Supplement to Possible Worlds

The Intensionality of Abstractionist Possible World Semantics

The intensionality of possible world semantics under an abstractionist ontology is vividly illustrated by extending the formal analysis provided in the supplementary document The Extensionality of Possible World Semantics. Recall that the formalized first-order metalanguage in that document included the set membership predicate ∈ as well as some additional metalinguistic primitives. However, we will not need the world predicate ‘World’ or the constant ‘@’ for the actual world, as these are definable for the abstractionist. Abstractionist semantics requires the following:

SOA(x):    x is a state of affairs
Ob(s):    (state of affairs) s obtains
T(φ,w):    (formula) φ is true at (world) w
dom(w):    the domain of world w
ext(π,w):    the extension of (n-place predicate) π at world w
den(τ):    the denotation of (constant or variable) τ

We assume there are appropriate abstractionist axioms for these primitives, e.g., that only SOAs can obtain — ◻∀x(Ob(x) → SOA(x)) — that anything that could be an SOA is an SOA, ◻∀x (◇SOA(x) → SOA(x)) — and so on. To formalize the abstractionist notion of a possible world and to pick out the actual world, four auxiliary definitions are needed:

Poss(s) =defOb(s)
Inc(s,t) =def ◻(Ob(s) → Ob(t))
Pre(s,t) =def ◻(Ob(s) → ~Ob(t))
Max(s) =deft(Inc(s,t) ∨ Pre(s,t))

Given these we have:

World(s) =def Poss(s) ∧ Max(s)
@ =def the s(World(s) ∧ Ob(s))

As before, truth can be defined as truth in the actual world:

  • True(φ) =def T(φ,@).

Now, recall that the formalized definition of truth in basic possible world semantics yielded the following clause for (6):

  • True(‘◻∀x(PxMx)’) ↔ ∀wx((World(w) ∧ xdom(w)) → (xext(‘P’,w) ∨ xext(‘M’,w))).

Spelling out the 'World' predicate according to our definition, then, we have:

  • True(‘◻∀x(PxMx)’) ↔ ∀wx((Poss(w) ∧ Max(w) ∧ xdom(w)) → (xext(‘P’,w) ∨ xext(‘M’,w))).

And unpacking the definitions of 'Poss and 'Max' in turn yields:

  • True(‘◻∀x(PxMx)’) ↔ ∀wx((◇Ob(w) ∧ (∀s◻(Ob(s) → Ob(t)) ∨ ∀s◻(Ob(s) → ~Ob(t))) ∧ xdom(w)) → (xext(‘P’,w) ∨ xext(‘M’,w))),

and the irreducibly intensional character of the truth condition becomes evident.

Return to the article “Possible Worlds”

Copyright © 2016 by
Christopher Menzel <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free