Privacy and Medicine

First published Wed May 13, 2009; substantive revision Thu Jan 28, 2021

Individuals, organizations and governments value and protect medical privacy (Francis and Francis 2017; Beauchamp and Childress 2008; Humber and Almeder 2001; Englehardt 2000b). As a general rule, they strive to (1) restrict and secure what they deem to be sensitive medical information and biospecimens, (2) respect medically-related decisions by individuals and families and (3) honor community and legal expectations of privacy (Francis 2017; Winslade 2014). For more than fifty years, philosophers and bioethicists have taken a keen interest in privacy issues. They have contributed to an expanding literature, some with practical applications, consisting of diverse perspectives on how privacy concepts and values are implicated in patient care and biomedical research (Presidential Commission 2012).

The scope of this entry is “privacy” in the several varied and popular uses of the term employed in medicine and health research, including the controversial uses debated by philosophers. Most contemporary discussions of privacy and medicine concern the informational privacy of patients and research subjects, treated in Section 1, below. Medical record confidentiality is a frequent focus. This emphasis is neither surprising nor inappropriate given the problems, priorities and preoccupations of the digital age. Not to be overlooked, and covered here in Sections 2 and 5, philosophic discussion has extended beyond informational privacy, engaging the privacy implications of observing, touching and choosing for oneself in medical practice. These forms of privacy are sometimes referred to as physical and decisional privacy. Associational and proprietary concepts of privacy found in health-related dicussions and recognized by some philosophers are also briefly treated in below in Sections 3 and 4.

This entry principally deals with the professional work of physicians, nurses and other trained and licensed medical caregivers, along with hospitals, insurance companies and researchers. Privacy in relation to wellness and well-being are beyond the scope of this entry, except to the considerable extent that it prompts encounters with medical professionals and organizations. Wellness encounters with spiritual, fitness or non-medical beauty professionals are not discussed. Finally, while the privacy of patients and biomedical research subjects is the focus of this entry, philosophical questions concerning health professionals’ own privacy-related interests implicated in medical practice are recognized.

1. Informational Privacy

This section will highlight philosophical issues relating to informational privacy and medicine. In medical contexts, the “privacy” at issue is very often “confidentiality” (DeCew 2000). Health care professionals acknowledge ethical duties to keep medical information private (APA 2017; AAMFT 2015). Physicians, nurses, hospitals, pharmacists, and insurers are required by law and professional codes to practice confidentiality. Since the 1990s, in policy discussions of health policy and reform, concerns about confidentiality have often been prominent (Sharpe 2005; Schwartz 1995). Confidentiality practices remain salient in medical settings, even as members of the general public display more relaxed attitudes about voluntarily sharing health and medical information.

A few preliminary points about informational privacy and medicine bear emphasis at the start—one about public attitudes, a second about professional responsibility, a third about law and policy, and a fourth about the significance of disparities and big data analytics to meaningful medical privacy.

First, while information-sharing has grown more common in recent decades—due, inter alia, to social media, big data, precision medicine, and increased infectious disease, new drug marketing and other health surveillance—individuals commonly keep some health concerns to themselves, whether out of personal preference, ethical reserve, etiquette, fear or shame (Allen 2016; Rosenberg 2000; Buss 1980; Westin 1967). When they share what they consider sensitive health concerns with others, most individuals employ culturally appropriate discretion and reserve (Nissenbaum 2009; Goffman 1959, 1963). Because of such privacy practices, families, friends, employers, employees, co-workers, doctors, researchers and governments may not acquire all the medical information they want, when they want it (Currie 2005; Etzioni 2000). At the same time, individuals who want medical privacy may feel they lack meaningful control over what happens to their personal information. The rise of social media, smart phones, wearable health monitoring devices, personal possession of electronic copies of medical records, consumer DNA testing and precision medicine represent diverse opportunities for intended and unintended disclosures of health-related images and information. The practical ability of individuals to control and protect their health privacy is partly a function of effective data security, their knowledge of contemporary medical data management practices and social-economic privileges (Bridges 2017; Marx 2007). Children, along with adults in active military service, judged mentally incompetent, dependent on government entitlement programs or incarcerated, lack substantial control over their medical privacy (Annas et al. 2013). In the context of medical emergencies, infections diseases and epidemics, competent adult civilians not in custody may be denied the choice to keep their medical information private.

Second, many medical professionals, hospitals, insurers and other entities with access to health information regard maintaining the confidentiality of medical communications and the security of medical information as paramount professional responsibilities (Daly et al., 2015; Presidential Commission 2016). This sensibility extends to social work, mental health and pharmacy records. Moreover, clinical health care providers and bio-medical researchers generally seek to accommodate patients’ reasonable expectations of privacy and are required to do so by state and national laws (Allen 2011; Presidential Commission 2009). That said, encouraging patients to embrace sharing health information to improve research, clinical practices and their own care is an emergent trend (Juengst et al. 2016).

Third, societies impose major privacy and private choice-related legal obligations on their members (Waldman 2018; Allen 2016; Westin 1967). Legal obligations of privacy and confidentiality bind persons and also bind health care providers, insurers, health-data processors, health researchers, public health officials and government (Mello at al. 2016; DHHS 2015; GAO 2001). Thus in a number of legal systems, disclosing a private medical fact or breaching medical confidentiality can result in civil liability (Allen and Rotenberg 2016; Solove 2004, 2008). The law imposes obligations to respect informational privacy (e.g., confidentiality, anonymity, secrecy and data security); physical privacy (e.g., modesty and bodily integrity); associational privacy (e.g., intimate sharing of death, illness and recovery); proprietary privacy (e.g., self ownership and control over personal identifiers, genetic data, and biospecimens); and decisional privacy (e.g., autonomy and choice in medical decision-making) (Allen 2016). Yet privacy is not everything in the eyes of the law, nor is it a sufficient or absolute ethical good (Allen 2003). In the context of emergencies and public health crises, such as the COVID-19 global pandemic, symptom checking, disclosures, surveillance and contact tracing that diminish privacy may be encouraged and legally permitted or mandated. The desire of health officials and researchers for health data concerning chronic health problems, such as diabetes, hepatitis and drug addiction, has prompted them to seek or legally obtain otherwise confidential health records.

Fourth, the traditional emphasis in academic and policy discussions of privacy on informed consent and choice grounded in individual freedom, can neglect the ways in which health disparities and societies’ structural injustices contribute to poor health, constrain choice and reduce opportunity (Skinner-Thompson, 2021; Obasagie and Darnovsky 2018; Shepherd and Wilson 2018; Bridges 2017). Moreover, the rise of big data and artificial intelligence in the digital economy have made it increasingly difficult for any individual to exercise meaningful control over the collection, manipulation and use of medically-related and other personal information about them (Kasperbauer 2020; Velez, 2020; Allen 2016; Cato et al. 2016; van der Sloot 2017).

1.1 Confidentiality

“Privacy” in medicine often denotes the confidentiality of patient-provider encounters (including the very fact that an encounter has taken place), along with the secrecy and security of information memorialized in physical, digital, electronic and graphic records created as a consequence of patient-provider encounters (DeCew 2000; Parent 1983). Confidentiality is defined as restricting information to persons belonging to a set of specifically authorized recipients (Allen 1997; Kenny 1982). Confidentiality can be achieved through professional silence and secure data management (Sharpe 2005; Baer et al. 2002). Hence Sissela Bok characterized confidentiality as referring “to the boundaries surrounding shared secrets and to the process of guarding these boundaries” (Bok 1982: 119).

Philosophers have suggested new ways of conceptualizing familiar privacy and confidentiality issues, pushing the topic of privacy and medicine into less traveled directions or novel frames. For example, it has been proposed that privacy and confidentiality in medical practice eschew the traditional imperative of individual patient autonomy in favor of a relational understanding that welcomes families and support networks into a confidential circle with patients and caregivers (Mohapatra and Wiley 2020). It has been proposed that traditional physician-patient confidentiality laws should be understood to impose potentially unwanted secrecy onto physicians, who bear burdens of silence they might prefer not to bear but are in effect coerced to bear by legal liability to do so (Allen, 2011).

Philosophers tend to agree that health is a vital component of human flourishing (Faden et al. 2013; Moore 2005; Rössler 2004; Rosenberg 2000; Schoeman 1984; Boone 1983). Maimonides maintained that bodily health is among the means and ends of a good life (Weiss 1991). Modern philosophers generally hold that a just society will be committed to securing the material and political bases of public health (Powers and Faden 2008). Philosophers of medicine, ethicists and bioethicists tend to agree that, with a handful of exceptions, respecting patient confidentiality benefits both individual and public health (Kamoie and Hodge 2004). They defend the practice of confidentiality by diverse appeals to utility, dignity and virtue (Easter et al. 2004).

Building on the 5th century BCE Hippocratic tradition of medical caregiver secrecy, western philosophers defend confidentiality on several utilitarian or other consequentialist grounds (Frey 2000; Hare 1993; Freedman 1978). They argue that preventive medicine, early diagnosis and treatment save human lives and money. Individuals will be more inclined to get medical attention if they believe they can do so privately. Policy experts maintain that the cost of health care and insurance would be considerably higher if people avoided routine check-ups and prompt medical attention because confidentiality was not credibly promised (Fairchild et al. 2007a). Confidentiality practices are believed to promote both seeking care and frank disclosures of health concerns in the context of care. Symptoms of illness and decline, such as incontinence, memory loss, or hallucinations can be embarrassing to talk about, even with sympathetic professional clinicians. In addition, promises of confidentiality can make persons more willing to participate in health research (Presidential Commission 2012; Easter et al. 2004).

Medical confidentiality promotes the individual’s medical autonomy, by sheltering those seeking morally controversial medical care from outside criticism and interference with decisions (Dworkin et al. 2007; Englehardt 2000a; Feinberg 1983). Patients seeking cosmetic, abortion or fertility treatments might not wish others to know their plans. Members of the general public have from time to time attempted to influence choices strangers make relating to the care of disabled infants, comatose or brain dead kin, and abortions. Spouses, partners, parents and siblings have sought involvement, with arguably greater moral warrant. H.J. McCloskey suggested that loving personal relationships call for mutual accountability (McCloskey 1971). Of course some health problems—morbid obesity, scoliosis, psoriasis, paralysis—simply cannot be concealed from intimates. Bioethicists, consistent with public health considerations and laws, commonly argue that hidden contagious conditions or exposures should not be concealed from vulnerable associates and in extreme cases could justify non-voluntary isolation or public health quarantine (Presidential Commission 2015a).

Philosophers have also offered deontological grounds for protecting informational privacy (Pierce 2018; Benn 1988). Centuries of philosophical thought depict human beings as vulnerable bodies and self-aware souls (Lackoff and Johnson 1999). Informational privacy promotes respect for human dignity, philosophers have said. Caregivers display concern for moral persons with rational interests and feelings of their own when they keep information about their health and health needs private (Freedman 1978).

Individuals concerned about discrimination, shame or stigma have an interest in controlling the flow of information about their health, and arguably the moral right to do so. Mental and other behavioral health care consumers continue to face stigma and discrimination in a world in which getting what they need requires a virtual surrender of confidentiality to a bevy of other people, including family members, doctors, social workers, teachers, hospitals, insurers, and law enforcement (APA 2002; AAMFT 2001; Dickson 1998).

Notions of moral fairness play into arguments for confidentiality. Confidentiality is arguably required by fair relations with government and businesses (Workplace Fairness, 2009, Other Internet Resources). Since “knowledge is power”, special concerns have been raised about the manner in which government collects and manages personal medical information. Pervasive ideals of fair information practices require that personal data collected about individuals be limited, accurate, secure and disclosed to third-parties only with consent. Some patients believe they own personal information about themselves, and that is it only fair that they, not others, control its release (McGuire 2019). They may believe they own medical information because they have purchased medical services (Martin 1981: 624–25). Or they may believe they own medical information, especially genetic information, because it reveals information of a highly personal and unique sort (Laurie 2002; Rothstein 1997).

Philosophers have identified duties of welfare promotion, care, dignity and fairness to support the case for privacy and confidentiality (Schoeman 1984). Virtue ethics suggests its own set of grounds for informational privacy in health care (van der Sloot 2017). Jennifer Radden has argued that the special vulnerability of mental health patients and the stigma attached to their problems turns confidentiality into a particular brand of excellence for mental health care practitioners (Radden 2004). She has argued that the demand for confidentiality in psychiatric medicine is inadequately accounted for on theories that fail to take into account the virtues of trust and reserve that are hallmarks of mental health care. Ari Ezra Waldman has also defended trust as a critical virtue for understanding the normative grounds of informational privacies. (Waldman 2018)

In the context of health research, ethics committees and institutional review boards impose ethical obligations on researchers to protect the confidentiality of research subjects and their medical information (Fisher 2006; Hiatt 2003; IOM 2000). The obligation of confidentiality may require the use of “identifiers” rather than names or “de-identification” procedures such as data aggregation (Presidential Commission 2012). Researchers may need to publish genomic data in ways calculated to obscure the identities of whole families. Patient confidentiality can be compromised in the setting of medical lectures and ground rounds, and in the publication and archiving of medical lectures, scholarly articles and personal papers. The question of whether there are privacy concerns when only statistical use is made of individuals’ health data has arisen. It has been argued that individuals have an interest in the uses to which data sets that include their data is put, even if they are not personally identified by researchers (Newcombe 1994).

Privacy theorists caution that deprivation of privacy can amount to subordination, injustice and inhumanity (Skinner-Thompson 2020; Gandy 1993). Most privacy theorists focus on the harms that stem from invading the privacy people value. Theorists have begun also to consider the harms that stem from voluntary self-disclosure (Allen 2011). Individuals freely disclose medical and other sensitive information about themselves. They do it in published memoirs, in social media postings and in forums devoted to illnesses, medical procedures, prescription medications, and alternative medicine. Women have webcast childbirth and mastectomy, citing public health education goals (Allen 2000).

Privacy is not defended as an absolute good (Hixson 1987; Boone 1983; Louch 1982; Pennock and Chapman 1971; Negley 1966). Confidentiality, for example, is seldom described as an absolute good in health care (Bok 1982). Philosophers justifiably recommend major exceptions to the practice of confidentiality. First, all health care providers and responsible adults should be obligated to report evidence of abuse or neglect of minor children, such as unexplained fractures and malnutrition, even if the privacy interests of the children and/or their abusers would seem to suggest otherwise (Dickson 1998). Failure of medical workers to promptly disclose can have deadly consequences for vulnerable minors. While confidentiality decisions are left to individuals or their guardians in most instances, minor children are a defensible exception due to their undeveloped cognitive and moral capacities and due to the possibility that their guardians are abusers who would benefit from confidentiality. Second, enshrined in American law as the Tarasoff Rule, mental health providers have an ethical duty to warn police or potential victims of mentally ill patients’ violent imminent intentions (Gates and Arons 1999). These two exceptions reflect a belief that avoiding physical injury to third parties is more important than invariably deferring to patients’ preferences, sparing their feelings and preserving their trust in relationships. Important philosophical questions arise about the extent of “Good Samaritan” duties, whistle-blowing obligations and the duty to warn in health care settings. Ascribing such duties potentially infringes the liberty persons otherwise enjoy to act and refrain from acting as they see fit so long as they do not affirmatively harm others. Arguably the person who declines to help or warn is not the responsible cause of the abuse and violence that befalls others. Yet beneficence argues for low risk, low cost interventions to prevent serious harm.

Third, there may be situations in which medical confidentiality should not be protected because the public has a right to know. One category of information which the public or public health officials are commonly thought to have a right to know is information about instances of highly infectious contagious diseases with high rates of mortality and morbidity, such as ebola, COVID-19, HIV/AIDS, hepatitis and measles. Another category of information deemed not suitable for confidentiality is information the media has a right to publish as a matter of its newsworthiness. Dramatic medical rescues of automobile accident victims are understandably newsworthy events. It has been argued that the public has a right to know about public officials’ serious medical problems, perhaps more than authorities have typically disclosed (Robins and Rothschild 1988; Thompson 1987). In the United States, plaintiffs in personal injury lawsuits are asked to submit to medical examination; and lawyers and grand juries have the authority to subpoena medical information for use in legal proceedings and investigations, placing highly sensitive medical information at risk of public disclosure (Wolf and Zandecki 2006). Like the demands of public health surveillance, legal process demands argue against unqualified rights of medical confidentiality (El Emam and Moher 2013).

1.2 Secrecy

Sissela Bok defined secrecy as intentional concealment (Bok 1982). Patients and caregivers can promote privacy through secrecy. Secrecy practices loom large in health care. Some people do not share the knowledge of medical symptoms even with their closest friends and family members. A person may secretly know he or she is ill before he or she admits it to family members or consults a physician. Reluctance to share knowledge of medical symptoms with associates or kin and medical professionals may stem from fear of disability or death; avoidance of discrimination in insurance, employment and education; or dread of social stigma, shame, embarrassment or rejection. In the 1990s, questions arose about the obligations of dentists and other health care providers to refrain from secrecy and disclose their HIV positive status to patients. Fertility patients may want to conceal the use of donated sperm or eggs, due to the social and religious consequences of disclosure (Birenbaum-Carmeli et al. 2008). Few medical conditions or procedures are shrouded in total secrecy anymore. Yet, people may prefer to keep secret the fact of, for example, their elective cosmetic procedures, weight loss surgery, sex reassignment surgery, abortions, fertility treatments, and sterilizations.

Paternalistically withholding medical knowledge from patients as the secrets of doctors, healthy spouses and adult children pits ideals of beneficence in caregiving against the patient’s right to know. Paternalistic secrecy is a major feature of medical practice, more prevalent in some countries, communities and families than others. Moral ideals of autonomy and agency argue for informing patients of their medical conditions, truthfully and fully. Yet, medical news is sometimes deliberately kept from patients. The adult children of a 95 year old woman might think it unduly cruel to reveal the diagnosis of operable bowel cancer when she would be better able to cope with the fib that she has benign diverticulitis. The parents of a young child might think it kind-hearted to conceal his terminal leukemia from him, on the ground that he is too young to understand death. Some moralists would agree. Yet if deception is categorically wrong, then secrecy about medical adversity would surely be unethical. A related issue is how medical clinicians and researchers should deal with “incidental and secondary findings”: disclose to the subject, or keep confidential within the research team? The return of incidental findings may create undue worry and increase medical costs by prompting unnecessary medical visits and testing, but the overriding obligation may be to anticipate incidental and secondary findings and communicate them with care (Presidential Commission 2013).

There is no guarantee that patients will believe medical truths or diagnoses squarely placed before them by qualified physicians. Denial of unpleasant truths is commonplace. Self-deception about health is a powerful phenomenon. Some people sincerely believe refusing to accept an unwanted diagnosis by maintaining a positive attitude will shield them from medical catastrophe. Mental disorders can trick one into thinking one is well, happy and insightful, rather than the manic, delusional person the psychiatrist may diagnose.

Another kind of secrecy practiced in medicine is the concealment of surgical wounds and scars. Cosmetic surgeons hide scars inside hairlines and in the creases behind the ears. Breast cancer is no longer the cause for secrecy it once was, yet reconstruction surgery following mastectomy is a kind of concealment. The lure of minimally invasive laparoscopic surgery is not only that it may both reduce the length of hospital stays and the risk of infection, but also that it leaves less prominent and visible scars. Advances in medical imagining, such as the X-ray, MRI, CT scan and ultrasound, allow providers to enter the body and capture information without leaving tell-tale signs of having done so.

Neuroimaging, brain imagining technologies (BIT) generally, and advanced lie-detection raise critical questions about whether secret thoughts should be available for discernment, and if so under what circumstances (Presidential Commission 2014; Farahany 2012). The issue is one of coerced self-disclosure and, if someday criminal guilt could be reliably discerned from imaging, self-incrimination.

1.3 Data Protection and Security

The moral significance attached to medical privacy is reflected in data protection and security laws adopted by local and national authorities around the world. The point of these laws is to regulate the collection, quality, storing, sharing and retention of health data, including the electronic health record (EHR) (CDT 2009, in Other Internet Resources). Health privacy statutes limit disclosure in the absence of informed consent; but typical statutes recognize numerous exceptions for routine uses, research, public health reporting, and legal process and law enforcement. The policy consensus seems to be that, while medical privacy is important, patients’ medical information may be disclosed to third-parties for socially important purposes unrelated to their own care. Electronically stored and produced medical information is by its very nature mobile. Those with access can transmit EHR data across town or across state and national borders. Patients today have unprecedented access to their own health information. Patients may transmit medical data over email, entrust it to third party cloud data storage providers, or collect health data via apps and wearable devices with little attention to third part access and use.

Some jurisdictions have special rules for management of certain health information. Data regarding HIV/AIDS, mental health and genetics are afforded special treatment in U.S. law, for example. Philosophers ponder whether particular conditions merit such exceptionalism. The argument for HIV/AIDS exceptionalism recalls the early days of the global epidemic when knowledge of the illness was poor, treatment was ineffective, and social stigma attached to affliction. The argument for mental health exceptionalism is that patients do and must “bare their souls” to mental and behavioral health providers, making disclosures socially costly (Radden 2004). A U.S. federal statute prohibits basing employment or health insurance decisions on information about a person’s DNA or genetic predispositions (GINA 2008). The leading argument for genetic data exceptionalism appears to be that genetic data conveys uniquely detailed information about a person and her biological family, information a person might have a right to know or a right not to know (Chadwick et al. 2014). Some genetic information can foretell a person’s health future (Laurie 2002; Rothstein 1997).

The use of electronic technology has been described as a boon for health care delivery and administration for decades (Burton 2004; National Research Council 1991). Yet heightened concerns for privacy followed increased portability of health data mandated by law (HIPAA 1996) and third-party (“cloud”) data storage. The obligation to protect medical data held by the state or private companies has taken on a new urgency as more and more health data is being transmitted and stored electronically. It has been argued that information managers owe it to the public to take stringent measures to prevent data breaches and to appropriately respond and remediate when a breach occurs. A data breach can result from the theft of a laptop; fraudulent or accidental access to data; sabotage by dishonest or disgruntled employees; or the loss of data storage devices. Major hospitals, health agencies and insurers have experienced highly publicized data breaches affecting millions of consumers whose names, addresses, health identification numbers and other data were compromised (Seh et al. 2020). A philosophical question raised by data breaches is how to define and morally repair harm. Medical identity theft and public disclosure of private facts are generally regarded as “harms” (Biegelman 2009). But it has been argued that negligently causing increased risks of identity theft and public disclosure of private facts are harms, too. If risk amplification is harm, though, it is unclear what should count as fair compensation or moral repair.

1.4 Anonymity

Anonymity has value in a variety of public health and medical research contexts. Research publications commonly shield the identities of biomedical research subjects or clinical patients. Special attention is paid to genetic information. Although a number of prominent scientists and lay people have made their genomes public, genetics research and scholarly publication standards call for protection of the identities of research subjects and their families. Bioethicists distinguish between identifiable, de-identified and anonymized whole genome sequencing data. (Presidential Commission, 2012) In the US, de-identified data is not protected under the laws protecting human subjects known as the Common Rule. Concerns can arise about whether particular methods of de-identification and anonymization adequately shield individuals from invasion of privacy and breaches of confidentiality (Yoo et al. 2018). “Differential privacy” is an anonymization approach to personal data sharing favored by some computer scientists that has potential value to health care data (Dwork 2006).

The use of the anonymously deployed personal diary for learning about and assessing health-related behavior is commonplace (Minichiello et al. 2000). Research subjects are asked to record contraception use, condom use and other sexual practices in diaries which become research tools. Researchers must take care to warn research subjects about the dangers of disclosing information which could expose them to social or legal sanctions.

In the context of COVID-19, North American policy makers were presented with members of the public who concealed their infected status and chose to travel on airplanes, congregate and not wear masks. In the heyday of the HIV/AIDS crisis in North America, policymakers similarly struggled to find ethically sound approaches to infectious disease control in the face of imperfect compliance with recommended best practices. Controversy arose in the 1990s over anonymous testing. Anonymous HIV/AIDS testing is now routinely performed but was once controversial among ethicists. Anonymity was defended on the ground that it encouraged testing by individuals wishing to control when, whether and to whom to disclose their HIV/AIDS status (Fairchild et al. 2007a). On the other hand, it was recognized that behavioral surveillance is a potentially useful component of aggressively protecting public health (Fairchild et al. 2007b; Gallagher et al. 2007; Burr 1999); in some situations, anonymous testing could make tracking patterns of infection more difficult. It was suggested that anonymous testing allowed infected persons to engage in dangerous, morally irresponsible sexual behavior without accountability. Proponents of anonymous testing replied that policy-makers and ethicists should not assume that men and women who learn they are HIV positive on the basis of anonymous tests would egoistically conceal their status from sexual partners. A few individuals will knowingly impose serious risks on others, but newly informed positive test-takers may responsibly notify past and future partners, refrain from risky behaviors, and seek medical care. The ethical issues surrounding HIV/AIDS have changed now that the condition is less stigmatizing and, in developed countries, is a treatable chronic condition rather than a death sentence.

1.5 Accountability

Confidentiality thrives as a legal duty and institutional practice, despite the emergent trend towards voluntary openness about personal medical information. The specifics of health and medical care have become acceptable topics of ordinary conversation outside the family circle. In the U.S., public figures have taken the lead, speaking out about their Covid-19, heart attacks, AIDS, erectile dysfunction, dementia, Parkinson’s disease, melanoma, prostate cancer and breast cancer. Disclosures that would have been considered indelicate or stigmatizing thirty years ago are made freely today, whether to make conversation, share a concern, educate the public, or endorse a non-profit or pharmaceutical product.

To a noteworthy degree, openness is also compelled by morals and law. Accountability for personal life is a feature of modern life, and medical accountability is a feature of modern life. Being accountable means being called upon to share information, explain, adjust behavior or submit to sanction. In the wake of COVID-19, SARS, Ebola and AIDS, new levels of information accountability gained public acceptance. World-wide, people are coming to think of minor and major contagious illnesses as conditions giving rise to public accountability. The accountability that is called for includes information gathering and sharing as a condition of travel between cities and countries or entering workplaces and schools. International travelers are asked to report symptoms of illness to officials. International visitors have their body temperatures scanned for fever automatically as they proceed to customs in some airports, workers are asked the same as a condition of enter workplaces. Mandatory testing, reporting, contact tracing and the use of prescribed symptom-checking apps, are examples of health information accountability. Beyond accountability for health information, the COVID-19 pandemic has made people accountable for mask wearing, hand washing, self-isolation, social gathering and other behaviors once considered purely personal. Decisions whether to vaccinate are also subject to moral and legal accountability, whether to prevent measles, COVID-19, or flu.

Many people speak openly about health matters with strangers as a condition of receiving and paying for health care. For example, a family needing the assistance of a regional mental health/mental retardation agency unavoidably places reams of sensitive information in the hands of government. (Bridges 2017) The same is true of a family which needs to apply for government benefits for aging or disabled kin. The more disclosures a family must make, the wider the circle of confidentiality and the lesser the medical privacy. Questions of distributive justice are raised by mandatory disclosures to government made as a condition of access to care. Poor and disabled persons dependent upon medical assistance from government have substantially less informational privacy vis-à-vis government than wealthy and healthy persons. The risks and burdens of state knowledge of the individual are disproportionately borne by the least well off segments of society.

1.6 Professional Norms

The duty of confidentiality is a core consensus norm within health care (Currie 2005). One important manifestation of this consensus in the U.S. has been the development of the “certificate of confidentiality” whereby researchers declare that confidentiality is of especial interest to their subjects (Wolf and Zandecki 2006, Wolf et al. 2004). The technological age has given rise to the call for health care providers, even those who work alone or in small groups, to be aggressive in the adoption of responsible information practices. All would agree that office practices can and should be designed to protect the identity of clients and the privacy of conversations. Common understandings are that practitioners should be judicious in the collection of information; they should store treatment notes and records in a secure manner; they should share information only with consent or as required by law; and they should protect sensitive information in its online and off-line forms using locks, passwords, encryption and other appropriate devices. Sensitive information that is no longer needed should not be retained indefinitely.

Health Care providers are ascribed ethical obligations to avoid casually discussing confidential patient matters in social media or in e-mail that may not be entirely private or secure (Chretien et al. 2011). They must avoid discussing patient matters on mobile phones in public places, such as in office corridors, hospital lobbies and on trains. Confidentiality can be violated by unauthorized recordings and disclosure of medical photographs. Photography plays a role in medical specializations including dermatology and plastic surgery, giving raise to concerns about ethical uses of graphic images of patients’ faces and bodies. At a minimum informed consent would appear to be required for making and disclosing photographs on whose basis a person could be identified. Ethically imperative consent was not obtained in a notorious U.S. case: it came to light in 2013 that a physician affiliated with Johns Hopkins University Hospital secretly videotaped hundreds of his obstetrics and gynecology patients with pornographic intent (Allen 2015). Videotaping has come to play a routine role in family therapy and is not considered unethical by typical practitioners (AAMFT 2001). Many clinicians believe the therapeutic and training benefits of videotaping outweigh the risks of unauthorized use or disclosure. Even if unauthorized use or disclosure were not a concern, an ethical question would remain. Should behavioral health clients be called upon to create recordings which inherently sacrifice the privacy of their homes, communications and expressions of emotions?

Physicians are debating whether to increase the use of video and audio-taping in routine clinical practice, surgery and research, and bioethicists are weighing in (Blaauw et al. 2014; Makary 2013). Should office visits be recorded as part of the standard medical record? On the one hand, recordings would address the problem of faulty memory and incomplete encounter notes. Recordings could document informed consent procedures and provide evidence to avert or support malpractice suits. On the other hand, recordings could inhibit patients and increase their discomfort. Recording practices might encourage physicians to be less attentive to the patients in front of them on the theory that they can always “go back to the tape” for details.

2. Physical Privacy

There has been relatively little attention paid by philosophers to physical privacy concerns in medicine compared to informational concerns. Yet typical patients bring a bevy of strong expectations of modesty, solitude and bodily integrity to doctors’ offices, hospitals, telemedicine visits and other health care encounters. These expectations that they will not be needlessly touched, crowded, gawked at or secretly filmed, recorded or imaged relate to the need for psychological comfort, dignity and security. The internet has made delivering health care possible across vast distances. (Chepesiuk 1999). Telemedicine, which grew exponentially during the first year if the COVID-19 crisis, allowed doctors and nurses to evaluate common medical complaints remotely without touching the patient. In the meantime, health care typically involves physical contact with others.

2.1 Solitude

Solitude is a form of physical privacy of special interest to medical ethics (Storr 2005; Barbour 2004). The sick do not want to be lonely and abandoned, but they may want personal space and time alone. Solitude has value as a context for quiet reflection about the significance of illness and injury. A period of solitude after consultation and self-education is a useful condition in which to make up one’s mind about treatment options.

The sickest patients may both crave and fear solitude. When alone they come face-to-face with the potentially cruel reality of impending death. Yet in company they may feel patronized or guilty about the burdens they impose on family and friends. Whether the suffering is the agony of injury, childbirth, recovering from major surgery or dying, persons may feel that they should not have to deal with others while in such a state or at such a time. Implicit social norms validate deferring to wishes of the sick or dying for seclusion and solitude (Post 1989; Nissenbaum 2009). These wishes may arise and be violated not only in hospital, hospice or nursing home settings, but also in mental hospitals and prisons, where panoptic policies of monitoring and surveillance prevail (Bozovic 1995; Holmes and Federman 2006: 16–17; Foucault 1977).

2.2 Bodily Modesty

Philosophers in the virtue ethics and Christian ethics traditions have identified modesty as a moral virtue (Schueler 1999). Modesty is a form of physical privacy of special interest to medical ethics. If patients are to receive the best care, they must be willing to expose their bodies to medical personnel and technicians. Removing one’s clothing for purposes of examination and testing is routine for most health care consumers. Busy emergency rooms and neighborhood clinics may be unable to cloak or seclude patients at all. Harried physicians may forget “bedside manners” and fail sufficiently to honor patients’ modesty expectations. In-patients in teaching hospitals are expected to adapt to diminished physical privacy, since medical students and researchers accompany attending physicians on rounds and participate in care.

Yet feelings of modesty and felt obligations of bodily modesty are commonplace. Many individuals understand bodily modesty as a moral virtue, and act accordingly. Under some religious traditions, such as those of Muslims, Orthodox Jews and the Amish, bodily modesty is a requirement of faith. Being asked to disrobe, even for a good reason, may impose the cost of going against principle or desire (Kato and Mann 1996).

Health care providers respond to the modesty values of their patients in a number of ways. They provide special modesty garments and sheeting to minimize nudity. They ask patients to uncover only those portions of the body which must be exposed, and then only for the period of time necessary. While hospitals cannot offer every in-patient a private room, shared rooms are generally dividable by curtains that grant patients some degree of physical seclusion (and associational intimacy with visiting family and friends). Male gynecologists and obstetricians help patients cope with sex-specific modesty norms and sexual abuse concerns by working with female assistants. Some health care providers maintain medical procedures staffing policies sensitive to modesty and harassment concerns. Indeed, mammograms on women are generally performed by female technicians. On the other hand, the radiologists and radiology technicians who deliver prolonged, intimate radiation services to breast cancer patients are likely to be male. Patients may encounter health institutions and providers who are unwilling to honor what they may regard as impractical or discriminatory preferences for same-sex or same race caregivers, preferences sometimes motivated rightly or wrongly by modesty concerns.

2.3 Bodily Integrity

Another aspect of physical privacy is bodily integrity. Mandatory testing and health evaluation offend bodily integrity by forcing persons to submit their bodies to unwanted touching and visual inspection (Allen 2014). Policy makers and the courts have generally permitted a great deal of nonconsensual urine testing of school children and people in jobs tied to public safety, public service and crime control. Drivers can be subjected to alcohol intoxication screening at road blocks or in hospital emergency rooms after accidents to promote highway safety. The concerns about neuroimaging and lie detection raised earlier in this article under the rubric of secrecy could as easily be raised here in connection with bodily integrity. Nonconsensual uses of imaging and lie-detection to assess honesty or character arguably demeans and disrespects autonomous moral agents and assaults bodily integrity. The philosophical issue here is whether there is some limit to the right of government to sidestep persons’ preferences about the handling of their bodies, body fluids and tissue samples. These issues arise in peace and war, and with respect to the living and the dead. Certainly, law-based constraints exist, but so too do principle-based and other moral constraints (Faden et al. 1986). Western cultures respect the integrity of a deceased’s body; however advances in transplant medicine mean the newly dead are a garden of healthy organs that could be used to save and extend lives. Organ harvesting with or without consent may be defended on utilitarian moral grounds. Of particular philosophical import is the issue of whether the bodily integrity of a person is violated when organs and/or tissue are harvested prior to brain death or prior to cardiac death. A related philosophical question is whether a legal regime of opting into organ donation or opting out of organ donation better serves the demands of justice and morality. Post-mortem sperm donation raises important ethical questions about bodily integrity. Harvesting the sperm of a deceased man raises concerns about respect for corpses; using sperm to create embryos and ultimately to parent the children of dead men raises concerns about parental autonomy and beneficence toward children.

3. Associational Privacy

Respect for the intimacy of the experiences of suffering, childbirth, recovery and dying is required by sound ethics. People who are in pain or grieving have an interest in including some people and excluding others. People commonly want to reserve sharing the joys of medical experience with friends and family, no less than the agonies. They have what can be thought of as an associational privacy interest in selective intimacy.

Injured, suffering, and dying adults may badly desire intimacy, even sexual intimacy. A patient may wish to exclude strangers or inessential medical personnel at times when the presence of loved ones is welcome. Parents of newborns may regard strangers photographing their babies as violations of family intimacy. A dying man may object to being photographed by a physician anxious to take photographs of the man’s surgical wounds for scientific purposes. If associational privacy is important, a bored visitor strolling the halls of a hospital should not maneuver to watch a randomly selected patient give birth; and if he does, he merits criticism as a morally offensive intruder.

Hospitals and hospital patients have clashed over who should be allowed visitation and a role in decision-making or hands-on care. Some institutions have kept extended family, paramours, gay or lesbian partners and children away from in-patients. On the other hand, children’s hospitals commonly encourage parents to spend as much time as possible with sick minors, and may have sleeping sofas near children’s beds or sleeping rooms inside the hospital for attentive guardians.

4. Proprietary Privacy

Moral and legal theorists have offered accounts of the relationship between “property” and “privacy”, “property rights” and “privacy rights” (May 1988; Radin 1987; Thomson 1975). Philosophers have debated the existence of a property right in the self, both the physical self and the non-physical self (e.g., the mind or soul) (Lakoff & Johnson 1999). One philosopher has argued that we own our selves and owe ourselves a self-love that constrains how we ought to treat our selves and allow others to treat us (Annas 1989).

John Locke famously characterized the relationship between a person and her body as self-ownership. However, other philosophers have held that persons are stewards of their bodies rather than owners (Honore 1961). In medical contexts, under rubrics of privacy, individuals are sometimes ascribed rights of self-ownership and the ownership of parts and products of their bodies (Moore 2005). In this vein, a philosophically interesting invasion of privacy argument was advanced in the landmark California case Moore v. Regents of the University of California (1990). Without his knowledge or consent, University of Southern California research physicians developed a commercial cell line from tissue removed from leukemia patient John Moore. Moore and an appellate court argued that in taking his DNA-laden tissue for unrevealed research and development purposes unrelated to Moore’s cancer care, UCLA doctors had appropriated Moore’s identity in a manner analogous to advertisers using a person’s photograph without consent for commercial gain. Moore’s privacy claim was novel at the time, but the claims of celebrities and others to control the attributes of their personal identities—likenesses, voices, names, monikers, trademarks, and Social Security numbers—are commonly styled as privacy rights and have been since the early 20th century. John Moore’s privacy claim was not successful in court. The California court held that Moore’s doctors ought to have obtained his informed consent; but the court was unwilling to commodify human tissue or DNA as private property (Radin 1987). Nor did the court think Moore’s injury fit the mold of traditional invasions of privacy recognized in the law. In a related case that did not result in tort litigation in her lifetime, cells taken from Baltimore resident Henrietta Lacks were the basis of an important immortal cell line, HeLa. Lacks died in 1951, but the cell line created using her cervical cancer cells without her knowledge or consent lives on. It has been used in the treatment and eradication of numerous conditions and illnesses, including polio, without any financial reward to her or her heirs.

But proprietary understandings of privacy continue to find expression in health care and health research contexts. Scholars suggest that individuals have privacy interests in their genes, genomes and bio-banked tissue specimens. These are sources of health information that reflect what individuals and their biological families are like, and what will become of them. Since most people share a DNA profile with no one other than an identical twin, a person’s DNA is virtually a unique personal identifier. The interest individuals have in controlling the use of their data and specimens can be reconciled with researchers’ needs for genotypical and phenotypical data, where principles of informed consent are honored (Presidential Commission 2012). Many people are now willing to voluntarily share genetic data without personal gain. The United States National Institutes of Health “All of Us” project sought to enroll one million American volunteers of diverse backgrounds into a research program requiring that they share medical and genetic data to help accelerate the search for disease cures and treatments.

Infertility medicine is a growing field, one dependent upon gamete donation and cryopreservation of embryos. Individuals have asserted what they describe as “privacy” interests in controlling the fate of gametes, zygotes, and frozen embryos. The privacy interests debated in the context of infertility medicine are twofold: a decisional privacy interest in the decision to bear a child with the help of reproductive technologies, and a proprietary privacy interest in controlling the fate of the building blocks of human life and the earliest beginnings of human life, created as a consequence of one’s intentions or the use of one’s genetic materials. While many courts have rejected viewing frozen embryos as property, they have struggled over how to allocate rights over embryos in cases of separation, divorce, death, moves and changes of heart.

In an entirely different vein, government regulators and the general public characterize identity theft as a “privacy” problem (Allen 2011). In recent years identify theft has become a privacy problem in the delivery of health care. Because of the high price of health care, medical identity theft—receiving medical care using others’ personal data for billing purposes—has become a serious problem. Consumers must worry both about the confidentiality of their medical records and physician encounters, and about the possibility that someone will appropriate their personal identifiers and then use them to defraud health care providers and insurers.

5. Decisional Privacy

In medical contexts, “privacy” is commonly used to denote autonomy, liberty or choice in health-related decision-making (Allen 2014; DeCew 1997; Feinberg 1983). Patients’ active participation in health-related decisions and control of their bodies—without undue interference of government or unauthorized persons—is a decisional variant of the concept of privacy. Women are often ascribed a “privacy right” to use medically prescribed birth control and to elect medically safe abortions. Men and women are ascribed a “privacy right” to utilize in vitro fertilization, surrogate gestators, and other reproductive technologies. Men and women with terminal illnesses or in vegetative comas are ascribed a “privacy right” to refuse life-sustaining nutrition, respirators, and medical care (Beauchamp 2000). Decisional privacy was problematically implicated in decisions whether to self-isolate or wear a facial covering to avert the spread of COVID-19, and has come up in relation to other health-impacting life-style decisions.

Decisional uses of “privacy” featured in this section are disfavored by some philosophers. They view the term “privacy” as more clearly and properly suited to informational and physical uses, which they view as central, paradigmatic or core. On the other hand, the decisional use of privacy has bona fide conceptual roots in Greek and Roman antiquity’s public/private distinction, marking a boundary between affairs of politics and government (res publicae) and affairs of the household (re privatae).

5.1 Birth Control

Birth control and abortion are common practices the world over. Felt by many to be deeply private matters, birth control and abortion were once criminalized on moral and medical grounds, but are safe and widely available today. Laws categorically criminalizing contraception and abortion were struck down in the U.S., Canada, most of Europe, Japan and Taiwan by the final third of the 20th century. In the United States, in 1965 the Supreme Court struck down laws criminalizing birth control in Griswold v Connecticut, on the ground that married couples have a “right to privacy” to use birth control provided by physicians, grounded in the Bill of Rights and the 14 Amendment. Several of the most effective forms of contraception are only available through a medical doctor, including, in some countries oral contraceptives, interuterine devices, and transdermal implants.

Feminist philosophers have widely debated the significance of the use of the concepts of privacy and a “right to privacy” to win women the capacity to control their fertility (Rössler 2004; Boling 1996). The concept of “privacy” played a role in confining women to traditional roles of daughter, wife and mother under the authority of male heads of households. While Catherine MacKinnon argued that ascriptions of rights of privacy are merely palliative distractions from a more basic quest for gender equality, other feminists have argued that privacy rights play a proper role in achieving reproductive autonomy and pave the road to greater education and employment equality (Allen 2000; MacKinnon 1984).

Official Roman Catholic doctrine opposes all non-natural birth control, birth control devices and all intentional abortions (Pope Paul VI, 1968, Humanae Vitae). Some regard human sexuality as having an essentially reproductive purpose and artificial birth control as unethically unnatural. Like Roman Catholics, other religious faith communities subscribe to a belief that human life begins “at the moment of conception” when a sperm fertilizes an egg, and that forms of birth control that may prevent the development of a fertilized egg to grow into a baby are the moral equivalents of intentional “abortion”. Those who oppose contraception on personal moral or religious grounds, sometimes but not always, support a legal “right to privacy” ; protecting access to medically safe birth control and/or abortion.

5.2 Abortion

With the possible exception of the privacy of medical records and genetic information since the 1990s, no issues have linked the concept of privacy to medicine more than the issue of abortion rights. Because of moral and religious disagreement about abortion, the link beween privacy and abortion rights has been politicized in the United States for decades (Jonsen 1998: 294ff).

Avoiding the concept of privacy as such, Judith Thomson employed the concept of a right to control the use of one’s own body in a famous defense of abortion rights (Thomson 1971). The United States Supreme Court popularized privacy grounds for abortion rights when it held in Roe v Wade in 1973 that the constitutional right to privacy requires striking down laws criminalizing medically safe abortions. Advocates of a decisional privacy right to abortion maintain that government should not take sides in what is irreducibly a moral debate, and that individuals should be free to make up their own minds about the moral status of the unborn (Richards 1986).

Stressing that fetus are not self conscious subjects of experience, some philosophers have denied that fetuses are moral persons with rights to life that outweigh women’s privacy rights. Those who oppose abortion privacy argue that abortion should not be left to private choice because the unborn are in fact equal members of the moral community, along with newborn infants. Membership in the moral community is conferred by human status or potential personhood, these philosophers argue. Religious ethicists sometimes characterize the unborn as acquiring souls in utero. Some moralists maintain that women’s decisional privacy must yield if science establishes that a totally unique human life comes into being with fertilization of an ovum. In support of moral and legal abortion rights, Peter Singer has argued that science proves that unique human lives do not begin at conception. Instead, fertilization begins a process of initially pluripotent cell development that may result in several human lives, due, e.g., to twinning and other divisions, or in no human life, due, e.g., to defects that result in spontaneous abortion. Philosophers Margaret Little and Rosalind Hursthouse contributed nuance to the ethics of abortion debate by arguing that while autonomy and privacy concerns are important, sui generis considerations of obligation and virtue are ethically relevant to decisions about terminating a pregnancy (Little 1999; Hursthouse 1991).

The trend in public policy, dating back to the 1970s in the U.S. and most of Europe, seems to be moral compromise (McDonagh 1996; Sher 1981). The law tends to permit women to obtain abortions freely in the first trimester and then to limit access to second and third trimester abortions. Philosophical differences in how societies think about abortion ethics are reflected in the four major models of abortion regulation found around the world. The models of abortion regulation are (1) the model of prohibition, banning most abortions, even if medically safe; (2) the model of permission, allowing most abortions but based legislated eligibility criteria rather than choice; (3) the model of prescription, requiring even unwanted abortions for eugenic or population control purposes and (4) the model of privacy, freely allowing most abortions chosen by women, with minimal restrictions. While the U.S. under Roe v. Wade (1973) used to be a nation in which the model of privacy prevailed, it has taken on features of a model of permission regime since 1989 when the U.S. Supreme Court announced it would begin allowing restrictions. The Court has upheld restrictions it deems not unduly restrictive of choice, including mandatory waiting periods and bans on specific second and third semester abortion (so-called “partial birth”) techniques.

5.3 Conscientious Refusal of Medical Services by Professionals

In most countries, the public relies on licensed physicians and hospitals for medical care. The medicines physicians recommend are available only from professionally trained, licensed pharmacists. In the U.S., state and federal laws have been enacted to relieve health care providers of the obligation to perform medical services that offend their philosophical, moral, or religious beliefs. Some policy-makers have argued that health care practitioners should be free to decline to provide services for which they are professionally trained if doing so genuinely violates personal conscience (Dresser 2005). Defenders of what have been called “conscience clauses” and “refusal laws” see themselves as defending the “privacy” of pharmacists and health care providers, privacy akin to liberty of thought and freedom of religion (White 1999). But opponents of such laws see themselves as the true defenders of privacy, standing up for the “right to privacy” of patients. They stress that the call for refusal laws has been tied to larger “pro life” strategies to limit access to contraceptives, medical abortifacients and surgical abortions. They say pharmacists who decline to dispense medication are placing their personal values and autonomy above the values and autonomy of patients. Furthermore, pharmacists, like physicians and nurses, enjoy the benefits of regulation and have chosen their professions voluntarily. Private reproductive choices can be exercised only if sufficient numbers of health care professionals are willing to perform lawful services.

Should health care workers be required to dispense medications and perform procedures that violate their personal scruples? Most bioethicists agree that in the context of emergency medicine, conscientious refusal has no place. A physician should not refuse to terminate an ectopic (tubal) pregnancy threatening the life of the mother, for example. There is significant disagreement, however, about whether morally-based refusal is warranted by retail pharmacists. An ethical code promulgated by a pharmacists association arguably places patients’ need and social justice above the personal convictions of individual pharmacists (APHA 1994). Whether pharmacists can ethically refuse may depend upon the proximity of other pharmacists willing to serve in their places. Ethicists also disagree about whether physicians may use their scruples as rationales for refusing to answer medical questions or refer patients to abortion providers. A further, related, question is whether physicians in countries where abortion is safe and legal may ethically follow their public or private employers’ orders to refrain from providing information about abortion services to patients.

5.4 Assisted Reproductive Technology and Enhancements

Some legal commentators and philosophers have argued that infertile persons have a right to procreative privacy that entails a right to use technology and surrogates to bear children. Assisted reproductive technology services (“ART”) include medicines to balance hormones, regulate ovulation, and stimulate the production of viable eggs; and surgery to unblock Fallopian tubes or undo the damage of endometriosis, miscarriages, ectopic pregnancies and pelvic inflammatory disease. Reproductive services also include sperm and egg harvesting and donation, in vitro fertilization, zygote and embryo transplant, reproductive organ transplant, cryopreservation (“freezing”) of pre-embryos, and surrogate pregnancies.

It may be argued that the ability to freely choose ART, like the ability to freely choose sterilization, abortion and birth control, is called for by the right to privacy. But ART use raises its own moral and practical concerns. One concern is the false hopes ART creates in a world in which the technology is expensive and the success rate low. The availability of affordable treatments can cause conflict within families in some societies. Women report feeling pressured by their families to undergo repeated painful attempts to get pregnant. It may argued that adoption is a more satisfying, affordable and socially commendable option for becoming a parent. The use of reproductive technology has led to bioethical concerns about the handling of the earliest beginnings of human life. Ethical concerns surround exposing otherwise healthy women to the uncertain health risks of repeated rounds of fertility drugs and high-risk multiple pregnancies with twins and triplets. In a few tragic cases children created using ART have been unwanted, raising questions of responsibility and the just role of family law. What should happen if the people who contract with a surrogate mother to carry a child for them using donated egg and sperm change their minds after a child is conceived? Should the mind-changers be deemed the parents? Should the gestator be deemed the parent; the gamete donors? Should parentage be assigned by a judge based on the best interest of the child?

The realm of reproductive technology is surprisingly laissez faire in the U.S., more regulated in the United Kingdom. Some U.S. constitutional lawyers argue that the right to bear and beget children enshrined by the Supreme Court in Fourteenth Amendment jurisprudence is a right to bear and beget by virtually any consensual means necessary. There is a right to reproduce, they argue, and a right to use other people and social resources to help one reproduce. Some have even argued that the right to procreative privacy is a reason for government or employers to pay for fertility services. In Israel, Germany and Taiwan, government subsidizes ART for infertile couples. Some major private insurers cover fertility treatments in the U.S. Great Britain has enacted a statute and created a governing body to deal with policy and ethical questions raised by the growing popularity of artificial reproductive technologies. The Human Fertilization and Embryology Act 1990 created the HFEA, an agency charged to license and monitor IVF, donor insemination, human embryo research, and the storage of gametes and embryos.

It is now possible to select the sex of one’s offspring. Some bioethicists have argued that a “right to privacy” countermands government placing bans on sex selection. Supporters of sex selection sometimes argue that choosing a child’s sex is a future parent’s moral and legal right. Some methods of sex selection include: (1) Amniocentesis testing to determine sex, followed by abortion if the fetus has the undesired sex; (2) Sperm sorting to produce X rich or Y rich batches of sperm, followed by in vitro fertilization or insemination to increase chances of having a child of the desired sex; (3) preimplantation genetic diagnosis (“PGD”) to determine the sex of a pre-embryo, followed by implantation of one or more pre-embryos of the desired sex. Amniocentesis and PGD were techniques developed originally to determine whether a fetus or embryo was affected by a genetic disorder such as Down’s syndrome or cystic fibrosis. In some jurisdictions abortion or PGD solely for sex-selection other than to avoid sex-linked disorders is illegal.

Adults who want children often prefer children of a particular sex, or a “balance” of male and female children, perhaps born in a particular order. Medically-assisted high-tech sex selection raises large ethical issues. PGD involves creating human embryos, some of which will not be used. Freezing, destroying and giving away human embryos can seem inconsistent with respect for human dignity. Sex selection is arguably a kind of gender discrimination and could heighten problems of pernicious gender discrimination. Sex selection plays into gender stereotypes and could someday throw off the societal, even global balance of males and females. Sex-selection is controversial as a first step on a slippery slop toward “designer babies”.

Men and women in developed countries are “designing” their babies (Parens and Knowles 2003). In the context of fertility medicine, patients select donated egg and sperm based on criteria such as the race, IQ, SAT scores, and detailed physical profiles of the donors. The capacity to select the traits of offspring is likely to expand in the coming years. It has been argued that a “right to privacy” countermands government placing bans on trait selection through genetic selection and manipulation. If women and their partners had an unlimited right to reproductive autonomy, it arguably would follow that they have a right to use technologies that enable them to choose the precise traits of their children. Yet the right is clearly not unlimited, and using technology to achieve “perfect” or “superior” humans may be unethical, even if using technology to screen out tragic abnormalities and diseases representing extremes of suffering is not (Presidential Commission 2015b).

Michael Sandel has argued that the quest for genetic enhancements and other god-like mastery over the human body reflects a failure to appreciate fully the “giftedness” of life and the ethical value of “humility, responsibility, and solidarity” (Sandel 2007: 12 and 86). Ronald Green has cautioned against a status quo bias that leads us to the irrational conclusion that human beings should remain as they are (Green 2008: 9). John Harris has moved several steps beyond Ronald Green in building a case against preserving the status quo. Offering what he calls “the ethical case for making people better”, Harris has argued that society ought to leap on opportunities to create “healthier, longer lived, and altogether ‘better’ individuals” (Harris 2007). In the future, the notion of decisional privacy may play a major role in building a case for allowing individuals and families to use or refuse genetic, pharmaceutical and other forms of enhancements.

The issue of biological enhancement is not limited to the context of prenatal intervention. Concepts of health privacy may be brought to bear on questions surrounding the ethics of electing to utilize medical procedures or drugs to improve the motor and cognitive capacities of people seeking to be “normal” or “superior”. The privacy-as-autonomy argument for allowing largely unfettered choice has been less controversial where persons and clinicians aim to bring someone who is suffering from disease or disability to within normal ranges, than where the aim is to enable someone to surpass normal levels. Thus, prescribing or taking Ritalin to combat ADD/HD may meet with moral approval as a matter of medical privacy, while prescribing or taking Ritalin to achieve a higher SAT score does not (Presidential Commission 2015b).

5.5 Medically Unhealthy Life-Styles

Does privacy entail largely unfettered lifestyle choices? Should the state enact health and safety rules designed to save people from poor private choices such as eating sugary, high fat foods, smoking and refusing to wear motorcycle helmets? Are individuals entitled to unfettered enjoyment of drinking alcohol, using drugs recreatioally and a medication-free existence? The answer John Stuart Mill gave to such questions in his famous essay On Liberty (1869) was “yes” to the extent that these are self-regarding behaviors that do not harm others. Mill defended liberal tolerance of intoxicants and narcotic drugs on the ground that liberty nets society benefits that are lost when government tells us what to do. A libertarian perspective condemns the “nanny state” that fails to treat citizens like conscientious adults (Harsanyi 2007: 41).

A robust regard for liberty prompts adopting an extreme libertarian perspective on the law. Yet “[t]he notion of radical individualism focuses on individual health behavior and ignores the social preconditions of that behavior ”(McGee 1999: 211). What, on the surface, appear to be inviolate personal choices may be straightforward products of social forces as diverse as “media, advertising, movies, literature and folklore” (McGee 1999: 212). Debates over managed care have stressed that individuals’ unhealthy choices have externalities, including higher health care costs for fellow citizens. Unhealthy lifestyles can impose substantial costs on others. Smokers impose the costs of illnesses caused by exposure to second-hand smoke. Unhealthy diets and the lack of exercise can contribute to reduced worker productivity and increase health care spending. Obesity in pregnancy can adversely impact the health of developing fetuses and infants. Unhealthy lifestyles divert societal resources from other areas of public need, such as education (McGee 1999).

5.6 The Patient’s Right to Refuse Life Saving Care

Whether persons with mental conditions are morally required to take medications that make them better able to live normal lives could be styled as a question of the limits of private choice. Some mental health patients are not competent to make their own treatment decisions, but the vast majority are competent most of the time. Some patients are offered medications by their physicians to curb distinctly anti-social impulses such as oppositionality, verbal aggression and violence. It could be argued that these patients have an ethical obligation to medicate themselves, as advised. Competent patients with cognitive and emotional problems (such as moderate depression or mild hallucinations) that affect mainly themselves may plausibly argue that the benefits of psychotropic medications are not outweighed by the risks of lethargy, sexual dysfunction, tremor, speech problems and organ damage. Questions of political philosophy are implicated in debates over the extent to which authorities may compel medication use by death row inmates, defendants awaiting trial, prisoners and in-patients in state hospitals.

The flowering of bioethics as an academic discipline and branch of philosophy was fed by religious, moral and ethical concerns raised by high profile legal cases about the right to die (Beauchamp 2000). These cases seemed to place the power to “play God”—make life and death decisions—in the hands of patients, families and physicians. The field was influenced, for example, by the famous Karen Quinlan decision (In the Matter of Quinlan, 1976). This case transported the federal constitutional ideal of the right to decisional privacy into state law, and characterized the right of a comatose woman’s family to refuse life-saving treatment on her behalf as a “right to privacy” (Jonsen 1998). After the Quinlan decision, hospitals began setting up ethics committees to help doctors, patients and families exercise decisional privacy rights in a lawful and responsible manner. In 1986, the U.S. Supreme Court recognized in the case of Nancy Cruzan a right of patients to refuse medical care such as artificial respiration and tube feeding, where the wishes of the patient to die could be established by clear and convincing evidence.

Moral philosophers have sought a greater role for ethics in shaping interpretations of constitutional law in life and death cases. On December 6, 1996, six prominent U.S. moral philosophers submitted an unprecedented brief to the U.S. Supreme Court in two cases, Washington v. Glucksberg (1997) and Vacco v. Quill (1997). The philosopher’s were on the losing side. The U.S. Supreme Court refused to strike down laws banning assisted suicide, instead upholding state laws in New York and Washington that criminalized physician-assisted suicide. The Court argued that states have an interest in protecting life, protecting the poor and the disabled, and promoting physicians’ ethical integrity. Patient’s rights groups had argued that laws banning physician assisted suicide violated the privacy and equality rights of people with terminal illnesses.

According to what came to be known as “The Philosophers’ Brief”, signed by Ronald Dworkin, Thomas Nagel, Robert Nozick, John Rawls, Thomas Scanlon, and Judith Jarvis Thomson in 1997 in connection with the United States Supreme Court case, Washington v. Glucksberg, 521 U.S. 702 (1997),

A person’s interest in following his own convictions at the end of life is so central a part of the more general right to make ‘intimate and personal choices’ for himself that a failure to protect that particular interest would undermine the general right altogether. Death is, for each of us, among the most significant events of life. (Dworkin et al. 1997 [2007] pp.548–561)

The Brief went on to argue that there is little moral difference between allowing an authorized physician to administer a life-ending injection on behalf of a terminally ill patient and allowing an authorized physician to turn off the respirator or remove the feeding tube of a person in a vegetative coma.

The 2007 Theresa Schiavo case raised the philosophically important question of when it is ethical to exercise privacy rights. A Florida court allowed spouse Michael Schiavo to terminate life support on wife Terri’s behalf, after the court found that Terri’s autonomous choice would have been to refuse life-sustaining care if she were hopelessly comatose. Since the age of twenty-five, Terri had subsisted in a “persistent vegetative coma”. Autopsy established that Terri had massive and irreversible brain damage, as her husband believed. Terri’s parents had doubted the diagnosis of hopeless coma and wanted their daughter alive. Assuming Michael Schiavo was justified in ignoring the pleas of strangers who wanted him to keep his wife alive, it is less clear that he was justified in turning down the pleas of his wife’s own parents, who urged Schiavo to waive his wife’s “privacy” and offered to assume complete responsibility for her care. What are the obligations of kin to honor the care and kinship wishes of fellow family members? What weight do privacy arguments on behalf of an incompetent spouse have in the face of parental claims?

6. Conclusion

Philosophers have identified and debated several meanings of “privacy” deployed in medical contexts. Respect for recognized forms of privacy —informational (Section 1), physical (Section 2), associational (Section 3), proprietary (Section 4) and decisional (Section 5)—is an ideal of biomedical ethics for the conduct of clinical research and administrative practices relating to physical and behavioral health. There is wide philosophical consensus about the importance of medical confidentiality, modesty and bodily integrity in all health settings; but substantial philosophical disagreement about the limits of personal autonomy or individual choice in fields relating to contagious diseases, human reproduction and genetics. Recently, sharing medical information with family friends and the general public voluntarily has supplanted norms of secrecy prompted by shame and stigma. Moreover, voluntarily sharing medical data is widely encouraged by researchers and officials to promote public health and precision medicine. As digital medical data technologies, mobile health care apps, telemedicine, public health surveillance, and brain imaging technologies expand, the range and complexity of important privacy questions in medicine will also expand.


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