First published Tue Sep 8, 2020

Protagoras (490–420 BCE ca) was one of the most important sophists and exerted considerable influence in fifth-century intellectual debates. His teaching had a practical and concrete goal, and many of the surviving testimonies and fragments suggest that it was mainly devoted to the development of argumentative techniques. But some of his views also raise important philosophical problems, which were going to be discussed in details by Plato, Aristotle, and many other philosophers. His famous thesis according to which “man is the measure of all things” has been interpreted as a first stance in favour of relativism, and his claim on the gods introduces the problem of agnosticism. Besides, his conventionalist notion of justice marks a break with the traditional account of divine justice; as it has been rightly claimed, it also seems to provide a theoretical foundation for democracy based on direct participation. By claiming a direct link with the great poets and thinkers of the past but also by appropriating and transforming their tenets, Protagoras presented himself as an heir to Greek paideia, as one of the great masters, or better, as the educator capable of imparting teachings suited to the needs of the new world of the polis.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

We do not know much about Protagoras’ life, and even less about his death: as the most famous sophist, he became the object of many, often unreliable, anecdotes. He was born in Abdera in Thrace, in the north coast of the Aegean Sea. In Plato’s Protagoras (317c) he says that he is old enough to be the father of anyone present, including Hippias and Prodicus. This confirms that he was one of the earliest sophists and suggests the 490s BCE as his birth year. According to an anecdote in Diogenes Laertius (IX.53) he was a porter until Democritus taught him. Democritus was also from Abdera, but was younger by about thirty years and criticised Protagoras’ thesis of the “Man measure” (see below) on the charge of being self-refuting. It is therefore highly improbable that Protagoras was one of his pupils. The anecdote, probably derived from some comic poets (such as Eupolis or Hermippus) due to possible connections between their epistemological theories, also served to point to Protagoras’ humble origins; an alternative testimony from Philostratus (Lives of the Sophist I.10.1–2) about his family hosting Xerxes at the time of the Persian wars goes in the opposite direction. This testimony also reports that Xerxes granted Protagoras’ family the rare privilege of having their son Protagoras educated by the Magi (this anecdote was also used to explain his agnosticism, as if it was impossible for a Greek to endorse similar ideas, see below). Even if we regard this story as spurious, it still seems to confirm the contacts between Protagoras and the culture of the Ionian colonies and of the Near East. As Plato repeatedly reports, he later travelled around Greece as a teacher and a “sophist” (most importantly, again according to Plato, he was the first to explicitly present himself as such, Protagoras 316c–317b), earning great fame and amassing considerable riches. It is equally certain that Protagoras sojourned at least twice in Athens in Pericles’ time, establishing with him personal ties. It is more difficult to tell whether these contacts also led to a direct involvement in the democratic politics of the great statesman. Evidence in this direction is apparently provided not just by some of the sophist’s surviving fragments, but also by the fact that in 444 BCE, Pericles entrusted him with drafting the constitution of the new pan-Hellenic colony of Thurii in South Italy (clearly, an appointment of this sort implies that the two men shared the same political outlook). This connection with Pericles can also be confirmed by the upheavals that marked the last years of Protagoras’ life: the crisis of Periclean politics seems to find a counterpart in the downfall of Protagoras, who—like other personalities close to the statesman—was put on trial. By the same account, the sophist died in a shipwreck during his flight. However, this is very questionable. First, that he had a trial seems to be confirmed also by other sources; but these sources (in particular Aristotle, see Diogenes Laertius IX.54) do not seem to relate the trial to political issues (Diogenes actually relates the trial to the charge of impiety, which would justify the story about the shipwreck as divine punishment); at stake was rather a controversy with a pupil. Moreover, it cannot be excluded that the trial with the student was also a fiction. Second, the story of the trial and flight from Athens differs from what Plato writes in his dialogues, where he speaks of Protagoras as though he had died as a universally esteemed figure in old age. From Plato we know that Protagoras lived approximately 70 years (Meno 91e; other sources state 90 years), which would place his death at around 420 BCE. Protagoras' pupils include Antimoerus of Mende, Carmidas and Euathlus of Athens, and Theodore of Cyrene. Protagoras’ influence has also been posited in relation to Prodicus and the Dissoi Logoi, although it is difficult to measure its extent.

1.2 Works

Diogenes Laertius (IX 55 = 80A1 DK) attributes many works to Protagoras, but a comparison with other sources reveals that his list is incomplete. Still worse, what is missing from Diogenes’ list are precisely the most important and controversial works, such as Truth and On the Gods. One possible explanation is that these two texts constituted individual sections of the Antilogiae (Opposing Arguments, mentioned by Diogenes), which were possibly known also as Kataballontes logoi (The Overthrower Arguments or, better, The Knockdown Arguments; in M VII 60 Sextus Empiricus attributes to this text the “Man measure” sentence, which other sources refer to Truth; see Decleva Caizzi 1999: 317; Lee 2005: 24–29). Intriguing as it is, the hypothesis is difficult to prove. The title suggests that the Antilogiai were structured upon some sort of oppositions (an interesting parallel are the Dissoi logoi); but there is no indication of oppositions in the surviving fragments from Truth and On the Gods. Again, any attempt at reconstruction is destined to remain speculative, given the dearth of available fragments. Other titles such as The Art of Eristic, On Wrestling, On Sciences, On Love of Honours, On the Constitution show the breadth of Protagoras’ interests.

Apart from these titles, unfortunately, all we have are a few (less than ten in Diels-Kranz’s edition) authentic fragments and many interpretations. Ever since Antiquity, his provocative theses have elicited interest and criticism from his readers. As a result, different reconstructions of his thought are available, which are not always reliable and are often clearly shaped by disparaging intentions. The first and most important tradition stretches back to Plato, who devoted two dialogues to the theses of the sophist of Abdera, the Protagoras and the Theaetetus. Many of the later testimonies, starting with Aristotle’s, would appear to depend on Plato’s discussions, and this must be taken into account when examining the information from our sources. Alongside the Platonic, another tradition proved rather influential in Antiquity, namely the one that highlighted the sceptical implications of Protagoras’ thought (the most interesting testimony, not in DK, comes from the Commentary on the Psalms by Didymus the Blind, see PToura V 222.18-29; this testimony, absent in DK, can be read in the recent edition by Laks and Most 2016, vol. VIII.1, 109–111). However, little is known about this interpretation because sceptics such as Sextus Empiricus explicitly refused to be associated with Protagoras, whom they regarded as a dogmatist. This kind of reading certainly served polemical purposes. Another tradition that was hostile to Protagoras, and which was possibly connected to the sceptical interpretation, was the Epicurean one, which is responsible for the emphasis on the link between Protagoras and Democritus, on the ground of their epistemologies—in all likelihood, an unfounded idea. All in all, we must note that many—if not all—the testimonies we have about Protagoras are vitiated by underlying polemical attitudes of some sort, which in some cases lead to actual distortions of his thought.

2. The “Man Measure” Thesis

In Plato’s Protagoras Protagoras claims that he teaches euboulia, good deliberation:

The object of my instruction is good deliberation about household matters, to know how to manage one’s own household in the best way possible, and about those of the city, so as to be most capable of acting and speaking in the city’s interest. (318e–319a = 80A5 DK)

Protagoras’ teaching had a practical and concrete goal, and many of the surviving testimonies and fragments suggest that it was mainly devoted to the development of argumentative techniques (which were probably investigated in texts such as the already mentioned Antilogiai and The Art of Eristics). Unfortunately, we have little evidence of what these actually were. In all probability, assertions such as that on every matter there are two logoi opposed to one another (80A1, B6a DK) or that it is impossible to contradict (80A19 DK), along with the claim to make the weaker logos (the) stronger (80B6b DK), belong to this context. Part of his teaching was also devoted to grammatical or linguistic issues and poetry analysis. More in general, it is also unclear the relation between his teachings and the apparent relativism of his famous thesis that the man is the measure of all things. Ancient sources report that this sentence opened Truth, a public declamation (epideixis) with which he presented himself to the public to potential pupils.

2.1 “Of all things the measure is man”: the epistemological interpretation

Truth is one of Protagoras’ most famous books. Ancient books were not necessarily given their titles by their authors; but Plato and Aristotle continuously refer to Protagoras’ text as Aletheia and also make puns, confirming that Protagoras himself gave this title. The notion of “truth” played a prominent role among the Presocratics: in choosing this title, Protagoras clearly wanted to present himself as an heir to this long-established tradition; and by questioning the existence of one single truth, as we will see, he sought to challenge it. The first sentence of the treatise fully confirms its author’s provocative intentions: “Of all things the measure is man: of those that are, that they are; and of those that are not, that they are not” (80B1 DK; for the sake of convenience, this sentence will be abbreviated as MM). MM is one of the few authentic Protagoras fragments to have been preserved and many ancient sources confirm that the statement was originally formulated precisely in these terms. The problem, however, is its opacity: ancient readers debated what Protagoras really meant, and modern interpretations have only increased doubt. As a matter of fact, it cannot be ruled out that a certain degree of ambiguity was intentional. Truth was not a scientific treatise but an epideixis, the text of public performance, which was meant “to demonstrate one’s virtuoso skill in argumentation” (Lee 2005: 27, after Lloyd 1987: 96). In opening his speech, Protagoras sought to capture the attention of his audience (or reader) by making a striking and allusive claim. There is nothing odd in all of this, since a desire to capture the audience’s attention was quite typical of the sophists, and is confirmed by many other sources (the sentence introducing the treatise on the gods was just as provocative, see §4).

This is not to say that MM had no specific meaning. Simply, it is a matter of dealing with potentially ambiguous elements. In particular, it is necessary to clarify the notion of man, i.e., whether “man” refers to each individual or to humanity in general: in discussing this issue, the meaning of the other terms that make up the sentence will also become clearer. In turn, this will help us assess the underlying meaning of Protagoras’ thesis and its field of applicability, so as to determine whether it is only an epistemological thesis or whether it also carries practical or political implications. As it will turn out, the sentence can be read on different levels, in accordance with the archaic logic which says there is no need to clearly distinguish the different meanings possessed by a term.

There are three main sources for MM: Plato, our most important source, Aristotle, and Sextus Empiricus. All three understand the phrase—at any rate at a first level—as though “man” referred to “each individual”. In the Theaetetus MM is equated with the claim that “knowledge is sensation” and paraphrased as follows: “just as each thing appears to me, so too it is for me, and just as it appears to you, so too again for you” (Theaetetus 152a). Thus, if the wind appears warm to me, it is warm for me; and if it appears cold to another person, it is cold for her. In other words, MM means that each person is the measure of her own sensations, and Protagoras emerges as a supporter of an empiricist theory that bases knowledge on sensory data.

Plato’s testimony is crucial and his reconstruction is also taken up by other authors (see 80A16 DK and 80B1 DK). It is, however, a reductive interpretation that potentially misleads. The underlying aim of Theaetetus is not to accurately report the theses of Plato’s opponent, but to show their philosophical limits: according to Plato, the MM thesis is a muddled one; the only way to make it clear is by assuming that Protagoras was only speaking of sensations; and since (according to Plato) it is impossible to base knowledge on sensations alone, it follows that the thesis is fallacious. This strict empiricist reading is philosophically interesting but not historically reliable, because Protagoras was not speaking of sensations alone. Remarkably, Plato himself suggests that Protagoras’ phrase had a broader meaning by remarking that MM also concerned all opinions and judgements (157d, 170a–171a). Aristotle and Sextus Empiricus further confirm the need for a broader interpretation: what are at play are not just sensations but more generally all opinions and judgements (and especially value judgements). On this interpretation, MM means that each individual is the ultimate arbiter of all her own judgements—not only that the wind is warm or cold, but also that performing a given action is right or wrong.[1]

The point just made is crucial for a correct reconstruction of the overall meaning of Protagoras’ position. The transition to a broader conception of human activities (not only sense-perceptions but human judgements as a whole) brings out one aspect of the thesis that scholars have all too often overlooked. From the example of wind it seems that Protagoras was addressing the problem of human knowledge in abstract terms, by examining the general ways in which the process of knowledge-acquisition unfolds—in other words, by investigating what happens to a subject X who at a given moment t experiences sensation f (let us think of the example of the wind). This is not correct. It is certainly true that Protagoras’ thesis was concerned with human knowledge. However, it is not true that it focused on it in an “abstract” way, as though men could be stimulated from the outside so as to study their reactions at given moments and in specific circumstances. This approach might work in the case of the wind, but not in that of judgements concerning what is good or bad. “Man” refers to the individual, yet not to a generic, impersonal, subject: Protagoras has concrete, historically well-defined people in mind, with their ideas and prejudices. What is meant by “man”, therefore, is each person with his or her own personal history, experiences, and expectations with a past and a future, i.e., people whose judgements largely reflect their individual experience. When I claim that a certain thing or action is good (or beautiful or unjust), I do so on the basis of a series of ideas and opinions that I have acquired over the course of my life and that I have continued to put to test through my engagement with facts—in other words, on the basis of my experience, which is different from that of other people. The true measure, then, is not man in the abstract sense but rather each individual’s experience (Mansfeld 1981: 44–46). Clearly this claim also carries a polemical undertone with respect to the so-called “masters of truth”, that is, philosophers like Parmenides (see also 80B2 DK), for whom terms such as “man” and “opinion” were synonymous with error, and the poets who claimed to be divinely inspired. There is no privileged access to any divine or higher reality. The ultimate purpose of Protagoras’ statement is to re-evaluate human experiences.

Having clarified the meaning of “man”, we can now turn to consider the second part of the phrase, “of those that are, that they are; and of those that are not, that they are not”. Essentially, it is a matter of clarifying what “things” means and in what sense man “measures” them. Based on what has been noted so far, we can reasonably claim that what Protagoras meant by “things” was not just material objects and entities with their specific properties (things that can be perceived by the senses, such as wind): “things” are to be understood in their broadest possible sense as facts or events—e.g., the temperature of the wind, but also an event such as performing a certain action and all that happens to man. In this respect, the choice of the term is probably revealing. Chrema derives from the verb chraomai, meaning “to treat”, “to use”, “to entertain a relation with”: according to its original meaning, the term describes not so much “things” in themselves (in this case Protagoras could have used onta or pragmata), as in relation to us; the emphasis is on the way in which we relate to things, use them, judge them, and so on. As far as the notion of measure is concerned, it is clear that man is the measure not of the existence of these things and facts, but rather of the way in which they present themselves (e.g., warm/cold or good/bad). The verb “is” must be understood not in an existential sense (in which case it would be difficult to understand what it means for man to be the measure of the non-existence of the things that are not), but rather in a modal-predicative sense: Protagoras is not denying the existence of the external world, but only limiting the possibility of knowing it to the way in which it presents itself to our experience: hence, if I judge the wind to be warm, I am the measure of the fact that it is warm and not of the fact that it exists; and if I judge the wind not to be warm, I am measure of the fact that it is not warm and not of the fact that it does not exist (but this does not exclude some specific cases where I can also be the measure of existence or lack there of, for instance the Gods: interestingly, the opening sentence of fr. 4 on the Gods appears to have existential implications, see below §4). Things in themselves do not possess any predetermined truth or any intrinsic value: they simply exist, they are what surrounds man, what happens to him. But what matters is the way in which we relate to them: each individual, according to his or her experience, is the judge of these facts, insofar as he or she assigns them a degree of consistency or value.

2.2 Objections and the practical interpretation

MM faces two serious objections: the charge that it is self-refuting and the charge of solipsism. The charge of being self-refuting (or peritrope, as the ancients called it: literally, the charge of turning oneself upside down) was apparently formulated for the first time by Democritus (80A15 DK) and then further developed by Plato (in Theaetetus and Euthydemus) and Aristotle (in the fourth book of Metaphysics). In brief, this accusation states that if all judgements are true (this being the implicit meaning of MM), then the judgement that MM is false is also true; hence, MM is false. Protagoras had reportedly further claimed that “it is not possible to contradict” (80A19 DK) and this had led Plato and especially Aristotle (Met. IV 5, 1009a6–16) to add that the sophist denied the principle of non-contradiction, suggesting another version of the peritrope charge: Protagoras claims that all judgements are true (let us call this thesis P) and his opponent that Protagoras’ claim is false (non-P); but according to Protagoras contradiction is impossible and therefore non-P is compatible with P; but in this case, non-P is true; hence, P is false (Barnes 1979: 548).

The soundness of this criticism has been the object of a heated scholarly debate, yet no shared solution has been reached (see now Castagnoli 2010). An infallibilist interpretation, according to which all beliefs are true simpliciter (see Theaetetus 161d6-7, 167a7-8; Aristotle, Metaphysics IV 5, 1009a7-8), clearly leads to Protagoras’ confutation for the above reasons. But Protagoras could nonetheless defend himself by endorsing some kind of relativism, according to which nothing is true simpliciter, but always relative to some framework. As a matter of fact, the criticism omits the qualifiers “for me” and “for you”, which are crucial to his thesis (Theaetetus 161d2-3; Aristotle, Met. IV 6, 1011a19-20; Sextus Empiricus, M VII 60). By introducing these qualifiers, Protagoras could reformulate the peritrope charge in such a way as to neutralise it: if what I judge is true and I judge that Protagoras’ thesis is false, it does not follow from this that Protagoras’ thesis is false in an absolute sense, but only that it is false “for me”. And the fact that it is false “for me” does not prevent it from being true for other people: it remains true, for instance, for Protagoras, who can thus avoid the charge that he is turning himself upside down (as well as denying the principle of non-contradiction; it may be argued however that this latter principle is denied when Protagoras’ adversary judges that Protagoras’ thesis is false: in this case she would be relying on Protagoras’ thesis and at the same time denying it).

This defensive strategy, however, is potentially open to the more serious charge of solipsism. This risk is clearly present in the aforementioned thesis that it is “impossible to contradict” (80A19 DK). The thesis in question is fully compatible with MM. If each individual is the measure of his or her own world of sensations and judgements, contradiction can only be apparent: each individual entertains a relationship with things whose truth-reality cannot be contradicted or disputed by others. But how can we deal with these divergences and oppositions if everyone is right? If this is how things stand, what follows is a radical (and intolerable) form or solipsism, whereby the fact that each person is his or her own judge makes it impossible to discuss things with others (and, in addition, makes also Protagoras’ teaching useless). The price that Protagoras must pay in order to defend the consistency of his doctrines seems far too high (Woodruff 1999: 303).

In this case too Protagoras has some arguments on his side. Up until this point, the discussion has centred on the problem of “truth”, a concept the importance of which can hardly be disputed. However, no matter how central it may be, truth is not the only criterion that governs human thoughts and actions. Alongside truth there are other, equally important criteria, as the sophist argues in the so-called “Protagoras’ Apology” (166a–168c = 80A21a DK; the Theaetetus takes place in 399 BCE, the year of Socrates’ trial, by which time Protagoras had already passed away; this is the answer Protagoras would have given to Socrates, had he been present at the dialogue: it is not a fragment but it probably conveys some of his views). In his fictional reply, Protagoras distinguishes between knowledge and wisdom (sophia). Unlike knowledge and truth, wisdom varies. From the point of view of knowledge and truth, every individual is a measure, and the fact that each person is a measure depends on his relationship with reality he or she is experiencing—this is a fact. But from the point of view of the value of the contents (of wisdom), it cannot be ruled out that some people are capable of allowing the individual to establish a more expedient relationship with reality.

As for wisdom (sophia) and the wise man (sophos), I am very far from saying that they do not exist; but I also call the man clever who, by transforming things makes them appear to be good and be good for someone to whom they appeared to be bad and were bad. (Theaetetus 166d = 80A21a DK)

Protagoras’ aim is not merely to abolish the idea of truth which is shattered into an endless number of private truths; his aim is to replace this criterion with another, more effective criterion, that of the useful. It is by reflecting on the issue of the useful that the sophist, while respecting everybody’s opinion, shows his wisdom. The useful varies from one situation to the next, and the problem is to identify what is truly expedient in each case.

All in all, it is difficult to articulate a comprehensive and consistent interpretation of MM. The testimonies are scarce, and they basically depend on Plato, who, though considering Protagoras a worthy interlocutor, is not so much interested in presenting his thought as to criticise it. Whereas in the first part of the dialogue Protagoras is presented as endorsing some sort of relativism, in the “Apology” the emphasis is on some kind of pluralism, which is further confirmed by a passage from Protagoras, where it is argued that the variety of the useful does not so much depend on what one subjectively believes to be good or bad as on the fact that reality is manifold (Guthrie 1971: 164–175; Apfel 2011). The problem of relativism has stimulated a huge discussion among modern scholars (after the seminal Burnyeat 1976); but it has been correctly questioned that the strict adoption of this category can really contribute to a better understanding of the sophist (Bett 1989). A pluralist interpretation, on the contrary, enables us to underline the practical dimension of Protagoras’ teaching which was certainly important, and explains how MM can be combined with his activity of teacher. As already remarked, MM was the opening sentence of an epideixis: on the one side, it challenged traditional wisdom and epistemic authority by revaluating personal opinions and experiences; on the other side it also argued for the importance of practical and concrete expertise. Indeed, it was an excellent presentation and advertisement for his activity.

3. Protagoras on Language

3.1 Protagoras’ grammatical interests

Several testimonies report Protagoras’ interest on morphological, syntactic, and stylistic issues. Apparently, he was the first to distinguish the gender of nouns (male, female, and neuter) while also proposing many corrections for names in use in his day. Thus he suggested that the female nouns menis (μῆνις, “wrath”, “frenzy”) and pelex (πήληξ, “helmet”), two terms familiar to Homer’s audience, should be regarded as masculine—either on the basis of morphological criteria (because names ending in sigma [ς] or xi [ξ] are usually masculine) or because of their meaning (insofar as war is an eminently masculine pursuit: see 80A27-8 DK). Protagoras also distinguished four verbal modes (indicative, conjunctive, optative, and imperative), which he linked to four types of speech (prayer, question, reply, and command), once again taking the occasion to mention Homer, who had addressed the goddess with a command (“Sing, Goddess, the wrath”) rather than a prayer (80A29 DK). Finally, Diogenes Laertius (IX 52 = 80A1 DK) seems to inform us of Protagoras’ interest in verb tenses (but this is more controversial). All in all, these grammatical reflections presuppose a “rudimentary” (Rademaker 2013: 86) theory of language, which is not limited to names but is rather investigated from the point of view of its underlying structure and connections in relation to the different functions of terms.

This interest on language did not depend on exclusively erudite or grammatical interests, as though Protagoras simply sought to codify or standardise the linguistic usages of the Greek world. On the contrary, practical and philosophical interests were in play. On the one hand, it was a matter of increasing the potential of words in view of the practical aim of teaching pupils to exploit language to further their goals: it is by mastering a language that one can use it more effectively. This is what happens in the Clouds; as Aristophanes was to note, these are the tools that help “make the weaker argument the stronger” (80B6b DK): in order to learn the “unjust argument” (Aristophanes’ version of Protagoras’ “weaker argument”), one must first learn the rules of grammar (Clouds, 658–691 = 80C3 DK). Besides, criticism of Homer is also a way to challenge the poet’s authority. From the surviving testimonies it appears that an important part of Protagoras’ teaching was devoted to the interpretation of poets such as Homer, Simonides (see Plato’s Protagoras 339a–e) and Hesiod (see below §5). Clearly, the purpose is not to provide a mere exegesis. Rather, it is to critically discuss the text and fulfil an educational goal: literary criticism is a useful intellectual exercise which enables the individual to grow familiar with and eventually criticise traditional values which were conveyed by the poets (Morgan 2000: 89–94). The sophist’s strategy is one of appropriation, where an engagement with traditional knowledge represents the starting point of their attempt to acquire a dominant position in the Athenian cultural scene. In such a way, Protagoras could reinforce his claim to be a new teacher, an educator capable of imparting teachings suited to the needs of the new world of the polis.[2]

3.2 Protagoras on correctness (orthotes)

From a philosophical perspective of special importance is the recurrent focus on the issue of correctness of names (orthotes onomaton, orthoepeia), which is to say the capacity of language to faithfully portray reality. This was the object of many discussions in fifth-century BCE Athens; Plato’s Phaedrus reports that one of Protagoras’ works was entitled Orthoepeia (The Correctness of Language; Phdr. 267c = 80A26 DK). Regrettably, the content of this book is completely unknown; but different sources confirm that Protagoras had an interest in the problem of correctness of language at different levels (Gagarin 2008: 28–30). We already mentioned Protagoras’ grammatical interests, which implied the thesis of linguistic correctness. On another level, the notion of orthos is used as a criterion for analysing poetry: correctness in this case concerns not points of grammar, but the consistency of a composition, its statements, and its moral teaching (80A25 DK). Finally, the same notion could also be applied in an even more general sense, as in the following testimony:

When a competitor in the pentathlon unintentionally struck Epitimus of Pharsalus with a javelin and killed him, he [i.e., Pericles] spent a whole day with Protagoras examining the difficulty whether, according to the most correct reasoning, it was the javelin, or the man who throw it, or the umpires, that should be considered responsible for this unfortunate event. (80A10 DK)

This testimony is a fine example of Protagoras’ way of reasoning. The facts are indisputable: a man has unintentionally killed another man. However, everything remains to be said as regards the issues of moral responsibility, legal guilt, and how to judge the whole incident. One and the same indisputable fact may be viewed from many different perspectives: for the physician, the javelin will be responsible for the man's death; for the umpire, it will be the javelin-thrower; for the person who has organised the competition, it will be the umpire. This contrast gives the sophist some room for action: he will attempt to create some agreement, lending meaning and order to the event (Untersteiner 1949 [1954: 56–57]). The notion of correctness is the criterion which enables him to overcome the above difficulties: given that there is some validity to all the above points of view, the problem will be to find the one most suited to the situation, while foregoing any claim to come up with a single, independently valid in all cases, answer. No doubt, the notion of “correctness” finds a prominent place in Protagoras’ thought and allows us to grasp some of its strands of continuity. At the basis of this notion lies the awareness of the problematic relationship between reality and human beings which was discussed in connection with MM, and which finds another expression in the statement that “concerning every subject, there are two arguments opposed to one another” (80B6a DK). With regard to each thing there are two opposite logoi (speeches, arguments, points of view)—A and non-A—precisely because each experience is open to contrasting readings and interpretations (thus, in the case of the above example, each of the three elements can be reduced to this binary logic by arguing whether it has been or not the umpire, or the javelin, or the javelin-thrower). Logos, which expresses our capacity to think and speak, thus cannot exhaust the complexity of reality. However, as already noted with regard to MM, contradictory points of view do not imply confusion or the failure of human possibilities. Rather, the challenge that Protagoras takes up and the promise he makes is to be able to (and teach others to) unravel this complexity by identifying which of any two opposite logoi is the better, or rather the more correct, which is to say the one better suited to the circumstance at hand: this is probably the meaning of his well-known claim to “to make the weaker argument the stronger” (80B6b DK). It is easy to discern the structural analysis that links this notion of correctness to that of the type of usefulness we have discussed in relation to the MM fragment: in both cases the problem is to find the best, most expedient relationship with things in each circumstance, and this can be obtained by using correctly our logos, both in the sense of judging correctly the case and convincing the others.

We here get a better idea of Protagoras’ teaching, which centres on the concept of logos, understood both as the ability to reason and the ability to express oneself (i.e., as both thought and language). “Correctness”, in other words, is to be understood on two levels, a conceptual and a linguistic one: correct reasoning, which expresses the best possible solution, must find a counterpart in formal correctness, which makes one’s speech persuasive and hence allows one to gain the upper hand in each particular situation (Classen 1976: 222–225). The best speech, therefore, is not the speech that is true but the speech that is correct, the speech best suited to the situation at hand and most capable of outdoing others from a formal and logical perspective: an irrefutable logos (Brancacci 2002: 183–190).

4. Protagoras on the Gods

Protagoras’ penchant for sensational statements, capable of seizing the public’s attention, is further confirmed by the opening of the On the Gods:

About the gods I am able to know neither that they exist nor that they do not exist nor of what kind they are in form: for many things prevent me for knowing this, its obscurity and the brevity of man’s life. (80B4 DK; on the text, see Benedetto 2001 and Corradi 2017: 445–448)

According to some ancient sources, this statement had a disproportionate effect: his books were burned in public, while he was convicted in Athens on a charge of atheism and sentenced to death; he then escaped and lost his life in a shipwreck. As already remarked, all these anecdotes are probably fictitious, but it is true that the sophist was made the object of unanimous and enduring condemnation, to the point of bringing together traditionally antithetical schools of thought, such as the Christians and the Epicureans, both concord in condemning his thesis as atheistic (see Diogenes of Oenoanda, 80A23 DK, and Epiphanius, Against Heresies III 16). As a matter of fact, there is no reason to assume a profession of atheism on his part, because these hostile sources conflate a confession of ignorance (“I do not know that P”) with a profession of knowledge (“I know that not-P”). “To the believer, agnostics may be as bad as atheists; but to the atheists agnostics are not much better than believers” (Barnes 1979: 449–450). Protagoras is the first thinker to take an agnostic stance, which can hardly be understood as an expression of atheism; at stake, in the fragment, is not so much an ontological thesis (on the existence of the gods) but an epistemological one (on our knowledge of them; Drozdek 2005: 41). Like in the case of MM, also in this fragment the emphasis seems to fall on the absence of a universal and incontrovertible truth.

While it is evident that Protagoras’ statement is not a profession of atheism, its overall meaning is less clear. Some interpreters have denied that Protagoras is doubting the existence of the gods in this passage on the ground of a parallel with the use of hos in this statement and in the MM: in the latter case, as we have seen, the preposition clearly has a modal meaning; if we assume that it was used in the same sense in the former passage, we must conclude that, according to this line of interpretation, Protagoras was chiefly interested in the way in which the gods are and present themselves, rather than in their presumed existence or non-existence. Protagoras would thus be claiming that we do not know “how” the gods are or are not, and the words that follow (“nor of what kind they are in form”) would have an almost epexegetic function (or would more concretely refer to the problem of their visible appearance: see Kerferd 1981a: 165–168). This would imply, then, that Protagoras never raised any doubts as to the existence of the gods (and a different translation of the first clause would follow: “I am able to know neither how they exist nor how they do not exist”). The merit of this reading is that it explains the otherwise inappropriate order of the two clauses: since the first statement argues for agnosticism, it makes no sense to discuss the problem of the gods’ form. Against it, however, it must be noted that all the ancient sources, from Plato onwards (see Theaetetus, 162d), unanimously present Protagoras’ thesis as though it concerned the existence of the gods. As there are no reasons to go against such a solid tradition, it is better to interpret the text as discussing both the existence of the gods (“neither that they exist nor that they do not exist”) and their form (“nor of what kind they are in form”). As for the order of the two clauses, the most reasonable explanation is that, like in the MM fragment, these opening statements, whose primary aim was to attract the attention of the audience, were not meant to be too rigorous. To be sure, to begin by professing one’s own ignorance is an unconventional choice. Incidentally, it is worth noting that the statement possibly presents the first recorded use of the verb “to be” in an existential sense (Kahn 1973: 302).

The reasons which Protagoras reportedly adduced in support of his thesis—the obscurity of the problem and the brevity of human life—have been regarded as too banal, or at any rate not particularly relevant. However, they acquire greater significance when viewed in relation to a concept the importance of which has already been stressed in relation to the MM, namely personal experience: this is the only legitimate criterion to verify our knowledge (Mansfeld 1981). Therefore it seems that also in this case by highlighting the limits of human experience, Protagoras was engaging in a polemic with those Presocratic thinkers, such as Parmenides and Heraclitus, who had repeatedly claimed to be able to transcend the limits of human knowledge, as well as the poets, who had based their authority on a privileged contact with the divine world. In this respect, some interesting similarities are to be found between Protagoras and Xenophanes of Elea (21B34 DK), who also reportedly criticised human claims to know the truth about the gods (significantly, for Xenophanes too, obscurity is an obstacle to knowledge). The analogies with Xenophanes become even more striking when we consider the second segment of the first statement, concerning the presumed appearance of the gods. In raising this problem, Protagoras was in all likelihood referring to the anthropomorphic conception, which Xenophanes had already repeatedly censured (see also Herodotus Histories II 53,1; Sassi 2013).

One intriguing problem for scholars has been to reconstruct the follow-up to this text. It is difficult to imagine that, after a statement of this sort, Protagoras continued to speak at length about the gods. The structure of the sentence (and in particular the presence of the particle men, which implies a contrasting de) suggests that the author shifted his attention onto man: for the Greeks, the notions of god and man were mutually defining. It is likely, therefore, that in the continuation of the text, Protagoras discussed not the problem of the gods in itself, but rather the issue of what they represent for man, thereby inaugurating an anthropological and sociological approach that considers religion in terms of its function for human civilisation and society (Jaeger 1947: 176). This hypothesis is no doubt more persuasive than the alternative hypothesis that the text was then devoted to a critique of religious beliefs or, on the contrary, that the acknowledgement of human weakness was intended to pave the way to an expression of piety and reverence for the unknowable nature of the gods. What is less convincing is the way in which this hypothesis has been developed. From Jaeger onwards, scholars have believed that, while leaving the problem of the actual existence of the gods open, Protagoras celebrated their importance for human civilisation in the sense that religious beliefs and sentiments played a decisive role in the development of human civilisation. Given the silence of this fragment, this hypothesis is based on the myth that Protagoras relates in the dialogue named after him, where mention is made of these beliefs. Yet what may be inferred from the myth is rather the very opposite (see §5, for a detailed analysis of this testimony). In the myth, Protagoras acknowledges the importance of belief in the gods as something specifically and universally human; but the very moment he acknowledges the presence of the religious dimension, he de facto limits its importance by implying that this belief (or fear) is not enough to provide a foundation for human society. What ensures that men can live together in cities is rather politics. Protagoras’ agnosticism is therefore instrumental towards his radical humanism, which is also attested in the MM fragment and in the myth of Prometheus.

5. Protagoras’ Political Thought

5.1 The myth of the “Protagoras”

The last important testimony on Protagoras comes from the first part of Plato’s Protagoras, where the sophist tells Socrates and the rest of the audience his own version of the myth of Prometheus (Protagoras 320c–322d = 80C1 DK). In the dialogue, this myth is meant to defend both the Athenian democratic practice of allowing every citizen to express his own ideas in public contexts and Protagoras’ claim to teach the “political art”. The myth is told in three phases:

  1. When the time had come to generate mortal animals (including humans), the gods entrusted Prometheus with assigning each species qualities that would allow it to survive and prosper. Prometheus (literally, “he who understands first”, “who foresees”) left the task up to his brother Epimetheus (“he who understands afterwards”), but the latter forgot humans.
  2. To make up for his brother’s mistake, Prometheus stole fire and technical expertise from the gods, allowing humans to approach the world of the gods, learn how to speak, and master the technologies required to solve practical life problems—the provision of food, clothing, and housing. However, despite this progress, humanity risked becoming extinct as it lacked political wisdom, and

    when they gathered together, they committed injustice against one another…so that they scattered once again and were destroyed. (322b).

  3. Fearing that the human race would meet extinction, Zeus dispatched Hermes to distribute justice (dike) and shame (aidos), not in the same way as with the other forms of arts (whereby, for instance, one physician is enough for many patients), but to everyone indiscriminately.

As Protagoras will make clear in the rest of his speech (322d–328d) the possession of these two virtues, which is clearly one major topic of the sophist’s political teaching, constitutes the basis of the social life.

This is not a fragment, but it is a reasonable and widely shared assumption that it conveys some Protagorean ideas. The problem is how to interpret it. There are at least two possibilities: (1) According to several scholars, this myth reflects Protagoras’ views on the development of human civilisation, a highly debated topic in fifth-century Athens (Kahn 1981: 98). Such a reading, however, has several limitations, both if you read it literally or metaphorically. Taken literally, the myth is full of inconsistencies. Just to give some examples: there does seem to be a pre-existing human kind, which is virtually defined by the possession of qualities which will be introduced later; since first humans were living scattered, it is not clear how they developed and used the different specialised arts; if language is distributed like the other technai, the absurd conclusion is that it does not belong to all human beings; the only possible solution to account for the passage from the second to the third phase seems to depend on Zeus’ direct intervention, a belief which is hard to reconcile with Protagoras’ agnosticism (see §4). Taken metaphorically, as a mythical (Platonic?) reshaping of an historical account, it results in a rather banal summary of some popular and widespread views on human progress (Cole 1967: 51) and does not explain the overall structure of Protagoras’ speech in its entirety. As a matter of fact, in the logos which follows the myth there is no interest at all for any sort of chronological reconstruction. To be sure, many parallels with the dossier of texts on the origins of human civilisation can be underlined; there is no need to deny a common ground between Protagoras’ myth and these texts. But there is no need either to read into the myth an historical narrative that either Protagoras or Plato would have reshaped into a myth. (2) An alternative, and more promising, option is to take the myth for what it is, that is, a myth—as a story and not history (Farrar 1988; Sihvola 1989; Bonazzi 2011; Beresdorf 2013). It is not a matter of denying that the story is clearly articulated in three phases, but of remarking that the myth need not be interpreted in a chronological sense as if it were offering a naturalistic reconstruction of how our civilisation developed. It is rather meant to account for how our society is organised and identify some essential features of humankind itself. When read in this way, analytically and not genetically, the myth gains in clarity and originality (interestingly, Plato often uses aetiological mythical narratives about the origins of certain phenomena, see for instance Betegh 2009 on the Aesopean myth on pleasure and pain in Phaedo 60b–c; these parallels could be tentatively used in favour of the attribution to Plato of the mythological format also in the case of the Protagoras). If the goal is to explain who we are, the myth does not need to be divided in three or five steps (as it is possible, of course), but rather in two parts, between the pre-political state of nature and the political world of the city, the first envisaging an impossible world, a counterfactual example which shows e contrario, what is really distinctive of the human world—what really allows men to live the way they live: not technical skills (or the belief in the gods), but the political attitude, which consists in the possess of aidos and dikeaidos corresponding to the component that enables each to govern himself in his conduct towards other human beings and dike to the norms which regulate the social intercourse among human beings (Segvic 2004 [2009: 9–11]). In this myth we find a first defence of the idea, which Aristotle will make famous, that we are political animals. Human beings are political animals: and political society is not so much the final accomplishment of mankind’s long journey but the condition of possibility for human life, which is always associated life.

5.2 Protagoras on technai

The comparison with the testimonies at our disposal on human civilisation shows what is distinctive, and remarkable, of Protagoras’ myth. Scholars insist on the parallels between the myth and these other texts. The differences, however, are even more interesting than the affinities. These texts all share a similar account of the history of human civilisation, underlining the importance of technical skills as the key condition for human progress. From Aeschylus and the other tragic poets to the corpus hippocraticum and Diodorus/Democritus, the history of human progress depends on technai, which are praised for enabling human beings to overcome natural needs and the perils of an hostile environment and thus to live a prosperous life (for a collection of these texts see Cole 1967 or Guthrie 1971: 79–84; the only remarkable exception is the Sisyphus fragment, 88B25 DK, which is later and clearly reminiscent of sophistical ideas). Techne is what marks the distinction between civilisation and savagery, and between human beings and animals. In Protagoras’ myth, on the contrary, technai do not play a decisive role—they do not suffice to warrant human survival and prosperity. Protagoras rather insists on the fact that technai, alone, are not able to warrant human progress, nor human survival, for the problem is not external, natural necessities, but internal, the human tendency to prevaricate and commit injustice:

when they gathered together, they committed injustice against one another…so that they scattered once again and were destroyed. (Protagoras 322b)

This is a remarkable difference, which changes the terms of the problem. Technical skills can help with natural necessities, but are not useful with human relations, which is by far a much more complicated problem. The emphasis on technai turns out to be excessive. What warrant human prosperity is the enactment of norms and laws (the problem of dike, justice), along with ethical and moral values (aidos, shame). These ideas are only sketched in the myth, but will be extensively developed in the second part of his speech, where Protagoras repeatedly underlines the political nature of human beings (see Protagoras 323a, 323b–c, 324c–325a). Protagoras’ myth, by underlining this point, presents a very subtle attack against technai and forcefully defends the importance of political art, which is the object of his teaching.

Interestingly, Protagoras’ critical attitude towards technai is also confirmed by other Platonic and, even more important, non-Platonic testimonies. In Protagoras 318e–319a Protagoras attacks Prodicus and Hippias because by only teaching technai such as “arithmetic, astronomy, geometry, and music” they do not teach the pupils what is really important for the polis (that is, political art). Protagoras’ argument seems to be that these specialised kinds of expertise are not really useful to the life of the polis, contrary to what is claimed by its supporters. Analogously, Aristotle (Metaphysics 998a2-4 = 80B7 DK) and Philodemus (On Poems, fr. 11 = 80B7a DK; but the reconstruction of this text is controversial, see Romeo 1992) inform us that Protagoras attacked geometry and perhaps astronomy and geodesics by arguing that their abstract investigations are hardly compatible with the results of empirical observation (“a hoop does not touch a straight edge at a point”, Protagoras argued according to Aristotle, Metaphysics 998a2-4 = 80B7 DK); therefore they amount to an insignificant verbal game of no utility. These are probably the arguments to which Plato himself was alluding to in the Sophist (232d–e = 80B8 DK) when he reports that Protagoras was teaching how “to contradict each of the artisans” in On Wrestling and the Other Arts. In Protagoras we therefore find two lines of attack against the technai. The first goes against the widespread view that the technai played a decisive role in achieving civilised society by arguing that they are necessary but not sufficient. Secondly, he attacked some specific technai such as geometry or astronomy as useless. These are admittedly different arguments and criticisms. But combined together, they seem to confirm the importance of politics and the political art, which are the objects of Protagoras’ teaching.

5.3 Protagoras on justice and law

The emphasis on the political dimension can be paralleled with the so-called Protagoras’ “Apology” in the Theaetetus—the problem of the compatibility between this dialogue and the Protagoras is one of the most urgent problems in Protagoras’ scholarship. In the myth, it is only stated that human beings, insofar as they are human beings, have a predisposition towards justice (dike). In the “Apology” (and partly in the second part of Protagoras’ speech in the Protagoras), there are not only individual decisions at stake but also collective ones. In the latter case the discussion is about the law (nomos), which depends on human decisions and can be modified according to the circumstances

whatever seems [or: is decreed to be, dokein] just and fine to each city also is that for it, so long as it thinks [or: adopt this law, nomizein]. (80A21a DK)

These two claims can be easily recombined by arguing that the law is the concrete actualisation of the human predisposition towards justice.

What is more controversial is how the apparent relativism of the “Apology” can be read into the myth and how it can be reconciled with its emphasis on the “naturalistic” notion of justice in the myth. But the tension is probably more apparent than real, for in the myth it is not said that justice can be developed in one sense only, and the notion of “useful”, which plays an important role in both dialogues, paves the way for a consistent reading of the two testimonies. Indeed, nomos is not the result of arbitrary decisions but depends on objective situations. But since situations and contexts are different and what is useful varies from context to context (cf. Protagoras 333e–334c), thus nomos also varies. Once again, more than “relativism” it is “pluralism” (according to which the variety of human laws depends on the complexity of reality) that seems to better describe Protagoras’ view. The joint reading of the two texts produces therefore something like the following: human beings have a predisposition towards justice, which is what will enable them to live a prosperous life (the alternative, without justice, would be conflict and use of force like in the animal world, see below, §5.4, the reference to Hesiod in the myth); justice, insofar as it is the condition for social life, is in the interest of human beings. Concretely speaking, this predisposition towards justice will find its actualisation in specific laws, which promote an advantageous relationship with reality. But since reality is complex and unstable, laws can be accordingly modified. The task of the politician (and the sophist) is therefore to promote the interest of the political community (polis) in any given situation by establishing the right (that is, advantageous) laws

the clever and competent orators [i.e., those who publicly discuss political matters, hence politicians and sophists] make good things seem to be just to cities instead of bad ones. (80A21a DK)

Remarkably, this conclusion perfectly fits with what Protagoras argues in both dialogues by insisting on the importance of competent and expert teachers.

All in all, Protagoras appears as one of the first supporters of a conventionalist notion of justice (Neschke-Hentschke 1995: 56–59; Bonazzi 2020: 67–68). Law and justice coincide: the just is what is established by law, which is the result of human decisions, a set of rules that men establish together. Interestingly, it is precisely this kind of conventionalist account of justice and the relation between nomos and the useful that will be objects of heated debates in the second half of the fifth century BCE, most notably among the sophists (see Antiphon 87B44 DK, significantly from a treatise entitled Truth, Xenophon, Memorabilia Book I, Ch. 40–46, Callicles in Plato’s Gorgias 483b–484b, Thrasymachus in Plato’s Republic 338c–339a, Thucydides History V 84–105).

5.4 Protagoras on democracy

From an historical-political perspective it is worth noticing the parallel between Protagoras’ thesis and Athenian democracy. Awareness of the importance of nomos was of course widely spread in the Greek world from an early time. It is not a coincidence, therefore, that in the myth the mention of Zeus’ law clearly alludes to some very famous Hesiodic verses (Hesiod is also explicitly mentioned among many other authoritative figures earlier in the dialogue, at 316d–317c):

Perses, lay these things in your heart
And give heed to Justice, and put violence entirely out of your mind.
This is the law (nomon) that Cronus’ son [i.e., Zeus] has established for human beings:
That fish and beasts and winged birds
eat one another, since Justice is not among them;
but to human beings he has given Justice, which is the best by far. (Hesiod, Works and Days 274–280)

This quotation is not a display of erudition, but aims to indicate the real subtext of the myth, with Protagoras adopting a subtle strategy of appropriation of the poet. Hesiod’s basic idea is that nomos (law, justice, politics) is what distinguishes humans from animals, insofar as it allows them to transcend the world of brute force and violence by creating an order based on shared values. As a matter of fact, as we have seen, this is also Protagoras’ thesis: what is typical of human beings is the common possession of justice, which is to say their political and social capacity. Protagoras’ myth, by alluding to Hesiod’s story, emphasises such a convergence. But also in this case the divergences are as interesting than the affinities. Borrowings are never neutral, and the appropriation is also a transformation. In Hesiod, Justice is divine, a deity, the daughter of Zeus, who intervened when he saw that men fail to respect her (Works and Days 257, 265; Theogony 901–903). All mythological imagery aside, this means the belief in the existence of absolute justice; human justice is not independent of this order of divine values, but must rather conform to it. The situation radically changes with Protagoras whose innovation consists in his emphasis on the human rather than divine. There is no place for divinity; justice is something human; it is determined by laws, which can vary—it is not what brings us close to the gods but what makes it possible to fulfil our natural potential. This emphasis on law as the result of collective human decisions was particularly well-suited to one of the key motives of the Athenian democratic propaganda, which insists on the idea of democracy as everyone’s government, as the government of the people as a whole and not just of a part of it (see Thucydides History VI 39: “democracy (demos) is the name for all, oligarchy for only a part”). Secondly, also in the Athenian political discourse the emphasis on the community is used to justify another cornerstone of the democratic ideology, arguably the most important one, namely the very close bond that must hold together the city’s interest and the individual’s, where the former is the precondition for the latter (for some interesting parallels, see Pericles in Thucydides History, II 40, 2 and 60, 2–4 and Herodotus Histories V 78). Thirdly, the parallel between the vindication of opinions implied by MM and another key motive of Athenian democracy, isegoria (everyone’s right to express their idea in the assembly), need to be taken into account: the right for everyone to express their ideas seems to rely on the assumption that all opinions are legitimate, as indeed Protagoras argued. All in all, without having to posit that Protagoras’ doctrines were developed precisely for this purpose, it is possible to note that they were far from irrelevant or foreign to the new political phase that Athens was experiencing. Protagoras’ views provide a theoretical basis for participatory democracy (Kerferd 1981a: 144; particularly important is Farrar 1988). Protagoras emerges as a democratic political thinker: he is a political thinker because he has shown that the social (or political—from polis) dimension is fundamental; he is democratic insofar as he suggests that political action is a collective and shared kind of action. It is hardly a coincidence that the main ancient reflections on democracy have often been set in relation to his ideas (see, e.g., Herodotus Histories III 80–82 or Dissoi logoi 7; Anonymous of Iamblichus, 90, 7 DK).

Indeed, presenting democracy, the form of government of the new times, as the heir and culmination of the Greek political tradition is certainly a brilliant outcome which legitimises Protagoras’ aspirations and ambitions. By claiming a direct link with the great poets and thinkers of the past but also by appropriating and transforming their tenets, Protagoras can present himself as an heir to Greek paideia, as one of the great masters, or, rather, as the great master, the only one who is capable of imparting a teaching that drew upon tradition but also meet the needs of the new times. In such a way, Protagoras could reinforce his claim to be the new teacher, the educator capable of imparting teachings suited to the needs of the new world of the polis. Plato’s goal, in the Protagoras and in the Theaetetus, was to show that this was not correct—if in the myth the sophist was implicitly identifying himself to Zeus, at the end he will turn out as Epimetheus. But for the time being, until this has been proven, one can well understand the enthusiasm of the Athenians when they heard that the great thinker had arrived in Athens (Protagoras 310b–e).


Editions and translations

  • Bonazzi, Mauro, 2007, I sofisti, Milan: Rizzoli.
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