The Sophists

First published Fri Sep 30, 2011; substantive revision Tue Aug 18, 2020

The Greek word sophistēs, formed from the noun sophia, ‘wisdom’ or ‘learning’, has the general sense ‘one who exercises wisdom or learning’. As sophia could designate specific types of expertise as well as general sagacity in the conduct of life and the higher kinds of insight associated with seers and poets, the word originally meant ‘sage’ or ‘expert’. In the course of the fifth century BCE the term, while retaining its original unspecific sense, came in addition to be applied specifically to a new type of intellectuals, professional educators who toured the Greek world offering instruction in a wide range of subjects, with particular emphasis on skill in public speaking and the successful conduct of life. The emergence of this new profession, which was an extension to new areas of the tradition of the itinerant rhapsode (reciter of poems, especially of Homer), was a response to various social, economic, political and cultural developments of the period. The increasing wealth and intellectual sophistication of Greek cities, especially Athens, created a demand for higher education beyond the traditional basic grounding in literacy, arithmetic, music and physical training. To some extent this involved the popularization of Ionian speculation about the physical world (see Presocratic Philosophy), which was extended into areas such as history, geography and the origins of civilization. The increase in participatory democracy, especially in Athens, led to a demand for success in political and forensic oratory, and hence to the development of specialized techniques of persuasion and argument. Finally, the period saw the flourishing of a challenging, rationalistic climate of thought on questions including those of morality, religion and political conduct, to which the sophists both responded and contributed. It is important to emphasize the individualistic character of the sophistic profession; its practitioners belonged to no organization, shared no common body of beliefs and founded no schools, either in the sense of academic institutions or in that of bodies of individuals committed to the promulgation of specific doctrines. In what follows we shall illustrate the diversity of sophistic activities, while considering the extent to which we can nevertheless identify common themes and attitudes.

1. Protagoras

A key figure in the emergence of this new type of sophist was Protagoras of Abdera, a subject city of the Athenian empire on the north coast of the Aegean. Abdera was also the birthplace of Democritus, whom some later sources represented as the teacher of Protagoras. In all probability Democritus was the younger of the two by about thirty years, and the only solid evidence of intellectual relations between them is a statement by Plutarch (Against Colotes. 1108F) that Democritus argued against Protagorean subjectivism (see below), complemented by Sextus, who reports (Against the Mathematicians VII.389–90) that Democritus’ arguments included the argument that Protagoras’ subjectivism is self-refuting. Protagoras was one of the earliest sophists; as presented in Plato’s Protagoras (one of our principal sources for Protagoras’ life and activities as a teacher) he says (317c) that he is old enough to be the father of anyone present, who included rival sophists Hippias and Prodicus, while another Plato passage (Meno 91e) says that he practised as a sophist for over forty years till his death at about seventy (probably about 420 BC). In the Protagoras he also says (316d–317b) that while the activity of sophistry has been practised by poets and other experts from ancient times, he is the first person to have openly proclaimed himself a “sophist” and claimed to teach people (sc. how to achieve success in life); he thus claims for himself recognition of his professional status in a role, that of teacher of human excellence as a means to success in life, which was traditionally claimed by the poets

Specifically, in the Protagoras he claims to teach ‘the proper management of one’s own affairs, how best to run one’s household, and the management of public affairs, how to make the most effective contribution to the affairs of the city by word and action’, and he accepts Socrates’ account of that subject as ‘the art of running a city’, which he promises will ‘make men into good citizens’ (319a). Can we form any conception of the means by which this ambitious project of education in self-improvement and good citizenship was to be put into effect? In his ‘Great Speech’ in the dialogue (320c–328d) Protagoras presents an account of the development of human civilization, with the aim of showing that the essence of good citizenship consists in justice and self-restraint, which are natural to humans in that the preservation of the social order, and ultimately the survival of the species, depend on their being universally inculcated. It is at least plausible that this complex of themes, including the development of civilization from primitive beginnings, the nature of social virtue and its foundation in human nature, represents some of the content of Protagoras’ actual teaching; the list of titles of his works preserved by Diogenes Laertius (IX.55) includes ‘On the Virtues’, ‘On (the) Constitution’ (Peri Politeias) and ‘On the State of Things in the Beginning’. Later in the dialogue he provides a critical reading of a poem of Simonides, saying that the ability to specify the good and bad parts of a poem and to justify one’s criticisms is a very important part of education (338e–339a). Relevantly to this, he is reported as a pioneer of some aspects of linguistic theory, and of its application to literary criticism. He wrote on correctness in language (orthoepeia, Plato, Phaedrus 267c): he is said to have devised a taxonomy of speech acts into assertion, question, answer, command etc. (Diogenes Laertius IX.53–4), and to have criticised the opening of the Iliad ‘Sing, goddess, of the wrath of Achilles’ on the ground that instead of a prayer, as it ought to be, the phrase is a command (Aristotle Poetics 1456b15–16). He is also said both to have classified grammatical genders (Aristotle Rhetoric 1407b6–7) and to have suggested that gender should be modified to fit the sense, so that ‘wrath’ (mēnis) in the same line of Homer, which is a grammatical feminine, should be masculine, since wrath is characteristic of males rather than females (Aristotle Sophistici Elenchi 173b19–20). It is unclear whether these topics and their application to literary criticism are seen primarily as part of an individual’s cultural refinement, something valuable for its own sake, or whether the aim is to be able to incorporate exegesis and criticism of poets in forensic or political speeches, as one tactic in argument and persuasion.

In any event, we do have some evidence for Protagoras’ teaching of techniques of argument. Diogenes Laertius’ list of titles includes one, ‘The Technique of Eristics’ (Technē Eristikōn) which certainly designates a handbook of argumentative techniques, and another which probably does. The literal title is ‘On Wrestling’, but it is more likely that the wrestling in question is intellectual than physical; there is nothing in our other evidence to suggest that Protagoras set himself up as an athletic coach. (It is relevant that Protagoras’ celebrated work ‘Truth’, which began with the famous ‘Man the Measure’ sentence (see below) apparently had the alternative title ‘Overthrowing’ (sc. Arguments) (Kataballontes).) So Protagoras taught argumentative strategies, but we have comparatively little evidence of what these actually were. The critique of Simonides’ poem mentioned above suggests that eliciting a contradiction from one’s opponent’s statements was one such strategy, since what Protagoras actually does is to seek to show that Simonides contradicts himself in first asserting that it is hard to become good and then in finding fault with Pittacus, one of the so-called ‘Seven Sages’, for saying that it hard to be good. Socrates’ description of the audience’s loud applause (339d10–e1) is one of the many indications that sophistic argumentative contests had the status of a spectator sport, even to the extent of figuring among the sideshows at the great athletic festivals; in Plato’s Lesser Hippias (363c–364a) Hippias describes how he goes regularly to the Olympic Games to take part in contests of question and answer and has never yet been beaten, and similarly Protagoras says that he has had verbal contests with many people, and that he would never have become celebrated if he had allowed his opponents to dictate the rules of the contest (Prot. 335a). According to Diogenes Laertius IX.52 Protagoras was the first to institute such contests. The technique of adversarial argument clearly has some connection with two specific claims for which Protagoras was famous (or notorious). According to Diogenes Laertius he was the first to maintain that on any matter there are two theses, statements (or perhaps arguments) (logoi) opposed to one another (IX.51 (=DK 80B6a)), and according to Aristotle he claimed ‘to make the weaker (or inferior) logos stronger (or superior) (ton hēttō logon kreittō poiein)’ (Rhetoric 1402a23–5 (=DK 80B6b)), for which claim he was, Aristotle says (ibid.), rightly censured. Investigation of what Protagoras may have meant by these claims leads to consideration of his views on truth and reality, and specifically to the ‘Man the Measure’ doctrine and the issue of relativism.

While relativism, particularly in the area of morality, is popularly seen as characteristic of sophists generally (see Bett 1989), in fact Protagoras is the only sophist to whom ancient sources ascribe relativistic views, and even in his case the evidence is ambiguous. A key text is the famous ‘Man the Measure’ sentence, the opening sentence of his work entitled ‘Truth’, which runs ‘Man is the measure of all things, of the things that are that they are and of the things that are not that they are not’ (Plato, Theaetetus 151e, Sextus Against the Mathematicians VII.60 (=DK 80B1)). In the Theaetetus (our principal source for this aspect of Protagoras’ teaching) this is interpreted as a claim of the relativity of the truth of all judgments to the experience or belief of the individual making the judgment, i.e., as subjectivism. On that interpretation, the way things seem to an individual is the way they are in fact for that individual. First illustrated by Socrates, who quotes this sentence, as a claim concerning sensory appearances, e.g., that if the wind feels cold to me and warm to you then it is cold for me and warm for you, in the course of the dialogue Socrates expands it to apply to all judgments, including itself, yielding the result that every belief is true for the person who holds it (and only for them), and hence that there is no objective truth on any matter. That this subjectivist interpretation was current in antiquity is shown by Aristotle’s attribution to Protagoras of the view that ‘it is equally possible to affirm and to deny anything of anything’ (Metaphysics 1007b20–22) and by Sextus’ evidence of Democritus’ critique of Protagoras mentioned above; Sextus reports Democritus (and Plato, see Theaetetus 170e–171c) as having argued that, given Protagoras’ thesis that every appearance (phantasia) is true, the thesis that it is not the case that every appearance is true, ‘which is itself in accordance with appearance (kata phantasian huphistamenon)’ is true; hence Protagoras’ thesis is self-refuting. But elsewhere in the Theaetetus (167c) Socrates explains Protagoras’ view by claiming on his behalf that ‘whatever things seem to each city to be fine and just are so for that city, so long as it maintains them (heōs an auta nomizēi)’: i.e., the truth about what is fine and just (which appears to indicate the truth of moral judgments generally) is relative not to the judgment of the individual, but to that of the society to which the individual belongs. If the wind feels cold to me, and I consequently believe that it is cold, there is no objective fact of the matter by reference to which that belief can be false; but if I believe that infanticide is wrong, whereas infanticide is sanctioned by the laws and customs of the state of which I am a citizen, then my belief is straightforwardly false, though of course it would come to be true if the state of which I am a citizen changed its laws and customs so as to condemn infanticide. Within a single Platonic dialogue, then, Protagoras is represented as maintaining both universal subjectivism and limited social relativism, though those two versions of relativism are mutually inconsistent. And there is a further twist. In the very passage of the Theaetetus where, according to Socrates, Protagoras maintains the social relativity of moral judgments (167b–c), he gives a pragmatic justification of the role of the expert, both in the individual and in the social context. In the individual case, while no appearance is truer than any other, some appearances are better than others, and it is the role of the expert (for instance, the doctor) to produce better appearances instead of worse (as those appearances are then judged even by the patient); while in the case of cities, some judgments of what is just etc. are better than others, and it is the role of the expert (in this case the expert orator) to persuade the city to adopt the better judgment. (He adds (167c7–d1) that the sophist improves those whom he educates in the same way, implying that not merely collective judgments but also individual judgments (about what?) may be better or worse.) This account of the role of the expert may imply that there are matters of fact of what is better and worse independent of the judgement of those whom the expert persuades. E.g., a city might initially judge it right to pursue its individual interest without any consideration of obligations to other cities, but then be persuaded that it was more in its long-term interest to respect treaties. That persuasion presupposes that the question of what is in the city’s long-term interest is a matter of fact, not merely a matter of how it now seems to the city.

The evidence of the Theaetetus on Protagorean relativism is therefore ambiguous, since in that dialogue he is represented as maintaining a) universal subjectivism, b) social relativism in morality and c) objective realism on questions of advantage. The evidence of Aristotle and Democritus (transmitted by Sextus) indicates that he did in fact maintain a), but leaves it open whether the attribution to him of b) and c) is historically accurate, thereby indicating inconsistency on his part, or is due to misinterpretation, deliberate or inadvertent, on the part of Plato. It should also be recognized that in the Theaetetus Socrates only attributes b) and c) to Protagoras in his overarching effort, on Theaetetus’ behalf, to explicate and defend as plausibly as possible the ‘Man the measure’ doctrine before refuting it. The portrayal in the Protagoras shows little trace of relativism, either individual or social; instead he maintains that the essential social virtues are justice and self-restraint, and that without universal inculcation of those virtues the survival of society is impossible. These claims are presented as universal truths; there is not the slightest suggestion that in making them Protagoras is merely expressing a preference for these virtues which happens to prevail, e.g., in Athens, but which might be absent from the mores of some other city. It is clearly implied by his exposition that no such city could exist. On the assumption, adopted above, that the presentation of Protagoras’ social teaching in the dialogue is in essentials intended to be historically accurate, we must conclude that Protagoras recognised certain objective truths, not merely on questions of advantage, but in some fundamentals of morality, and consequently that his basic position was inconsistent.

Yet a further epistemological position is attributed to Protagoras in a papyrus fragment of the biblical commentator Didymus the Blind (fourth century CE), published in 1968. In this he appears neither as a subjectivist nor as a social relativist, but as a sceptic. In the fragment he is represented as saying ‘To you who are present I appear to be sitting, but to someone who is not present I do not appear to be sitting. It is unclear whether I am sitting or not’. On this account there is an objective fact of the matter, which is undiscoverable because different individuals have different appearances of what is the case, whereas given subjectivism there is no fact of the matter over and above the individual appearances which establish how each thing is for the one being appeared to. This might be yet another inconsistency on the part of Protagoras, but if so it is one which has no confirmation from any other source. It is more likely that what the fragment presents is a garbled instance of Protagorean subjectivism. Instead of the genuinely Protagorean argument ‘It seems to A that I am sitting and to B that I am not sitting, so I am sitting for A and I am not sitting for B’ we have the argument given in the fragment. Since the subjectivist thesis is that every belief is true for the person who has it, from the premisses that A believes that I am sitting and B does not believe that I am sitting (because B has no belief one way or the other), the correct Protagorean conclusion is not that it is unclear whether I am sitting or not sitting, but that it is true for A that I am sitting and that it is neither true for B that I am sitting nor true for B that I am not sitting.

All of this leaves it unclear what we are to make of the assertion that on every matter there are two logoi opposed to one another, and the claim to make the weaker logos (the) stronger. The former cannot be understood as the assertion of universal subjectivism, since it is in fact inconsistent with it. Given universal subjectivism, the claim that the wind is cold for me is not opposed to the claim that it is warm for you, since both are (relatively) true. Nor, for the same reason, can it be understood as an assertion of social relativism: the assertion that for girls to exercise naked is shameful in Athens is not opposed to the claim that it is not shameful in Sparta. Perhaps we should not try to tie this claim tightly to any general metaphysical position, but interpret it more loosely as the claim that that on a great many matters there are two sides to the question. What this might involve is perhaps indicated by the so-called Dissoi Logoi (i.e., Arguments on Either Side), a short text found appended to some manuscripts of Sextus, generally dated to the end of the fifth century. This text consists for the most part of a series of short discussions of pairs of standardly opposed moral properties, e.g., the good and the bad, the just and the unjust, the most general pattern being a series of arguments to show on the one hand that the opposed properties are in fact identical, followed by a series to show that on the other they are non-identical. Mostly the arguments for identity depend on the relativity of the application of the property, e.g., the bad is the same as the good because disease is bad for the patient but good for the doctor, while the arguments for non-identity rely on the absence of relativity, e.g., doing what is good for one’s parents is not the same thing as doing what is bad for one’s parents. Plainly, there is no inconsistency between the theses of identity and of non-identity, and it is not clear that the reader is supposed to be required to choose one rather than the other. Perhaps the point is simply to see that, given the appropriate distinctions, there is something to be said either way, with the implication that the correct answer to the question ‘Is the good the same as the bad, or different?’ is ‘In one way (i.e., relative to different things) the same, in another (i.e., relative to the same thing) different’ (see Protagoras 334a–c.). That could be a useful tactic to employ against an opponent who insisted on a ‘Yes or No’ answer.

Similarly, the claim to make the weaker logos the stronger has nothing to do with relativism, either individual or social. Since, as we have seen, relativized beliefs are not in conflict with one another, arguments in favor of them are not in conflict either, and hence neither the beliefs themselves nor the arguments in favor of them can be weaker or stronger than one another. Aristotle’s evidence in the Rhetoric passage cited above indicates that the context of the claim is that of forensic oratory, and specifically that the arguments in question are arguments from what is likely or plausible, e.g., on the one side that it is not likely that a weakling would assault a strong man, since he would expect to be beaten up himself instead, and on the other side that it is not likely that a strong man would assault a weakling, since everyone would assume precisely that it was likely that he would do so, hence he would know that he would almost certainly be found guilty, hence in those circumstances it is unlikely that he would actually commit the crime. In any case of this kind, where it is assumed that the facts cannot be established with certainty, considerations of what is plausible may, given sufficient ingenuity, be adduced on either side, and similar arguments can be adduced in the context of political deliberation, where the future outcome cannot be certain and the decision has to turn on the balance of probabilities. It is likely, then, that this slogan was a sales pitch for Protagoras as a teacher of forensic and deliberative rhetoric. How ambitious the claim was is hard to determine. It is hard to believe that he ventured to claim always to make the prima facie weaker case carry the day (which is equivalent to the claim to make every case whatever carry the day), but equally implausible that he merely claimed to make the weaker case stronger than it was before he devised arguments in its favor. Perhaps he simply claimed that he was capable, in the appropriate circumstances, of devising arguments which would turn the weaker case into the stronger one. If so, the claim was both reasonable and, despite Aristotle’s strictures, not necessarily morally discreditable. E.g., the prosecution may have a strong case that Leon committed a theft, since a number of eye-witnesses identified him as the thief, but if the defence can show that he has an identical twin brother, Pantaleon, who was in the vicinity, and further that Pantaleon is a known thief, whereas Leon has an unblemished record, the case that Leon is innocent, which was previously the weaker, is now the stronger, and the defence is not necessarily guilty of any sharp practice (even if Leon was in fact guilty of the crime). (Of course, a defence counsel who secured an acquittal on these grounds while knowing independently that Leon was guilty would deserve Aristotle’s disapproval.)

To complete our account of Protagoras’ views on language and reality we need to mention the thesis that it is impossible to say what is false, which occurs in three Platonic passages, Euthydemus 284a–c, Theaetetus 188d–189a and Sophist 236e–237e. According to this argument falsehood is impossible, since to say what is false is to say what is not (legein to mē on), whereas anyone who speaks has to say something that is (on ti); hence saying what is not is saying what is not anything, i.e., not saying anything. Hence, since of contradictory statements one must be false, it is not possible to contradict (ouk estin antilegein (Euthydemus 286b)). This argument has its origin in Parmenides’ claim (DK 28B2) that ‘You could not know what is not … nor could you say it’, and its application to falsehood and the impossibility of contradiction is ascribed to various fifth-century figures, including ‘Protagoras and his associates and even earlier people’ (hoi amphi Prōtagoran … kai hoi eti palaioteroi (Euthydemus 286c2–3)), Prodicus (in another fragment of Didymus, published in 1966), Cratylus (Cratylus 429d) and Antisthenes (Aristotle Metaphysics 1024b32–4). In the case of the latter two the thesis connects with other more general theses about language which they are reported to have held. Thus Cratylus has attributed to him by Plato the thesis that each thing has its own proper name, which expresses, through its etymology, the nature of the things it names, and which has significance only when correctly applied, but is otherwise a mere empty sound. Hence there can no such thing as the misapplication of a name (since a misapplied name is not a name, but a mere sound), and hence no such thing as a false statement, since (it is assumed) every false statement involves the misapplication of some name. Similarly Antisthenes held that each thing has its own proper definition or description, which cannot be applied to anything else, from which again the impossibility of falsehood follows. In the case of Protagoras it is hard to find any such connection. On the most plausible construal of subjectivism no one’s belief can contradict anyone else’s belief, but that does not appear to rule out an individual’s having inconsistent beliefs. Further, subjectivism does not rule out false statements; I can falsely assert ‘The wind is cold for me’ when in fact it is not cold for me. Though Protagoras seems to have had a fairly high tolerance threshold for inconsistency, it is hard to see how one and the same person could assert both that it is impossible to contradict and that on every matter there are two opposed logoi. The wording of the attribution to Protagoras in the Euthydemus is suspiciously vague, suggesting that Plato is attributing to Socrates a vague memory of Protagorean subjectivism, rather than precise recall of any particular doctrine.

2. Nomos and Phusis

Protagoras’ account of social morality in the Great Speech, according to which the universal acceptance of justice and self-restraint is necessary for the perpetuation of society, and thereby for the preservation of the human species, places Protagoras firmly on one side (the conservative side, we should note) of the debate about the relation between law and convention (nomos) on the one hand and nature or reality (phusis) on the other, which was central to moral and social thought in the fifth and fourth centuries. The debate was fundamentally about the status of moral and other social norms; were such norms ever in some sense part of or grounded in the reality of things, or were they in every case mere products of human customs, conventions or beliefs? The question was crucial to the perceived authority of norms; both sides agreed in seeing nature as authoritative for correct human behavior, and as the ultimate source of true value. Critics of traditional morality argued that since that morality was nothing more than a human invention it thereby lacked genuine authority (which belonged to the realm of nature), thus sanctioning violation of traditional moral norms if the violator could escape punishment or other bad consequences (while ‘following nature’), while the upholders of morality sought to show that morality, as reflected in traditional norms, was itself in some sense a part or product of nature. We find examples of the critical stance both in some Platonic dialogues and in some sophistic writings. The starkest expression of the opposition between nomos and phusis is that expressed in the Gorgias by Callicles, a pupil of Gorgias (though there is no suggestion in the dialogue or elsewhere that Gorgias himself held that position): Callicles holds that conventional morality is a contrivance devised by the weak and unintelligent to inhibit the strong and intelligent from doing what they are entitled by nature to do, viz. exploit their inferiors for their own advantage. He is thus an inverted moralist, who holds that what it is really right to do is what it is conventionally wrong to do. The true, authoritative norms are those which prevail in nature, as shown by the behavior of non-human animals such as beasts of prey; those who act in accordance with these norms ‘do these things in accordance with the nature of justice and … the law of nature, but perhaps not in accordance with this one which we lay down’ (Plato, Gorgias, 483e). The sophist Thrasymachus maintains a similar position in Book I of the Republic, though without Callicles’ daring inversion of values. He agrees with Callicles in praising the ruthless individual (above all the tyrant) who is capable of overcoming the restraints of morality, but whereas Callicles calls such self-assertion naturally just, Thrasymachus abides by conventional morality in calling it unjust. Both agree that a successful life of ruthless self-assertion is supreme happiness, and that that is what nature prompts us to seek; both, then, accept the normative authority of nature over nomos. The difference between them is that Callicles takes the further step of identifying the authority of nature with that of real, as opposed to conventional morality, whereas for Thrasymachus there is only one kind of morality, conventional morality, which has no authority. In Book II Glaucon presents a modified version of Thrasymachus’ position; while maintaining, as Protagoras does in the Great Speech, that humans adopt moral conventions as a necessary survival strategy in a hostile world, he insists that this involves a stunting of human nature, since people are obliged for self-protection to abandon the goal of self-satisfaction to which nature, as Thrasymachus insists, prompts them. This assertion of egoism is supported by the thought-experiment of Gyges’ ring; if, like the legendary Gyges, we had a magic ring which rendered us invisible, and hence immune from sanctions, we would all seek our own interest without restraint. We find a similar down-grading of convention in favor of nature (though one lacking the immoralist conclusions) in Hippias’ speech in the Protagoras (337c–d), where he urges that intellectuals such as are gathered in the house of Callias ought not to quarrel, since, though according to artificial political conventions they are citizens of many different cities, by nature they are all akin. The conventions which make them treat each other as strangers distort the reality by which they are all alike; hence they should recognise that reality by treating each other as friends and members of the same family, not as strangers. (The vignette gains added point from the fact that Hippias, speaking in Athens, is a citizen of Elis, a Peloponnesian state allied to Sparta in the war against Athens.) Outside Plato the most extended and explicit expression of the ‘antinomian’ stance is a well-known papyrus fragment of Antiphon (DK 87B44), which presents a number of contrasts between the requirements of conventional morality and those of nature, to the disadvantage of the former. Nature prompts us to do only what is advantageous to us, and if we try to act contrary to its promptings we inevitably suffer for it as a natural consequence, whereas morality typically restrains us from doing what is advantageous to ourselves and requires us to do what is disadvantageous, and if we violate the requirements of morality we come to harm only if we are found out. Legal remedies are insufficient to prevent the law-abiding person from harm, since they are applicable only after the harm has been done, and there is always the chance that the law-abiding person will lose his case anyway. Another part of the papyrus (fragment B) suggests that some legal norms are self-contradictory; it is just to bear true witness in court, and unjust to wrong someone who has not wronged you. So someone who bears true witness against someone who has not wronged him (e.g., witness A who truly testifies that he saw B murder C) wrongs the person against whom he bears witness, and therefore acts both justly and unjustly. (The argument here depends on an illicit assimilation of harming with wronging: the witness certainly harms the murderer by his true testimony, assuming that it leads to his conviction and execution, but there is no reason to agree that in giving that testimony the witness wrongs the murderer.) Moreover, he thereby puts himself in danger of retaliation by the person whom he has wronged; so once again obedience to nomos is disadvantageous.

On the other side of the debate, as we have seen, we have Protagoras’ contention in the Great Speech that law and morality are themselves natural developments, necessary for human survival and the growth of civilization. Protagoras agrees with Glaucon that moral and legal conventions arise ultimately from the need for cooperation in a hostile world, but rejects the latter’s Thrasymachean egoism, with its implication that morality is merely a second-best, to be rejected if circumstances allow the individual to pursue his natural goal of unrestrained self-interest. Morality, for Protagoras, consists in justice and self-restraint, dispositions which involve the replacement of Thrasymachean egoism by genuine regard for others as of equal moral status with oneself, and the crucial lesson of the Great Speech is that those dispositions, so far from requiring the stunting of human nature as Glaucon maintains, in fact constitute the perfection of that nature. The idea that law and morality arise from the exigencies of human nature is also found in some fragments of Democritus and in the so-called ‘Anonymous Iamblichi’ (DK 89), a fragmentary text from the late fifth or early fourth century BCE preserved by the neo-Platonist Iamblichus (third–fourth century CE: see Taylor 2007). This defence of the authority of nomos rests on the idea that nomos itself, in the sense of legal and moral convention, arises from phusis. A different, though related, defence of nomos assumes a distinction between on the one hand the moral and legal conventions of particular societies, assumed to be the product of human agreement, and on the other certain fundamental moral norms, alleged to be common to all societies, whose origin is to be traced, not to any agreement, but to the original constitution of human nature, traditionally attributed to the creation of humans by the gods; these norms were generally agreed to include the obligations to respect one’s parents and to worship the gods. The conception of natural or unwritten law is frequently appealed to in oratory and drama, notably Sophocles’ Antigone (see Guthrie 1969 pp. 77–9, 117–31 and Taylor 2008); one of its most extended expressions occurs in Xenophon’s Memorabilia IV.4.14–25, where in conversation with Socrates the sophist Hippias is represented as saying that since the unwritten laws are common to all countries, they cannot have arisen from agreement among humans who spoke different languages, and as being persuaded by Socrates that breach of such laws inevitably leads to bad consequences, thus guaranteeing the rationality of this divine legislation. There is, then, no uniform sophistic position in the nomos-phusis debate; different sophists, or associates of sophists, are found among the disputants on either side.

3. Religion

From its beginnings, Greek speculations about the origin and nature of the cosmos had a theological dimension, in that various early thinkers attributed divinity either to the cosmos as a whole (as in Heraclitus’ ‘ever-living fire’ (DK 31B30)) or to the fundamental cosmic principle or principles (so Anaximander is reported as regarding the Infinite (DK 12A15 (Aristotle)) and Anaximenes air (DK 13A10 (Aetius, Cicero)) as divine, that is, eternal and intelligent). Such speculations were not without their implications for the traditional Olympian pantheon; Xenophanes clearly intends to mock the cultural relativity of anthropomorphism, pointing out that different races of humans depict their gods in their own image, and suggesting that if horses and cattle could draw they would do the same (DK 21B15–16). On the positive side he proclaims a single supreme non-anthropomorphic divinity, which appears to be identified either with the cosmos itself or with its intelligent directive force (DK 21B23–6). This type of theology is naturalistic, but non-reductive; Heraclitus is not saying that God is nothing but cosmic fire, implying that that fire is not really divine, but rather that divinity, or the divinities that matter, is not a super-hero like Apollo, but the everlasting, intelligent, self-directing cosmos itself. In the fifth century the naturalistic approach to religion exhibits a more reductive aspect, with a consequent move towards a world-view which is not merely naturalistic, but in the modern sense secular. Some sophists contributed to that process of secularisation.

It is convenient to start with Anaxagoras, who, though not generally counted as a sophist, in that he did not offer instruction in how to live or teach rhetoric, nevertheless shared the scientific interests of sophists such as Hippias, and personified the growing rationalistic approach to natural phenomena. When he said that the sun was a molten rock, larger than the Peloponnese (Diogenes Laertius II.8, cf. Plato, Apology 26d), he did mean that it was nothing other than a rock, i.e., not a divine being, and he was rightly considered as challenging traditional views of natural phenomena as divinely significant. Plutarch’s story (Life of Pericles 6) of the one-horned ram neatly encapsulates the opposed world-views: a ram with one horn in the middle of its forehead was brought to Pericles, and the soothsayer Lampon interpreted it as a portent signifying the forthcoming triumph of Pericles in his political struggle with his rival Thucydides. Anaxagoras dissected the animal’s skull and showed that the single horn grew naturally out of a deformity of the brain. So, Plutarch reports, the people admired Anaxagoras (but admired Lampon even more when Thucydides was ostracized soon afterwards). The naturalistic approach to meteorology etc. is not as such inconsistent with belief in divinities, and though Anaxagoras does not explicitly describe his cosmic Nous as divine, his description of it as knowing, controlling and organizing everything (DK 59B12) strongly suggests that he thought that it was. Among the phenomena for which reductive explanations were offered in the fifth century was the origin of religious belief itself. There is an indication of this in Democritus DK 68B30 (preserved by Clement of Alexandria): ‘A few learned people, holding up their hands towards what we Greeks now call the air, said “Zeus thinks of all things and he knows all things and gives and takes away, and he is king of all things” ’, which is supported by the testimony of Sextus (Against the Mathematicians IX.24) that Democritus said that belief in gods arose when primitive people were frightened by thunder, lightning and other celestial phenomena. An alternative account, or rather two accounts, equally reductive, of the origin of religion is attributed to Prodicus, who is reported by various sources as holding that the names of gods were originally applied either to things which are particularly important in human life, such as the sun, rivers, kinds of crops etc., or else to the people who had originally discovered things of that kind (DK 84B5). It was presumably on the basis of this that Prodicus was counted as an atheist in antiquity (Aetius I.7.1, Cicero De Natura Deorum I.42.117); he was understood, probably rightly, as meaning that in fact Demeter is nothing but corn, Dionysus nothing but wine, and so on. Most commentators agree that Prodicus was an atheist of some kind (for a dissenting view see Sedley 2013, at 329–331), but there is some division of opinion on whether the atheism which he espoused was radical atheism, i.e. denial of the existence of divine beings of any kind, or a more moderate version which denied the existence of the gods of popular and poetic tradition while allowing the divinity of cosmic items such as the heavenly bodies, water etc. (on the issue see Mayhew 2011, xvii, 183–4). (For more recent discussions of Prodicus’ views on religion, and of their connection with his views on cosmology and language see Kouloumentas 2018, Lebedev 2019 and Vassallo 2018.)

Atheism is more overt in the account of the origin of religion in a passage from a play called Sisyphus (DK 88B25), quoted by Sextus (Against the Mathematicians IX.54), attributed by DK and others on the authority of Sextus to the Athenian poet and oligarchic politician Critias, but now more usually thought to be by Euripides. The speaker (apparently Sisyphus himself) begins with the picture of primitive human origins familiar from Protagoras’ Great Speech: at first human life was bestial, unregulated by law, so humans invented laws to restrain mutual aggression. But since legal sanctions were effective only when the crime was discovered, someone ‘stalwart and wise in his mind’ invented the fiction that there are gods who live in the heavens, who see everything and punish evil-doing, even when it is secret. Atheism is explicit; the stalwart and wise man ‘concealed the truth with a false account’ (line 26). Of course atheism expressed by a character in a play cannot be directly attributed to the author, whoever he was; this is merely one of the expressions in fifth-century drama of a wide range of attitudes to religion, ranging from outright atheism (e.g., Euripides Fragments 7, 286, ‘Does then anyone say there are gods in heaven? There are not, there are not, if a man is willing not to give foolish credence to the ancient story’) to pious declaration of faith (Euripides Fragments 8, 912b, ‘See, all you who think the gods do not exist, how you are doubly in error with your poor judgment. They exist indeed, they exist’). The significance of the Sisyphus fragment is rather as further evidence of the fact that in the late fifth century the rationalistic approach to the natural world, including human nature, provided the intellectual foundation of a range of views hostile to traditional religion, including explicit atheism. From Protagoras himself we have a first-person declaration, not of atheism, but of agnosticism, in what was apparently the opening of his work On the Gods: ‘Concerning the gods I am not able to know either that they exist or that they do not exist or what their nature is; for there are many things which prevent one from knowing, both the unclarity (sc. of the subject) and the short span of human life’ (DK 80B4). According to some sources the outrage occasioned by this work led to his books being publicly burned and his being forced to flee from Athens to escape prosecution, and he is said by some to have drowned while trying to escape by sea (DK 80A1–4, 12). That story suggests that he was seen as a threat to traditional religion, much as Anaxagoras (and later Socrates) was, but the evidence of Plato’s Meno 91e (see above) gives an altogether different picture, since in that passage Socrates describes him as having had an unblemished reputation during forty years of activity as a sophist, a reputation, moreover, which has lasted from his death till the present day, i.e., till the dramatic date of the dialogue in the last few years of the century. Protagoras’ avowed agnosticism did not, then, provoke public outrage or even bring him into ill-repute, and it is worth considering why not. The answer may lie in his social relativism on matters of morality (see above); it is probable that among the things which ‘seem right and fine for each city’ and which therefore ‘are so for that city so long as it maintains them’ (Theaetetus 167c) are the prescriptions that it is right to honour the gods by the traditional observances. (The verb nomizein, here translated ‘maintain’, is regularly used to apply, among other things, both to religious belief and to ritual practice: the wording of the accusation against Socrates, that ‘he does not nomizei the gods whom the city nomizei’ implies that he neither believes in nor worships the gods of the city.) It is probable, then, that Protagoras was supportive of traditional religious practice, while the wording of his proclamation of agnosticism does not even offer a direct challenge to conventional belief. He cannot know whether or not the gods exist or what they are like; this presumably (though in the light of Protagorean subjectivism the inference is not as secure as it would otherwise be) implies that no-one can know these things, but lack of knowledge is no bar to belief, particularly if that belief is socially useful, as Protagoras probably thought it was. Overall, it is likely that Protagoras’ position on religious belief and practice was as conservative as his general social and moral views. If Xenophon’s portrayal of Hippias’ moral stance (see above) is historically accurate, then he held a deeply traditional view of the gods as authors of the unwritten law.

4. Other sophists

At Apology 19e–20c Plato represents Socrates as naming four individuals who undertake to teach or educate people (paideuein anthrōpous) in return for fees; they are Gorgias (from Leontinoi in Sicily), Hippias (from Elis, in the north-western Peloponnese, Prodicus (from Ceos, off the southern tip of Attica) and Euenus (from Paros, in the southern Aegean). Of the four only Euenus is expressly said to teach ‘human and political excellence’ (tēs … aretēs … anthrōpinēs te kai politikēs, i.e., success in the running of one’s life and in public affairs), but the context strongly suggests that the other three are seen as offering the same kind of instruction. Euenus is otherwise known chiefly as a poet (though Plato Phaedrus 267a mentions some contributions to rhetorical theory), and his appearance in this context indicates the continuation into the sophistic era of the older tradition of the poet as moral teacher (see above). If Gorgias is included in this context among the teachers of excellence, there is a difficulty in that at Meno 95c Meno, a pupil of Gorgias, says that what he most admires about him is that not only does he never claim to teach excellence, but that he makes fun of those who do. Consistently with that, in the dialogue named after him he begins by claiming that what he has to teach is not any system of values, but a technique of persuasion, which is in itself value-free, but is capable of being employed for whatever purposes, good or bad, are adopted by the person who has mastered it, just as skill in martial arts can be used for good ends or bad (456a–457c). But in fact the distinction is not so clear, since Gorgias is readily induced to agree that a political orator has to know what is right and wrong, and that he (Gorgias) will teach his pupil those things if he happens not to know them already (460a–c). Perhaps it is assumed that normally the pupil will know in advance what is right and wrong, so Gorgias will not have to teach him that, and can concentrate on the essential skill of persuasion. But the point of learning to persuade will be to gain power over others, and thereby to achieve personal and political success. So Gorgias will rightly be counted among the teachers of excellence; what is distinctive about his teaching is the prominence of persuasion in the achievement of excellence. But persuasion, though central, was not everything. At the opening of the dialogue (447d–448a) Gorgias claims to be able to answer any question anyone puts to him, and says that for many years no-one has asked him anything new, which seems to mean ‘asked me any question to which I didn’t already know the answer’ (see also Meno 70b). Making this claim seems to commit him to the kind of encyclopedic knowledge which we find Hippias displaying (see below). His extant writings include display speeches, purportedly in defence of Helen and Palamedes against charges of treachery (DK 82B11 and 11a); they seem to be intended partly as examples of stylistic brilliance for its own sake and partly as demonstration of skill in adversarial argument, ‘making the weaker argument the stronger’ (see above). In addition, we have a philosophical essay ‘On Non-Being or On Nature’ (DK 82B3), purporting to be a rebuttal of Parmenides, in which he maintains that nothing exists, that if anything did exist it could not be known and that if anything could be known it could not be communicated. Scholarly opinion has been and remains divided as to whether this was intended as a parody of Eleatic writing or as a serious piece of philosophy. What can definitely be said is that it shows some knowledge of Parmenides, that it at least raises serious philosophical questions, such as the relation of thought to reality and the possibility of referring to things which do not exist, that no question which it raises is developed to any significant extent and that most of its arguments are extremely feeble. It reads like a piece written by a clever man with no real interest in philosophy, but it is doubtful whether we shall ever know why he wrote it.

Hippias was above all a polymath. He first appears in the Protagoras (315c) sitting in a professorial chair giving detailed answers to questions on science generally and astronomy in particular, and later (318e) Protagoras in effect accuses him of defrauding his pupils by making them study arithmetic, geometry, astronomy and mousikē (music and poetry) instead of concentrating on teaching excellence. In the Greater Hippias (285b–e) he describes how he lectured at Sparta on genealogy and all aspects of ancient history, and he is variously reported as lecturing on painting and sculpture, as having developed a mnemonic technique which enabled him to repeat a list of fifty names after a single hearing (both DK 86A2 (Philostratus)), and as appearing at the Olympic Games wearing and carrying nothing which he had not made himself, down to his signet-ring (Lesser Hippias 368b). His writings included a list of Olympic victors and a work entitled Synagōgē, ‘Collection’ or ‘Miscellany’, which seems to have been a compendium of miscellaneous information collected from the poets and other sources, both Greek and foreign (DK 86B6 (Clement)). At the Olympic Games he gave speeches on any subject anyone proposed, and like Gorgias, answered any question anyone put to him (Lesser Hippias 363c), and in the same dialogue (346a) he says that since he began competing (agōnizesthai) at the games he has never been beaten. Presumably the competitions were eristic contests (see above). Like Protagoras and Prodicus he taught the correct use of language (Lesser Hippias 368d), and despite Protagoras’ stricture, he also offered the standard sophistic fare of poetic exegesis (Protagoras 347b, Lesser Hippias passim) and moral and practical instruction (Greater Hippias 286a–c). We saw above that his moral and religious stance was conservative, and his championing of phusis against nomos (see above) is rather an appeal to cosmopolitan elitism than any kind of challenge to conventional morality. Perhaps more than any other single person he encapsulates the complexity of the sophistic phenomenon.

Prodicus’ position on religion was discussed earlier. Apart from it he is best known for his insistence on the correct use of language (Plato, Euthydemus 277e), in particular fine discriminations of the senses of near-synonyms, a topic in which he seems to have specialised. Plato gives numerous examples in the Protagoras (especially 337a–c) and in other dialogues (for details see DK 84A13–18), and Socrates says (Cratylus 384b) that he has attended Prodicus’ ‘one-drachma’ lecture on names, but was unfortunately unable to afford the full course, for which the fee was fifty drachmas (a drachma being a day’s wage for a skilled craftsman at this period). He is reported as having had some interest in natural philosophy, including astronomy (DK 84AI (Suda), A5 (Aristophanes) and B3 (Galen)), and as having applied his linguistic theory to medical terminology (DK 84B4 (Galen)). All that has survived of his writings is a paraphrase by Xenophon (Memorabilia II.1.21–34) of his moral fable of the choice of Heracles between Virtue and Vice. In this story Heracles is approached at a cross-road by two female figures representing Virtue and Vice, each of whom tries to persuade him to follow her by describing the attractions of a life with her. Both base their appeal on pleasure, Vice stressing the meretricious allurements of the voluptuous life, while Virtue offers the genuine and lasting pleasures of the life of honesty and sobriety, including good reputation and the favor of the gods, an appeal which wins the day. In contrast to his radical views on religion, the moral stance expressed here is thoroughly conventional. (Mayhew 2011 xiv-xvii gives a useful summary of the basics of Prodicus’ treatment of language.)

For information on other sophists see Guthrie 1969, ch. 11, and (in German) Kerferd & Flashar 1998 (secs. 5, Thrasymachus; 8, Antiphon; and 11, minor sophists).

The major sophists were considerable celebrities, and were active in public affairs. The Protagoras captures the excitement which they engendered on arriving in a city, the cosmopolitan clientele who accompanied them and their associations with the rich and powerful. Some made a great deal of money; Hippias boasts (Greater Hippias 282e) of making, in a single visit to Sicily, more than a hundred and fifty minas, i.e., fifteen thousand drachmas, something in the region of thirty years’ wages for a skilled craftsman, and Socrates says (Meno 91d) that Protagoras earned more than ten sculptors, including the celebrated Phidias. Protagoras drew up the law-code for the foundation of the Athenian colony of Thurii in 444/3 (Diogenes Laertius IX.50), and Gorgias, Hippias, Prodicus and possibly also Thrasymachus acted as diplomatic representatives of their respective cities. But their wealth and celebrity status has to be set against the negative reaction they aroused in those of conservative views, e.g. Anytus in Meno 89e–94e, who saw them (to a considerable extent unfairly, as we have seen) as subversive of morality and religion and a bad influence on the young. According to Plato in the Apology, it was that climate of opinion, most strikingly expressed in Aristophanes’ Clouds, which had led eventually to the condemnation of Socrates on grounds of irreligion and the corruption of the young. Consequently, his rehabilitation of Socrates leads him to contrast the genuine philosopher with the sophists, whom he depicts predominantly as charlatans. That hostile portrait was the historical foundation of the conception of the sophist as a dishonest argumentative trickster, a conception which remains the primary sense of the word in modern usage, but which considerably distorts what can be recovered of the historical reality.



  • Barnes, J. (ed.), 1984, The Complete Works of Aristotle, 2 vols, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Cooper, J. M. (ed.), 1997, Plato: Complete Works, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Diels, H. and Kranz, W. (eds), 1974, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, Berlin, Weidmann, (volume 2), 252–416. (Abbreviated as ‘DK’ in the text.) English translations (including additional material): R.K. Sprague (ed.), 2001 The Older Sophists, 2nd edn., Indianapolis: Hackett; D.W. Graham (ed.), 2010, The Texts of Early Greek Philosophy, vol. 2, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. French translation (including additional material): J.-F. Pradeau (ed.), 2009, Les Sophistes, 2 vols, Paris: Flammarion.
  • Didymus the Blind; papyrus fragments in M. Gronewald, ‘Ein Neues Protagoras-Fragment’, Zeitschrift für Papyrologie und Epigraphik 2 (1968), 1–2, and in G. Binder and L. Liesenborghs, ‘Eine Zuweisung der Sentenz ouk estin antilegein an Prodikos von Keos’, Museum Helveticum 23 (1966), 37–43, repr, in C.J. Classen (ed.), 1976, Sophistik, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 452–462.
  • Euripides, Fragments. Volumes 7 and 8, ed. and trans. C. Collard and M. Cropp, Loeb Classical Library: Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. 2008.
  • Gagarin, M., 2002, Antiphon the Athenian: Oratory, Law, and Justice in the Age of the Sophists, Austin: University of Texas Press.
  • Laks, A. and Most, G.W. (eds.), 2016, Early Greek Philosophy, 9 vols, Loeb Classical Library: Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. Texts and translations of the Sophists in vols. 8 and 9.
  • Pendrick, G.J. (ed.), 2002, Antiphon the Sophist: The Fragments, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mayhew, R. (ed.), 2011, Prodicus the Sophist: Texts, Translations, and Commentary, Oxford: Oxford University Press. (Contains a larger collection of texts than DK.)

Modern Discussions

  • Barney, R., 2004, ‘Callicles and Thrasymachus’, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL= <>
  • –––, 2006, ‘The Sophistic Movement’, in M.L. Gill and P. Pellegrin (eds.), A Companion to Ancient Philosophy, Malden, Oxford and Carlton: Wiley-Blackwell, pp. 77–97.
  • Bett, R., 1989, ‘The Sophists and Relativism’, Phronesis, 34: 139–169.
  • Brisson, L., 1997, ‘Les Sophistes’, in M. Canto-Sperber (ed.), Philosophie Grecque, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, pp. 89–120.
  • Broadie, S., 2003, ‘The Sophists and Socrates’, in D. Sedley (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Greek and Roman Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 73–97.
  • Classen, C.J. (ed.), 1976, Sophistik, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • De Romilly, J., 1992, The Great Sophists in Periclean Athens, Oxford: Clarendon; French original, Paris, 1988.
  • Decleva Caizzi, F., 1999, ‘Protagoras and Antiphon: Sophistic Debates on Justice’, in Long 1999, pp. 311–331.
  • Flashar, H. and G.B. Kerferd, 1998, ‘Die Sophistik’ (Chapter 1), in H. Flashar (ed.), Die Philosophie der Antike 2/1: Sophistik, Sokrates, Sokratik, Mathematik, Medizin, Basel: Schwabe Verlag, pp. 1–137 (the volume contains a comprehensive bibliography).
  • Gagarin, M. and P. Woodruff, 2008, ‘The Sophists’, in P. Curd and D.W. Graham (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Presocratic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 365–382.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C., 1969, A History of Greek Philosophy III, part 1, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; published separately under title The Sophists, Cambridge, 1971.
  • Kerferd, G.B., 1981a, The Sophistic Movement, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, (ed.), 1981b, The Sophists and Their Legacy (Hermes Einzelschriften, 44), Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner.
  • Kouloumentas, S., 2018, ‘Prodicus on the Rise of Civilisation: Religion, Agriculture, and Cultural Heroes’, Philosophie Antique, 18: 127–152.
  • Lebedev, A., 2019, ‘The Authorship of the Derveni Papyrus, A Sophistic Treatise on the Origin of Religion and Language: A Case for Prodicus of Ceos’, in C. Vassallo, ed., Presocratics and Papyrological Tradition, Berlin: de Gruyter, pp. 419–608.
  • Long, A.A. (ed.), 1999, The Cambridge Companion to Early Greek Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sedley, D.N., 2013, ‘The Atheist Underground’ in V. Harte and M. Lane, (eds), Politeia in Greek and Roman Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 329–348.
  • Taylor, C.C.W., 2007, ‘Nomos and Phusis in Democritus and Plato’, Social Philosophy and Policy, 24: 1–20.
  • –––, 2008, ‘Popular Morality and Unpopular Philosophy’, in C.C.W. Taylor, Pleasure, Mind, and Soul, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 121–133.
  • Vassallo, C., 2018, ‘Persaeus on Prodicus on the Gods’ Existence and Nature. Another Attempt based on a New Reconstruction of Philodemus’ Argument’, Philosophie Antique, 18: 153–167.
  • Woodruff, P., 1999, ‘Rhetoric and Relativism: Protagoras and Gorgias’, in Long 1999: 290–310.

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