First published Wed Jan 12, 2005; substantive revision Mon Nov 8, 2021

Publicity can be opposed both to privacy and to secrecy. This entry will mostly deal with the latter meaning. In everyday life, calls for greater transparency or openness in political and economic life may seem uncontroversial. Still, the precise reasons why and the extent to which publicity should be upheld are not straightforward. Moral and political philosophers, along with social scientists, have until now provided us with only fragmentary elements in this respect. We shall review here what has been gathered so far.

This entry unfolds in three parts. We start with hypothetical publicity, and singularly with Immanuel Kant’s publicity test, contrasting his position with the one of Henry Sidgwick and looking both at the justification and implications of the Kantian test (§1). More precisely, our focus in this first part will be on two questions. First, what (if anything) justifies the importance of this test? Second, what are its implications for moral and political philosophy in general and for actual publicity in particular? Hypothetical publicity may appear to some readers as the only genuinely philosophical development on publicity, which is why we examine it first.

We then look more closely at actual publicity, focusing on two moments of our political life (voting and deliberation) and two of its actors (citizens and representatives) (§2). Authors such as John Stuart Mill and Jon Elster are our guides here. Secret ballots have not always been the rule. Hence, shifting away from the open vote gave rise to fascinating debates, especially in the 19th century. We then move to analyze the reasons for and against public deliberation, with Elster’s argument from the civilizing force of hypocrisy being our starting point. At least two central questions should be kept in mind while reading this second part of the entry. First, are the arguments in favor of open/secret voting different from those in favor of open/secret deliberation? Second, how much weight should we attach, in philosophical arguments about publicity, to empirical claims, and have philosophers paid enough attention to relevant empirical complexities?

In the third section, we introduce the reader to a few dimensions of the concept of publicity as it appears in John Rawls’s work. As for many other questions, Rawls has revived the topic. The ideas of “public rules” and “public reason” have now become important in political philosophy. We shall briefly present and discuss them.

1. Hypothetical Publicity

1.1 Kant’s Hypothetical Publicity Test

Kant’s hypothetical publicity test appears in the second appendix to his Zum ewigen Frieden (Perpetual Peace) (1795 [1923: 381]).[1] He writes:

All actions relating to the right of other human beings are wrong if their maxim is incompatible with publicity.[2]

There are at least three interesting issues here. First, what is the justification for such a publicity test? Is there any reason to suspect any connection between the demands of publicity and the rightness of a position? Second, which maxims of action and, more generally, which moral theories are likely not to pass such a publicity test? Third, what does this test entail with regard to the need for actual publicity?

Some interpretative issues can quickly be disposed of. First, the Kantian test applies specifically to political maxims and is the equivalent in that sphere of the more general categorical imperative.[3] This is why Kant refers to it as the “transcendental principle of the publicity of public law” (1795 [1923: 382]). Second, this Kantian test is a merely negative one: passing the test is only a necessary condition for a maxim’s rightness. It is therefore not sufficient to guarantee that all maxims that pass this test are right. This is suggested both by the expression “wrong if” and by Kant’s explicit statement: “this principle is, furthermore, only negative, i.e., it only serves for the recognition of what is not just to others”.[4] Such a reading entails a difference with the categorical imperative insofar as the latter is a necessary and sufficient condition for permissibility. Third, it is also clear from the principle that neither an action itself, nor the actual motives underlying such an action (Davis 1991: 418) must be capable of being successfully disclosed in order to guarantee that they are not wrong. The test applies only to the maxim of such an action, which indicates one respect in which such a hypothetical test might leave room for actual secrecy. This claim is true irrespective of whether David Luban is correct in suggesting that:

the best way to make sure that officials formulate policies that could withstand publicity is by increasing the likelihood that policies will withstand publicity (Luban 1996: 157).[5]

Now, what does Kant mean when he uses the word “publicity”? Were we to face an actual public, we could give it a more or less demanding interpretation, ranging from merely general knowledge (each of us actually knows or is able to know) or mutual knowledge (each of us knows, and knows that the others know), to critical debate where what we know is being actively discussed (Luban 1996: 169–172). The latter form of publicity, while seeming much richer and appealing, probably does not fit the Kantian text.[6] It could itself be understood in two ways. Either, publicity would be taken as a synonym of debateability, i.e., the fact that the maxim be such as to be deemed appropriate for public discussion, in which case the test would exclude very little. Alternatively, were it taken as referring to the ability of a maxim to pass the filter of actual public debate and be accepted by its participants, the test would then have a very contingent outcome, depending on the real public we are facing.

We can try to ascertain whether publicity should be understood as general knowledge, mutual knowledge, or publicity as the outcome of public debate.[7] However, in the context of understanding the nature of the Kantian test, what matters much more is that Kant is referring to an ideal and rational public (Davis 1992: 180f.).[8] The test is thus hypothetical, not only because it does not necessarily require actual publicity (as we shall see), but also because any outcome of actual publicity must inevitably remain at best a rough approximation of what the test would lead us to with an ideal public.[9]

1.2 Sidgwick on Covert Utilitarianism

As we shall see in Section 2, classical utilitarians, such as Jeremy Bentham and especially Mill, were generally sympathetic to the idea of publicity. Still, it is also among utilitarians that we find one of the strongest principled defenses of secrecy. Sidgwick defends the idea that it may be necessary for utilitarianism to go under cover, and that this need not be unjust. In his Methods of Ethics (1874), he writes:

[…] on Utilitarian principles, it may be right to do and privately recommend, under certain circumstances, what it would not be right to advocate openly; it may be right to teach openly to one set of persons what it would be wrong to teach to others; it may be conceivably right to do, if it can be done with comparative secrecy, what it would be wrong to do in the face of the world; and even, if perfect secrecy can be reasonably expected, what it would be wrong to recommend by private advice or example […]. Thus the Utilitarian conclusion, carefully stated, would seem to be this; that the opinion that secrecy may render an action right which would not otherwise be so should itself be kept comparatively secret; and similarly it seems expedient that the doctrine that esoteric morality is expedient should itself be kept esoteric. Or if this concealment be difficult to maintain, it may be desirable that Common Sense should repudiate the doctrines which it is expedient to confine to an enlightened few. And thus a Utilitarian may reasonably desire, on Utilitarian principles, that some of his conclusions should be rejected by mankind generally; or even that the vulgar should keep aloof from his system as a whole, in so far as the inevitable indefiniteness and complexity of its calculations render it likely to lead to bad results in their hands. (Sidgwick 1874 [1893: 487–489])

As in the Kantian case, Sidgwick not only deals with secret actions, but with the secrecy of doctrines underlying such actions. Two of his points are worth stressing. First, the relative confidentiality of a given practice or—more importantly for us—of its maxim may not only be acceptable, but may even be a necessary condition for the moral acceptability of such a practice, which is then the reverse of what Kant defends. Indeed, utilitarians may consider some practices acceptable on the condition that they remain marginal. And keeping such practices confidential may be required for them not to spread. Secrecy would thus not only be allowed in this case. It would also be required. Second, there is a doctrine of meta-secrecy at play as well, as Sidgwick’s argument applies on top of actions to both maxims and meta-maxims. For him, the very idea that utilitarianism may allow and even require such covert actions should itself be kept relatively secret. As Luban puts it,

not only is it best if utilitarianism is not widely believed, but it is best if the very fact that the belief in utilitarianism has been suppressed by the “enlightened few” is not widely believed. This is no longer Government House utilitarianism. It is conspiratorial utilitarianism (Luban 1996: 167).

1.3 Sidgwick’s and Kant’s Examples

1.3.1 Sidgwick on Celibacy and Lying

With the aim of identifying the exact implications of Kant’s and Sidgwick’s views, let us look more closely at the examples they provide in the course of their discussions. We shall begin with Sidgwick, who contrasts two cases: lying and celibacy.[10] The argument unfolds as follows. First, some types of behavior are morally acceptable only if they remain (very) restricted in scope.[11] If lying and celibacy were to become widely practiced, this would become a problem for utilitarians, according to Sidgwick. However, as long as they remain marginally practiced, to an extent that is justified on utilitarian grounds, they should be accepted. Second, the question arises as to whether we should recognize all this publicly. Albeit not raising any difficulty in the case of celibacy,[12] publicly abandoning an absolute prohibition on lying might not be acceptable for utilitarians. Sidgwick writes:

… assuming that general unveracity and general celibacy would both be evils of the worst kind, we may still all regard it as legitimate for men in general to remain celibate if they like, on account of the strength of the natural sentiments prompting to marriage, because the existence of these sentiments in ordinary human beings is not affected by the universal recognition of the legitimacy of celibacy: but we cannot similarly all regard it as legitimate for men to tell lies if they like, however strong the actually existing sentiment against lying may be, because as soon as this legitimacy is generally recognized the sentiment must be expected to decay and vanish (Sidgwick 1874 [1893: 486]).

It is worth emphasizing that Sidgwick clearly states that the need for secrecy in the case of lying arises only because we are dealing with a general public that is not constituted of only enlightened utilitarians. For Sidgwick considers that

if therefore we were all enlightened Utilitarians, it would be impossible for any one to justify himself in making false statements while admitting it to be inexpedient for persons similarly conditioned to make them; as he would have no ground for believing that persons similarly conditioned would act differently from himself (Sidgwick 1874 [1893: 486–487]; Piper 1978: 190f).

However, once we assume that we do not live in such an ideal world, populated by only enlightened utilitarians, we have reason to keep our complex moral rules secret in order to avoid counterproductive consequences from an utilitarian perspective. Such consequences may flow from various sources, such as a lack of time (e.g., people spending too much time finding out what the fair action would be), misunderstandings possibly due to inadequate cognitive abilities (e.g., construing too broadly the class of cases in which lying would be acceptable from a utilitarian point of view, leading to a spread of lying) or from distrust towards utilitarianism (e.g., principles having a larger number of exceptions generating more doubts about their cogency than elegant and exceptionless ones).

Notice moreover the difference between the Sidgwickian argument, as illustrated by these two examples, and another utilitarian argument that would justify “self-effacement”, i.e., the idea that to remain able to reach its goals, utilitarianism should go totally undercover. In other words, even enlightened utilitarians should not be motivated by their doctrine. The argument is as follows: being motivated by a utilitarian goal may impede our ability actually to reach this very goal. For instance, truly believing in the value of an artistic project independently of its ability to bring about happiness is more likely to maximize welfare than being motivated towards this project out of a commitment to utilitarianism. The upshot, then, is that a society committed to utilitarian principles may turn out to be a less happy one than a society relying on a given set of commonsense principles. If this is true, we would not only have an argument, for “Government House utilitarianism” (i.e., for utilitarian principles being relied on only by the enlightened few), or for its stronger “meta-secrecy” version (of which a few enlightened would still be aware). Rather, we would have a case for something even more radical: the full self-effacement of utilitarianism for utilitarian reasons, i.e., even enlightened utilitarians would have to forget about it if they are really committed utilitarians.[13]

In short, Sidgwick’s argument explicitly refers to a non-ideal public (“society as actually constituted”, “mankind in general” or “the vulgar”, as opposed to “an ideal community of enlightened Utilitarians”). And his view then has to do with a logic of confinement, which is necessary to preserve the practice’s acceptability. Because of this, several of the reasons for secrecy that underlie Sidgwick’s discussion of the lying case would not apply if we were all enlightened utilitarians. However, it is worth noting that, besides the “self-effacement” argument, Adrian Piper has argued that there may be utilitarian grounds for secrecy in an ideal community of enlightened utilitarians as well. For knowing that in such a society, e.g., promises might not necessarily be kept—keeping them depending in each case on the outcome of a utilitarian calculus—will cause significant coordination problems due to lack of predictability of other people’s action. In the absence of secrecy, such an ideal society would then become less efficient (Piper 1978: 198–199).

1.3.2 Kant on Rebellion and Secession

Interestingly, while Kant’s test refers to an ideal public, the examples he provides us with have to do—as in Sidgwick’s discussion—with a non-ideal public. As we shall see, however, the mechanisms on which Kant’s argument rest differ from those on which Sidgwick’s is based. Two cases are envisaged: rebellion and secession. Let us begin with the former. Kant asks: “Is rebellion a legitimate means for a people to employ in throwing off the yoke of an alleged tyrant (non titulo, sed exercitio talis)?” (1795 [1923: 382]). The publicity test is used here in two ways. First, Kant claims that the open acknowledgment of the maxim of rebellion “would make its own purpose impossible” (1795 [1923: 382]). The argument is the following: a person cannot be said to be the chief if the people may sometimes employ force against him (chief-with-absolute-power assumption). The establishment of a state requires a chief in this sense (no-state-without-chief assumption). Therefore, publicizing the maxim of rebellion would make the establishment of a state impossible. Second, the chief himself may publish the maxim according to which rebellion will be sanctioned with death, “for when he knows he possesses irresistible power […] he need not fear vitiating his own purpose by publishing his maxims” (1795 [1923: 383]). And it is because of such irresistibility that publishing this maxim will not be self-frustrating. Again, Kant does not say whether in a non-ideal situation, in which nobody is in a position to have absolute power, the fact that publishing the same maxim would frustrate its very purpose would also mean that this is an unjust maxim. And what is also worth stressing is that such purpose frustration does not imply approval by an ideal and rational public. It merely derives from power relations. Hence, were we to adopt the same line of argument, we could conclude that the stronger a despotic power, the larger the spectrum of maxims that may pass the publicity test, a conclusion that Kant implicitly endorses in the case of maxims of international law.[14]

The rebellion example illustrates the difficulty involved in moving from the hypothetical test to real life situations. What is at stake is our understanding of what “compatibility” could plausibly mean once we move from an ideal to a non-ideal public. The tension in Kant’s text is the following. As we keep reading the general part of his argument, it looks as if reference is made to the universal acceptability of a maxim in the eyes of an ideal and rational public. The rebellion as well as the other examples he gives however (1795 [1923: 383–384]) all rely on a “self-frustration” (or counter-productivity) mechanism. Of course, the latter may have a direct connection with what it may be rational for the beneficiaries and victims of a maxim to do. However, Kant remains unclear about the connection between such preoccupations and the just or unjust nature of a maxim.

Let us then take the secession example:

“If a smaller State is situated as to break up the territory of a larger one, and continuous territory is necessary to the preservation of the larger, is the latter not justified in subjugating the smaller and incorporating it?”. We easily see that the greater power cannot afford to let this maxim become known; otherwise the smaller states would very early unite, or other powers would dispute the prey, and thus publicity would render this maxim impracticable. This is a sign that it is illegitimate. (1795 [1923: 384])

Again, Kant refers here to the risk that defense strategies of the potential losers of a maxim’s implementation may render the latter less efficacious, if not totally inefficacious. There are at least two difficulties with this. First, in a real life context (e.g., Cuba or Chechnya type) in which the large state knows that other small or large states are unlikely to intervene in such situations, publicity would not make the maxim impracticable. Hence, the maxim could in principle still be fair if we were to follow the Kantian logic. Second (and conversely), let us take a domestic analogy involving a state fighting a local mafia. Were the state to announce in advance that it will run a special anti-mafia operation on a given day, any benefits from a surprise intervention would vanish. That is, a maxim stated precisely enough to include the date of the police intervention could not be publicized. All the local Mafiosi would seek to hide themselves on that very day, hence making the intervention useless. This should not suffice to convince us however—even if we were ideal and rational observers—that the planned police intervention (and the maxim on which it would be grounded) is unjust.

Both Sidgwick’s and Kant’s examples rely on non-ideal publics. Admittedly they do so in different manners. Whereas Kant’s ideal public apparently sticks to the role of a judge, Sidgwick’s ideal community of utilitarians is taken as a set of actors whose understanding of the rules is likely to affect their actual behavior. However, the reasons justifying secrecy in the examples each of them gives are of a very different nature. For Sidgwick’s illustrations do not necessarily involve power relation problems. Instead, they highlight motivational and cognitive dimensions. For our purposes, what matters is that, whereas the examples given by Sidgwick properly illustrate the logic of his argument, those provided by Kant do not enlighten us much further, for the idea of purpose frustration (or “self-frustration”) mobilized in the rebellion and secession cases is not applicable once we shift to an ideal public. Therefore, we shall now rely on four examples distinct from those mentioned by Kant in order to ascertain the meaning and implications that could be attached to the Kantian test.

1.4 Does the Kantian Test Prohibit Actual Secrecy?

1.4.1 Sidgwick’s Meta-Secrecy Doctrine

Let us now examine whether or not Sidgwick’s covert utilitarianism is able to pass Kant’s publicity test. As we have seen, this doctrine states that we should keep secret the very idea that some principles and actions should remain secret. This means that, even at a very high level of generality, there is no way we could submit any maxim for assessment to the ideal public, unless such a maxim makes no direct reference to the problem of publicity. But what about the following maxim: “any means should be deemed appropriate if they serve the utilitarian ideal”? Utilitarians claim that an ideal public should at least consider utilitarianism a plausible doctrine. And it is therefore unlikely that the Kantian test will lead to a “necessary and unanimous” rejection of this proposed higher-order formulation of the maxim. Hence the test may be passed successfully, without any discussion on the issue of publicity. Of course, one may find such a maxim totally unjust for other reasons. But Kant himself does not seem to claim that his test should be seen as a sufficient test for justice anyway.

1.4.2 Glomar Responses

Our second example comes from actual Freedom of Information (FoI) regimes. That a public authority may have to justify each of its significant decisions will seem largely uncontroversial. In principle, this should also hold each time a public authority denies access to a document requested by a citizen on the basis of his FoI right. The citizen should know the grounds that access is being denied to the document he wants to double-check, e.g., whether this is because of privacy, trade secrets, or state security. However, there are cases in which disclosing the exact reason why access to a document is denied unavoidably entails the disclosure of the document’s very content. One could deny access with no overt justification, implying that disclosing the precise ground for denial would be equivalent to disclosing the document’s very content. Along the same lines, an authority could even refuse to deny or confirm the very existence of the requested document, which is known in US law as a Glomar response.[15]

Again, one may well propose a higher-order principle accounting for a response of this kind:

whenever access to a document may be denied on a legitimate basis and disclosing either the basis for denial or even the very existence of the document would jeopardize the pursuit of this very goal, a justification for denial or even the confirmation of the document’s (non)-existence may be withheld.

So long as the set of such legitimate bases for denial is publicly discussed and procedural checks are in place, there is no reason to believe that publicizing such a maxim will be self-frustrating in the presence of a real public, nor that such a maxim should be rejected by an ideal public. Admittedly, the Glomar doctrine embodies some extent of “meta-secrecy”. However, it does not go as far as a meta-secrecy of the kind that Sidgwick favors. For the very possibility that a state may sometimes act on secret grounds is not publicly denied, nor are the grounds for justifiable Glomar responses necessarily left outside the sphere of public discussion.[16]

1.4.3 The Judiciary’s True Goal

For our third example, let us suppose that the true goal of the judiciary were to promote peace and stability rather than justice. However, let us assume as well that letting people believe that the genuine goal of such institutions is justice would best guarantee peace, for decision-acceptance would be enhanced if such decisions were perceived as just (Luban 1996: 160). In such a world, there is no question that peace would better be pursued by keeping it secret as the true goal of judiciary. The maxim may be:

act in a way such that if peace is best pursued by letting people think (wrongly) that it is in fact justice that is being pursued, you should let people think so.

Publicizing such a maxim may be “self-frustrating” and would therefore not pass the Kantian test.

However, besides asking ourselves whether such self-frustratingness is what accounts for the possibly unjust nature of the maxim, we may provide a higher order formulation of the maxim:

Act in a way such that if one legitimate goal is best pursued by letting people think (wrongly) that it is in fact another legitimate goal that is being pursued, you should let people think so.

This higher-order maxim’s publication is not self-frustrating, even in a case in which we assume that the legitimacy of each goal has been examined in detail, along with the legitimacy of other goals. Of course, this does not end the discussion since, in case we were to grant priority to justice over peace, the maxim’s implementation could still lead to injustice, which the Kantian test does not exclude.

1.4.4 The Optimal Confidentiality of FoI Laws

Let us finally move to an example that deals again with real FoI regimes. One of the surprises of such regimes is that, as a matter of fact, their very existence remains rather confidential in many countries. Citizens do not exercise their right of access to state-detained documents as much as one might expect. This could be regarded as unfortunate. One may as well consider it necessary, however, at least if we find meaningful the idea of an optimal level of confidentiality of FoI regimes. This optimal level would consist in some active citizens being maximally aware of its existence, and all civil servants being as little aware of it as possible. For if (non-ideal) civil servants know that they are potentially being watched, they may admittedly try to change their behavior for the better. However, they may simultaneously want to hide even further the more problematic aspects of their behavior (e.g., through shifting from written to oral discussions). In other words, in order for the fundamental FoI right to be maximally effective, its existence and exercise may have to remain relatively covert, perhaps unequally known.

What should an ideal public think about the following maxim then: “In order for a legitimate goal to be pursued, while the goal itself would be fully public (here: the accountability of public authorities), while the social expectations of citizens towards civil servants would be fully transparent, some of the means enabling such citizens to ensure the accountability of public authorities may remain covert”? Not each and every covert means is acceptable. However, the one consisting in a right to ask for a copy of administrative documents may very well be so. Of course, publicizing a lower order version of this maxim may be self-frustrating, hence incapable of passing the Kantian test. But again, this is not sufficient to discard this lower order maxim as unjust, nor does it mean that a higher-order translation of it (as suggested above) must be unable to pass the Kantian test.

These four examples leave us with two important open questions regarding the Kantian test. First, how should we assess the test’s importance if the level of generality at which the maxim of an action should be phrased cannot be normatively fixed? As we have illustrated above, the lower the level of generality at which a maxim is phrased, the higher the risk that its publicity would be self-frustrating, and vice versa (Luban 1996: 189–191). No doubt, the test would be over-exclusive if we were forced to phrase our maxims at a very low level of generality. This is clear when we think about keeping secret the date of a police intervention to trap criminals or the location of a stock of weapons in times of peace. Kant himself never suggests that all secret actions should be ruled out by his test. The problem is that, as long as we do not have any indication as to the appropriate level of generality at which an action’s maxim should be tested, the opposite risk of under-exclusiveness becomes hard to avoid as our four examples above illustrate.

Second, it is not entirely clear why self-frustratingness (or purpose-frustratingness) is an indicator of injustice. In other words, whenever the Kantian test bites, why would this tell us anything about the just or unjust nature of a maxim and the actions that fall under it?[17] Answering this question is even more crucial for those who—contrary to us—view the publicity test as a necessary and sufficient condition for permissibility. What we need then is an account of the “intrinsic connection” between self-frustratingness and injustice—in the same way as one may ask why, for contractualists, there should be a significant connection between justice and the hypothetical agreements of fairly-situated individuals. Such an account is not provided by Kant, who claims about the principle that “like an axiom, it is indemonstrably certain” (1795 [1923: 382]). One sound suggestion is Luban’s (1996: 191). Imagine that making the maxim of my action public would frustrate my ability to reach this maxim’s very goal. This can be taken as a sign of the injustice of this maxim only if the frustration-generating mechanism is at least in part based itself on morally justifiable grounds. But if publicizing a doctrine generates distrust from a real audience merely because of people’s attraction for simplicity or non-demandingness, the frustration flowing from such a distrust might hardly be considered relevant to the assessment of the maxim’s (in)justice.

2. Actual Publicity

Actual publicity can be looked at through the prism of hypothetical publicity. However, philosophers approach the issue from other angles as well. Their arguments have mobilized both empirical assumptions and philosophical claims regarding the purpose of voting and political representation, the importance of participation and deliberation, etc. Here, we examine more closely arguments in favor and against actual publicity in the political arena. In order to do so, we will restrict ourselves to two modes of political action (voting and deliberation) and two types of actors (electors and representatives). In so doing, we consider two types of relationships: horizontal ones (among voters or among representatives) and vertical ones (between voters and representatives). Notice already that the view one favors regarding the function attached to one’s vote as a member of the electorate and to one’s activity as a representative will have an impact on the reasons why publicity may matter and the extent to which it does.

Before engaging in this philosophical discussion, let us clarify what the arguments developed below may show for one significant practical evolution, namely the development of FoI regimes in democratic countries during the second half of the 20th century.[18] Such regimes have been set up with the view of allowing citizens to participate more actively in public affairs, enabling them to have access to the details of most administrative documents in due time.[19] Hence, not only MPs but civil servants become more effectively accountable. This means that citizens are not forced simply to accept package deals from their representatives at the time of elections. They can question the practicalities of implementation at any time.

Not only does the enactment of FoI regimes provide opportunities for multiple interactions between active citizens and state authorities, they also force us to weigh the relative importance of open government vis-a-vis other fundamental rights. Specific grounds for denying access to administrative documents include the protection of privacy, property rights (e.g., trade secrets), easing the gathering of information from third parties (e.g., executive privilege[20] or medical secrecy), paternalistic justifications (e.g., in the case of technical documents that could be misinterpreted), state interests (e.g., in defense and terrorism matters or international negotiations), and economic efficiency (e.g., in public procurement, the content of the offer made by competitors being disclosed only after the final decision). Sometimes, such grounds for secrecy will justify strict denial of access. On other occasions, the disclosure of information will be deferred (e.g., through declassification procedures) or be selective (e.g., to some types of actors only). This variety of potential justifications of secrecy and the diverse ways of accommodating the conflicting values constitute a largely unexplored terrain for applied political philosophy. Here, we will focus only on general reasons to promote or restrict actual publicity.

2.1 Voting

2.1.1 Mill’s (1861) Case Against Secret Ballot

Let us look at voting first. We may begin with the view according to which the electoral process aims only at aggregating people’s individual preferences regarding the type of decisions they consider in their own interest (rather than in the public interest). Under such a view, there is no strong case for making sure that my fellow citizen be able to know what my actual preferences are. This is especially significant when it comes to direct democracy (e.g., a referendum). However, in democratic systems involving representation, there may be weighty reasons for representatives to know which type of electors they are representing, and hence to favor open ballots. This implies that, even under an “aggregation of private interests” view of democracy, there may be a case for open ballots. This case has nothing to do with the need for fellow voters to know about their neighbor’s actual preferences. Only their representatives need to know about them.

Let us now move to a different conception of democracy, advocated by Mill:

In any political election, even by universal suffrage (and still more obviously in the case of a restricted suffrage), the voter is under an absolute moral obligation to consider the interest of the public, not his private advantage, and give his vote, to the best of his judgment, exactly as he would be bound to do if he were the sole voter, and the election depended upon him alone. This being admitted, it is at least a prima facie consequence that the duty of voting, like any other public duty, should be performed under the eye and criticism of the public; every one of whom has not only an interest in its performance, but a good title to consider himself wronged if it is performed otherwise than honestly and carefully. Undoubtedly neither this nor any other maxim of political morality is absolutely inviolable; it may be overruled by still more cogent considerations. But its weight is such that the cases which admit of a departure from it must be of a strikingly exceptional character (1861 [1991: 355]).

Mill later discusses whether such reasons to depart from publicity are forceful, which is an issue to which we shall return. However, what matters here is that, once we consider that voters are supposed to vote according to what they believe would promote the public interest, rather than their own private interests,[21] the case for publicity is reversed. On the one hand, if we can associate to such a conception of voting one of representation according to which representatives are supposed to defend the public interest, rather than the class interests of their identifiable electors,[22] the case for vertical publicity weakens. For knowing who their electors actually are may induce MPs to stick to a defense of their actual electors rather than to promote the public interest at large. On the other hand, the very act of taking part in an election acquires a non-private dimension, such that we should consider ourselves accountable towards our fellow citizens (horizontal accountability). And the claim that we should regard ourselves as horizontally accountable towards those who may be affected by the consequences of our choices clearly supports the case against secret ballots. For Mill, this is a very significant reason for open ballots. In fact, he even stresses that, as electors, we should see ourselves accountable not only towards fellow electors, but also to non-electors whenever the franchise is not as universal as it could be (which generates the risk of electors voting only to defend their class interests as voters).[23] The example from Mill’s times is the one of women, who were excluded from “manhood suffrage”. Present day illustrations could refer to non-national residents excluded from the right to vote or to those below the age of majority.[24]

2.1.2 Why Worry About Open Vote?

Mill was not the first to write about vote secrecy. Authors such as Cicero (III.15), Montesquieu,[25] Jean-Jacques Rousseau[26] and Alexis de Tocqueville[27] also expressed their views on the matter. And Mill’s intervention is in fact part of a lively debate that had been going on in England for several decades.[28] He writes:

It may, unquestionably, be the fact that if we attempt, by publicity, to make the voter responsible to the public for his vote, he will practically be made responsible for it to some powerful individual, whose interest is more opposed to the general interest of the community than that of the voter himself would be if, by the shield of secrecy, he were released from responsibility altogether. When this is the condition, in a high degree, of a large proportion of the voters, the ballot may be the smaller evil. When the voters are slaves, anything may be tolerated which enables them to throw off the yoke. The strongest case for the ballot is when the mischievous power of the Few over the Many is increasing […].

But in the more advanced states of modern Europe, and especially in this country, the power of coercing voters has declined and is declining; and bad voting is now less to be apprehended from the influences to which the voter is subject at the hands of others than from the sinister interests and discreditable feelings which belong to himself, either individually or as a member of a class. To secure him against the first, at the cost of removing all restraint from the last, would be to exchange a smaller and a diminishing evil for a greater and increasing one […] (Mill, 1861 [1991: 355–357]).[29]

Geoffrey Brennan and Philip Pettit (1990) revived Mill’s argument, contending that, while we should not assume that people will generally tend to vote according to their private interest whenever voting is secret, unveiling the vote would certainly encourage further the practice of voting in accordance with what one considers to be the common good (Brennan and Pettit 1990: 325–329). They argue as well that the case for open votes is especially strong in pluralistic societies involving large electorates.[30]

Still, Mill’s lesser-evil type of justification for open votes has been rejected in the past on at least three grounds. First, one could question the very purpose that Mill ascribes to voting. Hence, some of the protagonists of the 19th century British debate criticized the view according to which voting should be regarded as a trust rather than a right.[31] In contrast with Mill’s view, this entails that ballot secrecy is not even a lesser evil. It is no evil at all. Second, one may disagree with Mill at the factual level rather than at the normative one. James Mill, his father, clearly agreed with his son on the purpose of voting, referring explicitly on various occasions to the idea of a trust. In his long essay “On the Ballot”, he states that “The voter for a member of Parliament has a trust placed in his hands, on the discharge of which the highest interests of his country depend”.[32] However, James Mill considered—in opposition to his son’s view—that the negative consequences attached to the secret ballot were not only less weighty than its advantages, but devoid of any weight at all.[33] This entails that for James Mill as well, secret voting was not even a lesser evil reform. It did not involve any evil at all. Third, let us consider Bentham’s position. Although he does not refer explicitly to the trust-based view of voting, he considers that voters should be influenced by tutelary motives. For him,

in judging whether a motive ought to be referred to the class of seductive or tutelary motives, it is necessary to examine whether, in the case in question, it tends […] to favour the greatest or the smallest number (Bentham 1843 [1999: 145]).[34]

After balancing the pros and cons of publicity, Bentham concludes:

The system of secrecy has therefore a useful tendency in those circumstances in which publicity exposes the voter to the influence of a particular interest opposed to the public interest. Secrecy is therefore in general suitable in elections.

In contrast with James Mill, Bentham’s argument is of the lesser-evil type. But contrary to J.S. Mill, it is a lesser-evil argument in favor of secrecy rather than publicity.[35]

Such developments may be dismissed as being of merely historical interest. And indeed, except for Brennan and Pettit’s (1990) work, there is little contemporary debate about the justifiability of the secret ballot. Rather, the discussion has shifted its focus to parliamentary debate and to administrative activity, such as FoIs. Still, there are at least three lessons to be learnt from older debates about the ballot, over and above the fact that vote secrecy is not unambiguously costless. First, already at that time, there were attempts at envisaging simultaneously the questions of vote secrecy in the case of electors and in the case of representatives.[36] The interesting fact is that we do not today have a clear theory telling us why we should have secret ballots for electors and open votes in plenary parliamentary sessions. Simply referring to the fact that representatives are accountable to their electors (vertical accountability) in a sense in which electors are not to their fellow citizens (horizontal accountability) is insufficient in itself. Ceteris paribus, the importance of horizontal accountability, insofar as it emphasizes the need to justify our decisions to those who may endure their consequences, could suffice to justify openness. Moreover, it is probably also insufficient to claim that the fact that representatives may lose their job as a result of electoral discontent is not as problematic as the fact that electors could lose their job if their employer were to know for whom they voted. This does not mean that differences are absent. Ceteris paribus, a representative has more power than a citizen, for example.[37] What we need to ask ourselves is whether this is sufficient to justify treating the two categories so differently with regard to vote publicity.

Second, open voting in parliament may not only give room to pressure from your actual electors, it may also lead to pressure from those who did not actually vote for you or from well-organized lobbies defending some specific interests. This is probably one of the concerns today in many countries. Publicity allows the electors to use the threat of non-reelection in full knowledge of what a representative actually did. Still, it allows as well other actors to do so, who may neither be the representative’s actual electors, nor lobbies acting in the name of the general interest. Though employers and landowners may not pressure employees and landless people anymore, lobbyists representing the former do pressure the MPs elected by the latter, with comparable results. This indicates how pressure made possible through publicity may effectively force representatives to take directions that do not fit with the view of the public interest defended by those who elect them. Pressure is a double-edged sword. This may call for at least mixed systems, a proposal to which we shall return shortly. It may even justify taking more seriously the possibility of vote anonymity in parliament, provided that the number of votes for and against each proposal be known anyway.

Finally, one may consider that the only way of dealing with such issues consists in obtaining empirical evidence regarding the respective effects of secrecy and publicity and weighing them up.[38] More principled arguments could be developed however. Such principled arguments could take at least two (non-exclusive) forms. According to one strategy, even in a society where the level of coercion on voters is very weak on average, it is reasonable to assume that those who will suffer most from such risk of coercion (given their higher dependence on others) are the least advantaged. There may thus be a maximin case for secret ballots on such grounds, putting priority on the protection of the most vulnerable. The other strategy would consist in stressing the fact that the extent to which the coercion of voters obtains in a given society may fluctuate, and hence evolve at some point for the worse, in line with political or economic degradations. A preventive approach would thus consist in claiming that, once coercion increases to an extent such that it becomes worrying (provided that there are levels of coercion that would not be worrying in the first place), it would then be too late to switch back to secret voting. This could justify preserving vote secrecy from the start, even when the risk of coercion is currently negligible.[39]

2.2 Deliberation

2.2.1 Can Publicity Civilize Representatives?

Let us now turn to the issue of public deliberation. Notice first that the arguments for open ballots invoked above in the context of an “aggregation of private interests” view of voting, equally justify the publicity of debates taking place between representatives. This is because these individuals have interests in learning about each other. An implication of this fact is that, in a system in which vertical accountability matters, it is essential both for citizens to know what their representatives think and do, and for representatives to know more than once every four years how the electorate reacts to their arguments and decisions.

Learning about each other is one thing. Learning from each other (about facts, what to think, or how to act) is another, however.[40] Publicity is not supposed to allow only for citizens and their representatives to act upon fixed preferences regarding their private or even the public interests. The interactions that publicity enables are also potentially rich in transformative power. Such a dynamic impact can take various forms. Publicity of deliberations between representatives may play an exemplary role for citizens (both procedurally and substantively), as suggested by Bentham, who writes that

the order which reigns in the discussion of a political assembly, will form by imitation the national spirit. This order will be reproduced in clubs and inferior assemblies, in which the people will be pleased to find the regularity of which they have formed the idea from the greater model (Bentham 1843 [1999: 31]).[41]

Similarly, we have seen that open ballots can incentivize electors to restrict themselves in public to positions that they see themselves as being able to justify to other fellow citizens. And this is true even when their fellow citizens are not especially educated, as Mill argued:

The notion is itself unfounded, that publicity, and the sense of being answerable to the public, are of no use unless the public are qualified to form a sound judgment. It is a very superficial view of the utility of public opinion to suppose that it does good only when it succeeds in enforcing a servile conformity to itself. To be under the eyes of others—to have to defend oneself to others—is never more important than to those who act in opposition to the opinion of others, for it obliges them to have sure ground of their own. Nothing has so steadying an influence as working against pressure. Unless when under the temporary sway of passionate excitement, no one will do that which he expects to be greatly blamed for, unless from a preconceived and fixed purpose of his own; which is always evidence of a thoughtful and deliberate character, and, except in radically bad men, generally proceeds from sincere and strong personal convictions. Even the bare fact of having to give an account of their conduct is a powerful inducement to adhere to conduct of which at least some decent account can be given. If any one thinks that the mere obligation of preserving decency is not a very considerable check on the abuse of power, he has never had his attention called to the conduct of those who do not feel under the necessity of observing that restraint. Publicity is inappreciable, even when it does no more than prevent that which can by no possibility be plausibly defended—than compel deliberation, and force every one to determine, before he acts, what he shall say if called to account for his actions (1861 [1991: 360–361]).[42]

Now, let us suppose that Bentham is correct to suggest that representatives can civilize their electorate through public deliberation, and that Mill is correct to suggest that voters may be civilized by their not-necessarily-civilized fellow voters (and non-voters) in case of open ballots. Elster presents still another view according to which the publicity of deliberation can assist citizens in civilizing their representatives. Elster refers to this as “the civilizing force of hypocrisy”, and the central passage is the following:

Generally speaking, the effect of an audience is to replace the language of interest by the language of reason and to replace impartial motives by passionate ones. The presence of a public makes it especially hard to appear motivated merely by self-interest. Even if one’s fellow assembly members would not be shocked, the audience would be. In general, this civilizing force of hypocrisy is a desirable effect of publicity. […] Publicity does not eliminate base motives, but forces and induces speakers to hide them (Elster 1998a: 111; Naurin 2003).

The Filter

Elster’s argument occurs in two steps. The first one is the filtering step, and it starts with the idea that the public holds normative expectations regarding what representatives are supposed to say.[43] One of these expectations is that any overt reference to mere self-interest is deemed unacceptable in the course of justifying their position,[44] which leaves open the question of whether it is acceptable to refer to the self-interest of their class of electors.[45] Another expectation is that representatives must justify their position by referring to minimally general principles. Finally, there is also a social norm favoring argument over bargaining,[46] such that, whenever the debate takes place in public, deliberation oriented towards the force of the better argument should be promoted. At the very least, the entails the need to disguise overt threats as warnings (Elster 1998a: 103–104). Normative expectations such as these that regard acceptable discourse thus act as a filter on what representatives are permitted to say. Importantly, it is not hypocrisy as such that filters out the set of unacceptable speech elements. However, it allows the representative to engage in a discourse in which he does not necessarily believe. In other words, this account does not necessarily presuppose a normative expectation among the public that politicians ought to be sincere.[47] Actually, hypocrisy is rather an enabling factor (allowing for an initial gap between what is said and thought), and not a cleaning up factor.

Does this argument presuppose that voters be on average more civilized than their representatives? At least two types of answers can be provided. First, there are reasons of principle to doubt that representatives are on average wiser or more committed to the common good than their electorate. As Luban writes,

… the empirical validity of the publicity principle turns not on whether the Many are ignorant or wrong-headed, but on whether their leaders are less ignorant or less wrong-headed. No doubt the Wise are few; and the leaders are few; but it hardly follows that the leaders are wise. Before we reject the publicity principle because the leaders know best, we must have reason to believe that the leaders know better. And to find that out, we must look carefully at the variety of mechanisms by which decision-making elites are actually selected. If actual selection mechanisms choose randomly between the Many and the Wise, or affirmatively disfavor the Wise, then the foolishness of the many is irrelevant: the Few in official positions have no reason to suppose that their policy brainstorms are any less foolish (Luban 1996: 193).

Second, the average level of civilization may be less relevant than the presence of at least a minority of civilized members. As Mill puts it, “[…] cases exist […] in which almost the only restraint upon a majority of knaves consists in their involuntary respect for the opinion of an honest minority” (1861 [1991: 362]). In line with this Millian view, were the average level of civilization among representatives higher or equivalent to the one obtaining within the electorate, publicity could still increase in absolute terms the amount of civilized persons attending the representative’s discourse, adding civilized members of the public to those who are civilized in parliament. Hence, through such a sampling effect, if we agree with Mill that the mere presence of a civilized minority can make some difference, a larger absolute size of such a minority might be relevant. As for Elster, he explicitly relies more directly on a multiplier effect, insisting that “a small group of impartially minded individuals might induce many others to mimic their impartiality out of self-interest” (Elster 1995: 249). And as Elster points out, this is even more true whenever there is uncertainty as to who these impartially minded people are (Elster 1995: 248).

Reducing cognitive dissonance

Let us now turn to the second step in Elster’s argument (Elster 1986, §II). There is an additional normative expectation that, once representatives commit themselves in public to a given view, they ought not to switch to another view unless they can justify such a departure (Elster 1998a: 104). As Elster puts it,

public speaking is subject to a consistency constraint. Once a speaker has adopted an impartial argument because it corresponds to his interest or prejudice, he will be seen as opportunistic if he deviates from it when it ceases to serve his needs (Elster 1998a: 104).[48]

Citizens may be more or less vigilant regarding compliance with such a requirement that demands consistency through time. Still, it is likely to have some weight. Furthermore, as representatives cannot publicly depart from the principled views they have expressed earlier, they may begin believing in what they say, even though they may not have been holding such views at the time they began expressing them.[49] Hence, being forced to restrict oneself to publicly acceptable views may turn out to influence what one eventually believes. This is because, in order to reduce the dissonance between what one says and what one believes, a representative may come genuinely to believe what one is expected to say. Civilizing people’s speech will eventually civilize their mind (and hopefully in turn their non-linguistic actions) and—so Elster claims—“on the average, […] yield more equitable outcomes” (Elster 1995: 251). What begins as a strategic use of a non-self-interested arguments ends up leading to preference change (Fearon 1998: 54).

A related line of argument is offered by Robert Goodin, who contends that individuals have a latent moral sense, and that having to state arguments in public acts as a reminder of what they already agree with. Crucially, they might not otherwise have connected the issue at stake with the principles they endorse.[50] One way of contrasting Goodin’s position with Elster’s view is the following. What is at stake would be as much a matter of reducing dissonance between what one says and what one genuinely believes, as one of reducing dissonance between two separate beliefs one holds.

Having explored Elster’s claims concerned the civilizing force of hypocrisy, there are two empirical questions to be asked. First, are Elster’s factual assumptions empirically plausible? Second, are there no other negative side effects relating to publicity that might outweigh the benefits identified by Elster? In the next section, we provide elements that may be relevant to answering the latter question. Let us briefly address the first challenge here. Daniel Naurin (2004) provides some interesting evidence in this respect. On the one hand, he refers to a study by Christian Joerges and Jurgen Neyer (1997) that looks closely at European Union comitology committees. Their study indicates that public-spirited deliberation can be present in such committees whose existence is unknown to most people. This may seem reassuring as it suggests that publicity is not necessary to foster truly deliberative behavior. However, on the other hand, Naurin refers to evidence from Nina Eliasoph (1998: 7) suggesting that, in the case of activists, while in backroom conversations these individuals tend to express themselves with reference to justice and common good concerns, shifting to a front stage context also increases their use of self-regarding arguments. Naurin’s (2004) own empirical data illustrate a similar trend in the case of industry lobbyists in the European Union context. In other words, a forum-like type of behavior is already present in the lobby corridor. Surprisingly enough, bringing lobbyists from the backstage to the front stage therefore risks making things worse from the point of view of reducing reference to mere self-interest. One should admittedly be cautious in extrapolating such results.[51] Still, both Eliasoph and Naurin identify a phenomenon that goes in the opposite direction of what Elster’s view implies. This is clearly a serious challenge to his account.

2.2.2 The Quality of Deliberation

The variety of effects of publicity on the nature of the deliberation process is an understudied matter. We have already looked at some considerations, asking ourselves whether publicity substitutes public-interest-oriented to self-regarding arguments, and whether it leads to a shift from bargaining to deliberation. Here, leaving Elster’s account aside for a moment, we go on with examining other dimensions of what can be referred to—in an admittedly vague manner—as the quality of the debate. We start with the possibility that publicity risks modifying the nature of a discussion in ways that are not desirable. One such negative side-effect, as identified by James Madison in 1787 in the case of the American Constitutional Convention, is the following:

Had the members committed themselves publicly at first, they would have afterwards supposed consistency required them to maintain their ground, whereas by secret discussion no man felt himself obliged to retain his opinions any longer than he was satisfied of their propriety and truth, and was open to the force of argument.[52]

The idea of sticking to a position and being unwilling to depart from it, despite the existence of good arguments, can be a problem for at least two reasons.[53] Consensus will be harder to reach because of such stubbornness, which matters whenever agreement can be reached only by consensus (be it in a deliberation or in a bargaining type of context). More importantly, we may be worried not (only) by actors’ lack of sincerity, but by the loss in debate spontaneity.[54] Unless the deliberating parties are able to try out ideas, to show hesitation,[55] and to re-consider the issues again and again with a fresh eye, actual deliberations may be no more than the juxtaposition of pre-prepared statements with no genuine interaction taking place.[56] Part of the problem here is that the public may view hesitation and trial and error as signs of a lack of commitment, which may disadvantage those representatives truly taking part in the discussion, hence inhibiting them from adopting a genuinely deliberative posture. And as Naurin puts it,

[…] if deliberation is about transforming preferences, and publicity forces you to know what you want and stand by your position, then “public deliberation” is something of a contradiction in terms (Naurin 2003: 32).

Because of this, if we value deliberation as a living interaction with real transformative power, there may be a strong case for at least some proportion of political deliberation to take place behind closed-doors, despite the latter’s negative side-effects.[57]

Ellen Meade and David Stasavage (2008) document another way in which publicity might negatively affect the quality of deliberation. They deal with the specific case of central banks and whether minutes of board meetings should be released. Based on empirical evidence, they show how, under conditions of publicity, the fact that expert advisors may have career concerns reduces the chances of dissent being expressed during deliberation. Here, what is at stake is not whether one sticks to one’s own initial position. Rather, it has to do with whether one is ready to show disagreement with the position taken by another expert who is highly regarded and has spoken first.[58] Hence, publicity might generate disincentives both to openly changing one’s mind and, in some contexts, to dissenting with other (authoritative) people’s views.

Simone Chambers (2004) points at still another negative impact of publicity on the quality of deliberation. Discussion behind closed doors will admittedly tend to allow for the expression of particularistic reasons that would not pass the test of actual publicity. However, while making deliberation public might force the deliberating parties both to provide the best possible reasons in support of their claims (Socratic effect) and to provide public reasons (democratic effect) in the sense of reasons that should refer to the public interest and be acceptable to a wide audience in a pluralistic society, one problem remains.[59] It is that publicity also tends to favor reasons that are “plebiscitary” in the sense of shallow or manipulative (Chambers 2004: 393). Moving from private, particularistic reasons to truly public reasons may then often have an associated price, i.e., shifting from profound (private) reasons to shallow (public) reasons. Admittedly, the reason why such shallow reasons prosper might have to do with the need for a common denominator, which could be needed in a deliberation behind closed doors as well. However, it is plausible that it may also have to do with an attempt at pleasing the public and thus giving way to populism.

These are just a few illustrations of possible negative side effects of bringing deliberation under the public eye. It may become less lively, leave less room for dissent in the presence of an authoritative member, and favor shallower types of arguments, no matter how rational and public they are. It is important to identify exactly which benefits and which costs are attached to actual publicity and secrecy, and what their respective weight might be. In this respect, it is true that the argument may be of a different nature or at least carry a different weight depending on whether one deals with voting or deliberation. For instance, the importance of learning from each other (rather than simply about each other) may provide a stronger argument for open public deliberation than for open ballots.

Once all normative and empirical dimensions have been carefully considered, we may want to adopt a firm standpoint regarding the need for publicity or secrecy in deliberation and voting in general. However, we may also want to try to mix secrecy and publicity in ways that allow for more optimal schemes, providing us with the best of both worlds. Let us illustrate the availability of this option by pointing at two of such schemes. First, Bentham refers to a system obtaining in the Polish Permanent Council in the late 18th century by which an open vote was followed by a secret vote on the very same issue (Bentham 1843 [1999: 147–148]). Second, Elster argues that a constitution-making process

ought to contain elements of both secrecy (committee discussion) and publicity (plenary assembly discussions). With total secrecy, partisan interests and logrolling come to the forefront, whereas full publicity encourages grandstanding and rhetorical overbidding. Conversely, secrecy allows for serious discussion, whereas publicity ensures that any deals struck are capable of withstanding the light of day (Elster 1998a: 117).

One can thus mix both publicity and secrecy in the case of voting (Bentham) or deliberation (Elster), through a succession of openness and secrecy (Bentham)[60] or secrecy and openness (Elster).[61] One could also advocate for mixing public deliberation with a secret vote (which is probably a correct description of what happens during electoral periods in many democratic countries), or, conversely, secret deliberation and a public vote (which is what actually takes place in parliamentary systems with secret commissions in which plenary debates take a purely formal dimension). Each of these regimes has specific properties that may warrant separate study.

3. Rawls on Public Reason and Public Rules

Having looked at both hypothetical publicity and actual publicity, let us now turn to examine the place of publicity within the political philosophy of John Rawls. We shall analyze two distinct conceptions of publicity that arise in his writings. The first relates to the doctrine of public reason. The second relates to the doctrine of public rules. Though we begin with some remarks about public reason, we shall focus predominantly on public rules, as this idea is less familiar.

3.1 The Doctrine of Public Reason

Stated in a quite general way, the doctrine of public reason holds that, when justifying the exercise of political power, we ought to appeal exclusively to reasons that all “citizens as free and equal may reasonably be expected to endorse in the light of principles and ideals acceptable to their common human reason” (Rawls 1996, 137). So as to highlight their shared nature, we can call these public reasons.

In contrast with public reasons, there are non-public reasons. These reasons are controversial, in the sense that they are not reasons that we can expect all reasonable citizens to accept. Their possibility emerges from the fact of reasonable pluralism (Rawls 1996: 36–39), which refers to the idea that, in any society in which basic rights are protected, citizens will inevitably disagree about the worth of competing conceptions of the good life. The doctrine of public reason states that, because certain reasons are controversial, we ought not to appeal to them when making the case for the political legislation we support. In this respect, the doctrine calls for a kind of justificatory restraint (Rawls 1996: 447).[62]

To illustrate, let us consider the case of a Christian, who is opposed to abortion for religious reasons. The doctrine of public reason holds that, even though this citizen may act on these reasons in her own personal life, she ought not to appeal to her religious beliefs in order to oppose the legal right to abortion. This is because her Christian reasons are not ones that we can reasonably expect others to endorse. Instead, if she wishes to oppose the legislation, she must offer reasons that are shared by all reasonable citizens (Rawls 1996: 243 n. 32).

One concern with the doctrine of public reason is that, by asking citizens to set aside certain controversial reasons in political decision-making, it invites them to misrepresent their beliefs in various ways. This is the Insincerity Objection. For example, the Christian who is prohibited from appealing to her religious beliefs in order to oppose the legal right to abortion may decide to offer an argument that she does not find persuasive, but that she hopes others will, in order to advance her political agenda. This may be objectionable for a number of reasons, including because it may reduce the quality of political deliberation (Quong 2011: ch. 9; Schwartzman 2011).

A further concern is that the doctrine of public reason proves too much. This is because we disagree about almost all values, including political values. Even when we use political power in seemingly just ways, such as in the name of equality of opportunity, say, we must appeal to controversial reasons that are not widely accepted. Does it follow that we cannot reasonably expect citizens to endorse those reasons, and, if so, isn’t the doctrine of public reason too restrictive? Or, despite such disagreement, can we still reasonably expect their endorsement? If so, why can’t we also reasonably expect citizens to endorse other controversial reasons, such as those that derive from religious beliefs? Proponents of the doctrine must answer these questions by explaining why we may treat disagreements about political values differently from disagreements about conceptions of the good life. For this reason, we can call it the Asymmetry Objection (Caney 1995; Fowler and Stemplowska 2015; Sandel 1994; Waldron 1994).

The precise formulation of the doctrine of public reason is subject to further variation. Among other factors, it will depend upon (1) how we discriminate between the reasons that we can and cannot reasonably expect others to endorse; (2) whether its demands apply broadly to any matter of public concern or narrowly only to the essentials of a political constitution (Kelly 2013; Quong 2011: ch. 9); and (3) whether we acknowledge that there may be conditions under which the doctrine is defeated by other considerations, such concerns for religious salvation, for example (Rawls 1996: 152; Clayton and Stevens 2014).

Though the arguments we discuss below provide partial answers to these questions, we shall not explicitly discuss these issues here. Instead, our goal is to outline the various arguments in defence of the idea of public reason. These arguments clarify the demands of public reason, as well as inform our later analysis of public rules.

We can distinguish three distinct justifications for the doctrine, each of which finds support within Rawls’s texts:

  1. The Political Autonomy Argument
  2. The Civic Friendship Argument
  3. The Stability Argument

The Political Autonomy Argument begins with the claim that each citizen has a weighty interest in being politically autonomous—that is, in freely identifying with the constraints that she faces, such that she fully comprehends and endorses the justification of those constraints (Rawls 1996: 402).[63] Only by justifying the exercise of political power by appeal exclusively to public reasons can we protect citizens’ interest in political autonomy.[64] After all, what distinguishes public reasons from non-public reasons is that the former are ones that we can reasonably expect everyone to endorse and to act upon.

One objection to this argument comes from those who deny that citizens have a weighty interest in being politically autonomous. These critics target the fact that it is possible to justify the kind of justificatory restraint imposed by the doctrine of public reason only if this interest is sufficiently weighty. If the interest were not very weighty, or if there were no interest at all, then it is difficult to see why we ought to exercise the kind of justificatory restraint that the doctrine of public reason calls for, especially since it prevents us from appealing to a certain class of sound reasons (Raz 1986; Wall 1998).

The second justification for the doctrine of public reason is the Civic Friendship Argument. On this view, we can justify the doctrine by appeal to its role in enabling citizens jointly to maintain just institutions, and thereby realise a form of civic friendship. Public reason is central to this task since the joint pursuit of justice is possible only if citizens “affirm the same political conception of justice” and so “share one very basic political end” (Rawls 1996: 202).

Political autonomy and civic friendship are distinct ideals. Unlike political autonomy, civic friendship is an essentially common good—its benefits cannot be enjoyed by an individual in isolation but can be enjoyed only with others. Only citizens who relate to each other in a particular way—that is, as joint pursuers of a shared conception of justice—can enjoy this kind of civic friendship (Rawls 1996: 204; Leland and Wietmarschen 2017; Lister 2013; Ebels-Duggan 2010; Schwarzenbach 1996, 2005; Watson and Hartley 2018). Elaborating upon the idea of essentially common goods, Rawls writes,

That there should be such a political and social good is no more mysterious than that members of an orchestra, or players on a team, or even both teams in a game, should take pleasure and a certain (proper) pride in a good performance, or in a play of the game, one that they will want to remember (Rawls 1996: 204).

The success of the Civic Friendship Argument depends upon two claims. The first is that it is not possible, or at least it is much more difficult, for citizens to realise civic friendship in ways other than by upholding the doctrine of public reason. Some deny this claim, instead maintaining that forms of democracy that do not uphold the doctrine of public reason can fare equally as well in this regard (Billingham 2016; Caney 1995; Kogelmann 2017). The second is that citizens’ interest in realising civic friendship is sufficiently weighty so as to justify the kind of restraint imposed by the doctrine of public reason (Caney 1995).

The third justification of the doctrine of public reason is the Stability Argument. This argument emphasizes the alleged psychological fact that citizens are more likely to support principles and institutions that they themselves see as just (Rawls 1996: 140–4; Weithman 2011). This implies that, if we want to extend the life-expectancy of our institutions, then we should favour principles and institutions that will predictably generate their own support (Freeman 2007b: ch. 3). This counts in favour of the doctrine of public reason, whose defining claim is that we may appeal only to those reasons that we can reasonably expect others to endorse.

Unlike the previous two arguments, the Stability Argument is purely instrumental. It sees citizens’ support for the principles and institutions to which they are subject as valuable only insofar as it enhances the stability of those principles and institutions. Of course, this is not to say that stability is always valuable: instead, the stability of a set of institutions is valuable only if those institutions meet other moral standards, such as if they treat citizens justly.

3.2 The Doctrine of Public Rules

Whereas the doctrine of public reason restricts the reasons to which we may appeal, the doctrine of public rules regulates the character of the requirements that principles of justice may produce.[65] More specifically, it states that we have weighty reasons to prefer principles of justice that can serve as a public standard, in the senses that they are (i) not self-effacing; and yield demands (ii) that are sufficiently determinate and accessible, and (iii) compliance with which is sufficiently verifiable to others (Rawls 1996: 66–67; Rawls 1999a: 48–49; see also Williams 1998: 233). We explain each of these properties in turn.

First, principles of justice provide a public standard only if they are not self-effacing—that is, only if the success of the principles from which the rules derive does not depend upon some citizens being ignorant of these principles, or upon some citizens being ignorant of others’ knowledge of these principles (see §1.3.1). In other words, the idea of publicity requires mutual knowledge, and not mere general knowledge (see §1.1). In clarifying what he means by a public system of rules, Rawls writes,

I mean then that everyone engaged in it knows what he would know if these rules and his participation in the activity they define were the result of an agreement… He also knows that the others know this and that they know that he knows this, and so on (1999a: 48).[66]

Second, principles of justice provide a public standard only if they provide sufficiently determinate and accessible standards of moral permissibility, such that a “person taking part in an institution knows what the rules demand of him” (Rawls 1999a: 48). This has two components. First, principles pass the test of determinacy only if they are not so vague that they are incapable of producing clear directives.[67] Second, principles pass the test of accessibility not merely when citizens can attain knowledge of how they would be required to act if they were to have the relevant empirical information, but instead only if citizens are in fact able to attain knowledge of that empirical information (Rawls 1996: 182; Lippert-Rasmussen 2008: 41).

Third, principles of justice provide a public standard only if compliance with their demands is sufficiently verifiable to others. For Rawls, what matters is not only that “the institutions of the basic structure are just” but also that “everyone recognizes this” (1996: 66). This test of verifiable compliance therefore requires the possibility of widespread knowledge of the extent to which citizens discharge their duties. This test is most plausibly understood as an aggregative one. For example, the duty not to litter is verifiable to others in virtue of the fact that we can attain knowledge of the extent to which others on aggregate refrain from littering, even though we may not be able to attain knowledge of the extent to which any given citizen refrains from littering.[68]

Rawls appeals to the doctrine of public rules in order to justify several features of his view, including the idea that the principles of justice should govern the distribution of social primary goods rather than the distribution of welfare. Part of what justifies this verdict is that, because it is not feasible accurately to measure welfare, principles that refer to welfare fail the test of accessibility. Accordingly, these principles “run afoul of the [publicity] constraint”, such that “In political life citizens cannot sensibly apply or follow it” (Rawls 1996: 182 n. 11; Rawls 1999b: 13 n. 3). Because of this, principles of justice that govern the distribution of welfare abrogate their chief purpose, which is “to provide a publicly recognized point of view from which all citizens can examine before one another whether their political and social institutions are just” (Rawls 1996: 9).

In the same vein, Andrew Williams writes,

…we have reason to reject conceptions of justice which, given the fact of limited information, are too epistemically demanding to be public and stable. We should, like Rawls, favour conceptions whose scope is restricted to publicly accessible phenomena (1998: 245).

An implication of the doctrine of public rules, therefore, is that we have reasons to object to highly epistemically demanding principles of justice that fail the tests of determinacy, accessibility, and/or verifiable compliance. As an example of this, let us consider G. A. Cohen’s claim that justice requires citizens to internalize an egalitarian ethos that condemns self-serving behaviour and, subject to a personal prerogative and special labour burdens, requires citizens to be guided by a concern for the least advantaged when making occupational choices (2008: part 1). Rejecting this possibility on the grounds that it violates the doctrine of public rules, Williams writes that

it is quite possible that, in typical cases, we will lack a sufficiently precise public standard by which to justify, or criticize, each other’s self-serving behavior (1998: 240).

This is because, in order to calculate whether a citizen is acting in accordance with the demands with the egalitarian ethos, we would need to know which occupation available to her best serves the interests of the least advantaged, as well as whether her choice to pursue an alternative occupation would be protected by either her personal prerogative or a concern for special labour burdens.

The success of Williams’s reply to Cohen depends partly upon the existence of weighty reasons to endorse the doctrine of public rules. For this reason, we shall now turn our attention to the various arguments in defence of this doctrine. In particular, we highlight three distinct justifications, each of which corresponds to an argument in defence of the doctrine of public reason.

The Political Autonomy Argument justifies the doctrine of public rules by appeal to its role in protecting political autonomy (Williams 1998: 244). If citizens have no clear sense of what the principles of justice demand of them, then they lack awareness of the moral constraints to which they are subject, and so are prevented from freely identifying with those constraints. A similar threat to political autonomy arises when principles of justice fail the test of verifiable compliance. If citizens are freely to identify with the constraints to which they are subject, it is important that they can recognise these constraints as a product of others’ compliance with principles of justice.

The second justification is the Civic Friendship Argument, according to which we should uphold the doctrine of public rules because of the role it plays in realising civic friendship (Williams 1998: 244). According to this view, civic friendship can exist within a society only when citizens are able justifiably to regard themselves and others (and justifiably be regarded by themselves and others) as doing what is necessary to sustain reasonably fair terms of social cooperation. Publicity facilitates each of these ends. Just as members of an orchestra are denied a common good when they cannot hear, or otherwise appreciate, their own or others’ contributions to their joint performance, so too citizens are denied the good of civic friendship when they are denied awareness of their own or others’ compliance with the principles of justice.

Finally, the Stability Argument justifies the doctrine of public rules on the grounds that its acceptance enhances “the long-term probability of a society conforming with its conceptions of justice” (Williams 1998: 244). Again, this instrumental argument relies upon the alleged psychological fact that citizens are more likely to support principles and institutions that they perceive as just (Rawls 1996: 140–4). This supports the doctrine of public rules insofar as citizens are more likely to perceive principles and institutions as just when the demands of justice are sufficiently determinate and accessible, and compliance with them is sufficiently verifiable to others (for objections: Caney 1995; Lippert-Rasmussen 2008: 45–46).

3.3 The Good Faith Efforts Objection

The most sustained critique of the doctrine of public rules comes from Cohen (2008: ch. 8). Though he advances a number of distinct objections to the doctrine, for reasons of space we shall focus on only one element of his analysis, in which he disputes the claim that principles of justice must pass the tests of determinacy, accessibility, and of verifiable compliance. Cohen denies that, in order to be valid, principles of justice must be capable of serving as a public standard. Instead, he maintains that we can rely solely upon citizens’ good faith efforts. This is the Good Faith Efforts Objection (Casal 2015; Lippert-Rasmussen 2015: ch. 8).

In support of this objection, let us consider a gender egalitarian ethos that condemns women having to do more housework than men, for no good reason. As with Cohen’s egalitarian ethos, this ethos may fail to provide a public standard by which to justify and to criticize our own and others’ sexist behaviour. This is because, in order to determine whether a husband who refuses to do the washing up because of backache is acting in accordance with the demands of the gender egalitarian ethos, we would need to know how severe his backache is, as well as to compare the other domestic burdens that he has borne with those that his wife bears. This makes the gender egalitarian ethos highly epistemically demanding, such that it may fail the tests of determinacy, accessibility, and/or verifiable compliance (Cohen 2008: 359–60). However, it is intuitively implausible to reject the gender egalitarian ethos on this basis. Rather, in this case, justice requires “good-faith efforts, not omniscience” (Casal 2015: 822).[69]

Cohen offers a second case in support of the Good Faith Efforts Objection:

During World War II in Britain, a social ethos induced people to sacrifice personal interests for the sake of the war effort, and everyone was expected, as a matter of justice, to “do his bit,” to shoulder his just share. It is absurd to suppose that someone could have stated precisely what amount of sacrifice that injunction required, and it is true, therefore, that, with respect to many people, one couldn’t tell, and with respect to some, they couldn’t even themselves tell, whether they were sacrificing on the required scale (2008: 353).

Cohen maintains that, rather than reject such an ethos on the grounds that it is inconsistent with the demands of the doctrine of public rules, we should instead abandon the latter. What matters in these cases, Cohen thinks, is that citizens are able to make “a reasonably efficacious societywide good faith effort” (2008: 352 [emphasis in original]).

In reply to this objection, proponents of the doctrine of public rules might circumscribe their claims, holding that we should prefer principles of justice that provide a public standard only under certain conditions. One possibility is to relinquish the doctrine of public rules in those cases in which citizens are required to bear costs that are much smaller than the benefits generated by good faith efforts to comply with those principles. This would explain why the indeterminacy, inaccessibility, and lack of verifiable compliance is not troubling in the two cases we have just considered. In the first, the gender egalitarian ethos requires citizens to bear minimal costs in the fight against sexism; and in the second, Cohen’s sacrifice ethos requires citizens to bear potentially larger costs, but the reward is enormous.

This would not amount to an abandonment of the doctrine of public rules. Rather, according to this reply, we should prefer principles of justice that provide a public standard, except when there is not this discrepancy in costs. As the costs that citizens are required to bear increase in comparison with the benefits they are required to generate, it becomes increasingly important that citizens know both what their duties demand of them and the extent to which others discharge their duties.

Two reasons support this conviction. First, without determinate and accessible standards of moral permissibility, there is a risk that some citizens will make larger sacrifices than what is morally required of them. When the costs involved are comparatively high, this is likely to be unfair. To illustrate this unfairness, we can consider the case of an individual who internalises the egalitarian ethos, and who takes on some grueling occupation only because she fails to recognise that, because of her personal prerogative, she would be morally justified in pursuing a more enjoyable occupation.

Second, it is sometimes reasonable for a citizen who makes considerable sacrifices to have assurance that other citizens are discharging their duties. This is because she knows that she is not being exploited by non-compliers, and because she knows that, if she were not to make such sacrifices, she would be free-riding on benefits that others’ compliance brings (Lister 2020; Mason 2012: 541). Again, these concerns are likely to be more powerful when the sacrifices required of citizens are comparatively high.

This reply to the Good Faith Efforts Objection is incomplete in multiple ways. Proponents of this reply must specify the implications of their views in a larger range of cases, including those in which the costs and benefits involved are of comparatively equal values (both high and low). Moreover, it also remains important to explain more precisely how this reply relates to the three justifications for the doctrine of public rules that we considered above. Meeting these challenges is central to establishing the plausibility of the doctrine of public rules.

4. Conclusion

We began our exploration by looking at Kant’s hypothetical publicity test. We asked ourselves whether there were good reasons to believe that hypothetical publicity should be considered a sound requirement to test maxims of action. We also wondered whether hypothetical publicity entailed significant restrictions from the point of view of actual publicity. The answer appears to be rather negative in both cases. This is because, first, there does not seem to be any intrinsic relationship between self-frustratingness and justice. To put things in another way, the less the effect of publicity is contingent, the more we can doubt about its validity as a test of justice. And second, if no criterion is provided as to the level of generality at which the Kantian test should operate, we run both risks of under- and over-exclusiveness. Which maxims of action should be deemed unjust is therefore left rather undefined by the test in most cases.

While it is unclear whether the Kantian hypothetical publicity test could (and should) be rescued, there is no doubt that actual publicity issues raise interesting philosophical challenges. One of them has to do with the articulation between, on the one hand, the function that political philosophy ascribes to voting, representation, and deliberation; and, on the other hand, the types of effects that could be expected from going public. In the course of our discussion, we also tried to draw parallels and to identify differences between voters and their representatives (e.g., through the idea of horizontal accountability) and between the voting and the deliberation debate. The meaning of the publicity requirement may differ significantly as well when we compare standard representative bodies (e.g., parliaments) with the civil service or with “independent” bodies acting within a democratic context (e.g., central banks or courts). Publicity in the latter case is likely to have both a meaning and consequences quite different from the ones attached to public deliberation, e.g., in a parliament’s plenary session.

Moreover, while we did not question the possibility of developing principled views in the field of actual publicity, factual assumptions present in most of the key arguments in this respect (e.g., in those of Mill or Elster) require more extensive empirical research. The results that we reported from some of these empirical investigations are potentially rich in consequences for our normative theories. The data gathered by Naurin (2004) and Meade and Stasavage (2008) are especially important in this respect. As is the case with other issues in political philosophy, there is certainly a need here for philosophers to engage in a dialogue with social scientists.

Finally, we briefly presented Rawls’s uses of the idea of publicity. The variety of ways in which he refers to it certainly shows the need for a more substantial mapping enterprise, at a strictly conceptual level. This could in turn indicate reasons to develop philosophical arguments in new directions.


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The update published on August 4, 2017 contains new Section 3, written by T. Parr. Many thanks to B. Baertschi, P. Bou-Habib, M. Clayton, P. Destrée, P. Dietsch, B. Engelen, R. Gannett, A. Kahan, O. Klein, L. Langlois, C. Larrère, C. Mills, D. Naurin, T. Pogge, H. Pourtois, P. Pross, A. Roberts, M. Schwartzman, A. Walton, and A. Williams for very valuable suggestions and information. Earlier versions of this entry were presented at the universities of Aarhus (2016), Montréal (2003), Bristol (2004), Louvain (2004) and St Louis (Brussels) (2004). We wish to thank these audiences. The usual disclaimers apply.

Copyright © 2021 by
Axel Gosseries
Tom Parr <>

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