Qualia: The Knowledge Argument

First published Tue Sep 3, 2002; substantive revision Fri Mar 1, 2024

The knowledge argument aims to establish that conscious experience involves non-physical properties. It rests on the idea that someone who has complete physical knowledge about another conscious being might yet lack knowledge about how it feels to have the experiences of that being. It is one of the most discussed arguments against physicalism.

1. History of the Underlying Ideas

The Knowledge Argument became the subject of intense philosophical discussion following its canonical formulation by Frank Jackson (1982). However, there are numerous precursors of this argument in the literature. Precursors of the Knowledge Argument typically involve at least one of two strategies which are familiar from Jackson’s formulation. The first is to appeal to what Daniel Stoljar & Yujin Nagasawa term the knowledge intuition: the intuition that no amount of knowledge of the physical information or physical facts concerning certain experiences can by itself suffice for knowledge of what these experiences are like, i.e., knowledge of their qualitative character or distinctive qualia (2004, 2–3). The second is to make use of thought experiments which are similar to Jackson’s famous example of Mary. These thought-experiments typically involve a being who has complete knowledge of the physical information or physical facts concerning certain experiences, but who (it is claimed) lacks knowledge of what those experiences are like.

As examples of the knowledge intuition, Stoljar & Nagasawa cite passages by Bertrand Russell (1998, 13–14) and by J.W. Dunne (1929). As Dunne puts it, quoting James Ward, physical descriptions cannot entail knowledge of what it is that “you immediately experience when you look at a field poppy” (1929, 5). Around the same time as Dunne was writing, C.D. Broad (1925) used a thought-experiment as part of an argument against a mechanistic version of physicalism. Broad argues that even if the mechanistic theory of chemistry were true there still would be a property of ammonia that a mathematical archangel endowed with unlimited mathematical skills and “gifted with the further power of perceiving the microscopic structure of atoms” could not predict, namely its smell:

He [the archangel] would know exactly what the microscopic structure of ammonia must be; but he would be totally unable to predict that a substance with this structure must smell as ammonia does when it gets into the human nose. The utmost that he could predict on this subject would be that certain changes would take place in the mucous membrane, the olfactory nerves and so on. But he could not possibly know that theses changes would be accompanied by the appearance of a smell in general or of the peculiar smell of ammonia in particular, unless someone told him so or he had smelled it for himself (1925, 71).[1]

Under the title “The Cognitive Role of Acquaintance,” H. Feigl (1958) briefly discusses the epistemic limitations of a Martian who studies human behavior but does not share human sentiments:

The first question I wish to discuss concerns the cognitive ‘plus’, i.e., the alleged advantages of knowledge by acquaintance over knowledge by description. We may ask, for example, what does the seeing person know that the congenitally blind person could not know. Or, to take two examples from Eddington, what could a someone know about the effects of jokes if he had no sense of humor? Could a Martian, entirely without sentiments of compassion and piety, know about what is going on during a commemoration of the armistice? For the sake of argument, we assume complete physical predictability and explainability of the behavior of humans equipped with vision, a sense of humor, and sentiments of piety. The Martian could then predict all responses, including the linguistic utterances of the earthlings in the situations which involve their visual perceptions, their laughter about jokes, or their (solemn) behavior at the commemoration. But ex hypothesi, the Martian would be lacking completely in the sort of imagery and empathy which depends on familiarity (direct acquaintance) with the kinds of qualia to be imaged or empathized (1958, 431).

B. A. Farrell had earlier presented a similar thought experiment featuring a Martian; in this version, it is humans who lack knowledge of what it is like for the Martian to exercise his sensory capacities (1950, 183; though Farrell ultimately argues that this thought experiment does not present a challenge to physicalism). Paul E. Meehl, responding to Feigl, describes two individuals who each have complete neurophysiological knowledge, one of whom is congenitally blind; he takes it as intuitive that this person does not know something which the other does, namely “what red looks like” (1966, 151).

More recent examples from the literature come closer to being versions of the Knowledge Argument rather than merely precursors to it. For example, consider the following statement of the knowledge intuition by Nicholas Maxwell:

from a complete physicalist description alone it would be impossible to deduce the perceptual qualities of things, but this is due, not to the fact that things do not really possess perceptual qualities, but to the fact that the physicalist description is incomplete: it does not tell us all that there is to know about the world. It does not tell us what it is like to be a human being alive and experiencing in the world (1965, 309).[2]

Howard Robinson, writing the same year as Jackson published ‘Epiphenomenal Qualia’, describes a deaf scientist “who knows everything there is to know about the physical processes involved in hearing”, but who intuitively does not know what it is like to hear (1982, 4). Saul Kripke had outlined similar ideas in unpublished lectures given in 1979 (Renero 2023).

Finally, it is worth mentioning the extremely influential thought experiment described by Thomas Nagel (1974). According to Nagel, the physical facts about an organism and its perceptual systems are “objective facts par excellence – the kind that can be observed and understood from many points of view and by individuals with differing perceptual systems” (1974, 442). Nagel argues that even if we knew all the objective facts about a bat’s sonar system, we would still not know what it would be like to perceive using this system. Therefore, complete knowledge of the physical facts about a bat’s perceptual system would not yield knowledge of certain facts about a bat’s experiences; these facts can only be captured from a subjective perspective. Nagel does not argue against physicalism, but rather claims that we presently have no understanding of how it can be true. In Section 4.9, we shall outline a related approach to the knowledge argument which interprets it as a challenge not to physicalism but to a position called objectivism.

2. The Basic Idea

Frank Jackson (1982) formulates the intuition underlying his Knowledge Argument in a much cited passage using his famous example of the neurophysiologist Mary:

Mary is a brilliant scientist who is, for whatever reason, forced to investigate the world from a black and white room via a black and white television monitor. She specializes in the neurophysiology of vision and acquires, let us suppose, all the physical information there is to obtain about what goes on when we see ripe tomatoes, or the sky, and use terms like ‘red’, ‘blue’, and so on. She discovers, for example, just which wavelength combinations from the sky stimulate the retina, and exactly how this produces via the central nervous system the contraction of the vocal chords and expulsion of air from the lungs that results in the uttering of the sentence ‘The sky is blue’.… What will happen when Mary is released from her black and white room or is given a color television monitor? Will she learn anything or not? It seems just obvious that she will learn something about the world and our visual experience of it. But then is it inescapable that her previous knowledge was incomplete. But she had all the physical information. Ergo there is more to have than that, and Physicalism is false.

The argument contained in this passage may be put like this:

Mary has all the physical information concerning human color vision before her release.
But there is some information about human color vision that she does not have before her release.
Not all information is physical information.

Most authors who discuss the knowledge argument cite the case of Mary, but Frank Jackson used a further example in his seminal article: the case of a person, Fred, who sees a color unknown to normal human perceivers. We might want to know what color Fred experiences when looking at things that appear to him in that particular way. It seems clear that no amount of knowledge about what happens in his brain and about how color information is processed in his visual system will help us to find an answer to that question. In both cases cited by Jackson, an epistemic subject A appears to have no access to particular items of knowledge about a subject B: A cannot know that B has an experience of a particular quality Q on certain occasions. This particular item of knowledge about B is inaccessible to A because A never had experiences of Q herself.

3. Some Clarifications

3.1 Two Versions of the Argument

As Horgan (1984) points out, talk of ‘physical information’ in the context of the knowledge argument is ambiguous between an epistemological and an ontological reading. “Physical information” may be interpreted (a) in the sense of what Horgan calls ‘explicit physical information’ (according to Horgan’s proposal a sentence S expresses explicit physical information about certain processes just in case S belongs to, or follows from, a theoretically adequate physical account of those processes) or (b) in the sense of ‘ontologically physical information’ which is explicated in Horgan (1984, 150) as follows: a sentence S “expresses ontologically physical information about certain processes just in case (i) all entities referred to or quantified over in S are physical entities, and (ii) all the properties and relations expressed by the predicates in S are physical properties and relations.” Presupposing a distinction along these lines one may replace ‘to have all explicit physical information about x’ by ‘to have complete physical knowledge about x’ and one may replace ‘to have all ontologically physical information about x’ by ‘to know all the physical facts about x’. The argument may thus be reformulated in two different ways:

The weaker version of the knowledge argument:
Mary has complete physical knowledge concerning facts about human color vision before her release.
But there is some kind of knowledge concerning facts about human color vision that she does not have before her release.
There is some kind of knowledge concerning facts about human color vision that is non-physical knowledge.
The stronger version of the knowledge argument:
Mary knows all the physical facts concerning human color vision before her release.
But there are some facts about human color vision that Mary does not know before her release.
There are non-physical facts concerning human color vision.

The conclusion of the stronger version of the argument (3b) is an ontological claim that the physicalist must reject. The conclusion of the weaker version of the argument is merely an epistemological claim that is compatible with denying the existence of non-physical facts. Although Jackson’s original formulation in terms of information is open to both interpretations it is clear that the second stronger version is what he had in mind.

As many have pointed out, the result of the weaker version (3a) does not imply the result of the stronger version (3b). That a person has incomplete knowledge about a certain topic does not imply without further assumptions that there is some specific fact she does not have knowledge of. The example of knowledge about oneself (de se knowledge) may illustrate the general point. Let us suppose that John, who is at t in Amsterdam, does not know that he is now in Amsterdam (if asked about his present location he would assert “I am now in Venice”). John’s knowledge concerning the present location of people is incomplete. He lacks a specific locating piece of de se knowledge. Still, there need not be any fact concerning the location of people that John does not have knowledge of. It does not follow from the description of the case that John does not have knowledge of the fact that John is in Amsterdam. John may well know that John is in Amsterdam but, having forgotten that he is himself John, he may fail to conclude that he is now in Amsterdam. If John finally learns that he is in Amsterdam, he does not thereby learn a new fact – or so many philosophers would insist – he gains new knowledge of a fact that he already knew in a different way.

If – in analogy to the de se case – some physical facts about color vision can be known in two different ways, – in a ‘physical way’ (under ‘physical concepts’) and in some other, non-physical way (under ‘non-physical concepts’), then it is possible to acquire new (non-physical) knowledge about a (physical) fact without thereby acquiring knowledge of a new fact (the very same fact may have been known before under its physical conceptualization). Many authors accept the weaker version of the argument but reject the stronger one for the reason just sketched: they admit that Mary gains new propositional knowledge but deny that she thereby comes to know facts that she did not know before in some other way. (These authors accept the first premise of both versions of the argument and the second premise of the first version as well, but they deny the second premise of the second version and insist that (2a) does not imply (2b)). Their position with respect to the knowledge argument will be called the New Knowledge/Old Fact-View (see Section 4.6 below). Others deny even the weaker version V1 and claim that Mary does not gain any new propositional knowledge (no new knowledge about something that is the case, no factual knowledge). Their position will be called the No Propositional Knowledge View (see Sections 4.3 and 4.5 below).

To locate the different points of disagreement it is helpful to formulate the stronger version of the argument more explicitly.

Explicit formulation of the knowledge argument (stronger version):
Premise P1
Mary has complete physical knowledge about human color vision before her release.
Consequence C1
Mary knows all the physical facts about human color vision before her release.
Premise P1
There is some (kind of) knowledge concerning facts about human color vision that Mary does not have before her release.
Therefore (from (P2)):
Consequence C2
There are some facts about human color vision that Mary does not know before her release.
Therefore (from (C1) and (C2)):
Consequence C3
There are non-physical facts about human color vision.

Once C1 and C2 are accepted, there is obviously no way to avoid C3 (which follows logically from the former two). Moreover, is seems hard to deny that it is in principle possible to have complete physical knowledge about human color vision (or about an appropriately chosen part thereof). If so, premise P1 should be accepted as an appropriate description of a legitimate thought experiment. To avoid the antimaterialist conclusion C3 the physicalist can (a) object against the inference from P1 to C1 (a minority of philosophers have chosen this strategy, see Section 4.2 below) or he or she can avoid C2 by (b) denying premise P2 (this is the strategy chosen by proponents of the No Propositional Knowledge View, see Sections 4.3 and 4.5 below) or by (c) blocking the inference from premise P2 to C2 (this is the strategy chosen by a majority of physicalist philosophers who subscribe to some version of the New Knowledge/Old Fact View, see Section 4.6 below).

3.2 Physical and Non-physical

The knowledge argument is often cited as one of those anti-physicalist qualia-based arguments that are supposed to justify property dualism. The above formulation, however, does not explicitly mention non-physical properties but only non-physical facts. But the relation between the two claims is obvious. Friends of the knowledge argument will say that the facts at issue are non-physical because they involve the exemplification of non-physical properties (e.g. of the property of having an experience with quality Q).

In the assumption that Mary has all physical knowledge (first version) or knows all the physical facts (second version) “physical” is meant in a very broad sense that includes knowledge about (or facts concerning) the functioning of the receptors and neurons involved in color vision (biological and physiological knowledge/facts) as well as knowledge about (or facts concerning) the whole network of causal relations between processes underlying color vision, external stimuli and behavior (functional knowledge/ functional facts). “Physical” knowledge in the broad sense at issue even includes psychological knowledge (e.g. knowledge about the result of psychophysical experiments) in so far as they can be formulated without use of phenomenal terminology. One might try to explicate “physical knowledge” in the sense at issue in roughly the following way: physical knowledge includes all knowledge that is expressible in a terminology that does not contain irreducibly mental terms. It would be natural to define physical facts as those facts that can be expressed in this way. But note that this definition of ‘physical facts’ begs the question against an objection that has been raised against the knowledge argument (see Section 4.2 below).

It is certainly not easy to formulate a precise, adequate and non question-begging account of “physical knowledge” and “physical facts” suited for the discussion of the knowledge argument. It is, however, quite common to assume that our intuitive understanding of “physical knowledge” in the broad sense at issue is clear enough for the purposes of the debate, though some argue that talk of “physical facts” needs clarification (see Alter 1998). One prominent suggestion is that physical knowledge is exhausted by knowledge of structural information, “information that can be fully expressed by statements containing only logical, mathematical, nomic, and perhaps spatiotemporal vocabulary” (Alter 2023, 11; for further discussion of structure and the closely related notion of dynamics see Chalmers 2010a; Alter 2016).

3.3 Knowing what it is like

It is common to formulate Mary’s new knowledge in terms of Thomas Nagel’s famous locution of knowing what it’s like: Mary does not know (while living in her black-and-white environment) what it is like to see colors and she learns what it is like to see colors only after her release. But this common way to put the point may lead to a confusion of (a) mere acquaintance with kinds of color experiences by having and remembering them and (b) knowledge about what kind of color experience other subjects have at a given occasion, and it may thereby lead to a failure to distinguish two steps of epistemic progress that Jackson’s Mary takes at once. To see the two steps involved one may consider an example used in Nida-Rümelin (1996) and (1998): Like Mary, Marianna first (at t1) lives in a black and white environment. Contrary to Mary (at a later moment t2) she gets acquainted with colors by seeing arbitrarily colored objects (abstract paintings, red chairs, blue tables, etc. but no yellow bananas, no pictures of landscapes with a blue sky etc.). Marianna is therefore unable to relate the kinds of color experiences she now is acquainted with to what she already knew about them at t1. At t2, Marianna may wonder which of four slides (a red, a blue, a green and a yellow slide) appears to her in the color normal people experience when looking at the cloudless sky. At t2 Marianna knows, in a sense, what it is like to have experiences of red, blue, etc. But she still lacks the relevant items of knowledge about what other people experience: there is a clear sense in which she still may not know that the sky appears blue to normal perceivers, she may even have the false belief that it appears to normal perceivers like the red slide appears to her and thus believe, in a sense, that the sky appears red to normal perceivers. Only at t3, when Marianna is finally released and sees the sky, does she gain this item of knowledge. One way to describe the two steps of epistemic progress is this: At t2, by having color experiences, Marianna can form new concepts, she now has what has been called ‘phenomenal concepts’ of kinds of color experiences. By acquiring these concepts she acquires the capacity to ask new questions, and to form new (eventually false) hypotheses (e.g. about the appearance of the sky to normal perceivers). Only at t3 does she acquire the kind of knowledge that the knowledge argument is concerned with (knowledge that involves the application of phenomenal concepts) about experiences of other people.

Once these two steps are clearly distinguished one may conclude that Marianna’s relevant epistemic progress at t3 (and Mary’s relevant progress after release) is not happily described by talk of knowing what it’s like. Rather, or so one may argue, Mary and Marianna acquire a particular kind of belief that the sky appears blue to normal perceivers, namely the phenomenal belief that it appears blue to normal perceivers, where phenomenal belief involves the application of the appropriate phenomenal concept. Both may have believed, in a sense (the non-phenomenal sense that does not require use of phenomenal concepts) that the sky appears blue to normal perceivers while still in their black-and-white environment (they may have been told so by their friends). (For the distinction between phenomenal and non-phenomenal belief see Nida-Rümelin 1996 and 1998).

In addition to the danger of confusing the two steps of epistemic progress distinguished above, talk of knowing what it is like raises various semantic issues. One issue is whether attributions of knowing what it is like can be reduced to attributions of propositional or factual knowledge, so that for Mary to know what it is like to F just is for her to know that p, where ‘p’ is a proposition related in some suitable way to F-ing (for different views on this see Lycan 1996, 92–93; Tye 2011; Lynch 2020; see also Sections 4.3–4.5. A second issue is raised by Daniel Stoljar, who distinguishes two ways of reading attributions of knowing what it is like (2016). On the interrogative reading, to know what it is like to, e.g., see red just is to know some fact which answers the question ‘What is it like to see red?’ On the free relative reading, to know what it is like to see red is to know a type of experience. Stoljar outlines a possible criticism of the Knowledge Argument which appeals to an ambiguity between these two readings of knowing what it is like, concluding that the Knowledge Argument can be reformulated to avoid this criticism.

4. Objections

4.1 Doubts about the Thought Experiment

Some authors have raised doubts about the thought experiment itself. It is sometimes pointed out, for example, that merely confining Mary to a monochromatic environment would not prevent her from having color experiences (see Thompson 1995, 264) or that, after release, she would not be able to see colors. But the example can be refined to meet these objections. Mary might be monochromatic from birth and changed into a normal perceiver by some medical procedure. It is sometimes objected that already accepted or future results of visual science are or might be incompatible with the existence of a Mary-case (a person with monochromatic experience who becomes a normal color perceiver later) or that such results might require (to preserve consistence with visual science) the introduction of so many additional assumptions that the conceivability of the example becomes doubtful. To this one might reply that the thought experiment need not be compatible with visual science. If the case of a person with monochromatic vision who turns into a normal perceiver really does involve serious difficulties for materialism, then the mere fact (if it were one) that our visual apparatus excludes the actual existence of such a case does not seem to provide a convincing reply for the materialist. But this point (the relevance or irrelevance of visual science in this context) has not received much discussion in the literature. It has, however, been pointed out (see Graham and Horgan, 2000, footnote 4 with its reference to Shepard 1993) that at least presently available results of color vision science do not exclude a Mary-case. (The psychologist Knut Nordby was a real life case of a color vision specialist who was also a complete achromat. See Nordby 1996 [Other Internet Resources] and Nordby, 2007.)

Another doubt about the thought experiment is raised by the claim that a person who is confined to a monochromatic environment but knows everything physical there is to know about visual color experience would be able to figure out what colored things look like and thus would e.g. be able to imagine the kind of color experience produced in normal perceivers when looking at the cloudless sky during the day (see e.g. Dennett 1991; Dennett 2007; Churchland 1989; Maloney 1985, 36). Probably the most common reaction to this is simply to doubt the claim. But it is not clear that the claim, if correct, would undermine the knowledge argument. The opponent would have to show that complete physical knowledge necessarily involves the capacity to imagine blue. One may doubt that this claim is compatible with the widely accepted assumption that physical knowledge can be acquired independently of one’s particular perceptual apparatus. (Arguably a subject whose visual apparatus is not suited for visual experiences at all will not be able to develop the capacity to imagine colors on the basis of physical knowledge alone, even if this were true for Mary).

Some have argued that Mary would recognize the colors when first seeing them on the basis of her complete physical knowledge about color vision (see Hardin 1992; Ross 2018). According to this claim she would think something like “oh, so this is red” when first confronted with a red patch and she could not be fooled by what Dennett calls ‘the blue banana trick’: when shown a blue banana she would know that it has the wrong color (see Dennett 1991). A possible and common response is to simply doubt these claims. But, in any case, it is not clear that these claims undermine the knowledge argument. One may respond along the following lines: If Mary when first confronted with red were able to conclude that she is now seeing what people call red, she thereby acquires a large set of new beliefs about red experiences (that they are produced by roses, such-and-such wavelength combinations and so on). On the basis of seeing red she (a) acquires a new phenomenal concept of red and (b) she forms new beliefs involving that new concept using her previously acquired physical knowledge. But if this description is correct, then her previous knowledge was incomplete (for a detailed discussion of Dennett’s argument involving the blue banana trick see Dale 1995).

A slightly different way of doubting the thought experiment is to in effect shift the burden onto proponents of the Knowledge Argument. The idea is that we are not in an informed position concerning whether or not Mary would know the phenomenal facts, because ex hypothesi she has complete knowledge of the relevant physical facts and we do not; we may be ignorant of certain physical facts which would allow Mary to deduce the relevant phenomenal facts. This ignorance hypothesis is defended in Stoljar (2006, 79–86), primarily on the basis of considering analogous thought experiments (for critical discussion see Alter 2023, 41–50).

McClelland (2019) develops this line of thought into a dilemma. Given the ignorance hypothesis, the proponent of the Knowledge Argument must offer reasons to think that the physical facts in an ideal completed science would not entail the phenomenal facts. If such reasons are not forthcoming, then we should not accept the Knowledge Argument. But if they are forthcoming then the Knowledge Argument would be redundant (since those reasons would by themselves suffice to defeat physicalism).

It is also worth mentioning that non-philosophers seem to agree that Mary would not know everything about experiences while confined to the room. 82% of respondents in a survey answered that Mary in the room would not know what it is like to see red, and this finding held across a range of different demographic groups (Gregory, Hendrickx & Turner 2022, 530–532).

4.2 Complete Physical Knowledge without Knowledge of all the Physical Facts

It may appear obvious that premise P1 (Mary has complete physical knowledge about human color vision) implies C1 (Mary knows all the physical facts about human color vision). If all physical facts can be known under some physical conceptualization, then a person who has complete physical knowledge about a topic knows all the relevant physical facts. But a few philosophers can be understood as objecting against precisely this apparently unproblematic step. Harman (1990) argues that Mary does not know all the functional facts concerning human color vision because she lacks the concept of what it is for an object to be red, blue, etc. Flanagan (1992) distinguishes metaphysical physicalism from linguistic physicalism. While metaphysical physicalism is the ontological claim that there are no non-physical individuals, properties or relations and no non-physical facts, linguistic physicalism says that “everything physical can be expressed or captured in the languages of the physical sciences.” According to Flanagan Mary’s case may refute linguistic physicalism but does not refute metaphysical physicalism. Alter (1998) points out that the knowledge argument needs the premise that all physical facts can be learned discursively and argues that this assumption has not been established. It may be argued against this view that it becomes hard to understand what it is for a property or a fact to be physical once we drop the assumption that physical properties and physical facts are just those properties and facts that can be expressed in physical terminology.

Moran (2023) develops a proposal like Flanagan’s which offers a way to address this worry. He suggests that the physicalist can distinguish between narrowly physical facts, those revealed by fundamental physics, and broadly physical facts, those which are wholly and fully grounded in the narrowly physical facts. (Crucially, this distinction assumes that facts which are wholly and fully grounded in narrowly physical facts are themselves physical – for critical discussion of this assumption see Nida-Rümelin & O’Conaill forthcoming.) A physicalist will hold that phenomenal facts about, e.g., what it is like to see red, are broadly physical. Moran argues that Mary can come to know phenomenal facts only on leaving the room. This allows him to deny that P1 entails C1.

4.3 No Propositional Knowledge 1: the Ability Hypothesis

Two different versions of the No Propositional Knowledge-View have been proposed. According to the Ability Hypothesis (most prominently defended in Lewis 1983, 1988 and in Nemirow 1980, 1990, 2007), Mary does not acquire any new propositional knowledge after release (no knowledge about something that is the case, no factual knowledge), but only a bundle of abilities (like the ability to imagine, remember and recognize colors or color experiences). According to the Acquaintance Hypothesis proposed by Conee (1994), Mary’s new knowledge after release is what he calls “acquaintance knowledge” which is neither propositional knowledge nor identical to a bundle of abilities.

Proponents of the Ability Hypothesis presuppose that Mary’s epistemic progress after release consists in the acquisition of knowing what it is like (e.g. to have an experience of blue) and they claim that to know what it is like is to have certain practical abilities. According to Nemirow “knowing what an experience is like is the same as knowing how to imagine having the experience” (1990, 495). According to Lewis,

…knowing what it is like is the possession of abilities: abilities to recognize, abilities to imagine, abilities to predict one’s behavior by imaginative experiments (Lewis 1983, 131).

A few years later he writes:

The Ability Hypothesis says that knowing what an experience is like just is the possession of these abilities to remember, imagine, and recognize. … It isn’t knowing-that. It’s knowing-how (Lewis 1990, 516).

Bence Nanay suggests that what Mary acquires is the ability to discriminate between different types of awareness, i.e., to distinguish having or imagining experiences of type E from having or imagining experiences of other types (2009).

Lewis’s main argument for the Ability Hypothesis can be summarized like this. (1) The only alternative to the Ability Hypothesis is what he calls the Hypothesis of Phenomenal Information (HPI). (According to the HPI knowing what it is like is propositional in the following sense: coming to know what it is like involves the elimination of hitherto open possibilities). (2) The HPI is incompatible with physicalism. (3) The Ability Hypothesis is compatible with physicalism and explains everything that may be explained by the HPI. Therefore: The Ability Hypothesis should be preferred.

Note that the Ability Hypothesis is compatible with the view that we do sometimes acquire propositional knowledge on the basis of getting acquainted with a new kind of experience from the first person perspective. The following remarks by Levin are hard to deny:

…it would be perverse to claim that bare experience can provide us only with practical abilities…. By being shown an unfamiliar color, I acquire information about its similarities and compatibilities with other colors, and its effects on other mental states: surely I seem to be acquiring certain facts about color and the visual experience of it (Levin 1986, 246; see also Crane 2003).

But, as pointed out by Tye (2000), this does not undermine the Ability Hypothesis. The Ability Hypothesis implies that there is some knowledge that can only be acquired by having experiences of a particular kind and that this knowledge is nothing but knowing-how. This of course does not exclude that there also is propositional knowledge that can be acquired by getting acquainted with kinds of experiences from the first person perspective. The proponent of the Ability Hypothesis only has to insist that, if there is such propositional knowledge, then it need not be acquired on that particular basis but is accessible in other ways as well.

4.4 Objections Against the Ability Hypothesis

It has been argued against Nemirow that the ability to imagine having an experience of a particular kind is neither necessary nor sufficient for knowing what it is like to have that kind of experience. To show that imaginative abilities are not necessary for knowing what it is like, Conee (1994) and Alter (1998) cite the example of a person who has no capacity to imagine having color experiences. They claim that despite this defect she would know what it is like to have an experience of e.g. green while attentively staring at something that looks green to her. To show that imaginative abilities are not sufficient for knowing what it is like Conee introduces the following example: A person, Martha, “who is highly skilled at visualizing an intermediate shade that she has not experienced between pairs of shades that she has experienced…happens not to have any familiarity with the shade known as cherry red.” Martha is told that cherry red is midway between burgundy red and fire red (she has experienced the latter two shades of red). Given this information and her extraordinary capacity, Martha has the ability to imagine cherry red, but as long as she does not exercise this ability she does not know what it is like to see cherry red.

A similar example is used for the same purpose and discussed in more detail by Raymont 1999. Raymont argues that mnemic, recognitional and imaginative abilities neither separately nor conjointly amount to knowing of what it is like to have a particular kind of experience. He first argues that none of these abilities is necessary and sufficient for knowing what it is like: (a) Mnemic abilities are not necessary, since someone can learn what an experience is like when first having it without already remembering an experience of the relevant kind. (b) Imaginative abilities are not sufficient since someone can have the ability to imagine a particular kind of experience without exercising it (see the example cited above). (c) To show that recognitional abilities are not sufficient either, Raymont cites empirical data “in support of the view that one can have the ability to noninferentially recognize a certain type of visual experience without ever having had it, and thus without knowing what it is like to have it”. But then these three kinds of abilities cannot conjointly amount to knowing what it is like either: if they did, then – contrary to (a) – each of them would have to be a necessary condition for knowing what it is like.

A different argument against appeals to imagination is offered by Amy Kind (2019). She argues that Mary could while in the room already imagine seeing red, so we cannot explain her learning anything when she leaves the room by appealing to her acquiring a new ability to imagine. Kind also discusses reformulations of the Ability Hypothesis, e.g., in terms of Mary acquiring the ability to imagine correctly, and argues that these also face objections (for discussion see O’Conaill 2020).

Gertler (1999) argues that the best candidate for an analysis in the spirit of the Ability Hypothesis is to identify knowing what it is like to have an experience of red with the ability to recognize seeing-red experiences by their phenomenal quality and then goes on to attack this candidate: she points out that the ability to recognize seeing-red experiences by their phenomenal quality can be explained by the fact that I know what it is like to see red but not vice versa.[3]

Michael Tye (2000) concedes that none of the abilities considered by Lewis is necessary for knowing what it is like and he discusses the following possible revision of the Ability Hypothesis: knowing what it is like to have an experience of red is the ability to apply an indexical concept to an experience of red (while having it) via introspection. But, he goes on to argue, this revised version can again be rejected by a counterexample that shows that the ability at issue is not sufficient for knowing what it is like: If Mary is distracted and does not attend to her experience when she first sees a red object, then she need not apply any concept to her experience at all. In this case, she still does not know what it is like to have red experiences although she has the ability to apply an indexical concept to her present experience (she has the ability, but, being distracted, she does not exercise it). Tye concedes that the revised version of the Ability Hypothesis could not, anyway, be used against the knowledge argument in the way that was originally intended. The reason is that the revised version is compatible with the view that Mary does acquire knowing-that if she is not distracted when first seeing something red: she learns that this is a red experience (where “this” refers introspectively to her present experience) and so acquires knowing-that. According to Tye to have indexical knowledge of this kind is sufficient but not necessary for knowing what it is like to have a red experience. After all, it is impossible to introspectively refer to a red experience without presently having that kind of experience, but Tye wishes to concede that a person can know what it is like to have a red experience while not presently having a red experience. This reasoning motivates his disjunctive account of knowing what it is like: “S knows what it is like to undergo experience E iff either S now has indexical knowledge-that with respect to E obtained via current introspection or S has the Lewis abilities with respect to E” (Tye 2000). Tye thus defends the physicalist view against the knowledge argument by a combination of the two strategies mentioned above: he applies the New Knowledge/Old Fact-strategy to the person who knows what it is like to have an experience in the sense of the first conjunct (the indexical thought at issue is made true by a physical fact) and he applies the No Propositional Knowledge-strategy to the case of someone who has knowing what it is like in the sense of the second disjunct.

Lycan (1996) argues against the Ability Hypothesis and for the view that Mary acquires new knowledge-that after release by claiming that “S knows what it is like to see blue” means something like “S knows that it is like Q to see blue” where Q names the phenomenal quality at issue. It has been objected by Tye (1995) that the use of the qualia name “Q” within a propositional attitude context creates the well-known problems: Replacing “Q” by another name “R” for the same quale may change the truth value of the belief ascription. A proponent of Lycan’s view could however respond along the following lines: In the case of qualia names within belief contexts it does not matter which name is used to refer to the quale at issue as long as the belief is meant in the sense of a phenomenal belief ascription. “S believes that it is like Q to see blue” means, on the phenomenal reading, that S has the relevant belief about Q under a phenomenal concept of Q. Under the assumption that it is impossible to have two different phenomenal concepts of one and the same quale, the objection is met: As long as two qualia names Q and R refer to the same quale, replacing Q by R in an ascription of phenomenal belief cannot change the truth value of the belief ascription.

As we have seen, proponents of the Ability Hypothesis assume that the know-how which Mary acquires is distinct from any propositional knowledge. This assumption can be challenged, based for example on the work of Jason Stanley and Timothy Williamson (2001). On this view, for a subject S to know how to do something (to F) is for S to know that there is a way w for S to F, and for S to know this under a practical mode of presentation (2001, 430). Stanley & Williamson themselves apply this thought to Lewis’s version of the Ability Hypothesis:

Knowing how to imagine red and knowing how to recognize red are both examples of knowledge-that. For example, x’s knowing how to imagine red amounts to knowing a proposition of the form ‘w is a way for x to imagine red’, entertained under a guise involving a practical mode of presentation of a way (2001, 442; see also McConnell 1994).

Yuri Cath suggests that this point can be accommodated by proponents of the Ability Hypothesis, provided they distinguish between Mary’s learning a new proposition and her coming to be in new state of propositional knowledge (2009, 142–143). Specifically, before her release Mary can know that w is a way for someone to imagine red, but only under a theoretical mode of presentation; after her release, she comes to know the same proposition under a practical mode of presentation. She thus comes to be in a new state of propositional knowledge, but without learning any new propositions.[4]

4.5 No Propositional Knowledge 2: The Acquaintance Hypothesis

Earl Conee (1994) proposes another variant of the No Propositional Knowledge-View. According to Conee acquaintance constitutes a third category of knowledge that is neither reducible to factual knowledge nor to knowing-how and he argues that Mary acquires after release only acquaintance knowledge. According to Conee knowing something by acquaintance “requires the person to be familiar with the known entity in the most direct way that it is possible for a person to be aware of that thing” (1994, 144). Since “experiencing a quality is the most direct way to apprehend a quality” (Conee 1994, 144), Mary gains acquaintance with color qualia only after release. According to the view proposed by Conee the physicalist can defend himself against the knowledge argument in the following way: (1) Qualia are physical properties of experiences (and experiences are physical processes). Let Q be such a property. (2) Mary can know all about Q and she can know that a given experience has Q before release, although – before release – she is not acquainted with Q. (3) After release Mary gets acquainted with Q, but she does not acquire any new item of propositional knowledge by getting acquainted with Q (in particular she already knew under what conditions normal perceivers have experiences with the property Q). More recently Michael Tye (2009, 131–137) defends the acquaintance hypothesis as the right answer to the knowledge argument thereby abandoning his original response (see below 4.7).

A friend of the knowledge argument might concede that a person is acquainted with Q only if she has or had an experience with property Q but she could insist that being acquainted with Q in that sense enables Mary to acquire a new item of propositional knowledge, e.g., knowing (in the relevant sense) that an experience has Q (see, e.g., Alter 2023, 80–83). Another kind of criticism of the Acquaintance Hypothesis is developed in Gertler (1999). She argues that the property dualist can explain why the most direct way to get familiar with a quale is by having an experience of the relevant kind while the physicalist does not have any explanation for this particular feature of qualia. Similarly, Robert Howell (2007, 146) argues that all other physicalist responses to the Knowledge Argument depend upon the Acquaintance Hypothesis, and that acquaintance is incompatible with objectivism (see Section 4.9 below).

It is interesting to see that one version of the New Knowledge/Old Fact View is very similar in spirit to the Acquaintance Hypothesis. Bigelow and Pargetter (1990) and Grzankowski and Tye (2019) argue that Mary’s progress after release consists in the fact that she now stands in a new acquaintance relation to color qualia, but their theory about the individuation of beliefs implies that she thereby acquires new factual knowledge. On this view, different beliefs can be distinguished appropriately only if one takes into consideration the way the subject is acquainted with the individuals and properties her belief is about (for instance, Bigelow and Pargetter distinguish between different “modes of acquaintance” in that context).[5]

4.6 The New Knowledge/Old Fact View

Several positive arguments for the view that Mary’s new knowledge after release constitutes propositional knowledge (genuine information) have been formulated in the literature. Lycan argues, for example, that Mary’s new knowledge goes along with the elimination of epistemic possibilities and that her new abilities are best explained by her having new information (for further arguments see Lycan 1996, 92). Loar (1990/1997) points out that the embedded occurrence of “feels like such and such” in sentences like “if pains feel like such and such then Q” cannot be accounted for in a model that treats knowing what it is like as mere know-how. McConnell (1994) defends the more radical view that the acquisition of knowing-how is normally accompanied by the acquisition of a particular new item of knowing-that.

Many philosophers find it hard to deny that Mary gains new factual knowledge after release and for that reason (if they are physicalists) feel attracted by the New Knowledge/Old Fact View. Positions that clearly fall into that category are defended in Horgan 1984; Churchland 1985; Tye 1986, 1995; Bigelow and Pargetter 1990; Loar 1990/1997; Lycan 1990a, 1996; Pereboom 1994; Perry 2001; Byrne 2002; Papineau 2002, 2007; Van Gulick 2004; Levin 2007; Balog 2012a, 2012b.

The basic ideas common to the New Knowledge/Old Fact View may be summarized as follows:

Phenomenal character, e.g. phenomenal blueness, is a physical property of experiences (but see Lycan 1990a for an exception who construes qualia as properties of external objects).
To gain knowledge of what it is like to have an experience of a particular phenomenal character requires the acquisition of phenomenal concepts of phenomenal character.[6]
What it is for an organism to acquire and possess a phenomenal concept can be fully described in broadly physical terms.
A subject can acquire and possess phenomenal concepts only if it has or has had experiences of the relevant phenomenal kind.
After release Mary gains knowledge about phenomenal characters under phenomenal concepts.

But the facts that make these new items of knowledge true are physical facts that Mary knew before release under another conceptualization.

The differences between variants of the New Knowledge/Old Fact View concern the theoretical (physicalist) account of (a) phenomenal character, (b) phenomenal concepts of phenomenal characters and (c) the relation between phenomenal characters and the corresponding phenomenal concepts. All proponents of the view point out that, according to their proposal, physical concepts and phenomenal concepts are cognitively independent: it is impossible to see a priori that something that falls under a physical concept of a particular phenomenal character also falls under the corresponding phenomenal concept of that phenomenal character. This is why it is possible to have (like Mary) complete physical knowledge about e.g. phenomenal blueness (you know everything there is to know about phenomenal blueness under its physical conceptualization) without having a phenomenal concept of blueness and without knowing any of these facts under a phenomenal concept of blueness. Some have argued that the phenomenal conceptualization is not expressible in language (see Byrne 2002 and Hellie 2004).

In general, if a philosopher A claims that the argument of philosopher B does not go through, it is a point in favor of his view if he can provide an error theory, that is if he can explain why the argument may appear correct in the first place. The New Knowledge/Old Fact View can claim to have an error theory with respect to the knowledge argument. Given the cognitive independence of physical and phenomenal concepts of blueness it appears as if we could imagine a situation where everything Mary knew before release were fulfilled but not what she came to know after release (and this can be taken to imply that she does come to know new facts). But, according to the New Knowledge/Old Fact View this is an illusion. There is no such possible situation. What Mary learns after release is made true by a physical fact that she already knew before her release. Some versions of the New Knowledge/Old Fact-View will be briefly described in what follows.

4.7 Variants of the New Knowledge/Old Fact View

Horgan (1984) does not provide a developed theoretical account of phenomenal concepts but is one of the first to formulate the basic intuition shared by most or all proponents of the New Knowledge/Old Fact View: By having experiences of blue, Mary gets acquainted with phenomenal blueness (which is in fact a physical property of experiences) “from the experiential perspective,” she gains what he calls “the first person ostensive perspective on that property” (Horgan 1984, 151): she now can refer to phenomenal blueness by thinking or saying “that kind of property” while having, remembering or imagining a blue experience and while attending to its particular quality. She thus has acquired a new concept of phenomenal blueness. Using this new concept she can form new beliefs (and acquire new knowledge) about phenomenal blueness. Formulated in this way, the view may appear similar to Conee’s acquaintance account. According to both views, Mary’s progress consists primarily in getting acquainted with phenomenal blueness from an inner perspective. But contrary to Conee’s thesis, according to the New Knowledge/Old Fact View, acquaintance with phenomenal blueness from an experiential perspective enables the subject to form a new concept of phenomenal blueness and thereby implies the capacity to acquire new beliefs.

An example of a more explicit theoretical account of phenomenal character, phenomenal content and their relation can be found in Tye (1995). He proposes a representationalist account of phenomenal character. For a state to have phenomenal character is to represent internal or external physical items in an ‘abstract’ and nonconceptual way that is “appropriately poised for use by the cognitive system” (see Tye 1995, 137–144). According to Tye, there are two kinds of phenomenal concepts: indexical concepts (an example is the concept applied when thinking of a particular shade of red as “this particular hue” while having a red experience) and what he calls “predicative phenomenal concepts” that are based on the capacity to make certain discriminations. Tye wishes to accommodate the natural intuition that Mary before release cannot fully understand the nature of phenomenal blueness (she doesn’t really know what it is to have a blue experience). One might think that his view is incompatible with the intuition at issue. Phenomenal blueness, according to his view, has a physical nature and one might expect that physical natures are fully describable in physical terms and fully understandable under a physical conceptualization. But Tye has a surprising response: although phenomenal blueness has a physical nature, a person cannot fully understand its nature unless she thinks of phenomenal blueness under a phenomenal concept.

Another representationalist view about phenomenal character is combined with the New Knowledge/Old Fact View in Lycan (1990a) and (1996). Lycan’s account of Mary’s epistemic progress can be put, roughly, like this: Only after release Mary can form “introspective second order representations” of her own color experiences. One may think of an introspective representation as of “a token in one of the subject’s languages of thought, his or her Introspectorese”. It has often been said that what Mary learns is in some sense “ineffable”, that it cannot be communicated in public language. Lycan is led to a similar conclusion within his computational theory. In his view, when Mary finally has an experience of blue she “tokens a semantically primitive mental word for the type of first-order state being inwardly sensed”, where this word in Mary’s language of thought has an “inferential and/or conceptual role” that is “unique to its subject, in that no other subject could deploy a functionally similar representation whose designatum was that (the subject’s) very same first-order state-token, ….” And he concludes that “the introspective word would certainly not be synonymous with any primitive or composite expression of public English,…” (Lycan 1996, 101).

Papineau (1996) distinguishes third person and first person thoughts about experiences. First person thoughts involve the imagination of an experience of the relevant kind. The basic idea may be put like this: When Mary is finally released and after some time sufficiently acquainted with color experiences she can ‘reproduce’ blue experiences in her imagination. These imaginations of experiences of a particular kind can be used to refer to experiences of the kind at issue and to think about them. Obviously, Mary could not have first person thoughts about color experiences (she could not use imagined blue experiences in order to refer and to think about blue experiences) before she ever had blue experiences. After release, Mary can acquire new beliefs: first person beliefs about blue experiences. But for every such new first person belief about a given kind of experience, there will be one of her old third person beliefs which refers to the same kind of experience and has the same factual content.

Another way to understand phenomenal concepts is as a species of indexical concepts. For instance, Perry (2001) argues that Mary’s new knowledge after release does not pose a problem to physicalism any more than indexical thoughts like “I am a philosopher” or “today is Sunday” (for a defense of this claim see also McMullen 1985). Perry treats Mary’s new knowledge as a particular case of demonstrative belief (and he proposes an account of Mary’s new beliefs after release in terms of his theory of token-reflexive thoughts). After release, when seeing the sky, Mary may think “Oh, so having blue experiences is like this” where “this” refers to a physical property (the phenomenal character) of her present color experience. She could not have had a demonstrative belief of this kind before release. But, again, the fact that makes the thought true is simply the fact that blue experiences have the particular physical property at issue. Therefore, she does not learn any new fact.

Doubts about Perry’s proposal have been raised along the following lines. In normal cases of demonstrative reference the demonstrated object is in some way given to the epistemic subject (when pointing to a table and referring to it by “this table”, the object may be given as “the next table left to me”). But what is the way the kind of experience is given to Mary when she thinks of phenomenal blueness under the demonstrative concept “this kind of experience?” It cannot be the way it feels to have an experience with that property, since this solution, so one may argue, introduces phenomenal characters of phenomenal characters and thus reintroduces the original problem. Maybe “the kind of experience I am now having” is the appropriate candidate. But there are problems with this proposal too (see Chalmers 2002). There are also problems with suggesting that the demonstrative concept is ‘thin’, in the sense that it has no reference-fixing mode of presentation associated with it (for some of these problems see Demircioglu 2013, 263–269).

Robert Stalnaker (2008) raises further doubts regarding Perry’s treatment of Mary’s new knowledge. Drawing on a distinction between the two stages of Mary’s epistemic progress (see Section 3.3 above), he argues that the cases of acquiring demonstrative beliefs which Perry compares with Mary’s new knowledge are akin to the second stage of Mary’s progress, but “It is at stage one that the problematic cognitive achievement – the learning ‘what it is like’ to see red – takes place” (2008, 44).

Stalnaker suggests an alternative way in which Mary’s new knowledge is demonstrative in character. On this proposal, what Mary acquires is essentially contextual information, where “the content of what is expressed or believed in a context is not detachable from the context in which it is expressed or believed” (2008, 81). As an example of such information, Stalnaker describes a bomb disposal expert pointing at the ground and saying “A bomb is buried there, and unless we defuse it now it will explode within five minutes” (2008, 85). This information, Stalnaker suggests, cannot be known by someone who was not in that situation at that time, even if they know the exact co-ordinates of where the bomb is located and when it will detonate. Daniel Stoljar (2011) argues that phenomenal knowledge is not essentially contextual. In defence of this claim, he suggests there is an important dis-analogy between the difference between Mary, pre- and post-release, and the difference between the bomb disposal expert and anyone who was not with her when she made her utterance. The thought which the bomb disposal expert expressed in her utterance could not even be entertained by someone who was not present at that time; it is for this reason that someone not there could not know what the expert knew. In contrast, Stoljar suggests that “the fact that post-release Mary learnt could have been entertained by pre-release Mary (e.g., she can wonder whether it obtains)” (2011, 441). This suggests that what Mary learns upon release is not essentially contextual, at least not in the sense which Stalnaker has in mind.

Another worry about demonstrative accounts is that they do not seem to do duty to the way in which the subjective character itself is present to the mind of the thinker when employing a phenomenal concept of that character. This worry is sometimes put in terms of acquaintance: the specific way in which the thinker is acquainted with the referent of her thought in using phenomenal concepts does not seem to be captured by the demonstrative account (see Levine 2007; Howell 2007, 164–166). Several attempts have been made to answer objections of this kind. Papineau (2002) and Balog (2012a) argue that the cognitive intimacy to be accounted for is well explained by a quotational theory of phenomenal concepts: in thoughts involving phenomenal concepts token experiences are used in order to refer to the kind those tokens belong to. Levine (2007) argues that even these refined theories do not account for the specific intimate way in which the thinker is related to the referents of phenomenal concepts. Contrary to this Levin (2007) does not see any need to ‘embellish’ the original simple demonstrative account. While Balog’s current position is an elaborated version of the quotational account, Papineau has abandoned the quotational theory and argues in Papineau (2007) that phenomenal concepts are special cases of perceptual concepts where perceptual concepts do not involve demonstration.

An influential view about phenomenal concepts which answers the knowledge argument admitting that Mary gains new knowledge but no knowledge of new facts is developed in Loar (1990/1997): Phenomenal concepts are recognitional concepts. To have the phenomenal concept of blueness is to be able to recognize experiences of blueness while having them. The recognitional concept of blueness refers directly to its referent (the physical property of blueness) where this means (in Loar’s terminology): there is no other property (no property of that property) involved in the reference fixing. According to Loar’s view the recognitional concept of phenomenal blueness refers to the physical property phenomenal blueness in virtue of being ‘triggered’ by that property. It has been doubted that ‘directness’ in Loar’s sense provides an account for what one might call acquaintance: for the way in which the phenomenal character is present to the mind when a thinker employs phenomenal concepts (see Levine 2007). White (2007) argues against Loar that the account cannot explain the a posteriori character of mind-brain identity statements in a satisfying manner.

4.8. Objections Against the New Knowledge/Old Fact View

An objection to the New Knowledge/Old Fact View can be made as follows. In standard cases, if a subject does not know a given fact in one way that it does know in some other way, this can be explained by two modes of presentation: the subject knows the fact under one mode of presentation and does not know it under some other mode of presentation. So, for example, a person may know the fact that Venus is a planet under the mode of presentation associated with “the morning star is a planet” and fail to know the very same fact under the mode of presentation associated with “the evening star is a planet.” In this particular case, as in many others, the difference in the mode of presentation involves two different properties that are used to fix the referent. In one mode of presentation Venus is given as the heavenly body visible late in the morning (or some similar property), whereas in the other mode of presentation the object is given as the heavenly body visible early in the evening.

If the New Knowledge/Old Fact View involves two modes of presentation of this sort, then it cannot be used to defend physicalism because this kind of explanation of the supposed double epistemic access to facts concerning phenomenal types would reintroduce non-physical properties at a higher level: the subject would have to be described as referring to the phenomenal type at issue by some physical property in case it believes the relevant fact under its physical mode of presentation and as referring to that phenomenal type by some non-physical property in case it believes the relevant fact under its phenomenal mode of presentation.

It has been argued by several authors that the different modes of presentation at issue in the case of beliefs about phenomenal states do involve the introduction of different reference-fixing properties and that therefore the proposal is unsuccessful. Arguments of that kind are found in Lockwood (1989, chap. 8) and McConnell (1994). White (2007) develops the objection in detail. Block (2007) gives a detailed answer to White (2007) based on a distinction between what he labels cognitive and metaphysical modes of presentation. Chalmers (1996, 2002, 2010b) makes a similar point as White (2007) using his framework of primary and secondary intensions. In that framework, primary intensions describe the way a concept picks out its referent in the actual world and the cognitive independence of phenomenal and physical concepts is explained by their different primary intensions. If one singular fact can be known under a physical mode of presentation as well as under a phenomenal mode of presentation, then the two items of knowledge involve two concepts (a phenomenal and a physical concept) with different primary intensions and these different primary intensions correspond to different properties.

A two-dimensional framework is used in a different manner in Nida-Rümelin (2007) to develop the idea that the nature of phenomenal properties is present to the mind of the thinker when using phenomenal properties – an idea which leads to the result that the New Knowledge/Old Fact View is mistaken. This idea is also suggested by Philip Goff (2017). He suggests that the knowledge argument does not by itself refute physicalism because it does not overcome the New Knowledge/Old Fact View. However, things are different if the phenomenal concept which Mary acquires is transparent (i.e., it reveals the nature or essence of the phenomenal property which satisfies it):

in this case Mary’s new knowledge is knowledge of the nature of red experiences, but if pure physicalism is true, she already knew the complete nature of red experiences in knowing the pure physical truths, and hence there ought to be nothing more she can learn about their nature (2017, 74–75; see also Fürst 2011, 69–70; Demircioglu 2013, 274–275).

A general argument against the materialist strategy of appealing to phenomenal concepts is developed in Chalmers (2004; 2007); for critical discussion see Balog 2012b; Alter 2023, 144–148.

Anyone who wishes to argue in the way just mentioned, that the two modes of presentation do involve the introduction of two different reference-fixing properties, must deal with Loar’s proposal (see 4.7). Loar avoids the problem of two reference fixing properties by his claim that phenomenal concepts refer directly to their referent. It has been argued against Loar that his causal account of how phenomenal concepts manage to directly refer to their referent (namely by being triggered by them) cannot appropriately describe the particular cognitive role of phenomenal concepts (see McConnell 1994 and White 2007).

A final issue concerning both the New Knowledge/Old Facts View and the knowledge argument itself is whether there are any phenomenal concepts. Derek Ball (2009) and Michael Tye (2009) argue that there are no such concepts, at least as defined above: in particular, both deny claim (4) outlined in Section 4.6, that a subject can possess phenomenal concepts only if it has or has had experiences of the relevant kind. Ball and Tye appeal to work on social externalism regarding the content of our concepts to argue that even prior to her release, Mary possesses the same concepts which she uses to think about her experiences after her release. Specifically, she possesses such concepts ‘deferentially’, in virtue of interacting with her linguistic community; a crucial part of social externalism about content is that one can possess concepts deferentially even though one is largely ignorant of the nature of what satisfies these concepts (Ball 2009, 947–954; Tye 2009, 63–70).[7] This result threatens to undermine the New Knowledge / Old Facts View, but Ball suggests it also undermines the knowledge argument itself, since the knowledge argument itself depends on there being phenomenal concepts (2009, 940–943).

Torin Alter (2013) responds to these arguments by focusing on the distinction between deferential and non-deferential concept possession (the latter is conceptual mastery). He suggests that it is mastery of phenomenal concepts rather than mere deferential possession which matters for the knowledge argument: “Mary makes epistemic progress when she leaves the room because she comes to master or non-deferentially possess phenomenal colour concepts” (2013, 486). And defenders of the knowledge argument can claim that mastery of a phenomenal concept requires actually having experiences with the relevant phenomenal character. For further discussion of conceptual mastery see Ball 2013; Alter 2019; Rabin 2019; for different responses to Ball and Tye’s arguments see Veillet 2012; Byrne 2021.

4.9 The Knowledge Argument and Objectivism

The Knowledge Argument has traditionally been understood as an argument against physicalism or perhaps against reductive versions of physicalism. But an influential alternative approach sees the argument as working not against physicalism per se, but against a different position which can be termed objectivism.[8] Objectivism is the view that an objective description of what exists can be complete; that there are no aspects of reality which can only be understood by having experiences of a specific type. This notion is closely related to Nagel’s characterization of the physical nature of organisms as “a domain of objective facts par excellence – the kind that can be observed and understood from many points of view and by individuals with differing perceptual systems” (1974, 442). On this view, the point of Jackson’s thought experiment is to bring out that Mary learns something which can only be known by having an experience of a certain kind (e.g., a perceptual experience). If this is correct, then this shows that no objective description of what exist can be complete. As Howell formulates it, the argument understood in this way runs as follows:

before leaving the room, Mary knew all the objective information about the world. When she left the room, she gained further understanding about the world. Therefore, all the objective information about the world is insufficient for a complete understanding of the world (2007, 147).

A number of proponents of this interpretation of the Knowledge Argument suggest that it is compatible with a specific form of physicalism, on which all facts are physical or metaphysically necessitated by microphysical facts but some facts can only be understood by having specific experiences (see, e.g., Kallestrup 2006; Howell 2007; for slightly different formulations see Crane 2003; Zhao 2012). That said, it is worth asking how the ‘physical’ is to be understood, such that facts which can only be known if one has certain experiences can count as physical (see also 4.2). Coleman (2022) addresses this problem by distinguishing between two senses of ‘objective’. In the first sense, an objective understanding of a property requires that it can in principle be understood by any subject with sufficient cognitive and sensory apparatus (this is very similar to Nagel’s characterisation of objective facts cited above). In the second sense, an objective understanding of a property requires that it can in principle be understood without the need for having any specific kind of experience. Coleman argues (appealing to Jackson’s other thought experiment, that of Fred – see Section 2 that these two senses of ‘objective’ can come apart, and that the first sense is all that is required to connect physicalism with objectivism in a way which blocks the Knowledge Argument.

It is also worth questioning whether a view on which facts are either physical or metaphysically necessitated by microphysical facts thereby counts as a form of physicalism. It has been argued that such a view is compatible with non-physicalist positions such as emergentism or certain forms of ethical non-naturalism (see Horgan 1993, 559-566; 2010, 311–314; Crane 2010; for discussion see Stoljar 2017, section 9).

5. The Dualist View About the Knowledge Argument

There has not been much discussion of the knowledge argument from a dualist perspective. This is unsurprising given the small number of contemporary philosophers who defend a dualist position (for a prominent exception see Chalmers (1996); the knowledge argument is discussed on pp. 140–146). There are two possible strategies for a dualist to take who wishes to defend the knowledge argument. The first is merely defensive or ‘destructive’ in that it tries to refute the positive theoretical proposals one by one that have been used by physicalists in their objections against the knowledge argument. The second is more ‘constructive’ in that it aims at developing an alternative positive dualist account of phenomenal concepts, phenomenal properties and their relations such that on that account Mary does learn new and nonphysical facts upon release. Examples (or partial examples) for the first strategy may occasionally be found in the literature (compare Warner 1986, Gertler 1999, Raymont 1995, 1999 and Connell 1994). Examples for the second are hard to find, but Chalmers (1996, 2002) and Nida-Rümelin (2007) exemplify the second strategy. Using his framework of primary and secondary intensions he develops a positive account of what he calls “pure phenomenal concepts” that can be described as incorporating the old and natural intuition that in the case of qualia (phenomenal characters) there is no distinction between appearance and reality, in other words: qualia ‘reveal their nature’ in experience.

The intuitive idea just mentioned has been expressed in different ways. Some say that qualia ‘have no hidden sides’. Others say that qualia are not natural kind terms in that it is not up to the sciences to tell us what having an experience of a particular kind amounts to (we know what it amounts to by having them and attending to the quality at issue). It is quite clear that an account of this intuitive idea has to be one of the ingredients of a dualist defense of the knowledge argument. Nida-Rümelin (2007) develops a technical notion of grasping properties which is intended to serve the purposes of dualists who argue against materialism using the assumption that in the special case of phenomenal concepts the relation that the thinker bears to the property he conceptualizes is more intimate than in other cases: the thinker understands what having the property essentially consists in. This idea can be used to block familiar objections to the knowledge argument in particular those falling into the Old fact/ New Knowledge category. A similar basic idea but formulated within a different theoretical framework is elaborated in Stephen White (2007).

According to mainstream opinion the most serious problem for property dualism is the danger of being driven into epiphenomenalism. If phenomenal characters are non-physical properties and if every physical event has a physical cause and if we exclude the possibility of overdetermination (where something is caused by two different causes that are both sufficient), then, arguably, whether or not a state has a particular phenomenal character cannot have any causal relevance. But if qualia are causally impotent, how can a person know that she has an experience with a particular phenomenal character? Many take it to be obvious that a person cannot know that she now has a blue experience unless her blue experience plays a prominent causal role in the formation of her belief at issue. This particular problem has been formulated as an objection against the knowledge argument in Watkins (1989). Until some time ago Jackson was one of the very few philosophers who embraced epiphenomenalism. But Jackson changed his mind. Jackson (1995) argues that knowledge about qualia is impossible if qualia are epiphenomenal and he concludes that something must be wrong with the knowledge argument. In Jackson (2003) and Jackson (2007) he argues that the argument goes wrong in presupposing a false view about sensory experience and that it can be answered by endorsing strong representationalism: the view that to be in a phenomenal state is to represent objective properties where the properties represented as well as the representing itself can be given a physicalist account. Jackson admits that there is a specific phenomenal way of representing but he now insists that the phenomenal way of representing can be accounted for in physicalist terms. Doubts about the latter claim are developed in Alter (2007). Other possible reactions to the threat of epiphenomenalism for dualism would be either to doubt that a property dualist must embrace epiphenomenalism or to develop an account of knowledge about one’s own phenomenal states that does not imply a causal relation between qualia and phenomenal knowledge about qualia (see Chalmers 2002).

6. Further Arguments

In addition to stimulating a wide range of responses, the Knowledge Argument has also served as an inspiration for a number of other arguments. Mørch (2019) offers a parallel argument against physicalism, the explanatory knowledge argument. She argues that phenomenal knowledge provides explanations of certain regularities (e.g., people will tend to avoid pain because of how it feels) which differ from any explanations which can be provided by physical knowledge. She argues that this difference between phenomenal and physical knowledge supports the view that phenomenal facts are distinct from physical facts.

Robert Howell (2019; 2023, 9–15) describes a thought experiment which resembles Jackson’s in a number of respects, in which a person tasked with discovering whether robots are capable of enjoying conscious experiences discovers (spoiler alert) that he himself is a robot. Howell teases out the various analogies and disanalogies between Jackson’s Knowledge argument and this knowledge argument about the self or subject of experiences. In particular, he suggests that each of these arguments is best understood as supporting a claim about the limits of objectivism (see Section 4.9: both subjects of experiences and the phenomenal character of experiences elude any objective description of reality.

A number of thinkers have explored parallels between the Knowledge Argument and arguments in meta-ethics. One way to do this is to lay out a challenge for meta-ethical naturalism, for instance by asking whether a person who knew all the natural facts could thereby know all the moral facts (Pelczar 2009; Yetter-Chappell & Yetter-Chappell 2013; Blaesi 2022). In response to this challenge, Yetter-Chappell & Yetter-Chappell outline a Moral Concepts Strategy on which moral and natural concepts are isolated from each other, even though moral properties just are natural properties (2013, 874–876). Pelczar offers an alternative response, explaining how a person can gain moral knowledge by entering into new relations with moral facts (see Section 4.5). Blaesi uses the challenge to naturalism to construct a parody of a widely-known argument for panpsychism, and argues that this meta-ethical parody threatens to reduce the argument for panpsychism to absurdity.

Finally, Saad (2016) has used variations of the Mary thought experiment to develop a parallel knowledge argument against certain kinds of dualism. Saad distinguishes between a number of different features of phenomenal states, including qualities (e.g., colours) and awareness of these qualities. He argues that even if Mary knew all the physical and qualitative truths (truths about qualities), she would not be able to work out all the truths about awareness (2016, 2370–2371). Therefore, a dualism which holds that physical facts and facts about qualities determine all other truths would be mistaken, in much the same way that the original knowledge argument is supposed to undermine physicalism.

7. Concluding Remark

The appropriate evaluation of the knowledge argument remains controversial. The acceptability of its second premise P2 (Mary lacks factual knowledge before release) and of the inferences from P1 (Mary has complete physical knowledge before release) to C1 (Mary knows all the physical facts) and from P2 to C2 (Mary does not know some facts before release) depend on quite technical and controversial issues about (a) the appropriate theory of property concepts and their relation to the properties they express and (b) the appropriate theory of belief content. It is therefore safe to predict that the discussion about the knowledge argument will not come to an end in the near future.


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