First published Fri Feb 7, 2003; substantive revision Tue Nov 9, 2021

In philosophy, “self-knowledge” standardly refers to knowledge of one’s own mental states—that is, of what one is feeling or thinking, or what one believes or desires. At least since Descartes, most philosophers have believed that self-knowledge differs markedly from our knowledge of the external world (where this includes our knowledge of others’ mental states). But there is little agreement about what precisely distinguishes self-knowledge from knowledge in other realms. Partly because of this disagreement, philosophers have endorsed competing accounts of how we achieve self-knowledge and of its epistemic status. These accounts have important consequences for a broad range of issues in epistemology, the philosophy of mind, and moral psychology.

This entry focuses on knowledge of one’s own mental states. A separate topic sometimes referred to as “self-knowledge” is knowledge about a persisting self. This topic is addressed in a supplement: Knowledge of the Self.

1. The Distinctiveness of Self-Knowledge

What is special about self-knowledge, compared to knowledge in other domains? Self-knowledge is thought to differ from other sorts of knowledge in one or more of the following ways.

  1. Self-knowledge is especially secure, epistemically.
  2. Self-knowledge is (sometimes) acquired by use of an exclusively first-personal method.
  3. Our capacity for self-knowledge reflects our cognitive agency.
  4. One’s pronouncements about one’s own mental states carry a special authority or presumption of truth.

The differences between these are subtle. Statement (1) identifies the distinctive feature of self-knowledge as the epistemic status of a certain class of beliefs, whereas statement (2) identifies it by the method one uses in forming these beliefs. Statement (3) emphasizes the subject’s agency, typically in relation to attitudes like beliefs and intentions, which are sensitive to reasons. Statement (4) focuses on the way that self-ascriptions of mental states, such as saying “I’m in pain”, are treated by others. Statements (1) and (2) are ways of cashing out the notion that we enjoy “privileged access” to our own mental states. Only these first two statements construe the distinctive feature of self-knowledge as plainly epistemic; however, most who endorse (3) also claim that this agential relation grounds a special epistemic relation. A minority of philosophers denies that self-knowledge is special at all (see Section 2).

1.1 Epistemic security

The strongest epistemic claims on behalf of self-knowledge are infallibility and omniscience. One is infallible about one’s own mental states if and only if (hereafter, “iff”) one cannot have a false belief to the effect that one is in a certain mental state. One is omniscient about one’s own states iff being in a mental state suffices for knowing that one is in that state. (This omniscience thesis is sometimes expressed by saying that mental states are self-intimating or self-presenting.) Few if any contemporary philosophers maintain that we are infallible or omniscient about all of our mental states. Here is a simple example that challenges both infallibility and omniscience. Kate trusts her therapist’s insights into her own psychology, and so she believes him when he tells her that she distrusts her mother. But the therapist is mistaken—in fact, Kate trusts her mother. Hence, Kate’s self-ascription I distrust my mother shows that she is fallible about her own attitudes (mistakenly taking herself to distrust her mother) and that she is not omniscient (she fails to recognize that she trusts her mother).

In the case described, Kate’s belief about her attitude is based on the testimony of another person. A more restricted infallibility thesis would limit the relevant domain to self-ascriptions based on an exclusively first-personal method—perhaps introspection. Descartes thought that we could in principle achieve infallibility in this circumscribed realm, but only by exercising meticulous care:

There remains sensations, emotions and appetites. These may be clearly perceived provided we take great care in our judgments concerning them to include no more than what is strictly contained in our perception—no more than that of which we have inner awareness. But this is a very difficult rule to observe, at least with regard to sensations. (Descartes 1644/1984: I.66, p. 216)

A common objection to even restricted infallibility claims is the idea, often attributed to Wittgenstein, that where one cannot be wrong, one cannot be right either. For instance, Wright maintains that the possibility of error is required for concept application, which is in turn required for substantial self-knowledge.“[E]rror—if only second-order error—has to be possible, if a genuine exercise of concepts is involved” (Wright 1989: 634).

In its unqualified form, the omniscience thesis seems even less plausible than the unqualified infallibility thesis.[1] On pain of regress, omniscience seems to require that self-knowledge is not always a matter of grasping one mental state by being in another: that is, it seems to require that some mental states comprehend themselves (so to speak). James rejected this idea.

No subjective state, whilst present, is its own object; its object is always something else. (James 1884: 2)

Some modify the omniscience thesis by claiming that, for some states, anyone who is in a state of that kind is justified in believing that she is, even if the thinker doesn’t actually have this belief (Peacocke 1999; Siewert 1998; Silins 2012; Smithies 2012). Horgan and Kriegel (2007) defend a modified omniscience thesis, based on the idea that sensations are by definition conscious.

Others argue that we are infallible or omniscient about our beliefs and other attitudes because there is a constitutive connection between the first-order attitude and the belief that one has that attitude (see 3.6 and 3.7). This connection varies. On some views, so long as we are rational and have the relevant concepts, believing that p constitutes a belief that one believes that p (Shoemaker 1994). Others reverse the constitution relation: taking oneself to believe that p can constitute believing that p (Coliva 2012a, Bauman 2017).

Claims of infallibility and omniscience concern general relations between beliefs about mental states and those mental states themselves. The most famous philosophical argument involving self-knowledge, Descartes’ cogito argument (Descartes 1641/1895), does not concern these general relations. Instead, it concerns the certainty of a particular instance of belief. Descartes aims to demonstrate that, so long as you are carefully attending to your own thoughts, you can know with certain that you’re thinking—and, hence, that you exist. This can be certain even if there is a supremely powerful evil genius who controls your thoughts and seeks to deceive you.

Perhaps the most widely accepted view along these lines is that self-knowledge, even if not absolutely certain, is more secure, epistemically, than other kinds of empirical knowledge—most obviously, perceptual knowledge. Some who take this line maintain that there is a causal gap between a perceptual state and its object, and this gap introduces sources of error that are absent in direct introspective apprehension of a sensation (Russell 1917; Chalmers 2003; Gertler 2012; Horgan 2012; Siewert 2012).

1.2 Special method

Most philosophers accept that there is some method of grasping one’s own mental states that is special in the sense that it is available exclusively to the subject. Traditionally, this special method was construed as a kind of “inward” gaze, directed at the mental state to be grasped.

The term “introspection”’—literally, “looking within”—captures a traditional way of conceiving how we grasp our own mental states. This term uses a spatial metaphor to express a divide between the “inner” world of thought and the “external” world. The term “introspection” is used in various ways in the self-knowledge literature. Perhaps the most common usage is that suggested by the term’s literal meaning: on this usage, introspection is inner observation—or “inwardly directed attention” (Goldman 2006: 246)—that, when successful, yields awareness of a mental state. The notion that inner observation is the special method by which we achieve self-knowledge is central to the acquaintance and inner sense accounts (see 3.1 and 3.2 below).

While the term “introspection” connotes a looking within, a view that has recently gained prominence envisions the method unique to self-knowledge as requiring precisely the opposite. On this view, we ascertain our own thoughts by looking outward, to the states of the world they represent. This is known as the transparency method, in that self-knowledge is achieved by “looking through” the (transparent) mental state, directly to the state of the world it represents. This view is associated with a famous passage from Evans.

[I]n making a self-ascription of belief, one’s eyes are, so to speak, or occasionally literally, directed outward—upon the world. If someone asks me “Do you think there is going to be a third world war?”, I must attend, in answering him, to precisely the same outward phenomena as I would attend to if I were answering the question “Will there be a third world war?” (Evans 1982: 225)

The idea that the special method by which we achieve self-knowledge involves transparency is central to empiricist transparency accounts (see 3.4) and to some agentialist accounts (see 3.7).

1.3 Agency

Many of our mental states, such as itches and tickles, are states we simply undergo. But some argue that others are active. “Our rational beliefs and intentions are not mere mental attitudes, but active states of normative commitment” (Korsgaard 2009: 39). This idea inspires the claim, central to many versions of agentialism, that the truly distinctive kind of self-knowledge is knowledge of these “active states of normative commitment” (see 3.7). Such self-knowledge is distinctive because believing and intending are things we do. According to these agentialists, this means that rational beliefs and intentions are not known simply through observation, which is the means by which we know other empirical phenomena (including sensations).

1.4 First-person authority

The views just described take the subject to be in a special epistemic position, vis-à-vis her own mental states. But a competing approach, sometimes attributed to Wittgenstein (Wright 1989), maintains that the special authority of self-ascriptions is primarily a matter of social-linguistic practices, which dictate that we should treat subjects as authoritative about their own states. On this view, one who responds to a self-ascription like “I believe that it’s raining” with “no, you don’t” (in ordinary circumstances) exhibits a misunderstanding of social-linguistic norms.

The first-person authority view diagnoses the authority granted to self-ascriptions as deriving from social norms rather than from the subject's privileged epistemic position. Strictly speaking, then, this position is not concerned with self-knowledge. However, some contemporary expressivist accounts (see 3.8) regard the phenomenon of first-person authority as centrally important to understanding self-knowledge.

2. Doubts about the distinctiveness of self-knowledge

2.1 General doubts

The idea that self-knowledge is not profoundly special was especially prevalent during the heyday of behaviorism. For instance, Ryle (1949) suggests that the difference between self-knowledge and other-knowledge is at most a matter of degree, and stems from the mundane fact that each of us is always present to observe our own behavior.

Doubts about self-knowledge are also fueled by more general epistemological concerns, such as doubts about the possibility of theory-free observations (Dennett 1991), and the familiar worry that the observational process unavoidably alters the target of observation (Hill 1991).[2] Others argue that while self-attributions may express self-knowledge, they are not epistemically superior to other kinds of beliefs.

I suspect … [that our] judgments about the world to a large extent drive our judgments about our experience. Properly so, since the former are the more secure. (Schwitzgebel 2008: 268)

In the same vein, some (including Stich 1983) deny that self-knowledge is special, relative to knowledge of others’ states, by claiming that ordinary (“folk”) concepts of psychological states are theoretical concepts. If psychological states are theoretical entities, both self-ascriptions and other-ascriptions will proceed by inference from observed data—presumably, behavior. (See the entry on folk psychology as a theory.)

Skepticism of a different kind stems from a puzzle raised by Boghossian (1989). On most accounts, attitudes such as desires and beliefs are individuated in part by their relations to other states and/or the environment.[3] For example, a desire for lemonade partly consists in being disposed to go to the refrigerator when one believes that there is lemonade there, and to feeling happy at the prospect of drinking lemonade. Believing there is lemonade in the refrigerator partly consists in being disposed to go to the refrigerator when one desires lemonade, and to feeling surprise if one finds the refrigerator empty. More generally, dispositional (or “standing”) beliefs and desires consist, partly or wholly, in dispositions to reason, behave, and affectively react in certain ways, relative to circumstances (see the entry on belief). Boghossian’s puzzle concerns how we could have privileged access to our relationally-individuated mental states. He considers three ways that self-knowledge could be achieved: (a) on the basis of inner observation, (b) on the basis of inference, or (c) on the basis of nothing. He argues that (a) would not allow for knowledge of relationally-individuated states, and that (b) and (c) do not provide for access that is truly privileged. The result is a trilemma regarding self-knowledge.

Philosophers have responded to Boghossian’s trilemma in a variety of ways. Some deny the assumption that recognizing a relationally-individuated state requires identifying the relational properties that make it the state that it is (Burge 1988; Heil 1988). Others argue that self-knowledge can be privileged even if it rests on inference (Dretske 1994; Byrne 2005; Lawlor 2009). And some maintain that we can know our attitudes through introspective observation, and that this weakens the case for relational construals of attitudes (Pitt 2004).

2.2 Doubts based on empirical results

Empirical work in psychology constitutes another source of doubt about the epistemic status of self-ascriptions. In a widely cited paper, Nisbett and Wilson (1977) present studies showing that subjects routinely misidentify the factors that influenced their reasoning processes. For instance, subjects in one study explained their preference for a product by its apparent quality, when in fact the products were all precisely alike: the subjects’ preferences were apparently driven by the product’s spatial position relative to its competitors seemed to drive the preferences.

The accuracy of subject reports is so poor as to suggest that any introspective access that may exist is not sufficient to produce generally correct or reliable reports. (1977: 33)

While these studies are instructive, Wilson acknowledges that their results are limited in that they apply only to the unconscious sources of decisions; they are silent as to our privileged access to our current states.

[T]o the extent that people’s responses are caused by the conscious self, they have privileged access to the actual causes of these responses; in short, the Nisbett and Wilson argument was wrong about such cases. (Wilson 2002: 106)

Schwitzgebel (2002) has marshalled other sorts of empirical evidence to show that introspective reports are unreliable. But he has also suggested that our attitudes about introspection may be particularly obstinate. This conclusion is borne out by his collaboration with a psychologist on a study of introspection using a method called Experience Sampling (Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel 2007). Strikingly, their careful analysis of the study’s results does not resolve their differences about the reliability of introspection: Hurlburt remains “optimistic” about introspection’s reliability while Schwitzgebel remains “a skeptic”).

This outcome suggests that not only careful empirical work, but also difficult conceptual work, is required for determining the scope and degree of introspection’s reliability—solving what Goldman aptly terms “the problem of calibration” (Goldman 2004: 14). Some targets of introspection, such as sensations, can be identified only through introspection itself: third-personal methods (for instance, identifying pain via a brain scan) depend on prior correlations between third-personal and introspective data. Goldman notes that, for this reason, we can fix the range of introspective reliability only by using introspection and evaluating its results for internal coherence and for consistency with other sources. But since there is no clear consensus as to how to evaluate the results of introspection, or how to weigh its results against other sources of evidence about mental states, the problem of calibration is especially thorny and complex as it relates to introspection. Spener (2015) proposes that we calibrate introspection by reference to abilities that we could not possess unless introspection were reliable (relative to certain circumstances, and about certain states). For example, our ability to focus binoculars on a distant object suggests that introspection is reliable in identifying when things look blurry.

3. Accounts of Self-Knowledge

Accounts of self-knowledge vary across a number of dimensions, including: how self-knowledge is achieved; the kind and degree of epistemic security that self-ascriptions possess; the nature of our (epistemic) privilege and (social-linguistic) authority relative to our mental states; and the role of our observational, rational, agential, and expressive powers in explaining first-person privilege and authority.

These accounts also differ as to their scope. Acquaintance theorists mainly aim to explain how we know what we’re currently thinking and feeling (our “occurrent” states). Reasons theorists and Agentialists are exclusively concerned with self-knowledge of those attitudes that represent our commitments, such as beliefs and intentions. Proponents of the Inner Sense, Self-Interpretation, Empiricist Transparency, Rationalist, and Expressivist accounts differ as to the scope of these accounts. Each of these is taken, by at least one of its proponents, to apply to all kinds of mental states. This variety means that hybrid views are possible. For instance, one might think that an Acquaintance account explains how we know our sensations while Agentialism best explains self-knowledge of beliefs.

In what follows, I proceed from broadly empiricist accounts, which take self-knowledge to be a form of empirical knowledge, to accounts that emphasize the role of a priori reasoning in self-knowledge, and finally to accounts that take the special features of self-knowledge to derive from our capacity for agency or self-expression.

3.1 Acquaintance Accounts

The idea that we know our mental states through acquaintance with them is usually associated with Russell (1917), but such accounts trace their lineage at least to Descartes (see the entry on knowledge by acquaintance vs. description). According to these accounts, our awareness of our mental states is sometimes peculiarly direct in both an epistemic sense and a metaphysical sense. It is epistemically direct in that I need not rely on awareness of something else in order to be aware of my mental state. It is metaphysically direct in that no event or process mediates between my awareness and the mental state itself. By contrast, my awareness of last night’s rain is epistemically indirect in that I achieve it only through being aware of something else (such as the wet pavement). This awareness is metaphysically indirect in that various factors, including the wet pavement and perhaps my visual experience thereof, mediate between my awareness of the rain and the rain itself.

Acquaintance accounts hold special appeal for epistemic foundationalists, who claim that all of our knowledge rests on a foundation of beliefs that are justified, but not justified by other beliefs.

The claim that introspective access is both epistemically and metaphysically direct is most plausible for sensations like pain. This is because how a sensation appears—how it seems to the subject—and how it actually is (its nature) are, according to many philosophers, one and the same. That is, “there is no appearance/reality distinction in the case of sensations” (Hill 1991: 127; compare Kripke 1980: 152–3).

Limiting acquaintance accounts to self-knowledge of sensations—or, more strictly, to self-knowledge of mental states individuated by phenomenology—does not entirely fix their scope, as philosophers disagree as to which kinds of mental states are individuated by phenomenology. Recently, the idea that thoughts have a distinctive phenomenology has received renewed attention (see the entry on consciousness and intentionality). Pitt (2004) uses the fact that we seem able to know what we’re thinking in a direct, highly secure way—one that is best explained by an acquaintance model of introspection—to argue that thoughts have distinctive phenomenological properties with which we are acquainted. Some philosophers also argue that conscious attitudes, such as judgments, have distinctive phenomenologies.

The purported epistemic and metaphysical directness of introspection does not imply that we are either infallible or omniscient about our own states, since it is an open question whether all of our states are introspectible. But if introspection involves epistemically and metaphysically direct access to one’s phenomenal states, then its proper use may allow the relevant self-attributions to achieve a high degree of certainty. And some philosophers have drawn on the concept of acquaintance to argue that at least some mental states, such as intense sensations, may be “luminous”: that is, that being in a state of that kind may ensure that one can know that one is (Weatherson 2004; Duncan 2018). These arguments are responses to Williamson’s (2000) “anti-luminosity” argument, which seeks to establish that no mental states are luminous.

The idea that we know (even some of) our sensations by acquaintance remains highly controversial. The idea that we know our beliefs or other attitudes by acquaintance is even more controversial. As James (1884) observed, self-knowledge requires more than even direct contact with a mental state: it requires that one properly conceptualize the state, classifying it as e.g. pain or coldness. The greatest challenge for acquaintance accounts is to explain how this conceptualization occurs. In particular, they must show that awareness of a mental state that is direct and immediate can also be an epistemically substantial grasp of the state as a state of a certain kind.

One approach to this challenge draws on the phenomenon of demonstrative reference (Gertler 2001; Chalmers 2003). Demonstrative reference often involves literal pointing: by pointing to my desk, I can demonstratively refer to it as “that (desk)”. When it comes to experiences, we don’t pick them out by pointing but, instead, by attending to them. As Sosa aptly observes, “Selective attention is the index finger of the mind” (2003: 279). By attending to how an experience feels (or appears), one can use this appearance—e.g., the itchiness of an itch—to refer to the feature demonstratively, as “this quality”. One can then register the presence of the itch by thinking “I’m now experiencing this quality” Since reference is secured by attending to the itchiness, one grasps the feature in question, as itchiness. Chalmers refers to this grasp of phenomenal features as a “direct phenomenal concept”.

The clearest cases of direct phenomenal concepts arise when a subject attends to the quality of an experience, and forms a concept wholly based on the attention to the quality, “taking up” the quality into the concept. (Chalmers 2003: 235)

One worry about acquaintance accounts stems from the observation that we sometimes err about our experiences. However, most acquaintance theorists will concede that we can be wrong about our own phenomenal states. The theory implies only that, under certain conditions, an experience’s phenomenal reality—the “quality” in Chalmers’ terms—constitutes how it appears to the thinker—the “concept” of that quality (see also Horgan and Kriegel 2007; Gertler 2012). When those conditions are met, we are aware of the experience in a way that could not occur in the absence of that experience, and so our self-ascription of the experience will be true.

Some critics charge that acquaintance accounts construe introspective beliefs as too close to their objects to qualify as genuine knowledge (Wittgenstein 1953; Stalnaker 2008). In effect, this objection denies that direct introspective attention to an instance of a phenomenal quality can provide an epistemically substantial grasp of that quality.

3.2 Inner Sense Accounts

While acquaintance accounts construe introspection as fundamentally different from perception in its epistemic and metaphysical directness, inner sense accounts take the opposite tack: they construe introspection as similar to perception in crucial respects.

Locke, an early inner sense theorist, described the introspective faculty as follows.

This Source of Ideas, every Man has wholly in himself … And though it be not Sense, as having nothing to do with external Objects; yet it is very like it, and might properly enough be call’d internal Sense. (Locke 1689/1975: II.1.iv.)

Inner sense accounts construe introspection as similar to perception in that it involves a monitoring mechanism or “self-scanning process” (Armstrong 1993: 324) that takes mental states as input and yields representations of those states as output. The monitoring mechanism involved in inner sense forms representations of the mental states it takes as input. This process is reliable, according to some inner sense accounts, because the mechanism “redeploys” the content of the input state in the representation of those states that is its output (Nichols and Stich 2003; Goldman 2006). On such accounts, and in contrast to acquaintance accounts, the connection between the introspected state (the input) and the introspective state (the output) is causal and contingent. But inner sense accounts allow that introspection also differs from perception in significant ways. Perception is achieved through dedicated organs such as eyes and ears, whereas there is no (literal) organ of introspection. Perception ordinarily involves sensory experiences, whereas “No one thinks that one is aware of beliefs and thoughts by having sensations or quasi-sense-experiences of them” (Shoemaker 1994: 255).

Because inner sense accounts construe introspection as a causal process, they are particularly well-suited to reliabilist (or, more broadly, epistemically externalist) approaches to self-knowledge. For example, Armstrong characterizes the introspective process as “a mere flow of information or beliefs” (Armstrong 1993: 326). The causal connections involved in self-monitoring need not be known by the subject in order to deliver self-knowledge, and inner sense accounts generally regard knowledge based in introspection as non-inferential. Inner sense is a first-personal method because the relevant scanners or monitoring mechanisms are directed only towards one’s own states. Strikingly, however, this asymmetry of access is merely contingent. It is possible, in principle, for one’s “inner sense” mechanism to be linked to someone else’s mental states, thereby allowing for “direct [read: non-inferential] awareness of the mental states of others”, through a kind of telepathic scanning (Armstrong 1993: 124).

Perhaps the chief benefit of inner sense accounts is that they are especially conducive to a broadly naturalistic picture of mentality. By assimilating introspection to perception, inner sense accounts construe mentality as epistemically continuous with the nonmental, and thus allow a single overarching epistemology to apply to both self-knowledge and knowledge of external things. Since most of the leading arguments for mind-body dualism depend on the claim that our epistemic relations to mental states diverge in crucial ways from our epistemic relations to physical objects, the claim that the mental is epistemically continuous with the nonmental paves the way for assimilating mentality to the nonmental realm ontologically as well.[4]

Shoemaker (1994) offers a sustained critique of inner sense accounts. His main objection centers on the charge that, in construing the capacity for self-knowledge as similar to sensory capacities like vision, inner sense accounts imply that the capacity for self-knowledge is one that a rational person might lack. As he puts this, they imply that a rational creature could be “self-blind”, unable to recognize its own mental states. But, he says, self-blindness is impossible in a rational creature (at least, one with ordinary mental states and who possesses mental state concepts). Shoemaker’s discussion has been as influential for its positive suggestion—that our capacity for self-knowledge is closely tied to rationality (see 3.6 and 3.7)—as for its critical treatment of inner sense accounts.

Kind (2003) contends that the possibility of self-blindness does not directly threaten inner sense accounts. Even if Shoemaker is right that rational creatures will generally be capable of self-awareness, this conclusion is silent as to how such awareness occurs. So it does not rule out the possibility that it is achieved through inner sense. Gertler (2011a: ch. 5) argues that the inner sense theorist can block Shoemaker’s objection by stipulating that no creature qualifies as rational if it is self-blind. “No rational creature is self-blind” would then be a de dicto truth and, as such, is compatible with the inner sense account. Shoemaker’s challenge to inner sense views requires a stronger thesis, namely that the capacity for self-knowledge is a de re necessary characteristic of rational beings: that is, rational beings must be capable of self-knowledge in order to exist at all.

Another objection to inner sense accounts targets their epistemic externalism. Inner sense accounts are not likely to appeal to those who take self-knowledge to involve internal or accessible reasons for belief (Peacocke 1999: 224).

3.3 Self-Interpretation Accounts

Some philosophers maintain that grasping our beliefs and desires—and perhaps also our emotions—requires engaging in a process of self-interpretation (Lawlor 2009; Carruthers 2011; Cassam 2015). Self-interpretation accounts are one response to a point mentioned earlier (sec. 2.1): that our attitudes are partly defined by their causal roles, including how they dispose us to reason, behave, and affectively react (see the entries on belief and desire). Whether a given state plays the relevant causal role seems not to be knowable simply by introspective observation. (This point echoes the first horn of Boghossian’s trilemma. See also Peterson 2019.) We can know this only by interpreting our current thoughts or feelings, explaining them as manifestations of a particular belief, desire, or other attitude. Since this interpretive process relies on inference, self-interpretation accounts are sometimes labelled “inferentialism”. But inferentialism is a broader category, encompassing some transparency accounts (sec. 3.4).

Lawlor uses the following example. A woman named Katherine finds herself thinking “have another” as she stands by her son’s crib. Hearing those words (in “inner speech”) does not, on its own, provide her with knowledge about whether she wants to have another child. She must interpret this thought: is it a genuine longing or just an idle daydream? The best interpretation is the one that best explains the introspected thought. Arriving at this explanation will often involve imaginative exercises: e.g., Katherine may imagine a newborn baby in her arms and, noticing that this leads her to feel happy, infer that she desires another child. Lawlor’s approach is supported by research suggesting that “people can detect their nonconscious dispositions and motives by vividly imagining a future situation and attending to how it would make them feel.” (Wilson and Dunn 2004, describing a study by Schultheiss and Brunstein (1999).)

Carruthers’ (2011) Interpretive-Sensory Access account similarly takes self-knowledge to require self-interpretation. Rejecting the idea that there is an “inner sense”, a cognitive faculty dedicated specifically to self-knowledge, Carruthers proposes that a single “mindreading” system detects both one’s own mental states and the mental states of others. In fact, he hypothesizes that our “mindreading” system “evolved for outward-looking social purposes” and was only later co-opted for self-knowledge (2011:69). This system takes sensory data as input; interprets these data by drawing on situational facts and background information; and yields representations of mental states as output.

Like the inner sense view, Carruthers’ account takes the output of these states to qualify as knowledge on epistemically externalist grounds--roughly, because of the system’s reliability. By contrast, Lawlor’s account is friendly to epistemic internalism. Self-interpretation is based on internal, accessible evidence including thoughts and feelings, as well as evidence from one’s own behavior.

The idea that we must engage in interpretation to know our own attitudes and emotions echoes Ryle’s (1949) view that our means of achieving self-knowledge is broadly similar to our means of knowing others’ states. In particular, self-interpretation theorists maintain that, just as we know others’ attitudes by inference from what they say, self-knowledge often involves inference from inner speech. (I’m indebted here to Byrne 2012a.) Ryle suggests that the experience of inner speech is a maximally effective type of “eavesdropping”.

We eavesdrop on our own voiced utterances and our own silent monologues. … [T]here is nothing intrinsically proprietary about this activity. I can pay heed to what I overhear you saying as well as to what I overhear myself saying, though I cannot overhear your silent colloquies with yourself. (Ryle 1949: 184)

Self-interpretation accounts do recognize differences between self-knowledge and other-knowledge. Most crucially, in our own case we have access to introspective evidence (about our experiences), whereas our only evidence for others’ states is their behavior, prominently including their verbal behavior.

Is our access to introspective evidence also inferential, in a way that threatens a regress? Self-interpretation theorists maintain that even understanding what you’re currently feeling will require self-interpretation. Cassam explains this using Lawlor’s example: “When you identify your feeling as the yearning for another child what you are doing is interpreting it” (Cassam 2015: 163). Cassam argues that this process is holistic, as you rely on knowledge of your recent mental life (e.g., recently feeling envy about others’ pregnancies) and perhaps your recent behavior (going out of your way to visit a friend with a newborn) to interpret your current feelings.

The self-interpretation view is compatible with the idea that we know some of our states non-inferentially. Carruthers argues that interpretation is not required for knowledge of any state that can be recognized solely on the basis of raw sensory data, since sensory data are the inputs to the mindreading system. Cassam is more circumspect about this possibility, pointing out that even knowledge of basic sensations like pains sometimes requires cognitive effort (2015: 164).

Critics of self-interpretation accounts contend that it neglects the profound asymmetry between self-knowledge and other-knowledge: that our rationality guarantees that we have non-inferential access to our own attitudes (Shoemaker 1994) or that the need to engage in self-interpretation implies that we are alienated from our attitudes (Moran 2001). These claims form the basis for some rationalist and agentialist views (see 3.6 and 3.7).

3.4 Empiricist Transparency Accounts

Transparency accounts are inspired by the idea discussed above in connection with Gareth Evans’ famous remark: that if asked whether you believe that there will be a third world war, you answer by directly considering the likelihood of a third world war. The metaphor of transparency expresses the notion that one “looks through” the (transparent) mental state to directly consider what it represents.

Some philosophers use the idea that mental states are “transparent” to advance rationalist or agentialist accounts of self-knowledge, which are non-empiricist (see 3.6 and 3.7). The current subsection concerns transparency accounts that see Evans’ procedure as generating empirical justification or warrant for self-ascriptions (Dretske 1994; Fernández 2003, 2013; Byrne 2005, 2018).

Dretske describes self-knowledge as “a form of perceptual knowledge that is obtained—indeed, can only be obtained—by awareness of non-mental objects” (Dretske 1994: 264). E.g., I can know that I’m thinking it’s snowing only by inference from my awareness of a non-mental object, such as the falling snow. This account secures first-person privilege, since my awareness of the snow would not similarly support an inference about anyone else’s mental state. The account requires that we rely on background beliefs to justify the inference from seeing snow to I’m thinking that it’s snowing. One worry about this account is that it’s not clear that the relevant background beliefs will be available or justified (Aydede 2003).

Fernández’s version of the transparency account avoids this worry by taking self-knowledge to be non-inferential. He argues that a single state can serve as the basis for both the belief that p and the belief that one believes that p. For example, seeing snow falling will ordinarily result in the belief that it’s snowing; this visual experience may also form the basis for the self-ascription I believe that it’s snowing. Fernández (2013) labels this “the bypass model”, to indicate that it takes self-attributions of belief to be based directly on the basis for the first-order belief, “bypassing” the first-order belief itself. The self-ascription is justified in a way that is “partly internalist” (ibid.: 44) in that I have access to the basis for my belief that I believe that it’s snowing, namely the fact that I (seem to) see falling snow. The account is also “partly externalist” (ibid): my self-ascription is warranted because my perceptual state that is its basis tends to correlate with the belief that it’s snowing.

The bypass method is exclusively first-personal, since only I can base a belief directly on my perceptual state. And it is more secure than others’ knowledge of my mental states. Others know my states only by inference—from my behavior, and/or their observations of the evidence available to me. But self-knowledge that satisfies the bypass model is non-inferential, since the self-ascription (e.g., the belief that I believe that it’s snowing) is not inferred from its basis (e.g., seeing falling snow).

By contrast, Byrne’s (2005, 2018) transparency account is explicitly inferentialist. He claims that we know our beliefs by reasoning according to the “doxastic schema” (Gallois 1996).

\[\frac{p}{\mbox{I believe that } p}\]

Byrne argues as follows. To reason in accord with the doxastic schema is to infer I believe that p from the premise p; one does not infer from a premise unless one believes the premise; so such reasoning will yield true self-ascriptions. The doxastic schema is thus self-verifying.[5] And it is self-verifying regardless of whether the premise is justified, or even whether the thinker regards it as justified.

Byrne’s main thesis, that self-knowledge is achieved through use of the doxastic schema, rests on two basic claims. The first claim is that it’s independently plausible that we actually use the doxastic schema (as Evans’ remarks suggest). The second claim is that the hypothesis that we use the doxastic schema best explains the special security and asymmetry of self-knowledge. On his proposal, the special epistemic security of self-knowledge is a matter of externalist warrant: the doxastic schema is not only self-verifying but also yields self-ascriptions that are “safe” in that they could not easily have been false.[6] The asymmetry of self-knowledge consists in the fact that following this schema will not yield knowledge of others’ states. Reasoning from it’s snowing to you/they believe that it’s snowing will not reliably yield true beliefs about others’ beliefs.

One objection to transparency accounts is that answering the question “Do you believe that p?” by directly considering whether p may not shed light on what one believed before the question arose (Shah and Velleman 2005). For example, to answer the question “Do you believe that there will be a third world war?” by considering geopolitical matters may produce a new belief rather than revealing a pre-existing belief. In general, reflection on accessible evidence about whether p may actually change a pre-existing belief on this issue (Wilson and Kraft 1993). The transparency theorist cannot avoid this worry by stipulating that, when considering whether p, one should not draw a new conclusion. Avoiding new conclusions would require already knowing one’s beliefs, that is, which conclusions one had already drawn.

Transparency theorists can respond by arguing that the objection misconstrues the aim of these accounts. The objection charges that the account may not explain first-person access: how it is that, if you believe that p, you can know that you do. Transparency accounts may be intended to address a different question, namely, what kind of exclusively first-personal method could deliver self-ascriptions that constitute knowledge. And even if considering geopolitical matters produced a new belief that a third world war is likely, the inference that Byrne describes—from a third world war is likely to I believe that a third world war is likely—would arguably yield self-knowledge. Still, the objection exposes a possible limitation of transparency accounts. Because they cannot distinguish newly-formed judgments from previous dispositional beliefs, they cannot account for our apparent ability to knowledgeably answer the question “Do you believe that p?”, where that question concerns what one believes at the time the question is posed (Gertler 2011b).

Another objection concerns these accounts’ presumption that self-knowledge need not meet epistemically internalist conditions on knowledge. Boyle (2011) targets Byrne’s view on this point, arguing that even if the inference from p to I believe that p reliably yields true (and safe) self-ascriptions, this inference cannot explain self-knowledge since it will not appear reasonable to the thinker: after all, in general the fact that p doesn’t imply that I believe that p. Fernández addresses this worry, in arguing that beliefs formed through the bypass method will seem reasonable to the subject. Other critics argue that the transition from p to I believe that p is not a genuine inference. Valaris (2011) argues that, unlike genuine inferences, this transition cannot be used in hypothetical contexts—e.g., when one reasons from a premise one doesn’t believe, to see what follows from it. Barnett (2016) argues that this transition violates plausible, broadly evidentialist restrictions on inferences.

Fernández limits his account to explaining self-knowledge of beliefs and desires, while Byrne extends his account to encompass self-knowledge of all of our mental states. Critics express skepticism about extending the transparency account beyond beliefs: to desires (Ashwell 2013a, 2013b), to thoughts or intentions (Samoilova 2016), or to beliefs held with less than 100% confidence (Tang 2017).

3.5 Reasons Accounts

Above, we saw that on standard views of beliefs and desires, these attitudes are at least partly constituted by dispositions to reason, behave, and affectively react. This is one basis for thinking that self-knowledge of attitudes must be inferential. After all, dispositions seem to be linked with counterfactual truths, and such truths can be known only through inference.

The reasons account of self-knowledge, first advanced by Peacocke (1999), says that we can sometimes know our beliefs without relying on inference. While beliefs are dispositional states, judgments are occurrent: a judgment that p is an event. Peacocke argues that judging it’s snowing (say) provides you with a reason to think that you have the dispositions associated with the belief that it’s snowing—e.g., to put on boots when leaving the house (if you desire dry feet). In other words, Peacocke thinks that judging it’s snowing gives you reason to believe that you believe that it’s snowing.

Notably, on this view the judgment can serve as a reason for the corresponding self-ascription of belief so long as the judgment is conscious. You need not be aware of the judgment. An analogy may illuminate the basic idea here. An itch can serve as a reason for scratching even if there is no further conscious state (distinct from the itch) that constitutes an awareness of the itch. Peacocke argues that, in a broadly similar way, a conscious judgment that p can serve as a direct reason for my self-ascribing the belief that p, without my introspecting the judgment and inferring that I believe that p, or even having any distinct awareness of that judgment. (Compare Silins 2012.)

The non-inferential transition from judging that p (a conscious, occurrent state) to believing that one believes that p (that is, to self-ascribing a belief) is a rational one, on this view, because judging is conceptually linked with believing: making a judgment “is the fundamental way to form a belief” (Peacocke 1999: 238). Similarly, since remembering that p is conceptually linked with believing that p, a conscious memory that p can justify the belief that one believes that p. And anyone in a position to self-ascribe a belief will possess the concept of belief, and so will grasp—or at least, manifest cognitive dispositions appropriately reflecting—these conceptual truths.[7]

Drawing on Peacocke, Paul (2012) develops a reasons account of how we know our intentions. On this account, the transition from deciding to do something (or remembering that one has so decided) to believing that one intends to do that thing is rational, since it is a conceptual truth that deciding normally suffices for intending.

Silins (2020) presents a different argument for the reasons account as applied to belief. He thinks that judgments like it’s snowing but I don’t believe that it is—known as “Moore-paradoxical judgments”—are plainly irrational. But if the judgment that p didn’t provide justification for self-ascribing the belief that p, these judgments could be perfectly rational. Silins concludes that judging that p provides (propositional) justification for self-ascribing the belief that p. This explains why Moore-paradoxical judgments are irrational: in making such a judgment “you flout the justification given to you by your judgment that p” (Silins 2020: 334).

Coliva (2008) objects that judgments cannot rationalize self-ascriptions of belief in the way the reasons theorist contends, because they are not suitably accessible. Her argument rests, in part, on a claim reminiscent of the self-interpretation view: that the phenomenology of a conscious thought—such as “things will look up”—does not indicate whether this is the content of a judgment or, instead, of a wish. McHugh (2012) responds on behalf of the reasons account, arguing that there is a “phenomenology characteristic of judging that p” that is present in cases where ordinary self-knowledge is possible (2012: 148). This dispute suggests that the prospects for the reasons account, as an account of self-knowledge of the attitudes, may depend in part on whether attitudes have “proprietary phenomenology” (Pitt 2004). (For more on that question, see the entry on consciousness and intentionality.)

3.6 Rationalist Accounts

Rationalist accounts of self-knowledge maintain that our status as rational thinkers guarantees our capacity for self-knowledge. Some agentialist accounts (discussed in the next subsection) agree with that claim, but on agentialist views this guarantee stems from the agency exercised in rational deliberation. I reserve the term “rationalist” for accounts that focus on rationality and are independent of claims about agency.

As we saw in 3.2, Shoemaker (1994) contends that no rational thinker (who possesses the relevant mental state concepts) could be “self-blind”, that is, incapable of self-knowledge. He reasons as follows. A self-blind person would (i) fall into certain conceptual errors, such as making irrational Moore-paradoxical judgments like it’s snowing but I don’t believe that it is; (ii) be unable to communicate their beliefs, and hence to engage in cooperative endeavors; (iii) regard themselves “as a stranger”, e.g. in observing themselves taking aspirin without grasping that they were in pain. Yet a rational thinker would not commit these errors, be incapacitated in this way, or suffer this kind of self-alienation. So rational thinkers cannot be self-blind.

Shoemaker explains the link between rationality and self-knowledge with his “constitutivist” [8] thesis, namely: for rational thinkers with the appropriate conceptual repertoire, being in certain mental states constitutes knowledge that one is in them. What it is for a rational creature to feel pain is, in part, for that creature to believe that they are in pain; what it is for a rational creature to believe that p is, in part, for it to believe that it believes that p; etc. Shoemaker cashes out this idea with a functionalist analysis of mental states, proposing that in rational creatures, the causal role defining a mental state are also sufficient for belief that one is in that mental state (Shoemaker 1994: 287–9).

Inspired in part by Shoemaker’s arguments, Stoljar (2018, 2019) has recently proposed an ambitious, systematic explanation of the (supposed) fact that rational thinkers are necessarily capable of self-knowledge. Stoljar posits that what it means to be rational is to be guided by the rules of rationality, which include the following “introspective principle”:

If one is in a conscious state C, … one will believe that one is in C. (Stoljar 2019: 405; ellipsis in original)

(The ellipsis indicates that further conditions must be added; the details are not crucial here.) If rationality partly consists in following this principle, then no rational creature will be self-blind. Stoljar (2019) argues that his proposal also explains why, as Evans claimed, we can know that we believe that p by considering p. He proposes that a belief is conscious, in the relevant sense, when one attends to its content—e.g., to it’s snowing. Together with the introspective principle above, this means that a rational person who believes that p, and who attends to p, will believe that they believe that p.

Smithies (2019) also defends the idea that rational thinkers are necessarily capable of knowing their beliefs. His starting point is the claim that Moore-paradoxical beliefs are always irrational. He notes that such beliefs may seem rational if a thinker doesn’t know what they believe: e.g., if someone believes that p but has misleading evidence suggesting that they don’t believe that p. Smithies concludes that, since such beliefs are always irrational, a rational thinker will know all of their beliefs. “Rationality requires knowing what you believe, since otherwise you’re liable to fall into an irrational Moorean predicament” (ibid.: 174). To explain how we are able to know all of our beliefs, he proposes a nonstandard conception of belief: “to believe that p is to be disposed to judge that p when you consciously entertain whether p” (ibid.: 175–6). Given that conception, beliefs are necessarily accessible to the subject, since they consist in dispositions to conscious judgments. This means that a rational thinker who believes that p will have (available) justification for believing that they believe that p.

Rationalist accounts face two related challenges. First, to defend the idea that rationality guarantees the capacity for self-knowledge, these accounts must adopt a fairly demanding conception of what it is to be rational. But if a conception of rationality is too demanding, then it is questionable whether it applies to cognitively flawed creatures like us (Kornblith 2012; Cassam 2015). Second, in order to explain how we can meet their demanding standards for rationality—how we can follow Stoljar’s introspective principle, or can know all of our beliefs—rationalists tend to invoke nonstandard conceptions of “conscious” or “belief”. The challenge here is to show that the process of achieving self-knowledge is psychologically realistic and that it applies to the kinds of states that we actually possess.

Many philosophers share the intuition that, necessarily, no rational thinker is self-blind. The success of rationalist accounts of self-knowledge depends on whether there are conceptions of rationality, consciousness, belief, etc. that are robust enough to exclude the possibility of self-blindness yet psychologically realistic enough to explain the cognitive achievements of actual human beings.

3.7 Agentialist Accounts

The accounts of self-knowledge canvassed thus far treat self-knowledge as a largely epistemic phenomenon. But as noted in Section 1, some philosophers deny that the special character of self-ascriptions is primarily epistemic. One version of this denial charges that by focusing on our access to our mental states, standard accounts of self-knowledge portray the introspective thinker as passive, a mere spectator (or detector) of a cognitive show. Agentialists contend that the special character of self-knowledge stems from the fact that we exercise agency over our mental states, and hence are responsible for them.

The privilege of first-person knowledge is … really more like the knowledge of a person driving a car as opposed to that of her passenger. The passenger may very well see where the driver is going, but still does not know in the immediate executive sense of the driver herself. (McGeer 1996: 505)

The phenomena of self-knowledge … are themselves based as much in asymmetries of responsibility and commitment as they are in difference in capacities or in cognitive access. (Moran 2001: 64)

Many versions of agentialism are inspired by a broadly Kantian approach to reason and agency (Burge 1996; Moran 2001; Bilgrami 2006; Boyle 2009). On this approach, a thinker’s most basic self-conception (as an “I”) is agential: we see ourselves as authors of our beliefs and intentions, rather than as an inert thing in which attitudes merely occur. This authorial agency is essentially rational: it is exercised when we believe or intend on the basis of reasons. Agentialism differs from rationalism in taking our capacity for self-knowledge to derive from our agency and not (just) from our rationality. Agentialists maintain that our rational agency guarantees that we are capable of—or even that we possess—self-knowledge.

Agentialists differ as to the precise link between agency and self-knowledge. I begin with Burge, who argues that our responsibility for our beliefs entitles us to belief self-ascriptions. Burge uses the following reasoning. Our rational agency confers on us the obligation to (try to) satisfy certain rational norms: that one’s beliefs should conform to one’s evidence; that a belief set should be internally consistent; etc. In order to satisfy these rational norms—e.g., to assess our beliefs for conformance with our evidence, or for consistency with other beliefs—we must rely on judgments as to which beliefs we have. So our responsibility to satisfy rational norms epistemically entitles us to those judgments about our beliefs (and other attitudes) that are crucial for satisfying those norms.

[I]f one lacked entitlement to judgments about one’s attitudes, one could not be subject to rational norms governing how one ought to alter those attitudes given that one had reflected on them. (Burge 1996: 101)[9]

This appears to be a version of “ought implies can” reasoning. The upshot is that being responsible for one’s attitudes requires, and thereby implies, that we can know those attitudes.

Burge's reasoning has a distinctly transcendental flavor (see the entry on transcendental arguments). Transcendental reasoning also fuels Moran’s agentialism. But while Burge uses it to establish a general entitlement to self-ascriptions, Moran deploys it to show that self-knowledge can be achieved in a specific way, namely by reflection on reasons. He reasons as follows. We could not engage in rational thought unless we had the “epistemic right” to the assumption that our attitudes are shaped by our reasons. (This is “something like a Transcendental assumption of Rational Thought” (Moran 2003: 406).) So we do have the epistemic right to that assumption. And our right to that assumption gives us the epistemic right to use the transparency method associated with Evans’ famous remarks: to answer the question “do you believe that p?” by considering reasons bearing on p (ibid.) So the self-ascriptions produced by the transparency method constitute knowledge.

Moran’s agentialist transparency account differs markedly from empiricist transparency accounts (3.4). For empiricists, the transparency method provides for self-knowledge because it is reliable or generates self-ascriptions that could not easily be false. For agentialists, our entitlement to use the transparency method is rooted in a normative fact: that we are responsible for our attitudes.

Some worry that Moran’s account is too demanding. O’Brien argues that I am not justified in self-attributing the belief that there will be a third world war, on the basis of considering geopolitics, unless I recognize that my reasons for expecting a third world war constitute evidence that I believe it will occur. But this recognition in turn requires a reflective grasp of the nature of deliberation that seems unnecessary for ordinary self-attributions (O’Brien 2003: 379–81).

Other philosophers have supplemented Moran’s argument by claiming that the agentialist transparency account is needed to make sense of various phenomena. Keeling (2018) cites the fact that we confabulate reasons for our attitudes (Nisbett and Wilson 1977) as showing that, as rational agents, we take ourselves to be obligated to know the rational basis for our attitudes, and hence to be justified in taking our attitudes to reflect our reasons. Marcus and Schwenkler (2019) argue that we cannot satisfy the honesty norm for assertions unless we have non-empirical knowledge of what we believe, of the sort provided by the transparency method.

Like Burge and Moran, Bilgrami (2006) regards self-knowledge as intimately tied to the phenomenon of rational agency. But his view is not merely that, as rational agents, we are necessarily capable of knowing our attitudes. He argues that we could not exercise the agency involved in believing unless we actually knew our beliefs. Beliefs are necessarily known by the thinker because they are commitments.

[C]ommitments [such as beliefs] … are states that, were we not to live up to them, we should be prepared to criticize ourselves and be prepared also to try and do better, by way of living up to them … We cannot therefore have commitments without believing that we have them. … Thus the very condition for having a commitment presupposes that one has a second-order belief that one has that commitment. (2006: 287)

Boyle also thinks that our responsibility for our attitudes means that we must be generally aware, at least tacitly, of our conscious beliefs. The capacity to deliberate about whether p requires an awareness of how p is being represented: e.g., awareness that it is represented as a settled matter, as opposed to a hypothesis to be examined (Boyle 2019: 1034). This means that a rational thinker who consciously believes that p has a tacit awareness of that belief. Importantly, for Boyle this awareness is not higher-order: the belief that p is not an object of a separate state of awareness. Instead, it is an in-built awareness:

[F]or a person who consciously believes that p, being aware of her own belief and seeing the world from the perspective of p-believer are two aspects of the same awareness. (ibid.: 1018)

The agentialist views discussed thus far have been inspired by the Kantian idea that we are responsible for our beliefs and intentions because, in believing or intending, we exercise a distinctive type of agency, viz. rational agency. Whether positive this distinctive type of agency is needed to explain the epistemic and normative aspects of self-knowledge invoked by agentialists is a matter of controversy (Gertler 2018; Sorgiovanni 2019).

Some agentialist views are independent of the idea that our attitudes are exercises of rational agency. McGeer’s (1996) view, a pioneer of empiricist agentialism, takes self-ascriptions to be “commissive”: in self-ascribing an attitude, we commit to behaving in ways that fit that attitude.

[W]e are actors as well as observers and so can be good, even excellent, “predictors” of our future behavior because we have the power to make these “predictions” come true. … [W]e do not just wait to see if our actions make sense in light of intentional self-attributions, but rather make them make sense. (McGeer 1996: 507)

McGeer’s account does not invoke the idea of rational agency. This means that it does not rest on positing a distinctive agential faculty, and allows its scope to extend beyond reasons-sensitive attitudes such as beliefs and intentions. For example, saying (or judging) “I want to go to the beach” commits one to act in ways that make sense given that desire: e.g., to go to the beach when an opportunity presents itself. The normativity of this commitment stems not from the requirements of rationality but, instead, from our ordinary practical obligations. In expressing an attitude, we provide others with ways of explaining and predicting our behavior; this obligates us to behave in ways that fit the attitudes we express or self-ascribe (or to convey that our attitudes have changed).

Coliva (2012a) develops a related view concerning self-ascriptions of commitments—which for her include not only beliefs and intentions but also rationally held conative attitudes, such as desires. Provided that a thinker is rational and has the relevant concepts, their self-ascriptions of commitments will be true because they will create the attitudes ascribed.

[A] judgement (or a sincere assertion) such as 
“I believe/desire/intend/wish/hope that P” is like a performative, namely like “I promise to buy you an ice-cream”… : it makes a certain thing happen, for it does create the first-order propositional attitude as a commitment. … [J]udging “I believe/desire/intend/wish/hope that P” becomes just an alternative way of undertaking the same commitments one would make by judging that P (is worth pursuing or having)… (Coliva 2012a: 235–6)

The agency operative in Coliva’s account is our power to undertake commitments through self-ascriptions. This contrasts with the kind of agency at work in Kantian agentialist views, which is exercised simply in having beliefs or intentions. However, Coliva’s account still has a rationalist element in that self-ascriptions involve committing to there being good reasons for the attitude.

We now consider the prospects for agentialism generally. The agentialist’s primary burden is to explain the epistemic dimension of self-knowledge. After all, most cases of knowledge involve a belief being controlled by what is known: e.g., I know my dog’s location only if my belief about his location is controlled by (sensitive to) his actual location. By contrast, the agential approach focuses on our control over what is known. Agentialism is not a genuine competitor to the accounts of self-knowledge unless it explains how agency relative to our attitudes provides for self-knowledge. (Parrott’s (2015) non-epistemic version of agentialism is explicitly not a competitor to those accounts, as its aim is to explain why it is reasonable to defer to others’ self-ascriptions.) Because the various versions of agentialism differ as to the way that agency secures justification or warrant for self-ascriptions, their responses to this challenge will differ.

A possible drawback of agentialism is its limited application. Most versions of agentialism apply only to attitudes are sensitive to reasons. (McGeer’s is an exception.) But arguably, non-instrumental desires and some other types of attitudes are insensitive to reasons: this is part of the motivation for self-interpretation accounts (3.3). And some beliefs and intentions are insensitive to reasons. Beliefs that are deeply entrenched (such as superstitions) or comforting (as in wishful thinking) sometimes persevere in the face of counter-evidence. Intentions that run counter to one’s goals (e.g. akratic or self-sabotaging intentions) sometimes withstand practical deliberation.

Agentialists generally hold that we can know such recalcitrant attitudes, but only through a process of self-observation, which they regard as problematic. (McGeer is again an exception.) Agentialists argue that if I can know about my own attitude only through observation, then I am “alienated” (Moran 2001) from that attitude; my relation to it, qua agent, is “brute, contingent, non-rational” (Burge 1996); and I can view it only from a “third-person perspective” (Bilgrami 2006) and not “as my own” (Boyle 2009).[10] Some of agentialism’s critics maintain that knowing an attitude through an observational process does not preclude a thinker from regarding it as her own in the relevant sense (Reed 2010; Borgoni 2015). Some even claim that a detached perspective on one’s own attitudes can be especially enlightening: it can help us to recognize and combat recalcitrant attitudes (McGeer 2008; Levy 2016), and it may be necessary for genuine self-understanding (Doyle 2019).

3.8 Expressivist Accounts

Expressivist views highlight similarities between utterances like “I’m in pain” and direct expressions of one’s mental states, such as wincing or saying “ouch!” (Wittgenstein 1953; Finkelstein 2003; Bar-On 2004; Campbell 2020). In particular, these views center on the idea that utterances like “I’m in pain”—avowals—directly express the mental states they ascribe. The most radical version of expressivism—what Bar-On (2004) calls Simple Expressivism, sometimes attributed to Wittgenstein—says that avowals, like non-linguistic expressions of mental states such as wincing, are neither true nor false. On that view, avowals do not express knowledge any more than wincing does. Most contemporary expressivists take avowals to express self-knowledge. Since our concern is with self-knowledge, our discussion will be limited to those views.

Avowals include thoughts like I want some water as well as utterances like “I’m in pain”. According to the expressivist, the relation between an avowal and the mental state it expresses is direct in two respects. First, no judgment to the effect that I’m in pain or desire water intervenes between my pain or desire and my avowal. Just as a wince flows from my pain directly, a spontaneous avowal flows from my pain (or desire) directly, unmediated by any judgment. Second, the knowledge expressed in such avowals is epistemically “groundless” in that it is not based on evidence that one is in pain or desires water. Obviously, the subject can directly express only her own mental states.

Expressivist approaches differ as to the feature of avowals that they aim to explain. Finkelstein and Bar-On focus on the social-linguistic aspect of avowals, known as first-person authority: we ordinarily defer to others about their own mental states, so avowals are presumed to be true. Campbell focuses on the epistemic aspect of avowals, known as first-person privilege: our capacity to avow our mental states constitutes a privileged epistemic position vis-a-vis those states.

Finkelstein allows that my avowal “I’m so happy!” may be caused by my happiness. But he denies that this is a matter of brute causation, as hitting someone’s knee with a hammer brutely causes his leg to kick out. Rather, what differentiates these cases is that my happiness and my spontaneous avowal “have, we might say, a particular kind of intelligibility” (Finkelstein 2003: 126). This does not mean that my happiness rationalizes the avowal. (A relevant contrast here is with the reasons account.) Instead, he says, my avowal, like my smiling, makes sense together with my happiness in something like the way that a dog’s pain and its moaning make sense together, in “the logical space of animate life”.

Since dogs are not usually thought to possess self-knowledge, this analogy raises the question: Does my avowal “I’m happy” express knowledge that I’m happy? The answer is complex, on Finkelstein’s view. Whether the avowing subject is to be credited with self-knowledge depends, he thinks, on how one understands “knowledge”: in particular, avowals do not express knowledge if knowledge requires an epistemic grounding in evidence.

Bar-On’s account focuses on the fact that avowals enjoy a presumption of truth. To use one of her examples: if I say “I’m so happy!”, it would be inappropriate (in ordinary circumstances) for you to question whether I am the one who is happy, or whether what I’m feeling is happiness. This presumption of truth is explained, on Bar-On’s account, by the fact that my avowal flows directly from my happy feeling. That is, my avowal is not based on evidence about how I feel, and no judgment to the effect that I’m happy mediates between my happiness and the avowal.

Bar-On maintains that avowals can represent “genuine and privileged self-knowledge” (Bar-On 2004: 405), although the avowing subject typically has not “formed the active judgment [that he is happy] on some basis”, and cannot offer evidence bearing on his happiness (ibid.: 363). She is not committed to a particular account of how avowals constitute knowledge, but she presents a number of approaches compatible with her view, which she calls Neo-Expressivism.

On one of these approaches, a conscious state can provide epistemic warrant for a self-ascription directly, in the two senses of directness mentioned earlier: that is, without mediation by a judgment and without serving as evidence for the avowal.

[A]vowing subjects enjoy a special epistemic warrant, since their pronouncements, when true, are epistemically grounded in the very states they ascribe to themselves, which states also serve as the reasons for their acts of avowing. (Bar-On 2004: 405)

(By “epistemically grounded”, Bar-On simply means warranted: such avowals are not based on evidence.)

Although both Finkelstein and Bar-On maintain that avowals may qualify as knowledge, providing an epistemology of self-knowledge is, for them, at most a peripheral goal. These views are concerned with avowals that issue directly from the states they express, in something like the way a dog's moaning issues directly from its pain. But to some critics, this spontaneous, reflexive quality of avowals—that they are not informed by evidence or reasoning—means that they cannot represent to the kind of epistemic achievement required for knowledge.

Campbell (2020) draws on the idea at the core of expressivism—that only the subject can directly express their mental states—to explain our special epistemic position relative to our own mental states. Her account contrasts with Finkelstein’s and Bar-On’s in taking the epistemic dimension of avowals (first-person privilege) to be the basis for their social-linguistic dimension (first-person authority).

Campbell proposes that an avowal like “I’m in pain” can express not only pain but also knowledge that I’m in pain (2020: 15). This proposal draws on her Rational Response account of knowledge, which says that knowing that p is “being able to rationally respond to or operate with, the fact that p” (ibid.: 12). On this account, to know that I want water is to have the rational capacities to act on, express, and reason with my desire for water. I exercise these capacities when I rationally respond to my desire in any of a variety of ways: pouring myself a glass of water, or altering my route so that I will pass a drinking fountain, or saying “I want some water”. The utterance “I want some water” expresses self-knowledge, of the uniquely first-personal kind, if it is a direct, rational response to my desire for water. This response must be direct in the ways described earlier: not based on an intermediate judgment or on evidence about my desire. The requirement that it be rational distinguishes expressions of self-knowledge from brute reactions, e.g. a dog’s responding to his thirst by going to his water bowl.

This last point highlights an aspect of Campbell’s account that deserves further discussion. The account rests on distinguishing rational responses to the fact that p from non-rational (or “brute”) reactions. If the account is to explain rather than presuppose first-person privilege, what makes a response rational must not be analyzed in epistemic terms. E.g., the rationality of a response must not lie in its being justified or warranted. This is a fruitful area for future work on this new contribution to the self-knowledge literature.


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Further Reading

Anthologies on self-knowledge:

  • Cassam, Q. (ed.), 1994, Self-Knowledge, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Coliva, A. (ed.), 2012, The Self and Self-Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gertler, B. (ed.), 2003, Privileged Access: Philosophical Accounts of Self-Knowledge, Aldershot: Ashgate Publishing.
  • Hatzimoysis, A. (ed.), 2011, Self-Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • D. Smithies and D. Stoljar (eds.), 2012, Introspection and Consciousness, Oxford: Oxford University Press,
  • Wright, C., B. Smith, and C. Macdonald, (eds.), 1998, Knowing Our Own Minds, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Other Internet Resources

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