Positive and Negative Liberty

First published Thu Feb 27, 2003; substantive revision Fri Nov 19, 2021

Negative liberty is the absence of obstacles, barriers or constraints. One has negative liberty to the extent that actions are available to one in this negative sense. Positive liberty is the possibility of acting — or the fact of acting — in such a way as to take control of one’s life and realize one’s fundamental purposes. While negative liberty is usually attributed to individual agents, positive liberty is sometimes attributed to collectivities, or to individuals considered primarily as members of given collectivities.

The idea of distinguishing between a negative and a positive sense of the term ‘liberty’ goes back at least to Kant, and was examined and defended in depth by Isaiah Berlin in the 1950s and ’60s. Discussions about positive and negative liberty normally take place within the context of political and social philosophy. They are distinct from, though sometimes related to, philosophical discussions about free will. Work on the nature of positive liberty often overlaps, however, with work on the nature of autonomy.

As Berlin showed, negative and positive liberty are not merely two distinct kinds of liberty; they can be seen as rival, incompatible interpretations of a single political ideal. Since few people claim to be against liberty, the way this term is interpreted and defined can have important political implications. Political liberalism tends to presuppose a negative definition of liberty: liberals generally claim that if one favors individual liberty one should place strong limitations on the activities of the state. Critics of liberalism often contest this implication by contesting the negative definition of liberty: they argue that the pursuit of liberty understood as self-realization or as self-determination (whether of the individual or of the collectivity) can require state intervention of a kind not normally allowed by liberals.

Many authors prefer to talk of positive and negative freedom. This is only a difference of style, and the terms ‘liberty’ and ‘freedom’ are normally used interchangeably by political and social philosophers. Although some attempts have been made to distinguish between liberty and freedom (Pitkin 1988; Williams 2001; Dworkin 2011), generally speaking these have not caught on. Neither can they be translated into other European languages, which contain only the one term, of either Latin or Germanic origin (e.g. liberté, Freiheit), where English contains both.

1. Two Concepts of Liberty

Imagine you are driving a car through town, and you come to a fork in the road. You turn left, but no one was forcing you to go one way or the other. Next you come to a crossroads. You turn right, but no one was preventing you from going left or straight on. There is no traffic to speak of and there are no diversions or police roadblocks. So you seem, as a driver, to be completely free. But this picture of your situation might change quite dramatically if we consider that the reason you went left and then right is that you’re addicted to cigarettes and you’re desperate to get to the tobacconists before it closes. Rather than driving, you feel you are being driven, as your urge to smoke leads you uncontrollably to turn the wheel first to the left and then to the right. Moreover, you’re perfectly aware that your turning right at the crossroads means you’ll probably miss a train that was to take you to an appointment you care about very much. You long to be free of this irrational desire that is not only threatening your longevity but is also stopping you right now from doing what you think you ought to be doing.

This story gives us two contrasting ways of thinking of liberty. On the one hand, one can think of liberty as the absence of obstacles external to the agent. You are free if no one is stopping you from doing whatever you might want to do. In the above story you appear, in this sense, to be free. On the other hand, one can think of liberty as the presence of control on the part of the agent. To be free, you must be self-determined, which is to say that you must be able to control your own destiny in your own interests. In the above story you appear, in this sense, to be unfree: you are not in control of your own destiny, as you are failing to control a passion that you yourself would rather be rid of and which is preventing you from realizing what you recognize to be your true interests. One might say that while on the first view liberty is simply about how many doors are open to the agent, on the second view it is more about going through the right doors for the right reasons.

In a famous essay first published in 1958, Isaiah Berlin called these two concepts of liberty negative and positive respectively (Berlin 1969).[1] The reason for using these labels is that in the first case liberty seems to be a mere absence of something (i.e. of obstacles, barriers, constraints or interference from others), whereas in the second case it seems to require the presence of something (i.e. of control, self-mastery, self-determination or self-realization). In Berlin’s words, we use the negative concept of liberty in attempting to answer the question “What is the area within which the subject — a person or group of persons — is or should be left to do or be what he is able to do or be, without interference by other persons?”, whereas we use the positive concept in attempting to answer the question “What, or who, is the source of control or interference that can determine someone to do, or be, this rather than that?” (1969, pp. 121–22).

It is useful to think of the difference between the two concepts in terms of the difference between factors that are external and factors that are internal to the agent. While theorists of negative freedom are primarily interested in the degree to which individuals or groups suffer interference from external bodies, theorists of positive freedom are more attentive to the internal factors affecting the degree to which individuals or groups act autonomously. Given this difference, one might be tempted to think that a political philosopher should concentrate exclusively on negative freedom, a concern with positive freedom being more relevant to psychology or individual morality than to political and social institutions. This, however, would be premature, for among the most hotly debated issues in political philosophy are the following: Is the positive concept of freedom a political concept? Can individuals or groups achieve positive freedom through political action? Is it possible for the state to promote the positive freedom of citizens on their behalf? And if so, is it desirable for the state to do so? The classic texts in the history of western political thought are divided over how these questions should be answered: theorists in the classical liberal tradition, like Benjamin Constant, Wilhelm von Humboldt, Herbert Spencer, and J.S. Mill, are typically classed as answering ‘no’ and therefore as defending a negative concept of political freedom; theorists that are critical of this tradition, like Jean-Jacques Rousseau, G.W.F. Hegel, Karl Marx and T.H. Green, are typically classed as answering ‘yes’ and as defending a positive concept of political freedom.

In its political form, positive freedom has often been thought of as necessarily achieved through a collectivity. Perhaps the clearest case is that of Rousseau’s theory of freedom, according to which individual freedom is achieved through participation in the process whereby one’s community exercises collective control over its own affairs in accordance with the ‘general will’. Put in the simplest terms, one might say that a democratic society is a free society because it is a self-determined society, and that a member of that society is free to the extent that he or she participates in its democratic process. But there are also individualist applications of the concept of positive freedom. For example, it is sometimes said that a government should aim actively to create the conditions necessary for individuals to be self-sufficient or to achieve self-realization. The welfare state has sometimes been defended on this basis, as has the idea of a universal basic income. The negative concept of freedom, on the other hand, is most commonly assumed in liberal defences of the constitutional liberties typical of liberal-democratic societies, such as freedom of movement, freedom of religion, and freedom of speech, and in arguments against paternalist or moralist state intervention. It is also often invoked in defences of the right to private property. This said, some philosophers have contested the claim that private property necessarily enhances negative liberty (Cohen 1995, 2006), and still others have tried to show that negative liberty can ground a form of egalitarianism (Steiner 1994).

After Berlin, the most widely cited and best developed analyses of the negative concept of liberty include Hayek (1960), Day (1971), Oppenheim (1981), Miller (1983) and Steiner (1994). Among the most prominent contemporary analyses of the positive concept of liberty are Milne (1968), Gibbs (1976), C. Taylor (1979) and Christman (1991, 2005).

2. The Paradox of Positive Liberty

Many liberals, including Berlin, have suggested that the positive concept of liberty carries with it a danger of authoritarianism. Consider the fate of a permanent and oppressed minority. Because the members of this minority participate in a democratic process characterized by majority rule, they might be said to be free on the grounds that they are members of a society exercising self-control over its own affairs. But they are oppressed, and so are surely unfree. Moreover, it is not necessary to see a society as democratic in order to see it as self-controlled; one might instead adopt an organic conception of society, according to which the collectivity is to be thought of as a living organism, and one might believe that this organism will only act rationally, will only be in control of itself, when its various parts are brought into line with some rational plan devised by its wise governors (who, to extend the metaphor, might be thought of as the organism’s brain). In this case, even the majority might be oppressed in the name of liberty.

Such justifications of oppression in the name of liberty are no mere products of the liberal imagination, for there are notorious historical examples of their endorsement by authoritarian political leaders. Berlin, himself a liberal and writing during the cold war, was clearly moved by the way in which the apparently noble ideal of freedom as self-mastery or self-realization had been twisted and distorted by the totalitarian dictators of the twentieth century — most notably those of the Soviet Union — so as to claim that they, rather than the liberal West, were the true champions of freedom. The slippery slope towards this paradoxical conclusion begins, according to Berlin, with the idea of a divided self. To illustrate: the smoker in our story provides a clear example of a divided self, for she is both a self that desires to get to an appointment and a self that desires to get to the tobacconists, and these two desires are in conflict. We can now enrich this story in a plausible way by adding that one of these selves — the keeper of appointments — is superior to the other: the self that is a keeper of appointments is thus a ‘higher’ self, and the self that is a smoker is a ‘lower’ self. The higher self is the rational, reflecting self, the self that is capable of moral action and of taking responsibility for what she does. This is the true self, for rational reflection and moral responsibility are the features of humans that mark them off from other animals. The lower self, on the other hand, is the self of the passions, of unreflecting desires and irrational impulses. One is free, then, when one’s higher, rational self is in control and one is not a slave to one’s passions or to one’s merely empirical self. The next step down the slippery slope consists in pointing out that some individuals are more rational than others, and can therefore know best what is in their and others’ rational interests. This allows them to say that by forcing people less rational than themselves to do the rational thing and thus to realize their true selves, they are in fact liberating them from their merely empirical desires. Occasionally, Berlin says, the defender of positive freedom will take an additional step that consists in conceiving of the self as wider than the individual and as represented by an organic social whole — “a tribe, a race, a church, a state, the great society of the living and the dead and the yet unborn”. The true interests of the individual are to be identified with the interests of this whole, and individuals can and should be coerced into fulfilling these interests, for they would not resist coercion if they were as rational and wise as their coercers. “Once I take this view”, Berlin says, “I am in a position to ignore the actual wishes of men or societies, to bully, oppress, torture in the name, and on behalf, of their ‘real’ selves, in the secure knowledge that whatever is the true goal of man ... must be identical with his freedom” (Berlin 1969, pp. 132–33).

Those in the negative camp try to cut off this line of reasoning at the first step, by denying that there is any necessary relation between one’s freedom and one’s desires. Since one is free to the extent that one is externally unprevented from doing things, they say, one can be free to do what one does not desire to do. If being free meant being unprevented from realizing one’s desires, then one could, again paradoxically, reduce one’s unfreedom by coming to desire fewer of the things one is unfree to do. One could become free simply by contenting oneself with one’s situation. A perfectly contented slave is perfectly free to realize all of her desires. Nevertheless, we tend to think of slavery as the opposite of freedom. More generally, freedom is not to be confused with happiness, for in logical terms there is nothing to stop a free person from being unhappy or an unfree person from being happy. The happy person might feel free, but whether they are free is another matter (Day, 1970). Negative theorists of freedom therefore tend to say not that having freedom means being unprevented from doing as one desires, but that it means being unprevented from doing whatever one might desire to do (Steiner 1994. Cf. Van Parijs 1995; Sugden 2006).

Some theorists of positive freedom bite the bullet and say that the contented slave is indeed free — that in order to be free the individual must learn, not so much to dominate certain merely empirical desires, but to rid herself of them. She must, in other words, remove as many of her desires as possible. As Berlin puts it, if I have a wounded leg ‘there are two methods of freeing myself from pain. One is to heal the wound. But if the cure is too difficult or uncertain, there is another method. I can get rid of the wound by cutting off my leg’ (1969, pp. 135–36). This is the strategy of liberation adopted by ascetics, stoics and Buddhist sages. It involves a ‘retreat into an inner citadel’ — a soul or a purely noumenal self — in which the individual is immune to any outside forces. But this state, even if it can be achieved, is not one that liberals would want to call one of freedom, for it again risks masking important forms of oppression. It is, after all, often in coming to terms with excessive external limitations in society that individuals retreat into themselves, pretending to themselves that they do not really desire the worldly goods or pleasures they have been denied. Moreover, the removal of desires may also be an effect of outside forces, such as brainwashing, which we should hardly want to call a realization of freedom.

Because the concept of negative freedom concentrates on the external sphere in which individuals interact, it seems to provide a better guarantee against the dangers of paternalism and authoritarianism perceived by Berlin. To promote negative freedom is to promote the existence of a sphere of action within which the individual is sovereign, and within which she can pursue her own projects subject only to the constraint that she respect the spheres of others. Humboldt and Mill, both advocates of negative freedom, compared the development of an individual to that of a plant: individuals, like plants, must be allowed to grow, in the sense of developing their own faculties to the full and according to their own inner logic. Personal growth is something that cannot be imposed from without, but must come from within the individual.

3. Two Attempts to Create a Third Way

Critics, however, have objected that the ideal described by Humboldt and Mill looks much more like a positive concept of liberty than a negative one. Positive liberty consists, they say, in exactly this growth of the individual: the free individual is one that develops, determines and changes her own desires and interests autonomously and from within. This is not liberty as the mere absence of obstacles, but liberty as autonomy or self-realization. Why should the mere absence of state interference be thought to guarantee such growth? Is there not some third way between the extremes of totalitarianism and the minimal state of the classical liberals — some non-paternalist, non-authoritarian means by which positive liberty in the above sense can be actively promoted?

3.1 Positive Liberty as Content-neutral

Much of the more recent work on positive liberty has been motivated by a dissatisfaction with the ideal of negative liberty combined with an awareness of the possible abuses of the positive concept so forcefully exposed by Berlin. John Christman (1991, 2005, 2009, 2013), for example, has argued that positive liberty concerns the ways in which desires are formed — whether as a result of rational reflection on all the options available, or as a result of pressure, manipulation or ignorance. What it does not regard, he says, is the content of an individual’s desires. The promotion of positive freedom need not therefore involve the claim that there is only one right answer to the question of how a person should live, nor need it allow, or even be compatible with, a society forcing its members into given patterns of behavior. Take the example of a Muslim woman who claims to espouse the fundamentalist doctrines generally followed by her family and the community in which she lives. On Christman’s account, this person is positively unfree if her desire to conform was somehow oppressively imposed upon her through indoctrination, manipulation or deceit. She is positively free, on the other hand, if she arrived at her desire to conform while aware of other reasonable options and she weighed and assessed these other options rationally. Even if this woman seems to have a preference for subservient behavior, there is nothing necessarily freedom-enhancing or freedom-restricting about her having the desires she has, since freedom regards not the content of these desires but their mode of formation. On this view, forcing her to do certain things rather than others can never make her more free, and Berlin’s paradox of positive freedom would seem to have been avoided.

This more ‘procedural’ account of positive liberty allows us to point to kinds of internal constraint that seem too fall off the radar if we adopt only negative concept. For example, some radical political theorists believe it can help us to make sense of forms of oppression and structural injustice that cannot be traced to overt acts of prevention or coercion. On the one hand, in agreement with Berlin, we should recognize the dangers of that come with promoting the values or interests of a person’s ‘true self’ in opposition to what they manifestly desire. Thus, the procedural account avoids all reference to a ‘true self’. On the other, we should recognize that people’s actual selves are inevitably formed in a social context and that their values and senses of identity (for example, in terms of gender or race or nationality) are shaped by cultural influences. In this sense, the self is ‘socially constructed’, and this social construction can itself occur in oppressive ways. The challenge, then, is to show how a person’s values can be thus shaped but without the kind of oppressive imposition or manipulation that comes not only from political coercion but also, more subtly, from practices or institutions that stigmatize or marginalize certain identities or that attach costs to the endorsement of values deviating from acceptable norms, for these kinds of imposition or manipulation can be just another way of promoting a substantive ideal of the self. And this was exactly the danger against which Berlin was warning, except that the danger is less visible and can be created unintentionally (Christman 2013, 2015, 2021; Hirschmann 2003, 2013; Coole 2013).

While this theory of positive freedom undoubtedly provides a tool for criticizing the limiting effects of certain practices and institutions in contemporary liberal societies, it remains to be seen what kinds of political action can be pursued in order to promote content-neutral positive liberty without encroaching on any individual’s rightful sphere of negative liberty. Thus, the potential conflict between the two ideals of negative and positive freedom might survive Christman’s alternative analysis, albeit in a milder form. Even if we rule out coercing individuals into specific patterns of behavior, a state interested in promoting content-neutral positive liberty might still have considerable space for intervention aimed at ‘public enlightenment’, perhaps subsidizing some kinds of activities (in order to encourage a plurality of genuine options) and financing such intervention through taxation. Liberals might criticize this kind of intervention on anti-paternalist grounds, objecting that such measures will require the state to use resources in ways that the supposedly heteronomous individuals, if left to themselves, might have chosen to spend in other ways. In other words, even in its content-neutral form, the ideal of positive freedom might still conflict with the liberal idea of respect for persons, one interpretation of which involves viewing individuals from the outside and taking their choices at face value. From a liberal point of view, the blindness to internal constraints can be intentional (Carter 2011a). Some liberals will make an exception to this restriction on state intervention in the case of the education of children, in such a way as to provide for the active cultivation of open minds and rational reflection. Even here, however, other liberals will object that the right to negative liberty includes the right to decide how one’s children should be educated.

Is it necessary to refer to internal constraints in order to make sense of the phenomena of oppression and structural injustice? Some might contest this view, or say that it is true only up to a point, for there are at least two reasons for thinking that the oppressed are lacking in negative liberty. First, while Berlin himself equated economic and social disadvantages with natural disabilities, claiming that neither represented constraints on negative liberty but only on personal abilities, many theorists of negative liberty disagree: if I lack the money to buy a jacket from a clothes shop, then any attempt on my part to carry away the jacket is likely to meet with preventive actions or punishment on the part of the shop keeper or the agents of the state. This is a case of interpersonal interference, not merely of personal inability. In the normal circumstances of a market economy, purchasing power is indeed a very reliable indicator of how far other people will stop you from doing certain things if you try. It is therefore strongly correlated with degrees of negative freedom (Cohen 1995, 2011; Waldron 1993; Carter 2007; Grant 2013). Thus, while the promotion of content-neutral positive liberty might imply the transfer of certain kinds of resources to members of disadvantaged groups, the same might be true of the promotion of negative liberty. Second, the negative concept of freedom can be applied directly to disadvantaged groups as well as to their individual members. Some social structures may be such as to tolerate the liberation of only a limited number of members of a given group. G.A. Cohen famously focused on the case proletarians who can escape their condition by successfully setting up a business of their own though a mixture of hard work and luck. In such cases, while each individual member of the disadvantaged group might be negatively free in the sense of being unprevented from choosing the path of liberation, the freedom of the individual is conditional on the unfreedom of the majority of the rest of the group, since not all can escape in this way. Each individual member of the class therefore partakes in a form of collective negative unfreedom (Cohen 1988, 2006; for discussion see Mason 1996; Hindricks 2008; Grant 2013; Schmidt 2020).

3.2 Republican Liberty

Another increasingly influential group of philosophers has rejected both the negative and the positive conception, claiming that liberty is not merely the enjoyment of a sphere of non-interference but the enjoyment of certain conditions in which such non-interference is guaranteed (Pettit 1997, 2001, 2014; Skinner 1998, 2002; Weinstock and Nadeau 2004; Laborde and Maynor 2008; Lovett 2010, forthcoming; Breen and McBride 2015, List and Valentini 2016). These conditions may include the presence of a democratic constitution and a series of safeguards against a government wielding power arbitrarily, including popular control and the separation of powers. As Berlin admits, on the negative view, I am free even if I live in a dictatorship just as long as the dictator happens, on a whim, not to interfere with me (see also Hayek 1960). There is no necessary connection between negative liberty and any particular form of government. Is it not counterintuitive to say that I can in theory be free even if I live in a dictatorship, or that a slave can enjoy considerable liberty as long as the slave-owner is compassionate and generous? Would my subjection to the arbitrary power of a dictator or slave-owner not itself be sufficient to qualify me as unfree? If it would be, then we should say that I am free only if I live in a society with the kinds of political institutions that guarantee the independence of each citizen from such arbitrary power. Quentin Skinner has called this view of freedom ‘neo-Roman’, invoking ideas about freedom both of the ancient Romans and of a number of Renaissance and early modern writers. Philip Pettit has called the same view ‘republican’, and this label has generally prevailed in the recent literature.

Republican freedom can be thought of as a kind of status: to be a free person is to enjoy the rights and privileges attached to the status of republican citizenship, whereas the paradigm of the unfree person is the slave. Freedom is not simply a matter of non-interference, for a slave may enjoy a great deal of non-interference at the whim of her master. What makes her unfree is her status, such that she is permanently exposed to interference of any kind. Even if the slave enjoys non-interference, she is, as Pettit puts it, ‘dominated’, because she is permanently subject to the arbitrary power of her owner.

According to Pettit, then, republicans conceive of freedom not as non-interference, as on the standard negative view, but as ‘non-domination’. Non-domination is distinct from negative freedom, he says, for two reasons. First, as we have seen, one can enjoy non-interference without enjoying non-domination. Second, one can enjoy non-domination while nevertheless being interfered with, just as long as the interference in question is constrained to track one’s avowed interests thanks to republican power structures: only arbitrary power is inimical to freedom, not power as such.

On the other hand, republican freedom is also distinct from positive freedom as expounded and criticized by Berlin. First, republican freedom does not consist in the activity of virtuous political participation; rather, that participation is seen as instrumentally related to freedom as non-domination. Secondly, the republican concept of freedom cannot lead to anything like the oppressive consequences feared by Berlin, because it has a commitment to non-domination and to liberal-democratic institutions already built into it.

Pettit’s idea of freedom as non domination has caught the imagination of a great many political theorists over the last two decades. One source of its popularity lies in the fact that it seems to make sense of the phenomena of oppression and structural injustice referred to above, but without necessarily relying on references to internal constraints. It has been applied not only to relations of domination between governments and citizens, but also to relations of domination between employers and workers (Breen and McBride 2015), between husbands and wives (Lovett forthcoming), and between able-bodied and disabled people (De Wispelaere and Casassas 2014).

It remains to be seen, however, whether the republican concept of freedom is ultimately distinguishable from the negative concept, or whether republican writers on freedom have not simply provided good arguments to the effect that negative freedom is best promoted, on balance and over time, through certain kinds of political institutions rather than others. While there is no necessary connection between negative liberty and democratic government, there may nevertheless be a strong empirical correlation between the two. Ian Carter (1999, 2008), Matthew H. Kramer (2003, 2008), and Robert Goodin and Frank Jackson (2007) have argued, along these lines, that republican policies are best defended empirically on the basis of the standard negative ideal of freedom, rather than on the basis of a conceptual challenge to that ideal. An important premise in such an argument is that the extent of a person’s negative freedom is a function not simply of how many single actions are prevented, but of how many different act-combinations are prevented. On this basis, people who can achieve their goals only by bowing and scraping to their masters must be seen as less free, negatively, than people who can achieve those goals unconditionally. Another important premise is that the extent to which people are negatively free depends, in part, on the probability with which they will be constrained from performing future acts or act-combinations. People who are subject to arbitrary power can be seen as less free in the negative sense even if they do not actually suffer interference, because the probability of their suffering constraints is always greater (ceteris paribus, as a matter of empirical fact) than it would be if they were not subject to that arbitrary power. Only this greater probability, they say, can adequately explain republican references to the ‘fear’, the ‘sense of exposure’, and the ‘precariousness’ of the dominated (for further discussion see Bruin 2009, Lang 2012, Shnayderman 2012, Kirby 2016, Carter and Shnayderman 2019).

In reply to the above point about the relevance of probabilities, republicans have insisted that freedom as non-domination is nevertheless distinct from negative liberty because what matters for an agent’s freedom is the impossibility of others interfering, not the mere improbability of their doing so. Consider the example of gender relations with the context of marriage. A husband might be kind and generous, or indeed have a strong sense of egalitarian justice, and therefore be extremely unlikely ever to deny his wife the same opportunities as he himself enjoys; but the wife is still dominated if the structure of norms in her society is such as to permit husbands to frustrate the choices of their wives in numerous ways. If she lives in such a society, she is still subject to the husband’s power whether he likes it or not. And whether the husband likes it or not, the wife’s subjection to his power will tend to influence how third parties treat her – for example, in terms of offering employment opportunities.

Taken at face value, however, the requirement of impossibility of interference seems over demanding, as it is never completely impossible for others to constrain me. It is not impossible that I be stabbed by someone as I walk down the street this afternoon. Indeed, the possible world in which this event occurs is very close to the actual world, even if the event is improbable in the actual world. If the mere possibility of the stabbing makes me unfree to walk down the street, then unfreedom is everywhere and the achievement of freedom is itself virtually impossible. To avoid this worry, republicans have qualified their impossibility requirement: for me to be free to walk down the street, it must be impossible for others to stab me with impunity (Pettit 2008a, 2008b; Skinner 2008). This qualification makes the impossibility requirement more realistic. Nevertheless, the qualification is open to objections. Is ‘impunity’ a purely formal requirement, or should we say that no one can carry out a street stabbing with impunity if, say, at least 70% of such stabbings lead to prosecution? Even if 100% of such stabbings lead to prosecution, there will still be some stabbings. Will they not be sources of unfreedom for the victims?

More recently some republicans have sidelined the notion of impunity of interference in favour of that of ‘ignorability’ of interference (Ingham and Lovett 2019). I am free to make certain choices if the structure of effective societal norms, whether legal or customary, is such as to constrain the ability of anyone else to frustrate those choices, to the point where the possibility of such frustration, despite existing, is remote enough to be something I can ignore. Once I can ignore that possibility, then the structure of effective norms makes me safe by removing any sense of exposure to interference. Defenders of the negative concept of liberty might respond to this move by saying that the criterion of ignorability looks very much like a criterion of trivially low probability: we consider ourselves free to do x to the extent that the system of enforced norms deters others’ prevention of x in such a way as to make that prevention improbable.

The jury is still out on whether republicans have successfully carved out a third concept of freedom that is really distinct from those of negative and positive liberty. This conceptual uncertainty need not itself cast doubt on the distinctness and attractiveness of republicanism as a set of political prescriptions. Rather, what it leaves open is the question of the ultimate normative bases of those prescriptions: is ‘non-domination’ something that supervenes on certain configurations of negative freedom and unfreedom, and therefore explainable in terms of such configurations, or is it something truly distinct from those configurations?

4. One Concept of Liberty: Freedom as a Triadic Relation

The two sides identified by Berlin disagree over which of two different concepts best captures the political ideal of ‘liberty’. Does this fact not denote the presence of some more basic agreement between the two sides? How, after all, could they see their disagreement as one about the nature of liberty if they did not think of themselves as in some sense talking about the same thing? In an influential article, the American legal philosopher Gerald MacCallum (1967) put forward the following answer: there is in fact only one basic concept of freedom, on which both sides in the debate converge. What the so-called negative and positive theorists disagree about is how this single concept of freedom should be interpreted. Indeed, in MacCallum’s view, there are a great many different possible interpretations of freedom, and it is only Berlin’s artificial dichotomy that has led us to think in terms of there being two.

MacCallum defines the basic concept of freedom — the concept on which everyone agrees — as follows: a subject, or agent, is free from certain constraints, or preventing conditions, to do or become certain things. Freedom is therefore a triadic relation — that is, a relation between three things: an agent, certain preventing conditions, and certain doings or becomings of the agent. Any statement about freedom or unfreedom can be translated into a statement of the above form by specifying what is free or unfree, from what it is free or unfree, and what it is free or unfree to do or become. Any claim about the presence or absence of freedom in a given situation will therefore make certain assumptions about what counts as an agent, what counts as a constraint or limitation on freedom, and what counts as a purpose that the agent can be described as either free or unfree to carry out.

The definition of freedom as a triadic relation was first put forward in the seminal work of Felix Oppenheim in the 1950s and 60s. Oppenheim saw that an important meaning of ‘freedom’ in the context of political and social philosophy was as a relation between two agents and a particular (impeded or unimpeded) action. However, Oppenheim’s interpretation of freedom was an example of what Berlin would call a negative concept. What MacCallum did was to generalize this triadic structure so that it would cover all possible claims about freedom, whether of the negative or the positive variety. In MacCallum’s framework, unlike in Oppenheim’s, the interpretation of each of the three variables is left open. In other words, MacCallum’s position is a meta-theoretical one: his is a theory about the differences between theorists of freedom.

To illustrate MacCallum’s point, let us return to the example of the smoker driving to the tobacconists. In describing this person as either free or unfree, we shall be making assumptions about each of MacCallum’s three variables. If we say that the driver is free, what we shall probably mean is that an agent, consisting in the driver’s empirical self, is free from external (physical or legal) obstacles to do whatever he or she might want to do. If, on the other hand, we say that the driver is unfree, what we shall probably mean is that an agent, consisting in a higher or rational self, is made unfree by internal, psychological constraints to carry out some rational, authentic or virtuous plan. Notice that in both claims there is a negative element and a positive element: each claim about freedom assumes both that freedom is freedom from something (i.e., preventing conditions) and that it is freedom to do or become something. The dichotomy between ‘freedom from’ and ‘freedom to’ is therefore a false one, and it is misleading to say that those who see the driver as free employ a negative concept and those who see the driver as unfree employ a positive one. What these two camps differ over is the way in which one should interpret each of the three variables in the triadic freedom-relation. More precisely, we can see that what they differ over is the extension to be assigned to each of the variables.

Thus, those whom Berlin places in the negative camp typically conceive of the agent as having the same extension as that which it is generally given in ordinary discourse: they tend to think of the agent as an individual human being and as including all of the empirical beliefs and desires of that individual. Those in the so-called positive camp, on the other hand, often depart from the ordinary notion, in one sense imagining the agent as more extensive than in the ordinary notion, and in another sense imagining it as less extensive: they think of the agent as having a greater extension than in ordinary discourse in cases where they identify the agent’s true desires and aims with those of some collectivity of which she is a member; and they think of the agent as having a lesser extension than in ordinary discourse in cases where they identify the true agent with only a subset of her empirical beliefs and desires — i.e., with those that are rational, authentic or virtuous. Secondly, those in Berlin’s positive camp tend to take a wider view of what counts as a constraint on freedom than those in his negative camp: the set of relevant obstacles is more extensive for the former than for the latter, since negative theorists tend to count only external obstacles as constraints on freedom, whereas positive theorists also allow that one may be constrained by internal factors, such as irrational desires, fears or ignorance. And thirdly, those in Berlin’s positive camp tend to take a narrower view of what counts as a purpose one can be free to fulfill. The set of relevant purposes is less extensive for them than for the negative theorists, for we have seen that they tend to restrict the relevant set of actions or states to those that are rational, authentic or virtuous, whereas those in the negative camp tend to extend this variable so as to cover any action or state the agent might desire.

On MacCallum’s analysis, then, there is no simple dichotomy between positive and negative liberty; rather, we should recognize that there is a whole range of possible interpretations or ‘conceptions’ of the single concept of liberty. Indeed, as MacCallum says and as Berlin seems implicitly to admit, a number of classic authors cannot be placed unequivocally in one or the other of the two camps. Locke, for example, is normally thought of as one of the fathers or classical liberalism and therefore as a staunch defender of the negative concept of freedom. He indeed states explicitly that ‘[to be at] liberty is to be free from restraint and violence from others’. But he also says that liberty is not to be confused with ‘license’, and that “that ill deserves the name of confinement which hedges us in only from bogs and precipices” (Second Treatise, parags. 6 and 57). While Locke gives an account of constraints on freedom that Berlin would call negative, he seems to endorse an account of MacCallum’s third freedom-variable that Berlin would call positive, restricting this variable to actions that are not immoral (liberty is not license) and to those that are in the agent’s own interests (I am not unfree if prevented from falling into a bog). A number of contemporary liberals or libertarians have provided or assumed definitions of freedom that are similarly morally loaded (e.g. Nozick 1974; Rothbard 1982; Bader 2018). This would seem to confirm MacCallum’s claim that it is conceptually and historically misleading to divide theorists into two camps — a negative liberal one and a positive non-liberal one.

5. The Analysis of Constraints: Their Types and Their Sources

To illustrate the range of interpretations of the concept of freedom made available by MacCallum’s analysis, let us now take a closer look at his second variable — that of constraints on freedom.

Advocates of negative conceptions of freedom typically restrict the range of obstacles that count as constraints on freedom to those that are brought about by other agents. For theorists who conceive of constraints on freedom in this way, I am unfree only to the extent that other people prevent me from doing certain things. If I am incapacitated by natural causes — by a genetic handicap, say, or by a virus or by certain climatic conditions — I may be rendered unable to do certain things, but I am not, for that reason, rendered unfree to do them. Thus, if you lock me in my house, I shall be both unable and unfree to leave. But if I am unable to leave because I suffer from a debilitating illness or because a snow drift has blocked my exit, I am nevertheless not unfree, to leave. The reason such theorists give, for restricting the set of relevant preventing conditions in this way, is that they see unfreedom as a social relation — a relation between persons (see Oppenheim 1961; Miller 1983; Steiner 1983; Kristjánsson 1996; Kramer 2003; Morriss 2012; Shnayderman 2013; Schmidt 2016). Unfreedom as mere inability is thought by such authors to be more the concern of engineers and medics than of political and social philosophers. (If I suffer from a natural or self-inflicted inability to do something, should we to say that I remain free to do it, or should we say that the inability removes my freedom to do it while nevertheless not implying that I am unfree to do it? In the latter case, we shall be endorsing a ‘trivalent’ conception, according to which there are some things that a person is neither free nor unfree to do. Kramer 2003 endorses a trivalent conception according to which freedom is identified with ability and unfreedom is the prevention (by others) of outcomes that the agent would otherwise be able to bring about.)

In attempting to distinguish between natural and social obstacles we shall inevitably come across gray areas. An important example is that of obstacles created by impersonal economic forces. Do economic constraints like recession, poverty and unemployment merely incapacitate people, or do they also render them unfree? Libertarians and egalitarians have provided contrasting answers to this question by appealing to different conceptions of constraints. Thus, one way of answering the question is by taking an even more restrictive view of what counts as a constraint on freedom, so that only a subset of the set of obstacles brought about by other persons counts as a restriction of freedom: those brought about intentionally. In this case, impersonal economic forces, being brought about unintentionally, do not restrict people’s freedom, even though they undoubtedly make many people unable to do many things. This last view has been taken by a number of market-oriented libertarians, including, most famously, Friedrich von Hayek (1960, 1982), according to whom freedom is the absence of coercion, where to be coerced is to be subject to the arbitrary will of another. (Notice the somewhat surprising similarity between this conception of freedom and the republican conception discussed earlier, in section 3.2) Critics of libertarianism, on the other hand, typically endorse a broader conception of constraints on freedom that includes not only intentionally imposed obstacles but also unintended obstacles for which someone may nevertheless be held responsible (for Miller and Kristjánsson and Shnayderman this means morally responsible; for Oppenheim and Kramer it means causally responsible), or indeed obstacles created in any way whatsoever, so that unfreedom comes to be identical to inability (see Crocker 1980; Cohen 2011, pp. 193–97; Sen 1992; Van Parijs 1995; Garnett forthcoming).

This analysis of constraints helps to explain why socialists and egalitarians have tended to claim that the poor in a capitalist society are as such unfree, or that they are less free than the rich, whereas libertarians have tended to claim that the poor in a capitalist society are no less free than the rich. Egalitarians typically (though do not always) assume a broader notion than libertarians of what counts as a constraint on freedom. Although this view does not necessarily imply what Berlin would call a positive notion of freedom, egalitarians often call their own definition a positive one, in order to convey the sense that freedom requires not merely the absence of certain social relations of prevention but the presence of abilities, or what Amartya Sen has influentially called ‘capabilities’ (Sen 1985, 1988, 1992; Nussbaum 2006, 2011). (Important exceptions to this egalitarian tendency to broaden the relevant set of constraints include those who consider poverty to indicate a lack of social freedom (see sec. 3.1, above). Steiner (1994), grounds a left-libertarian theory of justice in the idea of an equal distribution of social freedom, which he takes to imply an equal distribution of resources.)

We have seen that advocates of a negative conception of freedom tend to count only obstacles that are external to the agent. Notice, however, that the term ‘external’ is ambiguous in this context, for it might be taken to refer either to the location of the causal source of an obstacle or to the location of the obstacle itself. Obstacles that count as ‘internal’ in terms of their own location include psychological phenomena such as ignorance, irrational desires, illusions and phobias. Such constraints can be caused in various ways: for example, they might have a genetic origin, or they might be brought about intentionally by others, as in the case of brainwashing or manipulation. In the first case we have an internal constraint brought about by natural causes, and in this sense ‘internally’; in the second, an internal constraint intentionally imposed by another human agent, and in this sense ‘externally’.

More generally, we can now see that there are in fact two different dimensions along which one’s notion of a constraint might be broader or narrower. A first dimension is that of the source of a constraint — in other words, what it is that brings about a constraint on freedom. We have seen, for example, that some theorists include as constraints on freedom only obstacles brought about by human action, whereas others also include obstacles with a natural origin. A second dimension is that of the type of constraint involved, where constraint-types include the types of internal constraint just mentioned, but also various types of constraint located outside the agent, such as physical barriers that render an action impossible, obstacles that render the performance of an action more or less difficult, and costs attached to the performance of a (more or less difficult) action. The two dimensions of type and source are logically independent of one another. Given this independence, it is theoretically possible to combine a narrow view of what counts as a source of a constraint with a broad view of what types of obstacle count as unfreedom-generating constraints, or vice versa. As a result, it is not clear that theorists who are normally placed in the ‘negative’ camp need deny the existence of internal constraints on freedom (see Kramer 2003; Garnett 2007).

To illustrate the independence of the two dimensions of type and source, consider the case of the unorthodox libertarian Hillel Steiner (1974–5, 1994). On the one hand, Steiner has a much broader view than Hayek of the possible sources of constraints on freedom: he does not limit the set of such sources to intentional human actions, but extends it to cover all kinds of human cause, whether or not any humans intend such causes and whether or not they can be held morally accountable for them, believing that any restriction of such non-natural sources can only be an arbitrary stipulation, usually arising from some more or less conscious ideological bias. On the other hand, Steiner has an even narrower view than Hayek about what type of obstacle counts as a constraint on freedom: for Steiner, an agent only counts as unfree to do something if it is physically impossible for her to do that thing. Any extension of the constraint variable to include other types of obstacle, such as the costs anticipated in coercive threats, would, in his view, necessarily involve a reference to the agent’s desires, and we have seen (in sec. 2) that for those liberals in the negative camp there is no necessary relation between an agent’s freedom and her desires. Consider the coercive threat ‘Your money or your life!’. This does not make it impossible for you to refuse to hand over your money, only much less desirable for you to do so. If you decide not to hand over the money, you will suffer the cost of being killed. That will count as a restriction of your freedom, because it will render physically impossible a great number of actions on your part. But it is not the issuing of the threat that creates this unfreedom, and you are not unfree until the sanction (described in the threat) is carried out. For this reason, Steiner excludes threats — and with them all other kinds of imposed costs — from the set of obstacles that count as freedom-restricting. This conception of freedom derives from Hobbes (Leviathan, chs. 14 and 21), and its defenders often call it the ‘pure’ negative conception (M. Taylor 1982; Steiner 1994; Carter and Kramer 2008) to distinguish it from those ‘impure’ negative conceptions that make at least minimal references to the agent’s beliefs, desires or values.

Steiner’s account of the relation between freedom and coercive threats might be thought to have counterintuitive implications, even from the liberal point of view. Many laws that are normally thought to restrict negative freedom do not physically prevent people from doing what is prohibited, but deter them from doing so by threatening punishment. Are we to say, then, that these laws do not restrict the negative freedom of those who obey them? A solution to this problem may consist in saying that although a law against doing some action, x, does not remove the freedom to do x, it nevertheless renders physically impossible certain combinations of actions that include doing x and doing what would be precluded by the punishment. There is a restriction of the person’s overall negative freedom — i.e. a reduction in the overall number of act-combinations available to her — even though she does not lose the freedom to do any specific thing taken in isolation (Carter 1999).

6. The Concept of Overall Freedom

The concept of overall freedom appears to play an important role both in everyday discourse and in contemporary political philosophy. It is only recently, however, that philosophers have stopped concentrating exclusively on the meaning of a particular freedom — the freedom to do or become this or that particular thing — and have started asking whether we can also make sense of descriptive claims to the effect that one person or society is freer than another, or of liberal normative claims to the effect that freedom should be maximized or that people should enjoy equal freedom or that they each have a right to a certain minimum level of freedom. The literal meaningfulness of such claims depends on the possibility of gauging degrees of overall freedom, sometimes comparatively, sometimes absolutely.

Theorists disagree, however, about the importance of the notion of overall freedom. For some libertarian and liberal egalitarian theorists, freedom is valuable as such. This suggests that more freedom is better than less (at least ceteris paribus), and that freedom is one of those goods that a liberal society ought to distribute in a certain way among individuals. For other liberal theorists, like Ronald Dworkin (1977, 2011) and the later Rawls (1991), freedom is not valuable as such, and all claims about maximal or equal freedom ought to be interpreted not as literal references to a scalar good called ‘liberty’ but as elliptical references to the adequacy of lists of certain particular liberties, or types of liberties, selected on the basis of values other than liberty itself. Generally speaking, only the first group of theorists finds the notion of overall freedom interesting.

The theoretical problems involved in measuring overall freedom include that of how an agent’s available actions are to be individuated, counted and weighted, and that of comparing and weighting different types (but not necessarily different sources) of constraints on freedom (such as physical prevention, punishability, threats and manipulation). How are we to make sense of the claim that the number of options available to a person has increased? Should all options count for the same in terms of degrees of freedom, or should they be weighted according to their importance in terms of other values? If the latter, does the notion of overall freedom really add anything of substance to the idea that people should be granted those specific freedoms that are valuable? Should the degree of variety among options also count? And how are we to compare the unfreedom created by the physical impossibility of an action with, say, the unfreedom created by the difficulty or costliness or punishability of an action? It is only by comparing these different kinds of actions and constraints that we shall be in a position to compare individuals’ overall degrees of freedom. These problems have been addressed, with differing degrees of optimism, not only by political philosophers (Steiner 1983; Carter 1999; Kramer 2003; Garnett 2016; Côté 2020; Carter and Steiner 2021) but also by social choice theorists interested in finding a freedom-based alternative to the standard utilitarian or ‘welfarist’ framework that has tended to dominate their discipline (e.g. Pattanaik and Xu 1991, 1998; Hees 2000; Sen 2002; Sugden 1998, 2003, 2006; Bavetta 2004; Bavetta and Navarra 2012, 2014).

MacCallum’s framework is particularly well suited to the clarification of such issues. For this reason, theorists working on the measurement of freedom tend not to refer a great deal to the distinction between positive and negative freedom. This said, most of them are concerned with freedom understood as the availability of options. And the notion of freedom as the availability of options is unequivocally negative in Berlin’s sense at least where two conditions are met: first, the source of unfreedom is limited to the actions of other agents, so that natural or self-inflicted obstacles are not seen as decreasing an agent’s freedom; second, the actions one is free or unfree to perform are weighted in some value-neutral way, so that one is not seen as freer simply because the options available to one are more valuable or conducive to one’s self-realization. Of the above-mentioned authors, only Steiner embraces both conditions explicitly. Sen rejects both of them, despite not endorsing anything like positive freedom in Berlin’s sense.

7. Is the Distinction Still Useful?

We began with a simple distinction between two concepts of liberty, and have progressed from this to the recognition that liberty might be defined in any number of ways, depending on how one interprets the three variables of agent, constraints, and purposes. Despite the utility of MacCallum’s triadic formula and its strong influence on analytic philosophers, however, Berlin’s distinction remains an important point of reference for discussions about the meaning and value of political and social freedom. Are these continued references to positive and negative freedom philosophically well-founded?

It might be claimed that MacCallum’s framework is less than wholly inclusive of the various possible conceptions of freedom. In particular, it might be said, the concept of self-mastery or self-direction implies a presence of control that is not captured by MacCallum’s explication of freedom as a triadic relation. MacCallum’s triadic relation indicates mere possibilities. If one thinks of freedom as involving self-direction, on the other hand, one has in mind an exercise-concept of freedom as opposed to an opportunity-concept (this distinction comes from C. Taylor 1979). If interpreted as an exercise concept, freedom consists not merely in the possibility of doing certain things (i.e. in the lack of constraints on doing them), but in actually doing certain things in certain ways — for example, in realizing one’s true self or in acting on the basis of rational and well-informed decisions. The idea of freedom as the absence of constraints on the realization of given ends might be criticised as failing to capture this exercise concept of freedom, for the latter concept makes no reference to the absence of constraints.

However, this defence of the positive-negative distinction as coinciding with the distinction between exercise- and opportunity-concepts of freedom has been challenged by Eric Nelson (2005). As Nelson points out, most of the theorists that are traditionally located in the positive camp, such as Green or Bosanquet, do not distinguish between freedom as the absence of constraints and freedom as the doing or becoming of certain things. For these theorists, freedom is the absence of any kind of constraint whatsoever on the realization of one’s true self (they adopt a maximally extensive conception of constraints on freedom). The absence of all factors that could prevent the action x is, quite simply, equivalent to the realization of x. In other words, if there really is nothing stopping me from doing x — if I possess all the means to do x, and I have a desire to do x, and no desire, irrational or otherwise, not to do x — then I do x. An equivalent way to characterize the difference between such positive theorists and the so-called negative theorists of freedom lies in the degree of specificity with which they describe x. For those who adopt a narrow conception of constraints, x is described with a low degree of specificity (x could be exemplified by the realization of any of a large array of options); for those who adopt a broad conception of constraints, x is described with a high degree of specificity (x can only be exemplified by the realization of a specific option, or of one of a small group of options).

What perhaps remains of the distinction is a rough categorization of the various interpretations of freedom that serves to indicate their degree of fit with the classical liberal tradition. There is indeed a certain family resemblance between the conceptions that are normally seen as falling on one or the other side of Berlin’s divide, despite there being some uncertainty about which side to locate certain particular conceptions. One of the decisive factors in determining this family resemblance is the theorist’s degree of concern with the notion of the self. Those on the ‘positive’ side see questions about the nature and sources of a person’s beliefs, desires and values as relevant in determining that person’s freedom, whereas those on the ‘negative’ side, being more faithful to the classical liberal tradition, tend to consider the raising of such questions as in some way indicating a propensity to violate the agent’s dignity or integrity. One side takes a positive interest in the agent’s beliefs, desires and values, while the other recommends that we avoid doing so.


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