Francis Hutcheson

First published Tue Apr 20, 2021

Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746) was an influential British moralist, an advocate of moral sentimentalism, and a key figure of the Scottish Enlightenment. While Hutcheson was educated, and completed his career, at the University of Glasgow, he was Irish by birth, and returned to Scotland only after his major writings (including the Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue, the Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions, with Illustrations on the Moral Sense) had been published, and in some cases extensively revised. Nevertheless, he had a tremendous influence on the Scottish intellectual scene, in part due to his interactions with important Scottish figures of the day, including Adam Smith, Thomas Reid, and David Hume.

Leaving aside his influence on the Scottish enlightenment, Hutcheson’s contribution to the broader development of modern British moralism cannot be overstated. His chief philosophical contributions, upon which this entry will concentrate, include his aforementioned sentimentalism, his complex moral psychology, his proto-utilitarianism, his critique of self-interest theorists (such as Hobbes and Mandeville), his critique of rationalists (such as Clarke and Wollaston), and his attempted reconciliation of virtue and self-interest.

One brief note. Though this entry will concentrate on Hutcheson’s contributions to moral philosophy, Hutcheson also offers views on the nature of human perception (broadly derived from Locke’s Essay), first- and second-order theories of aesthetics (see Kivy 1976 [2003]), logic (Hutcheson 1756), associationism about human cognition (cf. Gill 1995, 1996; Kallich 1946), religion (Elton 2008; Harris 2008), and many other topics that must be foregone for lack of space.

This entry will proceed in two stages, the first focusing on Hutcheson’s metaethics, including his sentimentalism and moral psychology; the second concentrating on his normative ethics, including his anticipation of some strains in utilitarian thought, and his argument that virtue and self-interest are aligned.

1. Hutcheson’s Metaethics

Hutcheson’s most detailed statement of his sentimentalism and substantive moral and aesthetic theory is to be found in his 1725 (and subsequently revised) work, An Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. Indeed, at least in early editions of the Inquiry, Hutcheson considered this essay an attempt to defend the (broadly considered) sentimentalist doctrines of Lord Shaftesbury, as expressed in the Characteristiks of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (1711). Indeed, the subtitle of the book’s first edition runs as follows:

In which the principles of the late Earl of Shaftesbury are Explain’d and Defended, against the Author of the Fable of the Bees: and the Ideas of Moral Good and Evil are establish’d, according to the Sentiments of the Antient Moralists. With an Attempt to introduce a Mathematical Calculation in Subjects of Morality. (Inquiry)

The reference to Mandeville is significant here. In the Inquiry, Hutcheson considered it his task to defend, not the exact details of Shaftesbury’s scheme, but rather his general sentimentalism against the “self-interest” theories of Mandeville and Thomas Hobbes. But leaving aside his rejection of self-interest theorists for the moment (see §2.1), what is the nature of Hutcheson’s overall metaethic?

1.1 The Senses

In the Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions, Hutcheson defines his sentimentalism in the following terms:

“Objects, Actions, or Events obtain the Name of Good, or Evil, according as they are Causes, or Occasions, mediately, or immediately, of a grateful, or ungrateful Perception to some sensitive Nature”. To understand therefore the several Kinds of Good, or Evil, we must apprehend the several Senses natural to us. (Essay, 15)

This passage reveals a number of features of Hutcheson’s sentimentalism. First, he admits of a wide variety of what might be called evaluative modes: there are several kinds of good or evil, according to Hutcheson, which arise given the “grateful or ungrateful” perceptions in people, or other “sensitive Natures”. These evaluative modes will correspond to the various senses that are apt to receive such perceptions.

But what, for Hutcheson, is a “sense”? (For a very thorough introduction, see Schmitter 2016.) In the Essay, he defines this notion as follows:

every Determination of our Minds to receive Ideas independently on our Will, and to have Perceptions of Pleasure and Pain. (Essay, 17)

Now, this account of the nature of senses permits of a fairly broad range—any “determination” of our mind to receive ideas involuntarily is to be understood as a sense. And, indeed, Hutcheson takes this breadth seriously. He recognizes not just the “five senses”—which he dubs “external” senses (Inquiry, I.X; Essay I.1)—but a broad range of “internal” senses. Hutcheson writes:

In Musick we seem universally to acknowledge something like a distinct Sense from the External one of Hearing, and call it a good Ear; and the like distinction we should probably acknowledge in other Objects, had we also got distinct Names to denote these Powers of Perception by. (Inquiry, I.X)

For Hutcheson, the ideas, and pleasures, received via the “good ear”—as opposed to the simple external sense of hearing—are the products of an internal sense.

Indeed, in Hutcheson’s psychology, we get a very wide array of internal “senses”. While this is not an exhaustive list, he lists or at least suggests senses of:

  1. Imagination (Essay, 17) or “Beauty and Harmony” (Inquiry, 23) (“the Pleasant Perceptions arising from regular, harmonious, uniform Objects; as also from Grandeur and Novelty”; Essay, 17).
  2. the “Publick Sense” (“our Determination to be pleased with the Happiness of others, and to be uneasy at their Misery”; Essay, 17).
  3. The Moral Sense (“by which we perceive Virtue, or Vice in our selves, or others”; Essay, 17).
  4. The “Sense of Honour” (“which makes the Approbation or Gratitude of others, for any good Actions we have done, the necessary occasion of Pleasure; and their Dislike, Condemnation, or Resentment of Injuries done by us, the occasion of that uneasy Sensation called Shame, even when we fear no further evil from them”; Essay, 18).
  5. The sense of “decency or dignity” (by which we take pleasure in actions or activities that are specifically adapted to human nature; System, 27–30; Essay, 18).

In Hutcheson’s psychology there is a key difference between the external and internal senses. According to Hutcheson, the external senses have the power to perceive simple ideas—notes, colors, sounds, tastes, etc. (Inquiry, 23). But the internal senses are those, according to Hutcheson, that arise “only upon some previous Idea, or Assemblage, or Comparison of Ideas” (Essay, 15–16). The internal senses, then, will proliferate under Hutcheson’s general account—any capacity to generate pleasure or pain involuntarily given the comparison of ideas will, on Hutcheson’s view, be a sense. And hence it should not at all be surprising that Hutcheson gives the diverse accounting of senses that he does.

However, despite there being a difference, in Hutcheson, between the external and internal senses concerning their operation on simple or complex ideas, they are nevertheless justly grouped together as senses:

Since then there are such different Powers of Perception, where what are commonly called the External Senses are the same; since the most accurate Knowledge of what the External Senses discover, often does not give the Pleasure of Beauty or Harmony, which yet one of a good Taste will enjoy at once without much Knowledge; we may justly use another Name of these higher, and more delightful Perceptions of Beauty and Harmony, and call the power of receiving such Impressions, an Internal Sense…This superior Power of Perception is justly called a Sense, because of its Affinity to other Senses in this, that the Pleasure does not arise from any Knowledge of Principles, Proportions, Causes or of the Usefulness of the Object; but strikes us at first with the Idea of Beauty: nor does the most accurate Knowledge increase this Pleasure of Beauty, however it may super-add a distinct rational Pleasure from prospects of Advantage, or from the Increase of Knowledge. (Inquiry, 24–25)

Here Hutcheson appears to be defending his use of the term “sense” to describe the internal senses as well as the external. According to Hutcheson, the fundamental similarity is the generation of pleasures and ideas immediately, without intervening cognitive work—the sense of taste “strikes us at first with the Idea of Beauty”, along with its accompanying pleasure.

1.2 Senses and Evaluative Modes

According to Hutcheson’s metaethic, evaluations are specifically linked to the senses, in particular the internal senses. So, for instance, aesthetic goodness will be determined (in a sense to be discussed in §1.3) by the operation of the sense of imagination. Honorable actions will be determined by the operation of the sense of honor. Morally good actions will be determined by the operation of the moral sense, and so on. But one might wonder whether there is such a ready distinction between the internal senses. Given that we can form new ideas given their comparison, and derive pleasure from them, why believe that there is such a sharp distinction between, e.g., the sense of imagination and the moral sense? Put another way, what individuates these senses, sufficient to distinguish evaluative modes?

Generally, Hutcheson appears to individuate senses by the sorts of things that generate the particular ideas/pleasures involved. For instance, he suggests that “Harmony” “denotes our pleasant Ideas arising from Composition of Sounds” (Inquiry 23). Here we know it is the sense of harmony, rather than, e.g., the moral sense, because the pleasure we take is given rise by the “composition of sounds”. The pleasures of the publick sense arise as a result of the consideration of others’ happiness and misery (Essay, 17). The pleasures of the sense of dignity arise from others’ assessment of us, and so on.

However, the moral sense has a further characteristic feature that the other internal senses, and hence other evaluative modes, do not. Hutcheson’s earliest reference to the moral sense runs as follows:

[S]ome Actions have to Men an immediate Goodness; …by a superior Sense, which I call a Moral one, we perceive pleasure in the Contemplation of such Actions in others, and are determin’d to love the Agent, (and much more do we perceive Pleasure in being conscious of having done such Actions our selves) without any View of further natural Advantage from them. (Inquiry, 88)

Here it appears that Hutcheson holds that the moral sense is that which takes pleasure in actions. But it is also the case that the moral sense, aside from a distinctive input, as it were, maintains a distinctive output: love of the agent. Later editions of the Inquiry also identify this output as “the simple ideas of Approbation and Condemnation” (Inquiry, 217n45) (see Darwall 1995: 210).

But it would appear that, for Hutcheson, the senses—and with them the evaluative modes—are distinguished by the object sortals to which they apply.

1.3 Semantics and Moral Ontology

Given Hutcheson’s insistence that the operation of our various senses “determines” the various evaluative modes, it’s clear that he is marked out as a sentimentalist in some form or other. But how should we understand Hutcheson’s sentimentalism more precisely? Several questions arise.

First, we might ask a semantic question. Can we take Hutcheson, in expressing his view, to be a proto-non-cognitivist? In other words, is it the case that when people make moral utterances, they are simply expressing their attitudes? Second, we might ask an ontological or metaphysical question. Can we take Hutcheson to regard his moral metaphysics as response-dependent (i.e., that moral properties just are the properties of eliciting certain responses), or is his view compatible (or does it even express) some kind of realism about moral properties?

Let’s begin with the question of whether Hutcheson is a non-cognitivist. Now, of course, much depends on what one means by this. But for the purpose of fixing our discussion, treat non-cognitivism as a sematic thesis, according to which moral terms do not refer to specific properties or objects, but are rather the expression of a particular non-cognitive (such as conative, affective, and so on) attitude. And, indeed, there are some who read Hutcheson in just this way. Perhaps most famously, William Frankena writes:

As I read Hutcheson, then, his position is this: in passing moral approbation as such on an action I am not cognizing and ascribing any identifiable property of goodness, etc., in or to the action, and I am not cognizing or asserting any fact about the actual or possible reactions of any spectators to the action. I am simply feeling a unique sort of pleasure in contemplating the action, and I am expressing this feeling by my verbal utterance, perhaps also expressing (but not asserting) a conviction that others will feel this pleasure if similarly situated, and almost certainly intending to evoke similar feelings in my hearers. That is, my moral approbation as such is wholly non-cognitive, very much as it is on Ayer’s more recent view, except that Ayer does not bring in a unique unacquired moral sense as the source of the feelings involved. (Frankena 1955: 372)

Why think this? Frankena mentions that Hutcheson specifically notes that our moral sense is a determination to “receive pleasure” independently of any further ideas:

We are not to imagine, that this moral Sense, more than the other senses, supposes any innate Ideas, Knowledge, or practical Proposition: We mean by it only a Determination of our Minds to receive amiable or disagreeable Ideas of Actions, when they occur to our Observation, antecedent to any Opinions of Advantage or loss to redound to our selves from them. (Inquiry, 100)

Here it would appear that Hutcheson identifies the “amiable or disagreeable Ideas” as the “immediate Pleasure” gained as a result of the operation of the moral sense. If so, it would make some sense to say that Hutcheson holds that when making moral judgments, one is simply expressing the affective attitudes, i.e., pleasure, that one gains as a result of the operation of the moral sense.

However, on balance Hutcheson’s text does not permit of this reading. (For a much more thorough rejection of such a reading, see Darwall 1995: ch. 8; esp. 215–16; Kupperman 1985) Recall again his passage from the opening of the Essay:

Objects, Actions, or Events obtain the Name of Good, or Evil, according as they are the Causes, or Occasions, mediately, or immediately, of a grateful, or ungrateful Perception to some sensitive Nature.

Hutcheson does not claim that the property, say, “goodness”, or our expressions of such a property just are expressions of our sensitive responses to such objects. But, rather, the property of goodness identified in such objects is the property of being a “Cause or Occasion” of such reactions. A similar thought is expressed in the opening passages of the Inquiry:

The Word Moral Goodness, in this Treatise, denotes our Idea of some Quality apprehended in Actions, which procures Approbation, and Love toward the Actor, from those who receive no Advantage by the Action. (Inquiry, 85)

Frankena dismisses this passage by noting that Hutcheson, in the next sentence, holds that these are “Imperfect Descriptions” (Frankena 1955: 368). But Hutcheson does not believe that they are “Imperfect” in the sense of being incorrect—rather, he holds that these descriptions are imperfect in the sense requiring additional evidence and argument, i.e.,

until we discover whether we really have such Ideas, and what general Foundation there is in Nature for this Difference of actions, as morally Good or Evil.

Thus it seems that we shouldn’t accept that Hutcheson is a non-cognitivist in the sense meant by Frankena. For Hutcheson, moral goodness (and, presumably, the other evaluative modes) refers to particular properties. However, at this point we may wish to turn to the nature of these properties. What sort of property is moral goodness or evil? The key question is the manner in which the moral sense “determines” moral distinctions (Radcliffe 1986). Though this is a bit of a coarse-grained division, one could distinguish what we might call “constitutive sentimentalism”, according to which the property referred to by the term “good” just is the property of causing the relevant sentiments in observers. Contrast this with “epistemic sentimentalism”, according to which the properties referred to by the term “good” are independent of the moral sense, but it is nevertheless the operation of the moral sense that allows us to ascertain or recognize these properties (Raphael 1947).

Indeed, it is not immediately clear from the Inquiry how we are to read Hutcheson on this matter. As already quoted, he holds that the moral sense is the source of the ideas of moral good and bad (Inquiry 86). But this would appear to be neutral concerning whether Hutcheson is a constitutive or epistemic sentimentalist. However, the passage from the Essay is less ambiguous. As noted, he holds that objects, actions, and so on “obtain the name Good” insofar as they are causes of the relevant perceptions (Essay, 15). And hence this would appear to be a constitutive sentimentalism: moral properties just are those properties that cause a particular sentimental reaction. On this reading (or so it would seem), if our psychology were different, then it may be that those things that “procure Approbation” would be substantially different than what they are now. This consequence was a key contemporary criticism of Hutcheson. John Balguy, for instance, writes

In the first place, it seems an insuperable difficulty in our author’s scheme, that virtue appears in it to be of an arbitrary and positive nature, as entirely depending upon instincts, that might originally have been otherwise, or even contrary to what they now are, and may be at any time altered or inverted, if the Creator pleases. (Balguy 1728 [BM: 390])

However, there are two further points worth making here, as we come to understand Hutcheson’s moral ontology. First, even if it were the case that Hutcheson accepted a kind of constitutive sentimentalism, Hutcheson nevertheless believes that the property of goodness could not have been otherwise. This is for two reasons. First, Hutcheson believes that our capacity for approbation, and our capacity to take pleasure in particular actions given the moral sense is firmly rooted in the universal principles of human nature:

But if we call “that State, those Dispositions and Actions, natural, to which we are inclined by some part of our Constitution, antecedently to any Volition of our own; or which flow from some Principles in our Nature, not brought upon us by our own Art, or that of others;” then it may appear, from what has been said above, that “a State of Good-will, Humanity, Compassion, mutual Aid, propagating and supporting Offspring, Love of a Community or Country, Devotion, or Love and Gratitude to some governing Mind, is our natural State”. (Essay, 130)

Furthermore, Hutcheson seems to believe that only the fundamental principles of human nature maintain moral authority. He writes, in the Inquiry:

All Men seem persuaded of some Excellency in the Possession of good moral Qualitys, which is superior to all other Enjoyments; and on the contrary, look upon a State of moral Evil, as worse and more wretched than any other whatsoever. We must not form our Judgment in this matter from the Actions of Men; for however they may be influenc’d by moral Sentiments, yet it is certain, that Self-interested Passions frequently overcome them, and partial Views of the Tendency of Actions, make us do what is really morally evil, apprehending it to be good. But let us examine the Sentiments which Men universally form of the State of others, when they are no way immediately concern’d; for in these Sentiments human Nature is calm and undisturb’d, and shews its true Face. (Inquiry, 163–4)

And the root of our moral sentiments in human nature is further evidence that morality is not, as suggested by Balguy, arbitrary. This is because, after all, we are created by a benevolent deity (Rauscher 2003). And no benevolent deity would have chosen to impart a disposition to praise, e.g., ill-will, cruelty, pain, hatred, and so forth as principles of human nature (Essay 132). (Indeed, this passage reveals a key error in Frankena’s criticism of a “subjectivist”, rather than non-cognitivist, approach to Hutcheson’s metaethics. According to Frankena, the subjectivist view is

incomplete. For it should include a statistical investigation into the actual or possible incidence of feelings of pleasure or pain at contemplating the act in question among the preliminaries to a moral judgment. (Frankena 1955: 371)

But Frankena fails to recognize that Hutcheson does conduct this statistical inquiry. He holds that the sentiments he is describing are universal principles of human nature, implanted by a benevolent deity.) Of course, that’s not to say that the deity couldn’t have made us different than we are (Inquiry, 80; Radcliffe 1986)—just that the deity wouldn’t have.

So if Hutcheson is a constitutive sentimentalist, it appears that his brand of constitutive sentimentalism has at least had some responses to some common objections. After all, our responses are fixtures of human nature, so there needn’t be any sort of problematic contingency in the application of moral predicates.

However, there is one slight complication that can and should be raised for the constitutive interpretation of Hutcheson. (Further to this discussion, see Kail 2001.) Recall how we distinguish senses, i.e., via their subject matter. Now, as noted before, the moral sense takes pleasure in actions. But so does, e.g., the sense of dignity or decency. Of course, this isn’t any particular problem for his account of sense individuation. After all, Hutcheson holds, in the latter case, that it is the suitableness to human nature upon which the sense of dignity operates. This indicates that whether an action is suitable to human nature is independent of the operation of the sense of dignity. But note that Hutcheson also (at least occasionally) refers to the moral sense as a quality that perceives and operates upon virtue and vice (Essay, 17). Now, were Hutcheson a constitutive sentimentalist, this would create a serious problem. After all, on a constitutive sentimentalist view, virtue and vice is logically posterior to the operation of the moral sense, rendering any attempt at individuating that particular sense circular. It would appear a better reading to hold that, as a perceptive quality, the moral sense is perceiving and reacting to something, viz., virtue and vice, telling in favor of an epistemic rather than constitutive reading of Hutcheson’s sentimentalism.

In further support of an epistemic reading, consider the following passage from Hutcheson’s A System of Moral Philosophy. Here, Hutcheson writes the following:

Tho’ the approbation of moral excellence is a grateful action or sensation of the mind, ’tis plain the good approved is not this tendency to give us a grateful sensation. As, in approving a beautiful form, we refer to the beauty of the object; we do not say that it is beautiful because we reap some little pleasure in viewing it, but we are pleased in viewing it because it is antecedently beautiful. Thus, when we admire the virtue of another, the whole excellence, or that quality which by nature we are determined to approve, is conceived to be in that other; we are pleased in the contemplation because the object is excellent, and the object is not judged to be therefore excellent because it gives us pleasure. (System, 54; see also Norton 1985: 410)

Now, this seems to be a direct rejection of his view, expressed in the Essay, that goodness just is the cause or occasion of a “grateful Perception”. Rather, or so it would appear here, Hutcheson seems to be holding that the goodness is a real property of the object, which we feel pleasure upon contemplating, just as beauty is a real property of a particular object, which we feel pleasure upon seeing or appreciating. This clearly tells in favor of an epistemic rather than a constitutive sentimentalism.

One might hold that Hutcheson, by the time he wrote the System, had changed his view. Indeed, the Essay’s first edition was published in 1728, and the System was a much later book, left unpublished at the time of his death. A standard view is that Hutcheson’s thinking changed substantially once we reach the System (Carey 2005: v–vi; Scott 1900: 214). However, this explanation is somewhat unsatisfactory, for at least one reason. Hutcheson was a perennial tinkerer. The Essay underwent no fewer than three separate revised editions during Hutcheson’s lifetime. The final, third, edition of the Essay was completed and published in 1742. But the System, while it was not published until after Hutcheson’s death in 1755, was substantially complete by 1737, five years earlier than the final revised edition of the Essay. And hence were Hutcheson to have changed his view concerning the nature of the property of goodness, one would certainly expect to see this change reflected in the text of the Essay, which was revised as of 1742. But one doesn’t. (This is especially striking given that Hutcheson was not shy about making very substantive changes in later editions of his work; this is especially true of the four editions of the Inquiry.)

This, therefore, is an exegetical puzzle. However, progress may be made by reconsidering Hutcheson’s passage from the Essay. He writes that objects, etc.,“obtain the Name of Good” given their capacity to cause pleasurable sensations. Notice the word “obtain”. We might read Hutcheson as saying not that the property of goodness is the tendency to cause feelings of approbation or feelings of pleasure, but rather the property of goodness is one to which we have access given our feelings of pleasure, just in the sense that beauty is a property to which we have access given our feelings of pleasure in contemplation of the beautiful object. Our feelings of pleasure, in this way, serve to fix the reference of the term “goodness”, but do not constitute the referent of that term. In other words, moral goodness just is the property of XYZ, but we “apprehend” that property given our affective responses and the operation of the moral sense. For Hutcheson, the pleasure generated by the moral sense operates in an analogous way that the description of an object operates in a causal theory of reference. “The author of The Shining” fixes the reference of “Stephen King”, but the property of being Stephen King is not the property of being the author of The Shining. Similarly, that which has a tendency to cause approbation fixes the reference of moral goodness, but being the property of moral goodness is not the same as being the disposition to cause approbation. For Hutcheson, the property is independent.

1.4 Attack on Rationalism

However we understand the ontological status of moral properties in Hutcheson’s sentimentalism, it is clear that Hutcheson made it his business to insist that the foundation of morality is not to be found in our rational capacities, or capacities for the determination of truth and reason (see Gill 2006: ch. 12). This put Hutcheson at odds with his rationalist contemporaries, most importantly John Balguy, Samuel Clarke, and William Wollaston. In the Illustrations on the Moral Sense (which was published with the Essay), Hutcheson offers a sustained critique of these authors and other forms of rationalism (cf. Essay, 137–155).

At this point, however, it would do to say a little bit about how rationalism is understood by Hutcheson’s interlocutors. According to Clarke, the virtue and/or vice of particular actions is determined by the “eternal relations” of “fitness and unfitness”. More specifically, Clarke writes:

there is a fitness or suitableness of certain circumstances to certain persons, and an unsuitableness of others; founded in the nature of things and the qualifications of persons, antecedent to all positive appointment whatsoever; also that from the different relations of different person one to another, there necessarily arises a fitness or unfitness of certain manners of behaviour of some persons towards others: it is as manifest, as that the properties which flow from the essences of different mathematical figures, have different congruities or incongruities between themselves; or that, in mechanics, certain weights or powers have very different forces…. (Clarke 1706 [BM: 192–3])

One way in which this “fitness” seems to work, for Clarke, is that there is a “fitness” in humans worshiping God; there is a “fitness” in behaving benevolently toward others, and so forth. But these “fitnesses” are not known via, nor are they the product of, any moral sense—they are “eternal and immutable” and are discoverable by rational inquiry.

Balguy, another rationalist, takes a somewhat different approach. According to Balguy,

VIRTUE, or moral goodness, is the conformity of our moral actions to the reasons of things. VICE the contrary…The CONFORMITY of such actions to REASON, or the RECTITUDE of them, is their agreeableness to the nature and circumstances of the agents and their objects.—A social action is then right, when it is suitable to the nature and relations of the person concerned. Thus a person obliged acts rightly and reasonably, when his actions are answerable to the relation of gratitude between him and his benefactor. (Balguy 1728 [BM: 398])

Finally, Wollaston suggests a different variety of rationalism, according to which the rightness and wrongness of action is determined by their interference or otherwise with “truth”. Wollaston writes:

I lay this down then as as fundamental maxim, that whoever acts as if things were so, or not so, doth by his acts declare, that they are so, or not so; as plainly as he could by words, and with more reality…No act (whether word or deed) of any being, to whom moral good and evil are imputable, that interferes with any true proposition, or denies any thing to be as it is, can be rightEvery act therefore of such a being, as is before described, and all those omissions, which interfere with truth (i.e., deny any proposition to be true, which is true; or suppose any thing not to be what it is, in any regard) are morally evil, in some degree or other: the forbearing such acts, and the acting in opposition to such omissions are morally good: and when any thing may be either done, or not done, equally without the violation of true, that thing is indifferent. (Wollaston 1724 [BM: 243, 250])

In each case, the rationalist seems to suggest that there are certain actions that, antecedent to our approval of them, or sentiments toward them, have certain qualities, i.e., they are reasonable, fit, true, and so forth. However, Hutcheson believes that all such positions are fundamentally confused. His general line of attack on rationalism is to disambiguate a number of potential readings of rationalism, showing that each is either absurd on its face, or else surreptitiously relies on the existence of a moral sense or sentiment. “But what”, asks Hutcheson, “is this Conformity of Actions to Reason?” (Here he clearly has in mind the view championed by Balguy.) And here he provides two possible answers.

When we ask the Reason of an Action we sometimes mean, “What truth shews a Quality in the Action, exciting the Agent to do it?” Thus, why does a Luxurious Man pursue Wealth? The Reason is given by this Truth, “Wealth is useful to purchase Pleasures”. (Essay, 138)

Alternatively, Hutcheson distinguishes another way an action might be conformable to reason:

Sometimes for a Reason of Actions we shew the truth expressing a Quality, engaging our Approbation. Thus the Reason of hazarding Life in just War, is, that ‘it tends to preserve our honest Countrymen, or evidences publick Spirit…The former sort of Reasons we will call exciting, and the latter justifying. (Essay, 138)

Here Hutcheson is making reference to the, now commonplace, distinction between explanatory reasons (i.e., why did a person do such a thing? what was her motivation?) and normative reasons (i.e., why should this person have done that thing? what does this thing have to say for itself?, and so on).

In examining the nature of exciting reasons, Hutcheson rejects the claim that such reasons could be antecedent to our sentiments or affections. For Hutcheson, our motivations must be a result of our affections, and cannot arise without them.

When it comes to justifying reasons, Hutcheson believes that one cannot genuinely justify an action without reference to a moral sense. As Hutcheson notes, one cannot justify an action simply by noting that it conforms to a true proposition, as this would justify every possible action (Essay, 144). Furthermore, even if we focus on particular truths that may be said about particular actions (such as, e.g., “a Truth shewing an Action to be fit to attain an End”), these truths do not genuinely justify without some reference to the moral quality of the end itself. But for this we must advert to a moral sense. Simply discerning truths about particular ends will not tell us whether those ends are morally justified:

We have got some strange Phrases, “that some things are antecedently reasonable in the Nature of the thing”, which some insist upon: “That otherwise, they say, if before Man was created, any Nature without a moral Sense had existed, this Nature would not have approved as morally good in the Deity, his constituting our Sense as it is as present”. Very true; and what next? If there had been no moral Sense in that Nature, there would have been no Perception of Morality. But “could not such Natures have seen something reasonable in one Constitution more than in another?”…They would have reasoned about both, and found out Truths: are both Constitutions alike reasonable to these Observers? No, they say, “the benevolent one is reasonable, and the malicious unreasonable:” And yet these Observers reasoned and discovered Truths about both: An Action then is called by us reasonable when ’tis benevolent, and unreasonable when malicious. This is plainly making the Word reasonable denote whatever is approved by our moral Sense, without Relation to true Propositions. (Essay, 153–4)

Hutcheson also spends considerable time examining the positions of Clarke and Wollaston in detail. For Clarke, moral distinctions derive from the relations of fitness and unfitness, which are themselves eternal. For Hutcheson, any construal of such relations as morally significant must presuppose a moral sense. As Hutcheson notes, we do not morally praise the relations between, e.g., the natural numbers as in mathematics, or the fitness of certain chemical compositions. The fitness of a sword to end someone’s life is in and of itself morally neutral. And the fitness of an action to its end is also morally neutral—some actions are just as fit to human misery as other actions are fit to human happiness. Of course, one might hold that the fitness relation is simply to be applied (in a morally interesting sense) to the ultimate end of action. Happiness, in other words, is “fit”; misery “unfit”. But, according to Hutcheson, what does this mean? It cannot be “fit” to, say, give rise to some other thing—that’s what makes it an ultimate end. But any explication that would render some particular end as “fit” seems, according to Hutcheson to presuppose an independent evaluation beyond its “fitness”. (Though for a reading of Hutcheson that suggests significant continuity between Hutcheson and Clarke, see Sheridan 2007.)

Hutcheson saves his most biting criticism for Wollaston’s view, however. According to Hutcheson, there is no plausibility to be had that moral distinctions can be derived by the tendencies of our actions to signify truth or falsity. Depending upon what one understands to be “significance”, or how one understands Wollaston’s “[acting] as if things were so, or not so”, we would declare as immoral such benign acts as leaving one’s lights on at night, or traveling, as a noble, “without Coronets”, or walking in plainclothes despite being clergy, or writing plays or “Epicks” (Essay, 164–66). In addition, according to Hutcheson, Wollaston’s system cannot distinguish between degrees of virtue or vice. Assuming it makes some sense to say that particular actions signify truth or falsehood, this appears to be a binary property—it either does or does not. But virtue is scalar: some actions are horribly vicious, others are heroic, others are relatively morally insignificant (Essay, 170; see also §2.2). Ultimately, then, Hutcheson concludes that Wollaston (and every other rationalist he considers) is really smuggling in some sort of moral sense in disguise, whether this is by means of a reference to the “reasonableness” of particular actions, a reference to their “fitness” or reference to their “significance of truth or falsity”.

2. Hutcheson’s Normative Ethics

Most of the scholarly attention paid to Hutcheson concerns his metaethics—the nature of his moral psychology, his understanding of the ontological status of moral facts, his critique of rationalism, and so forth. But equally interesting is his normative ethics, which features a striking critique of “self-interest” theories, a unification of virtue and happiness, and a view that clearly anticipates later British utilitarianism.

2.1 Self-Interest and Benevolence

To begin, Hutcheson believed that the most important contribution of the Inquiry was a rejection of the “self-interest” theories of Hobbes and Mandeville (see Gill 2006: ch. 11). Famously, Hobbes and Mandeville placed the foundation of morality on the individual self-interest of every moral agent. Now, Hutcheson thinks that a crass reduction of morality to self-interest is thoroughly untenable—else we would assign moral properties to “a fruitful Field, or commodious Habitation” (Inquiry, 89).

However—as Hutcheson clearly understands—the reduction morality to self-interest proposed by the self-interest theorists is clearly more sophisticated than this. To see this, consider the argument connecting morality and self-interest from Hobbes. Hobbes begins with a psychological claim. According to Hobbes, humans are motivated by their own good. (Note that this is something of an oversimplification. Hobbes believes that individuals are motivated by whatever they in fact desire—but that their desires constitute the nature of their good; Leviathan, VI, IX.) This leads them into conflict, as each person desires greater power to satisfy their desires, which inevitably interferes with the desires of others. The result is violence, and “the life of man, solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short” (Leviathan, XIII). Notice, however, that Hobbes thinks that these tendencies in people—their tendencies toward self-interest and self-preservation, resulting in violence—are not themselves morally problematic. He writes:

The desires, and other passions of man, are in themselves no sin. No more are the actions, that proceed from those passions, till they know a law that forbids them: which till laws be made they cannot know: nor any law be made, till they have agreed upon the person that shall make it. (Leviathan, XIII)

Hobbes thus seems to think that moral normativity has an essential connection to the motivations of agents. But because the motivations of agents are fundamentally self-directed, moral normativity cannot extend beyond what is in the fundamental interest of agents.

Hobbes, then, develops his self-interest theory by means of two premises. The first, psychological, premise is that human motivation is essentially self-directed. The second, normative, premise is that moral obligation is determined simply given what agents will be motivated to do.

Hutcheson concentrates his attack on the first premise of this argument (see Bishop 1996). According to Hutcheson, we are not simply guided by our self-interest, but possess a form of “disinterested benevolence” toward others. His most striking example of this comes from the following thought experiment:

To make this yet clearer, suppose that the Deity should declare to a good Man that he should be suddenly annihilated, but at the Instant of his Exit it should be left to his Choice whether his Friend, his Children, or his Country should be made happy or miserable for the Future, when he himself could have no Sense of either Pleasure or Pain from their State. Pray would he be any more indifferent about their State now, that he neither hoped or feared any thing to himself from it, than he was in any prior Period of his Life? Nay, is it not a pretty common Opinion among us, that after our Decease we know nothing of what befalls those who survive us? How comes it then that we do not lose, at the Approach of Death, all Concern for our Families, Friends, or Country? Can there be any Instance given of our desiring any Thing only as the Means of private Good, as violently when we know that we shall not enjoy this Good many Minutes, as if we expected the Possession of this good for many Years? (Inquiry, 228n33)

Insofar as our self-interest is not affected by what happens after our death, at least according to Hutcheson, it seems strange to say that individuals are concerned only for their self-interest. After all, we appear to be concerned not just with ourselves, but with, e.g., our children, friends, and compatriots. (Note also that Hutcheson uses a very similar argument against Hume’s reliance on the motivational significance of sympathy. See System, 48–49.)

Now, as Hutcheson argues here, we may have a certain form of partial benevolence toward others. But Hutcheson also argues that we in fact maintain “a universal Determination to Benevolence in Mankind, even toward the most distant parts of the Species” (Inquiry, 147; Essay, 34). He writes:

Every one at present rejoices in the Destruction of Pirates; and yet let us suppose a Band of such Villains cast upon some desolate Island, and that we were assur’d some Fate would confine them there perpetually, so that they should disturb Mankind no more. Now let us calmly reflect that these Persons are capable of Knowledge and Counsel, may be happy, and joyful…[L]et us ask ourselves, when Self-Love or regard to the Safety of better Men, no longer makes us desire their Destruction…whether we would wish them the Fate of Cadmus’s Army, by plunging their Swords in each others Breast…or rather that they should recover the ordinary Affections of Men, become Kind, Compassionate, and Friendly…and form an honest happy Society, with Marriages, and Relations dear, and all the Charities of Father, Son, and Brother—I fancy the latter would be the Wish of every Mortal. (Inquiry, 105–106)

Furthermore, it is crucial for Hutcheson that motivations of self-interest should play no role in the esteem of actions as virtuous. And hence According to Hutcheson, our moral sense approves only actions motivated by benevolence, not self-interest:

If we examine all the Actions which are counted amiable any where, and enquire into the Grounds upon which they are approv’d, we shall find, that in the Opinion of the Person who approves them, they always appear as Benevolent, or flowing from Love of others, and a Study of their Happiness, whether the Approver be one of the Persons belov’d, or profited, or not; so that all those kind Affections which incline us to make others happy, and all Actions suppos’d to flow from such Affections, appear morally Good, if while they are benevolent toward some Persons, they be not pernicious to others. (Inquiry, 116)

Indeed, for Hutcheson,

the Perfection of Virtue consists in ‘having the universal calm Benevolence, the prevalent Affection of the Mind, so as to limit and counteract not only the selfish Passions, but even the particular kind Affections. (Essay, 8)

Indeed, even if a particular action is beneficent in its effects—that is, it benefits other people to some extent or other—Hutcheson holds that such an action cannot be esteemed as virtuous if we presume that the action was motivated by self-interest:

Nor shall we find any thing amiable in any Action whatsoever, where there is no Benevolence imagin’d; nor in any Disposition, or Capacity, which is not suppos’d applicable to, and design’d for benevolent Purposes. Nay, as was before observ’d, the Actions which in fact are exceedingly useful, shall appear void of moral Beauty, if we know they proceeded from no kind Intentions toward others; and yet an unsuccessful Attempt of Kindness, or of promoting publick Good, shall appear as amiable as the most successful, if it flow’d from as strong Benevolence. (Inquiry, 116)

2.2 Virtue and Utility

Hutcheson is often recognized as an early figure in the development of contemporary utilitarianism. Indeed, it was Hutcheson who first used the phrase, in identifying the nature of moral goodness, that acts should promote “the greatest happiness for the greatest number”. He writes, in the Inquiry, that

that Action is best, which procures the greatest Happiness for the greatest Numbers; and that, worst, which, in like manner, occasions Misery. (Inquiry, 125)

But is Hutcheson really a utilitarian? And if so, what sort of utilitarian is he?

To begin, there are passages in Hutcheson that sound quite utilitarian, indeed. In the early editions of the Inquiry, Hutcheson suggests a quasi-mathematical principle by which to

compute the Morality of any Actions, with all their Circumstances, when we judge of the Actions done by our selves, or by others. (Inquiry, 128)

He holds that

The moral Importance of any Agent, or the Quantity of publick Good produced by him, is in a compound Ratio of his Benevolence and Abilitys: or (by substituting the Letters for the Words, as M = Moment of Good, and μ = Moment of Evil) M = B × A. (Inquiry, 128)

Deriving, then, that a person’s benevolence is determined by M/A, Hutcheson declares that

must be the Perfection of Virtue where M = A, or when the Being acts to the utmost of his Power for the public Good. (Inquiry, 130)

(It should be noted that the fourth edition of the Inquiry refrains from this technical language, but the general idea remains the same. See Inquiry, 234n56.)

Now this sounds as if Hutcheson is espousing a relatively straightforward utilitarianism. After all, the morality of an action is determined, on this view, by whether or not an agent produces the greatest “publick Good” he or she can. In addition, “Publick Good”, here, is understood by Hutcheson to mean the “natural Good of Mankind” (Inquiry, 91) where “natural good” (more on this later) is understood to mean a person’s happiness, defined in hedonistic terms (Inquiry, 86; Essay, 87). Putting this all together, we get a standard, run-of-the-mill, hedonistic utilitarianism.

However, there are major deviations from a straightforward utilitarianism as we might understand it from, e.g., Bentham or Sidgwick (see Albee 1896: 32–35). First, Hutcheson appears to offer us something like a scalar utilitarianism. On a scalar view, there is no absolute rightness or wrongness, but rather degrees of rightness or wrongness that an action may display (see Norcross 2020). And while Hutcheson does discuss the notion of “perfect virtue”—achieved when the good one has the ability to do is equal to the good one does—he admits that there will be degrees of virtue (which simply follows given his mathematical calculations), and does not describe the perfection of virtue as any sort of absolute obligation (see Darwall 1997: 87–88). (Indeed, this point is essential to his critique of Wollaston, §1.4.)

Second, Hutcheson clearly intends his moral “calculation” to refer, at least in part, to the motivation of a given action. Only actions motivated by benevolence will be perfectly virtuous. If one is motivated by self-interest, or has a mixed motivation, the extent to which the action was motivated by self-interest will be deducted from the overall moral character of an action:

when the Moment of Good, in an Action partly intended for the Good of the Agent, is but equal to the Moment of Good in the Action of another Agent, influenc’d only by Benevolence, the former is less virtuous; and in this Case the Interest must be deducted to find he true Effect of the Benevolence. (Inquiry, 129)

So Hutcheson clearly means to hold that any “publick good” that is to be credited to the moral quality of an act must be intended.

Third, Hutcheson holds that the consequences of a particular act will have no bearing on its moral quality not just if it is not intended, but also if it is not foreseen:

It is true indeed, that that publick Evil which I neither certainly foresee, nor have actual Presumptions of, as the Consequence of my Action, does not make my present Action Criminal, or Odious; even altho I might have foreseen this Evil by a serious Examination of my own Actions; because such actions do not, at present, evidence either Malice, or want of Benevolence…In like manner, no good Effect which I did not actually foresee and intend, makes my Action morally Good. (Inquiry, 131).

The second and third deviations from a standard utilitarianism might be expected given his affirmed belief that the motivation of virtuous actors is paramount in understanding the virtue of their action. As already noted, Hutcheson holds that the moral sense approves actions insofar as they are motivated by disinterested benevolence. Thus far one might state his version of utilitarianism as a kind of scalar motivational utilitarianism (which we should think of as clearly distinct from a “motive” utilitarianism (see Adams 1976), according to which morally appropriate actions are motivated by dispositions the possession of which leads to the best consequences), according to which an act is virtuous insofar as the agent aims at the greatest overall good.

But there is one interesting twist that is briefly suggested by Hutcheson that is also worth mentioning. Hutcheson holds that the perfectly benevolent, and hence perfectly virtuous, agent will aim at the greatest public good they can achieve. But the “publick good” here should not be understood as a straightforward aggregate of happiness across persons. In describing his understanding of public good, Hutcheson says this:

In comparing the moral Qualitys of Actions, in order to regulate our Election among various Actions propos’d, or to find which of them has the greatest moral Excellency, we are led by our moral Sense of Virtue to judge thus; that in equal Degrees of Happiness, expected to proceed from the Action, the Virtue is in proportion to the Number of Persons to whom the Happiness shall extend; (and here the Dignity, or moral Importance of Persons, may compensate Numbers) and in equal Numbers, the Virtue is as the Quantity of the Happiness, or natural Good; or that the Virtue is in a compound Ratio of the Quantity of Good, and Number of Enjoyers…Again, when the Consequences of Actions are of a mix’d Nature, partly Advantageous, and partly Pernicious; that Action is good, whose good Effects preponderate the evil, by being useful to many, and pernicious to few; and that, evil, which is otherwise. Here also the moral Importance of Characters, or Dignity of Persons may compensate Numbers; as may also the Degrees of Happiness or Misery: for to procure an inconsiderable Good to many, but an immense Evil to few, may be Evil; and an immense Good to few, may preponderate a small Evil to many. (Inquiry, 125)

Two things are worth noting here. First, and less interestingly, the phrase “compound Ratio of the Quantity of Good, and Number of Enjoyers” suggests that Hutcheson is inclined toward a form of average utilitarianism, rather than total utilitarianism (see Smart & Williams 1974: 27–28; Parfit 1984: 420–421). Furthermore, and compatible with this form of average utilitarianism, Hutcheson holds that small benefits spread over many persons need not compensate for massive evils subjected to few, and that small evils spread over many may be a price worth paying for large benefits for a small number. All this is compatible with standard forms of utilitarian aggregation.

But, more interestingly, Hutcheson suggests that the “Dignity, or moral Importance of Persons, may compensate Numbers”. How to understand this passage? One might interpret it as a proto version of a view according to which the moral virtue of individuals is intrinsically significant, the happiness of two people, one of whom is virtuous, the other vicious, are not of equal value. (One might compare this to a form of “luckism” as advocated by, e.g., Richard Arneson [2004].) But Hutcheson explicitly denies this reading one paragraph earlier. He writes:

The moral Beauty, or Deformity of Actions, is not alter’d by the moral Qualitys of the Objects, any further than the Qualitys of the Objects increase or diminish the Benevolence of the Action, or the publick Good intended by it. Thus Benevolence toward the worst Characters, or the Study of their Good, may be as amiable as any whatsoever; yea often more so than that toward the Good, since it argues such a strong Degree of Benevolence as can surmount the greatest Obstacle, the moral Evil in the Object. (Inquiry, 124)

For Hutcheson, any “compensation” the moral worth of individuals is allowed in comparison to numbers must be understood to be pragmatic:

Yet when our Benevolence to the Evil, encourages them in their bad Intentions, or makes them more capable of Mischief; this diminishes or destroyes the Beauty of the Action, or even makes it evil, as it betrays a Neglect of the Good of others more valuable. (Inquiry, 124)

In addition, in the System, Hutcheson holds that it is more important to benefit friends, family, and people “of eminent virtue” in comparison to strangers, but notice that only when all other circumstances are equal is one permitted to favor such individuals (see System, 247–8).

But this is puzzling. It would appear that any attention we pay to the moral worth of the objects of our beneficence is simply given the general consequences such beneficence may produce. And hence it would appear that the “moral Importance of Persons” is not actually “compensating” numbers at all. Rather, the moral importance of persons is or perhaps could be an important causal factor in the overall production of happiness or the overall distribution of happiness, but is not itself a compensatory axiological variable. But this is also puzzling, insofar as Hutcheson seems to treat the moral importance of persons as such a variable twice. At this point Hutcheson’s embrace, or lack thereof, of luckism must be left as an interpretive puzzle.

2.3 Virtue, Happiness, and Hedonism

The first sentence of Hutcheson’s System of Moral Philosophy runs this way:

The intention of moral philosophy is to direct men to that course of action which tends most effectually to promote their greatest happiness and perfection; as far as it can be done by observations and conclusions discoverable from the constitution of nature, without aids of supernatural revelation. (System, 1)

Put another way, Hutcheson holds that his aim in discussing the very nature of virtue, benevolence, and the moral sense, is to persuade people to act in such a way as to develop “their greatest happiness and perfection” (see Heydt 2009). And to this end, it is important to note that Hutcheson steadfastly maintains that virtuous behavior is in the interest of the virtuous. Of course, given that Hutcheson holds that behavior is virtuous insofar as it is motivated by benevolence and not self-interest, it is impossible (on Hutcheson’s view) to pursue one’s self-interest through virtuous behavior. To be motivated by self-love diminishes, to that extent, the virtue of one’s action.

But it is nevertheless the case, for Hutcheson, that virtue is in one’s self-interest. Notice, however, that Hutcheson’s argument for this claim is not straightforward. As has already been indicated, Hutcheson is a hedonist:

Because we shall afterwards frequently use the Words Interest, Advantage, natural Good, it is necessary here to fix their Ideas. The Pleasure in our sensible Perceptions of any kind, gives us our first Idea of natural Good, or Happiness; and then all Objects which are apt to excite this Pleasure are call’d immediately Good…Our Sense of Pleasure is antecedent to Advantage or Interest, and is the Foundation of it. (Inquiry, 86)

But how could it be that a hedonist, of all things, believes that benevolent acts—acts that are motivated for the good of others—are always in our self-interest? Surely such acts can involve sacrifice of our own pleasure, as when a father dutifully endures the painful duration of “Rudolph the Red-Nosed Reindeer: the Live Musical!” for the sake of his daughter’s delight in watching it.

The simple story, to be complicated shortly, runs this way. Hutcheson holds that the moral sense is a greater repository of pleasure than the other senses. He says, in many places, that the operation of the moral sense provides more pleasure than the operation of the other senses, internal and external. Hutcheson states, in the Inquiry, that the moral sense “gives us more Pleasure and Pain that all our other Facultys” (Inquiry, 163). In the Essay, Hutcheson writes:

Our moral Sense thus regulated, and constantly followed in our Actions, may be the most constant Source of the most stable Pleasure. (Essay, 126)

Hutcheson offers a number of arguments for this, generally appealing to our own intuitions about the nature of happiness:

Now should we imagine a rational Creature in a sufficiently happy State, though his Mind was, without interruption, wholly occupy’d with pleasant Sensations of Smell, Taste, Touch, &c., if at the same time all other Ideas were excluded? Should we not thing the State low, mean and sordid, if there were no Society, no Love or Friendship, no good Offices? (Inquiry, 163)

So much for the external senses. But he goes on:

Would we ever wish to be in the same Condition with a wrathful, malicious, revengeful, or envious Being, tho we were at the same time to enjoy all the Pleasures of the external and internal senses?…What Castle-builder, who forms to himself imaginary Scenes of Life, in which he thinks he should be happy, ever made acknowledg’d Treachery, Cruelty, or Ingratitude, the Steps by which he mounted to his wish’d for Elevation, or Parts of his Character, when he had attain’d it? We always conduct our selves in such Reveries, according to the Dictates of Honour, Faith, Generosity, Courage…. (Inquiry, 163–4)

Now, this is fine as far as it goes. But notice that Hutcheson does not explain why it should be that, e.g., our Castle-building friends tend to imagine that they are virtuous rather than vicious. And why should it be that in every case, the virtuous are better-off than the vicious?

A key mechanism here is the notion of a “reflex Act”. Lord Shaftesbury—borrowing Locke’s notion of “reflection”—introduces the idea this way (see Baier & Luntley 1995):

In a Creature capable of forming general Notions of Things, not only the outward Beings which offer themselves to the Sense, are the Objects of the Affection; but the very Actions themselves, and the Affections of Pity, Kindness, Gratitude, and their Contrarys, being brought into the Mind by Reflection, become Objects. So that, by means of this reflected Sense, there arises another kind of Affection towards those very Affections themselves, which have been already felt, and are now become the subject of new Liking or Dislike. (Shaftesbury 1711, v. 2, 16)

For Hutcheson, while we do not immediately receive pleasure from our own virtuous actions, we nevertheless can take the part of a spectator to ourselves. When we do this, our virtuous actions will trigger our moral sense, itself—as Hutcheson is insistent upon—the fount of the most valuable pleasures. (Hutcheson details this in the “D” (i.e., final, 1738) edition of the Inquiry.) He writes:

every Spectator is persuaded that the reflex Acts of the virtuous Agent upon his own Temper will give him the highest pleasures. (Inquiry, 217n47)

Again, this is fine as far as it goes. But we may still wonder why it is that such “reflex Acts”, even if engaging the moral sense, necessarily produce the “highest pleasures?” And what is exactly meant by such a phrase?

One solution to this puzzle, opted for by some commentators, holds that Hutcheson is a kind of qualitative hedonist—a view according to which some pleasures are of higher quality, and therefore more valuable, pleasurableness held equal (Edwards 1979: 30; Riley 2008: 275; Strasser 1987: 518; Crisp 2020: 124). And there are some very tantalizing passages that suggest just this:

As to pleasures of the same kind, ’tis manifest their values are in a joint proportion of their intenseness and duration. In estimating the duration, we not only regard the constancy of the object, or its remaining in our power, and the duration of the sensations it affords, but the constancy of our fancy or relish: for when this changes it puts an end to the enjoyment. In comparing pleasures of different kinds, the value is as the duration and dignity of the kind jointly. We have an immediate sense of a dignity, a perfection, or beatifick quality in some kinds, which no intenseness of the lower kinds can equal, were they also as lasting as we could wish. No intenseness or duration of any external sensation gives it a dignity or worth equal to that of the improvement of the soul by knowledge, or the ingenious arts; and much less is it equal to that of virtuous affections and actions. (System, 117)

Here it would seem that Hutcheson’s justification for treating virtuous conduct as in the interest of the virtuous is as plain as day. In conducting our “reflex Acts” concerning our own virtuous conduct, we trigger our “virtuous affections”, which themselves have a “worth” that no intenseness or duration of any external sensation could match. If we interpret Hutcheson as a qualitative hedonist, the explanation of the benefits one maintains as a result of virtue are straightforward.

What is less straightforward is whether or not Hutcheson genuinely is this form of qualitative hedonist. And there is very good reason to doubt it. (Much more detailed argument for this point is available in Dorsey 2010.) Nowhere in this passage is the “dignity” of a pleasure thought an axiologically significant variable. In the Essay, Hutcheson writes explicitly that:

The Value of any Pleasure, and the Quantity or Moment of any Pain, is in a compounded proportion of the Intenseness and Duration. (Essay, 87)

In the Inquiry, he seems especially clear that the superiority of the moral sense is quantitative rather than qualitative: it produces “more” pleasure than our other senses (Inquiry, 162). Furthermore, while the System passage cited above is extremely suggestive when it comes to interpreting Hutcheson as a qualitative hedonist, a mere chapter earlier in the System he seems to commit to a straightforward quantitative hedonism:

supreme happiness must consist in the most constant enjoyment of the most intense and durable pleasures. (System, 100)

On a quantitative reading of Hutcheson’s hedonism, rather than being an axiological guarantee that the pleasures of the moral sense are more valuable, it is simply a matter of psychological fact that human beings take more intense and durable pleasures from the moral sense, sufficient to override whatever joys may be taken in the low road.


A. Primary Literature

  • [Inquiry] [A] 1725 , An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue, London; second edition [B] 1726, London; third edition [C] 1729, London; fourth edition [D] 1738, London. Page numbers are from the 2004 edition, Wolfgang Leidhold (ed.), An Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund. [Inquiry 1726 [2004] available online]
  • [Essay] 1728, An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions, with Illustrations on the Moral Sense, London; second edition 1730, London; third edition 1742, London. Page numbers are from the 2002, Aaron Garret (ed.), An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections, with Illustrations on the Moral Sense, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund. [Essay 1742 [2002] available online]
  • 1730, De naturali hominum socialitate , inaugural lecture as Professor of Moral Theology, Glasgow. Translated as On the Natural Sociability of Mankind in Hutcheson 2006: 189–216.
  • 1742, Philosophiae Moralis Institutio Compendiaria. Translated as A Short Introduction to Moral Philosophy, 1747.
  • 1742, Synopsis metaphysicae, Glasgow; second edition 1744; third edition 1749. Second edition translated as A Synopsis of Metaphysics in Hutcheson 2006: 57–188.
  • [System] 1755, A System of Moral Philosophy, three volumes, London. Page numbers are from the 2005 edition, Daniel Carey (ed.), A System of Moral Philosophy, two volumes, London: Continuum Publishing.
  • 1756, Logicae Compendium, Glasgow; translated as A Compend of Logic in Hutcheson 2006: 1–56.
  • 2006, Logic, Metaphysics, and the Natural Sociability of Mankind, Michael Silverthorne (trans.), James Moore and Michael Silverthorne (eds), Indianapolis, IN: Liberty Fund, 2006. [Hutcheson 2006 available online]

Note that there is not currently scholarly agreement on the methods by which to cite Hutcheson’s text. To eliminate confusion, then, I have simply cited the pagination of the editions here. While the Inquiry and Essay’s pagination is not original, the editions cited here are the most readily available and comprehensive critical edition of his works. Insofar as there is no critical edition of the System, the pagination of the 2005 text is identical to the original.

B. Secondary Literature

  • Albee, Ernest, 1896, “The Relation of Shaftesbury and Hutcheson to Utilitarianism”, The Philosophical Review, 5(1): 24–35. doi:10.2307/2176103
  • Adams, Robert Merrihew, 1976, “Motive Utilitarianism”:, Journal of Philosophy, 73(14): 467–481. doi:10.2307/2025783
  • Arneson, Richard J., 2004, “Luck Egalitarianism Interpretated and Defended”:, Philosophical Topics, 32(1): 1–20. doi:10.5840/philtopics2004321/217
  • Baier, Annette C. and Michael Luntley, 1995, “Moral Sentiments, and the Difference They Make”, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 69: 15–46. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/69.1.15
  • Balguy, John, 1728, The Foundation of Moral Goodness, London: John Pemberton; excerpted in [BM] = Raphael 1969 [1991: vol. 1, 389–408]. Page numbers in the text are to the 1991 edition.
  • Bishop, John D., 1996, “Moral Motivation and the Development of Francis Hutcheson’s Philosophy”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 57(2): 277–295. doi:10.1353/jhi.1996.0013
  • Carey, Daniel, 2005, “Introduction” to A System of Moral Philosophy, by Francis Hutcheson, London: Continuum Publishing, v–vii.
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Other Internet Resources


Large thanks are due to Si-won Song for invaluable research assistance. I would also like to thank Mark Timmons for asking me to write this entry.

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Dale Dorsey <>

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