Foundationalist Theories of Epistemic Justification

First published Mon Feb 21, 2000; substantive revision Fri Aug 5, 2022

Foundationalism is a view about the structure of (epistemic) justification or knowledge. The foundationalist’s thesis in short is that (a) there are some “basic” or “foundational” beliefs that have a positive epistemic status—e.g., they count as justified or as knowledge—without depending on any other beliefs for this status, and (b) any other beliefs with a positive epistemic status must depend, ultimately, on foundational beliefs for this status.

Many interesting and difficult questions can be raised about the relation between justification and knowledge, including whether knowledge should be analyzed in terms of justification, as epistemologists traditionally seem to have thought, or whether knowledge is prior to or independent of justification.[1] In what follows we will concentrate on foundationalism about justification, though much of what we say also applies to foundationalism about knowledge.

A little reflection suggests that the vast majority of the propositions that we know or are justified in believing have that status only because we know or are justified in believing other propositions. So, for example, I am justified in believing that there is at least one dog in our neighborhood, because I am justified in believing that my next door neighbor has a dog; I am justified in believing that our garbage will get picked up tomorrow, because I am justified in believing that tomorrow is Tuesday and that our garbage gets picked up every Tuesday; and I am justified in believing that there is going to be at least some rain in the next week, because I am justified in believing that the forecast calls for a good deal of rain, and that forecasts are almost always right when it comes to similar short-term forecasts in this area. And the dependence seems to be inferential in nature: in each case, I am justified in believing the former only because I have inferred it, or at least am able to infer it, from the latter. Foundationalists about justification want to contrast my foundationally justified belief (knowledge) with a kind of justified belief (knowledge) that doesn’t involve the having of other justified beliefs (knowledge). There is no standard terminology for what we shall henceforth refer to as foundational justification (knowledge).[2]

We just noted that the epistemic dependence of one belief on another in the above examples seems to be a kind of inferential dependence. Epistemologists do tend to assume that all epistemic dependence between beliefs is inferential. But perhaps not all relations of epistemic or justificatory dependence between beliefs are inferential. When I form an introspective belief about a conscious or occurrent belief of mine -- e.g., my belief that I believe it’s raining outside -- perhaps (on some views) my second-order belief’s justification depends on my having the conscious belief that it is raining. Many would take such introspective beliefs to be “foundational”, akin to my justification for beliefs about my own present experiences. One way to make sense of this is that even if such beliefs depend for their justification on the first-order beliefs, they are foundational in the sense of not depending positively on the epistemic or justificatory status of other beliefs. (Notice that my belief that I believe that it is raining outside doesn’t depend for its justification on whether I’m justified in believing that it’s raining outside.) This suggests that we understand foundational beliefs as those that do not depend on the epistemic status of other beliefs, and non-foundational beliefs as beliefs that do so depend. And if we think that any dependence of a belief on the epistemic status of another belief must be inferential, we get the neat result that foundational beliefs do not, but non-foundational beliefs do, depend for their justification on inferential relations to other beliefs. But is it possible for a belief to depend on the epistemic status of other beliefs, but in a non-inferential way? We will briefly illustrate how some accounts might accept the possibility of non-inferential epistemic dependence between beliefs further below, when we discuss coherentism and reliabilism. However, aside from such cases, we will treat “foundational/nonfoundational” justification and the “noninferential/inferential” justification as interchangeable.

Epistemologists commonly distinguish between doxastic and propositional justification. Very roughly, one has propositional justification when one has justification (e.g., some reason or evidence) for belief in a proposition. One has doxastic justification when one not only has justification to believe a proposition but also believes the proposition and believes it on the basis of the justification one has. This distinction applies to foundational and non-foundational beliefs: being foundationally/non-foundationally justified in believing that P requires having some foundational/non-foundational justification for P, and believing that P on the basis of this justification. (While this is to understand doxastic justification in terms of propositional justification, some prefer to go the other way round, and understand having justification in terms of being in a position to acquire doxastic justification. For a helpful discussion, see Turri 2010.) For ease of exposition, much of our discussion is put in terms that most naturally refer to doxastic justification—e.g., “justified belief”, “being justified in believing”. However, even when we use such terms, we focus on propositional justification (which is required for doxastic justification) and assume that the other conditions involved in believing on a proper basis are satisfied. (For more on the basing requirement, see the entry on the epistemic basing relation.)

1. Regress Arguments for Foundationalism

A foundationally justified belief (henceforth simply: ‘foundational belief’) is one that does not depend on any other beliefs for its justification. According to foundationalism, any justified belief must either be foundational or depend for its justification, ultimately, on foundational beliefs. Historically, foundationalism was very widely, almost universally accepted. Aristotle argued that “not all knowledge is demonstrative” (i.e., not all knowledge is based on an argument from other things known), and that some knowledge must be “independent of demonstration” (Posterior Analytics, I.3). Many of the medieval philosophers seemed in agreement with Aristotle, holding that all knowledge must rest on “first principles” or “self-evident truths” of some sort. More recently, Descartes famously held that all knowledge must rest on a secure foundation of indubitable truths (see the entry on Descartes’s epistemology). Many other philosophers of the early modern period, including Locke, Leibniz, Berkeley, Hume, and Reid, all seemed to accept foundationalism as well, despite disagreeing about much else. When an argument was implicitly or explicitly offered for the view, it was most often some version of the now famous epistemic regress argument. (See Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics, I.3, for an early version of this argument.) Before presenting the argument we should discuss a principle it depends on.

Suppose I claim to be justified in believing that Fred will die shortly and offer as my evidence that Fred has an untreatable and serious form of cancer. Concerned, you ask me how I discovered that Fred has cancer, and I respond that it is just a hunch on my part. As soon as you become convinced (perhaps after further questioning) that I have no good reason to suppose that Fred has cancer, you will immediately conclude that my suspicion about Fred’s condition gives me no justification for believing that Fred will soon die. Generalizing, one might suggest the following principle:

To be justified in believing P on the basis of E one must be justified in believing E.

Now consider another example. Suppose I claim to be justified in believing that Fred will die shortly and offer as my justification that a certain line across his palm (his infamous “lifeline”) is short. Rightly skeptical, you wonder this time what reason I have for believing that palm lines have anything whatsoever to do with length of life. As soon as you become satisfied that I have no justification for supposing that there is any kind of probabilistic connection between the character of this line and Fred’s life, you will again reject my claim to have a justified belief about Fred’s impending demise. That suggests that we might expand our principle to include a second clause.

Principle of Inferential Justification (PIJ):
To be justified in believing P on the basis of E one must be (1) justified in believing E, and (2) justified in believing that E makes probable P.

One might note that in the palm reading example there actually is no significant, objective probability between the length of Fred’s so-called “life-line” and his life span. Perhaps this is why my belief that he is going to die soon is unjustified, and not that I don’t satisfy clause (2). Against this, the proponent of PIJ might ask us to consider an amendment to the case. Suppose that, surprisingly, it turns out that there is some objective, significant probabilistic connection between “life-lines” and the life spans of the individuals who have them, though again, suppose that I do not have any justification for believing that there is such a connection. This possibility seems coherent: the fact that the relevant objective probabilistic relation obtains is not sufficient for one to have justification for believing that it obtains. But then, intuitively, I remain unjustified in believing that Fred is going to die soon. Or consider the possibility that I believe Fred will die because he has just ingested a lot of hemlock, and when you ask me why I think hemlock would lead to death, I say that I’m not sure, that it is just a hunch on my part that it is going to kill him. Again, if I lack justification for believing that hemlock is a deadly poison, or that it is likely to have this effect, then intuitively, I lack justification for believing that Fred will die soon. What more, then, is needed? A natural though controversial suggestion is that one must satisfy something like clause (2).[3]

With the first clause of PIJ, one can present a relatively straightforward epistemic regress argument for foundationalism. That clause basically says that one cannot acquire justification for a belief by inferring it from an unjustified belief. It also seems that one cannot acquire justification for a belief by way of a circular, inferential justification—one cannot rely even in part on a proposition as a premise in an inference in support of that very proposition. We seem left with two options: allow that some beliefs have justification without depending on other beliefs, or suppose that all justification is inferential. If all justification is inferential, then for someone S to be justified in believing some proposition P, S must be in a position to legitimately infer it from some other proposition E1. But E1 could justify S in believing P only if S were justified in believing E1, and if all justification were inferential, S would have to infer it (or at least be able to infer it) from some other proposition justifiably believed, E2, a proposition which in turn would have to be inferred from some other proposition justifiably believed, E3, and so on, ad infinitum. But finite beings cannot complete an infinitely long chain of reasoning. And so, if all justification were inferential, no one could be justified in believing anything at all to any extent whatsoever.

This, however, is not yet an argument for foundationalism as much as an argument against what we might call “inferentialism”—the view that all justification is inferential—for it leaves open the skeptical position that we are not, and could not be, justified in believing anything at all, whether by inference or otherwise. This most radical of all skepticisms seems absurd (it entails that one couldn’t even be justified in believing it). But, strictly speaking, none of this shows that we have non-inferential justification for any of our beliefs, or even that non-inferential justification is possible. At best, it shows only that, if justification is possible, or if we are or could be justified in believing anything at all, then that justification must take a foundationalist structure. The epistemic regress argument for foundationalism thus needs an additional premise, though one that all but the most radical skeptics would accept: that epistemic justification is in principle possible for beings like us.

If we accept the more controversial second clause of PIJ, the looming regresses proliferate. Not only must S above be justified in believing E1, S must also be justified in believing that E1 makes likely P, a proposition he would have to infer (if there are no foundations) from some other proposition F1, which he would have to infer from F2, which he would have to infer from F3, and so on ad infinitum. But S would also need to be justified in believing that F1 does in fact make likely that E1 makes likely P, a proposition he would need to infer from some other proposition G1, which he would need to infer from some other proposition G2, and so on. And he would need to infer that G1 does indeed make likely that F1 makes likely that E1 makes likely P, and so on. Without noninferentially justified beliefs, it would seem that we would need to complete an infinite number of infinitely long chains of reasoning in order to be justified in believing anything!

PIJ is controversial, especially its second clause. It is important to note that either clause of the principle can be used by itself to generate the allegedly vicious regress for the philosopher who rejects foundations. It is the two clauses combined that are supposed to present the anti-foundationalist with an infinite number of vicious regresses. A number of philosophers (among them foundationalists) would argue that the second clause of PIJ confuses levels of epistemic questions. It is far too strong to require someone to have a justified belief in a probabilistic connection between available evidence and the conclusion reached on the basis of that evidence. Such a requirement is at best plausible for having second-level justification, justification for the epistemic belief that one has an inferentially justified belief. In responding to a challenge presented to one’s having an inferentially justified belief in P on the basis of E, one might find oneself searching for justification to support the claim that E makes probable P, but that is only because in the context of the challenge one is trying to support or justify the claim that one has a justified belief. A similar claim might be made with respect to clause (1) of the principle, although it is more difficult to generate the supporting intuition.

In any event, the careful foundationalist is certainly not confused about level-distinctions. The foundationalist who supports PIJ is claiming that a necessary condition for someone’s having an inferentially justified belief in P based on E is that the person have both a justified belief in E and a justified belief in the proposition that E makes P probable. It is simply not enough that E is true or that E does in fact make probable P. Our original examples used to support PIJ would seem to reinforce that conclusion. Even if there happened to be some bizarre connection between palm lines and length of life, for example, the person who has no reason to believe that such a connection exists has no justification for conclusions reached about length of life based on this anatomical feature of people. Similarly, even though there is in fact a connection between ingesting hemlock and dying, a person who had no reason to believe that ingesting hemlock would bring about death has no justification for believing that someone (who has just ingested hemlock) is about to die. Some have attempted to defend a weaker version of the principle, one that replaces the second clause of PIJ with the condition that the subject have some sort of non-doxastic awareness or appreciation of the connection--e.g., that one be acquainted with the connection or that it appear to one that the connection holds (e.g., Tucker 2012).

There are responses to the charge of vicious regress facing anti-foundationalists. One is to deny the premise that circular inferences are vicious or no good: granted, one can’t effectively convince someone who is skeptical of the truth of P that it is true by relying on an inference that ultimately comes back to P, but perhaps circular inferences can provide justification despite being dialectically ineffective (i.e., ineffective in persuading others). Still, it seems odd to say that one could justify P by use of an inference from P . After all, if P is already justified, the subject does not need to use it to justify P; and if it is not justified then, in line with the first clause of PIJ, one could not use it to justify P. More plausibly, the anti-foundationalist might reject the presupposition that all justification is linear or one-directional, that it flows from one belief to another, or is inherited by a belief from others. According to coherentism about epistemic justification, beliefs are justified “holistically” rather than in a linear, piecemeal way. Each belief is justified by virtue of its coherence with the rest of what one believes—in other words, by virtue of belonging to a coherent set or web of beliefs. The coherentist avoids the appearance of vicious circularity by insisting that one needn’t first have justification for believing the other propositions in one’s belief system. The coherence theorist’s response to the argument for foundationalism is, of course, only as plausible as the coherence theory of justification (see coherentist theories of epistemic justification).

Some forms of coherentism might complicate our taxonomy. According to some coherentists, a belief can depend for its justification on how well it “coheres” with the rest of one’s beliefs, and if this coherence is not understood in terms of actual or available inference, then they would allow for dependent but non-inferentially justified belief. Some beliefs may count as foundational in the sense of not depending on inference from other beliefs for justification, while still depending on other beliefs.

One other response is to embrace infinitism and hold that an infinite regress is not necessarily vicious or problematic. Infinitism has a few defenders (e.g., Peter Klein (1998) and more recently, Fantl (2003) and Aikin (2011)). The infinitist accepts the need to be able to supply non-circular justification for believing what we do, but argues that given the complexity of the human mind and its capacity to entertain and justifiably believe an infinite number of propositions, there is nothing vicious about the relevant regresses we face. There is no reason to suppose that we would be unable to justify every proposition we believe by appeal to some other different proposition which we justifiably believe. Infinitism is a view that should be seriously considered, particularly once one realizes that one not only can but arguably does have an infinite number of justified beliefs (e.g., that 2 is greater than 1, that 3 is greater that 1, and so on.). For some further discussion of infinitism and challenges to it, see Klein and Turri (2014).

Some don’t find the regress argument to be the best argument for the existence of foundational justification; as with any argument by elimination, it depends on whether the alternatives eliminated really are untenable. Pryor (2013b), for example, claims that the best argument comes from considering examples. I believe that I feel tired, that I have a headache, that I intend to get a glass of water, that black is not white; and in each case, it doesn’t seem that my justification is mediated by any other proposition. This supports the claim that there are foundational beliefs, though it does not speak directly to the thesis that all other beliefs must depend, ultimately, on foundational beliefs for their justification.

2. The Classical Analysis of Foundational Justification

Foundationalists are united in their conviction that there must be a kind of justification that does not depend on the having of justification for other beliefs. They nevertheless disagree radically among themselves as to how to understand foundational justification. In the latter part of the 20th century, the rise of externalist epistemologies has generated even more fundamentally different versions of foundationalism. It will not be possible to survey all of the strikingly different analyses or theories that have been offered of foundational justification. In what follows we will examine a few of the more prominent versions of classical and contemporary internalist and externalist foundationalism.

2.1 Foundational Justification as Infallible Belief

Descartes is often taken to be the paradigm of a classical foundationalist. Determined to build knowledge on appropriate and secure foundations, he seemed to want to identify foundational knowledge with infallible belief (though there is another interpretation that we’ll turn to in the next section, one that identifies foundational knowledge with infallible justification). Implicitly or explicitly, others seemed to follow his lead by restricting foundationally justified beliefs to beliefs that cannot be mistaken. Following Lehrer (1974: 81) we might formulate the following definition of infallible belief: S’s belief that P at t is infallible if S’s believing P at t entails[4] that P is true.

As Lehrer and others have pointed out, it is far from clear that this concept of infallible belief has much relevance to an attempt to understand the epistemic concept of foundational justification. The first and most striking problem involves necessary truths. Every necessary truth is entailed by every proposition, and thus if I happen to believe a necessary truth, P, that I believe P will entail that P is true. Thus, by the above definition my belief that P will be infallible--and so, on the present account, foundationally justified--whenever P is a necessary truth even if P is something exceedingly complicated that I can barely even comprehend.

Furthermore, a foundation of knowledge and justified belief restricted to infallible beliefs (as defined above) would arguably be far too thin to support any sort of substantial epistemic edifice. There are a few contingent propositions that are entailed by the fact that they are believed. My belief that I exist entails that I exist, that I have at least one belief, that someone has beliefs, etc. But once we get past these sorts of “self-referential” propositions, propositions whose very subject matter is encompassed by the fact that they are believed, it is hard to come up with uncontroversial examples of contingent infallible beliefs. Ayer (1956: 19) argues that as long as the belief that P is one state of affairs and P’s being the case is an entirely different state of affairs (not including as a constituent the former) there can be no logical absurdity in the supposition that the former could occur without the latter (see BonJour 1985: 27, for a similar argument).

2.2 Foundational Justification as Infallible Justification

It may be that classical foundationalists start off on the wrong foot if they seek foundations in logical relations between the mere fact that someone believes some proposition and the proposition’s being true. Foundational justification is, after all, a kind of justification, and if the impossibility of error is essential to foundational justification, it may be more plausible to locate the source of infallibility in a special kind of justification available in support of a belief. Let us say that S’s belief is infallibly justified at t when S’s ground or justification for believing P at t entails the truth of P—in other words, when S cannot have that ground or justification for believing that P while P is false. The suggestion, then, is that a belief is foundationally justified only if it is infallibly justified in this sense.

We still need to qualify the entailment in some way to circumvent the problem discussed earlier. Whenever I have any justification at all for believing a proposition that turns out to be necessarily true, that justification will entail the necessary truth. But we do not want just any sort of justification to yield infallibly justified belief, even if the object of that belief is a necessary truth. This problem is notoriously difficult to solve (see the entry on Certainty for more), but intuitively the solution should have something to do with the relation between the fact that would make true the proposition entailed and the fact that would make true the proposition that entails it. More specifically, we could say that P entails* Q only if the fact that would make P true is at least a constituent of the fact that would make Q true. This suggestion can be considered at best only preliminary since we will obviously need a more detailed account of facts and their constituents. That I have grey hair entails that someone has grey hair, but is my having grey hair a constituent of the fact that is someone’s having grey hair? There is certainly a sense in which it is something one can point to in answer to the question “What makes it true that someone has grey hair?” One cannot appropriately point to my having grey hair as something that makes it true that two plus two equals four. With some such relation in place, perhaps we can appropriately restrict the class of necessary truths we can be infallibly justified in believing, and still allow contingent truths to be infallibly justified: there is a sense in which one can “point” to one’s own experience when asked, “What makes it true that you are in pain?”

Consider again my belief that I’m in pain (when I am). If such a belief is foundationally justified, in what does the justification for that belief consist? What is it that distinguishes this belief from my belief about, say, whether it will rain next week? Some foundationalists want to locate the foundational justification in the truth-maker for the proposition believed. What justifies me in believing that I’m in pain when I am is the mere fact that I’m in pain. But again, what is it about my being in pain as opposed to its raining next week which makes it appropriate to claim that my being in pain justifies me in believing that I’m in pain while its raining next week doesn’t justify me in believing that it will rain next week?

It is tempting to think that the foundationalist is better off appealing to some special relation that I have to my pain which makes it unnecessary to look to other beliefs in order to justify my belief that I’m in pain. It is the fact that I have a kind of access to my pain that no one else has that makes my belief foundationally justified while others must rely on inference in order to discover that I am in this state. This takes us to another classical version of foundationalism, the acquaintance theory. Perhaps the best known proponent of an acquaintance theory is Bertrand Russell (1910–11, 1913; for more on the acquaintance theory, see entry on knowledge by acquaintance vs. description). But it takes little imagination to read the view into most of the British empiricists. Roughly the view is that what justifies S in believing that he is in pain is the fact that S is acquainted with his pain in a way in which he is not acquainted with any contingent facts about other people, the physical world, the future, and so on. Russell (1910–11) characterizes acquaintance as a relation of direct or immediate awareness, a relation in which, as he and some others have put it, something is “presented” or simply “given” to the subject (Lewis 1929 and 1946; Moser 1989: 80ff.; Fales 1996).

Some doubt that acquaintance with some fact is sufficient, on its own, to justify belief in a corresponding proposition. To help see the motivation for this, consider inferential beliefs again. A justified belief that P cannot provide justification for believing every other proposition it entails, for it might be that the entailment relation is beyond one’s cognitive grasp, or the inference is not something one has made or is even able to make. (As already discussed in section 1, reflection on such cases might lead us to accept the second clause of PIJ.) Similarly, some acquaintance theorists argue that acquaintance with some fact cannot provide justification for a belief in the absence of an awareness of (or at least an ability to become aware of) the relevance of the fact to the truth of the proposition believed. For example, I may be acquainted with a very specific color or shape in my visual field, and also believe (correctly) that I am experiencing such-and-such a color or shape, but I might actually be really bad at identifying such specific features and my belief might be little more than a lucky guess. Suppose these theorists also accept a correspondence conception of truth according to which, roughly, a proposition is true just in case it corresponds to the facts or to the way the world is; they might add that to be fully justified in believing a proposition to be true one must be acquainted not only with the fact that makes the proposition true but also with the relation of correspondence that holds between the proposition and the fact. For example, in order to be justified in believing that I am experiencing fuchsia, I must be acquainted with (or at least be able to become acquainted with) the “match”, “fit”, or correspondence between my thought or belief that I am experiencing fuchsia and the fact that I am experiencing fuchsia.[5]

When acquaintance with the fact that P is part of what constitutes my foundational justification for believing P, there is a trivial sense in which my foundational justification is infallible. I can’t be directly acquainted with the fact that P while I believe P falsely. However, most contemporary foundationalists are fallibilists about foundational justification: they hold that one could be foundationally justified in believing propositions that are false. It seems plausible that I could be justified in believing, for example, that I am experiencing a mild pain when in fact I am experiencing an itch, or that I could be justified in believing I am experiencing a specific shade of color when I am in fact experiencing a slightly different shade. Even some acquaintance theorists want to allow for some fallible foundations. For example, Fumerton (1995) holds that one can be noninferentially justified in believing P by virtue of being directly acquainted with a fact very similar to, but ultimately different from, the fact that P (the fact that makes P true). Such an acquaintance theory could allow for the possibility of a foundationally justified but false belief that P. Huemer (2007), Poston (2010), and Tucker (2016) argue, however, that classical foundationalists have difficulty accommodating fallible foundational beliefs. For some replies, see Fumerton (2010 and 2016), and Hasan (2013).

Not all classical foundationalists require acquaintance with the correspondence (or some other similar relation) between some thought or proposition and a distinct fact for one to have knowledge by acquaintance. For example, according to McGrew (1995, 1998), for any object of acquaintance or direct awareness it is possible to form a belief in which a demonstrative concept refers directly to it. By virtue of my acquaintance with a painful experience, I can believe directly of it that it exists, or that the property demonstrated, painfulness, is instantiated. We could express the belief roughly by saying “I am experiencing this.” For this kind of belief (unlike most other beliefs regarding contingent facts), to genuinely understand or grasp the content of the belief is to grasp its truth. Such demonstratively formed beliefs are guaranteed to be true:

For what this belief amounts to is that one has a certain experience; and a necessary condition for the formation of the belief itself is that one be having just that experience. (McGrew 1995: 90)

Rather than attempt to accommodate fallible foundations, McGrew follows early classical foundationalists in arguing that infallibility or infallible justification (what he calls “incorrigibility”) is in fact required for foundational justification. Some worry, however, that such foundations, even if they are generally available, are too “thin”: that I am “experiencing this” doesn’t seem to convey anything about what sort of experience I am having, and it is difficult to see how we could get from here to justified beliefs that involve categorizing or conceptualizing our experiences in more informative ways (see, e.g., Sosa 2003).

3. Objections to Classical Foundationalism

Once the received view, classical foundationalism has come under considerable attack in the last few decades. Here we will consider the most prominent objections that target the classical view of foundational beliefs. (For some more objections and discussion, see entry on knowledge by acquaintance vs. description.)

3.1 Regress Problems for Access Internalism

Laurence BonJour (1985: ch. 4) raised a highly influential objection to foundationalism (an objection raised before he joined the ranks of foundationalists). The objection presupposed a strong form of what we might call access internalism. (We discuss the internalist/externalist controversy in more detail in section 6 below.) The access internalist argues, roughly, that a feature of a belief or epistemic situation that makes a belief foundationally justified for us must be a feature to which we have actual or potential access. Moreover, we must have access to the fact that the feature in question is relevant to the truth or probability of what we believe. Suppose some foundationalist offers an account according to which a belief B is foundationally justified only if it has some characteristic X. BonJour argues that the mere fact that the belief has X could not justify the believer in holding B. The believer would also need access to the fact that B has X and that beliefs of this sort are likely to be true. But according to the strong access requirement BonJour accepts, this requires actual or potential knowledge or justified belief that B has X and that beliefs of this sort are likely to be true. So B would need other justified beliefs for its justification. B’s status as a foundationally justified belief is destroyed.

BonJour presented the objection on the way to developing a coherence theory of empirical justification. But it ultimately became obvious that the objection to foundationalism was too strong. Given the structure of the argument it should become evident that the coherence theory (and any other theory) would be equally vulnerable to the argument. Just replace “X” with some complicated description of beliefs cohering with each other. Coherence of one’s beliefs would never be sufficient for justification, for one would have to already be justified in believing that one’s beliefs were coherent and that such coherence makes one’s beliefs likely to be true. That might suggest to the classical foundationalist that strong access internalism is a view to be avoided.

Michael Bergmann (2006: chs. 1 and 2) argues, however, that if to avoid regress we drop the strong access requirements that are so dear to some internalists, we also lose the motivation for the view. As Bergmann sees it, the attraction of internalism is its claim to be able to construe justification in such a way that it gives a subject with a justified belief a certain assurance from the subjective perspective, an assurance that externalist views (discussed below) don’t offer. According to Bergmann, even acquaintance with truth bearers, truth makers and a correspondence holding between them doesn’t carry with it assurance unless it is accompanied by a justified belief that all these relations obtain. And this will take us again on the road to regress. Bergmann’s challenge is serious and the traditional acquaintance theorist who rejects the strong access requirement will need to convince you that acquaintance with the correspondence between a fact and a thought that P can make a difference to the subject’s perspective on the truth of P without needing justification for thinking that the fact corresponds to P (see Hasan 2011 for a reply along these lines). Alternatively, the internalist might attempt to convince you that the regress that comes with accepting the strong access requirement is not vicious after all (see Fales 2014).

3.2 The Sellarsian Dilemma

BonJour was quite aware that some classical foundationalists would attempt to avoid the regress problem raised in the previous section by appeal to the idea that some things are simply “given” to us, or that we directly “apprehend” or are “acquainted with” them. Inspired by Sellars (1963), BonJour (1978, 1985: ch. 4) presented the following objection to classical foundationalism, often referred to as the “Sellarsian Dilemma”. Does the awareness or acquaintance that is the alleged source of noninferential justification involve the acceptance of a proposition or thought, or at least the categorization of some sensory item or the application of some concept to experience? If, on the one hand, the acquaintance or awareness is propositional or conceptual in this way, then while such acts or episodes of awareness seem capable, in principle, of justifying other beliefs, they would surely need to be justified themselves. The episode of awareness would involve something like the acceptance of a proposition, or the categorization of experience, and such an attitude or act clearly needs justification if it is to justify anything else. But then, the allegedly foundational belief is not foundational after all. If, on the other hand, we can regard direct awareness as nonpropositional and nonconceptual, then while these acts or states of awareness do not require or even admit of justification they also don’t seem capable on their own of providing a reason or justification for propositional items like beliefs. Therefore, the classical foundationalist’s acquaintance or direct awareness cannot serve as a foundational source of knowledge or justified belief.

One proposed solution to the dilemma begins by emphasizing that acquaintance with a fact is not by itself an epistemic relation. The acquaintance theorist can argue that one has a noninferentially justified belief that P only when one has the thought that P and one is acquainted with the fact that P, the thought that P, and the relation of correspondence holding between the thought that P and the fact that P. On such a view no single act of acquaintance yields knowledge or justified belief, but when everything that is constitutive of a thought or a proposition’s being true is immediately before consciousness, there is nothing more that one could want or need to justify a belief. Acts of acquaintance, including acquaintance with propositions, do not involve belief, judgment, or concept application, and so do not need justification. However, if the objects of acquaintance, that with which we are acquainted, can be propositional, then perhaps acquaintance with the rights sorts of items (including propositional ones) can make a difference to justification. This view thus grants that a single act of acquaintance with a fact does not provide justification, but rejects the dilemma’s assumption that there are no acts of acquaintance that can, singly or in any combination, make a difference to justification. (See Fumerton 1995 for a reply of this sort. For a reply that is similar in many respects, see BonJour 2000 and 2003.)

A classical foundationalist who prefers McGrew’s (1995, 1998) view, according to which noninferentially justified beliefs are formed by demonstrative reference, would give a somewhat different response. An act of acquaintance alone is not sufficient for justification; one must also form a belief in such a way that the direct object of acquaintance becomes a constituent of the belief itself, or part of the belief’s very content. The relevance of the truth-maker to the proposition believed is transparent and guaranteed by the manner in which the belief is formed: acquaintance simply picks out some feature of experience and takes it up into the content of a belief or judgment that asserts that the feature exists or is instantiated. This view thus grants that an act of acquaintance does not automatically provide justification for a corresponding belief, but rejects the dilemma’s assumption that there is no way to use the act of acquaintance in forming one’s belief in a way that does make a difference to justification.

3.3 Doubts about Correspondence and Acquaintance

The direct acquaintance theorist does presuppose the intelligibility of a world that has “structure” independent of any structure imposed by the mind. Without facts that are independent of the thoughts and judgments that represent them, one could not make sense of a relation of acquaintance between a person and a fact, a relation that grounds foundational justification. More radical contemporary rejections of foundationalism may well involve dissatisfaction with the foundationalist’s implicit commitment to a strong realistic correspondence conception of truth as involving some relation to mind-independent facts. A discussion of problems with the correspondence conception and alternatives would take us far afield, however. (For more, see the entry on the correspondence theory of truth.)

Just as some reject the conception of truth underlying classical foundationalist accounts of foundational justification, so others profess to be bewildered by some of the fundamental concepts employed in defining foundational justification. The acquaintance theorist tends to have relatively little to say by way of analyzing what direct acquaintance is. To be sure, one can try to give someone a feel for what one is talking about by a method of contrast--e.g., by contrasting one’s awareness of pain with the temporary distraction caused by an engrossing conversation. It is tempting to suppose that for a short time the pain was still present but the person with the pain was no longer aware of the fact that the pain exists. This awareness, the acquaintance theorist will argue, is obviously something over and above mere belief in the existence of the pain, as one can believe that one is in a mental state (say a subconscious mental state) without being aware of that state. (Some may find it odd to speak of having a pain without being aware of it; in that case, it may help to consider similar cases involving desire, hope, fear, or belief.) Like most theories foundationalism will, however, ultimately rest its intelligibility on an appeal to a basic or primitive concept, one that defies further analysis. Just as one needs to end epistemic regresses with foundational justification, the foundationalist will argue, so one needs to end conceptual regresses with concepts one grasps without further definition.

3.4 The Threat of Skepticism

Although opponents of classical foundationalism are not always eager to admit it, we suspect that the primary dissatisfaction with classical foundationalism lies with the difficulty the view has avoiding radical skepticism. On infallible belief, infallible justification, or direct acquaintance theories of foundational justification, there is precious little included in the foundations of knowledge. Most classical foundationalists reject the idea that one can have noninferentially justified beliefs about the past, but the present disappears into the past in the blink of an eye. How can one even hope to get back the vast body of knowledge one pre-philosophically supposes one has, if one’s epistemic base is so impoverished? If the second clause of the Principle of Inferential Justification were accepted, the problem is even more serious. One might be able to convince oneself that one can know noninferentially the principles of deductive reasoning, but deduction will not take one usefully beyond the foundations of knowledge and justified belief. As Mill (1906: 126) argued, there is a very real sense in which one doesn’t advance one’s knowledge significantly employing a form of reasoning that takes one only to conclusions that were implicitly contained in the conjunction of one’s premises. To advance beyond foundations we will inevitably need to employ non-deductive reasoning and according to PIJ that will ultimately require us to have noninferential knowledge of propositions describing probability connections between evidence and conclusions that are not logically implied by the evidence. It is not absurd on the face of it to suppose that one can have noninferential a priori knowledge of probabilistic connections, but it is perhaps an understatement to say that the view is not popular (see Russell 1948 for an excellent discussion of this issue).

4. Internalist Alternatives to Classical Foundationalism

We noted above that at least many philosophers are convinced that acceptance of classical foundationalism leads inevitably to an unacceptably radical skepticism. Some contemporary epistemologists seek a more modest foundationalism that will make it much easier to respond to the skeptic’s arguments. Michael Huemer’s (2001) phenomenal conservatism and Jim Pryor’s (2000) dogmatism are both views that are far more “permissive” in allowing an extensive range of beliefs to have foundational justification. And their views are not unrelated to Chisholm’s longstanding efforts (e.g., 1989) to locate foundational justification for believing various propositions about one’s past and about one’s physical environment in the character of one’s experiential states.

Huemer offers his view as an improvement on a cruder view once defended by Chisholm (1980) that is often called “epistemic conservatism” and sometimes, more aptly, “doxastic conservatism.” The doxastic conservative takes the mere fact that you believe some proposition P to provide prima facie justification for believing P. This view does not imply that the mere fact that you believe something renders the belief justified, for it may be that your belief is prima facie justified but not ultima facie justified: if you have good reasons to disbelieve P, or good reasons to think that your belief that P is unreliable or untrustworthy, then your belief is “defeated” and not justified. In other words, according to doxastic conservatism, if S believes that P then, in the absence of defeaters, S has justification for believing that P.

Many worry that the view is vulnerable to counterexamples, for it seems committed to regarding beliefs that clearly have nothing going for them as justified. One of the better counterexamples involves cases in which one forms a belief in a proposition one has no evidence for or against. Suppose that despite lacking any evidence for or against the belief, S somehow comes to believe that there is an even number of grains of sand on a particular beach (Foley 1983: 174–5), or that a particular coin that is tossed and lands out of sight has landed “tails” up (Christensen 1994: 74). Suppose also that S lacks any defeaters for the belief: S has no evidence against the proposition, and is not aware of having formed the belief without evidence or in an unreliable way. Doxastic conservatism yields the counterintuitive result that this belief is rational or justified. (For an attempt to respond to this and related objections on behalf of doxastic conservatism, see McCain 2008.)

In any event, most foundationalists sympathetic to internalism prefer a view according to which a non-belief state provides justification for foundational belief. According to phenomenal conservatism, the justifying state is a “seeming” or “appearance”: if it seems to S that P, then, in the absence of defeaters, S thereby has some degree of justification for believing that P (Huemer 2001, 2007, 2013; Cullison 2010; Tucker 2010; Skene 2013). These appearances come in various sorts: sensory or perceptual, intellectual or intuitive, mnemonic, and introspective. Many use the term “dogmatism” to refer to the same view, or to the view restricted to some domain, typically to perception: if it perceptually seems to S that P, then, in the absence of defeaters, S thereby has some justification for believing that P.

It is worth noting that Pryor himself uses the term “dogmatism” to refer to the view that “justification is sometimes both immediate and underminable” (2013a: 96), and so uses the term in a way that is compatible with the rejection of phenomenal conservatism and dogmatism as these terms are generally understood. While those who accept the principle (whether in its general form or as restricted to perceptual seemings) do thereby hold that some states provide immediate but underminable or defeasible justification, it is possible to accept that some other states provide immediate but underminable justification and deny that perceptual seemings do. However, for simplicity and to follow the more common usage, we use the two labels “phenomenal conservatism” and “dogmatism” more or less interchangeably in what follows.

The main motivation for phenomenal conservatism is straightforward. As already noted, the view is far more “permissive” than classical foundationalism in allowing for more extensive foundational justification. For example, I believe that there is a cat on my lap, that I had fish for dinner last night, that I feel thirsty, that I am thinking about getting a glass of water, that pleasure is good, and that 2 + 3 = 5. Prima facie, it is plausible to say that I believe these propositions because they seem or appear to be true—because it seems to me that there is a cat on my lap, that I had fish last night, and so on. If I do indeed believe these things on the basis of these seemings or appearances, and they constitute an adequate source of justification, then, in the absence of defeaters, I have justification for these beliefs. And if we deny that they are good sources of justification, then how do we avoid skepticism? As Huemer puts it, “if undefeated appearances are not a source of justified belief, then how is one to avoid skepticism about the external world, the past, values, abstract objects, and so on? Unless this challenge can be met, we would be wise to place our trust in the appearances….” (2013, p. 349).

What exactly are these “seemings” or “appearances”? The distinction between seemings and beliefs is typically introduced with examples. Once we are familiar with the Müller-Lyer illusion, we no longer believe that the lines are of unequal length even though, in some sense, they still appear to be unequal. The same holds for various apparent intuitions and apparent memories that we become convinced are false. Moreover, beliefs are subject to epistemic norms and can be supported by epistemic reasons, while it doesn’t seem to make sense to say the same of appearances (McCain and Moretti 2021, p. 56–7). Huemer and others will claim that seemings cannot be identified with dispositions to believe, inclinations to believe, or impulses to believe, though not everyone will agree about this. Huemer argues for this on three main grounds (2007: 30–1). First, it is possible to have a persisting seeming or appearance (e.g., that one line is longer than another, or that a stick submerged in water is bent) but be so convinced that it is a mere illusion that you have no disposition or inclination to believe it. Second, it is possible to be inclined to believe that P (because, e.g., you really want it to be true) in the absence of a corresponding seeming that P. Third, appearances can provide non-trivial explanations for what we believe or what we are disposed to believe: I am inclined to believe that there is a bus approaching because it perceptually seems that there is; understanding the latter seeming as an inclination to believe trivializes the explanation. Some have pointed out, however, that many problems raised with doxastic accounts of appearances can be avoided by understanding appearances as beliefs or inclinations to believe with different contents. According to Glüer (2018) perceptual appearances might be understood as beliefs to the effect that something looks some way. And according to Conee (2013) and Tooley (2013), seemings can be understood as felt inclinations to believe that some state is evidence for P.

Proponents of phenomenal conservatism and dogmatism generally hold that seemings are a kind of experience distinct from beliefs and inclinations to believe. But they also hold that seemings are nevertheless belief-like in that they are propositional attitudes or at least have propositional or representational contents. And they hold that seemings have a distinctive phenomenal character: seemings are “assertive” (Huemer 2013); they have a “phenomenal force” to them such that “it ‘feels as if’ we can just tell that those propositions are true…just by virtue of having them so represented” (Pryor 2000, p. 547, n. 23); “a seeming that P ‘recommends’ P as true or ‘assures’ the subject of P’s truth” (Tucker 2013). There is an interesting disagreement among those who are take seemings to be a kind of experience, a disagreement that exists even among those who are sympathetic to phenomenal conservatism or dogmatism in some form. The disagreement concerns the relationship between seemings and sensations or sensory experiences. According to some (e.g., Huemer 2001, Ch. 4 and Tolhurst 1998) sensations are themselves a kind or species of seeming—perceptual seemings—while others (e.g., Tucker 2010, Brogaard 2013) take sensations to be distinct from perceptual seemings, though often accompanied by them. (For more on the relationship between sensations and seemings, see Tucker 2013, pp. 7–8.) Some have argued that any appearance-based theory of justification should accept that other features accompanying appearances can affect whether and how strongly they might justify beliefs (Reiland 2015, Brogaard and Gatzia 2018, McCain and Moretti 2021).

Some have pointed out that attempting to capture the phenomenal character of seemings by saying they are “assertive” is potentially misleading given that judgments and beliefs are assertive and seemings are supposed to be non-doxastic experiential states (Smithies 2019, p. 93, McAllister 2018, p. 3082), and something similar might be said of the claim that seemings “recommend” or “assure” us of their truth. Some find the appeal to phenomenal force obscure (Conee 2013 and Tooley 2013), while many others take something like phenomenal force to be an important and familiar, if difficult to describe, feature of mental states (e.g., Pryor 2000, Makie 2013, McGrath 2013, Skene 2013, McAllister 2018, Moretti and McCain 2021).

Both Huemer and Pryor make clear that the intentional states that provide justification do so without one’s having to be aware of the fact that one is in such states. They might both allow, however, that one can turn one’s attention inward to discover the fact that one is in such states, and that one can, in principle, discover (perhaps a priori) that the states in question do give one the relevant epistemic justification.

5. Objections to Internalist Alternatives to Classical Foundationalism

In this section, we focus on objections commonly raised against phenomenal conservatism and dogmatism, though they arguably apply to other internalist foundationalist views as well.

As one might expect, the main worry with both Huemer’s phenomenal conservatism and Pryor’s dogmatism is the very air of dogmatism that Pryor embraces in his label for the view. It strikes many epistemologists that these views make getting justification for one’s beliefs too easy. Perhaps sensations are representational states, and perhaps there is the kind of representational state that Huemer and other phenomenal conservatives call an appearance or a seeming, but as why should we assume that they accurately represent the world around us? Fear is a representational or propositional state, but from the fact that I fear that there are ghosts, it hardly seems to follow that I have a prima facie justification for believing that there are ghosts. For that matter, belief is a representational state and if we doubt that mere belief can provide justification, why should we think another representational state, like a seeming, provides justification? Huemer and Pryor will answer that the representational states they offer as justifiers, perhaps because of their peculiar “phenomenal force” or “assertiveness”, are simply different in this respect. While providing no guarantee that the world is as represented, they simply carry with them justification that other representational states are incapable of providing.

The claim that phenomenal conservatism and dogmatism make getting justification too easy can be motivated by the “problem of easy knowledge”. Since this problem has been raised against both internalist and externalist alternatives to classical foundationalism, we present this problem in section 8, after discussing externalism.

5.1 The Cognitive Penetration Objection

A recent objection to phenomenal conservatism and dogmatism involves appeal to cases of “cognitive penetration”, cases in which propositional attitudes (beliefs, fears, desires, etc.) that the subject already has give rise to a related seeming. The objection comes in two forms. The first is the “illegitimate boost” objection. If I have prior justification to believe that P (e.g., that my car is in my garage), and that belief causes me to have a seeming that P (e.g., the belief and expectation make it visually seem to me that my car is in my garage when I glance quickly in the direction of my garage), dogmatism entails that the belief’s justification goes up. The usual reply here is that the relevant claim is not counterintuitive. I gain no additional justification via the seeming if I have a good reason to suspect that my having the seeming depends on my having the belief; but in the case where I have no such reason, it is not clearly counterintuitive to say that I am justified. Tucker (2013: 14) gives a useful analogy to testimony: if Bill and Jill both testify to me, at different times, that there is free pizza on the quad, then both testimonies give me more reason to believe than either of them separately, and this still holds if unbeknownst to me Jill tells me only because she heard it from Bill.

The second form of the “cognitive penetration” objection is sometimes called the “tainted source” objection (Huemer 2013), and it arises from the fact that propositional attitudes other than justified belief—fears and desires, unjustified beliefs, etc.—can influence how things seem to us. Suppose, for example, that Jill fears that Jack is angry with her, and that upon seeing Jack that fear partly causes it to seem to her that Jack is angry with her (Siegel 2013). Many find it counterintuitive that Jill could acquire justification for her belief in this way. The natural suggestion is that the etiology of the belief matters to its epistemic justification (see, e.g., Markie 2005, 2013; Goldman 2009; Lyons 2011; Siegel 2013). Once again, there are some who do not share the intuition that the subject’s justification is affected by the belief’s causal history when that causal history is not accessible to the subject (e.g., Huemer 2013). But at least some phenomenal conservatives admit to feeling the pull of the intuition in response to some of the cases, and attempt to account for it by saying that there is something else that is epistemically bad in the situation—e.g., while the belief is epistemically justified, the agent is epistemically irresponsible, criticizable, or cognitively defective in some way (e.g., Skene 2013), or lacks the sort of justification that can turn true belief into knowledge (e.g., Tucker 2010). Some worry, however, that not all the problematic “tainted source” cases can be handled in these ways (see Markie 2013 and McGrath 2013.)

6. Externalist Versions of Foundationalism

The epistemic landscape has changed dramatically in the last forty or fifty years with the rise of externalist epistemologies. It is notoriously difficult to define clearly the controversy between internalists and externalists in epistemology. (For a detailed discussion of alternative ways of defining the controversy, see Fumerton 1995: chs. 3 and 4. See also the entry on internalist and externalist conceptions of epistemic justification.)

There are at least two common ways of understanding the controversy. It is sometimes taken to be a controversy over whether or not one can identify epistemic properties with “internal” states of believers. According to the view we might call “internal state internalism” (sometimes called “mentalism”), justification is analyzed in terms of or depends essentially and only on what is inside the mind. It follows on this view that no two individuals can be internally or mentally alike in all respects and yet differ in the justification they have for the same beliefs. In one sense, then, to be an externalist (a non-mentalist) is to claim that one’s justification involves or depends essentially on some facts or states of affairs outside the mind. Others take the controversy to center over the question of whether one requires certain sorts of access for justification. The “access internalist” holds (roughly) that being justified in believing that P requires that there be something within or at least available to one’s perspective or awareness which is relevant to the truth or justification of P. (While some access internalists seem to have held that everything that determines justification must be accessible, as we are about to see, hardly any internalists hold such a strong position.) The “access externalist” denies that justification requires any such access. The access externalist need not deny that something relevant to the truth of P is, at least sometimes, accessible to the subject who has justification for P; but paradigm externalists deny that access is always required for justification.

Some accept both forms of “internalism”, though perhaps take one sense to be more fundamental than the other. For example, one might take access internalism to be more fundamental, and hold that one can have access only to mental states and internal facts about them, and so accept mentalism as a consequence. Or one might take the mentalist thesis to be more fundamental, and argue that one has some minimal access to the relevant mental facts, and so accept some form of access internalism as well. But it is possible to accept one form of internalism and reject the other. Some mentalists might deny that we have access to all the mental states or features that make a difference to justification. And some access internalists might hold that we can be directly aware of external objects, external states of affairs, or external abstract entities or relations, and take this direct awareness to make a difference to one’s justification; they would deny that one’s justifiers must always be mental, though they might accept the thesis that there can be no difference in justification without a mental difference, assuming that access even to a non-mental entity counts as a mental relation or mental state.

Access internalisms vary depending on what sort of “access” is required (true belief, justified belief, acquaintance, etc.), and on what it is that must be accessed for justification. There are thus stronger and weaker forms of access internalism, and as a result the epistemic landscape is quite complex. Certainly, paradigm externalists would reject the second clause of the PIJ. According to virtually all externalists, one can arrive at a justified belief in P by inferring it from E without being aware of any sort of evidential connection between E and P; the fact that there is a good evidential connection between E and P can be external to the subject’s mind and inaccessible to the subject. They would also reject a parallel principle for noninferential justification: one can arrive at a justified belief on the basis of some sensory or other belief-independent input without being aware of any sort of evidential connection between the input and the belief. Phenomenal conservatives and dogmatists tend to agree with the paradigm externalist in rejecting the requirement that one grasp a connection between one’s epistemic grounds or evidence and the proposition believed (though they deny that external conditions like reliability discussed below are also needed for justification). However, externalists typically allow that in principle one could have a foundational belief in the absence of any appearance or seeming. Some epistemologists have combined some modest internal requirements with externalist ones in their accounts of epistemic justification (see, for example, Alston 1989 and Steup 2004).

While the externalist defends radically different views than those of classical foundationalists, the structure of knowledge and justification that emerges from such theories is still often a foundationalist structure. We might first illustrate the point by examining the view defended by the most prominent of the externalists, Alvin Goldman’s reliabilism.[6] The fundamental idea behind reliabilism is strikingly simple. Justified beliefs are reliably produced beliefs. Reliably produced beliefs are beliefs that are the product of a reliable process, and a reliable process is one that yields beliefs that are usually true (or would usually be true if enough of them were generated).[7] Justified beliefs are worth having because justified beliefs are probably true.

Goldman initially distinguished two importantly different sorts of justified beliefs—those that result from belief-independent processes and those that result from belief-dependent processes. The former are processes that take as their “input” stimuli other than beliefs; the latter are beliefs produced by processes that take as their input at least some other beliefs. So, for example, it is possible that we have evolved in such a way that when prompted with certain sensory input we immediately and unreflectively reach conclusions about external objects. And we may live in a world in which beliefs about the external world produced in this way are usually true (or would usually be true if enough of them were generated). Such beliefs will be justified by virtue of being the product of reliable belief-independent processes. This is basically the “base clause” of the reliabilist’s analysis, a principle of foundational or noninferential justification: if a belief is the product of a reliable belief-independent process, then it is justified. Reliabilists generally add to this a condition requiring, in effect, that there be no defeaters available to the subject—e.g., no good reason or justification to think that the belief is false, unreliable or untrustworthy. (Specifying the needed “no defeater” condition in the base clause without using epistemic terms like ‘justification’ and ‘reason’ is a nontrivial matter. Goldman (1979) proposes adding the condition that there be no reliable belief-withholding process available to the subject.) These foundational beliefs can in turn be taken as input for reliable belief-dependent processes in order to generate still more justified beliefs. A belief-dependent process is “conditionally” reliable if its output beliefs are usually (or would usually) be true if the relevant input beliefs are true. The output beliefs of conditionally reliable belief-dependent processes are justified, provided that the input beliefs are justified. This is basically the “recursive clause” of the reliabilist’s analysis, a principle of nonfoundational or inferential justification: if a belief is the output of a conditionally reliable belief-dependent process, and the input beliefs are justified, then (absent defeaters) the output belief is justified.

The above is a crude sketch of Goldman’s early reliabilism—he later modified it to deal with a number of objections. But the sketch is enough to bring out the foundationalist structure inherent in a reliabilist account. The reliabilist actually accepts the first clause of PIJ, and avoids the epistemic regress by embracing a kind of justified belief that does not owe its justification to the having of other justified beliefs. Any undefeated belief resulting from a reliable belief-independent process is justified. No other beliefs are involved in the justification. So, such beliefs are foundational.

Reliabilism might complicate our taxonomy. Some reliabilists might hold that some belief-dependent processes (taking other beliefs as input) can provide justification without being inferential processes. After all, there’s nothing about the reliability of a process that requires that it involve anything like an inference. Indeed, perhaps some memorial processes, or certain sub-conscious processes, are conditionally reliable and so can provide justification (absent defeaters). We will see in discussing objections in section 7.1, however, that this might lead to counterintuitive consequences.

It should be noted that Goldman (1979) himself denies that one could give a strict definition of an evaluative or normative epistemic term like ‘justification’ without using other, similar evaluative or normative terms. Still, he is interested in providing “substantive conditions”, conditions that specify, in non-epistemic terms, when a belief is justified. In that sense, Goldman remains interested in providing a general and substantive theory of justification.

We have illustrated the way in which an externalist account of justified belief can exemplify a foundationalist structure by examining one of the most prominent versions of externalism, reliabilism. But other versions of externalism are also implicitly or explicitly committed to a version of foundationalism, or, at the very least, give an account of justification that would enable one to distinguish noninferential from inferential justification, direct from indirect knowledge. Consider, for example, a crude version of the so-called causal theory of knowledge according to which one knows a proposition when one believes it and the belief is caused (in the “right” way) by the very fact that makes true what is believed. On such an account one can distinguish causal chains leading to the belief in question that involve intermediate beliefs from those that do not. Using this distinction, one can again define a distinction between foundational and nonfoundational knowledge: roughly, the causes of belief that do not include other beliefs are the ones that would be foundational knowledge.[8]

Externalist versions of foundationalism are probably attractive to many because they seem to allow at least the possibility of a much expanded foundational base of justified beliefs. Unlike the Cartesian view, the reliabilist’s distinction between foundational and non-foundational belief has nothing to do with whether the beliefs are somehow infallible or infallibly justified. If nature has been co-operative enough to ensure the evolution of cognitive agents who respond to their environmental stimuli with mostly true beliefs, then there might be an enormous store of foundational knowledge upon which we can draw in arriving at inferentially justified conclusions. On most externalist accounts of foundational belief there are literally no a priori constraints on what might end up being foundationally justified. Any proposition might have been believed as the result of the operation of some conceivable sort of reliable belief-forming process. Moreover, many epistemologists hold that justifiers must in some way be truth-conducive or probable, and the requirement of reliability (or some other such external condition) makes the connection to the truth explicit. In contrast, non-classical internalist foundationalist views like phenomenal conservatism threaten to sever the connection between justification and truth or probability, for it is possible that propositions that seem true are mostly false.

7. Objections to Externalist Versions of Foundationalism

A full evaluation of externalist versions of foundationalism is far beyond the scope of this entry (see the entry on internalist and externalist conceptions of epistemic justification). Here we must inevitably be selective, and focus on reliabilism for illustration (see entry on reliabilist epistemology).

7.1 Challenges to Sufficiency: Norman and Truetemp

The very ease with which the externalist can potentially broaden the foundational base of knowledge or justified belief is, ironically, one of the primary concerns of those philosophers unhappy with externalist epistemology. One of the best-known objections to externalism attempts to show that the externalist’s conditions for foundational belief are not sufficient for justification. Recall that for the reliabilist a belief is justified if it is the product of a reliable belief-independent process and there are no defeaters for the belief available to the subject. Consider BonJour’s (1985: ch. 3) case of Norman: We can imagine that Norman is a highly reliable clairvoyant, that his clairvoyance produces a belief that the President is in New York. Suppose also that he does not realize that he is a clairvoyant, and that he has no reasons or evidence for or against the belief or the reliability of whatever process produced it. Intuitively, Norman’s belief is unjustified. Or consider Lehrer’s (1990) case of Truetemp, who, without knowing it, has a chip implanted in his head that produces very precise and highly accurate beliefs about the ambient temperature. Truetemp often gets temperature beliefs from the operation of the chip, but he has never checked their correctness. Intuitively, Truetemp’s belief that the temperature is now exactly 47 degrees is not justified. Reliabilism seems to yield the wrong result, justifying too many beliefs.

There have been a number of attempts to respond to such cases. One response is defended by Bergmann (2006: ch. 1 and 2) and was already discussed above in connection with regress problems for access internalism (section 3.1). Proponents of the objection often claim that what the cases suggest is that there must be something the subject is aware of or has access to that makes a difference to his perspective on the truth or appropriateness of the belief. Bergmann argues that this requirement, as tempting or intuitive as it may be, leads to serious regress problems. (For some replies on behalf of internalism, see Rogers and Matheson 2011, Hasan 2011, and Fales 2014.)

Many others attempt to accommodate these intuitions in some way. Goldman (1986) argues that in the cases described it is natural to think that subjects like Norman do have defeaters available, and this explains our intuition to regard them as unjustified. However, many, including some other reliabilists, think it is easy to further specify or amend the cases to ensure that the defeaters are not available (Lyons 2009: 123–4). Some accept a modest form of internalism, introducing a relatively weak access requirement, e.g., that the subject must have an experience or accessible mental state that is in fact a reliable way to arrive at beliefs, though the subject need not have access to the reliability of the experience (Alston 1989). However, there seem to be many possible cases, including versions of the cases of Norman and Truetemp, where these conditions are satisfied but the intuition is the same; we might suppose for example that some phenomenological sensation, like some unusual sort of itch, headache, or olfactory sensation, is in fact a highly reliable indicator of the truth of their beliefs regarding the whereabouts of the President or the ambient temperature. This intuitively makes no difference when they are unaware that it is reliable (see Lyons 2009: 125).

A more recent attempt to respond to the Norman and Truetemp cases adds a restriction for basic or foundational beliefs: they must be perceptual beliefs, beliefs produced by a “perceptual system” (see Lyons 2009: ch. 4, for more on what counts as a perceptual system). Lyons (2009: ch. 5) argues that the original Norman case doesn’t specify whether the belief is a product of a perceptual system, and in the Truetemp case it is the product of an implanted chip and not a perceptual system; he also argues that once we change the details to make the beliefs the result of perceptual systems the intuitions seem to change. For example, imagine that Norman* is like Norman except that he belongs to an alien species all members of which have clairvoyant abilities, thanks to their evolved perceptual organs and reliable processes of information transfer. Lyons claims that, intuitively, someone like Norman*’s belief that the President is in New York is justified, even if Norman* is not aware of the existence or reliability of such processes.

Just as the cases of Norman and Truetemp are designed to show that reliabilism makes getting foundational justification too easy, other, similar cases seem to show that reliabilism make getting nonfoundational justification too easy. Suppose, for example, that while you are asleep a group of logician-neuroscientists implant a device in your head that takes some of your highly reliable foundational beliefs (say, introspective or perceptual beliefs) as input and responds by selecting at random from a list of complex theorems of logic and producing a belief in that theorem. Intuitively, such beliefs are not justified despite their high degree of reliability. (This example is taken from Lyons 2009: 126). One intuitive diagnosis is that the relation between the output beliefs and input beliefs is not evidential or inferential, or the process by which the output beliefs are generated is not an evidential or inferential one. The challenge for the reliabilist who wants to avoid saying that such beliefs are justified, and avoid adding internalist constraints, is to provide a better account of inferential processes. To retain its externalism, the account must not have good inference depend on awareness of or access to the connection between propositions believed.

7.2 A Challenge to Necessity: The New Evil Demon Problem

The objections discussed above challenge the sufficiency of the externalist’s proposed conditions for justification. However, even if the above counterexamples to sufficiency are met, we might question whether the externalist’s conditions capture something essential to or necessary for foundational justification, or for the justification of other beliefs on the basis of foundational ones. Is unconditional, belief-independent reliability, for example, really necessary for justification at the foundational level? And is conditional, belief-dependent reliability really necessary for the justification of other beliefs?

The “new evil demon problem” (Lehrer and Cohen 1983; Cohen 1984) challenges the claim that externalist conditions like reliability really are necessary. Suppose that there is a subject that is just like you in all internal respects, except that while your beliefs are (let’s assume) reliably produced, your twin’s or counterpart’s are not, for his or her beliefs are produced by a powerful deceiving demon. Intuitively, your twin is no less justified than you are. But given that your twin’s beliefs are not reliable, the reliabilist must say that your twin’s beliefs are not justified.

Various responses have been proposed. Some see no significant problem with denying that the evil demon victim is justified. If this is not a blanket rejection of the appeal to intuitions, it would help to account for the intuitions in some way, and some responses that appeal to an ambiguity in “justification” could be understood as doing just that. For example, Goldman (1988) says that the counterpart’s belief is “weakly justified” in the sense that the belief, though formed by an unreliable process, is one the subject is epistemically responsible or blameless for having, but the belief is not “strongly justified” in the sense that involves reliability. This does not seem to be adequate, for intuitively, there is something positive about the deceived counterpart’s situation that is not captured by saying that he is epistemically responsible or blameless. A subject who reasons in accordance with principles that are horribly defective in ways he cannot detect may have tried his best and be as epistemically blameless as an evil demon victim who attends carefully to his experiences and follows good principles of reasoning, but there’s something clearly positive about the latter’s epistemic situation that goes beyond epistemic blamelessness (see Audi 1993: 28, and Pryor 2001: 117 for discussion of this point). Some externalists like Bach (1985) and Engel (1992) posit a similar sort of ambiguity between doxastic and personal justification, i.e., between a belief’s being justified and a person’s being justified in holding the belief, so that the demon victim is justified in believing as he does, but his beliefs are not justified. Kvanvig and Menzel (1990) object that a person’s being justified in believing something entails that their belief is justified, so that the distinction cannot help with the problem, but Littlejohn (2009) argues that there is no such entailment, that the distinction between personal and doxastic justification is coherent and well-motivated, and that it can help with the new evil demon problem.

Rather than simply deny the intuition, or explain it away by positing an ambiguity, a number of reliabilists attempt to accommodate the intuition by amending the conditions for justification. An earlier response by Goldman (1986) attempts to defend “normal worlds reliabilism” according to which a subject’s belief is justified if the process producing the belief is reliable in normal worlds, where a “normal world” is, roughly, a world where our general beliefs about the actual world are true. It is no surprise that Goldman himself was quick to give this up. One obvious worry with this response is that it rules out even the possibility that “abnormal” processes like clairvoyance be justified. Another is that it rules out the possibility that our general beliefs about the world are unjustified (Pollock and Cruz 1999: 115). More recently, some have suggested more sophisticated amendments to the conditions or to the sort of reliability required so as to accommodate the intuition while avoiding the problems of normal worlds reliabilism (see Comesaña 2002; Majors and Sawyer 2005; Henderson and Horgan 2006).

8. The Problem of Easy Knowledge

We end by presenting the “problem of easy knowledge” that has been raised against both internalist and externalist alternatives to classical foundationalism (see Cohen 2002 for an initial formulation of the problem). The problem as presented there has two main forms. The first involves cases of deductive closure. Suppose, to use an example from Cohen (2002), that I am looking to acquire a red table for my room and do not want to end up with a table that only looks red—e.g., a white table illuminated by red lights. Suppose that upon looking at a particular table I find that it seems red to me. If phenomenal conservatism is true, then I can arrive at knowledge, or at least justified belief, by the following simple inference:

  1. This table is red. (Formed on the basis of perception.)
  2. If this table is red then it is not a white table illuminated by red lights.
  3. So, this table is not a white table illuminated by red lights.

The same goes for the following inference:

  1. I have a hand. (Formed on the basis of a perception.)
  2. If I have a hand, then I am not a handless brain in a vat being fed illusory experiences of hands.
  3. So, I am not a handless brain in a vat being fed illusory experiences of hands.

The problem is that it seems implausible that I could come to be justified in believing—let alone know—that the table is not a white table illuminated by red lights merely on the basis of its looking or seeming to be red. Of course, I may and often do have independent reasons to trust that the colors of tables are normally the way they look (colored lights are rare, I don’t notice any such lights, etc.), and the above argument makes no mention of that. But given phenomenal conservatism or dogmatism, a perceptual seeming alone would confer justification for beliefs of the form (1) in the absence of defeaters, whether or not one had good independent reasons to take the seeming to be trustworthy. Similarly, given reliabilism, a reliable perceptual process alone would confer justification for beliefs of form (1) in the absence of defeaters. The same applies to the second inference: it is implausible that I could come to be justified in believing that I am not a handless brain-in-a-vat that merely seems to have hands on the basis of a perception or perceptual seeming that I have hands.

It is difficult to see how these views can deny that (3) could be justified in this way. Let’s make this explicit: suppose that in each case (1) is indeed noninferentially justified for me on the basis of the corresponding seeming or reliable perceptual process, that I know the obvious entailment (2) a priori, and that on the basis of this I infer (3). Suppose also that we accept the following intuitively plausible principle of closure: if S is justified in believing that P, knows that P entails that Q, and infers on the basis of this that Q, then S is justified in believing that Q. (This is a principle that phenomenal conservatives and dogmatists themselves tend to accept. A few externalists, such as Dretske (1970) and Nozick (1981) deny the closure principle at work in the objection, but many externalists are reluctant to deny that something like it holds, for they do not want to deny that we could be justified in inferring (3) from (1).) It then follows that I am justified in believing (3). The objector who uses this against phenomenal conservatism or reliabilism takes the lesson here to be that mere seemings or reliable processes (respectively) cannot be a source of foundational or noninferential justification. Justification can’t be that easy.

The problem of easy knowledge (or easy justification) comes in a second form as well: phenomenal conservatism and reliabilism allow one to acquire justification in the reliability of one’s perceptual appearances in a way that appears to be illegitimate: by relying on those very appearances themselves. If phenomenal conservatism is true, then I can arrive at knowledge or at least justified belief in the reliability of my apparent perceptions in the following way:

  1. P. (Formed on the basis of a perceptual seeming that P)
  2. It seems to me that P. (Formed by introspection)
  3. Q. (Formed on the basis of a perceptual seeming that Q)
  4. It seems to me that Q. (Formed by introspection)
  5. etc…

Therefore (probably), my perceptual seemings are true.

Given some plausible principle of justification by induction, I can infer from the premises that my perceptual seemings are (probably) reliable. The problem is that it is intuitively implausible that I could come to acquire justification for the reliability of my seemings by relying on the very seemings whose reliability I am attempting to justify. But it’s not clear how the phenomenal conservative can deny that this is a legitimate way to acquire justification in the reliability of one’s seemings.

Externalists also seem vulnerable to the second form of the problem of easy knowledge. They must apparently allow that a circular track-record argument could provide justification for belief in the reliability or trustworthiness of fundamental sources of belief. For example, the reliabilist can rely on perception to justify the reliability of perception, memory to justify the reliability of memory. And it seems implausible that one could acquire justification for the reliability of such sources in this way (see Vogel 2008b for an argument against reliabilism along these lines).

One possible reply is to grant that such arguments are question-begging and epistemically useless if presented to someone who doubts the reliability or trustworthiness of such seemings or apparent perceptions, but hold that it can still provide a subject who lacks that doubt with justification. While the argument is question-begging against the skeptic, that is no reason to deny that one could, in the absence of defeaters, acquire knowledge or justification on the basis of such arguments (Pryor 2004; Markie 2005; Bergmann 2008). However, some object that such arguments remain intuitively problematic—the arguments seem not to justify at all, whether or not they should persuade skeptics. (Cohen 2005; see also Vogel 2008a: 539–42, for further examples of cases for which dogmatism allows subjects to have justification that they really lack).

One might begin to wonder whether the problem of easy knowledge is a problem for all foundationalist views if it is a problem for any. Indeed, some have argued that classical foundationalists are in no better a position than phenomenal conservatives and externalists with respect to the problem, for they too will have to allow that one could rely on acquaintance with facts to justify the existence and trustworthiness of acquaintance. First, consider a parallel case of deductive closure:

  1. This is a pain. (Formed on the basis of acquaintance)
  2. If this is a pain, then it is not a mere itch that I am mistaking for a pain.
  3. So, this is not a mere itch that I am mistaking for a pain.

And a parallel case of circularity:

  1. P. (Formed on the basis of my acquaintance with the fact that P)
  2. I am acquainted with the fact that P. (Formed on the basis of my acquaintance with the fact that I am acquainted with the fact that P)
  3. Q. (Formed on the basis of my acquaintance with the fact that Q)
  4. I am acquainted with the fact that Q. (Formed on the basis of my acquaintance with the fact that I am acquainted with the fact that Q.)
  5. etc.

Therefore (probably), acquaintance is a source of true beliefs.

Classical foundationalists might respond that the problem is not one of permitting some source to justify propositions about itself or its epistemic credentials. The problem is that some alleged sources make the justification implausibly easy. Classical foundationalism does not; the intuition that the knowledge or justification acquired is implausibly easy or unsatisfying in the argument forms just presented is absent or at least much weaker (see Fumerton 2006). The problem that classical foundationalism faces is that it makes justification too hard, not too easy.


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