First published Sun Aug 15, 2004; substantive revision Sat Jan 7, 2023

Democritus, known in antiquity as the ‘laughing philosopher’ because of his emphasis on the value of ‘cheerfulness,’ was one of the two founders of ancient atomist theory. He elaborated a system originated by his teacher Leucippus into a materialist account of the natural world. The atomists held that there are smallest indivisible bodies from which everything else is composed, and that these move about in an infinite void. Of the ancient materialist accounts of the natural world which did not rely on some kind of teleology or purpose to account for the apparent order and regularity found in the world, atomism was the most influential. Even its chief critic, Aristotle, praised Democritus for arguing from sound considerations appropriate to natural philosophy.

1. Life and Works

According to ancient reports, Democritus was born about 460 BCE (thus, he was a younger contemporary of Socrates) and was a citizen of Abdera, although some reports mention Miletus. As well as his associate or teacher Leucippus, Democritus is said to have known Anaxagoras, and to have been forty years younger than the latter (DK 68A1). A number of anecdotes concern his life, but their authenticity is uncertain.

The work of Democritus has survived only in secondhand reports, sometimes unreliable or conflicting: the reasoning behind the positions taken often needs to be reconstructed. Much of the best evidence is that reported by Aristotle, who regarded him as an important rival in natural philosophy. Aristotle wrote a monograph on Democritus, of which only a few passages quoted in other sources have survived. Democritus seems to have taken over and systematized the views of Leucippus, of whom little is known. Although it is possible to distinguish some contributions as those of Leucippus, the overwhelming majority of reports refer either to both figures, or to Democritus alone; the developed atomist system is often regarded as essentially Democritus’.

Diogenes Laertius lists a large number of works by Democritus on many fields, including ethics, physics, mathematics, music and cosmology. Two works, the Great World System and the Little World System (see the entry on doxography of ancient philosophy), are sometimes ascribed to Democritus, although Theophrastus reports that the former is by Leucippus (DK 68A33). There is more uncertainty concerning the authenticity of the reports of Democritus’ ethical sayings. Two collections of sayings are recorded in the fifth-century anthology of Stobaeus, one ascribed to Democritus and another ascribed to an otherwise unknown philosopher ‘Democrates’. DK accepts both as relating to Democritus, but the authenticity of sayings in both collections is a matter of scholarly discussion, as is the relationship between Democritus’ atomism and his ethics.

2. Atomist Doctrine

Ancient sources describe atomism as one of a number of attempts by early Greek natural philosophers to respond to the challenge offered by Parmenides. Despite occasional challenges (Osborne 2004), this is how its motivation is generally interpreted by scholars today. Although the exact interpretation of Parmenides is disputed, he was taken to have argued that change is merely illusory because of some absurdities inherent in the idea of ‘what is not’. In response, Leucippus and Democritus, along with other Presocratic pluralists such as Empedocles and Anaxagoras, developed systems that clarified how change does not require that something should come to be from nothing. These responses to Parmenides suppose that there are multiple unchanging material principles, which persist and merely rearrange themselves to form the changing world of appearances. In the atomist version, these unchanging material principles are indivisible particles, the atoms. The idea that there is a lower limit to divisibility is sometimes taken as an answer to Zeno’s paradoxes about the impossibility of traversing infinitely divisible magnitudes (Hasper 2006). Reconstructions offered by Wardy (1988) and Sedley (2008) argue, instead, that atomism was developed as a response to Parmenidean arguments.

The atomists held that there are two fundamentally different kinds of realities composing the natural world, atoms and void. Atoms, from the Greek adjective atomos or atomon, ‘indivisible,’ are infinite in number and various in size and shape, and perfectly solid, with no internal gaps. They move about in an infinite void, repelling one another when they collide or combining into clusters by means of tiny hooks and barbs on their surfaces, which become entangled. Other than changing place, they are unchangeable, ungenerated and indestructible. All changes in the visible objects of the world of appearance are brought about by relocations of these atoms: in Aristotelian terms, the atomists reduce all change to change of place. Macroscopic objects in the world that we experience are really clusters of these atoms; changes in the objects we see—qualitative changes or growth, say—are caused by rearrangements or additions to the atoms composing them. While the atoms are eternal, the objects compounded out of them are not. Clusters of atoms moving in the infinite void come to form kosmoi or worlds as a result of a circular motion that gathers atoms up into a whirl, creating clusters within it (DK 68B167); these kosmoi are impermanent. Our world and the species within it have arisen from the collision of atoms moving about in such a whirl, and will likewise disintegrate in time.

In supposing that void exists, the atomists deliberately embraced an apparent contradiction, claiming that ‘what is not’ exists. Apparently addressing an argument by Melissus, a follower of Parmenides, the atomists paired the term for ‘nothing’ with what it negates, ‘thing,’ and claimed that—in a phrase typical of the atomists—the one ‘no more’ exists than the other (DK 67A6). Schofield (2002) argues that this particular phrase originated with Democritus and not his teacher Leucippus. By putting the full (or solid) and the void ontologically on a par, the atomists were apparently denying the impossibility of void. Void they considered to be a necessary condition for local motion: if there were no unoccupied places, where could bodies move into? Melissus had argued from the impossibility of void to the impossibility of motion; the atomists apparently reasoned in reverse, arguing from the fact that motion exists to the necessity for void space to exist (DK 67A7). It has been suggested that Democritus’ conception of void is that of the (temporarily) unfilled regions between atoms rather than a concept of absolute space (Sedley 1982). Void does not impede the motion of atoms because its essential quality is that of ‘yielding,’ in contrast to the mutual resistance of atoms. Later atomist accounts attest that this ‘yielding’ explains the tendency of bodies to drift into emptier spaces, driven out by collision from more densely packed regions (Lucretius DRN 6.906–1089).

Some controversy surrounds the properties of the atoms. They vary in size: one report—which some scholars question—suggests that atoms could, in principle, be as large as a cosmos, although at least in this cosmos they all seem to be too small to perceive (DK 68A47). They can take on an infinite variety of shapes: there are reports of an argument that there is ‘no more’ reason for the atoms to be one shape than another. Many kinds of atoms can interlock with one another because of their irregular shapes and hooks at their surface, accounting for the cohesiveness of some compounds. It is not clear whether the early atomists regarded atoms as conceptually indivisible or merely physically indivisible (Furley 1967). The idea that there is a smallest possible magnitude seems to suggest that this is the lower limit of size for atoms, although notions like being in contact or having shape seem to entail that even the smallest atoms have parts in some sense, if only mathematically or conceptually.

There are conflicting reports on whether atoms move in a particular direction as a result of their weight: a number of scholars have tried to reconcile these by supposing that weight is not intrinsic to the atoms, but is a result of the centripetal tendencies set up in the cosmic whirl (cf. O’Brien 1981; Furley 1989, pp. 91–102). Atoms may have an inherent tendency to a kind of vibratory motion, although the evidence for this is uncertain (McDiarmid 1958). However, their primary movement seems to result from collision with other atoms, wherein their mutual resistance or antitupia causes them to move away from one another when struck. Democritus is criticized by Aristotle for supposing that the sequence of colliding atoms has no beginning, and thus for not offering an explanation of the existence of atomic motion per se, even though the prior collision with another atom can account for the direction of each individual atomic motion (see O’Keefe 1996). Although the ancient atomists are often compared to modern ‘mechanistic’ theories, Balme warned of the danger of assuming that the atomists share modern ideas about the nature of atomic motion, particularly the idea that motion is inertial (Balme 1941).

According to different reports, Democritus ascribed the causes of things to necessity, and also to chance. Probably the latter term should be understood as ‘absence of purpose’ rather than a denial of necessity (Barnes 1982, pp. 423–6). Democritus apparently recognized a need to account for the fact that the disorderly motion of individual distinct atoms could produce an orderly cosmos in which atoms are not just randomly scattered, but cluster to form masses of distinct types. He is reported to have relied on a tendency of ‘like to like’ which exists in nature: just as animals of a kind cluster together, so atoms of similar kinds cluster by size and shape. He compares this to the winnowing of grains in a sieve, or the sorting of pebbles riffled by the tide: it is as if there were a kind of attraction of like to like (DK 68B164). Although this claim has been interpreted differently (e.g. Taylor 1999b p. 188), it seems to be an attempt to show how an apparently ordered arrangement can arise automatically, as a byproduct of the random collisions of bodies in motion (Furley 1989, p. 79). No attractive forces or purposes need be introduced to explain the sorting by the tide or in the sieve: it is probable that this is an attempt to show how apparently orderly effects can be produced without goal-directioned forces or purpose.

Democritus regards the properties of atoms in combination as sufficient to account for the multitude of differences among the objects in the world that appears to us. Aristotle cites an analogy to the letters of the alphabet, which can produce a multitude of different words from a few elements in combinations; the differences all stem from the shape (schêma) of the letters, as A differs from N; by their arrangement (taxis), as AN differs from NA; and by their positional orientation (thesis), as N differs from Z (DK 67A6). These terms are Aristotle’s interpretation of Democritus’ own terminology, which has a more dynamic sense (Mourelatos 2004). This passage omits differences of size, perhaps because it is focused on the analogy to letters of the alphabet: it is quite clear from other texts that Democritus thinks that atoms also differ in size.

He famously denies that perceptible qualities other than shape and size (and, perhaps, weight) really exist in the atoms themselves: one direct quotation surviving from Democritus claims that ‘by convention sweet and by convention bitter, by convention hot, by convention cold, by convention color; but in reality atoms and void’ (DK 68B9, trans. Taylor 1999a). There are different accounts of this distinction. Furley argues that the translation ‘convention’ should not be taken to suggest that there is anything arbitrary about the perception of certain colors, say: the same configuration of atoms may be regularly associated with a given color (Furley 1993; cf. Barnes 1982, pp. 370–7). What Democritus rejects with the label ‘merely conventional’ is, perhaps, the imputation of the qualities in question to the atoms, or perhaps even to macroscopic bodies. Mourelatos (2005) draws the contrast as that between intrinsic and relational properties.

While several reports of Democritus’ view, apparently direct quotations, mention exclusively sensible qualities as being unreal, a report of Plutarch includes in the list of things that exist only by convention the notion of ‘combination’ or sunkrisis. If this report is genuinely Democritean, it would broaden the scope of the claim considerably: the idea that any combination—by which he presumably means any cluster of atoms—is ‘unreal’ or merely ‘conventional’ suggests that Democritus is drawing a more radical distinction than that between sensible and nonsensible qualities. The implication would be that anything perceived, because it is a perception of combinations of atoms and not atoms themselves, would be suspect, not merely the qualia experienced by means of individual sense organs. One report indeed attributes to Democritus a denial that two things could become one, or vice versa (DK 68A42), thus suggesting that combinations are regarded as conventional.

Commentators differ as to the authenticity of Plutarch’s report. As the word sunkrisis does not occur in other reports, Furley (following Sandbach) suggests that it is most likely an error for pikron, ‘bitter’ which occurs instead in another report. However, Furley concedes that Plutarch at least understands the earliest atomists to be committed to the view that all combinations of atoms, as much as sensible qualities, should be understood as conventional rather than real (Furley 1993 pp. 76–7n7). This would suggest that everything at the macroscopic level—or, strictly, everything available to perception—is regarded as unreal. The ontological status of arrangement or combination of atoms for Democritus is a vexed question, that affects our understanding of his metaphysics, his historical relationship to Melissus, and the similarity of his views to the modern primary-secondary quality distinction (Wardy 1988; Curd 1998; Lee 2005; Mourelatos 2005; Pasnau 2007). If we take the ‘conventionality’ thesis to be restricted to sensible qualities, there is still an open question about Democritus’ reason for denying their ‘reality’ (Wardy 1988; O’Keefe 1997; Ganson 1999).

3. Theory of Perception

Democritus’ theory of perception depends on the claim that eidôla or images, thin layers of atoms, are constantly sloughed off from the surfaces of macroscopic bodies and carried through the air. Later atomists cite as evidence for this the gradual erosion of bodies over time. These films of atoms shrink and expand; only those that shrink sufficiently can enter the eye. It is the impact of these on our sense organs that enables us to perceive. Visible properties of macroscopic objects, like their size and shape, are conveyed to us by these films, which tend to be distorted as they pass through greater distances in the air, since they are subject to more collisions with air atoms. A different or complementary account claims that the object seen impresses the air by the eidôla, and the compacted air thus conveys the image to the eye (DK 68A135; Baldes 1975). The properties perceived by other senses are also conveyed by contact of some kind. Democritus’ theory of taste, for example, shows how different taste sensations are regularly produced by contact with different shapes of atoms.

Theophrastus, who gives us the most thorough report of Democritus’ theory, criticizes it for raising the expectation that the same kinds of atoms would always cause similar appearances. However, it may be that most explanations are directed towards the normal case of a typical observer, and that a different account is given as to the perceptions of a nontypical observer, such as someone who is ill. Democritus’ account why honey sometimes tastes bitter to people who are ill depends on two factors, neither of which undercut the notion that certain atomic shapes regularly affect us in a given way. One is that a given substance like honey is not quite homogeneous, but contains atoms of different shapes. While it takes its normal character from the predominant type of atom present, there are other atom-types present within. The other is that our sense-organs need to be suitably harmonized to admit a given atom-type, and the disposition of our passageways can be affected by illness or other conditions. Thus someone who is ill may become unusually receptive to an atom-type that is only a small part of honey’s overall constitution.

Other observed effects, however, require a theory whereby the same atoms can produce different effects without supposing that the observer has changed. The change must then occur in the object seen. The explanation of color seems to be of this variety: Aristotle reports that things acquire their color by ‘turning,’ tropê (GC 1.2, 315b34). This is the Democritean term that Aristotle had translated as ‘position,’ thesis, i.e. one of the three fundamental ways in which atoms can alter and thus appear differently to us. Aristotle gives this as the reason why color is not ascribed to the atoms themselves. Lucretius’ account of why color cannot belong to atoms may help clarify the point here. We are told that if the sea’s atoms were really blue, they could not undergo some change and look white (DRN 2.774–5), as when we observe the sea’s surface changing from blue to white. This seems to assume that, while an appearance of a property P can be produced by something that is neither P nor not-P, nonetheless something P cannot appear not-P. Since atoms do not change their intrinsic properties, it seems that change in a relational property, such as the relative position of atoms, is most likely to be the cause of differing perceptions. In the shifting surface of the sea or the flutter of the pigeon with its irridescent neck, it is evident that the parts of the object are moving and shifting in their positional relations.

By ascribing the causes of sensible qualities to relational properties of atoms, Democritus forfeits the prima facie plausibility of claiming that things seem P because they are P. Much of Theophrastus’ report seems to focus on the need to make it plausible that a composite can produce an appearance of properties it does not intrinsically possess. Democritus is flying in the face of at least one strand of commonsense when he claims that textures produce the appearance of hot or cold, impacts cause colour sensations. The lists of examples offered, drawing on commonsense associations or anecdotal experience, are attempts to make such claims persuasive. Heat is said to be caused by spherical atoms, because these move freely: the commonsense association of quick movement with heating may be employed here. Betegh (2020) suggests that larger void spaces are directly associated with heating, rather than that rarefaction indirectly causes heat by allowing freer and more frequent atomic motion.

Aristotle sometimes criticizes Democritus for claiming that visible, audible, olfactory and gustatory sensations are all caused by touch (DK 68A119). Quite how this affects the account of perception is not clear, as the sources tells us little about how touch is thought to work. Democritus does not, however, seem to distinguish between touch and contact, and may take it to be unproblematic that bodies communicate their size, shape and surface texture by physical impact.

4. The Soul and the Nature of Living Things

In common with other early ancient theories of living things, Democritus seems to have used the term psychê to refer to that distinctive feature of living things that accounts for their ability to perform their life-functions. According to Aristotle, Democritus regarded the soul as composed of one kind of atom, in particular fire atoms. This seems to have been because of the association of life with heat, and because spherical fire atoms are readily mobile, and the soul is regarded as causing motion. Democritus seems to have considered thought to be caused by physical movements of atoms also. This is sometimes taken as evidence that Democritus denied the survival of a personal soul after death, although the reports are not univocal on this.

One difficulty faced by materialist theories of living things is to account for the existence and regular reproduction of functionally adapted forms in the natural world. Although the atomists have considerable success in making it plausible that a simple ontology of atoms and void, with the minimal properties of the former, can account for a wide variety of differences in the objects in the perceptible world, and also that a number of apparently orderly effects can be produced as a byproduct of disorderly atomic collisions, the kind of functional organization found in organisms is much harder to explain.

Democritus seems to have developed a view of reproduction according to which all parts of the body contribute to the seed from which the new animal grows, and that both parents contribute seed (DK 68A141; 143). The theory seems to presuppose that the presence of some material from each organ in the seed accounts for the development of that organ in the new organism. Parental characteristics are inherited when the contribution of one or other parent predominates in supplying the appropriate part. The offspring is male or female according to which of the two seeds predominates in contributing material from the genitals. In an atomist cosmos, the existence of particular species is not considered to be eternal. Like some other early materialist accounts, Democritus held that human beings arose from the earth (DK 68A139), although the reports give little detail.

5. Theory of Knowledge

One report credits Democritus and Leucippus with the view that thought as well as sensation are caused by images impinging on the body from outside, and that thought as much as perception depends on images (DK 67A30). Thought as well as perception are described as changes in the body. Democritus apparently recognized that his view gives rise to an epistemological problem: it takes our knowledge of the world to be derived from our sense experience, but the senses themselves not to be in direct contact with the nature of things, thus leaving room for omission or error. A famous fragment may be responding to such a skeptical line of thought by accusing the mind of overthrowing the senses, though those are its only access to the truth (DK68B125). Other passages talk of a gap between what we can perceive and what really exists (DK 68B6–10; 117). But the fact that atoms are not perceptible means that our knowledge of their properties is always based on analogy from the things of the visible world. Moreover, the senses report properties that the atoms don’t really possess, like colors and tastes. Thus the potential for doubt about our knowledge of the external world looms large.

Later philosophers adapted a Democritean phrase ou mallon or ‘no more’ in the argument that something that seems both P and not-P is ‘no more’ P than not-P. Arguments of this form were used for sceptical purposes, citing the conflicting evidence of the senses in order to raise concern about our knowledge of the world (de Lacy 1958). Democritus does not seem to be pursuing a consistently skeptical program, although he does express concern about the basis for our knowledge.

The idea that our knowledge is based on the reception of images from outside us is employed in Democritus’ discussion of the gods, wherein it is clear that our knowledge of the gods comes from eidôla or giant films of atoms with the characteristics we attribute to the gods, although Democritus denies that they are immortal. Some scholars take this to be a deflationary attack on traditional theology as based on mere images (Barnes 1982, pp. 456–61), but others suppose that the theory posits that these eidôla are really living beings (Taylor 1999a, pp. 211–6). Although atomism is often identified as an atheist doctrine in later times, it is not clear whether this is really Democritus’ view.

6. Indivisibility and Mathematics

The reasons for supposing that there are indivisible magnitudes apparently stem from Zeno of Elea’s account of paradoxes that arise if extension is understood to be infinitely divisible, i.e. composed of an infinite number of parts. The atomists may have sought to avoid these paradoxes by supposing that there is a limit to divisibility.

It is not clear, however, in what sense the atoms are said to be indivisible, and how the need for smallest magnitudes is related to the claim that atoms are indivisible. Furley suggests that the atomists may not have distinguished between physical and theoretical indivisibility of the atoms (Furley 1967, p. 94). The physical indivisibility of the atoms seems to be independent of the argument for indivisible magnitudes, since the solidity of atoms—the fact that there is no void within them—is said to be the reason why they cannot be split. The existence of void space between atoms is cited as the reason why they can be separated: one late source, Philoponus, even suggests that atoms could never actually touch, lest they fuse (DK 67A7). Whether or not Democritus himself saw this consequence, it seems that atoms are taken to be indivisible whatever their size. Presumably, though, there is a smallest size of atom, and this is thought to be enough to avoid the paradoxes of infinite divisibility.

A reductio ad absurdum argument reported by Aristotle suggests that the atomists argued from the assumption that, if a magnitude is infinitely divisible, nothing prevents it actually having been divided at every point. The atomist then asks what would remain: if the answer is some extended particles, such as dust, then the hypothesized division has not yet been completed. If the answer is nothing or points, then the question is how an extended magnitude could be composed from what does not have extension (DK 68A48b, 123).

Democritus is also said to have contributed to mathematics, and to have posed a problem about the nature of the cone. He argues that if a cone is sliced anywhere parallel to its base, the two faces thus produced must either be the same in size or different. If they are the same, however, the cone would seem to be a cylinder; but if they are different, the cone would turn out to have step-like rather than continuous sides. Although it is not clear from Plutarch’s report how (or if) Democritus solved the problem, it does seem that he was conscious of questions about the relationship between atomism as a physical theory and the nature of mathematical objects.

7. Ethics

The reports concerning Democritus’ ethical views pose a number of interpretative problems, including the difficulty of deciding which fragments are genuinely Democritean (see above, section 1). In contrast to the evidence for his physical theories, many of the ethical fragments are lists of sayings quoted without context, rather than critical philosophical discussions of atomist views. Many seem like commonsense platitudes that would be consistent with quite different philosophical positions. Thus, despite the large number of ethical sayings, it is difficult to construct a coherent account of his ethical views. Annas notes the Socratic character of a number of the sayings, and thinks there is a consistent theme about the role of one’s own intellect in happiness (Annas 2002). The sayings contain elements that can be seen as anticipating the more developed ethical views of Epicurus (Warren 2002).

It is also a matter of controversy whether any conceptual link can be found between atomist physics and the ethical commitments attributed to Democritus. Vlastos argued that a number of features of Democritus’ naturalistic ethics can be traced to his materialist account of the soul and his rejection of a supernatural grounding for ethics (Vlastos 1975). Taylor is more sceptical about the closeness of the connection between Democritus’ ethical views and his atomist physics (Taylor 1999a, pp. 232–4).

The reports indicate that Democritus was committed to a kind of enlightened hedonism, in which the good was held to be an internal state of mind rather than something external to it (see Hasper 2014). The good is given many names, amongst them euthymia or cheerfulness, as well as privative terms, e.g. for the absence of fear. Some fragments suggest that moderation and mindfulness in one’s pursuit of pleasures is beneficial; others focus on the need to free oneself from dependence on fortune by moderating desire. Several passages focus on the human ability to act on nature by means of teaching and art, and on a notion of balance and moderation that suggests that ethics is conceived as an art of caring for the soul analogous to medicine’s care for the body (Vlastos 1975, pp. 386–94). Others discuss political community, suggesting that there is a natural tendency to form communities.

8. Anthropology

Although the evidence is not certain, Democritus may be the originator of an ancient theory about the historical development of human communities. In contrast to the Hesiodic view that the human past included a golden age from which the present day is a decline, an alternative tradition that may derive from Democritus suggests that human life was originally like that of animals; it describes the gradual development of human communities for purposes of mutual aid, the origin of language, crafts and agriculture. Although the text in question does not mention Democritus by name, he is the most plausible source (Cole 1967; Cartledge 1997).

If Democritus is the source for this theory, it suggests that he took seriously the need to account for the origin of all aspects of the world of our experience. Human institutions could not be assumed to be permanent features or divine gifts. The explanations offered suggest that human culture developed as a response to necessity and the hardships of our environment. It has been suggested that the sheer infinite size of the atomist universe and thus the number of possible combinations and arrangements that would occur by chance alone are important in the development of an account that can show how human institutions arise without assuming teleological or theological origins (Cole 1967). Although here, as on other questions, the evidence is less than certain, it is plausible that Democritus developed a powerful and consistent explanation of much of the natural world from a very few fundamentals.

For the reception and subsequent history of Democritean atomism, see the related entry on ancient atomism.



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Other Internet Resources


I wish to thank the ancient philosophy editor John Cooper, A.P.D. Mourelatos and Tim O’Keefe for helpful comments and suggestions.

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