Structural Realism

First published Wed Nov 14, 2007; substantive revision Thu May 18, 2023

Structural realism is considered by many realists and antirealists alike as the most defensible form of scientific realism. There are different forms of structural realism, and an extensive literature about their pros and cons, and how they relate to case studies from science and its history. There are connections with debates in metaphysics, philosophical logic and philosophy of mathematics. This entry is a comprehensive survey of the field.

1. Introduction

Scientific realism requires belief in the unobservable entities posited by our most successful scientific theories. It is widely held that the most powerful argument in favour of scientific realism is the no-miracles argument, according to which the success of science would be miraculous if scientific theories were not at least approximately true descriptions of the world. While the underdetermination argument is often cited as giving grounds for scepticism about theories of unobservable entities, arguably the most powerful arguments against scientific realism are based on the history of radical theory change in science. The best-known of these arguments, although perhaps not the most compelling of them, is the pessimistic meta-induction, according to which reflection on the abandonment of theories in the history of science supports the expectation that our best current scientific theories will themselves be abandoned, and hence that we ought not to assent to them. (See §2 below and the entry on scientific realism for more on these arguments.)

Structural realism was introduced into current philosophy of science by John Worrall in 1989 as a way to break the impasse that results from taking both arguments seriously, and have “the best of both worlds” in the debate about scientific realism. With respect to the case of the transition in nineteenth-century optics from Fresnel’s elastic solid ether theory to Maxwell’s theory of the electromagnetic field, Worrall argues that:

There was an important element of continuity in the shift from Fresnel to Maxwell—and this was much more than a simple question of carrying over the successful empirical content into the new theory. At the same time it was rather less than a carrying over of the full theoretical content or full theoretical mechanisms (even in “approximate” form) … There was continuity or accumulation in the shift, but the continuity is one of form or structure, not of content. (1989: 117)

According to Worrall, we should not accept standard scientific realism, which asserts that the nature of the unobservable objects that cause the phenomena we observe is correctly described by our best theories. However, neither should we be antirealists about science. Rather, we should adopt structural realism and epistemically commit ourselves to the mathematical or structural content of our theories. Since there is (says Worrall) retention of structure across theory change, structural realism both (a) avoids the force of the pessimistic meta-induction (by not committing us to belief in the theory’s description of the furniture of the world) and (b) does not make the success of science (especially the novel predictions of mature physical theories) seem miraculous (by committing us to the claim that the theory’s structure, over and above its empirical content, describes the world).

Worrall’s paper has been widely cited in an extensive literature in which various varieties of structural realism are advocated or criticised, and different notions of structure are discussed. These contemporary debates recapitulate the work of some of the greatest philosophers of science of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. The increasing mathematisation of physics through the nineteenth century, with electromagnetism and thermodynamics lacking mechanical and material models, and then the advent of quantum and relativity physics, prompted a variety of structuralist responses. Worrall says he found his structural realism in Henri Poincaré (1902 [1905]; 1905 [1907]) whose structuralism was combined with neo-Kantian views about the nature of arithmetic and group theory, and with conventionalism about the geometry of space and time. (The prevalence of Kantian themes in the literature on structural realism is discussed further below; for more on Poincaré and structural realism see Giedymin 1982; Gower 2000; and Zahar 1996, 2001, and below.) Ernan McMullin (1990) argues that Pierre Duhem was a realist about the relations found in laws but not about explanations in terms of an ontology. According to Worrall (1989), Barry Gower (2000) and Elie Zahar (2001), Duhem too was a kind of structural realist, though there are passages in Duhem that more readily lend themselves to an instrumentalist interpretation (see the entry on Pierre Duhem). Milena Ivanova (2015a) compares the thought of Duhem and Poincaré in respect of conventionalism and structural realism, identifying significant differences between their views as well as similarities. Gower’s (2000) historical survey of structural realism discusses how it figures in the thought of Ernst Cassirer, Moritz Schlick, Rudolf Carnap and Bertrand Russell. Stathis Psillos (1999) explores the connections between structuralism and the Ramsey-sentence approach to scientific theory in the development of Carnap’s philosophy from logical positivism to ontologically relativist empiricism (Ramsey sentences are discussed in §3.2 below). Other important pioneers of structuralism about science include Arthur Eddington (see French 2003), Grover Maxwell (see Ladyman 1998 and §3.1 below) and Hermann Weyl (see Ryckman 2005).

Ladyman (1998) distinguished epistemic and ontic forms of structural realism in arguing for the latter. Many of those who have taken up structural realism have been philosophers of physics who have developed various forms of ontic structural realism, most notably Steven French. Others, including Worrall, have made it clear that their structural realism is a purely epistemological refinement of scientific realism. On the other hand, Bas van Fraassen (1997, 2006, 2007, 2008) defends an empiricist and non-realist form of structuralism about science, based on his view of scientific representation and motivated by an illuminating reconstruction of the origins of structuralism in the debate about the epistemology of physical geometry in the nineteenth century (see also Bueno 1999, 2000 on structural empiricism). Other kinds of structuralism abound in current analytic philosophy. These include causal structuralism concerning the individuation of properties, mathematical structuralism concerning the nature of mathematical objects, and structuralism about laws and dispositions. Following the debates about structural realism in the philosophy of science in the early twentieth century, the notion of structure in general, and the idea of modal structure in particular, have also become prominent in analytic metaphysics. Clearly, there many different notions of structure, and many different kinds of structural realism. This article reviews the main issues and provides a guide for further reading.

2. The Best of Both Worlds?

Scientific realism became dominant in philosophy of science after the demise of the forms of antirealism about science associated with the logical positivists, namely semantic instrumentalism, according to which theoretical terms are not to be interpreted as referring to anything, and theoretical reductionism, according to which theoretical terms are disguised ways of referring to observable phenomena. These forms of antirealism rely upon discredited positivist ideas about scientific language, such as that it can be divided into theoretical and observational parts, that much of it should not be taken literally, or that its empirically surplus content is redundant. Bas van Fraassen (1980) revitalised the debate about scientific realism by proposing his constructive empiricism as an alternative. His antirealism is sceptical rather than dogmatic, and does not depend on the distinction between theoretical and observational terms. He allows that terms such as “sub-atomic particle” and “particle too small to see” are perfectly meaningful and should be taken literally (the former term is theoretical and the latter term is not but both purportedly refer to unobservable entities). On the other hand, he holds that it is perfectly rational to remain agnostic about whether there are any such particles, because he argues that to accept the best scientific theories we have only requires believing that they are empirically adequate, in the sense of correctly describing the observable world, rather than believing that they are true simpliciter. (For more on constructive empiricism see Monton 2007.)

How then are we to decide whether to believe in the full theoretical truth of scientific theories, including what they say about unobservable entities such as electrons and black holes, or whether to believe instead only that our best scientific theories are empirically adequate? Van Fraassen argues that since the latter belief is logically weaker and yet as empirically contentful as the former belief it is natural for an empiricist to go only as far as belief in empirical adequacy. On the other hand, many philosophers are moved by the fact that belief in only the empirical adequacy of our best scientific theories leaves us unable to explain the phenomena that they describe. Inference to the best explanation is widely believed to be an important form of reasoning in science, and the production of explanations of the world is often supposed to be one of the main successes of science. When the target of explanation becomes science itself and its history of empirical success as a whole, we arrive at the no-miracles argument famously presented by Hilary Putnam as follows:

The positive argument for realism is that it is the only philosophy that doesn’t make the success of science a miracle. (1975: 73)

The no-miracles argument is elaborated in terms of specific features of scientific methodology and practice. Richard Boyd (1985, for example) argues that in explaining the success of science, we need to explain the overall instrumental success of scientific methods across the history of science. Alan Musgrave (1988) says that the only version of the no-miracles argument that might work is one appealing to the novel predictive success of theories. Some realists, such as Psillos (1999), have gone so far as to argue that only theories which have enjoyed novel predictive success ought to be considered as falling within the scope of arguments for scientific realism.

Colin Howson (2000), P.D. Magnus and Craig Callender (2004), and Peter Lipton (2004) argue that the no-miracles argument is flawed because in order to evaluate the claim that it is probable that theories enjoying empirical success are approximately true we have to know what the relevant base rate is, and there is no way we can know this. Magnus and Callender argue that “wholesale” arguments that are intended to support realism (or antirealism) about science as a whole (rather than “retail” arguments that are applied to a specific theory) are only taken seriously because of our propensity to engage in the “base rate fallacy” of evaluating probabilities without knowing all the relevant information. They think we ought to abandon the attempt to defend scientific realism in general rather than on a case-by-case basis.

This assumes that the wholesale arguments against scientific realism do not work. Of these the underdetermination argument, according to which the existence of empirical equivalents to our best scientific theories implies that we should withhold epistemic commitment to them, is is often dismissed by realists as generating doubt about unobservables that is no more worrying than doubting other minds or the external world. They argue that since scientists find ways of choosing between empirically equivalent rivals, philosophers ought not to make too much of merely in-principle possibilities that are irrelevant to scientific practice (see Laudan & Leplin 1991; Leplin & Laudan 1993; and Kukla 1998). (Kyle Stanford (2006) defends an underdetermination argument called “the problem of unconceived alternatives” with reference to the history of science, so perhaps not all underdetermination arguments are a priori and theoretical.)

The power of the arguments against scientific realism from theory change is that, rather than being a priori and theoretical, they are empirically based and their premises are based on data obtained by examining the practice and history of science. Ontological discontinuity in theory change seems to give us grounds not for mere agnosticism but for the positive belief that many central theoretical terms of our best contemporary science will be regarded as non-referring by future science. So-called “pessimistic meta-inductions” about theoretical knowledge take many forms and are probably almost as ancient as scepticism itself. They have the basic form:

Proposition p is widely believed by most contemporary experts, but p is like many other hypotheses that were widely believed by experts in the past and are disbelieved by most contemporary experts. We have as much reason to expect p to befall their fate as not, therefore we should at least suspend judgement about p if not actively disbelieve it.

More precisely, Larry Laudan (1981) gave a very influential argument with the following structure:

  1. There have been many empirically successful theories in the history of science which have subsequently been rejected and whose theoretical terms do not refer according to our best current theories.
  2. Our best current theories are no different in kind from those discarded theories and so we have no reason to think they will not ultimately be replaced as well.

So, by induction we have positive reason to expect that our best current theories will be replaced by new theories according to which some of the central theoretical terms of our best current theories do not refer, and hence we should not believe in the approximate truth or the successful reference of the theoretical terms of our best current theories.

The most common realist response to this argument is to restrict realism to theories with some further properties (usually, maturity, and novel predictive success) so as to cut down the inductive base employed in (i) (see Psillos 1996). Moreover Peter Lewis (2001), Marc Lange (2002) and Magnus and Callender (2004) regard the pessimistic meta-induction as a fallacy of probabilistic reasoning. However, there are arguments from theory change that are not probabilistic. Note first that there are several cases of mature theories which enjoyed novel predictive success, notably the ether theory of light and the caloric theory of heat. If their central theoretical terms do not refer, the realist’s claim that approximate truth explains empirical success will no longer be enough to establish realism, because we will need some other explanation for the success of the caloric and ether theories. If this will do for these theories then it ought to do for others where we happened to have retained the central theoretical terms, and then we do not need the realist’s preferred explanation that such theories are true and successfully refer to unobservable entities.

Laudan’s paper was also intended to show that the successful reference of its theoretical terms is not a necessary condition for the novel predictive success of a theory (1981: 45), and there are counter-examples to the no-miracles argument.

  1. Successful reference of its central theoretical terms is a necessary condition for the approximate truth of a theory.
  2. There are examples of theories that were mature and had novel predictive success but whose central theoretical terms do not refer.
  3. So there are examples of theories that were mature and had novel predictive success but which are not approximately true.
  4. Approximate truth and successful reference of central theoretical terms is not a necessary condition for the novel-predictive success of scientific theories

So, the no-miracles argument is undermined since, if approximate truth and successful reference are not available to be part of the explanation of some theories’ novel predictive success, there is no reason to think that the novel predictive success of other theories has to be explained by realism.

There are two common (not necessarily exclusive) responses to this:

  1. Develop an account of reference according to which the abandoned theoretical terms are regarded as successfully referring after all.

    Realists developed causal theories of reference to account for continuity of reference for terms like “atom” or “electron”, even though the theories about atoms and electrons have undergone significant changes. The difference with the terms “ether” and “caloric” is that they are no longer used in modern science. However, as C.L. Hardin and Alexander Rosenberg (1982) argue, the causal theory of reference may be used to defend the claim that terms like “ether” referred to whatever causes the phenomena responsible for the terms’ introduction. This is criticized by Laudan (1984) as making the reference of theoretical terms a trivial matter, since as long as some phenomena prompt the introduction of a term it will automatically successfully refer to whatever is the relevant cause (or causes). Furthermore, this theory radically disconnects what a theorist is talking about from what she thinks she is talking about. For example, Aristotle or Newton could be said to be referring to geodesic motion in a curved spacetime when, respectively, they talked about the natural motion of material objects, and the fall of a body under the effect of the gravitational force.

  2. Restrict realism to those parts of theories that play an essential role in the derivation of subsequently observed (novel) predictions, and then argue that the terms of past theories which are now regarded as non-referring were non-essential and hence that there is no reason to deny that the essential terms in current theories will be retained. Philip Kitcher says that: “[n]o sensible realist should ever want to assert that the idle parts of an individual practice, past or present, are justified by the success of the whole” (1993: 142).

The most detailed and influential response to the argument from theory change is due to Psillos (1999), who combines strategies (I) and (II). Hasok Chang (2003), Kyle Stanford (2003a,b), Mohammed Elsamahi (2005), and Timothy Lyons (2006) criticize Psillos’s account. Other responses include Kitcher’s (1993) model of reference according to which some tokens of theoretical terms refer and others do not. Christina McLeish (2005) criticizes Kitcher’s theory by arguing that there are no satisfactory grounds for making the distinction between referring and non-referring tokens. McLeish (2006) argues that abandoned theoretical terms like “ether” partially refer and partially fail to refer. Juha Saatsi (2005) denies premise (a) and claims that there can be approximate truth of the causal roles postulated by a scientific theory without its central terms necessarily successfully referring (see also Chakravartty 1998). There is no consensus among those defending standard realism in the face of theory change by adopting the selective approach of (II) with an account of reference.

Consider again the much-discussed case of the ether. Psillos argues that Fresnel’s use of the term “ether” was essential to his successful theorising, but that it referred to the electromagnetic field. Worrall (1989) argues that the project of defending realism by securing reference for abandoned theoretical terms is missing the point of the problem as well as the key to its solution. It is plausible to take “field” to be a new way of referring to what the ancients and early moderns termed “aether” or “ether”. Fields like the ether permeate all of space and are posited to explain optical, magnetic and other phenomena. Anaxagoras is said to have introduced the idea of the ether to propel the planets, and subsequently there were many ethers to account for various things. Fresnel’s optical ether was supposed to be a solid and Maxwell’s field behaves very differently and is said to be immaterial. However, from our current perspective the ether has much more in common with the field, than atoms do with the indivisible particles of antiquity (Stein 1989), and so continuity of reference is not the issue. The reference of the term “energy” at least overlaps in classical and quantum theories because quantities in each coincide in the limit as the number of particles increases. This does not solve the problem that the radical ontological and metaphysical differences between the theories pose for the realist. Different theories often use the same terms, to say very different things about what the world is like. The question of which terms refer, does not settle the whether it is plausible to say that the metaphysics and ontology of the theory is even approximately true, because in many case the same theoretical term is still used despite radical changes.

The argument from theory change threatens scientific realism because if what science now says is correct, then the ontologies of past scientific theories are far from accurate accounts of the furniture of the world. If that is so even though they were predictively successful, then the success of our best current theories does not mean they have got the nature of the world right either. The task of providing an adequate theory of approximate truth that fits the history of science and directly addresses the problem of ontological continuity has hitherto defeated realists, but a much more tractable problem is to display the structural commonalities between different theories. Hence, a form of realism about the structure of theories might not be undermined by theory change. Gerhard Schurz (2009) proves a structural correspondence theorem showing that successive theories that share empirical content also share theoretical content.

The structuralist solution to this problem is to take the metaphysical import of successful scientific theories to consist in their giving correct descriptions of the structure of the world, where this structure can be captured with different ontologies. Theories can be so different as to be contrary to each other, while both represent the same structure in the phenomena. Consider the theory according to which combustion is the emission of phlogiston that was dominant in chemistry prior to the end of the eighteenth century. Despite their radical disagreement about the nature of combustion both phlogiston theory, and the oxygen theory of Lavoisier that succeeded it, regard combustion, respiration and the calcination of metals as the same kind of process, and reciprocal to another kind of process exemplified by the smelting of ore. Furthermore there are tables of affinity that were formulated by the phlogistonists that can be reinterpreted in terms of Lavoisian chemistry (see Schurz 2009 and Ladyman 2011). Hence, even in this case there is continuity of structure despite the central entity of the old theory not existing at all according to the new theory

There are numerous examples of continuity in the mathematical structure of successive scientific theories. Indeed the principle that old ones should be recovered from new ones in some limit was explicitly formulated by Niels Bohr as the methodological principle known as the “correspondence principle”, according to which quantum-mechanical models ought to mathematically reduce to classical models in the limit of large numbers of particles, or in the limit of Planck’s constant becoming arbitrarily small relative to the action of the system. There are many cases in quantum mechanics where the Hamiltonian functions that represent the total energy of mechanical systems imitate those of classical mechanics, but with variables like those that stand for position and momentum replaced by Hermitian operators. There is a now a large literature in philosophy of physics that considers different characterisations of the structure of theories, and how it relates to to the relations between them, and their empirical content. Simon Saunders (1993a) discusses the structural continuities between classical and quantum mechanics and also shows how much structure Ptolemaic and Copernican astronomy have in common. Harvey Brown (1993) explains the correspondence between Special Relativity and classical mechanics. Jonathan Bain and John Norton (2001) discuss the structural continuity in descriptions of the electron, as does Angelo Cei (2005). Votsis (2011) considers examples of continuity and discontinuity in physics. Robert Batterman (2002) discusses many examples of limiting relationships between theories, notably the renormalization group approach to critical phenomena, and the relationship between wave and ray optics. Holger Lyre (2004) extends Worrall’s original example of the continuity between wave optics and electromagnetism by considering the relationship between Maxwellian electrodynamics and Quantum Electrodynamics. Alisa Bokulich (2008) considers the quantum-classical transition in detail arguing for what she calls “interstructuralism” as an approach to intertheory relations that emphasises structural continuities and correspondences. Zenker and Gärdenfors (2015) adopt a conceptual spaces approach to the continuity of theory structure. Joshua Rosaler (2015) analyses intertheory relations in physics arguing that local relations between models in different domains must be considered as well as global relations between theories. Manero (2022) argues for the stability of Lie algebras over theory change in physics.

The most minimal form of structuralism focuses on empirical structure, and as such is best thought of as a defence of the cumulative nature of science in the face of Kuhnian worries about revolutions (following Post 1971). See Katherine Brading’s and Elaine Landry’s (2006) “minimal structuralism”, and Otavio Bueno’s (1999, 2000) and van Fraassen’s (2006, 2007, 2008) structural empiricism (Ryckman 2005 calls the latter “instrumental structuralism”). For a range of recent work on the problem of theory change see Lyons & Vickers (eds.) 2021.

3. Epistemic Structural Realism (ESR)

Structural realism is often characterised as the view that scientific theories tell us only about the form or structure of the unobservable world and not about its nature. This leaves open the question of whether the natures of things are posited to be unknowable for some reason or eliminated altogether. Hence, Ladyman (1998) considers whether Worrall’s structural realism should be understood as a metaphysical or epistemological modification of standard scientific realism. Worrall’s paper is ambiguous in this respect. That he has in mind only an epistemic constraint on realism—commitment to the structure of our best scientific theories but agnosticism about the rest of the content—is suggested by his citation of Poincaré who talks of the redundant theories of the past capturing the “true relations” between the “real objects which Nature will hide forever from our eyes” (1905 [1907: 162]). So one way of thinking about structural realism is as an epistemological modification of scientific realism to the effect that we only believe what scientific theories tell us about the relations entered into by unobservable objects, and suspend judgement as to the nature of the latter. (ESR is called “restrictive structural realism” by Psillos 2001.) There are various forms this might take. (See French & Ladyman 2011.)

  1. We cannot know the individuals that instantiate the structure of the world but we can know their properties and relations.
  2. We cannot know the individuals or their intrinsic/non-relational properties but we can know their first-order relational properties.
  3. We cannot know the individuals, their first-order properties or relations, but we can know the second-order structure of their relational properties. Russell (1927) and Carnap (1928) took this extreme view and argued that science only tells us about purely logical features of the world.

Psillos (2001) refers to the “upward path” to structural realism as beginning with empiricist epistemological principles and arriving at structural knowledge of the external world. The “downward” path is to arrive at structural realism by weakening standard scientific realism as suggested by Worrall. Both paths are criticized by Psillos. Russell (1927) was led along the upward path by three epistemological principles: firstly, the claim that we only have direct access to our percepts (Ayer’s “egocentric predicament”); secondly, the principle that different effects have different causes (which is called the Helmholtz-Weyl Principle by Psillos); and thirdly, that the relations between percepts have the same logico-mathematical structure as the relations between their causes. This led him to the claim that science can only describe the world up to isomorphism, and hence to (3) above since according to him we know only the (second-order) isomorphism class of the structure of the world and not the (first-order) structure itself. Russell’s upward path is defended by Votsis (2005). Beni (2017a) considers the upward path in the light of the science of perception. Katherine Brading and Elise Crull (2017) explore the link between Poincaré’s philosophy of science and ESR, as does Ivanova (2015b) focusing on the connection with conventionalism and neo-Kantianism. Beni (2018) takes the downward path to ESR using information-theory.

Most defenders of ESR assume that there must be individual objects and properties that are ontologically prior to relational structure. Matteo Morganti (2004) differs from other epistemic structural realists by arguing for agnosticism about whether there is a domain of individuals over and above relational structure. Mauro Dorato argues for ESR on the grounds that structural realism needs entity realism to be plausible (2000) (but perhaps ontic structural realism can also be reconciled with entity realism to some extent (see below)).

3.1 Kantian ESR

As mentioned above, Poincaré’s structuralism had a Kantian flavour. In particular, he thought that the unobservable entities postulated by scientific theories were Kant’s noumena or things in themselves. He revised Kant’s view by arguing that the latter can be known indirectly rather than not at all because it is possible to know the relations into which they enter. Poincaré followed the upward path to structural realism, beginning with the neo-Kantian goal of recovering the objective or intersubjective world from the subjective world of private sense impressions:

what we call objective reality is… what is common to many thinking beings and could be common to all; … the harmony of mathematical laws. (1905 [1907: 14])

However, he also followed the downward path to structural realism arguing that the history of science can be seen as cumulative at the level of relations rather than objects. For example, between Carnot’s and Clausius’ thermodynamics the ontology changes but the Second Law of Thermodynamics is preserved. While Worrall never directly endorses the Kantian aspect of Poincaré’s thought, Zahar’s structural realism is explicitly a form of Kantian transcendental idealism according to which science can never tell us more than the structure of the noumenal world; the nature of the entities and properties of which it consists are epistemically inaccessible to us (as in (2) above). Ivanova 2013 considers how Perrin’s experiments converted Poincaré to atomism despite his previous opposition to it, but did not lead him to abandon his neo-Kantianism. Michela Massimi (2011) develops a different neo-Kantian perspective on structural realism.

Frank Jackson (1998), Rae Langton (1998), and David Lewis (2009) also advocate views similar to ESR. Jackson refers to “Kantian physicalism” (1998: 23–24), Langton to “Kantian Humility”, and Lewis to “Ramseyan Humility”. Peter Unger (1979) also argues that our knowledge of the world is purely structural and that qualia are the non-structural components of reality. Jackson argues that science only reveals the causal/relational properties of physical objects, and that

we know next to nothing about the intrinsic nature of the world. We know only its causal cum relational nature. (1998: 24)

Langton argues that science only reveals the extrinsic properties of physical objects, and both then argue that their intrinsic natures, and hence the intrinsic nature of the world, are epistemically inaccessible. Jackson points out that this inference can be blocked if the natures of objects and their intrinsic properties are identified with their relational or extrinsic properties, but argues that this makes a mystery of what it is that stands in the causal relations. Lewis’ structuralism is based on the centrality he gives to the Ramsey sentence reconstruction of scientific theories that is the subject of the next section.

3.2 ESR and Ramsey Sentences

A position called structural realism, that amounts to an epistemological gloss on traditional scientific realism, was advocated by Grover Maxwell (1962, 1968 [1972], 1970a, 1970b). Maxwell wanted to make scientific realism compatible with “concept empiricism” about the meaning of theoretical terms, and he also wanted to explain how we can have epistemic access to unobservable entities. The problem as Maxwell saw it was that theories talk about all sorts of entities and processes with which we are not “acquainted”. How, he wondered, can we then know about and refer to them and their properties? The answer that he gave, following Russell, was that we can know about them by description, that is we can know them via their structural properties. In fact, he argues, this is the limit of our knowledge of them, and the meanings of theoretical terms are to be understood purely structurally. The way that Maxwell explicates the idea that the structure of the theory exhausts the cognitive content of its theoretical terms, is to consider the Ramsey sentence of the theory (Ramsey [1929] 1931). Ramsey’s method allows the elimination of theoretical terms from a theory by replacing them with existentially quantified predicate variables (or names in the case of the influential D. Lewis 1970). If one replaces the conjunction of assertions of a first-order theory with its Ramsey sentence, the observational consequences of the theory are carried over, but direct reference to unobservables is eliminated.

If we formalise a theory in a first-order language:

\[\Pi(O_1,\ldots,O_n; T_1,\ldots,T_m),\]

where the Os are the observational terms and the Ts are the theoretical terms, then the corresponding Ramsey sentence is

\[\exists t_1,\ldots,t_m \Pi(O_1,\ldots,O_n;t_1,\ldots,t_m).\]

Thus the Ramsey sentence only asserts that there are some objects, properties and relations that have certain logical features, satisfying certain implicit definitions. It is a higher-order description, but ultimately connects the theoretical content of the theory with observable behaviour. However, it is a mistake to think that the Ramsey sentence allows us to eliminate theoretical entities, for it still states that these exist. It is just that they are referred to not directly, by means of theoretical terms, but by description, that is via variables, connectives, quantifiers and predicate terms whose direct referents are (allegedly) known by acquaintance. Thus Maxwell (and Russell) claimed that knowledge of the unobservable realm is limited to knowledge of its structural rather than intrinsic properties, or, as is sometimes said, limited to knowledge of its higher-order properties. It is arguable that this is the purest structuralism possible, for the notion of structure employed refers to the higher-order properties of a theory, those that are only expressible in purely formal terms.

This is an epistemological structural realism meant to vindicate and not to revise the ontological commitments of scientific realism. On this view the objective world is composed of unobservable objects between which certain properties and relations obtain; but we can only know the properties and relations of these properties and relations, that is, the structure of the objective world. However, there are serious difficulties with this view which were originally raised by M. H. A. Newman in 1928 and which have been recently discussed by Demopoulos and Friedman (1985 [1989]). The basic problem is that structure is not sufficient to uniquely pick out any relations in the world. Suppose that the world consists of a set of objects whose structure is W with respect to some relation R, about which nothing else is known. Any collection of things can be regarded as having structure W provided there is the right number of them. This is because according to the extensional characterisation of relations defined on a domain of individuals, every relation is identified with some set of subsets of the domain. The power set axiom entails the existence of every such subset and hence every such relation.

As Demopoulos and Friedman point out, if ∏ is consistent, and if all its purely observational consequences are true, then the truth of the corresponding Ramsey sentence follows as a theorem of second-order logic or set theory (provided the initial domain has the right cardinality—and if it does not then consistency implies that there exists one that does). The formal structure of a relation can easily be obtained with any collection of objects provided there are enough of them, so having the formal structure cannot single out a unique referent for this relation; in order to do so we must stipulate that we are talking about the intended relation, which is to go beyond the structural description. “Thus on this view, only cardinality questions are open to discovery!” (1985: 627 [1989: 188]); everything else will be known a priori.

This leads Demopoulos and Friedman to conclude that reducing a theory to its Ramsey sentence is equivalent to reducing it to its empirical consequences, and thus that:

Russell’s realism collapses into a version of phenomenalism or strict empiricism after all: all theories with the same observational consequences will be equally true. (1985: 635 [1989: 195])

Similarly, Jane English (1973) argued, though on the basis of different considerations, that any two Ramsey sentences that are incompatible with one another cannot have all their observational consequences in common. Hence it seems that if we treat a theory just as its Ramsey sentence then the notion of theoretical equivalence collapses onto that of empirical equivalence. (Demopoulos 2003 argues that similar considerations show that structural empiricism also collapses truth to empirical adequacy; he also discusses the relationship between Newman’s problem and Putnam’s Paradox. Votsis (2003) argues that the conclusion of the Newman argument doesn’t undermine ESR after all. Gordon Solomon (1989) defends Richard Braithwaite’s claim that Eddington’s structuralism (see §4.1 below) is vulnerable to Newman’s argument.)

Jeffery Ketland (2004) argues in detail that the Newman objection trivialises the Ramsey sentence formulation of ESR. Worrall and Zahar (2001) argue that the cognitive content of a theory is exhausted by its Ramsey sentences but that, while the Ramsey sentence only expresses the empirical content of the theory, the notion of empirical content in play here is sufficient for a form of realism. In his 2007 paper, Worrall sets out an account and defense of epistemic structural realism and responds to objections that have been raised to it, including the Newman problem. Cruse (2005) and Melia and Saatsi (2006) defend the Ramsey sentence approach against model-theoretic arguments by questioning the assumption that all predicates which apply to unobservables must be eliminated in favour of bound variables. Mixed predicates such as “extended” are those that apply to both observable and unobservable objects. The Newman objection does not go through if mixed predicates are not Ramsified, because a model of the Ramsey sentence will not necessarily be one in which what is claimed regarding the mixed properties and relations holds. In response, Demopoulos (2011) points out that the Ramsey sentence of a theory with mixed predicates where the latter are not Ramsified will be true provided the original theory is satisfied—hence the claim that the content of the Ramsey sentence is merely the observational content of the original theory plus a cardinality claim is still true when mixed predicates are considered. Melia and Saatsi (2006) also argue that intensional notions, such as naturalness and causal significance, may be applied to properties to save the Ramsey sentence formulation of ESR from triviality. (This recalls the defence of Russell’s structuralism against Newman discussed in Hochberg 1994.) Demopoulos also raises two problems with this strategy: firstly, even non-natural relations can have significant claims made about them in a theory, and secondly, the cognitive significance of unramsified theories is independent of a commitment to “real” or “natural” relations. Hence, Demopoulos insists that the Ramsey sentence of a theory and the theory itself are importantly different (see also Psillos 2006b). Peter Ainsworth (2009) gives an accessible account of the Newman problem and the responses that have been given to it. Ladyman (1998) and Ladyman and Ross (2007) argue that the Newman problem does not arise for ontic structural realism because it eschews an extensional understanding of relations.

In his 2011 paper, Demopoulos argues that there are three very different views in the work of Russell, Ramsey, and Carnap respectively, which have in common versions of a core structuralist thesis that he identifies. All the accounts he considers make use of Ramsey sentences; Demopoulos investigates the logical properties of the Ramsey sentence and arrives at an argument against the structuralist thesis. Friedman (2011) argues that Carnap’s account of theoretical terms involving the Ramsey sentence approach is not vulnerable to the Newman problem. The relationship between Friedman’s views on the relativized a priori and structural realism is interrogated in Ivanova (2011).

Structural realism is supposed to help with the problem of theory change. As Maxwell himself pointed out, his structural realism is a purely semantic and epistemological theory. The Ramsey sentence picks out exactly the same entities as the original theory. It does not dispense with reference, but it makes that reference a function of the (place of the theoretical terms in the) overall structure of the theory, as manifested in the Ramsey sentence. Hence, Ladyman (1998) argues that in general epistemological forms of structural realism do not significantly improve the prospects of standard scientific realism and that structural realism should be thought of as metaphysically rather than merely epistemically revisionary. The problem of ontological discontinuity is arguably left untouched by simply adopting Ramsification. In fact, it seems even worse if contextualism about the meaning of theoretical terms is adopted. Cei and French (2006) and Cruse (2005) also argue, on different grounds, that Ramsification is of no help to the structural realist.

Versions of ESR that employ the Ramsey sentence of a theory and the distinction between observational and theoretical terms are embedded in the so-called “syntactic” view of theories that adopts first-order quantificational logic as the appropriate form for the representation of physical theories. According to Zahar (1996: 14) the continuity in science is in the intension rather than the extension of its concepts. He argues that if we believe that the mathematical structure of theories is fundamentally important for ontology, then we need a semantics for theories that addresses the representative role of mathematics directly. Such an account of scientific representation is allegedly found in the so-called “semantic” or “model-theoretic” approach associated primarily with Patrick Suppes, Fred Suppe, Ron Giere and Bas van Fraassen, and more recently da Costa and French (2003). The relationship between structuralism and the semantic view is discussed by van Fraassen (1997, 2008), and Thomson-Jones (2011). Chris Pincock (2011) criticises structural realism on the basis of an analysis of the role of mathematics in scientific representation. See also Beni (2019) for the development of a form of structural realism together with an account of representation in general. Wallace (2022) argues that the mathematics-first view of scientific representation of the semantic view leads naturally to ontic structural realism.

4. Ontic Structural Realism (OSR)

Worrall’s statement of structural realism in his 1989 paper is not explicitly epistemic, and some of his remarks prompt a different interpretation:

On the structural realist view what Newton really discovered are the relationships between phenomena expressed in the mathematical equations of his theory. (1989: 122)

Some philosophers of physics had already more explicitly signalled a significant departure from traditional realist metaphysics. For example, Howard Stein says:

[O]ur science comes closest to comprehending “the real”, not in its account of “substances” and their kinds, but in its account of the “Forms” which phenomena “imitate” (for “Forms” read “theoretical structures”, for “imitate”, “are represented by”). (1989: 57)

Michael Redhead (1999: 34) says: “the best candidate for what is ‘true’ about a physical theory is the abstract structural aspect”. Accordingly, Ladyman (1998) argues that structural realism ought to be developed as a metaphysical position according to which, since the continuity in scientific change is of “form or structure”, the success of science should be accounted for in terms of the representation of modal relations among phenomena, not in terms of continuity of reference to objects and properties. Giere (1985) first suggested that a form of structural realism results from conjoining modal realism with constructive empiricism to form a modal empiricism. The idea of modal structure is central to OSR in the work of French, Ladyman, Ross and others, and is an abstraction of causal structure and nomological structure, that is intended to also include symmetry principles and perhaps more (the structure of dispositions described by Mumford (2004) and Psillos’s (2002) idea of nomological structure are more restrictive ideas of modal structure). The reason why it is claimed that some modal structure is retained on theory change, as well as the approximate truth of empirical regularities, is that counterfactuals, explanations and predictions are retained in a limited domain or regime when an old theory is superseded. For example, the reason the same side of the Moon always faces the Earth was explained by Newton in the third book of the Principia in terms of a gravitational tidal lock, and this explanation and related counterfactuals and predictions are retained in current physics even though Newtonian gravitation has been superseded by General Relativity. Nora Berenstain and Ladyman (2012) argue that a commitment to natural necessity is implicit in arguments for scientific realism, and that all scientific realists should be realists about modal structure as a form of natural necessity, and so should reject Humean supervenience. However, Esfeld (2009) develops a Humean take on structural realism, as does Lyre (2010). Ruyant (2019) considers how to understand continuity of modal structure in the history of science in terms of a modalised Ramsey sentence which he argues supports modal empiricism as distinct from structural realism.

OSR has attracted most sympathy among some philosophers of physics and physicists. This is natural since, while Worrall’s motivation for introducing structural realism was solely the need for a realist response to the pessimistic meta-induction, the proposal of OSR in Ladyman (1998) and its development in French and Ladyman (2003a,b) and their subsequent work was also motivated by two other problems:

  1. identity and individuality of quantum particles and spacetime points, and entanglement;
  2. scientific representation, in particular the role of models and idealisations in physics.

Their concern with (a) followed that of many of the pioneers of structuralism in twentieth-century philosophy of science including Cassirer, Eddington and Weyl. (Russell’s and Carnap’s versions of structuralism were more directly motivated by epistemological and semantic problems than by ontological issues arising from physics.) French did seminal work on the identity and individuality of quantum particles with Michael Redhead (French & Redhead 1988). In relation to (b), Redhead also wrote a classic paper on theories and models (1980), and French and Ladyman (1999) defended and developed the model-theoretic approach to scientific theories; Ladyman and Ross (2007), Gordon McCabe (2007), French (2014) and Wallace (2022) all defend OSR as a view that takes account of the ineliminability of mathematics in how physics represents.

OSR may be advocated as a response to current physics as a whole (for example, see Tegmark 2008), or in part (see below). Karim Thébault (2016) considers quantisation in order to formulate OSR. Dorato and Morganti (2022) consider structural realism as an ontology for Rovelli’s Relational Quantum Mechanics. Saunders and David Wallace have deployed structuralism to solve the problem of how macroscopic objects with more or less determinate properties can be recovered from the Everett interpretation of quantum states (the so-called preferred basis problem) (Saunders 1993b, 1995, and Wallace 2003). Saeed Masoumi (2021b) defends OSR by considering how to break the underdetermination of different forms of Newtonian physics. (Different versions of OSR are also elaborated and defended against various criticisms in Ladyman and Ross (2007), French and Ladyman (2011), Ladyman (2011), French (2014) and further sources cited below.)

Ontic structural realists argue that current physics teaches us that the nature of space, time and matter are not compatible with standard metaphysical views about the ontological relationship between individuals, intrinsic properties and relations. On the broadest construal OSR is any form of structural realism incorporating an ontological or metaphysical thesis that inflates the ontological priority of structure and relations. The attempt to make this precise splinters OSR into different forms (three of these are discussed in Ainsworth (2010) and he argues against two of them), and all of the following claims have been advocated by some defenders of OSR at some time (and some of them overlap, or differ largely or solely only in emphasis).

Eliminativism: there are no individuals (but there is relational structure).

A crude statement of ESR is the claim that all we know is the structure of the relations between things and not the things themselves, and a corresponding crude statement of OSR is the claim that there are no “things” and that structure is all there is, and in particular there are no individual things. This is called and “eliminative structural realism” by Psillos (2001) who objects to the elimination of objects from ontology, and “radical structuralism” by van Fraassen (2006), who argues it collapses the distinction between abstract and concrete structure and between pure mathematics and physics. For a recent defence of an explicitly eliminativist version of OSR see French (2010, 2016, 2019a). For a form of eliminativism about individuals in metaphysics developed without reference to structural realism see Dasgupta (2009).

Eliminativism is criticised on the grounds that there cannot be relations without relata. This objection has been made by various philosophers including Cao (2003b), Dorato (2000), Psillos (2001, 2006a), Busch (2003), Morganti (2004) and Chakravartty (1998, 2003) who says:

one cannot intelligibly subscribe to the reality of relations unless one is also committed to the fact that some things are related. (1998: 399)

The idea is that structure requires individuals, since structure is relations, and relations require relata which are individuals. Even many of those sympathetic to OSR object that it amounts to crediting relations without relata (Esfeld & Lam 2008; Lyre 2004; Stachel 2006; and Yaghmaie 2021).

However, there are at least two ways to make sense of the idea of relations without relata:

  1. The idea of a universal. For example, when we refer to the relation referred to by “larger than”, it is because we have an interest in its formal properties that are independent of the contingencies of its instantiation. To say that all that there is are relations and no relata, is perhaps to follow Plato and say that the world of appearances is not properly thought of as part of the content of knowledge. (See Esfeld & Lam 2008: 5, and the opening epigram in Psillos 2006a) This Platonic version of OSR is perhaps what Howard Stein has in mind:

    … if one examines carefully how phenomena are “represented” by the quantum theory… then… interpretation in terms of “entities” and “attributes” can be seen to be highly dubious… I think the live problems concern the relation of the Forms … to phenomena, rather than the relation of (putative) attributes to (putative) entities …. (Stein 1989: 59)

  2. The relata of a given relation always turn out to be relational structures themselves on further analysis. As Stachel puts it, “it’s relations all the way down” (although he denies the claim, 2006). See Saunders (2003d: 129) and Ladyman and Ross (2007) for the idea that there may be no fundamental relata, and hence that it is relational structure all the way down. The idea that there may be no fundamental level to reality is discussed in Schaffer (2003). Much discussion of OSR in ever form relates to issues of fundamentality and the relative ontological priority of objects, properties and relations. Horgan and Potrc (2000) take the fundamental level to be the whole universe so that there are not really any relations because there is only one thing. Schaffer 2010 argues that there are no external relations, in the sense that all relations are internal to the one thing that is everything. Other metaphysicians who doubt, deny or downgrade relations include John Heil, E.J.Lowe and Peter Simons (see Marmodoro & Yates 2016).

Another response to the relations without relata objection is to argue that OSR does not require that there be no relata, just that the relata not be individuals. However, there is no unanimity about the difference between individuals, objects, and entities among philosophers. One way of putting the issue is to ask whether all objects are individuals, or whether individuals are objects satisfying some additional criteria (for example, having identity over time or transworld identity, see Ladyman 2016). Clearly, debates about OSR are not productive unless the terminology is univocal, and the philosophical logic of individuals, objects and relations is explicit, and, given the extent of disagreement among philosophers about these matters, the sources cited here and in general should be read with the possible differences in terminology in mind.

There are relations (or relational facts) that do not supervene on the intrinsic and spatio-temporal properties of their relata.

The interpretation of entangled states in quantum mechanics in terms of strongly non-supervenient relations is due to Carol Cleland (1984). However, the idea that there could be relations which do not supervene on the non-relational properties of their relata runs counter to a deeply entrenched way of thinking among some philosophers, whose conception of structure is usually based on predicate logic and set theory. Hence, it is often assumed that a structure is fundamentally composed of individuals and their intrinsic properties, on which all relational structure supervenes. The view that this conceptual structure reflects the structure of the world is called “particularism” by Paul Teller (1989) and “exclusive monadism” by Dipert (1997). It has been endorsed by many philosophers, including Aristotle and Leibniz.

Spatio-temporal relations might be exempted from this prescription since the idea that the position of an object is intrinsic to it is associated with a very strong form of substantivalism. Hence, a standard view is that the relations between individuals other than their spatio-temporal relations supervene on the intrinsic properties of the relata and their spatio-temporal relations. This is David Lewis’s Humean supervenience:

[A]ll there is to the world is a vast mosaic of local matters of particular fact, just one little thing and then another … We have geometry: a system of external relations of spatio temporal distance between points (of spacetime, point matter, aether or fields or both). And at these points we have local qualities: perfectly natural intrinsic properties which need nothing bigger than a point at which to be instantiated … All else supervenes on that. (1986: x)

Tim Maudlin argues against this on the basis of quantum entanglement and argues that this means the end of ontological reductionism, and abandoning the combinatorial conception of reality that comes from thinking of the world as made of building blocks, each of which exists independently of the others (1998: 59) and: “The world is not just a set of separately existing localized objects, externally related only by space and time” (1998: 60). Similarly, advocates of OSR such as French and Ladyman emphasise that the non-supervenient relations implied by quantum entanglement undermine the ontological priority conferred on individuals in most traditional metaphysics. Some relations are at least ontologically on a par with individuals, so either relations are ontologically primary, or neither is ontologically primary or secondary. (Oliver Pooley 2006 and Esfeld & Lam 2008 hold the latter view, but Esfeld 2003, 2004 goes further and claims that if there are intrinsic properties they are ontologically secondary and derivative of relational properties [see below].) Primitive nonsupervenient relations of entanglement are a form of primitive modal structure. As discussed above and below, many advocates of OSR take the objective modal structure of the world to be ontologically fundamental, in the sense of not supervening on the intrinsic and spatio-temporal properties of their relata. The operational theory research programme in physics considers quantum mechanics in a more general space of theories that is analogous to the space of possible worlds of modal logic. Emily Adlam (2022) interprets the different constraints placed on correlations in different operational theories as different specifications of modal structure. See also Constructor Theory (Deutsch 2013), which is a formalism for physical theories based on possible and impossible transformations of states.

Individual objects have no intrinsic natures.

On this view, individual objects of a particular kind are qualitatively identical. They are not individuated by an haecceity or primitive thisness. Classical particles can be and often are so regarded, because if a principle of impenetrability is adhered to, no two such particles ever have all the same spatio-temporal properties. If there are spatio-temporal properties that distinguish each thing from every other thing, the identity and individuality of physical objects can be reduced to other facts about them. The bundle theory of individuation was developed by empiricists to account for the individuation of physical objects in terms of properties that are within the reach of natural science (such properties are called “qualitative” by Saunders).

This is a standard metaphysical position that implies nothing so radical as any version of OSR. It is relevant because it is often taken to require the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles (PII), which states in contrapositive form that there are no distinct objects having all the same properties (the discernibility of the distinct). PII is trivially true if its scope is taken to include properties that involve particular objects such as haecceities since clearly no two objects have the same haecceity, so it must be restricted so that such properties are not in its scope. The problem with PII is that prima facie in Quantum Mechanics entangled quantum states of many particles attribute exactly the same intrinsic and relational properties to each of them. For example, the famous singlet state of two fermions, such as electrons, attributes to the pair the relation that their spins in any given direction are opposite to each other, but does not attribute a definite spin in any direction to either particle alone. Given that they may also be attributed exactly the same spatial wavefunction, as when they are both in the first orbit of an atom, for example, then such particles would seem to violate PII. This leads to a dilemma that was articulated by Steven French and Michael Redhead (1988); either quantum particles are not individuals, or they are individuals but the principle of individuation that applies to them must make reference to some kind of empirically transcendent haecceity, bare particularity or the like.

French and Krause (2006) argue that quantum particles and spacetime points are not individuals, but that they are objects in a minimal sense, and they develop a non-classical logic according to which such non-individual objects can be the values of first-order variables, but ones for which the law of identity, “for all x, x is identical to x”, does not hold (but neither does “x is not identical to x”). Katherine Brading and Alexander Skiles (2012) consider the plausibility of arguing for structural realism on the basis of this underdetermination. The relationship between OSR and PII is assessed in Ainsworth (2011). The appeal to this problem of metaphysical underdetermination is criticised by Chakravartty (2003), who argues that it cannot be significant since it also obtains in the case of everyday objects. Morganti (2004) argues in favour of transcendental individuation, and also points out that if quantum mechanics is not complete and there are hidden variables as in Bohm theory, the quantum particles may be individuated by their intrinsic and spatio-temporal properties after all. Saunders argues that there is no underdetermination for reasons explained in (5) below.

There are individual objects or things, but they do not have any irreducibly intrinsic properties.

Michael Esfeld (2004) rejects (1) and argues that:

(a) relations require relata

but denies that:

(b) these relata must have intrinsic properties over and above the relations in which they stand.

As mentioned above Esfeld holds that there are things and relations but neither is ontologically primary or secondary. On this view, all the properties of individual objects are relations to other objects. This view is called “moderate structural realism” by Esfeld (and Esfeld & Lam 2008, 2011 and see also Lam & Esfeld 2012). It avoids the problems with (1) above, and is compatible with (2) and (3). Any version of (4) that is combined with (3) arguably makes individuals ontologically dependent on relational structure (see (6) below).

Benacerraf (1965) argues that there cannot be objects possessing only structural properties. The idea of such objects is denounced as “mysticism” by Dummett (1991), and criticised in the context of structural realism by Busch (2003). These objections go back to Russell:

…it is impossible that the ordinals should be, as Dedekind suggests, nothing but the terms of such relations as constitute a progression. If they are to be anything at all, they must be intrinsically something; they must differ from other entities as points from instants, or colours from sounds. What Dedekind intended to indicate was probably a definition by means of the principle of abstraction…But a definition so made always indicates some class of entities having… a genuine nature of their own (1903: 249 [ch. XXX, § 242]).

On the other hand, D.W. Mertz (1996) defends “network instance realism” and rejects the “tyranny of the monadic” arguing that individuated relation instances are ontologically fundamental. McKenzie (2016) argues on the basis of considering fundamentality in particle physics that particles are not defined by intrinsic properties.

Facts about the identity and diversity of objects are ontologically dependent on the relational structures of which they are part.

Saunders (2003a, 2003b and 2006) argues that there is a notion of discernibility (discussed by Quine 1976) that is satisfied even by electrons in the singlet state described above. Two objects are “weakly discernible” iff they satisfy some relation that is irreflexive in the pair of them. By the uncontentious converse of PII, sometimes known as “Leibniz’ law”, namely the Principle of the Indiscernibility of Identicals (or contrapositively put, the Distinctness of the Discernible), if the relation \(a\mathbin{R}b\) holds but the relation \(b\mathbin{R}a\) does not, then there must be distinct relata \(a\) and \(b\). Electrons in the singlet state stand in the relation of having opposite spin, and, an electron cannot have an opposite spin to itself, so, argues Saunders, they are weakly discernible. In this way the facts about the identity and diversity of objects are ontologically dependent on the qualitative relations they bear to each other.

This runs counter to the usual way of thinking according to which there are individuals in spacetime whose existence is independent of each other, and facts about the identity and diversity of these individuals are determined independently of their relations to each other (Stachel 2006 calls this “intrinsic individuality”). It is widely held that relations between individuals cannot individuate (account for the identity and diversity) of those same individuals or, as it is often put, “relations presuppose numerical diversity and so cannot account for it”. The argument is that without distinct individuals that are metaphysically prior to a relation, there is nothing to stand in the relation irreflexively that is supposed to confer individuality on the relata. The issue was famously discussed by Russell (1911), and see also MacBride (2006). Ladyman and Ross (2007), Saunders (2006) and Stachel (2006) argue that facts about the identity and diversity of fermions are not intrinsic, and obtain only in virtue of the relations into which they enter. On this view the individuality of quantum particles is ontologically on a par with, or secondary to the relational structure of which they are parts. Stachel (2006) calls this “contextual individuality” and he extends this to spacetime points (see §4.3 below).

Hannes Leitgeb and Ladyman (2007) note that in the case of mathematical structures there is nothing to rule out the possibility that the identity and diversity of objects in a structure is a primitive feature of the structure as a whole that is not accounted for by any other facts about it (Ladyman (2007) also discusses such primitive contextual individuality). One important question so far not much discussed is whether on the contextualist view the identity and diversity of the objects depends on the whole structure or just part of it. Another important issue is which if either of identity and diversity is primitive. Ladyman, Linnebo, and Pettigrew (2012) present some results about the relative strengths of different forms of discernibility in languages with and without names and identity (see also Ladyman 2015, 2016). In particular it turns out that weak discernibility in a language without names is equivalent to absolute discernibility in a language with names. In the light of this it is perhaps not surprising that in the recent literature the position that quantum particles can be absolutely discerned after all is defended in different ways by various authors (see Bigaj 2022 for a recent and comprehensive discussion of questions about the identity and individuality of quantum particles). Bigaj (2014) interprets the ontological dependence of objects on relational structures in terms of counterfactual identification, not identity and diversity, to propose an essentialist version of non-eliminativist OSR. For criticism of non-eliminative OSR in particular see Chakravartty (2012).

There are no self-subsistent objects, and relational structure is ontologically subsistent.

This claim is associated with quantum holism and holism more generally (see Horgan & Potrc 2000 and 2002). As mentioned above this is arguably implied by the conjunction of (3) and (4), and also by (5). The basic idea of ontological self-subsistence is that of being able to exist without anything else existing. The notions of ontological dependence and ontological subsistence are often employed in discussions of structuralism, but are in need of clarification (see Linnebo 2007). Kerry McKenzie (2014) uses Fine’s recent analyses of ontological dependence to argue against eliminativist OSR and in favour of moderate structural realism based on a case study from particle physics, and McKenzie (2020) formulates OSR in terms of determination. Vassallo, Naranjo, and Koslowski (2022) defend a metaphysics of self-subsisting structures for classical mechanics.

Individual objects are constructs

French (1999) and French and Ladyman (2003a) maintain that individuals have only a heuristic role. Poincaré similarly argued that “the gross matter which is furnished us by our sensations was but a crutch for our infirmity” (1898: 41). Ladyman and Ross (2007) argue that objects are pragmatic devices used by agents to orient themselves in regions of spacetime, and to construct approximate representations of the world. Anyone who defends eliminativism as in (1) above must similarly offer a non-ad hoc account of the point and value of reference to and generalization over objects in science. For example, cognitive science may show that we are not able to think about certain domains without hypostatising individuals as the bearers of structure. This is a subject for further study.

The articles in Landry and Rickles (2012) explore some of the above issues. See McKenzie’s (2013) review of the collection. See also the collection Bokulich and Bokulich (2011). Jo Wolff (2012) considers the relationship between objects and structures, arguing that the former are not reducible to the latter, and suggesting that a form of ontic structural realism may be defended in terms of the claim that objects are ontologically dependent on structures.

4.1 OSR and Group Theory

A symmetry is a transformation of some structure or object which leaves it unchanged in some respect. A group of symmetry transformations is a mathematical entity comprising the set of transformations, including the identity transformation and an inverse of each transformation, and the operation of composing them, where the result of two composed transformations is also itself in the original set. Mathematical objects can be characterised in terms of which symmetry transformations leave them unchanged or invariant, and symmetries of various kinds are associated with physical laws (see the entry on symmetry and symmetry breaking). Poincaré first understood the Galilean and Lorentz transformations as groups. These groups express fundamental features of reality, namely the dynamical symmetries of Newtonian and Einsteinian physics respectively. Poincaré understands group structure in Kantian terms as a pure form of the understanding in accordance with his epistemic form of structuralism.

Other pioneers of structuralism shared his appreciation of the importance of group theory in the metaphysics of physics. Cassirer held that the possibility of talking of “objects” in a context is the possibility of individuating invariants (1938 [1944]). Similarly, Max Born says:

Invariants are the concepts of which science speaks in the same way as ordinary language speaks of ‘things’, and which it provides with names as if they were ordinary things, (1953: 149)


The feature which suggests reality is always some kind of invariance of a structure independent of the aspect, the projection. (1953: 149)

He goes so far as to say:

I think the idea of invariant is the clue to a relational concept of reality, not only in physics but in every aspect of the world. (1953: 144)

Eddington says:

What sort of thing is it that I know? The answer is structure. To be quite precise it is structure of the kind defined and investigated in the mathematical theory of groups. (1939: 147)

The idea then is that we have various representations of some physical structure which may be transformed or translated into one another, and then we have an invariant state under such transformations which represents the objective state of affairs. The group structure is primary and the group representations constructed from this structure have a derivative status. Representations are extraneous to physical states but they allow our empirical knowledge of them. Objects are picked out by the identification of invariants with respect to the transformations relevant to the context. Thus, on this view, elementary particles are hypostatisations of sets of quantities that are invariant under the symmetry groups of particle physics.

For example, one of the most fundamental distinctions between kinds of particles is that between fermions and bosons. This was described group theoretically by Weyl and Wigner in terms of the group of permutations, and the former’s approach to relativity theory was similarly group-theoretic. In the case of quantum mechanics Weyl asserts that:

All quantum numbers, with the exception of the so-called principal quantum number, are indices characterising representations of groups. (1928/1931 [1931: xxi])

The central point of philosophical relevance here is that the mathematical idea of invariance is taken by Weyl to characterise the notion of objectivity. It is this that liberates physics from the parochial confines of a particular coordinate system. For Weyl appearances are open only to intuition (in the Kantian sense of subjective perception) and therefore agreement is obtained by giving objective status only to those relations that are invariant under particular transformations.

Weyl’s views were revived by Sunny Auyang (1995) in an explicitly neo-Kantian project which attempts to solve the problem of objectivity in quantum mechanics and quantum field theory (QFT). Auyang seeks to extract the “primitive conceptual structure” in physical theories and she too finds it in what she calls the “representation-transformation-invariant structure”. This is essentially group-theoretic structure. Auyang, like Born and Weyl, thinks that such invariant structure under transformations is what separates an objective state of affairs from its various representations, or manifestations to observers under different perceptual conditions. According to her events are individuated structurally.

Ryckman (2005) describes the history of relativity theory and Weyl’s role in it. Ryckman argues that the work of Eddington and Weyl was profoundly influenced by the phenomenology of Husserl. The latter also seems to have understood objectivity in terms of invariance. (Ryckman calls Kantian structural realism “transcendental structuralism”. OSR is what he calls “transcendent structuralism”.) Group theory in the development of structuralism deserves further historical analysis. It played a crucial role in epistemological reflections on geometry in relation to Klein’s Erlanger programme (Birkhoff & Bennett 1988). French (1998, 1999, 2000) and Castellani (1998a) have explored the ontological representation of the fundamental objects of physics in terms of sets of group-theoretic invariants by Cassirer, Eddington, Schrödinger, Weyl, Wigner, Piron, Jauch and others. See Bueno (2019), and Marquis (2020) for a recent discussion of structuralism in the history of mathematics in which group theory played a prominent role as it does in quantum field theory. On the other hand, Roberts (2011) criticizes the idea that structure can be understood as group structure in the context of quantum physics. Others have used other parts of mathematics to understand structuralism. Hannes Leitgeb (2021) develops a non-eliminative structuralism about graphs. See §4.2 below for OSR and category theory, and §4.4 and §6 for OSR and information theory.

4.2 OSR and Quantum Field Theory

There are states of quantum fields that can be identified with there being definite numbers of particular particles, but general states cannot. Particles are standardly thought of as particular excitations of the field sometimes called “field quanta”. Hence, the problem of metaphysical underdetermination raised by French and Redhead (1988) in the context of non-relativistic many particle quantum mechanics is obviated in the context of quantum field theory, because a particles-as-individuals view is not an option since, loose identifications of particles and field quanta not withstanding, field quanta are not individual things (see Bigaj 2018). Redhead (1999) reviews the interpretative issues with QFT and argues for OSR in the light of them. Much earlier, Cassirer rejected the Aristotelian idea of individual substances on the basis of physics, and argued that the metaphysical view of the “material point” as an individual object cannot be sustained in the context of field theory. He offers a structuralist conception of the field:

The field is not a “thing”, it is a system of effects (Wirkungen), and from this system no individual element can be isolated and retained as permanent, as being “identical with itself” through the course of time. The individual electron no longer has any substantiality in the sense that it per se est et per se concipitur; it “exists” only in its relation to the field, as a “singular location” in it. (1936 [1956: 178])

Cao in his book on quantum field theory sometimes sounds like an ontic structural realist, because he denies that the structures postulated by field theories must be “ontologically supported by unobservable entities” (Cao 1997: 5). However, in his (2003a) he explicitly criticises OSR and argues for a version of ESR in the context of a discussion of quantum field theory. Saunders (2003c and d) also criticises Cao for underestimating the difficulties with a non-structuralist form of realism in the light of the history of quantum field theory. Berghofer (2018) argues that quantum fields have intrinsic properties and that this undermines OSR.

In gauge quantum field theories, which are our best current physical theories of all the forces other than gravity, each field is associated with a particular symmetry group, and the unification of theories was achieved by looking for theoretical structures with the relevant combined symmetry (U(1) for quantum electrodynamics, U(2) for the electroweak theory and SU(3)/Z(3) for the strong interaction.) Lyre argues for OSR in the interpretation of gauge symmetry. He argues that

the traditional picture of spatiotemporally fixed object-like entities is undermined by the ontology of gauge theories in various ways and that main problems with traditional scientific realism…can be softened by a commitment to the structural content of gauge theories, in particular to gauge symmetry groups. (2004: 666)

He goes on to note that his favoured interpretation of gauge theories (in terms of non-separable holonomies) is one according to which the fundamental objects are ontologically secondary to structure because the objects of a theory are members of equivalence classes under symmetry transformations and no further individuation of objects is possible. Similarly, Kantorovich (2003) argues that the symmetries of the strong force are ontologically prior to the particles that feel that force, namely the hadrons, and likewise for the symmetries of the so-called “grand unification” of particle physics in the Standard Model of particle physics (but see McKenzie (2014) for a different view as cited above). However, There are “unitarily inequivalent” representations of the algebra of quantum field theories, and Howard (2011) and Ruetsche (2011) argue that this poses a problem for algebraic conceptions of structure. French (2012) responds, while David Glick (2016) argues for pluralism about structure in OSR on the basis of unitary inequivalence. McCabe (2007) presents the structure and interpretation of the Standard Model in ontic structural realist terms saying:

In terms of structural realism...fibre bundle cross-sections can be treated as the structures which lie beyond the empirical phenomena. (2007: 6)

French (2019b) addresses the Standard Model in terms of his account of OSR. Federico Benitez (2023) distinguishes between framework theories and interaction theories in assssing structural realism in the context of the Standard Model.

The ontology of fields and especially the status of vacuua, virtual particles and gauge fields is much contested. Malament (1996) and Halvorson and Clifton (2002), among others, argue that there is a fundamental conflict between relativistic quantum field theory and the existence of localisable particles. Similarly, when it comes to quantum field theory in a curved spacetime, “a useful particle interpretation of states does not, in general, exist” (Wald 1994: 47, quoted in Stachel 2006: 58). Fraser (2008) argues that there are no particles in quantum field theory on the basis of a theorem in algebraic quantum field theory (Haag’s theorem). Wallace (2006, 2011) adopts a different approach, considering the practice of Lagrangian or “effective” quantum field theory, which makes explicit that the theory does not describe interactions at certain energy and length scales, and arguing for a view of particles as scale-dependent emergent entities. Ladyman (2015) similarly argues that the current scientific understanding of particles exemplifies the claims of Ladyman and Ross (2007) that composition is dynamical, and that ontology is scale-relative.

If fields are construed as properties of space-time points or regions and then the issue becomes whether the spacetime points are individuals and this question is bound up with the debate about substantivalism in the foundations of General Relativity as discussed in the next section.

4.3 OSR and Spacetime Physics

There has been much dispute about how General Relativity relates to relationism and substantivalism about space and time. The main problem for the latter is the general covariance of the field equations of General Relativity: any spacetime model and its image under a diffeomorphism (a infinitely differentiable, one-one and onto mapping of the model to itself) are in all observable respects equivalent to one another; all physical properties are expressed in terms of generally covariant relationships between geometrical objects. Put crudely, since the points of spacetime are intrinsically indiscernible one from another, it makes no difference if we (smoothly) swap their properties around so long as the overall structure remains the same. This is made more apparent by the so-called “hole argument”, which constructs diffeomorphic models such that if they are regarded as physically distinct then there is a breakdown of determinism. John Earman and John Norton (1987) argue that substantivalists cannot just bite the bullet and accept this because the question of determinism ought to be settled on empirical/physical grounds and not a priori ones.

There have been a variety of responses to this problem. Lewis (1986) and Carol Brighouse (1994) suggest accepting haecceitism about spacetime points, but argue that it should not worry us that haecceitistic determinism, that is determinism with respect to which points end up with which metrical properties, fails. Melia (1999) criticises the notion of determinism employed by Earman and Norton. Nonetheless most philosophers of physics seem to have concluded that if spacetime points do have primitive identity, then the substantivalist who is committed to them must regard the failure of haecceitistic determinism as a genuine failure of determinism. Hence, others have sought to modify substantivalism. Carl Hoefer argues that the problems for spacetime substantivalism turn on the “ascription of primitive identity to space-time points” (1996: 11). Hence, it seems that interpreting spacetime in terms of an ontology of underlying entities and their properties causes problems for realism about spacetime.

In response various authors have adopted structural realism about spacetime. Robert DiSalle (1994) suggests that the correct response to the hole argument is that the structure of spacetime be accepted as existent despite its failure to supervene on the reality of spacetime points. (Masoumi (2021a) also thinks that consideration of the hole argument supports OSR.) This is akin to the position developed by Stein (1968) in his famous exchange with Grünbaum, according to which spacetime is neither a substance, not a set of relations between substances, but a structure in its own right. Similarly, Oliver Pooley (2007) argues that eliminativism about individual spacetime points can be avoided without any tension with General Relativity, if it is accepted that the facts about their identity and diversity is grounded in relations they bear to each other. His sophisticated substantivalism allows that spacetime points be individuated relationally and not independently of the metric field. This means embracing contextual individuality grounded in relational structure. See also Cassirer who says:

To such a [spacetime] point also no being in itself can be ascribed; it is constituted by a definite aggregate of relations and consists in this aggregate. (1936 [1956: 195])

The analogy between the debate about substantivalism, and the debate about whether quantum particles are individuals made by Ladyman (1998), Stachel (2002 and 2006), and Saunders (2003a,b) is contested by Pooley (2006). He argues that there is no such analogy, or at least not a very deep one, on the grounds that there is no metaphysical underdetermination in GR. According to him the standard formulations of the theory are ontologically committed to the metric field, and the latter is most naturally interpreted as representing “spacetime structure” (90).

Others who have discussed structural realism and spacetime include, Dorato (2000) who discusses spacetime and structural realism but rejects OSR, Esfeld and Lam (2008 and 2011) who argue for moderate ontic structural realism about spacetime (as defined above), and Bain (2006), who says that:

Conformal structure, for instance, can be realised on many different types of “individuals”: manifold points, twisters, or multivectors …What is real, the spacetime structuralist will claim, is the structure itself and not the manner in which alternative formalisms instantiate it. (2006: 64)

There are interesting connections between spacetime structuralism and the spacetime functionalism of Eleanor Knox (2019). Bain (2013) argues that critics of radical ontic structural realism have implicitly relied on a set-theoretic notion of structure and that a category theoretic formulation of ontic structural realism is useful in explicating the structure of physical theories, in particular, general relativity. Lal and Teh (2017) respond to Bain downplaying the significance of category theory for structuralism, but their arguments are contested by Eva (2016). Quantum gravity and structuralism is discussed by philosophers and physicists in Rickles, French, and Saatsi (2006).

4.4 OSR and the Special Sciences

Much of the work on ontic structural realism focuses on physics, but various authors have applied it much more widely. Gower (2000) argues that structural realism seems less plausible about theories from outside of physics, and Mark Newman (2005) argues that structural realism only applies to the mathematical sciences in therefore cannot account for retention of theoretical commitments across theory change in, for example, biology. However, Sarkar (2020) is more optimistic about the prospects for structural realism in biology if the focus is on organisational structure rather than laws, and French (2011 and 2014) also considers the implications of his form of ontic structural realism for the ontology of biology. French (2016) defends eliminative OSR across the sciences. On the other hand, Ladyman and Ross (2007) argue for OSR as part of a form of realism about the sciences as a whole, invoking the idea of real patterns due to Dennett and developed as part of Ross’s “rainforest realism” (see below). Harold Kincaid (2008) and Ross (2008) defend structural realist approaches to the social sciences. Tulodziecki (2016) considers the prospects of structural realism beyond physics. Ladyman (2008) considers the causal exclusion problem in the light of OSR, as does Cordovil et al (2023). Beni (2019) develops a form of structural realism for the cognitive sciences based on an analysis of representation and the scientific understanding of the brain in terms of connectionist networks and activation patterns. Ryan Nefdt (2021, 2023) develops a structural realist account of generative linguistics. Pierpaolo Donati and Margaret Archer (2015) argue for a relational ontology of individuals in sociology.

There are two ideas of general application to the special sciences associated with OSR, namely, effective ontology and real patterns. Together they provide for a degree of reconciliation of entity realism and structural realism in recent work, and both involve the idea of modal structure which is of wider signficance. Arguably in all of science except perhaps the ultimate physics, ontology is required only to be “effective” in the sense of applying in some domain or regime which may be characterised in terms of the kinds of processes involved, or in terms of scales of energy, length and time. Most of physics is in fact like the special sciences in the sense of not being fundamental, and not being applicable in all domains or regimes. For example, most of condensed matter physics — the study of all the properties of solids and liquids—is not applicable to energy scales at which there is no ordinary matter, as in the heart of the sun or in the early universe. In physics, quasi-particles like phonons are taken to exist when their half-life is effectively infinite relative to the scale of the interactions that are being studied. As mentioned above, the quantum field theories of the Standard Model of particle physics, and many other if not all theories in physics are effective (see Wells 2012). In general, Ladyman and Ross (2007) argue that ontology is scale-relative, in the sense that different energy levels and regimes, as well as different length and time scales, feature different emergent structures of causation and law, and that we should not assume that there is a fundamental level to reality.

The question of how the ontologies of the special sciences relate to more fundamental theories obviously relates to structural realism because in many cases the strongly empirically successful theories of the past are also the theories currently used in the relevant domain (see Robertson and Wilson forthcoming). For example, engineers and physicists still use Newtonian forces and classical optics despite the fact the theories about them have more fundamental successors. The ontology of such theories is effective as part of successful explanations and predictions. The idea of effective ontology readily relates to Dennett’s idea of real patterns. A real pattern is, very roughly, something that makes for a simplified description relative to some background ontology. Real patterns are entities of whatever ontological category that feature non-redundantly in projectable regularities. For example, a wave on the beach is a real pattern to a surfer, or a lifeguard, because it is taken as the basis for prediction and explanation. Waves are ephemeral and fuzzy real patterns, and in general real patterns are more or less definite and durable. David Wallace (2003) argues for the real-patterns account of effective emergent entities including worlds in the Everett interpretation as well as quasi-particles. Seifert (forthcoming) applies the idea of real patterns to chemical bonds which must also be considered as part of effective ontology. The precise definition of real patterns is a matter of debate. Ross sought to improve on Dennett’s original definition, Ladyman and Ross further refined it, and Suñé and Martínez (2021) criticise them and develop their own account. All agree that real patterns must be projectable in the sense of supporting prediction and explanation and hence modal. It is natural to characterise this in information-theoretic term in terms of compressibility, though it may also be thought about in terms of reduction in the effective number of degrees of freedom needed to model the dynamics of the system (Millhouse 2021 argues that compressibility is not apt for capturing real patterns that are coarse-grained with respect to the underlying ontology).

Ladyman and Ross (2007) defend Rainforest Realism, which is realism about the ontologies of the special sciences, by conjoining it with ontic structural realism in the philosophy of physics. They adopt scientific realism about effective ontology, and use their account of real patterns to provide a criterion of existence. According to the real-patterns account old ontologies are retained in much of scientific practice because they continue to identify projectible regularities in their domains of applicability. Relatedly, David Glick (2021) argues that the basis of the structural realist’s reply to the problem of theory change may be applied synchronically to allow for a pluralist structural realism. The problems of vagueness of composition and identity over time, and hence of generation and corruption all apply to both special science objects and everyday ones. Composition is often dynamical, especially in science, but the timescale of the interactions of the parts is very short compared to the timescale characteristic of the whole. Generation and corruption are not events at the level of the parts, but real patterns can indeed be created and destroyed by changes in the behaviour of other real patterns, and they can also persist over long time scales relative to the scale of the interactions of their parts. Hence, the real-patterns account of scale-relative ontology might provide a unified solution for both problems (Ladyman 2017). Such an account could be interpreted as being of the pragmatics of an ultimately epistemological kind of emergence as perhaps for Wallace. However, if there is not, or might not be, a fundamental level of reality, nor ultimate individuals of which everything else is made, then all real patterns are on a par. In this or some other way, the structural realist, like all scientific realists must give an account of the relationship between the ontology, causation and law described by theories and models that apply at different scales and so also in different sciences.

5. Objections to Structural Realism

As explained above, there are many different forms of structural realism and correspondingly, many different objections have been levelled against it. Obviously, ESR and OSR attract very different kinds of criticism, and different forms of each also face distinctive challenges. Varieties of structural realism and objections to it are also reviewed in Frigg and Votsis (2011). Worrall (2020) defends his form of structural realism against objections. Some common objections not already considered above are as follows:

Structural realism collapses into standard realism.

Psillos (1995) argues that any form of structural realism must presuppose a distinction between the form and content of a theory, and/or a distinction between our ability to know the structure and our ability to know the nature of the world. Both these distinctions are illusory according to Psillos because the scientific revolution banished mysterious forms and substances that might not be fully describable in structural terms. For Psillos, properties in mature science are defined by the laws in which they feature, and “the nature and the structure of a physical entity form a continuum” (1995: 31). Hence, for Psillos, structural realism is either false or collapses into traditional realism, echoing the response of Richard Braithwaite (1953: 463) to Eddington’s structuralism. Similarly, David Papineau argues that “restriction of belief to structural claims is in fact no restriction at all” (Papineau 1996a: 12), hence structural realism gains no advantage over traditional realism with the problem of theory change because it fails to make any distinction between parts of theories that should and should not enjoy our ontological commitment. Kyle Stanford (2003b: 570) also argues that we cannot distinguish the structural claims of theories from their claims about content or natures. As discussed above, the real patterns account and the idea of effective ontology can be used to reconcile structural realism with entity realism to some extent at least. Clearly, structural realism must be a form of scientific realism, and how distinct the positions are may be a moot point, but if scientific realism is not taken to involve a commitment to natural necessity then it is weaker than OSR characterised in terms of commitment to modal structure. Positions such as Chakravartty’s semi-realism (2007) and Massimi’s Perspectival Realism (2022) seem to agree with OSR that science describes modal structure. However, in the former case this is understood in terms of dispositions or powers which is too restrictive for most ontic structural realists for whom modal structure must include nomological structure, symmetry, equilibrium explanation and more (see French 2013). In the case of Perspectival Realism, modal structure is somehow tied to epistemic perspectives, and while real patterns are defined in terms of perspectives in Ladyman and Ross (2007), their notion of perspective is different to that of Massimi.

Not all structure is retained on theory change.

Many people’s first response to structural realism is to point out that mathematical structure is often lost in theory change too (see, for example, Chakravartty 2004: 164; Stanford 2003b: 570–572). If structural realism is understood as a form of selective realism seeking to identify what will be retained in advance then this makes it hopeless. However, the structural realist is not claiming that all structure is retained on theory-change, just that represent the relations among, or structure of, the phenomena in some domain, and in scientific revolutions the empirical content of the old theory is recovered as a limiting case of the new theory (so structural realism is not a form of selective realism, see Ladyman 2021). Post claimed there are no “Kuhn-losses”, in the sense of successor theories losing all or part of the well confirmed empirical structures of their predecessors (1971: 229). Well-confirmed relations among phenomena must be retained by future theories. This goes beyond mere belief in the empirical adequacy of our theories if we suppose that the relations in question are genuine modal relations rather than extensional generalizations about actual phenomena. However, Newman (2010) argues that structuralism cannot deal with the pessimistic meta-induction. McArthur (2011) argues that structural realism eliminates both theory change in science and scientific discovery.

Structural realism is too metaphysically revisionary.

Considerations from physics and the history of science do not logically compel us to abandon the idea of a world of distinct ontologically subsistent individuals with intrinsic properties. The identity and individuality of quantum particles could be grounded in each having a primitive thisness, and the same could be true of spacetime points. Physics does seem to tell us that certain aspects of such a world would be unknowable. The epistemic structural realist thinks that all we can know is structure, but it is the structure of an unknowable realm of individuals. An epistemic structural realist may insist in a Kantian spirit that there being such objects is a necessary condition for our empirical knowledge of the world. It may be argued that it is impossible to conceive of relational structures without making models of them in terms of domains of individuals. Certainly, the structuralist faces a challenge in articulating her views to contemporary philosophers schooled in modern logic and set theory, which retains the classical framework of individual objects, and where a structure is just a particular set, namely a set of objects, and a set of relations, where the latter are thought of extensionally as just sets of ordered pairs (or more generally n-tuples in the case of n-place relations), hence, some structuralists favouring of category theory as noted above.

Psillos (2001) argues that OSR is not “worked out” as a metaphysics, and that a strong burden of proof is on those who would abandon traditional metaphysics (see also Chakravartty 2004 and Morganti 2011). McKenzie (2017) also complains in a survey of OSR that the view has not been adequately articulated particularly in respect of the notions of individual, object and structure. The wealth of work referred to above makes these charges harder to sustain now, and in any case it is not clear that OSR’s rivals are “worked out” in any sense that OSR is not. There in no general agreement among philosophers that any of the metaphysical theories of, say, universals is adequate, and arguably metaphysical categories inherited from the ancient Greeks, the scholastics and the early moderns are not appropriate for contemporary science. Naturalists argue that we should reject metaphysical doctrines if they are not supported by science. Michael Esfeld (2004: 614–616) argues against any gap between epistemology and metaphysics. Similarly Ladyman and Ross (2007) argue for a kind of verificationism in metaphysics.

A key motivation for OSR is summed up by Ernan McMullin:

[I]maginability must not be made the test for ontology. The realist claim is that the scientist is discovering the structures of the world; it is not required in addition that these structures be imaginable in the categories of the macroworld. (1984: 14)

However, of course many metaphysicians do not accept these claims.

Structuralists cannot account for causation.

Busch (2003), Psillos (2006a) and Chakravartty (2003) all argue that individual objects are central to productive rather than Humean conceptions of causation, and hence to any genuine explanation of change. Objects are supposed to provide the “active principle” of change and causation. French (2006) replies to this charge invoking the idea of of modal structure discussed above. Structural realists think in terms of modal structure rather than causal structure to the extant that physics and other sciences describe relationships among phenomena of necessity, possibility, potentiality, and probability the world in ways that are not readily parsed in causal, dispositional or nomological terms. However, Ladyman and Ross (2007) argue that causation is very often the pragmatically indispensable proxy for modal structure in the sciences. For discussion of these issues see the “final section” of articles on modality and causality in structural realism in Landry and Rickles (2012).

Without positing knowledge of individual objects we cannot explain why certain properties and relations tend to cohere.

This objection is due to Chakravartty (2003) who points out that certain properties tend to be found together, for example, negative charge and a certain rest mass, and then asks “coincidence or object?”. French (2006) replies arguing that for a structuralist objects just are literally coincidences and nothing more. Once again the challenge for the critic of structuralism is to show that more than the minimal logical notion of an object is required, but there are many contexts in which this seems to be so. In response to this problem, the theory of real patterns could be developed so that so that triangulation among different modes of detection is required for ontological commitment to objects as opposed to minimal real patterns, but this is a subject for further work. O’Conaill (2014) argues that OSR cannot account for ordinary concrete objects. Saunders (2016) accounts for the emergence of macroscopic objects from the quantum in terms of decoherence.

Structural Realism collapses the distinction between the mathematical and the physical.

Many structuralists are motivated by the thought that if mathematics describes its domain only up to isomorphism, if, in other words, it only describes the structure of the domain, once the scientific description of the world becomes largely mathematical, then scientific knowledge too becomes structural knowledge. However, it may then be argued that if only the structure of mathematical theories is relevant to ontology in mathematics, and only structural aspects of the mathematical formalism of physical theories are relevant to ontology in physics, then there is nothing to distinguish physical and mathematical structure. Van Fraassen argues that the heart of the problem with OSR is this:

It must imply: what has looked like the structure of something with unknown qualitative features is actually all there is to nature. But with this, the contrast between structure and what is not structure has disappeared. Thus, from the point of view of one who adopts this position, any difference between it and “ordinary” scientific realism also disappears. It seems then that, once adopted, it is not to be called structuralism at all! For if there is no non-structure, there is no structure either. But for those who do not adopt the view, it remains startling: from an external or prior point of view, it seems to tell us that nature needs to be entirely re-conceived. (2006: 292–293)

The essence of van Fraassen’s objection here is that the difference between mathematical (uninstantiated/abstract) structure, and physical (instantiated/concrete) structure cannot itself be explained in purely structural terms. There is an analogy here with the theory of universals and the problem of exemplification. A similar complaint is made by Cao (2003a,b) and discussed in his debate with ontic structural realists. Esfeld (2013) uses this objection in the context of the interpretation of quantum mechanics to pose a dilemma for ontic structural realism. Saunders (2003d) points out that there is no reason to think that ontic structural realists are committed to the idea that the structure of the world is mathematical, just that it is described by it (see also French 2014). Tegmark (2008) explicitly embraces a Pythagorean form of OSR, but Ladyman and Ross (2007) argue that no account can be given of what makes the world-structure physical and not mathematical. If OSR is characterised in terms of modal structure then the mathematical structure of a scientific theory is understood as representing the modal structure of its domain, not as being identical with it.

There are two main versions of mathematical structuralism: a realist view according to which mathematical structures exist independently of their concrete instantiations; and an eliminativist position according to which statements about mathematical structures are disguised generalisations about their instantiations that exemplify them (see Shapiro 1997: 149–150.) For an excellent survey see Reck and Price (2000). The most well known advocates of realist structuralism in the philosophy of mathematics are Parsons (1990), Resnik (1997) and Shapiro (1997). Important critiques include Hellman (2005) and MacBride (2005). The relationship between ontic structural realism and ante rem structuralism has been explored by Psillos (2006a), Busch (2003), French (2006), Pooley (2006), and Ladyman (2007) among others. Many questions about objects versus individuals and the ontological priority of objects, properties and relations arise in discussions of structural realism and mathematical structuralism. Beni (2020) argues that the Benacerraf (1965) problem is a problem for OSR.

Structural realism lacks a clear notion of structure.

Arenhart and Bueno (2015) argue that the notion of structure is unclear, and that when made precise the position becomes indefensible motivating structural empiricism. Kyle Stanford (2010) argues that the consilience argument of Ladyman and Ross (2007) is based on the conflation of different kinds of structure. Lyons (2016) argues that the notion of structure deployed in structural realism becomes explanatorily vacuous when confronted with the history of celestial mechanics.

6. Other Structuralisms

As discussed above, the information-theoretic real patterns approach to ontology has been taken up by many ontic structural realists. Dunlap (2022) explores the connections between information-theoretic interpretations of quantum mechanics and OSR. A different form of informational structural realism in the context of the foundations of computer science is defended by Floridi (2008), and analysed in Bynum (2014) and Wheeler (2022). See also Beni (2016) and Long (2020) for the idea of digital ontology. Bueno (2010) argues that informational structuralism can be developed as a form of empiricist structuralism. Structuralism first became popular in analytic metaphysics in the form of causal essentialism. This is the doctrine that the causal relations that properties bear to other properties exhaust their natures (see for example, Shoemaker 1980 and Hawthorne 2001). Steven Mumford (2004) defends a structuralist theory of dispositional properties, and Alexander Bird’s (2007) theory of dispositions is in some ways structuralist. Anjan Chakravartty’s (2007) deploys dispositional essentialism in the defence of scientific realism. Michael Esfeld (2009) discusses structuralism about powers. Verity Harte (2002) discusses an interesting Platonic form of structuralism. Alistair Isaac (2014) argues for structural realism for secondary qualities. Ted Sider (2020) develops a form of structuralism in his approach to metaphysics and philosophical logic.


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The author is very grateful for comments on previous drafts of this entry to Ralf Bader, Katherine Brading, Jacob Busch, Anjan Chakravartty, Michael Esfeld, Katherine Hawley, Steven French, Øystein Linnebo, and Stathis Psillos. The editors would like to thank Christopher von Bülow and Gintautas Miliauskas for carefully reading this entry and identifying numerous typographical errors.

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