Carl Stumpf

First published Wed Jan 28, 2009; substantive revision Tue Jan 29, 2019

The name Carl Friedrich Stumpf (1848–1936) is historically associated with one of the most important philosophical trends in the early twentieth century, phenomenology. Stumpf supervised Husserl’s habilitation thesis in Halle in 1887 and the latter’s seminal work on phenomenology, Logical Investigations (1900–1901), is dedicated to him in recognition of his friendship and his philosophical contribution to this book. Stumpf is also known as the founder of the Berlin Institute of Psychology, which gave rise to Gestalt psychology, another important current during the early twentieth century and whose main adherents were among others, his students W. Köhler, K. Koffka, W. Wertheimer and K. Lewin. Founder of the Phonogram Archive in Berlin, now under the protection of the UNESCO, he is also considered one of the forefathers of comparative musicology and a pioneer in ethnomusicology. He held positions in the philosophy departments at the universities of Göttingen, Würzburg, Prague, Munich and Halle, before obtaining a professorship at the University of Berlin, where he was also rector in 1907–1908. His two main sources of inspiration in philosophy are Franz Brentano, of whom he was the first student in Würzburg, and Hermann Lotze, who supervised his doctoral thesis on Plato (1868) and his habilitation thesis on mathematical axioms (1870). The philosophical work he left us is as original and as diversified as his academic and institutional achievements. Besides many treatises in the fields of acoustics and musicology, his important contributions to the development of the “new psychology” and to the philosophy of the mind in general should also be noted. His friend William James said of him in his Principles of Psychology (p. 911) that he was “the most philosophical and profound of all writers; and I owe him much.” His studies in the field of descriptive psychology and phenomenology (known as the science of phenomena) for example, are of particular interest to current research in the fields of philosophy of mind and cognitive sciences.

1. Biographical Sketch

Stumpf’s intellectual biography is rich and complex due to his long university career that lasted for more than 50 years, his academic achievements, and his philosophical work. To complete this biographical sketch, the reader is invited to consult Stumpf’s autobiography (published in 1924) and Sprung’s biography, published in German under the title Carl Stumpf – Eine Biografie (2006).

  • 1848 Carl Friedrich Stumpf was born on April 21, 1848 in Wiesentheid in Franconia, Germany.
  • 1859–1863 Attended the Gymnasium in Bamberg, studied music and composed several pieces.
  • 1864–1865 Attended the Gymnasium in Aschaffenburg where he studied Plato with Hocheder.
  • 1865 Entered the University of Würzburg and during his first year studied aesthetics and law
  • 1866 Met Franz Brentano on July 14, 1866 during the disputatio of his habilitation and then decided to study philosophy with Brentano. From 1867 to 1870 he attended Brentano’s lectures on the history of philosophy, metaphysics, Comte and positivism and logic.
  • 1867–1868 Because Brentano had not been habilitated to supervise dissertations, it was recommended that Stumpf study with Hermann Lotze in Göttingen. He attended Lotze’s lectures on psychology, history of philosophy since Kant, philosophy of nature, and practical philosophy. He also attended lectures from the physiologist G. Meissner and the physician W. Weber.
  • 1868 Graduated on August 13, 1868 with a dissertation on Plato and then returned to Würzburg to study with Brentano.
  • 1869–1870 Entered the ecclesiastical seminary in Würzburg and resigned in July 1870 due to the influence of Brentano and Lotze.
  • 1870 Returned to Göttingen to prepare his habilitation on mathematical axioms under the supervision of Lotze and successfully defended it in October 1870.
  • 1870–1873 Lectured at the University of Göttingen where he founded the Eskimo society along with his friend Felix Klein. He also met G. Fechner and probably G. Frege, who studied in Göttingen during this period.
  • 1873 Published an important treatise on the origin of space perception, and dedicated it to Lotze.
  • 1873–1879 Was appointed to his first professorship at the University of Würzburg at the age of 25 to replace Brentano, who moved to Vienna in 1874.
  • 1878 Married Hermine Biedermann (1849–1930).
  • 1879–1884 Moved to Prague and was joined there by his friend Anton Marty in 1880. He developed professional contacts with Mach and maintained a close relationship with Ewald Hering.
  • 1882 Was visited by William James in Prague and this encounter led to the beginning of a lasting friendship between both philosophers.
  • 1883 Published the first volume of Tonpsychologie.
  • 1884–1889 Replaced H. Ulrici at the University of Halle and became a colleague of Georg Cantor and J. E. Erdmann.
  • 1887 Husserl submitted his habilitation thesis on the origin of the concept of number under Stumpf’s supervision.
  • 1889–1894 Arrived in Munich in 1889 as the successor to K. Prantl.
  • 1890 Published the second volume of Tonpsychologie. He also worked with H. Ebbinghaus, H. von Helmholtz, and G. E. Müller, among others, on the prestigious journal Zeitschrift für Psychologie und Physiologie der Sinnesorgane, of which Stumpf was one of the founding editors.
  • 1891 Involved in a controversy with W. Wundt and his students on the use of experiments and on Fechner’s law.
  • 1894 Joined the philosophy faculty in Berlin after a long period of hesitation; marked the beginning of a new period in his intellectual life.
  • 1896 Presided along with T. Lipps the third International Congress of Psychology in Munich.
  • 1898 Joined the Academy of sciences in Berlin. Founded the journal Beiträge zur Akustik und Musikwissenschaft, which contains many treatises written by Stumpf and his students.
  • 1900 Founded the Institute of Psychology in Berlin, which gave rise to Gestalt Psychology; started the Phonogramm-Archiv in Berlin on the basis of some phonographic recordings of a Siamese company performing in Berlin; in the same year along with F. Kemsies he started the Berlin Gesellschaft für Kinderpsychologie.
  • 1900–1901 Husserl’s groundwork Logical Investigations was published and dedicated to Stumpf.
  • 1904 Asked by the Board of Education to investigate the well-known case of “clever Hans” and in 1907 the results of this investigation were published by Stumpf and his assistant O. Pfungst in the book Clever Hans (The Horse of Mr. von Osten): A Contribution to Experimental Animal and Human Psychology.
  • 1906–1907 Published three important treatises, which were extensively discussed by philosophers and psychologists: “Erscheinungen und psychische Funktionen,” “Zur Einteilung der Wissenschaften” and “Über Gefühlsempfindungen.”
  • 1907–1909 Accepted the honorific position of rector of the University of Berlin; pronounced his first address “Renaissance of Philosophy” on the state of philosophy in Germany since Lotze.
  • 1908 Robert Musil, the author of The Man without Qualities, wrote a dissertation on Mach under the supervision of Stumpf.
  • 1909 Wolfgang Köhler received his PhD with a dissertation under the supervision of Stumpf, which was published under the title “Akustische Untersuchungen I.” Trip to Cambridge to celebrate the 100th anniversary of Charles Darwin.
  • 1911 Published Die Anfänge der Musik in which he summarized the results of his research on ethnomusicology.
  • 1912–1913 Established a station for anthropoids in Tenerife by the Academy of Sciences; as a member of the Academy, Stumpf recommended his student W. Köhler as director of this station. Köhler began his investigations in 1913 and published the results in his classic book The Mentality of Apes (1917).
  • 1921 Was appointed professor emeritus in Berlin and continued to teach philosophy in Berlin until the summer 1923.
  • 1922 W. Köhler succeeded Stumpf as director of the Institute of Psychology in Berlin.
  • 1923 With his assistant E. M. von Horbostel, Stumpf edited four volumes of the classical Sammelbände für vergleichende Musikwissenschaft. The fourth volume contains a study on popular music in Romania by the well-known composer Béla Bartók.
  • 1923 Festschrift in honor of Stumpf’s 75th anniversary in the Gestaltist journal Psychologische Forschung; this volume includes contributions by his students A. Gelb, C. von Allesch, W. Köhler, K. Koffka, M. Wertheimer, and K. Lewin, among others.
  • 1926 Published the results of extensive research on the nature of vowels and the sounds of speech in Die Sprachlaute; experimentell-phonetische Untersuchungen.
  • 1927/1928 Published a short biography on his friend W. James, based on their correspondence: William James nach seinen Briefen.
  • 1928 Published Gefühl und Gefühlsempfindung, an important collection of papers on emotions and feelings.
  • 1928 Celebrated his 80th anniversary for which an allocution was given by his friend and colleague Max Planck.
  • 1936 Carl Stumpf died on December 25 in Berlin at the age of 88.
  • 1939–1940 With the recommendation of Max Planck, his son Felix Stumpf published the two volumes of his monumental work Erkenntnislehre.

2. Historical Background

The two most important names associated with the young Stumpf’s philosophical formation are those of Franz Brentano and Hermann Lotze. His debt to Brentano is well documented in his autobiography and in the three biographies, which Stumpf (1918, 1919, 1922) devoted to him after his death in 1917. But opinions diverged regarding Stumpf’s later position to Brentano’s philosophical program. Some claim that Stumpf is a truly orthodox Brentanian (K. Schuhmann, 1996) while others argue that Stumpf gradually distanced himself from Brentano’s thinking and moved closer to that of Lotze (Ewen, 2008 Milkov 2015). The truth must lie somewhere in the middle if we are to judge the matter in light of Stumpf’s many testimonies in his biographical articles and in his substantial correspondence with Brentano where he unequivocally acknowledges his debt to Brentano.

Stumpf’s debt to Lotze’s philosophy is certainly significant but it is not very well documented. Most studies on the relationship between Stumpf and Lotze emphasize Lotze’s theory of local signs (see W. R. Woodward, 1978; Fisette, 2006, 2012; B. Centi, 2011) and the problem of the origins of space perception, which is in fact the central theme of Stumpf’s Raumbuch (Stumpf, 1873; M. Kaiser-El-Safti, 1994; D. Pradelle, 2015). In this book, dedicated to Lotze, Stumpf offers a summary of the debates between philosophers, scientists, and psychologists on the origins of space perception since Fechner. In the preface to this book, Stumpf explains that his starting point is the controversy between nativism and empiricism triggered by Helmholtz in his Handbuch (H. von Helmholtz, 1910, vol. 3, § 25) while his inspiration lies in Lotze (1852) Medizinischer Psychologie. Lotze’s influence on the young Stumpf’s thought is not limited to his doctrine of local signs as Stumpf repeatedly emphasized (R. Rollinger, 2008; N. Milkov, 2015; D. Fisette, 2009b). Beyond the question of influence, Stumpf assigns a central role to Lotze’s thought in the history of philosophy and associates him with a renaissance of philosophy in the mid-nineteenth century (Stumpf, 1907).

From his two mentors Brentano and Lotze, Stumpf inherited a marked interest in the history of philosophy. This interest was not strictly historiographical: his point of departure was Brentano’s theory of the four phases in the history of philosophy, and he worked out his own philosophy of history, which constitutes the basis of his diagnosis on the state of philosophy in the nineteenth century, which is inseparable from the way he conceived of philosophy. In his first address as the rector of the university of Berlin delivered in 1907 under the title “Renaissance of Philosophy,” exactly a hundred years after Fichte’s “Address to the German Nation” at the same university, Stumpf applied this philosophy of history to the nineteenth century and asked whether philosophy at this time belonged to an ascending stage of history and whether it tended towards a renaissance of philosophy. He identified two factors which marked the development of philosophy during this period: the empty space left by the decline of speculative philosophy of German idealism during the first half of the nineteenth century, and the remarkable development of psychology and of the physiology of senses during the second half of this century, due to the works of physiologists and physicists such as Fechner, Weber, Hering, and Helmholtz. These two factors corresponded to two divergent philosophical orientations at the time when Stumpf was undertaking his studies in philosophy. The first was the Kantian tradition in its different ramifications, including Neo-Kantianism; the second corresponds to what he called Erfahrungsphilosophie or philosophy of experience, which began with Fechner and above all with Lotze’s works on psychology and more particularly on the problem of space perception. Although it does not represent a homogeneous tradition, the philosophy of experience refers to common features of several schools and currents of thought which attempted to bring philosophy closer to natural sciences, and more particularly to the “new psychology”, which was neglected and relegated to the background by the other tradition. Corresponding to these two orientations are two different ways of doing philosophy: the philosophy of experience starts from below, and like any empirical science, uses the inductive method. They differ from an a priori and speculative approach to philosophy which favors an autocratic regime entirely disconnected from the empirical.

As B. Russell pointed out in his Essay on the Foundations of Geometry, Stumpf’s main criticism against Kant and a priori philosophy concerns the dichotomy between form and matter, more precisely the postulate of a priori forms of thought and sensibility. This criticism was already clearly formulated in his Raumbuch, where he examined the nativism-empiricism controversy on space perception, prepared some years earlier by Helmholtz in the third book of his Handbuch. This controversy is at the origin of an important division in the middle of the nineteenth century within the new psychology proponents, between empiricism advocated mainly by Helmholtz and Wundt; and nativism which, according to Helmholtz, characterizes the works of Ewald Hering in physiology, the latter of which in fact exercised an influence on the Brentano school and to a certain extent on Gestalt psychology. Instead of using Helmholtz’s terminology, as did most historians, Stumpf preferred the term phenomenology to designate the study of phenomenal experience, which occupied center stage in the field of physiology and psychology. In his Raumbuch Stumpf takes a stand in favor of a moderate form of nativism, according to which space is a unitary sense, its content is perceptible in an immediate and direct way, and it is inseparable from sensory qualities such as color and sound. Consequently, space and color constitute one and the same content, of which they are partial contents or attributes. They are in a relation of logical dependence with the phenomena of which they form a part. Hence, extension and color form a concrete whole which can only be separated through abstraction. From this point of view, the concept of space, as any concept, draws upon its origin in sense perception and is, to use the Scholastic expression, an abstracta cum fundamento in re.

3. Philosophy of Mind

Philosophy of mind or what is called descriptive psychology represents one of the main axes of Stumpf’s program in philosophy. His treatises in this domain are quite diversified, ranging from animal and developmental psychology to acoustic psychology and Gestalt psychology. Other than his Raumbuch, the book that made Stumpf renowned in psychology is Psychology of Sound (published in two volumes in 1883 and 1890) which was widely received in Germany and England (see reviews by P. Natorp, A. Meinong, T. Lipps and J. Sully). In this book, as in most of his treatises on psychology, Stumpf’s approach is similar to that of Brentano’s descriptive psychology. It differs from experimental and physiological psychology in that it conceptually analyses and describes what physiological psychology explains through the descriptive apparatus of the natural sciences such as biology or physiology. Between these two branches of psychology there is a form of division of labor wherein the first analyses and describes what the other explains. However, descriptive psychology has a methodological priority over experimental psychology in that the analysis and description of the explanandum is a prerequisite to its explanation. The two main tasks assigned to descriptive psychology are the analysis and the classification of mental states (also called acts or mental functions). In his influential study entitled “Phenomena and Mental Functions,” Stumpf shows how phenomena are closely linked in that they form a real unity, which can only be separated by abstraction. He conceives of phenomena as unitary wholes and not as aggregates, and claims that they are perceived as concrete and unitary wholes. As such, phenomena are the contents of sensations that are characterized by certain properties or attributes, for example extension, intensity, brightness, etc., and these contents of sensations are first-order phenomena as opposed to second-order phenomena like “mnemonic images” and phenomena such as color or sound, to the extent that they “are merely represented.” Although Stumpf rarely uses the concept of intentionality, one might say that mental functions are distinct from physical phenomena in that they are related to their objects by intentional relations.

Psychical functions have a specific structure that is characterized by the distinction between the content of a function and its relation to an object. This relationship is characterized by the notion of specific content, to which Stumpf refers with the concept of Gebilde (product), and by the quality and matter of an act. In an act of judgment, for example, the quality of an act consists in an affirmation or a negation, and it is characterized linguistically by the copula “is” or its negation. The “matter” (Materie) of a judgment is what remains when one disregards the affirmation and negation, i.e. the mere complex of presentations (subject and predicate without the copula). In addition to its quality and matter, the judgment conveys a specific “formation” or product (Gebilde) that Stumpf sometimes calls a state of affairs. They are “correlates” of thought and distinguish themselves from the individual act, of which they are the content, through their objective character. All other functions, from the simplest to the most complex, have their specific content. For example, the act of abstraction, which is responsible for the formation of concepts, has a concept as its specific content. In the field of more complex functions such as emotion, desire, and will, Stumpf maintains that we must also presuppose specific contents which he calls values.

Descriptive psychology’s second task is the classification of acts or psychical functions. This classification is based on the distinction between two classes of acts: intellectual and emotional functions. All functions that fall under either of these two classes have relationships ranging from the simplest to the most complex, so that functions of the second class presuppose, and are based on, lower level functions of the first class. This class of intellectual functions subsumes all acts ranging from sense perception to judgment. Sense perception in this classification has a particular status because it gives direct access to first-order phenomena and as such it is the function of consciousness (attention) through which something is noticed or apprehended. It serves as the foundation of all functions in that it provides them with their sensory material. Between perception and judgment, there is a series of intermediate acts: the act of presentation, which has as content second order phenomena, the act of abstraction and what Stumpf calls the acts of synthesis, whose specific contents are sets (Inbegriffe).

From the class of intellectual functions, Stumpf sets apart the class of feelings or emotional functions. Stumpf’s works in the field of emotions led to a debate with Brentano and were the subject of many discussions, particularly by the American psychologist E. B. Titchener. (E. B. Titchener, 1908, 1927; R. Reisenzein and W. Schönpflug, 1992; D. Fisette, 2013) At issue was whether the nature of pleasure provided by an object such as a work of art, for instance, is intentional, as was the case in Brentano’s theory wherein it is closely related to the class of emotions, or phenomenal as in Husserl and the sensualist theories of James and Mach. Stumpf claims that there is a specific difference between sense-feelings (bodily pleasure, pain, etc.) which are sensory qualities like sound and color, and emotions (joy, sadness, anger, disgust, etc.) which are intentional states directed towards states of affairs. Between emotional and intellectual functions, there is the same relation of foundation as that between judgment and perception, since judgment, or more precisely states of affairs, are presupposed by emotional functions which, although more complex, are nevertheless structured in the same way. In addition to emotions, this class of feelings subsumes the acts of desire and will, upon which the field of ethics is based. Between emotions and the will, there is a hierarchy comparable to that of the class of intellectual states, with the difference being however that the phenomenal basis of the class of emotional acts is nothing other than sense-feelings (pleasure and displeasure). Emotions belong to the subclass of passive feelings while desire and will belong to the subclass of active feelings. Feelings are passive in that they have something existent as an object (that is any object of a true judgment) while active feelings are related to a duty (object of a voluntary act). Values are the specific content of the class of active feelings (desire and will) while the contents of an emotion are values. Emotions are evaluative states concerning the content of a judgment and the evaluative element of emotions lies in the positive or negative stand taken with respect to the judged state of affairs. The difference between these two classes of acts lies therefore in their quality, meaning their negative or positive stand (Stellungsnahme) regarding their object: affirmation and negation in the case of judgment, love and hate in the case of the entire class of feelings. The relation of foundation between emotions and judgments or beliefs presupposes, on the one hand, a causal relation between states of belief and valuation (or stand), and on the other hand, an intentional relation between the content of belief and the emotion. From this point of view, jealousy, to use Stumpf’s example, would be a negative stand and a valuation of the state of affairs that a given person possesses and which another person wants or covets for herself, but which she does not possess; and this state is caused by the belief or judgment (true) that this state of affairs exists (besteht).

4. The Classification of Sciences

The starting point of Stumpf’s classification is the cardinal distinction made in Brentano’s Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint between two classes of phenomena, physical phenomena and mental phenomena, or what Stumpf calls sensory phenomena and psychical functions. (R. Rollinger, 2008b) The domain of psychical functions, to which internal perception gives access, belongs to descriptive psychology which constitutes the foundation of one of the two branches of Stumpf’s classification of sciences, namely the human sciences (Geisteswissenschaften). Human sciences such as aesthetics and ethics, are closely related to the major classes of the simple functions such as the class of emotions in ethics, for instance, and are defined as the sciences of complex functions. (Stumpf, 1906a, p. 21) The other branch is that of the natural sciences and it is based on physics. In the perspective of Stumpf’s Erfahrungsphilosophie, physics takes as its starting point the phenomena of external perception, and its task is to explain the regularity of phenomena by using the laws of physics. But Stumpf is not a phenomenalist as he advocates instead a form of critical realism that he conceives as the antithesis of phenomenalism such as that which he attributes to classical empiricism and to E. Mach. Nevertheless, Stumpf agrees with the latter that all concepts, including the concept of causality, originate from the contents of sensory experience and are the result of a process of abstraction. However, Stumpf clearly distinguishes the question of the origins of concepts, belonging to descriptive psychology, from the question of the origins and justification of knowledge, which falls within the theory of knowledge. This distinction is at the heart of his habilitation thesis and we shall have the opportunity to return to this important issue.

From these two main classes, Stumpf distinguished within his classification three neutral sciences whose task is to study the structure of the contents of psychical functions and sense phenomena in general. Stumpf claims that they represent three different fields of research, corresponding to three distinct sciences: phenomenology as the science of phenomena, eidology which studies formations, and the general theory of relations understood as the science of relations as a whole. These three new sciences are said to be “neutral” with regard to existing sciences and they are “propaedeutic sciences” in that their field of study represents the raw material and the starting point of the natural sciences as well as the social sciences. To use Stumpf’s terms, they are the atrium and the organon of all sciences and of philosophy.

What he calls phenomenology in his two Academy treatises of 1906 is a field of study to which he dedicated many works, from his early work on the origins of space perception up to his 1926 book on vowels and phonetics. The field of phenomenology in Stumpf’s sense is limited to phenomena and their properties and is defined narrowly as the science of phenomena. The study of formations and of objects of thought in general belongs to the second neutral science which Stumpf calls “eidology,” an expression that he borrowed from Herbart. Stumpf first introduced the notion of formation (Gebilde) in 1902 in order to characterize the specific contents of functions or what he also calls the objective correlates of a psychical function. Formations are contents that enter into consciousness through carrying out specific functions in the sense that to every class and subclass of acts there corresponds a certain content specific to each and every act. All psychical functions, from the simplest to the most complex, have their specific contents: concepts, states of affairs and values, to name only the most important. For example the act of abstraction, which is responsible for the formation of concepts, notably the concept of space, has a concept as its own specific content. States of affairs are contents of judgment, and they are comparable to Meinong’s “objectives”, Husserl’s “objectivity” or to Bolzano’s “proposition in itself”; they play a central role in Stumpf’s logic as we shall see later. (G. Fréchette, 2015; A. Chrudzimski, 2015) These are “correlates” of thought and, in contrast to individual acts, they have an objective character. The objectivity of formations, however, is not to be understood in terms of intentional inexistence (Brentano) or in the sense of Platonic realism (Bolzano and Frege), because any formation is logically dependent of the act that produces it, and the existence of states of affairs is logically linked to that of the act of judgment. They are therefore abstracted in the sense that they cannot exist independently from the acts by which they are produced. The same rule can be found in the field of more complex functions such as emotions, desires, and voluntary actions, whose specific contents are values. The very possibility of a neutral science such as eidology shows that we can study values in themselves, independently of any function; yet Stumpf claims that it is not possible to dissociate formations from their original functions.

Relations form the group of objects whose study belongs to the general theory of relations. This theory represents an important part of logic and formal ontology, and its task in fact lies in the study of the laws governing the formal relations between objects and parts of objects. This aspect of the general theory of relations is comparable to Husserl’s pure logic. The relations of structure between psychical functions and the hierarchy within the domain of simple and complex functions obey what Stumpf refers to as the “laws of structure” between parts or aspects of a whole. Its task is to establish relations between phenomena, functions, and formations and to investigate the origins of complex relations in simple relations, fixed by means of definition, and to determine the structural laws to which they obey. To these Grundverhälnisse or fundamental relations belong, namely, the concepts of analogy, equality and fusion that Stumpf examines succinctly in the second volume of Tonpsychologie, as being the relations of logical and real dependency, the part-whole relations as well as the relations of real dependency between psychical functions. These relations are immanent to phenomena and are noticeable directly and without intermediary. Sensory contents are noticed or remarked in themselves, and each of these relations is, to again use the Scholastic expression, an ens rationis cum fundamento in re. The notion of fusion designates one of the forms of relations that structure the sensory material. It is defined as the relation between two phenomena (or contents of sensation) by virtue of which they do not merely form a sum, but a whole. Stumpf argues that the elements which fuse into the whole, for example quality and intensity of sounds in a melody, are not changed, but this relation of fusion establishes between these contents a narrower unity which is perceptible as a Gestalt. To use the well-known case of the melody, moments of quality and of intensity form in that case a unitary whole which is perceptible as a “quality of form,” and it is precisely the unitary character of this perception, the fact that it is perceptible in one stroke and immediately as unitary form, that Stumpf tries to account for with the aid of the notion of relation of fusion.

5. Philosophy and Metaphysics

Within this classification of sciences, philosophy is meant to be the ultimate science responsible for the issues common to all sciences, i.e. to the natural and human sciences as a whole, but which are not specifically handled by any per se. That is why philosophy is considered the most general science of all sciences, and is defined “as the science of the most general laws of the mental and of those of reality in general” (Stumpf, 1906a, p. 91). Stumpf reiterates this position in his autobiography:

However one may formulate the difference between mind and nature, everybody distinguishes them in some manner. The philosopher, however, looks for what they may have in common. Thus philosophy is primarily the science of things in general, or metaphysics, to which the gateway is epistemology. But if philosophers since olden times have generally regarded psychology as belonging to their proper field is due to the fact that psychical elements have been much more prominent than the physical in forming fundamental metaphysical conceptions. It is therefore to the point to define philosophy as the science of the most common laws of the psychical, and of the real in general (or conversely). This is the only way through which we can justify the inclusion of logic, ethics, aesthetics, the philosophy of law, pedagogy, and other branches in the domain of the philosophical sciences; the connecting link is always essentially psychology, which must not therefore forget – when absorbed in experimental detail – the nobler phenomena of mental life that cannot be investigated in this manner and the great general questions. (Stumpf, 1924, p. 414–415)

Philosophy thus understood is first philosophy insofar as its main task is to investigate the laws that provide the cohesion and unity between mind and nature. It is closely related to metaphysics or to what Stumpf also calls “metapsychics” to the extent that it presupposes psychology as much as physics. But unlike traditional metaphysics, which is thought of a priori, Stumpf’s view of metaphysics, as he repeatedly imparted since his first lectures on metaphysics in Würzburg, is based on experience insofar as it is continuous with the empirical sciences and proceeds inductively, i.e. according to a bottom-up approach. (D. Fisette, 2015c)

Stumpf’s contribution to metaphysics has been the subject of recent studies, (K. Schuhmann, 1999; D. Jacquette 2000–2001; R. Rollinger, 2008b; R. Martinelli, 2011, 2015) and his lectures on metaphysics delivered in Halle in the late 1880s has been recently published. (C. Stumpf, 2015) He distinguished following Brentano four main branches of metaphysics: transcendental philosophy, which focuses on the justification of our knowledge of the external world, ontology whose domain includes, in addition to the categories, the topic of psychophysical relations and that of causality among other things; thirdly, theology which is concerned with the evidence of the existence of a foundation of the world, and finally, cosmology which deals namely with issues related to the actual infinite.

Stumpf focuses particularly in his writings on two specific topics related to the domain of ontology (D. Jacquette, 2000–2001, R. Martinelli, 2015), namely the categories and psychophysical relations. In Erkenntnislehre, he examines the categories of thing (substance), cause, necessity (legality), truth, reality, equality, and number (Stumpf 1939–1940, p. 13) and claims that these Grundbegriffe or categories have their origin in (internal and external) perception. This is primarily the case for the concept of necessity which is at the heart of his critique of psychologism. Stumpf agrees with Hume and J. S. Mill that we cannot observe necessary relations in nature, but he argues that internal perception provides us with many cases of necessary relations such as mathematical axioms, or in the perception of three consecutive sounds where one of them is necessarily intermediate (as to the pitch) between the other two. (Stumpf, 1939, p. 48) The concept of necessity, as the concept of causality, is formed through a process of abstraction and can then be used, hypothetically, to explain natural events based on causal laws. Moreover, we also find in Stumpf an original account of tropes which influenced the young Husserl. (R. Rollinger, 2015)

The second metaphysical topic to which Stumpf attaches great importance in his writings is that of psychophysical relations. Unlike most of his contemporaries, including Brentano and Husserl, Stumpf unequivocally rejects the doctrine of psychophysical parallelism according to which the physical and the psychological are aspects of one and the same reality and advocates, following Lotze, a form of interactionism that rejects monism in favour of dualism. The position that Stumpf defends in “Leib und Seele” and in his two studies on Spinoza, may be summed up by the following excerpt taken from his posthumous book:

The discredited dualism however, according to which everything in the world, including the mental and physical, stands in thoroughgoing interaction (directly or indirectly), now appears as the true monism. According to interactionism, the world, despite the diversity of its parts, is a unified organic whole. Thus the parallelistic view proves to be impractical and contradictory, and the theory of interaction therefore remains, for the time being, the best guide through the maze of this great problem. (Stumpf, 1939–1940, p. 822)

One of Stumpf’s arguments in favour of interactionism and against parallelism is Darwin’s theory of evolution (Stumpf, 1910, p. 78–79) to which he attaches great importance since the 1880s (E. Valentine, 2000) In an article entitled “Der Entwicklungsgedanke in der gegenwärtigen Philosophie,” Stumpf compares the bearing of Darwin’s theory on science to that of the Copernican revolution in astronomy. (Stumpf, 1899a) Stumpf’s interest in Darwin’s theory is clearly expressed in his work on psychophysical relations, the origins of music, animal psychology as well as in those on child development.

In his lecture on metaphysics as in his paper “Leib und Seele,” Stumpf’s main target is Mach’s phenomenalism and neutral monism, which amounts to reducing physical objects and subjectivity to functional relations between sensations (or elements) and inevitably leads, according to Stumpf, to idealism and solipsism. Stumpf published in 1919 a very interesting study on Spinoza’s parallelism in which he proposes an original and unorthodox interpretation of Spinoza’s Ethics. He argues that Spinoza’s parallelism, if understood correctly, has nothing to do with the psychophysical parallelism which was dominant at that time since Fechner. According to Stumpf, the heart of Spinoza’s parallelism rests on the distinction between act (or mental state) and the immanent object towards which it is directed. (Stumpf 1919b, p. 19) This act-content parallelism has its source in Aristotle and has been inherited by Brentano and Husserl via many philosophers from Thomas Aquinas to Descartes and Spinoza. Stumpf argues that this interpretation is consistent with Spinoza’s pantheism insofar as the distinction between the act and its immanent content has been transposed to God in Spinoza’s Ethics. For since God’s intellect is considered by Spinoza as the only possible subject, intentional acts and contents are then necessarily two of his numerous modes or attributes. (see R. Martinelli, 2011) Despite his critique of psychophysical parallelism, Stumpf advocates, like Spinoza, a form of pantheism that is consistent with his deterministic and mechanical conception of nature. In Erkenntnislehre, Stumpf recalls that pantheism is a view that he adopted in 1876 in the course of several discussions with Brentano on theism and this was the position that he already advocated in his lectures on metaphysics in Würzburg and later in Halle. Stumpf’s main argument against theism is its inability to satisfactorily resolve the problem of evil in the world. However, as Stumpf pointed out in Erkenntnislehre (1939–1940, p. 681, 798, 17), in his last writings, Brentano seems to adopt a form of pantheism similar to that of Spinoza. (Stumpf, 1939–1940, p. 798)

6. Philosophy of Mathematics

The recent publication of Stumpf’s habilitation thesis Über die Grundsätze der Mathematik raises many questions which have been the subject of recent commentaries. (D. Münch, 2002–2003; W. Ewen, 2008; C. Ierna, 2015). Stumpf’s habilitation thesis focuses on the nature and origins of mathematical principles or axioms. Its starting point rests on the following question:

Is there knowledge of scientific importance, which is in no way based immediately nor mediately on experience; and if there is such knowledge, what is its source? (Stumpf, 2008, Bogen 1–1)

The habilitation thesis is divided into two parts. In the first part, Stumpf examines two antagonistic positions which prevailed at the time, namely J. S. Mill’s empiricism according to which there is no knowledge that is not mediately acquired by induction, and Kantian transcendentalism which claims that our knowledge of the general principles of mathematics is based on synthetic a priori judgments. Stumpf rejects both accounts and seeks to show, in the second part of his thesis, that axioms and mathematical propositions are analytic a priori; they are not acquired through experience but are the result of a process of deduction from concepts.

In the critical part of his work, Stumpf raises the problem of the origins of the laws and principles of logic and mathematics as follows: if these principles are inductive in nature, as Mill believes them to be, then they do not constitute necessary truths; if, on the contrary, they are necessary truths, then the question arises as to whether they are synthetic a priori judgments as Kant claims or analytic a priori propositions as Stumpf claims. Against Mill, Stumpf argues that the axioms are not the result of empirical generalization based on an inductive process, and that arithmetic, like geometry, is a deductive science based on a priori and necessary truths, which are justified by the evidence of internal perception. (Stumpf, 2008, Bogen 5–4) Stumpf therefore agrees with Kant that axioms are necessary truths, but he denies that they are based on synthetic a priori judgments. Stumpf argues rather that Kant’s synthetic judgments presuppose a kind of “mental machinery” (Stumpf, 2008, Bogen 16–3) in order to account for their formation, as they involve numerous assumptions, notably the a priori forms of sensibility, intuition, and Denkformen, which Stumpf takes to be mere constructions. Stumpf criticizes Kant especially for the thesis according to which the origins of the necessity of our knowledge of axioms lie in intuition, in that knowledge of mathematics then becomes dependent upon experience. However, Stumpf argues that intuition understood in the Kantian sense is inductive and only leads to concepts and never to propositions. That is why Stumpf claims that the very idea of synthetic a priori judgments is a contradiction in terms. Axioms and propositions are analytic judgments constructed deductively from concepts. We can see that Stumpf’s fundamental argument against empiricism and transcendental criticism rests on the fundamental distinction between concept and proposition, which are of major philosophical significance in Stumpf’s subsequent work on the theory of knowledge, as we will later see. In his habilitation thesis, Stumpf is more concerned with delimiting the field of logic and mathematics from that of psychology. In this regard, Stumpf clearly separates the question of the origins of concepts, which is a psychological question, from the logico-mathematical domain to which propositions and axioms belong. For, as Stumpf argues in his posthumous work, one can agree with empiricism on the psychological origin of concepts while acknowledging that there is a priori knowledge which is independent from experience. (Stumpf, 1939–1940, p. 126) For Stumpf admits that the basic concepts of arithmetic (the concept of number) and geometry (the concept of space) have their origins in experience. In his Raumbuch, published three years after his habilitation thesis, Stumpf attempts to demonstrate the thesis that the concept of space has psychological origins. However, the position one takes on this issue is distinct from that which one adopts regarding the nature of propositions and necessary truths in the logico-mathematical domain. For, in this domain, one is solely concerned with axioms and propositions, which can be deductively inferred, and one also assumes the origins of the axioms and their justification as necessary truths. Stumpf argued in 1870 that these axioms are analytic a priori propositions and that arithmetic and geometry are deductive sciences.

There is a remarkable continuity in the work of Stumpf regarding his positions from his habilitation thesis up to his posthumous work, not only on the foundation of mathematics but also on the theory of knowledge. One of the main theses he advocates in Erkenntnislehre is based on the distinction between the origins of concepts and the origins of knowledge. (Stumpf, 1939–1940, § 1) Stumpf revisits the theme of mathematical axioms (Stumpf, 1939–1940, §§ 12–13) in the context of a critical discussion of Husserl’s doctrine of formal and regional ontologies. Stumpf’s conception of the concept of number in Erkenntnislehre is the same as the one he advocated in his habilitation thesis and in his Halle lectures, and Stumpf’s position is very similar to that of Brentano and his students. (W. Ewen, 2008, p 162 f.; C. Ierna, 2015) In this regard, Stumpf’s influence on his student Husserl’s habilitation thesis regarding the origins of the concept of number, including Husserl’s conception of symbolic presentations, is to be considered. (D. Münch, 2002, pp. 31–37)

Now, what is the place of mathematics in Stumpf’s classification of sciences? This question was left open in our earlier remarks because the classification criteria we used were based on the cardinal distinction between phenomena and psychical functions, which underlies the main division between natural and social sciences. But as Stumpf pointed out in his paper “On the Classification of Sciences”, contrary to the method with which most classifications that are meant to be normative proceed, a classification that describes the state of a science as it is practiced at a given time in the history cannot rely on a single criterion of classification, and its task is to show how several criteria are intertwined in many ways (C. Stumpf, 1906a, p. 88). This is why one must rely on a new criterion based on the distinction between a priori and a posteriori methods in order to delineate mathematics, including geometry, from the other sciences. Indeed:

The most tangible characteristic that is offered to us to delineate the mathematical sciences from all other sciences is that of the differences in method, i.e. the a priori method as opposed to the a posteriori method. Despite the opposing effort to assimilate mathematics to the natural sciences, this distinction persists, and in my opinion, rightly so. The attempt made by J. St. Mill to inductively derive the principles of mathematics (and logic) from a collection of several individual experiences manifestly runs in circles. (C. Stumpf, 1906a, p. 65)

This applies a fortiori to geometry which Stumpf, unlike Kant, refuses to ground on the concept of intuition insofar as it is an analytic a priori science, like any other branches of mathematics. The position he advocates in 1906 is therefore not different from the one he advocated thirty-five years earlier in his habilitation thesis. (Ewen, 2008, p. 157ff.) As an a priori science, one could say that mathematics is actually presupposed by all other sciences as Stumpf suggests in referring positively to Auguste Comte’s hierarchy of the positive sciences. (C. Stumpf, 1906a, p. 88) For, according to Comte, the hierarchy between sciences within his classification presupposes that all sciences, from physics to physiology, logically depend on mathematics, that is, the most simple science, and is the most autonomous with regard to all other sciences. In this regard, Stumpf here adopts a position akin to that of Brentano who followed Comte’s criteria on the matter of the classification of sciences, with the important difference being that psychology replaces sociology within Brentano’s system of sciences and that the field of psychical functions is, according to Stumpf, independent from all other sciences. (D. Fisette, 2015d; 2018b)

7. Theory of Knowledge

The theory of knowledge occupies a central place in Stumpf’s philosophy in his later works, especially in Erkenntnislehre, and we know that this discipline has always been at the heart of his teaching up to the end of his career in Berlin. We saw that Stumpf associates it both with the neutral sciences and the foundation of knowledge, specifically with the ultimate justification of knowledge. (Stumpf, 1939–1940, p. 7, 124) One of the central questions of the theory of knowledge is psychologism, which is the main topic in Stumpf’s article “Psychology and the Theory of Knowledge.” (D. Münch, 2002; G. Fréchette, 2013) Stumpf advocates a form of critical realism that he specifically opposes to Kantian idealism, and which maintains that the outside world is always the object of a supposition or hypothesis. Moreover, he claims that the only material that we have for formulating such an hypothesis are the concepts drawn from experience that enable us “to calculate the course of events.” One of the main tasks of the theory of knowledge, therefore, is to account for the most general modes of knowledge of the outside world. (Stumpf, 1891, p. 503) Stumpf distinguishes the theory of knowledge as a field of study from that of psychology on the basis of the cardinal distinction between the domain of concepts and that of propositions or necessary truths, as elaborated in his habilitation thesis.

Inquiry on the origins of concepts, as we said, is a task specific to psychology. In contrast, the theory of knowledge is limited to the research and justification of “the most general and immediately evident truths” (Stumpf, 1891, p. 501), such as laws and axioms necessary for knowledge. Yet, these axioms are nothing but propositions that we assume to be true and necessary, and they have their origin in the content of a specific class of psychical functions, namely judgments. Since the contents of judgments are formations or products (Gebilde) which, as we said, belong to eidology, the field of research of the theory of knowledge is therefore linked to that of this neutral science which also includes states of affairs. One must therefore avoid confusing the question pertaining to the nature of axioms with that of the psychological origins of concepts, but one can no more entirely separate the theory of knowledge from descriptive psychology since axioms are originally the contents of a specific class of psychical functions, i.e. the contents of judgments or of propositional attitudes whose justification is the task of the theory of knowledge. (Stumpf, 1891, p. 495–496; 1939–1940, p 124)

In light of this distinction, one can better understand the significance of the debate on psychologism such as Stumpf describes it in his 1891 paper. Stumpf opposes two schools of thought on the question of the relationship between the theory of knowledge and psychology: Kantian criticism that dissociates the theory of knowledge from psychology, and psychologism which Stumpf defines in this paper as “the reduction of all philosophical investigation, and especially all epistemological investigations, to psychology.” (Stumpf, 1891, p. 468) The argument in favour of psychologism boils down to the idea that “knowledge is itself a mental process and accordingly the study of its conditions would be a psychological investigation.” (Stumpf, 1891, p. 468) Critics of psychologism, on the other hand, argue that a psychological investigation can never lead to “knowledge of general and necessary truths.” (Stumpf, 1891, p. 469) Now since the conditions of possibility of knowledge, i.e. the forms of intuition and thought, are themselves a priori and therefore not analysable (Stumpf, 1891, p. 493), psychology is therefore useless for Kantian criticists.

The position adopted by Stumpf in this debate consists in conceding to criticism that necessary truths are irreducible to facts while admitting, with psychologists, that psychology is essential to the theory of knowledge. Hence the main mistake he attributes to Kantianism, which consists in refusing the assistance of psychological research in the theory of knowledge. (Stumpf, 1891, p. 493, 500) The field of psychology is understood here in a sense that is broad enough as to include sensory phenomena and mental functions because, in 1891, Stumpf did not explicitly distinguish the field of phenomenology from that of descriptive psychology. Now the main criticism he addresses to Kant focuses on the dichotomy between form and matter, and it is primarily the Kantian doctrine of phenomena (the manifold of intuition) that he holds responsible for its most obvious “mistakes.” In this article, Stumpf reiterates the main criticism that he addressed to Kant in his Raumbuch, namely “the doctrine of space as a subjective form and the Kantian conception of sensations as amorphous and unstructured matter designed to support the synthetic and unifying activity of the understanding.” (Stumpf, 1873, p. 15 f.)

However, this criticism of the Kantian theory of knowledge does not make Stumpf an advocate of psychologism. For Stumpf acknowledges with critical philosophy that we must maintain a strict concept of necessity and thus oppose the reduction of the principles and laws of logic and of science in general to simple empirical generalizations. Stumpf here refers explicitly to J. S. Mill, and maintains that the laws of nature and the principles of logic such as the principle of non-contradiction, for example, cannot be obtained merely by induction and are irreducible as such to the process of empirical generalization or “an accumulation of observations.” (Stumpf, 1891, p. 499–500) This raises the question as to what is the relationship between the position adopted by Stumpf in his 1891 article on the debate on psychologism and the position adopted by Husserl and Frege on the same issue several years later. Münch (2002, p. 50) argues that Stumpf’s position not only comes close to that of Husserl, but it also constitutes the background of Husserl’s critique of psychologism in his Logical Investigations. Ewen (2008, pp. 13, 22) argues instead that Stumpf is closer to the anti-psychologistic positions of Frege. But since they do not provide a clear definition of what is meant by “psychologism” and do not clearly present Stumpf’s, Frege’s, and Husserl’s respective arguments against psychologism, there is no way to settle this debate at the moment. (D. Fisette, 2015a)

That being said, there are parallels that can be drawn between the positions of Stumpf and of Frege on the foundations of mathematics and on psychologism. (see W. Ewen, 2008, p. 97 f.) Several attempts have been recently made to explain these parallels, and these accounts all focus on their mutual relationship with Lotze during their stay in Göttingen in the early 1870s, while Stumpf, after his habilitation, was Privatdozent (1870–1873), and Frege pursued his studies in mathematics (1871–1873). Although it can be assumed that the two philosophers met during this period, we have no written evidence that confirms this. (W. Ewen, 2008, p. 97 f.) Historical testimony does not say whether Frege attended Stumpf’s lectures in Göttingen on Aristotle’s metaphysics, which he taught for three consecutive years, or his lectures on “inductive logic with a particular focus on the problem of natural science” that he taught during the summer semester of 1873. Nevertheless, the correspondence that Frege and Stumpf exchanged in the early 1880s seems to testify that the two philosophers knew each other. In any case, an explanation of the elective affinities between Stumpf and Frege might be found in the work of Lotze. (Stumpf, 1918, p. 7; D. Fisette, 2015a)

8. Logic, Language, and States of Affairs

Stumpf did not publish any specific work on the topic of logic and wrote only a few pieces on language. These are however two topics in which Stumpf was very much interested. The topic of language was central in his 1876 paper on Anton Marty’s dissertation entitled Über den Ursprung der Sprache (A. Marty, 1875; L. Cesalli, 2015). Also worth mentioning is an essay on the psychology of music in England (1885) and his book Die Anfänge der Musik (1911) in which he discussed, in relation to Spencer and Darwin, the thesis of the linguistic origin of music. Finally he made a significant contribution to the field of phonology and conducted an extensive research on the nature of vowels and linguistic sounds, and this led to the publication of his book Die Sprachlaute (1926) in which he experimentally confirms Helmholtz’s principles on the theory of vowels. As to the domain of logic, there are many syllabi and extensive lecture notes, including those written by Husserl during his studies in Halle, which again show a direct influence from Brentano (K. Schuhmann, 1996, 1997; R. Rollinger, 2015). We know that logic is closely related to Stumpf’s theory of relations and eidology, which are central in both his philosophical and empirical works. More precisely, his contribution to logic in these two research areas concerns in fact the specific content of judgment (belief) or what he also calls states of affairs, and that part of the theory of relations pertaining to part-whole relations. The first leads to a theory of the states of affairs while the second was useful in developing a formal ontology, one that was central in the logic of his student Husserl. Finally, mention should be made of Stumpf’s publications on the relationship between logic and the theory of probabilities, and his research pertaining to the elaboration of a theory of induction. He claimed that the application of probability concepts does not involve any presuppositions about the external world and the law of causality, for the calculus of probability is purely a priori and is solely derived from the concept of probability itself.

Regarding his lectures on logic, while he accepted Brentano’s important distinction between what a statement expresses and what it means, he did not subscribe to Brentano’s central thesis on the reduction of categorical to existential statements. The meaning of a sentence corresponds to the content of a function, and it is distinct from the quality and matter of a predicative judgment. The quality of an act of judgment consists in its affirmation or negation, its acceptance or rejection of the matter of a judgment expressed linguistically by the copula “is” or its negation. The matter (Materie) of a judgment, which is provided by the lower level act of presentation, is what remains when one disregards the affirmation and negation, i.e. the simple complex of presentation (subject and predicate minus the copula). In addition to its quality and matter, a judgment has a content and a state of affairs, the latter roughly corresponding to what we call a proposition. Stumpf conceives a state of affairs both as a specific content of judgment and as its objective and necessary correlate, which is expressed linguistically in “subordinate clauses” or in the form of a “substantivized infinitive.” It therefore corresponds to what Stumpf called axioms. The truth of a statement is defined as the correspondence of the judgment quality to its content, that is, the property of a judicative content by virtue of which acceptance (or its opposite, rejection) is prompted by purely objective motives. This concept of truth is grounded in the evidence of internal perception (is true what is mediately or immediately self-evident), which also plays a central role in his theory of knowledge.

The study of the structures of the contents of judgment as such, apart from its functions and contingent states, is one of the tasks Stumpf assigns to this part of eidology which he calls the theory of states of affairs. (A. Chrudzimski, 2015) One of Stumpf’s original contributions to logic rests on the notion of state of affairs, which was already used in the history of philosophy and especially by Lotze. (B. Smith, 1989, § 2) Stumpf already used this notion in his lectures on logic in 1888 (Q 13, p. 4), and it is now well-known that it has been subsequently taken over by many philosophers including Husserl and Wittgenstein. In 1906, Stumpf associates it with the concept of formation or product (Gebilde) and applies it to both intellectual and emotional functions, where in the latter case it is conceived as a value (also called Wertverhalt) on which ethics and practical philosophy in general are based. These Gebilde are objective entities that are related both to the concept of objective in Meinong, to that of objectity in Husserl, and to Bolzano’s concept of “proposition in itself.” (Stumpf, 1906b, p. 30) For this student of Lotze, the doctrine of Gebilde is not incompatible with the Platonic theory of ideas though “without its metaphysical conclusions.” (Stumpf, 1906a, p. 33) One can certainly entertain a formation such as a state of affairs without having it as an actual content of judgment, but it is then a mere abstraction. Because, says Stumpf, “the state of affairs cannot be immediately given for itself independently of any mental function, and therefore effectively. It can only be real as the content of a judgment that is actually taking place. […] So, functions (and indeed only the conscious functions which are properly present) are facts immediately known, while the Gebilde are facts only regarded as contents of functions.” (Stumpf, 1906a, p. 32) Objectivism is an important issue in Stumpf’s philosophy since it serves as one of his main arguments against psychologism.

States of affairs are, as any other formation, governed by general and necessary laws, and are independent of the individual and the contingent act of judging. These structural laws or axioms as he calls them in his Erkenntnislehre govern relations between elementary psychical formations. Stumpf distinguishes between formal axioms, which apply to any objects, and material or regional axioms which belong to specific domains of objects such as the domain of phenomenology (structural relations between phenomena) and that of psychology (structural relations between elementary psychical functions). Of particular interest to logic are the axioms of consequence (Folgerungsaxiome), which are expressed in propositions and which establish a relation between the premises and the conclusion in terms of necessary inference.

9. Further Contributions

9.1 Ethics

In his second address as rector of the University of Berlin in 1908, Stumpf (1910c) expressed his opposition to formalism and moral skepticism and argued for an ethics based on an objective theory of values. It will be recalled that values are specific contents of acts belonging to the class of emotional functions or feelings and that they resemble the contents of judgment that belong to the class of intellectual functions. Ethics, like aesthetics, is grounded entirely on the class of feelings. Echoing Lotze’s distinction between passive and active feelings, Stumpf argues that emotions are passive feelings as opposed to active feelings which are directed towards a duty, a project, or an intention to be achieved through voluntary actions. Values or value-feelings, which are essential for an ethics worthy of this name, refer to the specific contents of will or voluntary actions. Moral actions, as opposed to instinctive or mechanical behavior, presuppose knowledge since this class of acts is grounded on judgments that in turn are at the foundation of theoretical knowledge. Just as true judgment, moral behavior differs from blind actions by the insight or self-evidence that is to the content of a feeling (value) what theoretical self-evidence is to a state of affairs. And just as the truth in logic, goodness or what is worthy of being wanted or desired is based on intrinsic and objective values that are immune to any external forces.

9.2 Musicology and Aesthetics

In the general field of musicology, in addition to his numerous studies on acoustics, which for the most part have been collected in his Beiträge zur Akustik und Musikwissenschaft, and his book of 1926 Sprachlaute (cf. B. Pompino-Marschall, 2003), those on ethnomusicology (cf. G. Schwörer-Kohl, 2011), published in his Sammelbände für vergleichende Musikwissenschaft, whose fourth volume contains the study on Romanian folk music by the famous composer Béla Bartók (1922–1923; V. Lampert, 2008), we owe to Stumpf several studies on the history of music. (Stumpf, 1885, 1896, 1897, 1911) In his autobiography, Stumpf listed his work in this field and stressed the importance of his contribution in two of his works:

To the systematic science of music belong, besides my works on physical and psychological acoustics, especially the treatise, Psychology of Music in England, and the book about the beginnings of music. In the treatise, which is an introduction to the later works on Tonpsychologie, I discussed the relation of music to language, and that of human speech to the utterances of animals – with reference to Spencer and Darwin – but also the exaggerated nativism of Gurney (power of sound), who practically ignored all genetic explanations and focused only on the erotic feelings of animal ancestors. (Stumpf, 1924, p. 438–439)

His classic work, The Origins of Music, made known notably by the famous anthropologist and linguist Edward Sapir (1912) thanks to his positive review of this work in 1912, has recently been published in English. (see E. M. von Hornbostel, 1933; M. Müller, 2003; A. Simon, 2000; H. de la Motte-Haber, 2011) This book is the culmination of more than twenty five years of empirical and theoretical research in the field of musicology and is divided into two main parts: the first, entitled “The Origin and Archetypes of Music Making” deals with the theoretical aspects of the debates at the time on this issue. Three theories on the origin of music are discussed, namely that of Darwin, that advocated independently by Rousseau, Herder, and Spencer, and finally that of Wallaschek and K. Bücher. All these theories are rejected in favour of that proposed by Stumpf in the second chapter entitled “The Origin and Archetypes of Singing.” Stumpf’s theory is based mainly on the famous concept of fusion that he developed in his Psychology of Sound. The third chapter entitled “Primitive Instruments and their Influence” traces the history of musical instruments among primitive peoples. In Chapter IV “Polyphony, Rhythm, and Intoned,” Stumpf examines the music of primitive peoples with regard to the forms of polyphony, rhythm, and the relation between song and speech. (see Deutsch, Sommer and Willam, 2003) The last chapter “Paths of Development” consists in a study of the different stages of the development of music. The second part of the book, “Songs of Primitive Peoples” is a study of music among primitive peoples in different countries of the world, and is based on several songs of which Stumpf offers the transcription and a detailed musical analysis. (H. Günther, 2003)

Moreover, although Stumpf has devoted only one article specifically to the theme of aesthetics, this topic is raised very frequently in his work, namely in his book Gefühl und Gefühlsempfindung which includes three of his papers on emotions and sense feelings (Stumpf, 1928b; C. Allesch, 2014, 2003). This issue led to a long discussion in his correspondence with Brentano on whether pleasure, and aesthetic pleasure procured by a work of art, is intentional or phenomenal in nature. In his article “Aesthetic Enjoyment and Tragedy,” Stumpf summarizes the problem of aesthetics as follows:

Every work of art bears within itself its primary purpose [which consists] in the production of an aesthetic enjoyment. And here, in this immediate effect, lies the enigma. (Stumpf, 1910a, p. 5)

This action or effect (Wirkung) of the artwork is immediate in a way comparable, for instance, to the experience that we have of pain, and is independent of any difference in culture, specialized knowledge of contemplated objects or worldview (historical, cultural or other). Stumpf acknowledges that sensations can act aesthetically on a subject without any conceptual thought or representation. However, the full aesthetic sentiment is forced upon us when and only if sensations and combinations of sensations “are entangled in an act of relational thinking.” That is to say, “an aesthetic affect presupposes a judgment on a state of affairs, on a fact.” (1899, p. 8) The feeling of pleasure is immediately linked to an activity as sensory pleasure to sensations, but it is not yet an emotion in the strict sense. For there to be an emotion in the experience of enjoyment (Entzücken) of a work of art, the relations intuited in a unitary and immediate way must become an object of consciousness, and therefore an intentional object. Hence the dual origin (or source) of aesthetic experience: the first is what he calls the fullness (Fülle) of the formal relations among the parts of a true work of art, while the second is derived from the properties of the object or, more precisely, the state of affairs. (Stumpf, 1899, p 8; 1924, p 54) The first source is phenomenological and resides in the formal relations which are given directly to consciousness. The second source is more complex in that it presupposes the processing of the phenomena and sensory data through judgment. (Stumpf, 1926, p. 2–3) These two sources, however, form a unitary content that can only be distinguished by abstraction.

The works and teachings of Stumpf in the field of emotions have had some influence on the literary work of the young Robert Musil. We know that Musil went to Berlin in 1903 to undertake his studies in philosophy, physics and mathematics. In 1908, he successfully defended, under the direction of Stumpf, a doctoral thesis on the work of Ernst Mach (R. Musil, 1908; R. Haller, 2003). Another important aspect of their relationship concerns Stumpf’s influence on Musil’s literary work, which gave rise to a vast literature. One of the important sources of Musil’s early novels and theoretical fragments is the work of Traugott K. Oesterreich (1910) who wrote his doctoral dissertation in 1905 under the supervision of Stumpf. Another source is Stumpf’s theory of emotions, which he presented in his articles of 1899 and 1907 (Stumpf, 1928b) and his lectures on psychology given during the winter semester of 1906–1907 in which he attaches great importance to the theme of sense feelings and emotions. It is more than likely that Musil attended these lectures.

9.3 Empirical Psychology

Stumpf’s scientific contribution to the field of empirical psychology has been in recent years highlighted by several studies. In addition to the numerous studies that explore Stumpf’s relationship to psychologists such as Külpe (W. Baumgartner, 1997), Herbart (M. Kaiser-El-Safti, 2009, 2010, 2011; S. Poggi, 2014), Helmholtz (H.-P. Reinecke, 2003) Wundt (U. Wolfradt, 2011), or to H. Ebbinghaus (see U. Wolfradt & M. Kaiser-El-Safti (eds.), 2010), several other studies have highlighted Stumpf’s diversified contribution to several sub-disciplines of psychology, including the psychology of sound, Gestalt psychology, animal psychology, the psychology of child development, etc. Stumpf’s most important contribution in the field of psychology – understood in the narrow sense of the science of psychical functions – is his Psychology of Sound published in two volumes. (Stumpf, 1883, 1890) The first volume deals with individual sound judgments while the second, dedicated to Brentano, studies the consciousness of simultaneous sounds. According to his initial proposal, Stumpf’s project was to write two more volumes. The third was to focus on musical phenomena such as consonance, dissonance, accords, melodies, etc., while he had planned to study feelings generated by sound (Tongefühle) in the fourth. Part of his research on these issues was published separately in his Beiträge zur Akustik und Musikwissenschaft (9 volumes).

This complex and unfinished work attracted much interest at the time and was reviewed by philosophers such as Meinong and Natorp and by psychologists such as J. Sully, H. Ebbinghaus, and especially W. Wundt who, in his anonymous review of the first volume of the book, criticized Stumpf’s method and the hypothesis of the relativity of sensations to judgment. (see C. Allesch, 2003) Let us recall, however, that this book is not a phenomenological study of sounds but rather a study pertaining to “judgments about sounds,” and it belongs therefore to the field of psychology in the narrow sense. (Stumpf, 1906a, p. 31) Stumpf makes it clear, however, that the judgment in question is not categorical but it is a judgment of a particular type which he calls apprehension or apperception. Stumpf claims moreover that there are sensory contents which are not related to judgments or any other mental functions such as space as he had demonstrated in his Raumbuch. (see J. Bouveresse, 2006) Two important contributions from Stumpf in this book (Kaiserl-El-Safti, 2011, pp. 38–39) rely on the famous concept of fusion (Verschmelzung) by which he characterizes the phenomenon of consonance, which in turn constitutes the foundation of music, and the theory of relations that Stumpf develops in the first volume of this work. (Stumpf, 1883, § 6) This theory of fusion led to a debate with Brentano (see C. Allesch 2003, R. Martinelli, 2013) and the importance of this notion in Husserl’s phenomenology is well-known, particularly in relation to the latter’s conception of figural moments. (C. Ierna, 2009)

In the field of psychology, Stumpf’s name is also associated with the famous case of Clever Hans, which aroused great interest in the early twentieth century, and which represented a significant step in the development of experimental psychology. (H. Baranzke, 2001 W. Prinz, 2006 H. Gundlach, 2006) We know that Stumpf’s assistant, O. Pfungst devoted an entire book to the case of Clever Hans in which he presented the results of the investigation that he and Stumpf conducted. (Stumpf, 1907a, pp. 7–15) Similarly, Stumpf contributed to the foundation of the anthropoid station in Tenerife where Köhler (1925) conducted his well-known research on chimpanzees. Stumpf was also interested in other similar phenomena, such as the study of child prodigies like Pepito Arriola and many others. He founded in 1901 the Society for Child Psychology and contributed two studies on that topic (Stumpf, 1900, 1901)

10. Stumpf’s Legacy

The work of Carl Stumpf has aroused much interest since the turn of the twenty-first century. Over the past fifteen years, in addition to the publication of numerous translations and reprints of Stumpf’s writings, several articles and books have been devoted to examining and evaluating the different aspects of his work. The recent reception of Stumpf’s work is very diversified and it reflects the interdisciplinary nature of his research and his many accomplishments at an academic as well as an institutional level. (G. Fréchette, 2010; M. Kaiser-El-Safti, 2011; D. Fisette 2015a)

At the very end of his autobiography, Stumpf confesses that he never sought to establish a school and that he is grateful to those of his students who pursued their research based on their own plans in the same scientific spirit. Stumpf’s words are confirmed by the testimonies of many of his students who all shared this scientific spirit and described Stumpf as a model of precision and clarity in thought and observation, with a keen sense for analysis and a critical attitude towards his own philosophical thought. If indeed he did not establish a school, he is however responsible for the formation of outstanding researchers and philosophers, and he has contributed directly to the development of two of the most important movements in Germany at the beginning of the twentieth century: Gestalt psychology and phenomenology. But Stumpf also counts as one of the harshest critics of these two movements as evidenced in his Erkenntnislehre, a posthumous work in which he presents the essential elements of his Weltanschauung and, in a sense, his philosophical testament. Let us remember that this book is dedicated to Brentano and can therefore be considered a contribution, the last in importance in the school of Brentano, to the philosophical program of his mentor. It is not surprising, therefore, that the criticism he addressed to his own students in this work was mainly motivated by this program.

In this work, he offers a remarkably penetrating analysis of the philosophical project that guided Husserl in the first book of Ideas. From Stumpf’s perspective, the originality of this new version of phenomenology in Ideas I lies less in the aspects in which he criticizes the doctrine of the Logical Investigations whereby phenomenology is defined as descriptive psychology than in the features by which Husserl opens up new perspectives with respect to descriptive psychology and phenomenology in Stumpf’s sense. This is the case of phenomenology understood as a doctrine of essences, whose aim is to ground the empirical sciences on the so-called regional ontologies. This endeavor belongs to the more general project of a general theory of science which Husserl worked out in this work. Stumpf understands this project as a widening of Brentano’s and Lotze’s initial program which, according to him, is nothing other than a regional phenomenology or ontology in the sense of Husserl. However, he does not see any progress in the idea of a “pure” or transcendental phenomenology nor in the postulate of a pure ego to which something like a “rein Ichblick” is purported to give access. For if this purity is acquired on the basis of the method of the reduction, more precisely the eidetic reduction, than by bracketing the existence of objects, it rules out eo ipso any possible contribution on the part of the empirical sciences. Stumpf also questions the status of sense perception and the domain of phenomena in this perspective given that Husserl’s Wesensschau can only be applied to what Stumpf calls mere presentations or second-order phenomena. In his remarks on Stumpf in Section 86 of Ideas I, Husserl pointed out that the study of phenomena belongs to what he calls in the introduction to this work “eidetic psychology.” But as a science of facts and of realities, this psychology falls under the reduction and does not seem to contribute significantly to the version of transcendental phenomenology put forth in Ideas I. Stumpf concludes that this version of phenomenology is a phenomenology without phenomena due both to Husserl’s account of phenomena and to his peculiar conception of (transcendental) phenomenology. (R. Rollinger, 1999, 2008c; D. Fisette, 2015b)

As we said, in 1900, Stumpf established the Institute of psychology in Berlin which was at the origin of the original movement in psychology called Gestalt psychology. With the exception of Max Wertheimer, who did his dissertation in 1904 under the direction of Külpe in Würzburg, the other psychologists of the Institute of Berlin, Wolfgang Köhler, Kurt Koffka, Kurt Lewin, Egon Brunswik and Adhemar Gelb undertook their apprenticeship in psychology and philosophy under Stumpf’s supervision. This is also the case of Robert Musil and C. von Allesch. However, although the Gestaltists in Berlin had initially adopted Stumpf’s phenomenological standpoint, they departed significantly from Stumpf’s conception of the mind. (M. Ash, 2000–2001, 1998; F. Toccafondi, 2009). Despite Stumpf’s significant contribution to the debate on the nature of Gestalt and psychology in general, he was targeted by Köhler (1913) in his classical paper on the constancy hypothesis, and which is sometimes considered to be the very beginning of Gestalt psychology. Stumpf replied to this objection in his posthumous book by saying that Köhler was wrong in eliminating founding contents in favour of the constancy hypothesis. The following excerpt from his book Erkenntnislehre summarizes the main issues in this dispute:

In the presentations of the Gestalt psychology, it is as if there were absolutely no sound and no color, nothing absolute in our sense perceptions, but only Gestalts. Gestalts alone seem to be the only original data while sounds, colors and everything that we call phenomena would only come apart by means of abstraction. (Stumpf, 1939, p. 242)

In summary, Stumpf claims that, in this conception of Gestalt, “the forest hides the trees.” For Stumpf maintains that the whole is prior to its parts and that each part, in virtue of its nature, is conditioned by the whole. However, he cannot allow the idea that one may perceive a Gestalt without presupposing a founding content or what he also calls first-order phenomena such as, for instance, color or sound. Stumpf’s conception of Gestalt is closer to that of Bühler (D. Fisette, 2015c) in that it consists in a “complex of structural relations.” (Stumpf, 1939, p. 246) Another quote from his posthumous work summarizes perfectly the theoretical issues at stake in Stumpf’s criticism of his students:

The conception of the perception of Gestalts which is advocated here presupposes: 1. The possibility of perceiving relations; 2. The possibility of unnoticed content in consciousness; 3. The distinction between phenomena and mental functions as heterogeneous contents of consciousness. If one admits these three theses, then our theory is founded. If one challenges it, then one will be led to the native Gestalt psychology, but also to all the difficulties that come with it. (Stumpf, 1939, p. 254)

According to Stumpf, the cost for adhering to the native theory is nothing less than to abandon the very principles of descriptive psychology and phenomenology. Moreover, besides the difficulties mentioned by Stumpf in this passage, Gestalt psychology conveys philosophical presuppositions which are at the heart of the dispute. The first is a form of sensual naturalism that Stumpf rejects. The second assumption concerns the metaphysical question of psychophysical relations in Köhler’s work and the attempt to introduce the concept of Gestalt in the field of physics. Stumpf believes that Köhler’s isomorphism thesis, which postulates the existence of an identity relation between the structural laws of the psychical world and that of the physical world, presupposes the theory of psychophysical parallelism, which Stumpf rejects as well.


A complete bibliography of Stumpf’s publications and manuscripts has been published in D. Fisette and R. Martinelli (eds.), 2015, Philosophy from an Empirical Standpoint. Essays on Carl Stumpf, Amsterdam: Rodopi.

Primary Sources

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  • ––––, 1926, Die Sprachlaute; experimentell-phonetische Untersuchungen (nebst einem Anhang über Instrumentalklänge), Berlin: J. Springer, 1926, 419 p.
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  • ––––, 1919, “Spinozastudien,” Abhandlungen der Königlich-Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin: Verlag der Königlich Akademie der Wissenschaften, pp. 1–57.
  • ––––, 1918, “Empfindung und Vorstellung”, Abhandlungen der Königlich-Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophisch-historische Klasse, Vol. 1, pp. 3–116.
  • ––––, 1917, “Zum Gedächnis Lotzes”, Kant-Studien, Vol. 22, pp. 1–26.
  • ––––, 1917, “Die Attribute der Gesichtsempfindungen,” Abhandlungen der Königlich-Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophisch-historische Klasse, Vol. 8, pp. 1–88.
  • ––––, 1916, “Verlust der Gefühlsempfindungen im Tongebiete (musikalische Anhedonie)”, Zeitschrift für Psychologie und Physiologie der Sinnesorgane, Vol. 75, p. 39–53.
  • ––––, 1911, Die Anfänge der Musik, Leipzig: J. A. Barth; The Origins of Music. Eng. Trans. D. Trippett, Oxford, Oxford University Press, 2012, pp. 31–185.
  • ––––, 1910, Philosophische Reden und Vorträge, Leipzig: J. A. Barth.
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  • ––––, 1907, Die Wiedergeburt der Philosophie, Rede zum Eintritt des Rektorates der königlichen Friedrich-Wilhelms-Universität Berlin, 15 Oktober 1907, Berlin: Francke.
  • ––––, 1906, “Zur Einteilung der Wissenschaften,” Abhandlungen der Königlich-Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophish-historische Classe, Berlin: Verlag der Königliche Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1906, pp. 1–94.
  • ––––, 1906, “Erscheinungen und psychische Funktionen,” Abhandlungen der Königlich-Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophish-historische Classe, Berlin: Verlag der Königliche Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1906, pp. 3–40.
  • ––––, 1906, “Über Gefühlsempfindungen,” in F. Schumann (dir.), Bericht über den II. Kongreß für experimentelle Psychologie in Würzburg vom 18–21. April 1906, Leipzig, Barth, pp. 209–213.
  • ––––, 1898, “Konsonanz und Dissonanz”, Beiträge zur Akustik und Musikwissenschaft, Vol. 1, pp. 1–108.
  • ––––, 1897, “Geschichte des Consonanzbegriffs. Erster Teil. Die Definition der Consonanz in Altertum,” Abhandlungen der Königlich bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1. Classe 21, 1. Abteilung, München, Franz, p. 1–78.
  • ––––, 1897, “Die Pseudo-aristotelischen Probleme über Musik,” Abhandlungen der Königlich-Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophisch-historische Abhandlungen, Berlin: Reimer, pp. 1–85.
  • ––––, 1895, “Antrittsrede,” Sitzungsberichte der Königlich-Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin, Reimer, pp. 735–738.
  • ––––, 1895, “Hermann von Helmholtz und die neuere Psychologie”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie (Neue Folge): 8(3): 303–314.
  • ––––, 1893, “Zum Begriff der Lokalzeichen”, Zeitschrift für Psychologie und Physiologie der Sinnesorgane (Volume 4), p. 70–73.
  • ––––, 1892, “Über den Begriff der mathematischen Wahrscheinlichkeit,” Sitzungsberichte der philosophisch-philologischen und historischen Classe der Königlich Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 20, München: Franz, pp. 37–120.
  • ––––, 1892, “Über die Anwendung des mathematischen Wahrscheinlichkeitsbegriffs auf Teile eines Kontinuums,” Sitzungsberichte der philosophisch-philologischen und historischen Classe der Königlich Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 20, München: Franz, p. 681–691.
  • ––––, 1891, “Psychologie und Erkenntnistheorie”, Abhandlungen der Königlich Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften (Volume 19, Part 2), München: Franz, pp. 465–516.
  • ––––, 1891, “Wundts Antikritik,” Zeitschrift für Psychologie und Physiologie der Sinnesorgane, 2, pp. 266–293.
  • ––––, 1890, Tonpsychologie (Volume II), Leipzig: Hirzel; English translation, Tone Psychology, by R. Rollinger, 2 volumes, Aldershot: Ashgate, forthcoming.
  • ––––, 1886–1887, “Syllabus for Psychology”; English translation, by R. Rollinger, in R. Rollinger, Husserl’s Position in the School of Brentano, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1999, pp. 285–309.
  • ––––, 1886–1887, “Syllabus for Logic”; English translation by R. Rollinger, in R. Rollinger, op. cit., pp. 311–337.
  • ––––, 1885, “Musikpsychologie in England”, Vierteljahrsschrift für Musikwissenschaft, Volume 1, pp. 261–349.
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  • ––––, 1881, “Rudolph Hermann Lotze”, Wiener Allgemeine Zeitung, July 18 1881, Volume 489, p. 6.
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  • ––––, 1869, Verhältnis des platonischen Gottes zur Idee des Guten, Halle: Pfeffer.
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  • ––––, and E. M. von Hornbostel (eds.), 1922–1923, Sammelbände für vergleichende Musikwissenschaft (4 volumes), München: Drei Masken; reprint by Olms: Hildesheim, 1975.
  • Brentano, F. & C. Stumpf, 2014, Franz Brentano – Carl Stumpf: Briefwechsel 1867–1917, M. El Safti & T. Binder (eds.), Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang.
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  • ––––, 2003, “Zur Rezeption von Stumpfs Tonpsychologie”, M. Kaiser-El-Safti & M. Ballod (eds.) Musik und Sprache, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, pp. 225–236.
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  • ––––, 2000–2001, “Carl Stumpf und seine Schüler: von empirischer Philosophie zur Gestaltpsychologie”, Brentano Studien, IX: 130–142.
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  • ––––, 2003, “Spekulative Ästhetik oder empirische Forschung? Spuren von Carl Stumpfs Denkweise in der Vorgeschichte des Wiener Kreises”, M. Kaiser-El-Safti & M. Ballod (eds.), Musik und Sprache, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, pp. 109–116.
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  • ––––, 1929, “The Psychology of Controversy,” Psychological Review, 36: 97–121.
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  • ––––, 1867–1917, Briefe an Carl Stumpf 1867–1917, Gerhard Oberkofler (ed.), Graz: Akademische Druck- und Verlagsanstalt, 1989.
  • ––––, 1905, “Von der psychologischen Analyse der Tonqualitäten in ehre eigentlich ersten Elemente”, in F. Brentano, Untersuchungen zur Sinnespsychologie, Hamburg: Meiner, 1979.
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  • –––, 2009, “Über die Grundsätze der Mathematik von Carl Stumpf”, Gestalt Theory, 31(2): 129–141.
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  • –––, 2018b, “Franz Brentano and Auguste Comte’s positive philosophy”, Brentano Studien (The Franz Brentano Centennial), 16: 73–110.
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  • ––––, 2014, “Phénomènes sensibles et fonctions psychiques : Karl Bühler et le programme de Stumpf”, in J. Friedrich et L. Cesalli (eds.), Between Mind and Language – Anton Marty and Karl Bühler, Basel, Schwabe Philosophica, pp. 103–140.
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  • ––––, 2013, “Mixed feelings. Carl Stumpf’s Criticism of James and Brentano on Emotions”, in D. Fisette & G. Fréchette (eds.), Themes from Brentano, Amsterdam: Rodopi, pp. 281–305.
  • ––––, 2012, “Segno, spazio, percezione. La teoria dei segni locali”, Paradigmi, no. 2, pp. 47–60.
  • ––––, 2009a, “Love and Hate: Brentano and Stumpf on Emotions and Sense Feelings”, Gestalt Theory, 32(2): 115–127.
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  • ––––, 2013, “Kant, Brentano and Stumpf on Psychology and Anti-psychologism”, S. Bacin et al. (eds.) Akten des XI. Internationalen Kant-Kongresses, Berlin : De Gruyter, p. 739–748.
  • ––––, 2010, “Actualité de Carl Stumpf”, Dialogue, 49: 267–285.
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Special Issues

  • 2015, Philosophy from an Empirical Standpoint. Essays on Carl Stumpf, D. Fisette & R. Martinelli (eds.), Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • 2011, Die Sinne und die Erkenntnis, M. Kaiser-El-Safti & M. Ebeling (eds.) Schriftreihe der Carl Stumpf Gesellschaft, Frankfurt : Peter Lang.
  • 2011, Carl Stumpf – From Philosophical Reflection to Interdisciplinary Scientific Investigation, S. Bonacchi & G.-H. Boudewijnse (eds.), Wien: Krammer.
  • 2010, Hermann Ebbinghaus und Carl Stumpf – Hallesche Perspektiven auf die Geschichte der Psychologie, U. Wolfradt, M. Kaiser-el-Safti & H.-P. Brauns, (eds.), Lengerich: Pabst Science Publisher.
  • 2009, Special issue on Carl Stumpf, Gestalt Theory, Volume 31, Number 2.
  • 2003, Musik und Sprache. Zur Phänomenologie von Carl Stumpf, M. Kaiser-El-Safti, & M. Ballod, (eds.), Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • 2001, “Carl Stumpf e la fenomenologia dell’esperienza immediate,” S. Besoli & R. Martinelli (eds.), Discipline Filosofiche, Volume 11, Number 2.
  • 2000–2001, “Carl Stumpf”, Brentano Studien, Volume 9.
  • 2000, Das Berliner Phonogramm-Archiv, A. Simon (ed.), Berlin: VWB.
  • 1923, Festschrift Carl Stumpf zum 75. Geburtstag in Dankbarkeit und Verehrung gewidmet, Psychologische Forschung, Volume 4.

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