Hermann Lotze

First published Wed Jan 12, 2005; substantive revision Fri Nov 2, 2018

Rudolph Hermann Lotze (1817–1881) mediated the transition from the exuberance of German idealism, in the first half of the nineteenth century, to the sober, scholarly and scientific ethos that came to prevail in the second half. He adapted the notion of “chief” or defining problems in the philosophical sub-disciplines, inherited from Herbart, and brought opposing approaches to bear on them, in a quasi-systematic way, preparing the way for the modern textbook. A professor in a changing situation, moving toward bureaucratic centralization in an encompassing national state, he mostly restricted his attention to academic issues, appealing to his peers (but not the public) in the now rising professional journal (while maintaining a lively interest in things quotidian). Given the increasing amounts of data and the rising importance of the burgeoning new disciplines, Lotze hoped to preserve a special place for philosophy as a value-theoretic investigation. Lotze’s influence was far-reaching and not yet widely admitted or well understood. While he accidentally inspired numerous materialists (and was simultaneously claimed by the idealists), his strong association with certain traditionalist preachers, on the one hand, and liberal theological movements, on the other, blunted his interest for the philosophical revolutionaries of the twentieth century, while simultaneously preserving a continued line of subterranean influence.

1. Brief Chronology

  • 1817, born 21 May at Bautzen, in Saxony
  • 1819, family moves to Zittau, near Bohemia. While attending the humanistic Gymnasium [secondary school] there, Lotze pens a youthful Romantic novel, Die Deutschen [The Germans]
  • 1834, begins university studies in medicine and philosophy at Leipzig and, while enrolled, makes the acquaintance of Fechner
  • 1837, Lotze’s philosophy teacher, C. H. Weiße (1801–1866) gives an academic address calling for greater attention to be paid to the philosophy of Kant
  • 1838, achieves dual degrees in medicine and philosophy from Leipzig
  • 1839, first practices, then teaches medicine at Leipzig
  • 1840, Lotze’s Habilitationsschrift [second dissertation], De summis continuorum (on infinite series), accepted at Leipzig, and publication of his Gedichte [Poetry]
  • 1841, the first or “lesser” Metaphysics published
  • 1843, the first or “lesser” Logic published
  • 1844, becomes the successor to Herbart at Göttingen
  • 1852, Medical Psychology published
  • 1854, Materialismusstreit [“the materialism controversy”] at Göttingen
  • 1857, Polemical Writings published, including his reply to the younger Fichte, and Lotze translates Sophocles’ Antigone into Latin
  • 1868, History of Aesthetics in Germany published
  • 1874, the second or “greater” Logic published
  • 1876, made Privy Counselor under Bismarck’s Reich
  • 1879, the second or “greater” Metaphysics published
  • 1880, accepts offer, conveyed by Zeller, to move to university at Berlin
  • 1881, dies 1 July in Berlin and, later, buried beside his wife in Göttingen
  • 1882ff, dictata of his lectures on various subjects published (the so-called “Grundzüge”)
  • 1885–91, an edition, in four volumes, of his Kleine Schriften [Lesser Writings] appears

2. Preface: philosophy before modernism

After modernism, philosophy changed. But the change was slow in coming and, well before the full impact of high modernism, Hermann Lotze reigned as the single most influential philosopher in Germany, perhaps even the world. Although almost completely unread today, his substantial body of work exemplifies the new academic philosophy (“Kathederphilosophie”) that flourished between the demise of the post-Kantian idealisms and the rise of scientific philosophy proper; he is usually credited with assisting “the rejection of Hegel and Absolute Idealism within the bounds of academic philosophy” (Schnädelbach, 1984, p. 169). Although the time period under discussion is sometimes denominated by the phrase “between idealism and positivism,” it might be more accurate to describe it as a transitory stage between the various ideological groupings of the post-Enlightenment (romanticism, materialism, et al.) and those diverging philosophical movements that only emerged in modernism proper (logical analysis, phenomenology, etc.). Thus, as a prominent figure within an essentially transitional period, Lotze’s long shadow was, perhaps, predestined to gradually fade from the scene.

Were we unsympathetic, Lotze might be uncharitably (and falsely) caricatured with the appellation “Biedermeier,” especially if one took seriously the oft-repeated charge of methodological eclecticism (implicit in the all-to-common adoption of “ideal-realism” as an adequate descriptor of Lotze’s project). It is true that Lotze refused to give pride of place to any particular method or theoretical approach. But this fact entails neither that Lotze himself possesses no particular method nor that he draws no determinate theoretical conclusions. Lotze’s actual technique involves, instead, a peculiar dialectic, one which while attempting to give consideration to each side of a seeming antinomy, resolves ultimately in favor for one side, albeit one which is fundamentally transformed. Moreover, Lotze’s approach—which takes place against the backdrop of significant political reaction and social revolution—exhibits a striking modernity in his patient discussions of competing approaches to various “problems,” one that proceeds without regard to their source in physiology, psychology or philosophy of mind. (We would do well to recall that it was precisely to such figures that the task of distinguishing amongst the heady mixture of early nineteenth-century science and pseudo-science fell.) His seminal interventions, according to one of his students, belong to “a period of transition and uncertainty; much of the light which the preceding age thought it possessed has vanished and the new light has not yet dawned” (Merz, 1907–14, p. 493). Accordingly, Lotze’s work looks both forward and backward, anticipating both the methods and the emphases of the new philosophical spirit while clinging, nonetheless, to certain key assumptions of the very romantic Weltanschauung (cf. Richards, 2002) that he helped (ultimately) to undo.

It would be useful to further note something else that might appear, at first glance, as purely trivial; this is the critical shift in tone and temper, from the prior hostile and polemical one, to one much more tentative and hesitant effected by Lotze:

In his reviews, criticisms, and polemical writings he is as dignified as Kant and Herbart had been; he is never impolite as Fichte and Schelling frequently were; nor does he fasten upon his opponents any stigma as Hegel frequently succeeded in doing; he is quite above that virulent and unmannerly invective by which Schopenhauer tries to crush, but never actually damages, the arguments of thinkers whom he chooses to regard as enemies. But the style of Lotze reflects one characteristic trait of modern thought. The confidence and self-assurance of Kant, Fichte, Hegel. Schopenhauer, and of the earlier Schelling have disappeared. (Merz, 1907–14, p. 493)

The new model of the academic researcher demands the replacement of prominent personalities—i.e., romantic ‘geniuses’—by the new exemplar of the sober scientist. Significant, as well, are the new material constraints on the practice of philosophy: not just the rise of the university professor—after Kant—as the most prominent representative figure, but the correlative emergence of the professional journal as the typical venue of presentation and publication. Of course, the atmosphere of political repression, following the failed revolutions of 1815 and 1848, surely played a crucial role in limiting the wider ambitions of philosophers and reinforcing the need for a more neutral tenor. Indeed, the same political pressures and bureaucratic demands associated with the state professor’s status as “civil servant” began to figure prominently during the first half of the nineteenth century, harkening back to the Fichte’s difficulties in the Atheismusstreit (1798/99) and leading up to, among other things, the dismissal of the “Göttingen Seven” (1837)—just to enumerate a few salient events from the German situation alone.

The efficient causes of this portentous change were not limited to the social-political sphere: in the numerous departments that came to make up the philosophical, or lower, faculty of the university, other important developments were also afoot. First, and foremost, there must be numbered the emergence of new, separate disciplines—such as geology, chemistry, biology and psychology—and the resulting squabbles over relative positions, proper boundaries, and the subsequent agon of “role purification” (see Kusch, 1995). In addition, the rapid advances in the scientific discovery had multiplied the previously manageable amounts of data and, hence, suggested to some that the task of philosophy was now to restrict itself to explaining “how the problems of speculation still connect themselves with the ever increasing mass of special knowledge that the labours of the new generation have accumulated” (Adamson, 1885b, p. 573). In this context, the cognate conceptions of philosophy as a synthesizing or supervisory endeavor began to gather adherents. Indeed, the “rehabilitation of philosophy” [Rehabilitierung der Philosophie] (see Schnädelbach, 1984, pp. 103ff) is perhaps the central foundational issue of the day and names “the attempt to allot to philosophy, in a scientific age, a domain of problems that would be independent of the special sciences” (ibid., p. 103). Here, as elsewhere, Lotze emulates Fichte: while science can surely explain what is, it can never elucidate the ultimate value or meaning of the phenomena it reveals—that alone is the task of philosophy (cf. ibid., p. 178).

Oddly—despite his one-time preëminence—Lotze founded no enduring school. However, his teaching directly influenced such prominent students as Windelband and Frege and his ideas were still being considered and debated as late as the 1920s by a numerous notables, including Heidegger and Carnap. Even in his own day, Lotze’s reputation soon spread beyond the continent. As a result, he became a substantial force in the English-speaking world affecting, among others, Green, Bradley, and Bosanquet, in Britain, and Royce, James, and Santayana, in America. Indeed, it is principally by this latter means that he came to hold some sway with both the early Moore and the early Russell. Furthermore, because his influence extended through both Anglo-America and the Continent, some have postulated his unconscious but seminal presence in the emergence of analytic philosophy (cf. Sluga, 1980, Gabriel, 2002, Milkov, 2000); and, likewise, studies of Lotze by historians of phenomenology (Rollinger, 2001, Hauser, 2003) have also begun to emerge.

Finally, in this same moment, when philosophy was only beginning its (eventual and complete) confinement to the academy—and becoming simultaneously more specialized and less provincial—Lotze was (notably) the darling of numerous Protestant theologians and preachers: both conservatives who sought to popularize him as a fanatical opponent of mid-century materialism, and others, of a more liberal character, who fastened on to his “personalism” as the proper antidote to the dangerous heterodoxies of pantheism, rationalism, agnosticism and atheism (cf. Hall, 1912, pp. 94n-96n). While Lotze himself may not have endorsed these distortions, there was, nonetheless, something about his work that permitted such misuse. Santayana, a keen observer of this very phenomena, insisted on inserting an important cautionary note: he remarked dryly that one ought not to be misled by Lotze’s continuous reference to “souls” or “God” as “a certain acceptance which Lotze has found in conservative circles is perhaps due to insufficient considerations of his meaning”:

Lotze is inclined to give old names to new things; he is fond of a metaphysical nomenclature, and his terms are generally more mysterious and old-fashioned than his ideas. Thus he speaks of the soul, of substance, of free will, of efficient causation, of a personal God; but these phrases stand in his system for comparatively modest and legitimate conceptions. The words may please us in themselves; but we shall be disappointed if we welcome the things for love of the names they bear. (Santayana, 1971, p. 153)

If correct, this suggests that Lotze, once again, followed the lead of Fichte in using traditional language to mask more deeply naturalistic conceptions than the surface meaning of the ordinary wording might initially suggest. (This peculiar feature of the expression of his thought must be made continually present by the active reader.) In any event, Lotze’s continuing influence in the twentieth century (ironically) came mostly through the theological curriculum of classical liberal Protestantism, still in evidence until the late-1960s (cf. Reardon, 1968).

Although it is tempting to regard the Post-Enlightenment period as a confused interregnum, serving only as a prelude to the revolutionary breakthroughs of philosophical modernism – that is, those movements that organized and flourished after the Great War – the fact is that Lotze (and in particular the Logik) was still a relevant and wholly viable topic for philosophical seminars well into the 1920s. As a result, there is a related trend that augurs for treating Lotze as if he were a contemporary and thus subjecting him to our own expectations and standards. On those terms, however, Lotze presents mostly an unappealing and enigmatic tangle.

The only viable way to proceed is to see him as consciously continuing to practice some of the sly deception and willful obfuscation of those Enlightenment thinkers still subject to vigorous state repression and social persecution. For this tack there are, of course, a grab bag of techniques, on display in a wide variety of modern thought, that all result in the same, highly desired end: plausible deniability. Without cultivating our own sensitivity to the highly provocative nature of controversies that to our minds may be considered settled, we cannot see how Lotze attempts to subtly open up the minds of his readers to any number of heterodox possibilities.

The name naturally associated with this sort of inquiry is, of course, that of Leo Strauss. Yet the work of his students invariably comes to an end with post-Enlightenment thinkers, terminating typically at the end of the Enlightenment, with “Rousseau, Lessing, and Kant” (Strauss, 1988, p. 33). But if we consider that a further line of repression runs from Fichte up to the widespread institutional successes of the neo-Kantians, on the continent, and the British Idealists, elsewhere, then Lotze is situated squarely in this interregnum. It thus seems natural to wonder if the state actions of the sort noted above, when combined with the obvious sensitivities of the university appointment process, may not have suggested to Lotze that a certain circumspection and discretion might still provide the outlines of the best course of action. In a period of political reaction and repression, civil servants needed to proceed cautiously (compare Beiser, 2014, pp. 178ff).

To this purpose, the structure of the entry now takes the following form: first, an investigation of three controversies, addressed by Lotze (that are, quite naturally, not controversies for us); second, an exposition of three contributions Lotze made to the academic discipline of philosophy, which are incorporated, sometimes as wholes, sometimes in parts, usually unacknowledged, by the modernist movements that displaced him; and, finally, a discussion, naturally somewhat speculative and incomplete, as to the ways that, faute de mieux, Lotze still exerts an underground influence on issues of some undisputed currency. These I deem his “legacies.”

Now that our own new century is well underway, [u]nderstanding and incorporating the insights and achievements of the twentieth century return us, perforce, to their roots in the prior century. But so long as the nineteenth century remains “still the most obscure of all the centuries of the modern age up to now” (Heidegger, 1977, pp. 139–140), even the true significance of our present endeavors may remain yet unknown and unknowable to us. The only alternative is blank incomprehension, the sort already possible within about fifty years of his death; for when Wittgenstein’s student Drury complained about the inclusion of Lotze as a special author in the second part of his Tripos, Wittgenstein could only reply: “Probably a man who shouldn’t have been allowed to write philosophy” (Rhees, 1981, p. 121).

3. Three Controversies

3.1 Polygenesis

A good example of the twists and turns intrinsic to Lotze’s dialectic may be illustrated by a brief excursus on his treatment of the “problem” of “race.” (On this topic, the first question that might occur to contemporary readers concerns the proper domain and ultimate provenance of this “problem”: is it biological, anthropological, sociological or political? does it name a theoretical or a practical difficulty?) Although often torturous, these passages provide a sometimes unique insight into the monogenesis-polygenesis debate in the post-Enlightenment. Lotze begins his discussion quite skeptically, averring that the “much discussed problem of the specific unity or diversity of the whole human race cannot as yet be definitely solved” and he heartily commends this attitude as “the impression of unprejudiced people” (Micro, I, p. 506). He immediately follows this admonition, however, with a lengthy list of cogent reasons for monogenesis, noting that “in the varieties of the human race … the differences are not so excessive as to render impossible a historical derivation from a single source”:

It is true that no race of men possesses any physiologically important organ denied to another race; in none is the normal number of multiple parts, such as teeth or fingers, different from what it is in another; no single joint of the skeleton, no muscular layer, is formed or situated on different plans in different races; all are formed erect, all capable of speech; to all physiological processes are assigned on a common plan; in the duration of life, of pregnancy, in the attainment of puberty, along with numerous fluctuations to which, as regards each of these points, the human race is liable, there are no constant differences of time distinguishing one race from another. The actual differences are varieties in the proportion of size of the parts of the body, and more especially in the form and colour of the external coverings. Assuredly, if Nature had not made the Negro black, the Indian red, the rest of the organisation of these races (whatever might have been the case with the analysis-loving naturalist) would never have suggested to the imagination of men in general any reason for treating them as distinct species, and excluding them from an origin common to all … Finally, let us add that the different races can be propagated by crossing, and as the result of all, it will appear that these varieties of the human race are connected together by the closest analogy of physical formation (Micro, I, pp. 508–509).

Lotze next goes on to consider but reject the very old idea that these superficial changes (size and color) have been effected by variations in such environmental factors as habitat or climate. In this supposition, Lotze believes that the central difficulty for all such investigations in this area is an inevitable but nonetheless unsavory dependence upon “uncertain causes of which we can form no conception” (Micro, I, p. 514). Consequently, “the hypothesis of the original unity of the human race cannot be absolutely disproved” (ibid.). The choice between monogenesis and polygenesis remains squarely at the level of scientific conjecture and no one can determine a priori which hypothesis to rule out. What we would prefer is a reliance upon “the actual facts for which we have the evidence of the senses” (Micro, I, p. 524). But even a brief consideration of this data forces upon us the realization that we have, at our disposal, a very small collection indeed.

Lotze’s seeming indifference and impartiality regarding these competing hypotheses masks his real and over-arching interests, namely establishing that: (1) much of this debate is actually rooted in logical errors and linguistic difficulties, and (2) value-theoretic conclusions are simply not derivable from either scientific theory or fact. First, errors arise in the logic of the very process of classification (Micro, I, p. 507) and, then, the very choices of terminology—kind, variety, species, genus, etc.—are open to logical or linguistic manipulation completely unconnected from the question at hand, namely “whether they can all have actually sprung from one and the same primitive stock by generation and climactic influences” (Micro, I, p. 522). Second, such mere manipulations are not facts and, furthermore, even were strong empirical evidence available, it would not provide the upshot its proponents suppose. To show this, Lotze constructs the following gruesome and impossibly racist scenario:

Supposing it could be proved by irrefragable evidence that the ancestors of the Negroes were really true undoubted apes, but at the same time the fact remained that the present Negroes walk erect, speak, think, and in general possess the degree of intelligence (be it great or small) which we know from experience they do—what moral excuse could there be for the cruelty of accommodating the treatment of them not to what they are, but to what their ancestors were, or—to speak logically—to the kind or species to which by their descent they belong? (Micro, I, p. 524).

When we recall that racism was often clothed in the respectability of being scientific and “up to date,” we can discern Lotze’s canny move in blocking any ethical conclusion being derived from seemingly scientific evidence. (And when we recall the subtitle of the Microcosmus – “attempt at an anthropology [Versuch einer Anthropologie]” – Lotze’s actual motives begin to shine through.)

Ultimately, this is part and parcel of Lotze’s overarching strategy of driving a wedge between scientific fact, on the one hand, and human significance, meaning and value, on the other: science, to which falls the task of describing what is, can never provide us with the ultimate meaning of or reason behind what is. Lotze remained convinced that no value theory could be derived from science and that, yet, the teleological impulse was intrinsic to and irreplaceable in human existence. On more than one occasion, he avers to the following line of reasoning:

… the contemplation of the whole series of graded periods during which formless matter may have been undergoing processes of formation would but add to the splendour and variety of the scenes in whose outward pomp our admiring phantasy might revel, but it would not explain the wondrous drama as a whole more adequately than the modest belief which sees nothing but the immediate creative will of God from which the races of living beings can have been derived (Micro, I, p. 527).

The varieties of human beings—should we choose to cast that in the terminology of race or not—appears to be the expression of some formative principle [Bildungstrieb], one whose meaning and purpose can never be exhausted by the technical complexity of the story we may adduce about the process of that formation. (For another discussion along similar lines see Appiah, 2014, pp. 94–98).

3.2 Panpsychism

Panpsychism is widely taken to provide a possible answer to the mind-body problem and the by now (merely repetitive) reiteration of Lotze’s commitment to panpsychism is easy to document. The fact that Lotze said praiseworthy things about his former teacher, Fechner, after the latter’s mental breakdown, is usually highlighted and we are informed that “Lotze’s main criticism of Fechner is that he is not bold enough … there were deeper metaphysical reasons for thinking that all reality is alive” (Beiser, 2013, p. 235). But this approach forces us to take Lotze’s equivocal statements at face value when there are numerous clear indications that we should not.

First of all, almost all of the quotations typically drawn from the Mikrokosmus in support of panpsychism are actually phrased in the form of questions (and not assertions), viz.

If we cannot account for the appearance of a mental state [geistigen Zustandes] by those properties in virtue of which we call matter matter, what hinders us from supposing that besides those properties there is a store of inner life which usually escapes our attention, and finds no other opportunity of manifestation than in what we call mental life [geistiges Lebens]? (Micro, I, p. 150)
Why, in opposition to matter as an ever dead substance, should all mental activity [geistiges Regsamkeit] be condensed into the special nature of a soul [Seele], destitute on its side of the properties by means of which the physical elements make themselves of account in Nature? (ibid.)
Might not the visible substance have directly a double life, appearing outwardly as matter, and as such manifesting no property other than those mechanical ones with which we are familiar, – internally on the other hand moved mentally [geistig bewegt], aware of the changes in its states, and accompanying with efforts the activity, whose general subjection to law it is certainly not in its power arbitrarily to alter? (ibid.)
Have things by their motions, while themselves destitute of enjoyment, only to minister to souls [Seelen] as mere stimuli to this mental life [innerlichen Leben]? (Micro, I, p. 353)
Has the one half of creation, that which we comprise under the name of the material world, no function whatever save that of serving the other half, the realm of mind [des Reiches des Geister], and are we justified in longing to find the lustre of sense [Sinnlichkeit] in that also whence we seem always to derive it? (ibid.)

In the Mikrokosmus, Lotze emphasizes that panpsychism is strongly motivated from the impetus to counter, in some fashion, the excesses of materialism. But this very “justification,” he comments, is simultaneously “the source of the barrenness of this view” (Micro, I, p. 151): we don’t like materialism, so we appeal to panpsychism, adopting the counter-hypothesis that simply “ascribes to matter a secret mental life” (ibid.). But why in the world ought we do that?

At best, panpsychism, under this pretext, is merely an empty and vain idea, “a conception … that, [may be counted] among the dreams of our imagination”; it names a belief about which the most we may say is that it “may be one of those which do not contradict actual facts” (Micro, I, p. 360). In a word, it is possible, but scarcely probable and in no wise to be considered actual. After all, were it quite literally to be true, then we would have to adjust ourselves to the following curious state of affairs: “Who could endure the thought that in the dust trodden by our feet, in the prosaic texture of the cloth that forms our clothing, in the materials shaped into all sorts of utensils … there is everywhere present the fulness of animated life …?” (Micro, I, p. 361). Who could truly inhabit such a ghastly and ghostly realm?

Consequently, neither science nor philosophy has any need of such an hypothesis, one that indeed bears an uncanny relation to mythological thinking (remnants of which are still preserved in our culture, through the influence of Greek art and thought). Nonetheless, whatever its storied pedigree, “we … must not introduce it into science.” From the sole requirements of knowledge alone, “nothing remains for us but to gather from experience the laws found valid in the ultimate ramifications of reality” (Micro, I, p. 363). Among our philosophical inheritance from German Romanticism, thus, cannot be counted “Schiller’s Götter Griechenlands” (Micro, I, p. xiv) and the like.

Nor can we, in any fashion, seek to derive this view from purely self-interested metaphysical motives, viz.

The dislike to look on one part of the cosmos as but a blind and lifeless instrument for the ends of another, the desire to diffuse over all the joy of animation, and to vindicate a universe enjoying at every point throughout its own existence a more perfect than one in which a divided structure shows mentality [des Geistigen] above an unconscious basis – in this we have but one series of motives inviting us beneath the unruffled surface of matter behind the rigid and regular repetitions of its workings, to seek the warmth of mental activity [geistigen Regsamkeit] (Micro, I, p. 362).

In a word, fear of nihilism is also no justification. Indeed, at long last, the only rationale that can be offered for the panpsychist “wager” is purely aesthetic in nature: “nothing but the beauty of the living form is made to us more intelligible by this hypothesis” (Micro, I, p. 366). Indeed, in the end, we may only admit that our scientific work “neither wants nor needs panpsychism – rather, it is needed to satisfy the human spirit, to make the nature of soul comprehensible” (Skrbina, 2007, p. 128).

At first glance, however, this explanation superficially suggests that Lotze may be nothing more than a beautiful soul. Panpsychism must, at bottom, be shown to possess some truly special significance, far outstripping the utterly false assistance it would pretend to offer to the natural sciences. For assisting the science of psychology, even the very possibility of panpsychism is “wholly immaterial” (Micro, I, p. 365). Rather, Lotze asserts, to be painfully repetitive, that “nothing but the beauty of the living form [die Schönheit der lebendigen Gestalt] is made to us more intelligible by this hypothesis” (Micro, I, p. 366). But what, precisely, could this gnomic utterance be taken to mean?

It appears that Lotze’s terminology cashes out directly as follows: “The image which we now have to form of the living form [die lebendige Gestalt] and its mental life is that of an association of many beings” (Micro, I, p. 367). Lotze then extends the figure by analogizing each human individual to our species being:

All that we prize in life, and that is the source of nobler enjoyments, rests on this mode of combination in a manifold; the human race, embodies in countless individuals, leads the life of constant reciprocal action, of mutual fellow-feeling in love and hatred, of uninterrupted progress, that make all share in the gain of one part (Micro, I, p. 368).

But this does not entail any submerging of the many into some one: “The unity in which we long to be knit with another is always completeness of intercourse, reciprocal enjoyment of what is without, never the confused mingling in which all joy of union perishes” (ibid.).

Consequently, as applied to each unique individual, we must admit that ontogeny really does recapitulate phylogeny, by admitting that “… its inner life never becomes ours and when the union of different beings on which our living form [unsere lebendige Gestalt] depends falls to pieces, while we shall all have gone through something together, it will be as beings originally different that after a passing contact again separate” (ibid.).

Panpsychism emerges hence as an aesthetic hypothesis that can be called on to account for one thing and one thing only: the realization forced earlier in the century by the French physiologists that life, whatever it was, was a union of separate and quite heterogeneous processes, held together in the most fragile of unions:

Bichat’s physiological conclusions grew primarily out of his study of death, in which we identified death as a fragmented process, consisting of the extinction of different organs and processes: the death of locomotion, of respiration, of sense perceptions, of the brain. If death was thus a multiple, dispersed event, then so was organic life. According to Georges Canguilhem, “The genius of Bichat was to decentralize the notion of life, to incarnate it in the parts of organisms.” With Bichat begins the progressive parcelization and division of the body into separate and specific systems and functions that would occur in the first half of the nineteenth century (Crary, 1992, pp. 78–79).

Each of us is then, quite literally, composed of others, who, while coming together for a time, to work upon a common purpose, ultimately disperse, returning to a more basic (and decomposed) form of existence. That is the ultimate and, indeed, the only point of the panpsychist perspective: we may view our individual being on analogy with the cooperative workings of multiple entities, as in a larger society. Society is simultaneously an image of the self, and vice versa.

Now Lotze did his best to sugar coat this physiological revelation but not, it seems, in order to make it more palatable; instead he wanted to show, simultaneously, how little we have gained and how little we have lost in its acknowledgement. In reality, the best gloss of Lotze’s overarching strategy – as wrested from its original point of reference – is that “… Lotze takes his reader to the abyss only to pull him back and teach him a lesson. The exercise in metaphysical brinkmanship is designed to show the reader that the only salvation from nihilism, the only way forward in metaphysics, lies in ethics …” (Beiser, 2013, p. 155).

Science has given and science has taken away. But, in reality, nothing has changed. What matters is how we look at it. The nihilistic conclusions of the natural sciences can’t change (or undermine the truth of) human experience, no matter how deep our investigation descends. Our situation is thus akin to that given admirable (if somewhat dated meteorological) literary expression as follows:

A barometric low hung over the Atlantic. It moved eastward toward a high-pressure area over Russia without as yet showing any inclination to bypass this high in a northerly direction. The isotherms and isotheres were functioning as they should. The air temperature was appropriate relative to the annual mean temperature and to the aperiodic monthly fluctuations of the temperature. The rising and setting of the sun, the moon, the phases of the moon, of Venus, of the rings of Saturn, and many other significant phenomena were all in accordance with the forecasts in the astronomical yearbooks. The water vapor in the air was at its maximal state of tension, while the humidity was minimal. In a word that characterizes the facts fairly accurately, even if it is a bit old-fashioned: It was a fine day in August 1913 (Musil 1930–1945 [1965], p. 3).

The poetic and the evaluative may appear resolutely old-fashioned in a cold, utilitarian universe. But it names precisely an impulse of human knowers that can never be replaced, supplanted or repressed. Practically speaking, we are value-finding beings. We will continue to utter such strange and human constructions as “the sun is coming up” or “it was a very fine day,” for our world is both poetry and prose. And it can never be simply one or the other for human existence.

3.3 Vitalism

As highlighted in the chronology, Lotze officially began as a student of medicine and, after attaining the doctorate in philosophy, he quickly followed with a degree in medicine, awarded for his dissertation De futurae biologiae principibus philosophicis (1838). There later commenced other medically-oriented works, including his Allgemeine Pathologie und Therapie als mechanische Naturwissenschaften (1st: 1842, 2nd: 1848), Allgemeine Physiologie des Körperlichen Lebens (1851), and Medicinische Psychologie, oder Physiologie der Seele (1852). Lotze’s output—in and around the Vörmarz—betrays a continuing preoccupation with both the theory and application of the biological sciences in medicine, physiology and psychology. But it is within this same time period that Lotze makes a fateful contribution, one later portrayed, by Lange, as his “involuntary service to materialism.” (Of course, from similar premises, Lotze drew sharply different conclusions than the materialistic thinkers he inadvertently inspired.) This “service” was his trenchant attack on the concept of “vital force” [Lebenskraft], widely held, by a variety of thinkers of differing orientations, to have struck the decisive blow (cf. Gregory, 1977, pp. 131f).

Lotze’s medical dissertation was, under one description, his opening salvo in this attack, for in it he advocated the abandonment of key concepts of Naturphilosophie including, inter alia, “polarity” and “vital oscillation” (cf. Woodward & Pester, 1994, p. 167 and Pester, 1997, p. 58). But his targets also included the diagnostic terminology favored by the medical nosology of the day—most prominently, “asthenia” (and its cognate notions) and, as already mentioned, “vital force.” While the former was a contribution of the Brunonian theory, further elaborated in Germany by numerous (and peculiar) enthusiasts, the latter was a more widespread assumption of biological thought generally speaking. Yet despite such important differences, both might be pegged with the same fundamental flaw: both could be characterized as empty “abstractions” that falsely paraded as causally “explanatory” notions. Put in Kantian terms, they were both treated (wrongly) as though they were truly “constitutive” principles of human cognition.

Teleology, and teleological notions generally, while licit for certain heuristic purposes, pace Kant, cannot be raised to the level of cognitive principle. Hence, while enquiries into the biological realm may safely assume purposive function, as a necessary theoretical posit, such assumptions may serve only as regulative—not constitutive—principles in biological thought. Teleological notions, such as ‘order’ and ‘purpose’, are, as necessary presuppositions of our theorization generally, ineliminable. But such notions cannot be used explanatorily or, more precisely, in a way that effectively precludes further investigation into the actual causes of organic phenomena. In other words, from the perspective of scientific explanation itself, vital force has no role to play. Furthermore, philosophy itself always outstrips science and indicates “the need to go beyond what is already known and given in the direction of something as yet unknown and not given” (Schnädelbach, 1984, p. 172).

The basic Kantian insight was further ramified by Lotze: mechanism and teleology are coexisting, compatible modes of explanation, each with their own proper sphere, and not contradictory opposites: “[b]oth … are limited, and both imply one another. Mechanism is therefore no power controlling reality, but rather the way in which a purposeful reality realizes itself” (Robins, 1900, p. 11). A lazy reliance on hypothetical posits, Lotze suspected, merely betrays our unwillingness to engage in the difficult work of real scientific discovery. Furthermore by “mechanism” Lotze meant not a blind naturalistic or reductionist technique; rather, he used this word to signify a hypothetical-deductive method of explanation of phenomena (cf. Woodward & Pester, 1994, p. 165). This has important ramifications for the emerging biological sciences: if the essence of science lies in the employ of the hypothetical-deductive method of explanation—and not mathematization, as Kant had insisted—then biology and medicine, for instance, both might admit of a rigorous treatment worthy of the name ‘science’. Teleology does not replace explanation: it supplements it (cf. Lenoir, 1982, pp. 168ff).

However, materialists such as Czolbe were inspired by the elimination of vital force to continue metaphysical “house-cleaning” into the remaining parts of the super-sensual. But Lotze saw no connection between the rightful rejection of empty, and hence, un-scientific notions, on the one hand, and respectable, metaphysical concepts proper, on the other. And so, he believed it possible to be a physiologist, investigating the brain and the nervous system, and a metaphysician, of the soul, simultaneously. There is only one clear and consistent view in natural science: that of hypothetical-deductive physical science. Within this framework, the notion of vital force is, as already noted, dispensable, replaceable by physico-chemical explanations. This substitution had no effect, however, on the metaphysical concepts of necessity, finality and purpose, which must both be part of and govern any (proper) investigation. Materialism was thus forestalled, from Lotze’s perspective, by his overriding commitment to a value-theoretic teleology.

With this proviso firmly in mind, one would have to admit that a properly scientific account could never rule out the existence of such thing as a “soul.” And yet traditional philosophical explanations, rooted in the spontaneity of thought, in practical reason, or in the freedom of the will, argued Lotze, cannot suffice to establish this “universal prejudice.” Nor may we rest content with the obvious fact that deductive explanations seem irrelevant when it comes to understanding mental life generally. There is, nonetheless, a “decisive fact of experience” which may serve to legitimate this posit: the unity of consciousness (Micro, I, p. 152). But it is not our perception of unity (consciousness) that underwrites this ulterior unity (the soul). Rather, “our belief in the soul’s unity rests not on our appearing to ourselves as a unity, but in our being able to appear to ourselves at all” (Micro, I, p. 157). As Lotze further details his (transcendental) argument: “We did not conclude that the soul is one, because we appear to ourselves as a unity; but … by the fact that anything can appear to us” (Micro, I, p. 163). This, teleology is further supplemented by Kantian-style arguments which may further rebuff positivist impulses to construe philosophical investigations as superfluous. Perhaps, for this reason, Lotze’s views are sometimes categorized under the very title that he, on occasion, used: “teleological idealism” (cf. Wagner, 1987, p. 75 & Schnädelbach, 1984, p. 177). Further, because Lotze comes to see nature itself as comprehensible as the life of a cosmic individual—or God—the unity of consciousness is part and parcel of the ultimate unity of the very cosmos itself (cf. Santayana, 1971, pp. 211ff).

4. Three Contributions

4.1 Intuition

The Lotzean soul functions as “a genuine stable point” (Micro, I, p. 143); thus, as a substantial and self-determining principle of unity in consciousness, it is the functional equivalent of Kant’s “transcendental unity of apperception.” The soul is, further, “the abiding source of sensation [i.e., cognition], of feeling [i.e., of emotion], of effort [i.e., volition]” (Micro, I, p. 184). But it is also, Lotze emphasized in contradistinction to Kant, always a particular, embodied consciousness, living entwined in concrete and manifold relatedness. And, even more importantly, it is equally characterized by its innate capacities for emotion and volition, and not just cognition: the soul encompasses all of the capacities of human consciousness and is not restricted to merely intellectual functions. Further, the soul is insofar as it lives (cf. OutMet, pp. 43–44). (Indeed, one interpreter goes as far as to suggest that Lotze embraced a “phenomenological”—rather than a traditional “metaphysical”—notion of the soul, citing the striking utterance: “Insofern ist der Name der Seele ein phaenomologischer Ausdruck” (cf. Sachs-Hombach, 1993, p. 256).) But that there is such a soul is an undeniable conviction inspired by the only credible apprehension of human selfhood and agency.

The Lotzean standpoint was created both to appeal to certain Herbartian emphases and to contrast sharply with others, for Herbart had modeled the soul (in part) on a Leibnizian monad: for him, it was a single, simple, independent, unchanging, indestructible substance. As such, it is utterly analogous to the one thing that, qua substance, underlies the many, shifting properties, which it bears. Such “reals,” which are absolutely simple, can, nonetheless, enter into causal relationships with other “reals” (be they souls or not). Hence, complex mental processes and psychological properties are constructed on the basis of the properties and relations of those “reals” we may identify as souls. (As shall soon become apparent, this conception is utterly abhorrent to Lotze, who embraces in its place, something that, at first glance, appears to be a form of phenomenalism, i.e., that to be a substance is nothing more than to appear as a substance.)

A strong commitment to the concept of soul—or mind or consciousness as distinct from brain activity—leads to a metaphysical question about the very possibility of exact spatial locality qua immaterial being. This, in turn, moves naturally to the prior epistemological issue of how the very perception of space is possible in the first place, given the essentially non-spatial character of mental representations. As Lotze begins with the assumption that these representations are non-spatial, he must account for how the soul can take the manifold of sensation and, subsequently, re-create the relative location of its elements in space. For if the brain and the soul are indeed distinct, then no spatial configuration in the brain could account for our mental apprehension of spatiality. Indeed, an even more basic problem is to account for the way in which “the fixed situation of the variously stimulated nerve extremities” becomes an object of consciousness at all (Micro, I, p. 307, cf. pp. 308–309).

Since spatial relations cannot proceed directly to consciousness, spatial localization is possible only if the non-spatial representations are accompanied by “a qualitative property of some kind which the impression acquires … in virtue of the peculiar nature of the place at which it comes into contact with the body” (Micro, I, p. 309). Consciousness takes up this accompanying qualitative information, such that “they act as marks or as local signs, under whose guidance it proceeds in spreading out the impressions into an image occupying space” (ibid.). As one contemporary commentator observes: Lotze theorized “a close connection between the muscle sensation associated with a sense organ and the local signs that accompany the sensations produced through stimulation of the sensory nerves of that organ” conceived of as a “an innate anatomical mechanism” (Hatfield, 1990, p. 160). This localization, Lotze believed, resulted from the “coloration” produced not by any innate characteristics of the stimulated nerve but by the associated motor impulses that will accompany stimulation of the nerve (cf. ibid.). It is only in such a way, Lotze contended, that non-spatial perceptions can be reconstructed, in our intuition, into a spatial dimension (cf. Micro, II, p. 605). It is a matter of further discussion whether Lotze’s theory of Lokalzeichen accords best with contemporary (and competing) empiricist or nativist accounts (cf. Woodward, 1978).

In typical Lotzean fashion, the preceding discussion is held to be strictly irrelevant in assessing the epistemic nature of spatial representation. This stems, in part, as shall be discussed in the next section, from the fact that Lotze insisted that mere stimuli—and their concomitant relations of association—do not, by themselves, attain to the level of judgmental validity: the mental representations which compose judgments proper are an accomplishment of the mind (consciousness, soul) alone. Hence, space is, as Kant had maintained, epistemically ideal. In a rare, uncharacteristically candid agreement, he admitted that “this kernel of Kant’s doctrine I accept unreservedly”: “space and all spatial connections are merely forms of our subjective intuition, not applicable to those things and those relations of things which are the efficient causes of all particular sensuous intuitions” (Micro, II, pp. 603–604). But Lotze affirmed this premises for reason quite different from Kant, for he believed that Kant had rested his claim of “the ideality of space on the argument that the spatial form of the intuition must be innate” (Hatfield, 1990, p. 163). While Lotze agreed that “… it is not we who are in space, but it is space which is in us” (OutRel, p. 53), this statement engenders no commitments about the ultimate justification of intuitive statements.

The upshot of this approach is that not only does this remove considerations of spatiality from the noumenal realm, but also to accord a new epistemic status to intuition simpliciter: Lotze spoke as though “it is simply given to us in intuition (by inspection) that between any two points only one straight line can be drawn; he referred the ‘first principles’of geometry to the same basis in intuition” (Hatfield, 1990, p. 163). Hence, Lotze counted the axioms of geometry as “self-evident truths,” their very self-evidence being grounded in their intuitive nature: “he conceived the role of intuition as that of revealing the self-evident” (ibid.). This picture is further enriched with Lotze’s distinction of justification (logical) from genesis (psychological). On this view, psychological genesis (or the context of discovery) was irrelevant to the question of logical justification (or the context of justification). It is this approach that gives rise to an axiomatics, where the axioms were to be numbered among those things identified as the self-evident truths. (However, “self-evident,” for Lotze, was often times invoked for an accomplishment of thought and, hence, not strictly identifiable with the ordinary notion of the plainly “obvious.”)

4.2 Thought

As the last section made clear, Lotze made important contributions to the emerging project of neo-Kantian epistemology, including the new concept of validity (as detached and detachable from questions of psychological origin). Further, in his Logic, Lotze included much that would normally be considered under the separate heading of ‘epistemology’. Yet Lotze resolutely refused the mantle of “the theory of knowledge” for a simple but compelling reason: what went under that title in the 1850s and 1860s was a psycho-physiological investigation, for some early figures in the neo-Kantian revival (prominently, Helmholtz and Lange) construed the Müllerian doctrine of “specific nerve energies” as proof positive of the Kantian emphasis on the contributions of transcendental subjectivity in our apprehension of objects. Lotze continuously rebuffed such associations. If “theory of knowledge” named a psychological investigation, then validity would be subordinated to “the history of the psychological development of our thought” (Phil, p. 467). But psychology was to be counted “last” and not “first” in epistemic priority and it “can never be the foundation of our whole philosophy” (ibid., p. 468).

Accordingly, many subsequent philosophers both recognized and credited Lotze with helping to make some of the earliest forays against the looming spectre of psychologism (cf. Heidegger, 2000, p. 29ff). Most critical here is, perhaps, Lotze’s act-content distinction (cf. Micro, II, 630), one which followed Herbart, but preceded Brentano by decades. Furthermore, concept-formation is conceived to be a logical process over and above the mere psychological course of our ideas (further discussed below). Also, Lotze clearly opposed the pan-logicist deduction of Absolute Idealism with something approximating the regressive analysis favored by the subsequent neo-Kantians: “the more urgent and the greater work of philosophy must, I think, bear the shape of a regressive investigation which seeks to discover and to fix securely what principle is to be recognised and used as the living principle in the construction and course of the world” (Phil, p. 452). Discovery of truths of absolute and universal validity describes the a priori project Lotze first adumbrated, later embraced in the logicist program of his student Frege and in varieties of transcendentalism espoused by various neo-Kantians.

As just mentioned, concept-formation is freed from the peculiarities of the subjective psychological process by concentration on the creation and refining of objective thought contents. This logical process may proceed by reference to the “grammatical” categories of substantive, adjective and verb that may be taken to “mirror” the logical categories of object, concept and relation, respectively. As it has been explained, this picture allows for both an act-content distinction and the minimal structure required to get our metaphysics off the ground:

The three logical forms thus indicate the minimum amount of structure we must presuppose in order to come to any deeper understanding of reality. That is, one must minimally posit: (i) things, which serve as “fixed points” which may support and to which we may append (ii) dependent properties, … which may connect or relate to other such “fixed points” by means of (iii) relations … [further] [b]y naming part of our sensory-manifold, we separate out that part and make it a content which can be grasped by others. (Sullivan, 1991, p. 260)

In this way, Lotze made headway and yet, ironically, appeared retrograde to those who came after, those who found little comfort in the seeming correspondence of grammar and thought-contents. Nevertheless Lotze’s actual contributions to the emergence of Sprachphilosophie are typically unappreciated, if not ignored altogether. This is strange for although, by mid-century, many different theoretic approaches to the study of language were available, Lotze is undoubtedly the most important of the mainstream academic philosophers to turn his attention to this topic. In his Microcosmus, Lotze devoted numerous pages to the connection he hoped to help establish, that between language and thought. A number of his important consideration and conclusions will be summarized and discussed in what follows. (For a further discussion of some of these points, particularly in relation to Frege, see Sullivan, 1991.)

First, Lotze denies that language is primarily a phonemic enterprise, insisting instead that there is a dual dependence between language and thought: language cannot exist without there being meanings [Bedeutungen] correlated to its words and yet thought also relies directly upon the syntactic abilities of a given natural language to provide the basic form by which apprehension may take place. For this reason, language cannot be portrayed as emerging as a species of “venting,” designed only to communicate bodily passions and excite animal sympathies. Language too is an inadequate expression of our thought and in our actual speech we omit much, relying on the abilities of our hearers to reconstruct that which is not explicitly expressed in words. Likewise, for effective communication, much is dependent upon such things as gestures, emphases, and other modulations of voice. But Lotze remained immovable on his central motif: “the peculiar nature of thought and the very close connection between it and language” (Micro, I, 619).

For Lotze, the merely accidental associations of ideas do not—and cannot—constitute thought. The animal mind is capable of linking associations but it can neither explain nor justify these perceived connections (for instance, on the basis of an objectively valid law). Thought is dependent in its architectonic on a certain process of formation to occur so that “building” can begin. As construction cannot begin with a mere “pile of stones,” there first must be a process of “cutting and shaping” so that the basic elements of thought may be properly “fitted together,” forming interlocking pieces: “Language exhibits this first operation of thought in the distinction of its parts of speech” (Micro, I, p. 622) and the three forms of substantive, adjective, and verb compose “the minimum of organization and division of presented matter with which thought can attempt to begin its operations” (Micro, I, p. 623). Furthermore, this syntactic organization is the very element that gives “significance” to our words:

Now this is what we signified above as the peculiar function through which the significant sound really becomes a word; for it is not made such by its significance; on the contrary, the interjections which most purely and directly express psychic excitement form an unorganized residue of the material of language. The sound becomes a word by means of the logical accessory thoughts displayed in the character of the parts of speech; they serve as uniting surfaces and joints for the various contents, which thus become capable of syntactic combination in the service of thought (ibid., my emphases).

Thus, to reiterate again, the three linguistic forms of substantive, adjective, and verb are required to express thought’s apprehension of (independent) objects, (dependent) properties, and relations (respectively). And for such formative purposes, syntax is critical, not sound. This is because “thought cannot directly make use of sensations, feelings, moods, simple or complex images, as materials for its structure” (Micro, I, p. 622).

Nevertheless, and despite the multiple riches of linguistic expression, grammatical syntax often falls short of logical structure (“may lag behind its logical articulation” (Micro, I, p. 624)). Indeed, linguistic form is responsible both for a certain superstition and a mythology being imported into human thinking. The first (superstition) occurs because the very process of naming seems to bestow a quality on reality that is, in point of fact, quite possibly lacking:

The sound of the name seems to dispel … obscurity, though it adds nothing to the content—does not even always bring the light implied in indicating the particular place belonging to the object in a series, or within the sphere of some wider notion. Young botanists delight in learning the Latin names of wayside flowers, and go contented on their way only to be presently disturbed by a mountain that, strange to say, has no name, and so has properly speaking no right to be there. Now, what do they miss in the one case? What did they gain in the other? I cannot look on this fancy as so insignificant as it appears—nay, I see in it a counterpart or continuation of the genuinely human mode of conception … We are not satisfied with the perception of an object; its existence becomes legitimate only when it forms part of a regular system of things that has its own significance apart from our perception (Micro, I, p. 627).

As a result, for Lotze, an arbitrarily given name is, in fact, no name at all: a mere “name” is utterly insufficient. What is required is for that name to provide “evidence of its having been received into the world of the universally known and recognised” (Micro, I, p. 628). While remaining somewhat obscure, it should now be apparent, as in the earlier remarks about “race,” that the mere enumeration of terminology is surely not sufficient for this larger requirement.

We go well beyond mere superstition into a full blown mythology, however, once we add in the fact that language has a history and, thus, has accumulated, over time, a large reserve of possible expressions including those made possible by what Lotze dubs “the syntactic pliability of language” (ibid.). Consequently, even utter nonsense can deceive us by means of the surface correctness of its grammatical form. The prime candidates here are those expressions which emerge by means of the nominalization of predicates. For example,

… we have almost ceased to speak of beautiful objects, i.e., we forget that what we call beautiful is originally a mere adjective determination not existing apart from a subject; we speak now of the Beautiful, or at best of Beauty, and our aesthetic thinkers are quite convinced that what can exist only as an attribute is correctly apprehended only when it has unnaturally been apprehended as something substantive which is everywhere identical (Micro, I, p. 629).

It thus appears that Lotze is among those figures who diagnosis circumstances where logical form ought not to follow (“model”) grammatical syntax, despite the undeniable work that grammar makes possible for thought:

In all … [such] cases language creates for us a mythology, from which, of course, in the use of language we can never wholly set ourselves free without becoming pedantically precise, but against the influence of which on the moulding of our thoughts we ought to be carefully on our guard. Logic does not always assist us in this direction, nay, sometimes in its methods makes pernicious concessions to this false tendency arising from the use of language (Micro, I, p. 630).

Unlike Frege, however, Lotze sees little prospect for a logic freed from the constraints of linguistic syntax. Further, because Lotze figures mathematical logic as contiguous with the Leibnizian project of a lingua characteristica, his doubts about the latter extend to the former, which he dubs the “logical calculus.” This new symbolism—e.g., the Boolean expression of universal affirmative judgements with “y = vx”—is only “an ineffectual indication of what we knew before” (Log, p. 276). In his eyes, the Leibnizian project entailed the search for a logical language which would provide “a universal mode of characterizing conceptions” (ibid., p. 272). But Lotze’s epistemological holism focused on the judgement, and its ultimate derivation from a priori principles, rather than the analysis of conceptual content. Furthermore, as just mentioned, Lotze’s analysis of content may be easily exhausted in a quasi-grammatical analysis and precludes, of course, a more complex construal involving, say, quantification and other second-order functions. (It is important to note, however, his introduction of a functional notation for the analysis of the relation of part-concepts.)

Now despite his rejection of symbolic logic as an unfruitful and unnecessary novelty, Lotze nonetheless held fast to the existence of “necessary laws of thought” as the strongest bulwark against relativistic skepticism. Indeed, the various kinds of skepticism, whatever there other differences, share a fatal flaw: they all must articulate a possible standard of truth and the very same time that they deny or demur the actual existence of such truth. Likewise, objections that such laws have only “subjective validity” (i.e., are valid only for us) and, hence, inadequate approximations of the external world presuppose some realist thesis (about the nature and existence of the external world) that has not yet been established (cf. Foster, 1882, pp. 43ff). Accordingly, Lotze must refuse the charms of any correspondence theory of truth and embrace, in their stead, a variant of the coherence theory. However, although coherence is a relation that is descriptive of ideal thought-contents, we must not expect that coherence entails the possibility of a completely coherent world-picture being graspable by any particular human knower. Hence, the laws of coherence are ideal laws of thought and philosophy must disclaim all ambition of arriving at a consummate and perfect system.

4.3 Existence

Once we abandon the project of further articulating relations between world and idea, as adumbrated in the preceding section, however, we might appear to be stymied by charges of vicious “circularity” once we refuse to go outside the sphere of our own presentations. Lotze acknowledges this “circle” but deems it unavoidable:

The circle is inevitable, so we had better perpetrate it with out eyes open; the first thing we have to do is to endeavour to establish what meaning it is possible for us to attach to knowledge in its widest sense, and what sort of relation we can conceive to subsist between the subject which knows, and the object of its knowledge, consistently with those yet more general notions which determine the mode in which we have to conceive the operation of anything whatever upon anything else. What we have to do is to obtain the last-mentioned conception, which amounts to a metaphysical doctrine, and to treat the relation of subject and object as subordinate to it. (Log., p. 451)

What is needed, within logic, is to concern ourselves with the general a priori structures of human cognition (for it is this investigation that leads one ineluctably to the existence of certain general yet necessary truths, which must frame our entire epistemological enterprise). This transcendental project is, however, subordinate to one constraint: a metaphysical system which can limit and constrain the realm of the possible which might make up our circle of ideas. Hence, we come ineluctably to the concept of being.

Any post-Kantian discussion of the relation of thought to being must come to grips with Kant’s rigid bifurcation between phenomenal appearance and noumenal reality. Of course, without strict adherence to this distinction, Kant’s own position would collapse into Berkleyan phenomenalism. Accordingly, post-Kantians such as Herbart, who wanted to maintain a strong realism, had to rethink this central feature of Kantian metaphysics. But while Herbart maintained the possibility of some relation between noumena and phenomena, Lotze went further in dissociating the two; hence, Lotze was led to oppose, as well, the notion of a single unchangeable substance lying at the base of the thing and constituting its essence. Accordingly, phenomenal properties, which say nothing about the true nature of a thing, say everything about our peculiar capacity of perception. Yet Lotze assumed that changes at the phenomenal level must reflect changes at the noumenal and he persisted in the belief that although appearance is not like reality it does, nevertheless, provide knowledge of reality. And so, he mustered adherence to Herbart’s realist standpoint while rejecting all correlative claims about the immutability of substance (cf. Santayana, 1971, pp. 152ff). Our only conclusion must be Santayana’s: “… although he retains the word substance he abandons the notion for which it commonly stands” (Santayana, 1971, p. 153). Hence, we might be tempted to see Lotze as inaugurating the reign of the Funktionsbegriff over the Substanzbegriff (cf., Cassirer, 1923).

Additionally, the notion of being favored by Kant (and his realistic disciple Herbart) rested in the belief that the meaning of existence simpliciter could by captured in the formulation “absolute position.” As this standpoint has been encapsulated:

The Herbartian view is indicated in the notion of ‘pure being’ as Setzung: that ‘what we call the true Being should be found only in pure “position,” void of relation’. In fact, on this view, it is only because pure being lacks relation that existing things are able to enter into relations at all. Herbart concludes that reality is composed of something plural, simple and indestructible: what he called ‘the Reals’. Since reality is compounded of substances that can suffer no change, and are hence immutable, the relations (into which things ‘enter in’) must be utterly external and accidental. (Sullivan, 1998, p. 841)

Lotze rejects this portrayal of reality composed of simple unchangeable substances for, first, the concept of ‘position’ ascribed to them is meaningless in abstracto and, second, utterly dependent upon the correlative notion of ‘relation’; conceptual relations are a creation of our thought, which stipulates a connection between otherwise divergent individual things. Subsequently it has no more claim to reality than spatiality, for it too simply implicates a mere form of perception. Also, the naïve conception of relations as metaphysically primitive gives rise to numerous problems of infinite regress (cf. Robins, 1900, pp. 88–89). In its place, Lotze substituted for this creation of pure thought a kind of linguistic contextualism: instead of affirmation of a particular concept, affirming, as an act, belongs to “nothing but a proposition in which the content of the notion is brought into relation with that of another” (Micro, II, p. 582). Notably, the contrasting conceptual folly has a metaphysical analogue, the insistence that “… things must be, before they can stand in the relations in which indeed alone their reality can become perceptible to us” (Micro, II, p. 583).

5 Three Legacies

5.1 Monism

It might be supposed—wrongly—that interest in Lotze cannot be justified except on historical or antiquarian grounds. And, of course, if combined with a Quinean attitude, enforcing a divergence between the history of philosophy and philosophy proper, Lotze could be dismissed without even a further thought. However, such objections might be blunted if it can be shown that the work of Lotze continues to influence contemporary thought, albeit in a disguised, even underground fashion, through the thought of those thinkers who came after him. Lotze’s main (and enduring) contributions are evidenced in the emergence of what others have dubbed “the neo-Kantian paradigm”. This philosophical approach (composed by parts of orientation, attitude and technique) provides the shared backdrop against which the analytic-continental split emerges. Particularly important for both Frege and Husserl, Lotze’s influence extends, partly via the British Idealists (see Sullivan, 2008), to Russell, Moore, and Carnap, on the analytic side of the equation, as already noted in the Preface.

Most of these continued influences remain unacknowledged, even subterranean. And it is only possible to isolate a few of them here. Beginning with the most obvious, Lotze, via the British Idealists, enriched the concept of the Absolute in a number of interesting ways. This can be shown if we further investigate two key aspects of Lotze’s metaphysics: how his functionalist approach entails both, on the one hand, monism and, on the other, a sort of instrumentalism.

Lotze seeks to finess the problem of causality—in its relation to the phenomena/noumena distinction—by replacing it with the notion of ground, or logical consequence. He is led to this conception by, among other things, the difficulties associated with the notion of metaphysical or transeunt causality. As he framed it, the problem was: if there were many separate, independently existing things, then there is no credible account forthcoming about how any single given thing may causally interact with any other single given thing. Further, Lotze’s solution aims at, once again, making sense of the process of our thinking and not explicating any supposed relation of mind and world. Hence, he insists that the very indispensability of cause and effect in human cognition entails a necessary rejection of metaphysical pluralism: we must abandon “our preconceived idea that they [i.e., things] are originally many and self-existent, and … [instead adopt] the view that there is a truly existent being m … [and that] this m is the ground and basis of all individual beings a, b, c, …” (OutRel, p. 39).

Lotze therefore utilizes Humean-style arguments, without thereby concurring with Humean conclusions (in particular Hume’s radical psychologism). If Hume dissolved causality into a mental predisposition—a psychological expectation of uniformity—then Lotze reduced it, instead, to the efficient causality found in a regularly occurring sequence, which expresses a rule or law. Hence, while it makes no sense to inquire into the deeper bases of causality, there remains, nonetheless, plenty of work to do; for while it is utterly “idle” to “look for the reason of that causality” (Santayana, 1971, p.190) yet, nonetheless,

… [t]o note and describe sequences is all we can do in such a case; the ground for these sequences is simply the nature of the given thing, which is nothing but the law which those sequences exemplify and actualize. We have no business to ask for any further ground for these sequences; they are the nature of things. All we can do is reconcile our will and imagination to this given and unexplained order, by showing that it gives rise to aesthetic and moral values. (ibid.)

This commitment to explaining the given by reference to ultimate values has a number of important ramifications for the unfolding of Lotze’s metaphysics. First, as there cannot be a plurality of mutually distinct, independently existing things, we must encourage a monistic conception. Recall the aforementioned issue of how thing a (if such existed) might causally interact with thing b (ditto). James provides the most admirable gloss of Lotze’s manner of reply:

The multiple independent things cannot be real in that shape, but all of them, if reciprocal action is to be possible between them, must be regarded as parts of a single real being, M. The pluralism with which our view began has to give place to a monism; and the ‘transeunt’ interaction, being unintelligible as such, is to be understood as an immanent operation.

The words ‘immanent operation’ seem here to mean that the single real being M, of which a and b are members, is the only thing that changes, and that when it changes, it changes inwardly and all over at once. When part a in it changes, consequently, part b must also change, but without the whole M changing this would not occur. (James, 1977, p. 31)

Of course, James himself strongly repudiated this argument and its conclusion, painting the former as verbal sophistry. But for Lotze this conclusion was inevitable if the universe and its elements were to be properly conceptualized as “a unity” or kosmos (i.e., an aesthetic demand).

Second, things (and their posited but unproven existence) remain nothing but “ideas indispensable for the intelligibility of the changeable phenomenal world” (Micro, II, p. 584). The subject of metaphysics is reality but reality only as it can be made intelligible to human knowers. Also, there are limits and paradoxes involved in our previous commitment to “this absolute existence which we symbolise as m” (OutRel, p. 40). Beyond its oneness and existence we cannot—from within metaphysics—go. The ‘absolute’ thus functions as “a limiting conception” (ibid., p. 41). Furthermore, metaphysics has no intrinsic method for support and, in particular, is not preceded by epistemology. In this way, among others, Lotze’s metaphysics attempted to chart a middle course, one set somewhere between the absolute idealism of Hegel and his followers, on the one hand, and the critical realism of Herbart and his disciples, on the other. But, most importantly, it attempted to carve out the requisite space for a conception that seemed naturalistic in its assumptions but which was wedded to the idealist notion of “unity” that was founded in self-consciousness or personality, whether this be attained by the philosopher-scientist alone or as supported by the continued consciousness of God.

As we have just seen, Lotze’s monism—or his belief in the substantial unity of everything that exists—stands opposed to Herbart’s earlier pluralistic atomism. His redescription of causality likewise coheres with his prior conviction that there must exist a human soul endowed with freedom of the will. Correlatively, Lotze encourages us to think of the world as the product of the will of God, of an infinite spirit: reality is, hence, that which corresponds to (a) self-consciousness. But is this particular self-consciousness or spirit—which we may identify with the absolute—also personal in nature? Our first impulse yields a negative response simply because personality normally is associated with the notion of fixed limits (which would, of course, be inappropriate in an infinite, unlimited being). And yet, Lotze contends that we must conceive of God as the preeminent personality and so, once again, God’s own personality is “an immediate certainty,” grasped only as a necessity of the human mind. And, hence, we come to the concept of personality.

The reduction of cognition, emotion and volition to values was to fit hand-in-hand with other thinkers’ preoccupation with the spectre of relativism. So although Lotze himself took refuge in a quasi-Platonic account, some neo-Kantians pushed farther in the attempt to ground value in some account of the nature of consciousness itself. Windleband, for example, developed the notion of a “normal [i.e., normative] consciousness,” which is to say a consciousness that was itself productive of norms or values. The further particulars here must await another occasion. But Schnädelbach’s observations of a fundamental shift from Lotze’s to Windelband’s position—or, from a “teleological value—relevance of reality … as a relation of transcendental constitution in which value stood to valuation” to one which emphasized “the evaluating normal consciousness … [as] the basis of both axiology and ontology” (cf. Schnädelbach, 1984, p. 182)—surely calls out for a detailed investigation in the near future.

5.2 Persons

While the centrality of ‘person’ stands in most natural affinity with the name of Kant, the idea undergoes a number of critical developments in the various strands of post-Kantian idealism. On the one hand, Kant had relied on personality in distinguishing rational being from mere things, by reference to the former’s capacity for self-government or autonomy. Further, Kant had insisted that persons have “worth” or “value” and that this serves as a critical characteristic separating them from mere things (which may be said to have only a “price”). On the other, the scientific approach, when applied directly to human beings, appear to have rendered the notion of personality incomprehensible and superfluous. (Indeed, Lotze would probably not be at all surprised by the threat posed to personal identity resulting from reflection on the quantum theory!). Also, if Christianity is re-described as an ethical religion—stressing the essential aspects of interior life and, henceforth, abandoning all claims to metaphysical or cosmological significance—then it cannot stand simply as a bulwark against the materialist onslaught on inessential aspects of our subjectivity.

Against these and similar considerations Lotze argued that our own subjectivity is not founded in opposition to objectivity: the subject (the ‘I’) is not opposed and formed in reaction to the object (the ‘not-I’) but rather in its encounter with another subject (a ‘thou’) (OutRel, pp. 65ff). Consequently, personality is an ethical concept par excellance and is, qua ethical, identifiable as the “ultimate reality.” Of course we cannot identify the world with our own subjective consciousness without falling into either solipsism or subjective idealism. Hence, we arrive, instead, at the necessary conclusion of objective idealism. Lotze’s view Santayana aptly encapsulates as follows:

The seat of the value of the world is consciousness, but of course not exclusively human consciousness. These moments that contain the sense of things, the consciousness of the cosmic law,—those in fact that contain the personality of cosmic life—contain also its value, and the happiness to which it gives rise. To us the divine life is revealed in beauty, in our own seasons of happiness, and our faith in the deep roots that good has in nature. Our consciousness, however, constitutes but an echo of that consciousness in which the purpose of the world is realized; the goal of things is the happiness of God…. (Santayana, 1971, p. 223)

Reality is purposive and its contents collectively form an ideal unity and this conclusion is fostered by an awareness of the view of the world comprised sub specie aeternitatis in the nature of supreme consciousness.

Further, Lotze’s peculiar investigations into morality provide yet another case study in Lotzean dialectic. Moral rules cannot be understood as merely prudential maxims or as essentially self-regarding in nature: moral principles must possess an “intrinsic worth.” However, this fact should not capitulate us into either a mystical or religious position, on the one hand, or the “empty formalism” of Kantianism, on the other. For both utilitarians and egoists are so far right when they insist upon the necessary presence of pleasure and pain (as concrete content) in moral deliberation. But to escape such subjective egoism in morality is possible only if we shift our perspective by changing “our conception of our personality and its position in the world” (OutRel, p. 159). Characteristically, our untutored convictions suggest the idea that moral laws express and embody the will of God. To escape the subsequent Euthyphro-style questions and difficulties, we must identify God with the supreme Good:

God is nothing else than that will whose purport and mode of action can be conceived of in our reflection as that which is good in itself—as a will which can only be separated by abstraction from the living form in which it exists in the real God. (ibid., p. 161)

Likewise our will expresses its moral nature in the ability to freely choose between competing values, without compulsion. But this choice is always rooted in a concrete reality—our feeling, for instance, that truth is rightfully to be pursued because it is good.

As already noted, by means of his enduring presence in liberal Protestant thought and literature, Lotze continued to be a topic of interest even in post-war American theological schools and seminaries. Indeed, through the impress of “personalism,” Lotze’s thought—handed down through Bowne and Brightman—appears to have imposed upon Martin Luther King the conception of a personal god and the metaphysical underpinnings for an insistence upon the “dignity and worth” of all “human personality.” But this underscores the unacknowledged fact that it is Lotze, and not Kant, that is the most likely source of King’s insistence on the dignity of the human person (cf. Burrow, 1999, pp. 76ff).

Likewise, Lotze’s contributions to the topic of polygenesis, with its obvious consequences for projects of scientific racism, may help explain Lotze’s line of influence, extending through the history of African American philosophy, beginning with Du Bois’ The Souls of Black Folk (1903). While “folk” has obvious Herderian overtones, for “soul” Du Bois would have drawn more naturally on Lotze, under the tutelage of McCosh and James (cf. Rampersad, 1990, p. 74). In point of fact, it appears that it is one of Lotze’s leading ideas that provides a key impetus to Du Bois cultural project.

Du Bois practices modernist collage, invariably beginning each chapter of his work with an excerpt of lyric, drama or poetry, combined with bars of musical notation from what he dubs “the Sorrow Songs.” Through this simple act of ostension, Du Bois directly posits the cultural parity of European American and African American culture, even as he is at pains to voice his revolutionary assertion:

We the darker ones come even now not altogether empty-handed:… here is no true American music but the wild sweet melodies of the Negro slave; the American fairy tales and folk-lore are Indian and African;… Will America be poorer if she replace… her vulgar music with the soul of the Sorrow Songs? (Du Bois, 1903, pp. 11–12).
Little of beauty has America given the world save the rude grandeur God himself stamped on her bosom; the human spirit in this new world has expressed itself in vigor and ingenuity rather than in beauty. And so by fateful chance the Negro folk-song—the rhythmic cry of the slave—stands to-day not simply as the sole American music, but as the most beautiful expression of human experience born this side the seas. It has been neglected, it has been, and is, half despised, and above all it has been persistently mistaken and misunderstood; but notwithstanding, it still remains as the singular spiritual heritage of the nation and the greatest gift of the Negro people (Ibid., p. 251).

African Americans had contributed mightily in the realm of art but little, to date, in thought or politics, for the obvious reasons. But Lotze provided a metaphysical basis for equalizing and explaining such contributions to human culture: as noted above, for Lotze, the human soul (or human consciousness) is equally cognition, emotion, and volition. Descartes was wrong: we are not just thinking things, but also feeling and willing things.

This tripartite division was expressed by Lotze in numerous ways—sometimes as concept, feeling, and sensation or, at others, as ideas, emotions and aspirations [Strebungen]. While attention has focused quite naturally on Du Bois famous “double consciousness,” he articulates this in the terminology of Lotzean tripartition: “two souls [emotions], two thoughts [cognition], two unreconciled strivings [volition]” (Ibid., p. 3). While “twoness” in African Americans was a pernicious “waste” (Ibid., p. 55) of energies, they shared equally with European Americans in the human experience of “meaning… passion… and… struggle” (Ibid., p. viii).

The very terminology (of Streben) points us to the centrality of Fichte for Lotze, a leitmotiv only suggested in the margins of this entry till now. Although sometimes pegged as either an Hegelian or Herbartian, Lotze is quite clear that Fichte’s influence was the decisive one — “The teaching of Fichte had been different”:

The problem of the spirit, he held, does not lie in the cognition of a blind ‘Being’ (the conception of which appeared to him as impossible as it appears to us), but in action. The aforesaid world external is not, but appears to us in order to serve as material of our duty, as inducement or object of our action (OutMet, p. 150).

This is, of course, the well-known Fichtean subjugation of theoretical to practical reason. But Lotze believes that action here is merely a formal concept and so he seeks the following emendation:

For the aforesaid ‘action’ of Fichte we substitute the morally Good, for which the action is simply the indispensable form of actualization; we besides conceive of the ‘beautiful,’ too, and the ‘happy’ or ‘blessedness,’ as united with this Good into one complex of all that has Value (OutMet, p. 151).

The ‘morally good’ [das sittlich-Gute] can only be realized —be actualized— through action of persons. Although all of the words used to describe the purpose of life—including happiness or blessedness—point us towards a super-ordinate concept, that of the valuable, the focus rests squarely on the human person.

But are we now not confined within a realm of pure subjectivity, “since all the Value of what is valuable has existence only in the spirit that enjoys it” (OutMet, p. 152)? Certainly not.

The objectivity of our cognition consists, therefore, in this, that it is not a meaningless play of mere seeming; but it brings before us a World whose coherency is order in pursuance of the injunction of the Sole Reality in the world,—to wit, of the Good. Our cognition thus possesses more of truth than it copied exactly a world of objects that has no value in itself. Although it does not comprehend in what manner all that is phenomenon is presented to its view, still it understands what is the meaning of it all; and is like to a spectator who comprehends the aesthetic significance of that which takes place on the stage of a theatre, and would gain nothing essential if he were to see besides the machinery by means of which the changes are effected on that stage (ibid.).

The metaphysical claim here is clear even if not to contemporary tastes: the “objectivity of our cognition” lies in the fact that it is not a meaningless game of mere appearance, but that it presents to us a world whose nexus is ordered in accordance with the commandments of the only Real [Realen] in the world, the Good [des Guten]. And thus we come, inexorably, to value.

5.3 Value Theory

To recapitulate, briefly: First, we must abandon the mere prejudice that the external world exists complete and independent of our minds, and that our thinking is merely a “useless appendage” which merely reproduces the contents of the world, as a fruitless activity. Nor should we fall into the trap of absolute idealism, which so reduces the world of things that they can easily be fitted into the formal categories of our thinking (that is, reduce metaphysics to logic). The right way was indicated by Fichte: our minds are not for the mere cognitive reproduction of meaningless things, but rather a “world” only appears to us in order to serve as a stage inducing us to meaningful action. But action characterizes only the subjective side of things: on the other side, we must identify the moral good, and our action becomes, hence, merely a means of realizing this end.

The terminology of “moral good” is thus shorthand for the entire complex of values (and, hence, can be identified with what earlier thinkers called the good, the beautiful, happiness, or blessedness). But although this apprehension of the world is dependent upon mind, it is not subjective. Instead, our cognition of the world and its value is objective: a world can only be a system of the truly real, that is to say, a system ordered according to the good. For this purpose, we need not understand the mechanics of our cognition and, indeed, we would gain little from this knowledge, for the central thing is the apprehension of meaningfulness present to us in a world of mere physical objects.

Finally, then we come to the subject of value and validity, which describes an immense topic.The following restricts itself to but one small part of the continental side, briefly discussing the case of Heidegger. Heidegger’s long engagement with the Lotzean foundations of his neo-Kantian teachers has not yet received widespread acknowledgement (see, however, Crowell, 2001). The early Heidegger seemingly operated wholly within the neo-Kantian paradigm and even the first emergence of the phenomenological impulse was directed, at least in part, at a reconceptualization of neo-Kantian topics and questions. Especially revealing is the lecture course of Summer Semester 1919, which aimed at nothing less than “a phenomenological critique of transcendental philosophy of value” (Heidegger, 2000, p. 108). Thereby, Heidegger intended to utilize Brentano, Dilthey and Husserl, among others, to combat and reconstruct the insights of Windelband, Rickert and Lask, on the one hand, and also the Marburgers (and even Simmel), on the other. And the common root of these heterogeneous schools and thinkers had to begin with Lotze’s decisive contribution (cf. ibid., pp. 116–118).

According to Heidegger, in the midst of the nineteenth century two global errors emerged, only to attain prominence in philosophical practice of that day: naturalism and historicism. The only school that avoided these two was “speculative theism” and it was under their influence that Lotze’s breakthrough emerged: the decisive repudiation of naturalism without falling into mere “history of philosophy.” This was accomplished by Lotze’s revival of the non-sensory while avoiding “the extravagant naturalistic supra-sensoriness of the old metaphysics” (Heidegger, 2000, p. 117). In his articulation of a philosophy of value, Lotze “killed two birds with one stone”: “a safeguarding of the continuity and connection with German idealism, but simultaneously a critical deflection of speculative idealism” (ibid., p. 118). (But this assessment would not stand, for by the Nietzsche lectures (cf. Heidegger, 1977, esp. pp. 70ff) of 1936–40, Heidegger has come to believe that a reliance on the terminology of value and values was simply the positivist version of the metaphysical (which was supposed to have been thoroughly vanquished) (cf. Schnädelbach, 1984, pp. 190f).)

Further substantiation of Heidegger’s deep and continuing struggle with Lotze (and the neo-Kantian paradigm he helped engender) is now available in English in the newly translated 1925/26 lecture course on Logic (Heidegger, 2010). Here Heidegger makes explicit the exact same thesis, later elaborated by Gillian Rose, namely that Lotze is indeed the founder of the paradigm so excellently developed and exploited by the neo-Kantians: “The ‘neo-Kantian paradigm’ refers to those who attempted a new answer to the Kantian questions of validity within the framework of validity and values first developed by Lotze” (Rose, 1981, p. 6). Coincident with this is a shift, by these later thinkers, to philosophy as a kind of purified methodologism, a pure and general (but not at all formal) logic, directed towards a vision of science “as an ideal network of propositions” (Heidegger, 2010, p. 50). By Heidegger’s later lights, all of neo-Kantianism and much of Husserl was sharply inflected by this (unconscious) prejudice.

While a fuller discussion of this interesting topic is not possible here, some light is nevertheless shed by a brief consideration of the twentieth-century reaction to neo-Kantianism, as found in the thought of (mostly) later thinkers (inter alia, Heidegger himself):

Dilthey, Heidegger, Mannheim, Benjamin and Gadamer have this criticism in common: the neo-Kantian answers to the question of validity debase the question of being, reality, life or history … [they] return to the Kantian question of validity, ‘What are the preconditions of experience?’, but judge that the Kantian reference to the categories and their application itself has a precondition: ‘life’ (Dilthey), ‘social-situation’ (Mannheim), ‘Dasein’ (Heidegger), ‘history’ (Gadamer). These become the presupposition of the use of the categories or of meaning, the ‘a priori’ of a new kind of ontology (Rose, 1981, pp. 22–23).

(Note that from the analytic side, the emergence of concepts such as ‘form of life’ and ‘ordinary language’ may be seen to play similar roles.) As a consequence, whether continental (or analytic) philosophy deserve the appellation of neo-neo-Kantianism remains an open question.

Heidegger’s rejection of Lotze and neo-Kantianism by means of a return to a more basic or primodial notion is quite explicit in the Logic lectures:

Lotze uses the word “being” as equivalent to “out-there-ness,” and therefore he uses “being” for sensible beings, material beings in the widest sense. I have already stressed that the currently common term “sensible entity” does not characterize being [Sein], but only determines the way of apprehending being … I use “being” in the exact opposite sense, and in connection with the genuine tradition of Greek philosophy broadly speaking (Heidegger, 2010, p. 53).

(A few pages later, Heidegger also makes clear where the necessary return in philosophy lies—“The need to return to Aristotle” (Heidegger, 2010, p. 90)—with, of course, the important proviso that “[t]he Greeks had no suspicion of this unfathomable problematic, which opens up before us once we have seen this connection [between being and time]” (Heidegger, 2010, p. 163).)

Unfortunately, there are grounds for thinking that this turn to metacritique—i.e., the application of neo-Kantian style criticism to neo-Kantianism (and its unacknowledged presuppositions)—nevertheless, “in spite of its radical intentions, remains within the paradigm of Geltung and cannot make the transition to a speculative position” (Rose, 1981, p. 24). Instead, almost all the lines of thought, dominant in the twentieth century, ultimately converge and terminate at “a neo-Fichtean station” (ibid.). And there, it appears, we remain.


Primary Literature in English

Log Logic, in three books: of Thought, of Investigation, and of Knowledge (1874), ed. and trans. B. Bosanquet, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1884; 2nd edition, 1887.
Met Metaphysics, in three books: Ontology, Cosmology, and Psychology (1879), ed. and trans. B. Bosanquet, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1884; 2nd edition, 1887.
Micro Microcosmus: An Essay Concerning Man and His Relation to the World (1856–58, 1858–64), trans. E. Hamilton and E. E. C. Jones, Edinburgh: T. & T. Clark, 1885; 4th edition, 1899.
OutLog Outlines of Logic and of Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. and trans. G. T. Ladd, Boston, MA: Ginn & Co., 1887.
OutMet Outlines of Metaphysic, ed. and trans. G. T. Ladd, Boston, MA: Ginn & Co., 1884 .
OutRel Outlines of a Philosophy of Religion, ed. F. C. Conybeare, London: Swan Sonnenschein & Co., 1892.
Phil “Philosophy in the Last Forty Years. First Article.” (1880) In Kleine Schriften, v. 3, ed. D. Peipers, Leipzig: S. Hirzel, 1885–91.

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  • –––, 2002, “The Further Question: Frege, Husserl and the neo-Kantian Paradigm,” Philosophiegeschichte und logische Analyse, 5: 77–95.
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