Principle of Sufficient Reason

First published Tue Sep 14, 2010; substantive revision Wed Jun 14, 2023

The Principle of Sufficient Reason is a powerful and controversial philosophical principle stipulating that everything must have a reason, cause, or ground. This simple demand for thoroughgoing intelligibility yields some of the boldest and most challenging theses in the history of philosophy. In this entry we begin by explaining the Principle and then turn to the history of the debates around it. We conclude with an examination of the emerging contemporary discussion of the Principle.

1. Introduction

Suppose you enter a farmers’ market, pick out a few cucumbers and ask the merchant for the price. “Five dollars a pound”. A bit expensive, you may think, but you pay. Before you leave the stand two other people approach the seller with the very same question (“How much are the cucumbers?”). “A dollar a pound”, she says to the one; “Ten dollars a pound”, she tells the other. At least two of you are likely to attack the merchant with a simple question: Why the price discrepancy? Of course, you may simply leave the place if you have a simple explanation for the discrepancy (for example, that both you and the person who was asked to pay ten dollars a pound belong to commonly discriminated minorities). You may also conclude that the seller is just out of her mind (or that she is just conducting a psychological experiment). In all of these cases you will be entertaining an explanation or reason for a fact that appears odd. But what kinds of facts demand an explanation? Do all facts—including the most ordinary ones—demand an explanation? If you accept an unrestricted form of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (= PSR), you will require an explanation for any fact, or in other words, you will reject the possibility of any brute, or unexplainable, facts.

A simple formulation of the principle is as follows:

For every fact \(F\), there must be a sufficient reason why \(F\) is the case.

The term “fact” in the above formulation is not intended to express any commitment to an ontology of facts. Still, if one wishes to avoid such connotations, the principle can be formulated more schematically:

For every \(x\), there is a \(y\) such that \(y\) is the sufficient reason for \(x\) (formally: \(\forall x\exists y\, Ryx\) [where “\(Ryx\)” denotes the binary relation of providing a sufficient reason]).

The PSR is, in fact, a family of principles which are generated by various restrictions of (2), and by ascriptions of different degrees of modal strength to (2). To begin with, variants of the PSR may differ according to how they restrict the kinds of things that require a reason (the explananda). Thus, one might restrict the PSR to only actual entities, or include possibilia as well. Alternatively, one might formulate the PSR as requiring a sufficient reason for every (true) proposition or as pertaining to entities and their properties. A variant of the PSR restricted to entities might require an explanation for the existence and non-existence of entities, or it might be further restricted by requiring a reason only for the existence (or only for the non-existence) of entities. A version of the PSR that is restricted to propositions might range over both contingent and necessary propositions, or it might be further restricted to only one of these sub-domains.

Similarly, different versions of the PSR issue from various ways of restricting the kinds of things that count as providing a reason (the explanantia). It is likely (though not necessary) that one’s decision about the kinds of explananda that fall under the range of the PSR will determine the kinds of things counted as explanantia.

Variants of the PSR may be generated not only by placing restrictions on the relata at stake (both the explananda and the explanantia), but also on the notion of the relation at stake. Frequently, the relation of providing a reason is conceived as irreflexive, antisymmetric and transitive, though each of these characteristics may be, and indeed have been, challenged. The relation of providing a reason can be conceived as an ontological relation (as in contemporary discussions of ground), or as a purely epistemological relation.

A modally strong version of the PSR will take the Principle as necessary and obtaining in all possible worlds, while a weak modal version will present the Principle as merely contingently true. Another distinction can be drawn between a factive, as opposed to merely regulative, version of the Principle. A regulative version of the PSR would consider it as a condition for intelligibility (on a par with the Law of Non-Contradiction) and thus as guiding our studying of nature. The factive version simply states that the Principle is true in actuality (or even in all possible worlds). The regulative and the factive versions differ in terms of allowing for the falsification of the principle. The factive version could be easily refuted by a single counter-example. A proponent of the regulative variant of the PSR would argue that an empirical falsification of the PSR makes as little sense as an empirical falsification of the Law of Non-Contradiction. Encountering a fact which seems to have no explanation, the proponent of the regulative variant would respond by insisting that we must keep searching for an explanation.

A proponent of the unrestricted version of the PSR could argue that one’s choice of a specific variant of the PSR cannot be arbitrary, on pain of inconsistency (i.e., one must provide a reason why to prefer one variant over others). Relying on this last point, she may further contend that in the absence of compelling reasons to the contrary, the unrestricted version of the Principle should be considered as default.

One of the most interesting questions regarding the PSR is why accept it at all. Insofar as the PSR stipulates that all things must be explainable, it seems that the PSR itself demands an explanation. Several modern philosophers attempted to provide a proof for the PSR, though so far these attempts have been mostly unsuccessful. Another important question related to the PSR is the possibility of self-explanatory facts and self-caused entities; particularly, one might wonder how these are distinguished from unexplainable, brute facts and uncaused entities. One might also wonder whether the PSR allows for any primitive concepts that cannot be further explained.

A third crucial problem for proponents of the PSR is how to address the Agrippan Trilemma between the apparently exhaustive three horns of: (i) acceptance of brute facts, (ii) acceptance of an infinite regress of explanation (or grounding), or (iii) acceptance of self-explanatory facts. Prima facie, each horn in the trilemma undermines the position of the proponent of the PSR.

Finally, the proponent of the PSR faces intriguing problems in addressing perfectly symmetrical states. We have seen that some variants of the PSR require an explanation for the existence of things (thus, assuming nonexistence as a “default” state requiring no explanation), while other variants require an explanation for both the existence and nonexistence of things. Let us look quickly at the latter (“default”-free) variant. Specifically, we might wonder how a proponent of the “default”-free variant of the PSR would respond to a situation in which we have neither a reason for the existence of \(x\), nor have a reason for the non-existence of \(x\)? A proponent of the PSR might indeed respond by denying the possibility of such a scenario (given the PSR and bivalence). A similar dilemma might be raised with regard to issues of identity: given the absence of a reason for the identity of \(x\) and \(y\), as well as for their non-identity, should we assume either identity or non-identity as a default position?[1]

With these general considerations in place, let us examine the historical role that the Principle has played. The term “Principle of Sufficient Reason [principe de raison suffisante/principium reddendae rationis]” was coined by Leibniz, though Spinoza is thought by many scholars to have preceded Leibniz in appreciating the importance of the Principle and placing it at the center of his philosophical system.[2] The Principle seems at first sight to have a strong intuitive appeal—we always ask for explanations—yet it is taken by many to be too bold and expensive due to the radical implications it seems to yield. Among the alleged consequences of the Principle are: the Identity of Indiscernibles, necessitarianism, the relativity of space and time, the existence of a self-necessitated Being (i.e., God), and the Principle of Plenitude.

Though there are several important precursors who, as we will see, seem to advocate variants of the PSR before the modern period, we will begin our discussion with the two main expositors of the Principle: Spinoza and Leibniz.

2. Spinoza

The earliest statement of the PSR in Spinoza’s writings appears in his first published work, the 1663 geometrical exposition of Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy (which may or may not reflect Spinoza’s own views at the time). The eleventh axiom of Part I of the book states:

Nothing exists of which it cannot be asked, what is the cause (or reason) [causa (sive ratio)], why it exists.

In a brief explanatory note to this axiom, Spinoza adds:

Since existing is something positive, we cannot say that it has nothing as its cause (by Axiom 7). Therefore, we must assign some positive cause, or reason, why [a thing] exists—either an external one, i.e., one outside the thing itself, or an internal one, one comprehended in the nature and definition of the existing thing itself. (Geb. I/158/4–9)[3]

Axiom 7, to which Spinoza appeals in the explanation, is a variant of the “ex nihilo, nihil fit” (“from nothing, nothing comes”) principle, and stipulates that an existing thing and its perfections (or qualities) cannot have nothing or a non-existing thing as their cause. Interestingly, however, in another work from this early period of his philosophical writing, the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza allows for one unique item to be without a cause. In §70 of this treatise, Spinoza argues:

[T]hat Thought is also called true which involves objectively the essence of some principle that does not have a cause, and is known through itself and in itself. (II/26/33–4. Our emphasis)

It is not completely clear what “the principle [principium]” at stake is, but given its qualification as “known through itself and in itself”, it may refer to God and indicate Spinoza’s understanding of Descartes’ rather nuanced view—in his Second Set of Replies—according to which God does not need a cause in order to exist, but there is a reason why God does not need a cause (AT VII: 164–65; cf. Carraud 2002: Ch. 2).[4]

According to some commentators Spinoza states a variant of the PSR already at the opening of his major work, the Ethics. The second axiom of Part One of the book reads:

E1a2: What cannot be conceived [concipi] through another, must be conceived through itself.

The immediate implication of E1a2 is that everything is conceived.[5] Since, for Spinoza, to conceive something is to explain it (see E1p10s, E1p14d and Della Rocca 2008: 5) it seems that E1a2 amounts to the claim that everything is explainable. Other commentators have also seen the PSR encoded in E1a3:

From a given determinate cause the effect follows necessarily; and conversely, if there is no determinate cause, it is impossible for an effect to follow.

If we interpret “effect” narrowly as something with a cause, then the second clause is trivial. If we interpret it more broadly as anything that exists, obtains, happens (or whatever the relata of causation are taken to be) has a cause, then the second clause contains a statement of a version of the PSR: everything has a cause (Garrett 1979 and Lin 2017).

In E1p11d2, Spinoza states explicitly a variant of the PSR: “For each thing there must be assigned a cause, or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence”. Similarly, in E1p8s2, Spinoza argues, “if a certain number of individuals exists, there must be a cause why those individuals, and why neither more nor fewer, exist.” Spinoza’s insistence that even the non-existence of things must be explainable is crucial. It allows him, for example, to argue that were God not to exist, his non-existence must be explainable. Since God is a substance, Spinoza argues, his existence or non-existence cannot be caused or explained externally (Spinoza takes substances to be causally independent of each other); hence, were God not to exist, his own nature would have to be the cause of his non-existence, just as the nature of a square-circle is the cause of the non-existence of that thing. But since God’s nature is not a contradictory, his nature cannot internally rule out his existence, and hence he must exist (E1p11d).

The scope of Spinoza’s PSR and its role in his system is a controversial matter. A dominant trend in recent scholarship reads Spinoza’s PSR as having unrestricted scope and playing a crucial role in deriving many of his most important doctrines (e.g., Della Rocca 2008). But this trend has recently been challenged by readers who argue that Spinoza’s PSR is restricted in scope to facts about existence and nonexistence and that he rarely explicitly appeals to this principle in deriving his signature doctrines (e.g., Garber 2015 and Lin 2019).

Commentators who give a prominent role to the PSR in Spinoza’s system frequently offer rational reconstructions of Spinoza’s arguments for his doctrines that find a crucial, if implicit, role for the PSR. For example, some think that the PSR is the primary motivation behind Spinoza’s strict necessitarianism. On this reading, for Spinoza, if there are two (or more) possible worlds, it would seem that neither one would have a sufficient reason or cause (for if there were such a sufficient reason, this world would be necessitated, and all other worlds would be impossible). In other words, the PSR dictates that there is only one possible world (see Della Rocca (2008), 69–78, Lin (2011), 23–25, and Melamed (2021). Other commentators, (e.g., Lin 2019), deny that the PSR plays any role in Spinoza’s arguments for necessitarianism, and still others have denied that Spinoza is a necessitarian in the relevant sense (e.g. Curley 1969, and Curley and Walski 1999). Moreover, there are commentators who, while believing that the PSR is behind Spinoza’s necessitarianism, suggest that, occasionally, Spinoza’s endorsement of the PSR is in tension with other principles of his metaphysics, such as the priority of the infinite (see Melamed (2012b), and Melamed (2013a), xvii).

Spinoza holds not only that the existence of things must be explained, but he is also committed to the assertion that the essences of all things follow necessarily from God’s essence (E1p25 and E1p16). He is thus committed to the claim that all essences have a cause and an explanation.

Other Spinozistic doctrines that some commentators have alleged to follow from his PSR are the Identity of Indiscernibles (E1p4. Although see Lin 2019 for a dissenting view), substance monism (E1p11 and E1p14), and the rejection of free will (E1p32 and E2pp48–49). It has also been argued that in E1p21d Spinoza implicitly relies on the PSR to infer a bold causal principle: a simple cause has one, and only one, simple effect. Had the cause more than one effect, the difference between the two effects would be unexplainable insofar as each effect is supposed to be fully explained by the same cause. Thus, if we experience a cause bringing about more than one effect, we should conclude that that the cause was not simple, but comprised of parts (so that the different parts contributed to the causation of the different effects. See Melamed (2013a), 117–119, and Melamed (2013b), 212–213.

Recently, Michael Della Rocca argued not only that the PSR “provide[s] the key to unlocking many of the mysteries of Spinoza’s philosophical system” (2008: 9), but that Spinoza requires the reduction of the most basic philosophical concepts to reason or intelligibility. This alleged “double use of the PSR” stipulates (1) that everything must be explainable, and (2) that it should be (ultimately) explained in terms of intelligibility. Hence, according to Della Rocca, Spinoza reduces his major philosophical concepts—existence, causation, rightness, and power—to intelligibility (2008: 8–9). While this is a fascinating and bold reading of Spinoza’s metaphysics, it seems to contradict his crucial doctrine of the causal and conceptual barrier between the attributes (E1p10 and E2p6). The reduction of any non-Thought item to intelligibility (presumably, a feature of the attribute of thought[6]) undermines the barrier between the attributes, and with it the entire edifice of Spinoza’s ontology (see Della Rocca 2012: 12–16; Melamed 2012a; and Melamed 2013a: xv and 196 n. 84). Moreover, some have noted that Della Rocca’s arguments for specific reductions, for example, the reduction of causation to intelligibility requires assumptions that Spinoza explicitly rejects (Lin 2019 and Melamed 2013, Ch. 3).

On the reading according to which Spinoza’s PSR is unrestricted, how would he respond to the Agrippan Trilemma? Clearly, on this interpretation, Spinoza is unsympathetic to any acceptance of brute facts. Yet he allows for some, restricted cases of self-explanation and infinite regress of explanation. Let us take a brief look at these two issues.

Spinoza begins the Ethics with the definitions of causa sui (E1d1), and of substance as that which “is conceived through itself” (E1d3). Positing these reflexive definitions at the outset might have been a calculated methodological move whose aim was to bypass the challenging task of proving the legitimacy of these notions. But since Spinoza considers his definitions as not merely stipulative (see TIE §95 and Ep. 60), we may well ask for a defense of the legitimacy of self-explanations.

The class of truths that Spinoza considers as self-explanatory are truths that follow merely from the essence or—what is the same—the nature of a thing. In E1p11d, Spinoza provides two examples of self-explanation:

[T]he very nature of a square circle indicates the reason why it does not exist, viz. because it involves a contradiction…, the reason why a substance exists also follows from its nature alone, because it involves existence.

In contrast, claims Spinoza, the existence (as well as the non-existence) of a triangle (or any other thing that is not a substance) do no follow merely from the essence of the triangle:

The reason why a circle or triangle exists, or why it does not exist, does not follow from the nature of these things, but from the order of the whole of corporeal Nature. (E1p11d).

Thus, consider the following three propositions: (i) The triangle has three angles, (ii) The substance exists, and (iii) The triangle exists. Proposition (i) is clearly self-explanatory, since the essence of the triangle (which contains the nature of the number three and the nature of an angle) is the sufficient reason for its having three angles (adding any other information is of no explanatory value). Spinoza considers proposition (ii) as self-explanatory as well. Notice that Spinoza does not define substance (in E1d3) as existing by virtue of its essence, but rather derives this claim from the definition of substance (in E1p7 and E1p6). In contrast to (i) and (ii), the existence of a triangle does not follow merely from its essence (since it is caused by entities external to the triangle, and therefore has to be explained through these external causes).

Let us turn now to the question of the legitimacy of infinite regress. In E1p28, Spinoza openly states that within each attribute there is an infinite causal chain of finite modes:

Every singular thing, or any thing which is finite and has a determinate existence, can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another cause, which is also finite and has a determinate existence; and again, this cause also can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another, which is also finite and has a determinate existence, and so on, to infinity. [Italics added]

Each link in this causal chain is preceded by infinitely many causes and is followed by infinitely many effects. Each link also provides at least part of the explanation for the existence of the following link. Is the existence of such an infinite regress consistent with the PSR? Spinoza has no qualms about answering this question in the positive. We may legitimately ask what is the cause of each link in the chain, and the answer would be: the preceding link. Spinoza also thinks that we may—indeed, should—ask what is the cause, or reason, for the existence of the entire infinite chain? He simply thinks that he can provide a clear answer to the latter question as well: God (or the being which is the ground of its own existence). Consider the following passage from Spinoza’s celebrated “Letter on the Infinite” in which he criticizes proofs of the existence of God which rely on the impossibility of an actual infinity of causes and effects.

In passing I should like to note here that the more recent Peripatetics have, as I think, misunderstood the demonstration by which the Ancients tried to prove God’s existence. For as I find it in a certain Jew, called Rab Chasdai, it runs as follows: if there is an infinite regress of causes, then all things that are will also have been caused; but it does not pertain to anything which has been caused, to exist necessarily by the force of its own nature; therefore, there is nothing in Nature to whose essence it pertains to exist necessarily; but the latter is absurd; therefore, the former is also. Hence the force of this argument does not lie in the impossibility of there being an actual infinite or an infinite regress of causes, but only in the supposition that things which do not exist necessarily by their own nature are not determined to exist by a thing which does necessarily exist by its own nature. [Ep. 12| IV/61/15–62/10; italics added]

In this passage, Spinoza follows the late medieval Jewish philosopher Hasdai Crescas in rejecting the Aristotelian ban on actual infinity (see Melamed 2014). For Spinoza (and Crescas) the existence of an infinite regress of causes is perfectly legitimate. Yet, if all the items in this infinite chain are contingent beings (i.e., “things which do not exist necessarily by their own nature”[7]), the chain itself remains a contingent being, and there must be a reason which explains its instantiation in reality. The ultimate reason for the instantiation of such an infinite chain of contingent beings must, claims Spinoza, be a being whose existence is not contingent (for otherwise, the chain will remain merely contingent and its instantiation in reality would not be sufficiently explained). Thus, Spinoza allows for an infinite regress of causes (or explanations) as long as the entire infinite chain is grounded in a being which exists by virtue of its mere essence.

3. Leibniz

No philosopher is more closely associated with the PSR than Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716). He was the first to call it by name and to recognize it as a major principle of philosophy. Still, Leibniz was well aware of the similarity between his principle and Spinoza’s claims. Thus, in a 1676 marginal note to his copy of Spinoza’s “Letter on the Infinite” (which we have just discussed at the end of §2), he writes: “This is rightly observed, and agrees with what I am accustomed to saying that nothing exists but that for whose existence a sufficient reason can be provided” (Leibniz, Labyrinth of the Continuum, 117/ Aiii71). Leibniz’s treatment of the PSR is also noteworthy for its systematicity and the centrality that he accords it.

Leibniz often presents it, along with the Principle of Contradiction, as a principle of “reasoning”. For example, in the Monadology (1714) he writes:

31. Our reasonings are based on two great principles, that of contradiction, in virtue of which we judge that which involves a contradiction to be false, and that which is opposed or contradictory to the false to be true.

32. And that of sufficient reason, by virtue of which we consider that we can find no true or existent fact [fait], no true assertion [énonciation véritable], without there being a sufficient reason why it is thus and not otherwise, although most of the time these reasons cannot be known to us. (G VI, 612/L 646)

These principles are characterized in what appears to be epistemic terms. They are principles of “our reasoning”. They concern what we “judge” or “find”. And yet it is clear that Leibniz intends them to have metaphysical as well as epistemic import. In the case of the PSR, this will become more evident when we discuss how Leibniz understands the notion of a sufficient reason but it is already indicated in the passage quoted above by the fact that Leibniz explicitly states that there are sufficient reasons for every truth or fact even if such reasons are unknowable by us. (The distinction between the epistemic and the metaphysical collapses with respect to God because there can be no gap between what an omniscient being knows and how things are.)

The scope of the PSR, as stated above, includes facts and truths. Leibniz sometimes, however, characterizes the scope of the principle in different terms. For example, he writes:

[T]he principle of sufficient reason, namely, that nothing happens [rien n’arrive] without a reason. (G VII 356; LC L2; AG 321, our emphasis)

The PSR is here said to apply to what “happens”. This suggests a version of the PSR that applies not to truths or facts but rather events: Every event has a sufficient reason.

These vacillations in the formulation of the PSR are not typically taken to register indecision on Leibniz’s part as to the scope of the PSR. Rather they are usually understood as indicating that Leibniz views the scope of the PSR to be very wide, perhaps even absolutely general, but at least wide enough to encompass facts, truths, and events (see Rodriguez-Pererya 2018).

Leibniz associates the Principle of Contradiction and the PSR with a variety of domains where each is especially important. For example, there are domains where the truths of the domain depend on one of the two principles. These domains are characterized modally: The Principle of Contradiction rules over the domain of necessary truths and the PSR rules over the domain of contingent truths (A 6 4 1616/MP 75; G VII 355–56/LC 15–16).

There are also domains that are characterized in terms of subject matter or areas of inquiry. The Principle of Contradiction allows us to study mathematics, whereas the PSR allows us to study metaphysics, natural theology, and physics (G VII, 355–6; LC L2; AG 321). It is far from obvious that these two ways of assigning domains to the Principles are equivalent. For example, it would be natural to assume that metaphysics and natural theology would include necessary propositions and thus the PSR would encroach upon the territory assigned to the Principle of Contradiction according to the modal characterization.

We must therefore distinguish distinct ways of associating the principles with various domains. The first way is to specify the domain to which each principle applies. Leibniz appears to believe that, according to this approach, there is a single universal domain and it is associated equally with each principle. There are no contradictory contingent facts or truths and so the Principle of Noncontradiction applies to all contingent truths as well as all necessary truths. Likewise, it is usually assumed that, for Leibniz, every necessary truth has a sufficient reason (see Broad 1975: 12 and 34 and Rodriguez-Pererya 2018). For example, mathematical truths, might have sufficient reasons in the form of proofs that rest on statements of identity. Thus the PSR applies to all necessary truths as well as all contingent truths.

The second way of associating the principles with specific domains is to specify the domain of truths that is grounded on or depends on each principle. According to Leibniz, only contingent truths depend on and are grounded by the PSR. Likewise, Leibniz believes that only necessary truths depend on and are grounded by the Principle of Contradiction. What does it mean for some truths to depend on a principle? Leibniz is not explicit on this point but we will get a better idea in the next section when we consider the question of what counts as a sufficient reason.

The third way is to specify a domain of truths that can be investigated on the basis of each principle. For Leibniz, we can know mathematical truths only on the basis of the Principle of Contradiction and only metaphysical, theological, and physical truths require the PSR in order to be known. We will see in more detail in what way the PSR allows us to investigate these domains in the section on applications.

3.1 What is a Sufficient Reason?

When Leibniz insists that every truth or fact requires a sufficient reason, what does he mean by “sufficient reason?” In some texts he suggests that sufficient reason is an “a priori proof”. This should not be understood in Kantian terms as a proof that doesn’t require any input from sense experience. Rather, Leibniz uses the term “a priori” in its original pre-Kantian meaning, which means an argument from causes to effects. An a priori proof is a proof that reflects the causal order. Thus, a sufficient reason would be a proof that is both a demonstration—a set of premises and a conclusion such that the former necessitate the later–and a causal explanation—a statement of the causal antecedents of some truth or event (see Adams 1994: 109).

In order to fully understand Leibniz’s conception of a sufficient reason, we need to also understand his theory of truth and its relationship to his theory of modality. Let us begin with truth. To keep things simple, we will focus only on categorical propositions of subject-predicate form. A proposition is true, according to Leibniz, just in case the concept of the predicate is contained in the concept of the subject. Uncontroversially, the concept of the predicate unmarried is contained in the concept bachelor and it is this conceptual containment which explains the truth of the statement bachelors are unmarried. But Leibniz makes the further highly controversial claim that all true statements are true for this reason, even statements like Caesar crossed the Rubicon. That is, this statement is true because the concept crossed the Rubicon is contained in the concept of Caesar. This theory of truth is sometimes called the conceptual containment theory of truth. It has as a consequence that all truths are analytic. But wouldn’t such a theory entail that all truths are necessary? After all, how could an analytic truth be contingent?

In response to this worry, Leibniz develops an account of contingency in terms of infinite analysis.[8] Leibniz understands analysis as the process of replacing the terms of a proposition with definitions or partial definitions. A demonstration results when an identity is obtained through the process of analysis in a finite number of steps. Leibniz claims that all and only necessary truths have a finite demonstration by analysis and all and only contingent truths do not have a demonstration by analysis in a finite number of steps. In this way, he preserves the distinction between necessary and contingent truths while also maintaining that all truths are analytic, that is, true in virtue of the meaning of the concepts involved.

This has led some commenters to think that Leibniz gave up the account of sufficient reason as an a priori proof. If there were a proof or demonstration, it would reveal that the concept of the predicate was contained in the concept of the subject in a finite number of steps and hence every proposition would be necessary. Leibniz is not a necessitarian in his late philosophy and thus he could not have accepted this consequence. Instead, he must have shifted from the conception of a sufficient reason as an a priori proof to that of an a priori proof sequence, where the latter notion is understood as an analysis that converges on an identity without reaching it in a finite number of steps (see Sleigh 1983: 200). What it means for an analysis to converge on an identity is, unfortunately, obscure. Nevertheless, there is some clear sense in which every contingent truth has a sufficient reason on this understanding. The sufficient reason why it is true that Caesar crossed the Rubicon, for example, is that the concept crossing the Rubicon is contained in the concept Caesar. The truth of the proposition obtains in virtue of the concepts of the subject and the predicate. Of course, this reason is undiscoverable by any finite human mind because it is buried too deeply in the concept of Caesar. Only God, in his omniscience sees the conceptual connection between them. It is enough for there to be such a connection for there be a sufficient reason.

Such a conception of the nature of a sufficient reason have led some commentators to think that for Leibniz the PSR is a logical notion or that it is a metaphysical notion that is ultimately reducible to logic (Couturat 1901: 123ff and Russell 1937: v). But the notion of a sufficient reason as a non-terminating proof sequence is not the only conception of a sufficient reason to be found in Leibniz. And other conceptions have a decidedly less logical and more metaphysical flavor.

One such characterization of a sufficient reason comes from Leibniz’s conviction that in order to preserve the notion of causal activity, without which substances are not really substances—i.e., truly fundamental building blocks of reality. Each genuine substance, for Leibniz, has what he calls a “primitive active force”. This force is the nature or essence of the substance. Now according to Leibniz, substances do not causally interact with one another (see the entry Leibniz on causation). The changes that they undergo derive solely from their own natures or primitive active force, which consequently determines the whole of its history. Many texts suggest that, for Leibniz, the sufficient reason for any state of a substance is its primitive active force (NE 65–6; T 400/G VI, 354; Mon. 18/G VI, 609–610; G IV, 507; G III, 72).

In many ways primitive active force plays the role of the concept of the subject in the logical version of the PSR. Just as on the logical version the PSR that \(a\) is \(F\) is explained by the fact that the concept of \(F\)-ness is in the concept of \(a\), so too on the metaphysical version of the PSR fact that \(a\) is \(F\) is explained by the primitive active force of \(a\) that determines it to be \(F\). Whereas commentators such as Couturat and Russell emphasize the logical notion of a sufficient reason to the detriment of the metaphysical notion, other commentators see the logical and the metaphysical as two equally fundamental presentations of the same datum (see Frankel 1994).

Another metaphysical characterization of a sufficient reason connects with the Principle of the Best, which says that for any proposition \(p\), \(p\) is true just in case \(p\) holds in the best possible world (G VI.448/DM 22; Mon. 46, 53, 54/G VI, 614–616). Is the Principle of the Best a supplement to the PSR or a rival to the PSR? It is, in fact, a consequence of the PSR in conjunction with three additional assumptions: (1) the sufficient reason for every choice is that the chooser perceives it to be the best; (2) God chooses the actual world; (3) God perceives something to be what is best just in case it is the best.

In some texts, Leibniz suggests that the sufficient reason for contingent truths cannot be found in the concepts or natures of things. We must instead look to the Principle of the Best (Mon. 36–38/G VI, 613). In other words the sufficient reason for any contingent proposition of the form “\(a\) is \(F\)” is that \(a\) is \(F\) is true in the best possible word. This appears to be an entirely different sort of reason than the fact that “\(a\) is \(F\)” is analytic or that the nature of \(a\) determines that it is \(F\). Those latter reasons are to be found internal to the concept of the subject or the nature of the substance. Reasons that advert to the Principle of the Best look outside the concept of the subject or the nature of the substance and make comparisons between worlds in terms of their relative perfections. It is possible that Leibniz thought that these different conceptions of sufficient reasons were equivalent but that they are so is far from obvious.

3.2 Why Did Leibniz Believe the PSR?

Leibniz argues for the PSR in three distinct ways: (1) from the concept of a sufficient reason and the concept of a “requisite”; (2) from his theory of truth; and (3) inductively.

In some texts, Leibniz argues that the PSR is a conceptual truth that is derivable from the concepts of a sufficient reason and the concept of a requisite (A VI, ii, 483; see also G VII 393, LC L5.18; A VI.iii.133). The concept of a requisite is that of a necessary condition. In this context, Leibniz defines a sufficient reason as a sufficient condition. If something exists, then all of its requisites have been posited. Leibniz then asserts that if all of a things requisites have been posited, then it exists. Thus, all of a thing’s requisites are a thing’s sufficient reason. The question-begging assumption is that all the necessary conditions for something to exist are jointly sufficient for it to exist. Anybody who denies the PSR will not agree with this assumption and it is clearly not encoded in the definitions of requisite and sufficient reason provided by Leibniz (for further discussion, see Harrop 2020).

In other texts, Leibniz argues that the PSR follows from the conceptual containment theory of truth (A VI.iv.1645/L 268; AG 31). Every truth is such that the concept of the predicate is contained the concept of the subject. This conceptual connection is the sufficient reason for the truth. Thus every truth has a sufficient reason.

It is worth noting that Leibniz believed the PSR before he developed his conceptual containment Theory of Truth. In fact, the PSR is one of Leibniz’s earliest and most stable philosophical commitments (see, for example, Leibniz’s 1671 letter to Wedderkopf A II.ii.117f/L146). This observation has led some scholars to conclude that rather than deriving the PSR from the conceptual containment theory of truth, Leibniz was in fact led to the conceptual containment theory from his antecedent commitment to the PSR. The conceptual containment theory explains how there could be a sufficient reason for every truth by guaranteeing that there will be an explanation in terms of conceptual relations (see Adams 1994: 69). Moreover, in at least one text, it is not at all clear whether, for Leibniz, the conceptual containment theory of truth motivates the PSR, or rather it is the PSR which motivates the conceptual containment theory of truth: see Leibniz, Philosophical Writings, 172).

In his Fifth paper to Clarke, Leibniz argues for the PSR inductively. He says that there are many cases where a fact has a sufficient reason and no cases where fact is known not to have a sufficient reason. He then says that it is reasonable to assume that the PSR holds in all cases where we do not know that sufficient reason. Leibniz describes this as “the method of experimental philosophy, which proceeds a posteriori” (G VII 420; LC, L5.129).

3.3 Applications

Leibniz says that PSR is needed if we are to go beyond mathematics to metaphysics and natural science. How does the PSR help in those domains of inquiry? There is a general pattern of argument that Leibniz uses to establish conclusions using the PSR. First, he assumes the falsity of what he wants to prove. Call the proposition to be proved \(p\). Then he tries to show that if \(p\) were false, there would be some fact or truth for which there could not be sufficient reason. But by the PSR, there is no such fact or truth. Therefore, \(p\) is true. Leibniz uses this template to argue for a number of claims, including the indefinite extension of space (Labyrinth of the Continuum, 233), determinism (Leibniz-Stahl Controversy, 17), the impossibility of bare occult qualities and bare faculties (Philosophical Writings, 172–3), the identity of indiscernibles, relationalism with respect to space and time, and the existence of God. Let us briefly look at how Leibniz uses the PSR to argue for each of the last three theses.

Leibniz presents arguments for the existence of God from the PSR in a number of different places (for example, The Ultimate Origination of Things, G VII 302–3; L 486–8. Monadology §37). Suppose that God does not exist. If God does not exist, then the only things that exist are contingent beings. Would the entire series of contingent things have an explanation? The explanation of the entire series cannot be a member of the series since then it would explain itself and no contingent thing is self-explanatory. But the explanation cannot be outside of the series because we have assumed that there is no non-contingent being, i.e., God. Thus if God did not exist, there would be something unexplained: the series of contingent beings. Everything has an explanation. Therefore God exists (notice, the similarity to the argument for God’s existence Spinoza cites in the name of Crescas which we have just discussed at the end of §2 above. In fact, this proof by Leibniz appears in a 1676 gloss to his copy of Spinoza’s letter discussing Crescas’ proof. See Leibniz, The Labyrinth of the Continuum, 117).

Leibniz also thinks that the PSR rules out the possibility that there could be two or more indistinguishable, that is, indiscernible, things (A VI, iv, 1541/AG 42). If there were two such things, God would have treated them differently insofar as he has related them differently to the rest of the world. For example, if there were two blades of grass that were indiscernible from each other, then one blade would stand in spatial and temporal relation \(R\) to the rest of the world, whereas the other blade would stand in some other spatial and temporal relation \(R'\) to the rest of the world. Why did God choose to put the first blade relation \(R\) to the rest of the world instead of \(R'\)? Leibniz claims that since they are indiscernible from each other, there could be no reason for God to treat them differently. Thus if there were two indiscernible individuals, then God would have acted for no reason. But there is a reason for everything. So, there are no indiscernible yet numerically distinct things.

For similar reasons, Leibniz thinks that space and time cannot be substances or anything else absolute and must ultimately be a system of relations that obtain between bodies (e.g., LC, L, 3.5). This is because if space, for example, were absolute, then there would be space points that were indiscernible from one another. God would treat these space points differently from each other insofar as he orients his creation in space one way rather than another. This would have to be an arbitrary decision for the reasons outlined above. So, space and time are not absolute (see Lin 2011).

Next to the PSR, Leibniz also holds a complimentary principle according to which nothing is without effects, or “nothing is sterile” (see, for example, Monadology §69 and AG 38).

4. Émilie du Châtelet

At the beginning of this entry we have addressed briefly the question of motivating the PSR. The PSR demands that all facts must have a sufficient explanation, and were the PSR itself unmotivated, it would seem to simply refute itself. We have also seen that overall Leibniz’s attempts to justify the PSR were not particularly successful (in Spinoza’s early works there is an attempt to justify the PSR, but he deserted this path in his later works). In this section, we would like to discuss one of the most intriguing attempts to justify the PSR as an exceptionless methodological principle. The arguments we are about to discuss appear in Émilie du Châtelet’s 1740 Institutions de physique (Foundations of Physics) “ostensibly a textbook in physics for her son, but in reality, a highly original work in natural philosophy” (Detlefsen 2018, §1). In this work, Du Châtelet attempts to provide a unified Newtonian natural philosophy that is grounded in metaphysics. Just like Leibniz, du Châtelet views the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason as the two fundamental principles of philosophy.

Immediately after presenting the PSR, Du Châtelet turns to justify the principle:

If we tried to deny this great principle, we would fall into strange contradictions. For as soon as one accepts that something may happen without sufficient reason, one cannot be sure of anything, for example, that a thing is the same as it was the moment before, since this thing could change at any moment into another of a different kind; thus truths, for us, would exist only for an instant.

For example, I declare that all is still in my room in the state in which I left it, because I am certain that no one has entered since I left; but if the principle of sufficient reason does not apply, my certainty becomes a chimera since everything could have been thrown into confusion in my room, without anyone having entered who was able to turn it upside down (Foundations of Physics, §8| Du Châtelet 2009, 129)

Without the PSR, claims Du Châtelet, we cannot be certain that the unexperienced world has the continuity and unity we always assume. Were we not to assume the PSR, we should be seriously concerned about the possibility of things appearing out of thin air and disappearing into nothing. Without the PSR, we cannot assume the permanence of anything. The very fact that we are not concerned about the sudden appearance or disappearance of things, seems to indicate that we actually assume the PSR. Moreover, claims Du Châtelet, our very foundational notions of equality and identity, seem to assume the principle:

Without this principle there would not be identical things, for two things are identical when one can substitute one for the other without any change to the properties which are being considered. This definition is accepted by everyone. Thus, for example, if I have a ball made out of stone, and a ball of lead, and I am able to put the one in the place of the other in a basin of a pair of scales without the balance changing, I say that the weight of these balls is identical, that is the same, and that they are identical in terms of weight. If something could happen without a sufficient reason, I would be unable to state that the weight of the balls is identical, at the very instant when I find that it is identical, since a change could happen in one and not the other for no reason at all (Foundations of Physics, §8| Du Châtelet 2009, 129)

When we compare two balls on a scale and infer that their weight is equal from the fact that neither side of the scale drops lower, we assume that the scales do not remain balanced without a reason. However, if thing could happen without reason, our inference would be unwarranted.

According to some commentators, Du Châtelet’s last argument shows not only that everything must have a sufficient reason, but also that this reason must be accessible to us (i.e., humans, or finite cognizers), at least in principle (Amijee 2021 and Wells 2021). Here is why. Consider the scales scenario in a world in which the PSR obtains strictly (and we are aware of this), but some reasons are in principle inaccessible to us. In such a world, we could not infer with certainty the equality of the balls from the horizontal states of the scales, since we should consider the possibility of interfering causes that are inaccessible to us.

A version of the PSR which requires that all reasons must be accessible to humans is not easy to accept: why should we assume that the nature of the world is such that it is cognitive accessible to any specific being? Of course, an anthropocentric version of the PSR might be warranted if one assumes that the world was created by a benevolent creator who intentionally designed the world in such a manner that it will always be accessible to human beings, but this cluster of heavy premises would be clearly rejected by many proponents of the PSR (such as Spinoza).

Setting aside the question of whether Du Châtelet’s last argument indeed requires that reasons must be accessible to humans, it seems she does offer a promising line of motivating the PSR as a regulative rather than a factive principle (see §1 above).

5. The PSR before Spinoza and Leibniz

The PSR is nearly as old as philosophy itself. Anaximander, one of the earliest of the pre-Socratics, is usually credited—on the basis of Aristotle’s de Caelo, (b12 295b10–16)—with being the first to make use of it. Anaximander argues, we are told, that the Earth remains stationary in space because it is located in the center of the universe and thus is “indifferently” related to any “extreme point”. This indifference means that if it were to move in any direction, it would do so without a reason. Since he concludes from this that it does not move, we can assume that Anaximander believes that motion in the absence of a reason is impossible.

Parmenides, another pre-Socratic, implicitly appeals to the PSR when he claims that the world cannot have come into existence because then it would have come from nothing (Fragment B8 9–10). It is against the later alternative that Parmenides appears to wield the PSR. Nothing comes from nothing because if it did, then we could ask: why did it not come into existence at an earlier or a later time than it actually did? Parmenides appears to think that if the world comes into existence from nothing, then there is no possible answer to this question. After all, prior to the coming-to-be of the world, there is nothing to explain its coming-to-be. Thus, its coming-to-be would be an arbitrary brute fact. There are no brute facts regarding coming-to-be. So, the world did not come into existence from nothing.

Another ancient source for the PSR is Archimedes who writes:

Equal weights at equal distances are in equilibrium, and equal weights at unequal distances are not in equilibrium but incline towards the weight which is at the greater distance (On the Equilibrium of Planes, 189).

Archimedes assumes that if there is a balance such that there is no difference between the weights and distances on either side, then neither side of the balance can move up or down. This is sometimes taken to be an implicit application of the PSR and is cited by Leibniz in his correspondence with Clarke as a precedent for his own principle.

In the Islamic world, Avicenna appears to assume a version of the PSR when he claims that the existence or nonexistence of any non-necessary possible thing must have a cause outside itself. If it didn’t, then either the cause would be internal to the non-necessary possible thing (which Avicenna takes to be contrary to the nature of a (mere) possible being) or it doesn’t have a cause at all. Avicenna’s reasoning implicitly rejects this latter alternative and thus he appears to be committed that all existence and nonexistence has a cause (Avicenna, Metaphysics 1.6 §1; Al-Shifa’: Al-Ilahiyyat, 37; See Richardson 747).

In the medieval Latin West, Peter Abelard argues that God must create the best of all possible worlds in a way that both appears to presuppose some version of the PSR and anticipates Leibniz’s reasoning on the subject. If God didn’t, Abelard argues, there would have to be some reason for it. But what reason could that be except God’s injustice or jealousy? But God cannot be unjust or jealous. So there is no possible reason for God making anything less than the best. Everything has a reason. Thus God makes the best possible world (Op. cit. col. 1324b; McCallum 1948, 93). Abelard’s opinion was rejected as heresy and mainstream opinion of philosophers during the Middle Ages in the Latin West appears to reject the PSR. God, on the mainstream medieval view, enjoys freedom of indifference with respect to his creation. Thus there is no sufficient reason for why God created what he did and the PSR slips from prominence until its early modern revival at the hands of Spinoza and Leibniz.

Some great epistemological rationalists, such as Plato and Descartes, appear to endorse the unrestricted PSR but in fact do not. For example, in the Timaeus Plato writes,

[E]verything that comes to be must of necessity come to be by the agency of some cause, for it is impossible for anything to come to be without a cause. (28a4–5)

This passage appears to assert the unrestricted PSR. But Plato believes that there are things that are not among the things that “come to be,” and some of these things have no cause or reason. For example, the Demiurge creates the world by imposing order on disorderly motion. The disorderly motion preexists the work of the Demiurge. It is uncaused and there is no reason for it.

At times, Descartes appears to endorse the unrestricted PSR. For example, he argues for the existence of God in the third Mediation on the basis of the principle that there must be at least as much reality in the cause as in the effect. And he justifies this causal principle by claiming that “Nothing comes from nothing”. This appears to make him as much an adherent of the unrestricted PSR as Parmenides who, as we have seen, argues for his conclusions on the same basis. But elsewhere Descartes claims that God creates the eternal truths, such as mathematical and metaphysical truths (Letters to Mersenne, April 15, May 6, and 27, 1630; Fifth Replies, AT 7:380, CSM 2:261). Moreover, he claims that God creates these truths by an act of will which is free and indifferent. Thus there can be no reason for the creation any of these truths. If mathematical and metaphysical truths are contingent and yet have no sufficient reason according to Descartes, then his philosophy imposes serious restrictions on any PSR.

6. The PSR in Eighteenth-Century Philosophy and German Idealism

Hume’s critique of causation presents an important challenge to the PSR. In his Treatise of Human Nature (I, 3, 3) Hume considers several arguments which attempt to prove the “general maxim in philosophy, that whatever begins to exist, must have a cause” and finds all of them wanting. Hume argues that since the ideas of cause and its effect are evidently distinct, we can clearly conceive or imagine an object without its cause. He takes the separability of the two ideas to show that there is no necessary conceptual relation between the ideas of cause and effect insofar as conceiving the one without the other does not imply any contradiction or absurdity.

Christian Wolff (1679–1754), the most influential German philosopher of the first half of the eighteenth century, was a follower of Leibniz and developed the latter’s system. Like Leibniz, Wolff assigned to the PSR a central role in his system while attempting to avoid necessitarianism (or “fatalism”). Like Spinoza and Leibniz, Wolff demanded a reason for both the possibility of things [ratio essendi] (i.e., coherence of essence) and for the actualization, or coming to be, of essences [ratio fiendi]. Wolff mildly criticized Leibniz for allegedly grounding the PSR merely in experience and attempted to marshal several proofs for the principle (Rational Thoughts on God, the World, and the Soul of Human Beings, §§30–31, 143; Ontologia, §§56–78; cf. Look 2001, 210–214). One of these proofs attempts to prove the PSR relying on the principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles (Rational Thoughts on God, the World, and the Soul of Human Beings §31), while the most famous proof attempts to derive the PSR from the Law of Non-Contradiction. According to the latter, if a thing \(A\) is assumed to exist without reason, than “nothing is posited that explains why \(A\) exists”. This, according to Wolff, would mean that \(A\) exists because of nothing (Ontologia, §70), which Wolff claims to be absurd. (Wolff seems to be assuming here the ex nihilo nihi fit maxim.) Kant criticized the proof claiming that it is based on an equivocal use of the term “nothing” (AK 1:398).

Leonhard Euler, the great Swiss mathematician and a contemporary of Wolff, warned against the “wretched abuse” of the PSR by those who

employ it so dexterously that by means of it they are in a condition to demonstrate whatever suits their purpose, and to demolish whatever is raised against them. (Letters to German Princess, Letter XIII)

According to Euler, many of the proofs which rely on the PSR amount to nothing over and above a petitio principii, while others derive carelessly the impossibility of things from our ignorance of the causes of these things.

In the Critique of Pure Reason (1781, 1787), Kant claims to provide a proof for the PSR by showing that

[T]he PSR is the ground of possible experience, namely the objective cognition of appearances with regards to their relation in the successive series of time. (B/246/A201)

Relying on his transcendental method Kant argues in the “Second Analogy of Experience” that a certain version of the PSR is a condition for the possibility of experience, and as a result also a condition for the possibility of objects of experience. Yet, this argument also restricts the validity of the PSR to human experience, i.e., to things which appear in space and time. Any use of the PSR that transgresses the boundaries of human experience is bound to generate antinomies.

Kant’s view of space and time as exhibiting brute difference (i.e., the non-identity of locations in space and time cannot be reduced to conceptual explanation) stands in sharp contrast to the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, and thereby also to the PSR. Salomon Maimon, Kant’s rationalist critic, attempted to enforce rationalist strictures on Kant’s philosophy by arguing that Kant is unable to explain the necessary agreement of intuitions and concepts. According to Kant, intuitions and concepts come from entirely different sources: sensibility and understanding. But if this were the case, claims Maimon, we could not explain the constant agreement between intuitions and concepts, which is necessary for the possibility of experience. This agreement can be explained if we reject the radical heterogeneity of intuitions and concepts, and view intuitions as disguised concepts. Thus, any difference exhibited in space and time must have its ground in the universal forms of our thought in general (Maimon, Essay on Transcendental Philosophy, Ch. 1, p. 13). Maimon also argued that we must seek an explanation for the fact that we have two forms of intuition rather than one, and suggested that it is only the interplay between the two forms of intuition which allows us to exhibit difference, by using a unity in one form to exhibit difference in the other form, i.e., conceive different times by concentrating on the change occurring at the same location in space, or conceive different locations in space at the same point in time (Essay, Ch. 1, 13–14).

Maimon was probably the strictest adherer to an unrestricted version of the PSR among the German Idealists. For Maimon, satisfying the demands of the PSR is the infinite task of both philosophy and science. Thus, in response to Maimonides’ claim that crucial astronomical facts are poorly explained by science, Maimon writes:

The world may be, in terms of time, finite or infinite; still, everything in it (as consequences of the highest wisdom) must be explainable through the principle of sufficient reason. How far we can actually get in achieving this is beside the point. Those things that Maimonides, working with the astronomy of his day, regarded as inexplicable, new discoveries (particularly Newton’s system) equip us to explain quite well. The highest order in the arrangement of the world’s structure is for us a necessary idea of reason, which, through the use of reason with regard to objects of experience, we can approach but never reach. (Maimon, 1792/3 [2019, 170]; italics added).

Ground [Grund] and the Principle of Sufficient Ground [der Satz vom zureichenden Grund] play a significant role in Hegel’s Logic. For Hegel, the demand for ground provides a major source of transition from one thing to another. It is, Hegel says, “the expulsion of itself from itself” (Encyclopedia Logic, §121A). Ground, for Hegel, is the unity of identity and difference: the ground of \(x\) has to explain all features of \(x\), and in sense duplicates it, yet it must also be different from \(x\) in order to have explanatory value and not be a mere petitio principii.

The PSR is the subject of Schopenhauer’s 1813 doctoral dissertation: The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason. In this work, Schopenhauer provides a brief history of the PSR, and then raises the questions of the justification for the PSR and the proper scope of the principle. Schopenhauer follows Wolff in distinguishing among four kinds of reasons, corresponding to four kinds of objects, and charges that much philosophical confusion arises from attempts to explain objects of one kind by reasoning that belongs to the other kind. These four kinds of explanation, or four variants of the PSR, share the very same ground. Along Kantian lines Schopenhauer suggests that it is the subject’s activity in regularly connecting representations that is the ground of the PSR (The Fourfold Root, §16).

7. The PSR in Contemporary Philosophy

It has recently been proposed by Dasgupta that a version of the PSR could be formulated in terms of grounds. Grounding is said to be a kind of explanation distinct from causal explanation. It is a metaphysical or constitutive explanation. It is generally taken to be asymmetric, irreflexive, and transitive. Alleged examples of grounding relations are: dispositions (e.g., fragility) are grounded in categorical features (e.g., molecular structure); semantic facts (e.g., Jones means addition by “+”) are grounded by non-semantic facts (e.g., Jones is disposed to draw certain inferences); mental properties (e.g., pain) are grounded by physical properties (e.g., c-fibers firing; see Rosen 2010 and Fine 2012). The proposal is formulated as follows:

PSR: For every substantive fact \(Y\) there are some facts, the \(X\)s, such that (i) the \(X\)s ground \(Y\) and (ii) each one of the \(X\)s is autonomous. (Dasgupta 2016: 12)

Here substantive means apt for grounding and autonomous means not apt for grounding. For example, perhaps essentialist facts are autonomous where essentialist facts are facts of the form: it is essential to \(x\) that \(\phi\). The idea is that just as definitions are not apt for proof, essentialist facts are not apt for grounding explanations, that is, they are autonomous (Dasgupta 2016: 6–9). The notion of an autonomous fact allows the adherent of this version of the PSR to avoid the Agrippan Trilemma without allowing for self-explanatory facts or infinite regresses. Chains of explanation terminate with autonomous facts, which are not brute because they are not apt for explanation.

Following Bolzano (Theory of Science: vol. II, 259–264), most contemporary theories of grounding affirm the irreflexivity of this relation (see Fine 2001: 15; Schaffer 2009: 364; and Rosen 2010: 115). More recently, Fine showed that given certain plausible premises, one may point out counterexamples to irreflexivity (Fine 2010; cf. Krämer 2013), and the issue has been further challenged by Jenkins (2011).

Jonathan Schaffer has relied on the notion of ground to revive an Aristotelian, structured metaphysics, i.e., a metaphysics which is ordered by priority relations (Schaffer 2009), and to defend Priority Monism (see the entry on monism). In response, Michael Della Rocca (2014) has argued that strict adherence to the PSR—and to Ockham’s Razor (see the entry on simplicity)—undermines Schaffer’s structured metaphysics (and Priority Monism), since insofar as all the features of the grounded are already present in the ground, the existence of the grounded is just redundant. (See also the entry on metaphysical grounding). More recently, in his audacious 2020 book, Della Rocca expanded his argument. Relying on what he takes to be a strict adherence to the PSR, and assisted by F.H. Bradley’s critique of the reality of relation, Della Rocca argues that we are entitled to assert only the existence of undifferentiated being that stands in no relations of distinction. According to Della Rocca, our major philosophical concepts – substance, action, knowledge, meaning, and explanation – fail to meet the strict requirements of the PSR. Toward the end of the book, Della Rocca launches a powerful attack on the widespread reliance on intuitions among analytic philosophers (Della Rocca, 2020, 260–290).

The question of the justification for the employment of the PSR has been addressed in some recent literature (see, for example, Della Rocca (2010)). Fatema Amijee has argued that from a practical point of view, participants in structural inquiry (i.e., an inquiry which attempts to explain why a given fact obtains) must assume the PSR as long as they do not discover that any fact is brute. Since structural inquiry is intrinsically valuable (and assists us in discovering new truths), it is rationally non-optional for us, and consequently, we must be committed to the PSR (Amijee 2022).

Implications for the PSR might also be discerned in recent discussions of surprisingness or strikingness, (although such implications are not typically stated explicitly). These discussions, which cut across such diverse subfields as epistemology, philosophy of science, metaethics, and philosophy of religion, have their origin in Paul Horwich’s observation that there is an intuitive difference between an event or fact being unlikely and its being surprising (Horwich 1982). For example, it is equally unlikely that, on a given occasion, a monkey typing randomly on a typewriter will type the string ‘sdlek93 91’ and that it will type ‘I want a banana.’ But although the probabilities of both events are the same, the latter string is surprising in a way that the former is not. The difference between surprising events or facts and unlikely fact is sometimes thought to map onto the distinction between events or facts that call out for explanation and those that do not. How can we account for the difference between the merely improbable—which some believe does not call out for explanation—and the surprising—which does? Often it is said that the surprising requires us to challenge our background beliefs and confirms hypotheses that are alternatives to those beliefs. Alternatively, that a theory T treats something surprising as inexplicable is a reason to disbelieve T (White 2007; Schechter 2013). Thus, such inquiry is guided by the presumption that the surprising is explicable. Principles such as these have led philosophers to substantive conclusions as diverse as: (1) the universe was designed by an intelligent agent (White 2017; van Inwagen 1993); (2) moral realism is false (Street 2006; Enoch 2011); (3) there exists a multiverse (Leslie 1989; Parfit 1998); and Platonism about mathematics is false (Field 1989, 2005). Unfortunately, we cannot discuss the details of the arguments from the improbable/surprising distinction to these claims here. Nevertheless, this methodological assumption has interesting repercussions for the PSR. First of all, those who advocate the distinction tend to suggest that, if the PSR is true, then it is so only in a restricted form. After all, the point of the distinction is that some things call out for explanation and others do not. But it also suggests that something like a restricted PSR is true. A principle that says that we have an epistemic reason to believe a hypothesis that would transform a surprising event of fact into an unsurprising one would only be truth conducive if we lived in a world in which events and facts are—at least for the most part—explicable. Why this is so can be illuminated by analogy with induction. As Hume observed, induction is truth conducive only if nature is uniform (T. So, by committing ourselves to the method of induction, we thereby presuppose the truth of the principle of the uniformity of nature. Similarly, by taking ourselves to have an epistemic reason to believe a theory because it renders explicable what is otherwise surprising, we thereby presuppose the truth of a restricted PSR.

The role of the PSR in ethics and political theory has not been seriously studied so far. Clearly, the PSR may be marshaled in order to question our reliance on mere intuitions. The repugnance of a certain view cannot be taken at face value, but rather requires a justification. In the past, various conservative views relied merely on the alleged repugnance of certain sexual acts (e.g., homosexuality, interracial relations). The requirement to dig deeper and ask a person to justify her intuitions may help the person understand the maxims guiding her specific moral beliefs. Adherence to the PSR may also shift the onus of proof in the debate between those who consider our preferential evaluation of human beings over other things in nature as simply brute (Williams 2006: 195) and those who insist that if human beings have a special value, there must be a reason for the ascription of such value (Buss 2012: 343).


Primary Literature

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Other Internet Resources

  • Candide, Wikipedia entry on the famous satire in which Voltaire mocks both Leibniz’s belief that this is the best of all possible worlds and the principle of sufficient reason. [Permanent Link]

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