Christian Wolff

First published Mon Jul 3, 2006; substantive revision Sat Jun 1, 2024

Christian Wolff (1679–1754), philosopher, mathematician, and scientist, is widely and rightly regarded as the most important and influential German philosopher between Leibniz and Kant. His scholarly output was prolific, numbering more than 50 titles (most multi-volume), in addition to dozens of shorter essays and prefaces and nearly 500 book reviews. Through his series of textbooks, published first in German and then in Latin, Wolff made signal contributions to nearly every area of philosophical investigation of his time, including but not limited to logic, metaphysics, ethics, political philosophy, and aesthetics. Wolff is perhaps best known in his role as (co-)founder of the “Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy”, and while Wolff himself rejected the term, the philosophical system it designates quickly gained broad, if not universal, acceptance within German universities in the first half of the eighteenth century.

Wolff’s influence on German philosophy is manifold and profound. Through his textbooks and his “martyrdom” for the cause of Enlightenment, he succeeded in placing modern philosophical ideas at the forefront of German academic debate. Moreover, since he was among the first to publish philosophical texts in German, Wolff had a formative role in establishing German itself as a philosophical language. Wolff’s philosophy gained an ascendant position in the German academy as a result of his own (seemingly tireless) defense of his ideas as well as through his many students and sympathizers, including Georg Bernhard Bilfinger (1693–1750), Ludwig Philipp Thümmig (1697–1728), F. Chr. Baumeister (1709–85), A. G. Baumgarten (1714–62), G. F. Meier (1718–77), and J. C. Gottsched (1700–66). Among his more prominent adherents and (sometime) admirers, Wolff could count Voltaire, Émilie du Châtelet, Moses Mendelssohn, Friedrich II (who had a hand in translating one of his works), and Catherine the Great (who offered him a pension). Kant, who himself owed much to Wolff for both the form and content of his philosophy, would later recognize him in the Preface to the Critique of Pure Reason as “the greatest of all dogmatic philosophers” (B xxxvi).

1. Biographical Sketch

Christian Wolff was born 24 January 1679 in Breslau in the province of Silesia (now part of Poland) to parents of modest means.[1] Wolff was educated at the Lutheran-humanist Maria-Magdelena-Gymansium, where his teachers included Christian Gryphius (1649–1706), a baroque poet and dramatist, and Caspar Neumann (1648–1715), the latter of whom Wolff credited with introducing him to the Cartesian philosophy. In 1699, Wolff enrolled at the University of Jena, where he pursued a course of study in theology, physics, and mathematics, moving from there to Leipzig in 1702 where he would sit the Magisterexamen and then complete his Habilitationsschrift in 1703 entitled: Philosophia practica universalis, methodo mathematica conscripta (On Universal Practical Philosophy, composed according to the Mathematical Method). Otto Mencke (1644–1707), the founder of the learned journal Acta eruditorum, served as an examiner for the dissertation and, impressed, sent it to Leibniz, with whom Wolff subsequently struck up a correspondence that continued until Leibniz’s death in 1716.

Due in part to Leibniz’s support, Wolff was soon offered, and accepted, a position in Giessen (though he had also been offered positions at Danzig and Wismar) which he intended to take up after visiting his family in Breslau. However, on his homeward journey the occupation of Saxony by Charles XII of Sweden required Wolff to take a detour through nearby Halle in Brandenburg-Prussia, whose recently founded university also happened to be in need of a professor of mathematics. Wolff was offered the position and, again with Leibniz’s assistance, was able to extricate himself from his commitment to Giessen, delivering his inaugural lecture at Halle in early 1707. During the next 16 years he enjoyed a prolific period, publishing and lecturing at first primarily in mathematics and natural science, though he began to lecture in philosophy proper around 1710.[2] Wolff’s first major philosophical textbook was published in 1713, the Vernünfftige Gedancken von den Kräfften des menschlichen Verstandes und ihrem richtigen Gebrauche in Erkäntnis der Wahrheit (Rational Thoughts on the Powers of the Human Understanding and its Propert Use in the Cognition of Truth) [the German Logic, hereafter GL]. In late 1719 (but with a publication date of 1720), Wolff published his German textbook on metaphysics, the Vernünftige Gedanken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt (Rational Thoughts on God, the World and the Soul of Man, and on All Things in General) [the German Metaphysics, hereafter GM]. These were followed by further German textbooks on ethics (1720), politics (1721), and physics (1723).

Wolff’s expanding philosophical activity, especially concerning topics in natural theology, as well as his popularity as a lecturer and growing influence within the university drew the ire of his Pietist colleagues in the faculty of theology, including August Hermann Francke (1663–1723), the founder of the famous Waisenhaus (orphanage), and Joachim Lange (1670–1744). They took exception to a number of doctrines expressed in Wolff’s German Metaphysics, including its privileging of the intellect to the will, its apparent demotion of freedom to mere spontaneity, and the diminished role played by revelation in matters of theological interest. While the Pietists were at first content to wage a behind-the-scenes campaign, Wolff’s address as outgoing rector of the university on 12 July 1721, in which he upheld the compatibility of Confucian moral philosophy with the acquisition of virtue (and consequently denied the indispensability of Christian revelation for morality), led to a significant escalation of the dispute. Wolff, asserting the independence of the philosophical faculty, refused to submit the text of his lecture for subsequent examination by the faculty of theology, a conflict that came to involve the university senate and even king Friedrich Wilhelm I (the “soldier king”) himself. While Wolff enjoyed the support of officials within the royal court, the Pietists exploited their personal connections with the king, who was allegedly persuaded that Wolff’s endorsement of the pre-established harmony represented a threat to military discipline (as the acts of deserters would be pre-established and so not subject to sanction). On 8 November 1723, the king issued an edict removing Wolff from his university position and ordering him to leave the lands of Electoral Brandenburg within 48 hours on pain of hanging. The edict was received in Halle four days later, on 12 November 1723, and Wolff immediately departed Halle, pausing once he crossed the Saale river (into Saxony) to refund the fees of his students for his undelivered lectures.

While Wolff’s Pietist colleagues celebrated Wolff’s exile (reportedly even from the pulpit), it ultimately served only to enhance Wolff’s reputation, bringing him to the attention of luminaries of the Enlightenment, including Voltaire. He was immediately offered positions in Leipzig and Marburg, the latter of which he accepted though a special exemption had to be granted to allow a Lutheran to teach at a Reformed university. And even as the dispute with his critics continued, generating a substantial literature in its own right, Wolff managed during his Marburg years to complete a reworked Latin presentation of his theoretical philosophy intended to make his ideas available to a pan-European audience. These texts include: Philosophia rationalis sive Logica (Rational Philosophy, or Logic) of 1728 [the Latin Logic, hereafter LL], the first part of which is the Discursus praeliminaris de philosophia in genere (Preliminary Discourse on Philosophy in General) [DP]; the Philosophia prima sive Ontologia (First Philosophy, or Ontology) of 1730 [Ont.]; Cosmologia generalis (General Cosmology) of 1731 [Cosm.]; Psychologia empirica (Empirical Psychology) of 1732 [EP]; the Psychologia rationalis (Rational Psychology) of 1734 [RP]; and the two-volume Theologia naturalis (Natural Theology) of 1736–37 [NT].

Friedrich Wilhelm I eventually thought better of his precipitous action against Wolff, as he attempted in 1733 to entice him (unsuccessfully) back to Halle and in 1736 lifted a prohibition he had enacted against the teaching of Wolffian texts. However, Wolff remained in Marburg, collecting tributes and memberships in learned societies, until the ascension of Friedrich Wilhelm I’s son, Friedrich II (the Great), himself an enlightened monarch and admirer of Wolff. Wolff accepted the new king’s offer of a professorship and vice-chancellorship at his previous institution in Halle and returned to the city on 6 December 1740 to take up his new position. Wolff continued to lecture and publish actively, with his later efforts devoted particularly to works on the law of peoples, natural law, and ethics. He died in Halle on 9 April 1754.

2. Philosophical Sources and Relationship with Leibniz

Wolff’s wide intellectual interests saw him exposed to a diverse set of influences. Neumann not only acquainted Wolff during his time at Gymansium with the Cartesian philosophy but impressed on him the need for “mathematical” treatments of philosophical topics (including natural theology and practical philosophy). Wolff also familiarized himself with late Scholastic philosophy, through a textbook by Johannes Scharf (1595–1660), a follower of Suarez; indeed, Wolff’s mastery of Scholastic thinking was displayed in his successful disputations with students at the rival (Catholic) St.-Elizabeth-Gymnasium. While Wolff’s own later philosophy would likewise be branded a form of scholasticism, the extent of the influence of Scholastic philosophers, such as Suarez, upon his thought is debated (École 2001, Leduc 2018). Wolff’s interest in mathematics was encouraged by his teachers, which interest ultimately brought him to Jena where he attended classes from G. A. Hamberger (1662–1716), the successor of Erhard Weigel (1625–99); he also studied a Euclidean textbook by J. C. Sturm (1635–1703), though his reflection on its obscurities reportedly brought him his “first light concerning the ancient method of demonstration” (Wuttke 1841: 122–3).

A rather important if under-appreciated early influence on Wolff’s thinking, particularly concerning scientific method, was Ehrenfried Walther von Tschirnhaus (1651–1708). Tschirnhaus, a Saxon nobleman, studied at the University of Leiden where the Cartesian Geulincx was active,[3] and was an important member of Spinoza’s circle of friends (among whom he circulated the Ethics). Yet, Tschirnhaus was also an active scientist, mathematician, and inventor, who among other things played a (perhaps the) key role in the discovery of the secret for making porcelain. Tschirnhaus’ principal philosophical work is his Medicina mentis (1687, 2nd ed. 1695), and he characterizes his aim there as outlining a “certain and constant method” for the discovery of all unknown truths. Wolff first gained an interest in reading the Medicina mentis while at Gymnasium, but it was only after taking up his mathematical studies in Jena in 1699 that he found himself able to profit from reading it. Wolff evidently read the text with great interest and care, marking his own copy with comments and queries and later preparing an excerpted text for use in lectures for students without the requisite mathematical background. Wolff even sought out Tschirnhaus himself during an Easter book fair in Leipzig to press him with his concerns relating to his method. (After Tschirnhaus’ death in 1708 Wolff inquired as to the status of his manuscripts but was disappointed to learn that, like Spinoza, he had ordered them destroyed).

It was G. W. Leibniz, however, who would exercise the most consequential influence on Wolff, both professionally (as seen above) and philosophically. Wolff is often described as a disciple or follower of Leibniz, a characterization for which there is some justification. So, central tenets of Wolff’s philosophical system closely resemble those advanced by Leibniz. The commitment to metaphysics, the extensive use of the principle of sufficient reason, and the (qualified) endorsement of the pre-established harmony are among many striking points of agreement. Indeed, Wolff appears not only to accept the principles and method of analysis posed by Leibniz, but he also identifies opponents to his system, such as Scholasticism, Spinoza, and materialist strains of thought, that Leibniz opposed in his own.

To describe Wolff as merely a disciple of Leibniz, however, is misleading in several respects. First and foremost, this characterization undercuts the important philosophical differences that existed between the two men. Second it misconstrues the nature of their relationship and the type of intellectual exchange that transpired between them. During the early part of Wolff’s career, and the period when he corresponded with Leibniz, Wolff’s primary focus was in the field of mathematics. It is maintained that Wolff was the first to teach calculus formally in Germany (Beck 1969: 257). According to Wolff’s own report (Wuttke 1841: 146), when he arrived at Halle in 1707, mathematics was “entirely neglected, nay quite unknown, in that place”. With the exception of his German Logic, Wolff’s energy early in his career was directed at producing the four-volume Elements of All the Mathematical Sciences [German edition 1710, and Latin edition 1713] as well as the Mathematical Lexicon [1716]. In this light, it is perhaps not surprising to find the bulk of the Wolff-Leibniz correspondence dedicated to issues in mathematics. Although they also exchanged ideas on philosophical topics (for discussion, see Rutherford 2004), their philosophical correspondence centered primarily on ethics and philosophical theology.

Leibniz published his Theodicy in 1710, and this work remained the only extended presentation of his philosophical ideas published in his lifetime. Apart from a handful of other smaller articles written on philosophical topics, most notably, Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas [1684], A Specimen of Dynamics [1695], and On Nature Itself [1698], there were relatively few texts available, and hardly any from what is regarded today as the core of Leibniz’s corpus, from which Wolff could have extracted a definitive statement of Leibniz’s philosophy. Consider a remark by Leibniz to Nicolas Remond, in a letter dated July 1714:

Mr. Wolff has adopted some of my opinions, but since he is very busy with teaching, especially in mathematics, and we have not had much correspondence together on philosophy, he can know very little about my opinions beyond those which I have published. (Leibniz 1989b: 657)

The philosophical works by Leibniz that we typically consider today to represent his mature philosophical views were published posthumously. The Principles of Nature and Grace appeared in 1718, The Monadology in 1720, and the New Essays Concerning Human Understanding as late as 1765. Although the early Kant and later German thinkers had the benefit of these texts, Wolff had no such luxury when writing his German Metaphysics in 1719.

One postumously published Leibnizian text which Wolff did have access to, and which exercised a profound influence on the development of his metaphysics was the correspondence with Clarke, originally published in 1717 (which Wolff reviewed in Acta that same year), and then in 1720 in German translation with a preface supplied by Wolff himself. Leibniz's letters brought key aspects of his metaphysical system–such as his relational conception of space and time, as well as his views on the justification of the principle of sufficient reason–to Wolff's attention for the first time. But Clarke's letters also had the effect (for Wolff) of foregrounding the dangerous errors posed by Newtonian thinking when it ventured into the domain of metaphysics. This underlined the need for a robust presentation and justification of the principles (such as the principle of sufficient reason) and concepts (space and time, but also substance, attribute, mode, action, and passion) that are at the foundation of all metaphysical disciplines. Just this is undertaken in Wolff's ontology, which investigation takes a place of newfound importance in Wolff's metaphysics from the German Metaphysics onwards (Dyck forthcoming[b]).

There is, then, clear evidence that Leibniz was a direct and important influence on Wolff, but to focus solely on Leibniz would be to obscure the range of figures who Wolff read and with whom he engaged, including (but not limited to) Descartes, Locke, Tschirnhaus, Malebranche, Newton, and Clarke. This informs Wolff's own rejection of the label of the “Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy” for his system, which moniker was apparently unwittingly coined by his own student and gleefully seized upon by his Pietist opponents. Rather, as Wolff himself emphasizes, his philosophy “begins only where Leibniz's ends,” which is to say that Wolff never assigned a place of importance in his metaphysics to the doctrines mostly closely associated with Leibniz, such as the contentious monadology and the pre-established harmony, even if he thought that his own metaphysical system provided a novel perspective from which Leibniz's doctrines could be better understood. 

3. Wolff on Philosophy, Science, and Method

Early in his career, until shortly after his expulsion from Halle, Wolff primarily presented his work in the German vernacular. His reasons for choosing German, rather than Latin, the standard languages for academic texts in Germany at the time, were both tactical and theoretical. Before Wolff, there were very few philosophical works written in German. By providing treatises on logic and metaphysics, Wolff was able to service a noticeable gap in the German university curriculum while at the same time promoting his own philosophical agenda. Prior to Wolff’s contributions, the standard text books in philosophy were largely outdated Lutheran-scholastic treatises modeled after the treatises of Philipp Melanchthon (1497–1560) (cf. Beck 1969: 189–94, 101–10). Unlike English and French universities, which had set aside hidebound scholasticism and embraced modern ideas and systems, German universities (often under the direct jurisdiction of local theological authorities) were slow to make such a change.

But Wolff also had deep-seated theoretical reasons for writing a German-language philosophy. He believed that the goal and purpose of philosophy should not only be rooted in what he calls “the pursuit of the knowledge of the truth” but also in its utility and the practical value it has for humans in their everyday life. In the preface to his German Logic, he writes:

a person should learn philosophy …[not with] a view to the vicious taste of the schools for idle disputation and wrangling, but in order to [enjoy its] usefulness in future life…. (GL: lxxvii; cf. also Corr 1970)

By writing a German-language philosophy, Wolff sought to transform philosophy from a discipline that had become mired in formalism and centered around traditionally defined topics to a discipline that had genuine utility for German students.

Among the practical aims of Wolff’s philosophy is outfitting the mind with the tools it needs to pursue and attain properly scientific knowledge, in contrast with “common” or “vulgar” knowledge, or as Wolff sometimes says “the natural way of thinking”. If certain groups of facts can be shown to follow from “well-grounded” assumptions according to strict requirements of demonstration, the class of facts is deemed by Wolff to constitute a “science”. Wolff gives several definitions of the term science:

By science, I understand, that habit of the understanding, whereby, in a manner not to be refuted, we establish our assertions on irrefragable grounds or principles (GL: c. 1, §2).

By science here I mean the habit of demonstrating propositions, i.e., the habit of inferring conclusions by legitimate sequence from certain and immutable principles (DP: §30).

Science is the capacity to prove from indisputable grounds everything one asserts or, in a word, the capacity to demonstrate; and in demonstration truths are connected together; therefore through science one knows the connection of truths, and thus science comes from reason (GM: §383).

Wolff emphasizes, in conformity with the antecedent scholastic tradition, that science is not simply a body of truths but also an intellectual habit. But that he calls it a “habit of the understanding” should not be taken to exclude the involvement of the human capacity of reason, inasmuch as reason is just the faculty for perceiving the connection between truths. When properly employed, then, human reason can discern groups of facts, establish a certain order and interconnectedness between these facts, and ultimately justify them as being certain parts of human knowledge. Put slightly differently, science is a disposition or ability of the human mind to conceive the facts of reality in an ordered and structured way. Individual sciences, therefore, such as theology, cosmology, or psychology, are simply the various sets, or subsets of demonstrable cognitions and the principles (including axioms, definitions, and empirical facts) from which they are derived.

Wolff’s system is also structured according to a notion of rational order. The “order of science” pertains to the relationship not only between individual sciences but also between the sets of discoverable facts within each given discipline (cf. DP: §§132–5). The central idea here is that certain truths are known prior to, and serve as a basis for discovering, other truths. And just as there are certain facts that are more fundamental and serve as a basis for discovering other facts, there are, Wolff believes, certain sciences whose subject matter is more basic and which ultimately stand as the foundation for other sciences that have a more specialized focus. For example, in the “order of demonstration”, physics follows general cosmology which, in turn, follows ontology (or first philosophy) (DP: §§94–5).

It appears, at first glance, that Wolff’s insistence on the rational order of science simply follows from a dogmatic metaphysical claim about the structure of reality. A reasonable objection to Wolff might be that his conception of the rational order of science is based on an unwarranted assumption about the harmonious order he believes to be present in all facets of reality. This harmonious order (the objection continues) illicitly presupposes that a divine architect has created everything according to a plan and thus the rational order of human science is simply an upshot of God’s creative power. There are certainly passages of Wolff’s works that lend support to such an objection (see for instance GL: c. 16, §3). However, to reduce Wolff’s view of the rational order of science to simply a dogmatic metaphysical claim really ignores the practical and common sense dimensions to his thought. An important part of the reason why Wolff believes that there is a rational order to science is because of the progress he believes he has witnessed in such sciences as astronomy and optics, which he believes have utilized such an order when establishing various scientific truths (DP: §139). By virtue of the very interconnectedness of the different disciplines (most notably, mathematics with physics and physics with astronomy) the claim for an intrinsic rational order among the sciences is seen by Wolff to be a pragmatic explanation for what is already largely observed and accepted as the status quo among many natural philosophers (GL: c. 1, §39). Unlike Leibniz, Wolff was much more willing to embrace the advances brought in the name of Newtonian natural philosophy (on this, see the next section).

Wolff gives the following definition of philosophy in his German Logic: “[p]hilosophy is the science of all possible things, together with the manner and reason of their possibility” (Preface, §1). Now because of its subject matter, philosophy is considered by Wolff to be the broadest and most fundamental science. In the classification of sciences given in his Preliminary Discourse, Wolff first divides philosophy into two branches: practical philosophy, on one hand, and theoretical philosophy, on the other. Practical philosophy deals (in general) with human actions and includes morality, politics, jurisprudence, and economics. Theoretical philosophy, by contrast, deals with sets of possible and actual objects and is (itself) divided into three separate branches: (1) ontology, or metaphysics proper, (2) “special” metaphysics, which includes general cosmology, psychology and natural theology, and (3) physics (DP: §92). Whereas ontology and general cosmology are considered by Wolff to be completely “pure” (or a priori) sciences, psychology, natural theology, and physics are considered to be based at least in part upon empirical (i.e., historical) principles.

Before turning to an examination of Wolff’s theoretical philosophy, and metaphysics in particular, it will be helpful to first consider Wolff’s distinctive, and often misunderstood, rationalism.

4. Wolffian Rationalism

Philosophical rationalism can be understood to involve any or all of the following: commitment to the existence of innate ideas or principles, the privileging of a priori cognition to cognition known a posteriori, and endorsement of the principle of sufficient reason (PSR). Even though Wolff is officially agnostic regarding innate ideas, a priori cognition (at least in the traditional sense of a cognition from grounds) enjoys a privileged place in his system, and to be sure, PSR is central to Wolff’s entire exposition of metaphysics and figures prominently in all levels of his philosophical system. Wolff is, accordingly, correctly identified as a philosophical rationalist; yet, this label has often inspired misleading characterizations of Wolff’s thought as abjuring all reliance upon experience in the aim of constructing a pure intellectual system founded solely on the principle of contradiction. Such a caricature, however persistent, is to be firmly rejected on both historical and philosophical grounds.

Historically, this misrepresentation of Wolff as an arch-rationalist ignores his liberal borrowings from, and deep engagement with, empiricistic and scientifically-minded thinkers, most notably Locke and Newton. In his capacity as reviewer for the Acta eruditorum, Wolff was intimately familiar with intellectual developments in England—indeed he was brought on by Mencke specifically in order to comment on the mathematical and scientific developments there (for which task Wolff taught himself English over a Summer)—and he wrote approving early reviews of Newton’s Opticks and Locke’s Posthumous Works. In general, Wolff took Locke’s “historical, plain method” as a model for his own empirical psychology, and admired the blending of reason and experiment that characterized Newton’s method, even if Wolff was deeply skeptical of Newton’s speculative and metaphysical excursions in the Queries in the Latin edition of the Optics and in the General Scholium of the second edition of the Principia (not to mention the metaphysical views explicitly defended by Samuel Clarke in the correspondence with Leibniz). Even so, Wolff’s importance for the reception of Locke in Germany is currently under-appreciated (vide Fischer 1975), and his contributions to the reception of Newton have only recently been explored in some detail (see Dunlop 2013, Stan 2012, Ahnert 2004).

It might nonetheless be thought that Wolff’s philosophy itself does not reflect this engagement with empiricism. Indeed, Wolff himself gives this impression when he states in the German Metaphysics that experience is opposed to reason such that they constitute “two paths to truth” (GM: §372), and while the path of experience might suffice for the concerns of ordinary life, Wolff makes clear that the philosopher cannot rest content with it but must use reason to press beyond what experience offers. That this is so is reflected in Wolff’s distinction between “common knowledge or cognition [gemeine Erkäntniss]” and “the cognition of a philosopher [Erkänntniss eines Welt-Weisen]” which he first offers in the German Logic:

It can now be seen how common cognition is distinguished from the cognition of a philosopher, namely, one who has no understanding of philosophy can learn many things about what is possible from experience, yet, he will not know how to indicate the reason why it [i.e., that which he learns from experience] can be. For instance, he learns from experience that it can rain, but cannot say how it happens […] nor indicate the causes why it rains. (GL: Preface, §6)

This would suggest, then, that for Wolff the path to genuinely philosophical truth is ultimately that of reason pursued independently of experience.

Yet, a more careful look at Wolff’s texts reveals that, rather than representing completely divergent paths, reason and experience are envisioned as forming a complementary whole, where experience provides an indispensable basis for properly philosophical cognition and even serves to confirm the latter’s results. Indeed, the important dependence of philosophical cognition upon experiential cognition is emphasized in Wolff’s later discussion in the Preliminary Discourse. There, Wolff labels the cognition of that which is and which happens historical cognition (DP: §3), and contends that cognition of the reason of that which is or occurs, that is, philosophical cognition (DP: §6), frequently relies on historical cognition as its foundation (fundamenta). This is the case, for instance, when we discover by means of experience something that can serve as the ground for something else that is or occurs (DP: §10). Since that which is known directly through experience is, for Wolff, “firm and unshakeable” (DP: §11), it follows that anyone who strives for philosophical cognition should not neglect the historical, or as Wolff claims, that

historical cognition should precede philosophical cognition and be constantly conjoined with it so that it does not lack a firm foundation. (DP: §11; cf. Kreimendahl 2007)

Unsurprisingly, Wolff sets up his distinctive emphasis on experience and introduces his innovations in philosophical method in conscious opposition to his rationalist predecessors. He faults Descartes, for instance, for attempting to posit universal metaphysical principles “from which one will deduce through the mere understanding everything that is possible in nature” (Wolff 1723 [Preface]). Instead, Wolff recommends near the end of the German Logic that the philosopher should be trained

to draw determinate propositions from experience and with the help of some to find the ground of others, consequently, to unite reason with experience (GL: c. 16, §11)

and later, in his oft-used metaphor, Wolff characterizes philosophical cognition itself as a “marriage of reason and experience [connubium rationis et experientiae]” (LL: §1232; cf. Cataldi Madonna 2001). Ideally, then, Wolff construes reason and experience as converging toward a common end rather than constituting divergent paths, and the philosopher is warned against pursuing one at the expense of the other (DP: §11). In this way, Wolff’s rationalism clearly separates itself from the spirit of classical rationalism (for discussion see Dyck 2021b).

5. Metaphysics

Philosophy is a science of possible and actual reality. According to Wolff’s own taxonomy, theoretical philosophy is divided into three separate branches: ontology (or metaphysics proper), special metaphysics, and physics. Cosmology, as a branch of metaphysics, is a special or restricted science insofar as its subject matter deals with the “world-whole” rather than “being in general” (the subject matter of ontology). Although there is an important sense for Wolff in which ontology is relevant for, and even necessarily grounds cosmology and the other special sciences, cosmology (itself) stands in a grounding relationship to physics that is, yet again, a more narrow and specialized discipline (Cosm. §121). Just as there are certain principles and certain truths established in ontology that are relevant for cosmology, there are certain principles and certain truths established in cosmology that are relevant for the more specialized science of physics. 

5.1 Ontology

Wolff’s ontology is constructed on two foundational principles, namely, the principle of contradiction [PC hereafter] and the principle of sufficient reason. According to Wolff, PC is the fundamental principle of human thought, the very first principle of “all metaphysical first principles”, and the “font [or source] of all certitude” (Ont. §§54–5). It is regarded by him to be a self-evident first principle, its truth made manifest through our inability to think in a manner contrary to it. In the Ontologia, he writes:

§27. We experience…[PC]… in the nature of our mind, in that, while it judges something to be, it is impossible at the same time to judge the same not to be….

§28.…[I]t cannot happen that the same thing simultaneously is and is not….

§30.…[For] … contradiction is simultaneity in affirming and denying.

PC is the “font of all certitude” insofar as, if it were called into question, the most evident and secure judgments of human knowledge, such as knowledge of the self (as a thinking thing), could likewise be called into question. We recognize the fact of our own existence by recognizing the psychological impossibility of denying it. But if it were possible both to affirm and also deny our own existence (simultaneously), then the experience of certitude that accompanies this cognition would thereby be undermined.

Wolff contends that PC is not only for our thinking but, in defining the limits of what is conceivable or not, also serves to distinguish the possible from the impossible. So, impossibility, defined formally, is that which involves a contradiction, whereas that which does not is taken to be possible. Now for Wolff, “possible” and “possible thing” are basically synonymous terms. What is possible as a concept is simply reducible to what is possible as a thing. The realm of concepts and the ontological realm of objects converge in the Wolffian system (Kuehn 1997). A thing or “being” is defined as “that which does not involve a contradiction” (Ont. §135). A possible concept, consequently, is that which corresponds to a possible object (Ont. §§57, 59, 60). This analysis of the concept of the possible typifies Wolff’s non-existential and essence-centered approach to ontology. Very briefly, Wolff’s understanding of being (or what is) involves regarding being in its most general sense. A being is “something” if and only if it is intrinsically possible, and something is intrinsically possible, if and only if its predicates or “determinations” are not contradictory. “Nothing”, in contrast, is simply a term that is empty of all content. In the ontological realm of objects there is literally no thing to which “nothing” corresponds (Ont. §57). Nothing, by definition, is not thinkable or conceivable.

One important point to emphasize about Wolff’s exposition of ontology is that existence (or the actual reality of being) is regarded exclusively as a determination or “complement” of a possible thing (Ont. §174). Although existing things are included in his overall description of reality, they are not as a class of objects his primary focus. More accurately, existing objects figure into Wolff’s metaphysical account only insofar as existing objects are a subset of possible things.

With the notions of “possible thing”, “something”, and “nothing” firmly in hand, we can now explain the notion of reason (Grund or ratio) that Wolff includes in his definition of philosophy. Insofar as the subject matter of philosophy concerns the realm of all possible things, Wolff believes that the task of the philosopher is to provide “the manner and reason” of their possibility. Warrant for this claim is grounded in the idea that everything, whether possible or actual, has a “sufficient reason” for why it is rather than not. In §56 of his Ontologia, he writes: “By sufficient reason we understand that from which it is understood why something is [or can be]”. Unlike Leibniz who essentially restricts the notion of sufficient reason to “contingent truths of fact”, Wolff considers the notion to have a much broader scope of application to include the set of all possible objects and what Leibniz calls “necessary truths of reason”. The idea that everything has a sufficient reason is presented formally by Wolff as the principle of sufficient reason.

Wolff’s most extensive treatment of the PSR appears in §§56–78 of his Ontologia. In this discussion, Wolff appears to give two separate accounts of the theoretical origin of the principle. On the one hand, in §70, Wolff provides a proof (or derivation) of PSR from the bare notions of “something” and “nothing”. And, on the other hand, in §74, Wolff claims PSR is a principle of the human mind and a self-evident logical axiom. Although prima facie, it is unclear why Wolff attempts to advance both views, it is perhaps worth pointing out the difference between (1) being able to be demonstrate the truth of a proposition and (2) knowing the truth of a proposition because it is self-evident. While demonstrating the truth of a proposition yields knowledge of it, to know a proposition because it is self-evident may or may not mean the proposition is also demonstrable. There is no inconsistency, for example, in holding that one and same proposition is both self-evident and demonstrable. A proposition could be known immediately one way and yet, in another way, follow as a conclusion of a sound deductive argument.

Wolff believes that the fact that PSR obtains becomes apparent when we consider three specific aspects of our rational/conscious experience. The first is that PSR is never contradicted by experience; the second is that we can recognize singular instances, or examples, of it in our experience of the world, and the third is that we have an inquisitive attitude toward our surroundings and future life (Ont. §§72–4). For Wolff, these characteristics are not regarded as empirical evidence for PSR, but rather that PSR is a necessary presupposition for these characteristics to be a part of our conscious experience. Thus by simply reflecting on the nature of our understanding of the world, Wolff believes that we arrive at the manifest truth of PSR.

Now according to Wolff there are at least four self-evident (axiomatic) principles of human thought: PC, the principle of excluded middle, the principle of certitude (or principle of identity), and PSR (Ont. §§52–55). Of these, only PC is indemonstrable in the sense that the truth of the principle cannot be proved to follow from a formal deductive inference. As we have seen, Wolff believes that we gain assurance of the truth of this principle by attending to the psychological experience of not being able to both affirm and deny our own existence in introspection. Thus only in a weak (and non-Wolffian) sense of “demonstration” can Wolff be said to demonstrate the truth of PC. The remaining principles, however, are demonstrable in the strict sense and his demonstration of PSR in §70 of the Ontologia is as follows:

Nothing exists without a sufficient reason for why it exists rather than does not exist. That is, if something is posited to exist, something must also be posited that explains why the first thing exists rather than does not exist. For either (i) nothing exists without a sufficient reason for why it exists rather than does not exist, or else (ii) something can exist without a sufficient reason for why it exists rather than does not exist (§53). Let us assume that some A exists without a sufficient reason for why it exists rather than does not exist. (§56) Therefore nothing is to be posited that explains why A exists. What is more, A is admitted to exist because nothing is assumed to exist: since this is absurd (§69), nothing exists without a sufficient reason; and if something is posited to exist, something else must be assumed that explains why that thing exists.

The crucial premise (italicized above) purports to reveal a contradiction that follows from the assumption that something exists without a sufficient reason. Since “nothing” cannot both be something and nothing at the same time (according to PC), the conclusion (or PSR) is claimed to follow.

This proof was the subject of an incisive critique by Wolff’s contemporary and critic, Christian August Crusius (1715–75), who (among other things) charges Wolff's proof with an equivocation in the term “nothing”, and once the two different meanings of this term are identified (viz. nothing as the opposite of something, on one hand, and Nothing as a non-being, on the other), the supposed contradiction, purported to follow from the assumption, cannot be established (Crusius 1741). Even so, the importance of a demonstration of PSR for Wolff's ends in his metaphysics, and as marking a radicalization of Leibniz's rationalism, has been greatly exaggerated. Not only as we have seen does Wolff consider other avenues, more consistent with his scientifically-minded rationalism, for securing conviction in the principle, but Leibniz himself attempted such proofs (Lodge 2018, Look 2011) and Wolff's own early attempts in GM (§§30–31) adhere closely to Leibniz's own suggestions of a possible proof of PSR at the end of his last letter to Clarke (Dyck forthcoming[b]).

In any case, for Wolff, the expression “to provide the reason of something” can be taken in two different ways. On the one hand, if the something for which a reason is provided is regarded solely as a possible thing, then “reason” stands to account for why that thing (as a possible thing) is the possible thing that it is. According to Wolff, every being is endowed with an essential nature. Possible things have natures insofar as they as are comprised of a number of non-contradictory determinations or predicates. Different sets of determinations, and the relationships among these determinations, serve as the principle of individualization within the realm of possible things. Hence, to provide the reason for a possible thing is simply to enumerate the determinations that make that thing the possible thing that it is. A reason, in this sense, is regarded by Wolff as ratio essendi or the “reason of being”.

If, on the other hand, the something to which a reason is provided is an actual (i.e., existing) thing, then “reason” stands to explain why that thing as an actual thing comes into existence. Reason, in this sense, is regarded as ratio fiendi or the “reason of becoming”. Recall that for Wolff existence is simply a predicate or determination of possible things. A familiar expression appearing in Wolff’s writings is that existence is “the complement of possibility” (Ont. §174). The basic idea here is that existence, as a predicate, perfects a possible thing by making it actual and a “real individual”. Real individuals differ from nominal beings insofar as the former are “complete and determinate”. To be “complete and determinate”, in Wolff’s sense of the expression, means that every aspect or determination of a thing can be specified and that its determinations are sufficient to individuate it from all other things. Nominal beings, although “complete”, are indeterminate (cf. GL: c. 1, §15). That is to say, although there is a certain set of specifiable determinations that is sufficient to pick out a given possible thing among all possible things, the total set of its determinations is not specifiable. A being, in the most general sense, is comprised of three different types of determinations: essentialia, attributes, and modes. Essential determinations define the essential nature of a being and a being’s attributes follow from, or are determined by, its essentialia. Whereas essentialia and attributes are both necessary properties of a thing, modes are contingent or accidental properties. Thus to say a nominal being is indeterminate is to say that there are modes of it that may or may not be present. In the weakest sense, since existence is a mode, and nominal beings do not exist (as such) but are able to come into existence under certain conditions, all nominal beings are indeterminate.

Discerning the difference between the “reason of being” and the “reason of becoming” is important for understanding the different ways Wolff employs PSR in his exposition of metaphysics. Depending on how exactly “reason” is interpreted, the principle, “nothing is without a sufficient reason for why it is rather than not” may apply either to the realm of possibility or to the realm of actual reality. Toward the end of his Ontologia, Wolff makes an attempt to recognize formally two different versions of PSR as “the Principle of Being” and “the Principle of Becoming” respectively (Ont. §866). As a Principle of Being, PSR stands as a definition of a thing’s essential nature. Yet as a Principle of Becoming, PSR serves to furnish the causes, or grounds, for why a real individual comes into actuality.

It is on the basis of PC and PSR that Wolff proceeds to explicate the fundamental concepts of his ontology. Recall that for Wolff a being in the most general sense is any possible thing. Possible things have essential natures insofar as they are composed of a number of non-contradictory determinations or predicates. The essence of any given possible thing is its principle of being, or principle of individualization. Whereas the essence of a simple being is defined by its essential properties, the essence of a composite being is defined by the manner in which its parts are combined together. In §532 of his Ontologia, Wolff explains:

A being is called composed which is made up of many parts distinct from each other. The parts of which a composite being is composed constitute a composite through the link which makes the many parts taken together a unit of a definite kind.

In one respect, simple beings and composite beings are not simply two different species of beings. It is not the case, for example, that within the realm of all possible things simple beings exist separate from, and in addition to, composite beings. More accurately, at the nominal level of reality simples and composites result from an epistemological distinction imposed by a perceiving mind in its analysis of what “exists” (i.e., exists in a nominal sense). Strictly speaking, the only substantial things to exist at any level of reality are simple substances. Simples are defined by their essentialia, and to borrow an expression from Gilson, essentialia are both “compatible and prime” (Gilson 1952: 114). That is to say, the essential properties that define a given simple substance do not contradict one another, or cancel each other out, and they are (themselves) not determined by any other thing and/or property. In this light, Wolff’s notion of substance is perhaps best regarded as a notion of essence, where each simple substance is a different set of compatible and prime essential properties (see Burns 1966: 26 and Gilson, 1952: 115). Furthermore, essential properties should not be viewed as the accidents of substance because, according to Wolff, they are the substance itself. In Wolff’s system, the accidents of substance are the properties that exist by virtue of a thing’s essentialia. And according to Wolff, there are three basic classes of accidents: proper attributes, common attributes, and modes (Ont. §148).

Proper and common attributes of substance follow from and are determined by a thing’s essentialia. Proper attributes are the properties of a thing that are determined by all the essentialia taken together, and common attributes are the properties of a thing that are determined by only some, but not all, its essentialia. Attributes (as such) are perhaps best understood as necessary accidents, since they are determined by and necessarily follow from a thing’s essentialia. Modes, in contrast, are only contingent accidents of substance. They are the properties of a thing that may or may not be present, and if actually present, they are causally the result of some contingent state of affairs. More precisely, the possible presence of any given mode follows from a substance’s essentialia, but the actual presence of a given mode is the result of something outside the substance’s essence that is causally responsible for its presence in a being. At the nominal level of reality, composite beings exist insofar as the accidents of a certain simple substance, or set of simple substances, are linked and/or arranged together in a certain sort of way. In §789 of his Ontologia, Wolff writes:

[t]he essence of a composite being consists only in mere accidents for the essence of a composite consists in the manner in which its parts are combined with one another.

5.2 Cosmology

The notion of “extended-composite” lies at the heart of Wolff’s doctrine of the world-whole. Cosmology, as a special metaphysical science, is the study of the world-whole in general. The world, as such, is an extended composite of extended composites. In §544 of his German Metaphysics, Wolff explains:

The world is a collection of mutable things that are next to each other, follow upon one another, but which are overall connected with one another.

In precise terms, Wolff believes the world is an extended whole that is composed of a finite number of interacting physical bodies. To better understand the types of cosmological claims that Wolff defends about the universe, it is perhaps helpful to consider first his conception of physical bodies. Ultimately, the conclusions that Wolff draws at the macroscopic level about the world-whole are simply extrapolated from his analysis of physical bodies. After considering Wolff’s analysis of body, this section will conclude with an overview of Wolff’s view of space, time and material extension.

Wolff’s analysis of physical bodies is given from two different perspectives. First is the “bottom-up” metaphysical account of bodies, where bodies are defined as aggregates of simple substances, and second is the “top-down” mechanistic description, where the reality of bodies, given by the testimony of the senses, is explained in terms of interacting primitive corpuscula (or corpuscles). To facilitate our discussion, we should identify the three levels of description that Wolff employs when giving his two perspective account. Identifying these three different levels is helpful in understanding at what respective point the mechanical and metaphysical accounts each terminate or bottom out.

The ground floor (so to speak) is the level occupied by a “multitude” of simple substances. Unlike simple substances at the nominal level of reality that lack the “mode of existence”, simples at this first level are real individuals (i.e., complete and determinate, actually existing beings). In addition to the term “simples”, Wolff also refers to these as “elements” and “atoms of nature” (atomi naturae). Elements (as such) are conceived by Wolff to be “unextended points of force” that lack internal motion (motus intestinus) but yet remain in a constant state of change. Each element is defined, or individuated, by its own distinctive internal state and each is considered to be indivisible in-itself. Although later Wolffians, such as Baumeister, would eventually refer to Wolff’s elements as “monads” (Baumeister 1747: 226), there is at least one important respect in which Wolff’s elements are different from Leibniz’s monads. Leibniz conceives monads as simple unextended substances, but also as “windowless” substances that do not interact or influence one another. Wolff’s elements, in contrast, do interact and have real dynamic influence over each other.[4]

The second level of description that Wolff employs when giving his account of bodies is the microphysical level. The occupants of this level are the primitive parts of bodies which Wolff calls corpuscles or material atoms. In §186 of his Cosmologia, Wolff provides a helpful contrast between the elements, or atoms of nature, on the one hand, and material atoms, on the other:

That is called an atom of nature which is indivisible in itself because it is devoid of parts into which it can be divided. That is called a material atom which in itself is able to be divided, but for actually dividing it, existing causes in rerum natura are not adequate.[5]

Material atoms or corpuscles are indivisible in the sense that there is nothing within the world that is capable of reducing them into further parts. Corpuscles represent the lowest level of explanation that is possible within a mechanical account of bodies. Similar to the level of elements, the microphysical level lies beyond the boundaries of human perception. Wolff believes that although corpuscles are extended, fill space, and are endowed with the “force of inertia”, a precise statement of their size, magnitude, and shape cannot be empirically determined. It is unclear, for example, whether all corpuscles retain homogeneity with respect to their magnitude and shape. Yet because corpuscles are a species of composite beings, Wolff is confident that the essence of a corpuscle consists in the manner in which its parts are joined together. A corpuscle is an aggregate of elements. Its component parts are simply the elements taken as unextended points of force.

The third level of description that Wolff employs when giving his account of bodies is the level of appearance or sensible reality. It is at this level that bodies and their phenomenal properties, such as extension, the force of inertia, and motor force (vis motrix), are described in mechanistic terms. In §793 of his Ontologia, Wolff writes:

I prefer that aggregates of simple substances, namely, those compound beings of which the material world is composed, be called bodies rather than simple substances…

In a strict sense, a body is considered by Wolff to be a composite of composites. The interacting elements (conceived as unextended points of force) give rise to primitive corpuscles and from the cohesion of corpuscles, a body is thereby constituted at the level of appearance. Wolff writes, “ … each body has its origin in that which is not extended, although it is itself extended” (Cosmologia, §223). At the level of appearance, bodies display a number of determinate properties. Each body has a specifiable size or magnitude (i.e., it can be measured), it occupies a fixed space or place (insofar as it is extended), it displays a certain shape, and it is divisible to the primitive corpuscles from which it is composed. Yet, according to Wolff, the properties of bodies should not be considered as the accidents of anything substantial because bodies are merely phenomenal manifestations of real, interacting, elements. Even the principal properties of bodies used in the analysis of bodily change and motion (i.e., the properties used in mechanics), such as extension, the force of inertia, and motor force, are deemed by Wolff to be phenomenal properties.

Now according to Wolff all sensible properties of bodies should be considered as secondary (or mind-dependent) qualities. In §144 of his Cosmologia, Wolff writes: “…extension is a phenomenon in the same sense in which color is accustomed to be called a phenomenon…”. And somewhat later in this same work, he states in §298: “[t]he force of inertia is called a phenomenon in the same sense in which all sensible qualities are called phenomena”. Perhaps the best way to understand Wolff’s view of sensible properties is to consider a quick comparison with Locke’s corpuscularian view of bodies. For Locke, the primary qualities of bodies, such as extension, solidity, shape, size and texture give rise to the secondary qualities that we perceive in bodies, such as color, sound, taste, smell and temperature. According to Locke, secondary qualities are nothing in the objects themselves but are the result of certain “powers” inherent in the primary qualities of things which effect various sensations in us, such as the sensation of a certain color or temperature. Thus it is by virtue of a body’s micro-structure that we are able to perceive its secondary qualities. Wolff, for the most part, accepts this causal-corpuscularian theory of secondary qualities. However, unlike Locke, Wolff believes that all sensible properties are secondary qualities that result from a body’s elemental structure. In very simplistic terms, sensible properties are for Wolff what color, sound, taste, smell and temperature are for Locke. For both philosophers, secondary qualities are phenomenal and mind-dependent properties having their causal origin in some objective (i.e., mind-independent) reality. For Locke, this reality is the independently existing corpuscles that comprise the material world; and for Wolff, this reality is the unextended points of force, or simple substances (cf. Cosm. §191).

Before explaining Wolff’s view of how extended composites come into being (i.e., the causal process that allows us to form our ideas of extended objects), it is necessary to say a few prefatory words about his view of space and time. The notions of “place” and “space”, on one hand, and the notion of “time”, on the other, figure in at different stages of Wolff’s exposition of extended reality.

First and foremost, there is an important distinction in Wolff’s cosmology between “general space” and “particular space”. Particular space (or a given place) is what an extended body “fills” or “occupies” by virtue of its corpuscular parts (Cosm. §§122–4). Its reality is derivative of the interacting elements that give rise to individual corpuscles. For Wolff, a corpuscle’s place simply results from a corpuscle’s extension. A given place is conceived as an imaginary immobile container that has the same dimensions as the extended thing that occupies it (Ont. §§676–9). General space, in contrast, is conceived as the perceived order of coexisting bodies. As explained above, the existence of bodies is established by Wolff experientially and amounts to an instance of historical cognition. In §45 and §46 of his German Metaphysics, Wolff explains:

If we pay attention to ourselves [as thinking things], we will find that we are conscious of many things outside ourselves. However, we set them apart from us in that we recognize that they are distinguishable from us, just in the same way as they are set beside each other, we recognize they are distinguishable from each other…. In that there are many things now which exist at the same time and which are presented apart (and yet at the same time different) from each other, such things come into being under a certain order. And as soon as we perceive this order we perceive space. Therefore, if we do not want to examine the matter differently than we recognize it, we must assume space is the order of such things which are simultaneous.

Wolff’s derivation of general space essentially involves three steps. First, knowledge of the self, as a thinking thing, affords a distinction between consciousness, on one hand, and consciousness of external things, on the other. Second, since that which is conscious (viz. the self) is different from that of which it is conscious (viz. the world), the self can recognize the historical and mathematical fact that it is conscious of many external things at one time (i.e., the world as a plurality). And third, since this empirical fact affords knowledge of real existences, the order or way the self represents these things is what becomes known as space. To borrow Kant’s terminology, Wolffian space lacks “objective reality” because it is simply abstracted from the coexistence of things in the world, and therefore takes on purely a subjective character (cf. Beck 1969: 270).

In contrast to his theories of place and general space, Wolff holds a much more realistic theory of time. In a strict sense, place and space serve an explanatory role for Wolff at two distinct levels of description (viz. the micro-physical level and the level of appearance). Since atomic elements are unextended, the concepts of place and space are considered by Wolff to be extraneous at the atomic level. Time, however, is not. Atomic elements are in time insofar as each element is in a constant state of change. In his most general description of time, Wolff writes: “[t]ime is the order of successive things in a continuous series” (Ont. §572). Since each atomic element produces in-itself a constant and continuous series of changes, time is regarded by Wolff as the objective measure of such changes. One clear statement of the Wolffian view of the relationship between time and change can be found in a letter to Kant (dated 13 October 1770) from Johann Heinrich Lambert. Lambert (1728–77) writes:

All changes are bound to time and are inconceivable without time. If changes are real, then time is real, whatever it may be. If time is unreal, then no change can be real. I think, though, that even an idealist must grant at least that changes really exist and occur in his representations, for example, their beginning and ending. Thus time cannot be regarded as something unreal. It is not a substance, and so on, but a finite determination of duration, and like duration, it is somehow real in whatever this reality may consist (AA 10:107).

For Wolff, Lambert, and Moses Mendelssohn, time is real insofar as it is an objective measure of change (cf. Falkenstein 1991 for discussion). Change is a constant feature of existing reality in that real individuals are finite and created beings with a determinate duration. Real individuals come into and go out of existence. Time, therefore, is applicable to the series of changes that occur within a given individual and, in the same respect, it is applicable to the totality of all the individuals that compose the world-whole. Thus for Wolff there is a meaningful sense in which real individuals and the world-whole (itself) are “in time”. This is not to say, however, that time is granted its own ontological existence. In Lambert’s words, time is not a substance (i.e., something real in-and-of itself). More precisely, time is the measure of the objective order of change that real things undergo.

Understanding the sense in which elements are “in time” is important for grasping the manner in which Wolff’s atomic elements interact. Since atomic elements lack extension, the nature of atomic interaction is not spatial. It is not the case, for example, that Wolff’s simple substances influence one another by physical contact and repulsion. Instead, elements as unextended points of force affect, and are responsive to, degrees of change by communicating with each other in time. The series of changes internal to a given element are the result of its own power (or motor force) as well as the motor forces of other elements to which it is connected. Ultimately Wolff believes that it is the interacting forces of a multitude of simple substances that gives rise to our idea of an extended object. In particular, we perceive extended objects at the level of appearance insofar as there are unextended points of force interacting in time at the level of elements. Our confused perception of this temporal interaction results in the idea of an extended object. Similarly to Locke, Wolff believes that it is the primitive qualities of a composite that produce, or effect in us, the various ideas we have of its secondary qualities. Since all sensible properties are considered by Wolff to be secondary qualities, extension, or a composite’s extendedness, results from the primitive forces of a composite at the atomic level. The analogy that Wolff presents to help explain the phenomenal manifestation of extension involves a rapidly ringing bell (Cosm. §789; cf. Burns 1966: 52). According to Wolff, just as the impression we gain from a rapidly ringing bell is the sound of one prolonged peal, where the successive strikes of a bell’s clacker are perceived as one monomial sound, our impression of extension is likewise the result of many successively acting elemental forces that give rise to our confused perception of one continuous extended object.

The notion of “extended-composite”, as already mentioned, is what ultimately stands at the heart of Wolff’s doctrine of the world-whole. Insofar as the world is a composite being, it follows from the principles of Wolff’s ontology that the world’s essence consists in the manner in which its parts are linked together. The world’s parts, as described from the standpoint of appearance, are simply the multitude of interacting physical bodies that are perceived in everyday life. And, if described from a metaphysical standpoint, the world’s parts are conceived by Wolff to be the interacting unextended points of force at the level of elements. Yet regardless of what standpoint or level of description is employed, it is clear that a necessary condition of the world’s existence is that its parts need to be interconnected. According to Wolff, the world is conceived as a substantial whole (totum substantiale) by virtue of the fact that all of its parts form real reciprocal connections with one another. On the basis of this “interconnection-thesis” the world is defined formally by Wolff as “a whole which is not also a part”.

5.3 Psychology (Empirical and Rational)

While the soul, as a simple substance, is understood to be a part of the world, and so is implicated in the treatment of cosmology, this does not exhaust what can be known of it, a fact that leads Wolff to treat it as a separate topic of metaphysics. Indeed, Wolff’s psychology constitutes one of his signal and most historically influential innovations. Most generally, insofar as Wolff seeks to offer a scientific account of the human soul specifically, and indeed with a focus on its cognitive and conative functions, his psychology represents a significant, and distinctly modern, departure from both the treatment of the soul in the context of a generic science of living things, still prevalent among Aristotelian natural philosophers in seventeenth century Germany, and from the metaphysical treatment of the soul in the context of a pneumatology, or doctrine of finite and infinite spirit (Stiening 2003, Vidal 2011). More narrowly, Wolff’s principal, and best-known innovation in psychology consists in his clear separation between two distinct investigations of the soul, the first based on the observation of one’s own mind, identified as empirical psychology, and the second which seeks to use reasoning to uncover truths about the soul that are not readily disclosed by experience, identified as rational psychology.

Wolff’s distinction between empirical and rational psychology proved to be enormously consequential, but no less important (if less well attended to) is the fact that these disciplines remain intrinsically connected. For Wolff, the observations catalogued in the course of empirical psychology serve as principles for the inferences of rational psychology, and the resulting findings on the part of rational psychology serve to guide our empirical observation in search of confirmation. Thus, Wolff writes, that which everyone can experience of themselves will serve “as a principle for deriving something else that not everyone can immediately see for themselves” (GM: §191), and that which is known of the soul from experience “is the touchstone [Probier-Stein] of that which is taught [in rational psychology] of its nature and essence” (GM: §727). Rather than constituting distinct disciplines, empirical and rational psychology amount to complementary parts of a single science, working together in the same way in which observation and theory co-operate in astronomy (EP: §5). Consequently, Wolff’s rational psychology is not to be identified as a narrowly rationalistic psychology, insofar as the latter is taken to intend a science of the soul that proceeds completely independently of experience. Nor is this interdependence of the two parts of psychology an aberration as Wolff takes their union as exemplifying his ideal for science of a connubium rationis et experientiae (EP: §497; cf., Dyck 2014, Rumore 2018).

Turning first to empirical psychology, Wolff’s treatment can be divided into four parts: (1) the initial consideration of the human soul in an attempt to arrive at an initial definition; the consideration of the soul’s (2) cognitive faculty and (3) appetitive faculty; and (4) a consideration of what can be known of the soul’s relation to the body through experience. In the first part, Wolff begins, in Cartesian fashion, by first considering the grounds for our certainty in the existence of the soul (EP: §11–14). Wolff begins by asserting that we are conscious of ourselves and other things, which he takes to be confirmed by our own indubitable experience (for to doubt it would presuppose such consciousness), and inasmuch as anything that is so conscious must exist, a claim Wolff identifies as an identical proposition or axiom (cf. GL: c. 3, §13), it follows that we can be certain that we exist. Wolff conveniently reconstructs this as a syllogism:

  • Whatever being is conscious of its self and of other things outside of it, exists.
  • We are actually conscious of ourselves and of things outside of us.
  • Therefore, we exist. (EP: §16)

In addition to assuring ourselves of the indubitability of the knowledge of our own existence (cf. Euler 2003), this initial consideration supplies a touchstone for what will count as demonstratively certain, but also provides the elements for a nominal definition of the soul. Thus, the soul is identified just as “that being in us which is conscious of itself and other things outside of it” (EP: §20) which, as an existing thing, can serve as the object of empirical psychology.

The next task for empirical psychology consists in cataloguing the various capacities that the soul has, which Wolff brings under two general headings: the cognitive faculty (facultas cognoscendi) and the appetitive faculty (facultas appetendi). Relevant to the distinction between (sub-)faculties in both cases is the distinction, borrowed from Leibniz, between obscure and clear perception (where the latter but not the former suffices for recognition of the perceived thing), and (clear but) confused and (clear and) distinct perception (where the latter but not the former involves the ability to explicate what serves to distinguish the perceived thing from others). Accordingly, both the cognitive and appetitive faculty are distinguished into lower and higher parts, where the lower includes capacities relating to ideas and notions that are obscure or clear but confused, and the higher those relating to ideas and notions that are distinct (EP: §§54–5, 584). (It bears noting that Wolff also distinguishes between obscure and clear perceptions inasmuch as the former are not apperceived but the latter are; cf. EP: §§25, 35; RP: §20, and for discussion see Wunderlich 2005 and Thiel 2011).

Among the faculties Wolff considers within the lower cognitive faculty are the faculty of sense, imagination, the fictive faculty, and memory. Sense, which includes the five sensory modalities, is understood as the capacity for sensations, where these are perceptions the reason for which is contained in the organs of our bodies, given the presence of an external thing (EP: §§67, 65). Imagination, by contrast, is the faculty for producing perceptions in the absence of sensible things. Wolff further claims that the imagination’s activity is guided by a general (associative) law that, when we have perceived things together (as parts of a whole, for instance, or as contiguous in space), if the perception of one is produced, then the imagination supplies the perception of the other (EP: §117). It is the imagination that is likewise responsible for the order of ideas in dreams. The fictive faculty (facultas fingendi) is our capacity to combine or divide the products of the imagination to create new representations (§144), and memory is defined as the faculty through which we recognize reproduced ideas as previously had (§175).

Where the lower cognitive faculty handles the generation and (re)production of obscure and confused ideas, the higher cognitive faculty encompasses the capacities and operations through which we introduce clarity and distinctness into those ideas. Accordingly, Wolff first considers the faculties of attention, whereby we introduce more clarity into a part of a composite perception (EP: §237), and reflection, through which we successively direct attention to what we perceive (as well as, in a Lockian vein, to the soul and its operations—§261) and thereby make distinct perception possible (§266). The capacity for distinct representation in general is identified as the understanding, which can be pure or non-pure depending on whether it admits confused representations, though since these are unavoidable in the case of the human being, our understanding is never pure (EP: §§313–4; for general discussion see Chance 2018). With an eye to his discussion of logic, Wolff further distinguishes three operations of the intellect with respect to its cognitions: simple apprehension (through which notions or representations of what is common to multiple things are formed), judgment (through which agreement or disagreement between representations is asserted), and discursion or reasoning (where judgments are formed on the basis of previous judgments) (EP: §§325, 366–7; cf. Dyck 2016, Rumore 2018). This latter operation informs Wolff’s definition of the faculty of reason as the capacity to perceive the interconnection among universal truths (§483), though Wolff again emphasizes that our reason is never pure but is always to some extent reliant upon experience (§§495–7).

Where the discussion of the cognitive faculty is relevant to Wolff’s aims in logic and metaphysics, the treatment of the appetitive faculty in empirical psychology is significant for Wolff’s practical philosophy. Wolff likewise distinguishes the appetitive faculty into lower and higher parts, where the distinction turns on whether there is an obscure or confused cognition of the good or evil (grounding a sensory desire or aversion), or a distinct cognition of the good or evil (grounding our act of willing or not willing). In connection with the latter, Wolff takes up the issue of freedom. He rejects the conception of freedom in terms of a capacity to act contrary to determining motives as counter to our experience and to the principle of sufficient reason (EP: §944), and instead defends a (Leibnizian) compatibilist conception, in accordance with which a freely willed act involves a distinct cognition of the perfection of some thing (which generates a motive to act in its favor); is spontaneous, or has its reason within the agent (insofar as the agent chooses it because it is pleasing); and is contingent, or the agent is not determined to choose it through its essence (EP: §§933–41; cf. Kawamura 1996; Dyck forthcoming[a]).

Lastly, but importantly, empirical psychology takes up the distinctively early modern problem of what can be experienced of the soul’s relation to the body. Here Wolff notes that we experience that some states of the soul depend upon the body (such as sensations), and some states of the body depend upon the soul (such as voluntary actions), such that the body and soul stand in a union or commercium. Nonetheless, Wolff contends (following Malebranche and in anticipation of Hume) that we have no experience of the causal power through which the soul influences the body and vice versa, but rather that our experience only confirms the general agreement between the states of each without penetrating to its ground (EP: §§961–2).

In turning to the rational consideration of the soul, Wolff’s aim is not to determine what can be known completely independently of experience but rather to employ what has been discerned in empirical psychology as principles from which its demonstrations proceed and as cognitions for which reasons are to be given (RP: §§3–4; Richards 1980). Conforming to this, the topics of rational psychology proceed from those which are closest to and draw most heavily from empirical psychology, such as the account of our soul’s nature and essence, to the increasingly more speculative topics, such as the defense of the pre-established harmony to the demonstration of the soul’s immortality and consideration of its state after death.

The determination of the soul’s nature and essence sets out from the definition of the soul given in empirical psychology as that in us which is conscious of itself and other things. Wolff argues that this consciousness is the result of a complex activity that involves reflection on and comparison of parts of a given perception as well as attention and memory (RP: §§22–3, 25). Given this, Wolff contends, the soul must be distinct from body since such an act cannot be explained in terms of a change in figure, magnitude, or the location of parts, through which alone changes in body are possible. Similar considerations serve to show that no composite can think, and thus that the soul, as conscious, must not be composite and is therefore simple, and indeed, a simple substance, since it perdures through changes in its thoughts (RP: §§44, 47–8). That the soul is a substance further implies for Wolff (as it did for Leibniz) that it is endowed with a power, understood as a sufficient reason for the actuality of the states that are possible for it through its faculties (RP: §§54–5; cf. Blackwell 1961, Heßbrüggen-Walter 2004). Wolff proceeds to determine the character of this power (which must be a single one given the soul’s simplicity), and he concludes that, because sensations are representations of the world in accordance with the position of the organic body, and because all of the representations the soul is capable of are derived from sensations, it follows that the soul’s power is just a power of representing the world in accordance with the position of the body, which power Wolff finally identifies as the essence and nature of the soul (RP: §§64–9).

Rational psychology also takes up the question of what best explains the agreement between the states of the soul and the body. Wolff considers three possible systems that purport to explain this agreement: (i) the system of physical influx, according to which one substance produces a state in another directly through its own activity (RP: §§558–60), (ii) the (Cartesian) system of occasional causes, according to which God modifies one substance on the occasion of some state arising in another (§§589–91); and (iii) the (Leibnizian) system of pre-established harmony, where the agreement between states of substances is the result of God’s initial activity in actualizing this world of substances (§§612–13). Wolff provides a number of familiar objections to the first two systems, claiming for instance, that physical influx conflicts with the laws of physics (cf. §§578–9), and that occasionalism relies on what amounts to a perpetual miracle (cf. §603), while defending the pre-established harmony from similar criticisms (cf. Watkins 2005: 45–51). Even so, given that any possible explanation cannot be confirmed or rejected by experience (as was disclosed at the conclusion of empirical psychology), each of these systems amounts to a mere hypothesis, and Wolff’s conclusion is only that the pre-established harmony is a more probable hypothesis than the other two (RP: §§503, 685; cf. Dyck 2014: 34–6), though he thinks that nothing significant turns on settling this contentious issue.

The last major topic Wolff turns to is the most speculative, namely, the demonstration of the soul’s immortality and its state after death. Immortality is taken to presuppose the incorruptibility of the soul, that is, that the soul does not naturally pass away after the death of the body, but (contrary to the Cartesians) Wolff does not think that this is all that is involved as any immortality worth having (and that would be consistent with Scripture) must also extend to the preservation of the soul’s capacity for distinct perception (that is, its spirituality) and its consciousness that it is the same being in the afterlife as it was before the body’s death (or its personality). The soul’s incorruptibility follows straightforwardly from the fact that it is simple (and so incapable of decomposition); inductive grounds are offered in favor of the soul’s preservation of its spirituality (namely, that the clarity of the soul’s perceptions is enhanced in all “great changes”—RP: §745); and the soul’s maintenance of its personality is shown by reference to the law of imagination in accordance with which its subsequent perceptions will lead it to recall previous ones. The relative merits of these arguments were hotly debated, with especially notable contributions by Wolff’s colleague in Halle, G. F. Meier, and later by Mendelssohn (in his famous Phaedo), and ultimately Kant (for discussion, see Sassen 2008; Dyck 2014: 141–72).

5.4 Natural Theology

Wolff’s treatment of metaphysics concludes with a consideration of natural theology defined as “the science of those things that are possible through God” (NT: I, §1, see Corr 1973). Yet, at the same time, natural theology also provides a bottom-up justification for metaphysics insofar as metaphysics is concerned with actual existing beings of a contingent, and so created, reality. Wolff indicates that natural theology has two principal aims: (1) to prove the existence of God and (2) to determine what pertains to the essence and attributes of God, and what follows from these.

Concerning the demonstration of God’s existence, Wolff had offered criticisms (much to the chagrin of his Pietist opponents) of a variety of traditional proofs early in his career (cf. Theis 2018: 221–3). In his Natural Theology, however, Wolff presents and defends two proofs: an a posteriori proof presented at the outset of the first volume, and an a priori proof provided at the beginning of the second. Wolff’s a posteriori proof sets out from the fact (elaborated at the outset of empirical psychology) that we exist, and proceeds to argue that the reason for our existence must be found in a necessary being:

The human soul exists or we exist. Since nothing is without a sufficient reason why it is rather than is not, a sufficient reason must be given why our soul exists, or why we exist. Now this reason is contained in ourselves or in some other being diverse from us. But if you maintain that we have the reason of our existence in a being which, in turn, has the reason of its existence in another, you will not arrive at the sufficient reason unless you come to a halt at some being which does have the sufficient reason of its own existence in itself. Therefore, either we ourselves are the necessary being, or there is given a necessary being other and diverse from us. Consequently, a necessary being exists (NT: I, §24).

From there, Wolff argues that the necessary being must also be independent, or have its sufficient reason in itself, and cannot have a beginning or end in time or is eternal. As such, the necessary being cannot be identified with the world (which is composite) or anything within it (since these have a beginning and end); moreover, it cannot be identified with the soul since unlike the soul it does not depend on the world. Therefore, the necessary being is identified as God, understood as an independent being in which the reason for the actuality of the world and the soul is found (NT: I, §67, see Corr 1973).

By contrast, Wolff’s a priori proof for God’s existence proceeds from the identification of God as the most perfect being (ens perfectissimum):

God contains all compossible realities in the absolutely highest degree. But He is possible. Wherefore, since the possible can exist, existence can belong to it. Consequently, since existence is a reality, and since realities are compossible which can belong to a being, existence is in the class of compossible realities. Moreover, necessary existence is the absolutely highest degree. Therefore, necessary existence belongs to God or, what is the same, God necessarily exists (NT: II, §21, see Corr 1973).

From the notion of a most perfect being, Wolff purports to prove God is an ens realissimum (or most real existing being). However, like Leibniz before him commenting on the Cartesian ontological proof, Wolff believes God must first be shown to be possible in order to be shown to exist. According to Wolff, arriving at the knowledge of God as an ens perfectissimum involves first contemplating the attributes that are present in the human soul, to a limited degree, and then extrapolating those attributes as unlimited qualities to God. Things are compossible insofar as they can coexist in the same subject. Since existence is a mode or reality for Wolff, existence is considered to fall within the class of compossible realities. And just as it is better to exist than not to exist, it is better to exist necessarily than just to exist contingently, therefore Wolff concludes that God’s existence is necessary.

With God’s existence assured, Wolff considers what can be known of Him. God is taken to have an understanding, consisting in His distinct representation of all possible worlds and which representation itself originates from the divine essence (NT: II, §§81, 84). God is also shown to have a will, through which He chooses one possible world to make actual, and since God’s choice in doing so finds its sufficient reason in his distinct cognition of the supreme perfection of that world, Wolff identifies God’s will as free (in the same sense of freedom presented in the empirical psychology, albeit in the highest possible degree—NT: II, §277). Wolff additionally considers God’s wisdom, which consists in His choice of the appropriate means to realize His end in creation, namely, the manifestation of His own glory and perfection (NT: I, §629), and goodness, which consists in His conferring of as much goodness on creatures as is consistent with His wisdom (NT: I, §§697–9).

While these discussions conclude the proper subject matter of natural theology, in the second half of the second volume Wolff additionally turns to critically examining various systems of atheism and radical thought. Significantly, among the views discussed is Spinozism, and indeed his treatment is considerably detailed (spanning §§671–716 of the second volume), likely reflecting the fact that Wolff had himself faced a persistent accusation of supporting Spinoza on the part of his Pietist critics. In contrast, however, with other discussions of Spinoza by philosophers of this period, Wolff’s does not trade in convenient caricatures or speculation concerning the real (immoral) motives behind Spinoza’s thought but hews closely, if critically, to the text of the Ethics. Wolff scrutinizes Spinoza’s definitions, particularly of God, substance, attribute, mode, and finite thing (which he contrasts with their proper definitions in the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy), and proceeds to show how these figure into Spinoza’s account of extension (NT: II, §§688–93), doctrine of bodies (§§694–6), claims of the uniqueness and necessary existence of substance (§§697–706), and his faulty account of infinite thought as composed of an infinite number of finite thinking things (§§707–8). Wolff’s discussion proved rather influential, with Mendelssohn echoing and developing it, and the accuracy of Wolff’s characterization of Spinoza was also a point of discussion in the famous Pantheismusstreit (cf. Beiser 1987: 103).

6. Practical Philosophy

Despite his reputation as a metaphysician first and foremost, Wolff had a longstanding interest in practical philosophy, from his Habilitation on Philosophia practica universalis to his final multi-volume works on the law of peoples, moral philosophy, and economics. Among Wolff's innovations is the introduction of a distinction between the special disciplines of practical philosophy (natural law, moral philosophy, and economics) and the consideration of volition in general in the context of what Wolff called universal practical philosophy. Kant would find an analog to his own conception of a “metaphysics of morals” in Wolff's universal practical, even as he faults Wolff for failing to focus on the pure will and the properly moral concept of obligation (AA 4:388–91).

Though it had long been overshadowed by Kant's, or even Leibniz's contributions, Wolff's moral philosophy has recently received more sympathetic attention (see the contributions in Schierbaum, et al., 2024), with its importance in the history of moral philosophy being recognized (see Brink 2019, and Eggers 2019). At the heart of Wolff's moral philosophy is the concept of perfection, a concept that Wolff borrows from Leibniz (for Wolff's development on this score, see Goldenbaum 2024). From this concept of perfection, understood quite generally in terms of the agreement or harmony within a manifold (cf. GM §152), Wolff derives the “universal rule of free action” or “law of nature”: “do that which makes you and your state or that of another more perfect, omit that which makes it more imperfect” (GE §12). In an early letter to Leibniz, dated 4 May 1715, Wolff explains the important role that the concept serves in his ethics:

I need the notion of perfection for dealing with morals. For, when I see that some actions tend toward our perfection and that of others, while others tend toward our imperfection and that of others, the sensation of perfection excites a certain pleasure [voluptas] and the sensation of imperfection a certain displeasure [nausea]. And the emotions [affectus], by virtue of which the mind is, in the end, inclined or disinclined, are modifications of this pleasure and displeasure; … From this also comes the general rule or law of nature that our actions ought to be directed toward the highest perfection of ourselves and others. (Leibniz 1989a: 231–232)

This derivation depends on Wolff's understanding of obligation (Verbindlichkeit) simply in terms of the connection of a motive for willing or not-willing to an action (GE §8). So, insofar as we have a motive to pursue our and others' perfectionm, given that its acquisition is a source of pleasure, it follows that we have an obligation to pursue our and others' perfection. 

Wolff thus finds an objective ground for moral obligation, that is, he locates the source of obligation in the nature of the action (and its agreement with the nature and essence of the human being) rather than in the will of God or some other human authority (Favaretti Camposampiero 2024). This has the consequence, which Wolff embraces, that the pursuit and attainment of virtue does not depend upon any knowledge of the content of the divine will, and therefore, more generally, effectively separates Wolff's moral theory from any reliance on divine commands. Indeed, it was just this separation that later led Wolff to praise Confucian moral philosophy in the prorectoral address that drew the ire of his Pietist colleagues and precipated his exile from Brandenburg-Prussia.

7. Other Philosophical Contributions and Impact

Wolff’s prominence in eighteenth-century Germany, and his wide-ranging interests, have meant that he is an important figure in the history of a number of established fields in the eighteenth century, including mathematics, physics, political theory, and even economics. Wolff also made notable, even pioneering contributions to disciplines that were not as yet recognized as distinct areas of philosophical inquiry. Wolff had, for instance, an early interest in the philosophy of language, having devoted a dissertation to the topic in 1703 (Disquisitio philosophica de loquela), an interest he continued to pursue in subsequent discussions in his logical writings, relating to semiotics and hermeneutics, and in his psychological texts, concerning the relation between mental and linguistic entities (see Favaretti Camposampiero 2018 for details). Wolff is also widely recognized as a founding figure in the discipline of aesthetics—while his only text devoted to the topic is a treatise on civil architecture (a volume in a mathematical textbook), Wolff’s account of aesthetic pleasure in terms of the intuitive cognition of perfection (EP: §511), and identification of that perfection as consisting in a unity in multiplicity, were taken up and discussed by later aesthetic theorists, including A. G. Baumgarten (the father of modern aesthetics), J. C. Gottsched, J. G. Sulzer (1720–79), and Mendelssohn (see Beiser 2009; Buchenau 2013).

Wolff's philosophy proved enormously influential, both within Germany and outside of it (especially after the publication of his Latin textbooks), in the first half of the 18th century. Through his textbooks, some of which saw many editions in his lifetime, and through his students, who found positions in universities throughout Germany, Wolff contributed more than any other thinker to the modernization of the Germany academy (a fact reflected in the designation of his system as Schulphilosophie), and effected a wholesale realignment within the faculty of philosophy into pro- and anti-Wolffian factions. Moreover, and significantly, among the early impacts of the Wolffian philosophy is the increased engagement of women with philosophical texts and debates, in part due to Wolff's innovative choice to publish (initially) in the vernacular, but also due to its stepwise manner of presentation (more suitable for those without access to formal education), and to its emphasis on the importance of the distinct cognition, and so the study of philosophy, for the attainment of virtue. For these, and other, reasons, Wolffianism counted a number of gifted women among its early adherents, defenders, and popularizers, including Luise Adelgune Viktorie Gottsched (1713–62), Johanna Charlotte Unzer (1725–82), and Émilie Du Châtelet (1706–49, and with whom Wolff engaged in correspondence). Unfortunately, Wolff’s impact upon women philosophers in Germany in the first half of the 18th century remains an under-appreciated part of his legacy.


Wolff’s Principal Works

For a complete listing of Wolff’s works, see Theis & Aichele (2018: 20–27). Editions of all of Wolff’s works have been reprinted in the series:

  • Christian Wolff: Gesammelte Werke, 1962–, edited by Jean École, Hans Werner Arndt, Charles Anthony Corr, Joseph Ehrenfried Hofmann, M. Thoman, Hildesheim: Olms.

In the case of the German Logic and German Metaphysics, both of which saw numerous editions and significant changes throughout Wolff’s lifetime, references in this entry are to the later, reprinted editions.

In the above entry, all translations are by the authors unless otherwise indicated.

Wolff’s German Texts

  • 1710, Der Anfangs-Gründe aller mathematischen Wissenschafften (Elements of All the Mathematical Sciences), Halle.
  • [GL] 1713, Vernünftige Gedanken von den Kräften des menschlichen Verstandes und ihrem richtigen Gebrauch in der Erkenntnis der Wahrheit (Rational Thoughts on the Powers of the Human Understanding and its Proper Use in the Cognition of Truth), Halle. 14th edition [1754] reprinted with an introduction by Hans Werner Arndt in Christian Wolff, Gesammelte Werke, 1.Abt., Deutsche Schriften, Bd.1. Hildesheim: Olms, 1965.
  • [GM] 1719/20, Vernünftige Gedanken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt (Rational Thoughts on God, the World and the Soul of Man, and on All Things in General), Halle. 7th edition [1751] reprinted with introduction by Charles A. Corr in Christian Wolff, Gesammelte Werke, 1.Abt., Deutsche Schriften, Bd.3. Hildesheim: Olms, 1983.
  • [GE] 1720, Vernünftige Gedanken von der Menschen Thun und Lassen zur Beförderung ihrer Glückseligkeit (Rational Thoughts on Human Action and Omission with a View to Promoting his Happiness), Halle.
  • 1721, Vernünftige Gedanken von dem gesellschaftlichen Leben der Menschen, und insonderheit dem gemeinen Wesen (Rational Thoughts on the Social Life of the Human Being, and in particular on the Commonwealth), Halle.
  • 1723, Vernünftige Gedanken von den Wirkungen der Natur (Rational Thoughts on the Operations of Nature, Halle.
  • 1724, Vernünftige Gedanken von den Absichten der natürlichen Dingen (Rational Thoughts on the Purposes of Natural Things), Frankfurt and Leipzig.
  • 1725, Vernünftige Gedanken von dem Gebrauche der Theile des menschlichen Leibes, der Thiere und Pflanzen (Rational Thoughts on the Employment of the Parts of the Human Body, Animals, and Plants), Frankfurt.

Wolff’s Latin Texts

  • 1703a, Philosophia practica universalis, methodo mathematica conscripta (On Universal Practical Philosophy, composed according to the Mathematical Method).
  • 1703b, Disquisitio philosophica de loquela, Leipzig.
  • 1709, Aërometriæ elementa, Leipzig.
  • 1713–15, Elementa matheseos universae (Elements of All the Mathematical Sciences), 2 vols. Halle.
  • 1716, Mathematisches Lexicon (Mathematical Lexicon), Leipzig.
  • 1718, Ratio prælectionum Wolfianarum, Halle.
  • [LL] 1728, Philosophia rationalis sive Logica, methodo scientifica pertractata, et ad usum scientiarum. atque vitae aptata. Praemittitur discursus praeliminaris de philosophia in genere (Rational Philosophy, or Logic), Frankfurt. Includes
    • [DP] Discursus praeliminaris de philosophia in genere (Preliminary Discourse on Philosophy in General)
  • [Ont.] 1730, Philosophia prima sive ontologia methodo scientifica pertractata qua omnis cognitionis humanae principia continentur (First Philosophy, or Ontology), Frankfurt.
  • [Cosm.] 1731, Cosmologia generalis methodo scientifica pertractata, qua ad solidam imprimis Dei atque naturae cognitionem via sternitur (General Cosmology), Frankfurt and Leipzig.
  • [EP] 1732, Psychologia empirica methodo scientifica pertractata, qua ea quae de anima humana indubia experientiae fide constant, continentur (Empirical Psychology), Frankfurt and Leipzig.
  • [RP] 1734, Psychologia rationalis methodo scientifica pertractata, qua ea, quae de anima humana indubia experientiae fide innotescunt (Rational Psychology), Frankfurt.
  • [NT] 1736–7, Theologia naturalis scientifica pertractata (Natural Theology), 2 vols., Frankfurt.
  • 1738–9, Philosophia practica universalis methodo scientifica pertractata, 2 vols. Frankfurt.
  • 1740–1748, Jus naturae methodo scientifica pertractatum, 8 vols., Frankfurt & Leipzig, and Halle.
  • 1749, Jus gentium methodo scientifica pertractatum (The Law of Nations Treated According to a Scientific Method), Halle.
  • 1750–3, Philosophia moralis sive ethica, 5 vols., Halle.
  • 1963, Briefwechsel zwischen Leibniz und Christian Wolff, C. I. Gerhardt (ed.). Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlagsbuchhandlung.

Primary Literature in English Translation

  • 1770, Logic, or Rational Thoughts on the Powers of the Human Understanding with their Use and Application in the Knowledge and Search of Truth, London: Printed for L. Hawes, W. Clarke, and R. Collins. Translation of Vernünftige Gedanken von den Kräften des menschlichen Verstandes und ihrem richtigen Gebrauch in der Erkenntnis der Wahrheit (1713/GL).
  • 1963, Preliminary Discourse on Philosophy in General, translated by Richard J. Blackwell, Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc. Translation of Discursus praeliminaris de philosophia in genere (1729/DP).
  • 1992, Moral Enlightenment: Leibniz and Wolff on China, translated by Julia Ching and Willard Gurdon Oxtoby, Nettetal: Steyler Verlag. Contains a translation of Wolff's Oratio de Sinarum philosophia practica.
  • 2003, Moral Philosophy from Montaigne to Kant, translated by J. B. Schneewind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Contains a translation of excerpts from Wolff’s Vernünftige Gedanken von der Menschen Thun und Lassen zur Beförderung ihrer Glückseligkeit (1720b).
  • 2009, Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason: Background Source Materials, edited and translated by Eric Watkins, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Contains a translation of excerpts from Wolff’s Vernünftige Gedanken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt (1720a/GM).
  • 2017, The Law of Nations Treated according to a Scientific Method, translated by Joseph H. Drake, revised and edited by Thomas Ahnert, Carmel, IN: Liberty Fund. Translation of Jus gentium methodo scientifica pertractatum (1749).
  • [EMGP] 2019, Early Modern German Philosophy, edited and translated by Corey W. Dyck, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Contains a translation of selections from Wolff’s Vernünftige Gedanken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt (1729a/GM) and of Wolff’s “Refutation of Spinoza” from the Theologia naturalis (1736–7/NT).
  • 2022, First Philosophy, or Ontology. Treated according to the Scientific Method, containing the Principles of all Human Cognition. Part I §§1–78. Translated, annotated, with an introduction by Klaus Ottmann. Thomason: Spring Publications.
  • 2024, Kant's Critique of Practical Reason: Background Source Materials, translated by Michael H. Walschots, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Contains a partial translation of Vernünftige Gedanken von der Menschen Thun und Lassen zur Beförderung ihrer Glückseligkeit.

Other Primary Sources

  • Baumeister, Friedrich Christian, 1747, Elementa Philosophiae Recentioris, Leipzig: Gleditschii.
  • Crusius, Christian August, 1743, Dissertatio philosophica de usu et limitibus principii rationis determinantis, vulgo sufficientis¸; translated in EMGP.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1900–, Kants gesammelte Schriften, edited by Königlichen Preußischen (later Deutschen) Akademie der Wissenschaften (ed.), Berlin: Georg Reimer (later Walter De Gruyter).
  • –––, 1998, Critique of Pure Reason, P. Guyer and A. Wood (eds. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Ahnert, Thomas, 2004, “Newtonianism in Early Enlightenment Germany, c. 1720 to 1750: Metaphysics and the Critique of Dogmatic Philosophy”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 35(3): 471–91. doi:10.1016/j.shpsa.2004.06.003
  • Anderson, R. Lanier, 2005, “The Wolffian Paradigm and Its Discontent: Kant’s Containment Definition of Analyticity in Historical Context”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 87(1): 22–74. doi:10.1515/agph.2005.87.1.22
  • –––, 2015, The Poverty of Conceptual Truth: Kant’s Analytic/Synthetic Distinction and the Limits of Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198724575.001.0001
  • Arndt, Hans Werner, 1983, “Rationalismus und Empirismus in der Erkenntnislehre Christian Wolffs”, in Schneiders 1983: 31–47.
  • Bacin, Stefano, 2017, “Rationalism and Perfectionism”, in The Cambridge History of Moral Philosophy, Sacha Golob and Jens Timmermann (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press;, 379–393. doi:10.1017/9781139519267.030
  • Beck, Lewis White, 1969, Early German Philosophy: Kant and His Predecessors, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Beiser, Frederick C., 1987, The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2009, Diotima’s Children: German Aesthetic Rationalism from Leibniz to Lessing, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199573011.001.0001
  • Beutel, Albrecht, 2001, “Causa Wolffiana. Die Vertreibung Christian Wolffs aus Preußen 1723 als Kulminationspunkt des thelogisch-politischen Konflikts zwischen halleschem Pietismus und Aufklärungsphilosophie”, in Wissenschaftliche Theologie und Kirchenleitung. Beiträge zur Geschichte einer spannungsreichen Beziehung, Ulrich Köpf (ed.), Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, 159–202.
  • Bianco, Bruno, 1989, “Freiheit gegen Fatalismus. Zu Joachim Langes Kritik an Wolff”, in Zentren der Aufklärung. Halle: Aufklärung und Pietismus, vol. I, Norbert Hinske (ed.), Berlin: DeGruyter, 111–155.
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