First published Mon Jul 25, 2005; substantive revision Mon Dec 4, 2023

A set of properties A supervenes upon another set B just in case no two things can differ with respect to A-properties without also differing with respect to their B-properties. In slogan form, “there cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference”.

As we shall see, this slogan can be cashed out in many different ways. But to illustrate the basic idea, imagine that there is a perfect forger. Her copies of paintings not only fool the art dealers, but are in fact exact duplicates of the originals down to the precise placement of every molecule of pigment—indeed, down to every microphysical detail. Suppose that she produces such a copy of El Greco’s A View of Toledo. It is of course different from the original in various respects—it is a forgery, it was not painted by El Greco, it is worth quite a bit less at Sotheby’s, and so forth. But the forgery is also exactly like the original in other respects. It is the same shape, size, and weight. The surface of the canvas contains the same arrangements of colors and shapes—a blue rectangle here, a green swirl there. Indeed, it looks just the same, at least to a single viewer under identical lighting conditions and so forth. Perhaps it is even just as beautiful as the original, though that is more controversial.

The properties that the forgery is guaranteed to share with the original are those that supervene upon its microphysical properties. Two paintings that are microphysically just alike are guaranteed to be just alike in the arrangement of colors and shapes on their canvases. That is, you cannot change the arrangement of colors and shapes on a painting’s canvas without changing its microphysical properties. This is just to say that the arrangement of colors and shapes supervenes on its microphysical properties.

Supervenience is a central notion in analytic philosophy. It has been invoked in almost every corner of the field. For example, it has been claimed that aesthetic, moral, and mental properties supervene upon physical properties. It has also been claimed that modal truths supervene on non-modal ones, and that general truths supervene on particular truths. Further, supervenience has been used to distinguish various kinds of internalism and externalism, and to test claims of reducibility and conceptual analysis.

Supervenience is related to but distinct from notions like grounding and ontological dependence. We directly address the relation between these notions in §3.5 (much of that section has been part of this entry since its initial publication in 2005).

1. Introduction

The core idea of supervenience is captured by the slogan, “there cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference.” It is important to notice the word ‘cannot’. Supervenience claims do not merely say that it just so happens that there is no A-difference without a B-difference; they say that there cannot be one. A-properties supervene on B-properties if and only if a difference in A-properties requires a difference in B-properties—or, equivalently, if and only if exact similarity with respect to B-properties guarantees exact similarity with respect to A-properties. Supervenience claims thus have modal force. The kind of modal force can vary; different supervenience claims might attribute different kinds of necessity to the connection between B-properties and A-properties (see Section 3.1.) Even when the modality is fixed, however, there are a number of distinct claims that might be expressed by the slogan. A good deal of philosophical work has gone into distinguishing these forms of supervenience, and into examining their pairwise logical relations.

We will begin with a few brief historical remarks (Section 2), and then turn to some general questions about supervenience, such as whether it is explanatory and whether it is guarantees entailment (Section 3). We will then explore the various versions of supervenience in some detail (Section 4). The technical work is interesting in its own right, but it is obviously made more interesting by the fact that the different varieties of supervenience may be useful for different philosophical purposes. Thus, although most of this entry will be concerned with supervenience itself rather than its applications, we will end with a discussion of some of the substantive philosophical issues to which supervenience is relevant (Section 5).

Readers primarily interested only in an overview of the relations between the main varieties of supervenience should skip to Section 4. The technical definitions are also collated in an Appendix.

2. History

2.1 ‘Supervenience’ as a Philosophical Term of Art

‘Supervenience’ and its cognates are technical terms. This is not news; ‘supervene’ is rarely used outside the philosophy room these days. But it occasionally is, and when it is, it typically has a different meaning. It is typically used to mean “coming or occurring as something additional, extraneous, or unexpected” (Webster’s New International Dictionary, 3rd edition). This is the sense at issue in the following passages from the Oxford English Dictionary: “upon a sudden supervened the death of the king (1674–48)” and “The king was bruised by the pommel of his saddle; fever supervened, and the injury proved fatal (1867)” (cited in Kim 1990, 2–3). It is also the sense at issue in W.V.O. Quine’s autobiographical remark about his adolescence: “necking, as it was called, supervened in the fullness of time as necking will” (1985, 43). However, this use of ‘supervenience’ is irrelevant to the philosophical use of the term. The philosophical use of ‘supervenience’ is strictly proprietary, and so in no way beholden to its vernacular use(s). In this way, ‘supervene’ is different from terms like ‘cause,’ ‘freedom,’ or ‘justice’. ‘Supervene’ receives its sense by stipulation, and the notion so defined is to be judged by its philosophical fruits (McLaughlin 1995).

2.2 Origin of the Term

What, then, is the origin of the philosophical use of the term? It is not clear. Some have speculated that it originates with the British Emergentists of the early part of the twentieth century. This is because the British Emergentist Lloyd Morgan (1923) used the term ‘supervene’ to characterize a relation that emergent properties bear to their base properties, and his use became fairly widespread in the literature on emergence. However, Morgan used ‘supervene’ in essentially its vernacular sense, rather than in its current philosophical sense. He held that emergent properties are distinct from, and additional to, their base properties, and arise unpredictably from them. It was this use, not the current philosophical use, that became fairly widespread in the literature on emergence (see Van Cleve 1990; and McLaughlin 1992 and 1997b).

It is also frequently claimed that the term ‘supervene’ was first used in its contemporary philosophical sense by R.M. Hare, who used it to characterize a relationship between moral properties and natural properties (1952, 145). Unlike Morgan, Hare used the term in essentially the current philosophical sense, but he claims that he was not the first to do so. He claims that the term was so used in Oxford in the 1940s, though he does not recall by whom, or in what context (Hare 1984).

It is important to be clear, however, that whether or not Hare was the first to use the term ‘supervene’ in the philosophical sense, he was by no means the first to assert a supervenience thesis. For example, while G. E. Moore did not use the term ‘supervene’, he asserted: “one of the most important facts about qualitative difference…[is that] two things cannot differ in quality without differing in intrinsic nature” (1922, 263). And there are many other historical examples of such explicit statements of supervenience theses. Moreover, though we are not going to argue the point here, it seems no exaggeration to say that virtually every major figure in the history of western philosophy has been at least implicitly committed to some supervenience thesis or other (or to the denial of one).

But regardless of how long the notion of supervenience has been around, or who first used the term ‘supervenience’ in its philosophical sense, it is indisputable that Donald Davidson played a key role in bringing the idea to center stage. He introduced the term ‘supervenience’ into contemporary philosophy of mind in the following passage:

[M]ental characteristics are in some sense dependent, or supervenient, on physical characteristics. Such supervenience might be taken to mean that there cannot be two events alike in all physical respects but differing in some mental respect, or that an object cannot alter in some mental respect without altering in some physical respect (1970, 214).

After Davidson’s appeal to supervenience, Terence Horgan (1982, 1984), Jaegwon Kim (1984, 1987, 1988, 1990, 1993), David Lewis (1983), and others began to examine the notion of supervenience itself, and to explore its usefulness for a wide variety of philosophical purposes. The literature then mushroomed.

3. Supervenience and Other Relations

Philosophers have distinguished many different varieties of supervenience. In Section 4, we will lay out those varieties, and note their pairwise logical relations. For now, though, we will stick to the core idea of supervenience—namely, that there cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference. A number of general points of philosophical interest can be made just by working with that simple and easy idea.

3.1 The Modal Force of the Supervenience Relation

In order to sort out how supervenience connects up to other relations—like entailment, reduction, grounding, ontological dependence, and explanation—we need to discuss the fact that supervenience can hold with varying degrees of modal force. That is, the ‘cannot’ in “there cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference” comes in different strengths. For example, it can mean “cannot as a matter of logic,” or it can mean “cannot consistently with the laws of nature”.

This raises some controversial issues. For the purposes of this essay, we make the following three assumptions. First, we assume that metaphysical necessity is just as strong as logical necessity. There are, to be sure, metaphysically necessary truths that are not logical truths, such as the truth that water = H20. But metaphysical necessity is just as strong as logical necessity in that the space of metaphysical possibility is exactly the same as the space of logically possibility: the logically possible worlds = the metaphysically possible worlds (see, e.g., McLaughlin 1995; Chalmers 1996; and Jackson 1998). This is not entirely uncontroversial, but little we have to say turns on it. Second, and more importantly in what follows, we assume that at least certain properties that figure in laws of nature do not play their nomic roles essentially, so that it is logically or metaphysically possible for those properties not to figure in the laws in question. This is also controversial, but we will not defend it here. (See Shoemaker 1980, Swoyer 1982, and Ellis 2001 for the opposing view.) Finally, we will assume that whatever is metaphysically necessary is nomologically necessary, but not conversely. (One can hold that there are nomologically necessary truths that are not metaphysically necessary, even if one holds that all nomic properties play their nomic roles essentially; see Fine 2002.)

Some supervenience relations are metaphysically (or logically) necessary. The property being a haircut or a halibut supervenes with metaphysical necessity on the two base properties being a haircut and being a halibut: two things cannot differ with respect to being a haircut or a halibut without differing either with respect to being a haircut or else with respect to being a halibut. Also, the surface areas of perfect spheres supervene with metaphysical necessity on their volumes (and vice versa) (Lombard 1986). Some supervenience relations are metaphysically contingent. Consider the Wiedemann-Franz Law, which entails that the electrical conductivity of a metal co-varies with its thermal conductivity. This law thus entails that electrical conductivity and thermal conductivity mutually supervene on each other. But on the assumption that the law is metaphysically contingent, the supervenience relation is too. It is only nomologically necessary that there cannot be a difference in one sort of conductivity without a difference in the other sort.

So, supervenience relations can hold with either metaphysical or nomological necessity, and perhaps even with some other kind of necessity. The fact that supervenience comes in different modal strengths is important. Sometimes there is widespread agreement that a certain supervenience relation holds, but dispute over what its modal force is. One important example is the supervenience of the mental on the physical. Just about everyone, even a Cartesian dualist, believes some version of this supervenience claim. But there is vigorous disagreement about whether the supervenience relation holds with metaphysical or merely nomological necessity. Ask yourself—could there be an individual that has no conscious experience at all, despite being physically indiscernible from an individual that is conscious (Kirk 1994; Chalmers 1996)? That is, could there be what philosophers call a ‘zombie’? Because it is widely agreed that the mental nomologically supervenes on the physical, it is widely agreed that zombies are nomologically impossible—that their existence would violate psychophysical laws. But some philosophers (e.g., Chalmers 1996) think that zombies are metaphysically possible. This remains a matter of lively dispute, and resolving it requires addressing some hard questions about the relationship between conceivability and metaphysical possibility. Suffice it to note that the dispute is precisely over the modal force of the ‘cannot’ in “there cannot be a mental difference without a physical difference.” (For discussions of the relationship between conceivability and metaphysical possibility see, e.g., the essays in Gendler and Hawthorne 2002. For a discussion of physicalism, see Section 5.4 of this entry and the separate entry on physicalism.)

3.2 Supervenience and Entailment

Is supervenience a form of entailment? The two relations are logically similar in certain ways. The entailment relation is reflexive, transitive, and non-symmetric, and so is supervenience. Supervenience is reflexive: for any set of properties A, there cannot be an A-difference without an A-difference (see, e.g., Kim 1984). It is also transitive: if A-properties supervene on B-properties, and B-properties supervene on C-properties, then A-properties supervene on C-properties. However, supervenience is neither symmetric nor asymmetric; it is non-symmetric. Sometimes it holds symmetrically. Every reflexive case of supervenience is trivially a symmetric case; consider also the case of the volume and surface area of perfect spheres mentioned in Section 3.1. And sometimes it holds asymmetrically. For example, while the mental may supervene on the physical, the physical does not supervene on the mental. There can be physical differences without mental differences. One uncontroversial way to see this is to note that radically physically different things—a washing machine and a paper bag, say—can be mentally just alike in virtue of lacking mental properties altogether. Thus supervenience, like entailment, is reflexive, transitive, and non-symmetric.

Nonetheless, that B-properties entail A-properties is neither necessary nor sufficient for A-properties to supervene on B-properties. (The notion of property entailment in play is this: property P entails property Q just in case it is metaphysically necessary that anything that possesses P also possesses Q.) To see that such entailments do not suffice for supervenience, consider the properties being a brother and being a sibling. Possessing the former entails possessing the latter; every brother is a sibling. But being a sibling does not supervene on being a brother. Two people can differ with respect to being a sibling despite being exactly alike with respect to being a brother. To see this, suppose that Sarah has a sister and Jack is an only child. Thus Sarah is a sibling and Jack is not, though neither is a brother. So the B-properties can entail the A-properties, even though A does not supervene on B.

To see that supervenience does not suffice for entailment, recall that supervenience can hold with only nomological necessity. In such cases, there is no entailment; thermal conductivity properties do not entail electrical conductivity properties, for example.

But what about supervenience with metaphysical or logical necessity? Even that does not in general guarantee that there are B-properties that entail the A-properties. At best, the logical supervenience of A on B means that how something is B-wise entails how it is A-wise. But it does not follow that every A-property is entailed by a B-property, or even that some A-property is entailed by a B-property. Consider two examples. First, on the assumption that there are negative properties, every property F will supervene with logical necessity on its complement not-F. After all, two things cannot differ with respect to whether they are F without differing with respect to whether they are not-F, and conversely. But obviously being F does not entail being not-F (McLaughlin 1995, 1997a). Second, consider a case in which the property set B contains only the property P and the property Q, and property set A is the unit set of the conjunctive property P&Q. That is, A = {P&Q}, and B = {P, Q}. A supervenes with metaphysical necessity on B. But there is no property in B that entails the A-property.

Now, there might be special sets of properties for which the supervenience of A on B guarantees that there are B-properties that entail the A-properties—namely, property sets that are closed under the Boolean operations of complementation, infinitary conjunction, infinitary disjunction (see Kim 1984), and operations involving quantification. Closing {F} and {~F} under these operations will result in the same set, namely {F, ~F, F & ~F, F v ~F…}. In both cases just above, then, the closure of B under these operations in fact contains a property that entails the A-property.

Discussions of supervenience often appeal to property sets that are closed under such operations. But this is not a trivial assumption, for two reasons. First, it is controversial whether complementation, conjunction, and disjunction are legitimate property-forming operations. Whether they are largely depends upon what properties are taken to be. If properties are just the semantic values of predicates, then there are negative, conjunctive, and disjunctive properties, because negative, conjunctive, and disjunctive predicates can have semantic values. But if properties are universals there may not be any such properties (Armstrong 1978, 1989). And if properties are ways a thing might be, then property sets cannot be closed under Boolean operations. That would entail that for any property F, being F and ~F is also a property. However, that is not a way anything might be. (However, see Priest 2010 for an opposing view.) Second, even if it is assumed that the property-forming operations are legitimate, the fact is that we are quite often interested in property sets that are not closed under them. Consider negation. Even assuming that there are negative properties, the fact is that we do not standardly count cats as having geological properties because they are neither ignaceous, sedimentary, nor metamorphic. And it seems strange to say that Descartes was committed to mental substances having physical properties simply because he thought they are not spatially extended. Since not every property set is closed under every property-forming operation, supervenience is not in general sufficient for entailment. (For further discussion of supervenience and various property-forming operations, see Van Cleve 1990; Oddie and Tichy 1990; Bacon 1990, 1995; Glanzberg 2001; Bader 2012.)

One particularly interesting case of entailment failure arises when the property sets are not closed under quantification. This opens room for cases in which the supervening set A contains properties formed by quantification, like being such that every F is a G, and the subvening set B does not. If B does not include such properties, there are no properties in B that entail them. As Bertrand Russell noted many years ago, “you cannot ever arrive at a general fact by [deductive] inference from particular facts, however numerous” (Russell 1918, 235; quoted in Bricker 2005). But general properties, nevertheless, logically supervene on particular ones: no two possible worlds can differ in what general facts hold without differing in what particular facts hold (see Skyrms 1981, Lewis 1992, and Bricker 2005). Thus, general facts logically supervene on particular facts, even though the latter do not entail the former.

The upshot is that the logical supervenience of property set A on property set B will only guarantee that each A-property is entailed by some B-property if A and B are closed under both infinitary Boolean operations and property-forming operations involving quantification.

3.3 Supervenience and Reduction

Everyone agrees that reduction requires supervenience. This is particularly obvious for those who think that reduction requires property identity, because supervenience is reflexive. But on any reasonable view of reduction, if some set of A-properties reduces to a set of B-properties, there cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference. This is true both of ontological reductions and what might be called “conceptual reductions”—i.e., conceptual analyses.

The more interesting issue is whether supervenience suffices for reduction (see Kim 1984, 1990). This depends upon what reduction is taken to require. If it is taken to require property identity or entailment, then, as we have just seen (Section 3.2), even supervenience with logical necessity is not sufficient for reduction. Further, if reduction requires that certain epistemic conditions be met, then, once again, supervenience with logical necessity is not sufficient for reduction. That A supervenes on B as a matter of logical necessity need not be knowable a priori.

3.4. Supervenience and Ontological Innocence

The issues about entailment and reduction are related to a question about whether supervenience with metaphysical necessity is ontologically innocent—whether the A-properties are anything “over and above” the B-properties.

Some think that supervenience—at least when accompanied by grounding; see sect. 3.5 below—is indeed ontologically innocent in this sense. After all, if the A-properties supervene with metaphysical necessity on the B-properties, then they come along automatically given the B-properties. To borrow Kripke’s metaphor (1972, 153–154), once God fixes the B-properties, she is all done; she does not need to do anything further to get the A-properties going. Indeed, she cannot block them. Given the distribution of B-properties, there is no further question about which A-properties are instantiated. So, it is claimed, the latter are nothing over and above the former. However, other people vigorously resist this idea. How can the A-properties not count as a further ontological commitment, if they are numerically distinct from the B-properties? (Both Jonathan Schaffer (2015) and Karen Bennett (2017, chapter 8.2) have recently argued that the best way to make sense of this is as follows. Grounded entities are nonfundamental, and nonfundamental entities do not count against the simplicity of a theory, although they do count towards the total number of things there are.)

This dispute is central to various issues in metaphysics and the philosophy of mind. For example, nonreductive physicalists often say that mental properties are distinct from but nonetheless “nothing over and above” physical ones. Their reductivist opponents, however, clearly think that this is illegitimate. This can be seen in the charge that nonreductive physicalists face the exclusion problem—that they are unable to account for the causal efficacy of the mental without claiming that all of its effects are “double-caused.” (See the entry on mental causation.)

Another example concerns composition. Some people—those who believe in “unrestricted mereological composition”—think that any two or more things whatsoever compose a larger thing. They typically claim that while the (single) fusion is not identical to its (many) parts (the exception is Baxter 1988), it does supervene on them, and is thus “nothing over and above” those parts. So, for example, there is a mereological fusion of your left elbow, Tony Blair, and the Mississippi River, and it is distinct from, but nothing over and above, those three parts. Lewis, speaking of a fusion of a trout and a turkey, says that “it is neither fish nor fowl, but it is nothing else: it is part fish and part fowl” (1991, 80) and that “mereology is innocent” (87). However, opponents of unrestricted mereological composition are unsurprisingly unconvinced: “what does ‘nothing over and above’ mean? This slippery phrase has had a lot of employment in philosophy, but what it means is never explained by its employers” (van Inwagen 1994, 210). Indeed, the thought that composition is not in the least ontologically innocent has led some to claim that there aren’t any composite objects (or that living organisms are the only composite objects; see van Inwagen 1990, Merricks 2001, Dorr and Rosen 2002, and the entry on mereology).

So, on the one hand, there is what might be called the “supervenience intuition”. Many nonreductive physicalists think that the metaphysically necessary supervenience of the mental on the physical means that mental properties are nothing over and above physical ones, and most (all?) believers in unrestricted mereological composition think that the metaphysically necessary supervenience of fusions on their parts means that fusions are nothing over and above those parts. On the other hand, there is what might be called the “distinctness intuition”—if mental properties and mereological fusions are distinct from physical properties and mereological atoms, respectively, then surely they count as something over and above them.

This can be made to look as though it is just a terminological issue about how to best use phrases like “nothing over and above” and “ontological innocence”. But there are very real issues here. The central difference between the two sides is that one emphasizes the fact that the two kinds of properties or entities are numerically distinct, and the other emphasizes the fact that there is nonetheless a close nonidentity relation between them. And what matters in any given case is i) just which particular nonidentity relation holds, and ii) whether the fact that that relation holds is enough to defuse whatever problem is on the table.

In the mereological fusion case, the issue is really just whether fusions exist at all. Those who believe in unrestricted mereological composition think that the existence of the atoms entails the existence of the fusions, and their opponents do not. The debate here is only about whether the fusions are (or would be if they existed) anything “over and above” their parts insofar as that would perhaps make them a significant ontological commitment, leading some (not Schaffer or Bennett; see above) to be suspicious of the principle of unrestricted mereological composition.

In the nonreductive physicalism case, the issue is about whether all nonidentity relations are on a par as far as the exclusion argument is concerned. Nonreductive physicalists think that mental properties supervene with metaphysical necessity upon physical properties (whether they are also entailed by physical properties depends upon what property-forming operations the set of physical properties is taken to be closed under; see Section 3.2). The interesting question is not whether this enables them to truly say that mental properties are “nothing over and above” physical ones, but rather whether it enables them to solve the exclusion problem. (For views that more or less say that it does, see Yablo 1987, Shoemaker 2001, Bennett 2003, Melnyk 2003). Note that this issue also arises in the case of mereological fusions; Merricks (2001) uses a version of the exclusion problem to argue against the existence of nonliving composites.

One more example, which is similar to the fusion case. We have just seen that general truths supervene with metaphysical necessity on particular truths, but are not entailed by them (Section 3.2). This led Russell to say that “you must admit general facts as distinct from and over and above particular facts” (1918, 236). It would be a mistake to focus too much on Russell’s claim that general facts are “over and above” particular facts; he clearly just means that they are numerically distinct from particular facts. The interesting issue is rather whether Russell is right that we must admit general facts into our ontology at all. (See Bricker 2005 for an argument to the contrary.)

All told, there may not be a straightforward answer to the question of whether supervenience with metaphysical necessity is ontologically innocent. Whether it is depends upon whether it is a tight enough relation to do the work required to solve whatever concern is in play, and that will obviously depend upon what that concern is. So whether metaphysically necessary supervenience is “ontologically innocent” may well depend upon the case. In one case, metaphysically necessary supervenience might do the job, in another case entailment might be required, and in another perhaps nothing short of numerical identity will do.

3.5 Supervenience, Grounding, and Ontological Dependence

There is now a large literature on grounding and ontological dependence, including an entry for each in this encyclopedia. Roughly, one fact grounds another when the latter obtains in virtue of the former: the former in some sense makes the latter obtain. It is a productive, generative relation. (Bennett 2017 claims that there are several such relations, which she calls building relations. Talk of production and generation naturally invites a question about the relation between grounding or building and causation; see Schaffer 2016, Bennett 2017 chapter 4, Bernstein 2017, and A. Wilson 2018 for discussion of the relation between grounding and causation.) Roughly, an entity ontologically depends on another when the former would not exist without the latter. Much, much more can be and has been said about these relations, but this is enough for our purposes.

Grounding and ontological dependence are distinct from each other. The simplest way to see this is by means of the kinds of case that revealed to David Lewis that causation is distinct from causal dependence (1973): preemption and overdetermination. Just as cases of causal overdetermination and preemption involve causation without causal dependence, so too do cases of ‘grounding overdetermination’ and ‘grounding preemption’ involve grounding without ontological dependence. For example, the fact that I exist grounds the fact that something exists, but the obtaining of the latter fact does not depend upon the obtaining of the former; the fact that something exists is massively overgrounded.

Because grounding and ontological dependence are distinct, the claim that supervenience is not the same as grounding is distinct from the claim that supervenience is not the same as ontological dependence. Nonetheless, many of the same considerations are relevant.

One such consideration is that these relations may not have the same relata. Supervenience is typically said to be a relation between properties or families of properties, but at least some of grounding’s advocates say that it is a relation between facts only (e.g. Rosen 2010, Audi 2012), and ontological dependence seems to obtain between members of a variety of ontological categories. However, it is not clear how seriously to take this kind of concern, since notions of fact supervenience and property grounding can easily be defined.

A second way to see that supervenience is not identical to either grounding or ontological dependence is to note that the latter two relations are widely (though not universally) thought to be irreflexive and asymmetrical. Nothing can ground or ontologically depend upon itself, and nothing can ground or ontologically depend on something that also grounds or depends on it. But as we have seen, supervenience is reflexive and not asymmetrical (see Section 3.2). (For challenges to the claim that dependence and/or grounding are irreflexive and asymmetric, see Jenkins 2011, Bliss 2014, Wilson 2014, and Barnes 2018; for a reply to these challenges, see Bennett 2017, sect. 3.2).

A third way to see that supervenience is not the same as either grounding or ontological dependence is that the following conditionals are false:

  • if A supervenes on B, B grounds A
  • if A supervenes on B, A ontologically depends on B

As McLaughlin put it in 1995, a mere supervenience claim does not entail any “in virtue of” claim. Here are a couple of ways to see this. As noted above, for any property F, being F supervenes on being ~F: two things cannot differ with respect to being F without differing with respect to being ~F. But, of course, being ~F does not ground being F, and being F does not ontologically depend on being ~F!

Another way to see that the conditionals are false is to notice that properties everything has necessarily and ones that nothing can possibly have supervene, with the same sort of necessity, on any property whatsoever. (The fact that the necessary and the impossible supervene on anything and everything poses not one but two problem for attempts to use supervenience to define physicalism. See Section 5.4.) The property being self-identical supervenes on the property being an antique; the property being both a kangaroo and not a kangaroo supervenes upon the property being dusty. The reason is simple enough. No two things can differ with respect to either necessary or impossible properties, period; thus no two things can differ with respect to such properties without also differing with respect to B-properties, for any property set B. Nothing can be both a kangaroo and not a kangaroo, so no two things can differ with respect to that property, and thus no two things can differ with respect to that property without also differing with respect to being dusty, or being purple, or being a steam engine, etc. But it is not the case that being both a kangaroo and not a kangaroo is ontologically dependent upon being dusty, or that being dusty grounds being both a kangaroo and not a kangaroo. Being dusty has nothing to do with it at all.

For yet another reason for denying that the supervenience of A-properties on B-properties entails anything about grounding or ontological dependence, see the discussion of certain forms of global supervenience in Section 4.3.5.

Author’s note: the main ideas in this section have been in place since the original 2005 edition, though the section was substantively revised in 2018 to be more careful about the differences between grounding, ontological dependence, and ontological priority. (The 2023 revision merely involved trivial edits.)

3.6 Supervenience, Realization, and Emergence

Like ‘supervenience’, both ‘realization’ and ‘emergence’ are philosophical terms of art. Their definitions are stipulative and thus can only be judged by their theoretical usefulness, not by accord with common usage.

Realization is primarily taken to be a relationship between properties, though derivative notions of property instance realization and state of affairs realization have been defined. We will focus on property realization. There is more than one use of the term ‘property realization’ in literature. Perhaps the leading use is the one found in the literature on the functionalist theory of mind. (See, e.g., Block 1980; Melnyk 2003, 2006). On the functional view of realization, one property G realizes another F just in case G occupies (or fills or plays) the causal role associated with F, ‘the F-role’—that is, just in case instances of G have the kinds of causes and kinds of effects that comprise the F-role. Thus, for instance, a neural property will realize pain just in case it has the kinds of causes and effects that comprise the pain-role. (According to analytical functionalism, the pain-role is the causal role that folk psychology associates with pain; according to psychofunctionalism, it is the causal role that scientific psychology associates with pain.) If more than one property plays the F-role, then F is multiply realizable. (See the entry on multiple realizability.)

Sydney Shoemaker (2007, chapter 2) defines a related notion of property realization, which he calls the ‘subset view of realization’. He says that “as a first approximation, property P has property Q as a realizer just in case (1) the forward-looking causal features of property P are a subset of the forward-looking causal features of property Q, and (2) the backward-looking causal features of P have as a subset the backward-looking features of Q” (2007, 12). Once again, if P has more than one realizer, then P is multiply realizable. (McLaughlin (2007) argues that this subset notion of realization, will not serve Shoemaker’s purposes.)

There are other, less well-entrenched notions of realization in the literature (e.g., Gillett 2003; Shoemaker 2007, chapter 3), but it would take us too far afield to spell these out in detail.

What is the relation between supervenience and realization, in either of the above senses? It looks like realization is sufficient for supervenience, at least for non-local versions of supervenience. But supervenience is not sufficient for realization, for reasons that are familiar from section 3.5: necessary properties supervene on anything, and properties supervene on their own negations. Further, because realization is a distinctively causal notion, there are additional considerations here. The interesting case has to do with epiphenomenal properties—those that have no causal powers and play no causal role. Perhaps mathematical properties are epiphenomenal in this way. Let F be such a property, and let it supervene upon G. F is not functionally-realized by G, since G does not play F’s distinctive causal role (F does not have one). So this is another reason to deny that supervenience is sufficient for functional realization. But F is Shoemaker-realized by G. That’s because F’s causal powers are the null set, and the null set is a subset of every set. Epiphenomenal properties are thus Shoemaker-realized by anything at all, including G. (Shoemaker’s view of realization, like his view about the causal individuation of properties (1980), is simply not well-suited to the epiphenomenal case.)

What about emergence? The term is used in a variety of ways, in the sciences as well as philosophy. These uses are so wildly divergent that it is not clear that there is a common core notion. (See the essays in Bedau and Humphreys 2008, in Gibbs, Hendry, and Lancaster 2019, Wilson 2021, and the entry on emergent properties.) But one canonical source of emergence talk is the British Emergentist tradition, particularly the work of C.D. Broad. Broad thought of emergent properties as fundamental properties possessed by complex objects (Broad 1925; McLaughlin 1992, 1997, 2019). A number of philosophers have suggested that Broad’s notion can be characterized by means of supervenience with mere nomological necessity (e.g. van Cleve 1990, Chalmers 2006). One question that arises, then, is whether the appeal to nomological as opposed to metaphysical necessity can distinguish emergence from tighter relations like realization; Jessica Wilson (2005; 2021, 143–149) and others have argued that it cannot.

3.7 Supervenience and Explanation

Supervenience claims, by themselves, do nothing more than state that certain patterns of property (or fact) variation hold. They are silent about why those patterns hold, and about the precise nature of the dependency involved (see Kim 1993, 167; 1998, 9–15; Blackburn 1984, 186; Schiffer 1987, 153–154; and McGinn 1993, 57). But few supervenience theses are plausibly brute, that is, unexplainable. It is natural to look further, and to try to explain why A-properties supervene on B-properties. When such supervenience is explainable, there is ‘superdupervenience’ (a term coined by William Lycan; see also Schiffer 1987; Horgan 1993; and Wilson 1999).

Sometimes it is easy to see what explains a supervenience thesis. Consider the examples of trivial supervenience relations from Section 3.5. It is obvious why there cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference if A is a set of necessary or impossible properties—namely, because there cannot be an A-difference at all. The supervenience relation is explained by the necessity or impossibility of the supervening properties. It is also obvious why A-properties supervene on A-properties. Of course, property identity claims are sometimes not a priori knowable; consider, for example, the fact that the property being water is identical with the property being H20. Still the fact that being water is identical with being H20 explains why there cannot be a difference with respect to being water without a difference with respect to being H20. And supervenience with only nomological necessity can be explained by appeal to laws of nature. It is in virtue of the Wiedemann-Franz Law that electrical conductivity supervenes with nomological necessity on thermal conductivity.

Because we expect supervenience theses to be explainable, it is hard for us to rest content with a supervenience thesis if we do not see what would explain why it is true. If it is claimed, for instance, that moral properties supervene on non-moral properties, we expect there to be an explanation of why this is so. Appeals to unexplainable supervenience theses can thus seem to be mystery mongering.

3.8 Tallying Up

Supervenience gives us less than some philosophers have thought. Even logically or metaphysically necessary supervenience is compatible with there being no B-properties that entail any A-properties. Supervenience is not itself explanatory, and does not guarantee that the A-properties either reduce to, ontologically depend upon, or are grounded by the B-properties. It might provide a way to capture the thought that A-properties or facts are not a further ontological commitment over and above the B-properties or facts, but this is controversial. At heart, all a supervenience claim says is that A-properties covary with B-properties. Nevertheless, as we shall see in Section 5, supervenience has a variety of philosophical uses.

4. Varieties of Supervenience

The slogan “There cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference” is applied both to particular individuals and to entire possible worlds. In the former case, the slogan expresses the idea that two individuals cannot differ in A-respects without also differing in B-respects. This sort of claim is an individual supervenience claim. In the latter case, the slogan expresses the idea that two possible worlds cannot differ with respect to their world-wide pattern of distribution of A-properties without also differing with respect to their world-wide pattern of distribution of B-properties. That sort of claim is a global supervenience claim. Both individual and global supervenience claims come in a variety of modal strengths. In this section, we will distinguish various forms of both individual and global supervenience, and examine some logical relationships among them.

4.1 Weak and Strong Individual Supervenience

Kim (1984, 1987) distinguished two different kinds of individual supervenience, weak and strong. They are defined by means of quantification over possible worlds, as follows:

A-properties weakly supervene on B-properties if and only if for any possible world w and any individuals x and y in w, if x and y are B-indiscernible in w, then they are A-indiscernible in w.

A-properties strongly supervene on B-properties if and only if for any possible worlds w1 and w2 and any individuals x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 is B-indiscernible from y in w2, then x in w1 is A-indiscernible from y in w2. (Kim 1987.)

x and y are A-indiscernible if and only if they are exactly alike with respect to every A-property; similarly for B-indiscernibility. (Here times are omitted, but of course objects may be A-indiscernible at one time, but not at another.) The possible worlds quantified over might include all metaphysically possible worlds, or only nomologically possible worlds (etc.), depending upon what degree of modal force is intended.

As the names indicate, strong individual supervenience is stronger than weak individual supervenience. (We shall hereafter follow established usage and drop the word ‘individual’ unless clarity requires it.) Weak supervenience says that there is no possible world that contains individuals that are B-indiscernible but A-discernible. Strong supervenience entails that there are no possible individuals that are B-indiscernible but A-discernible, whether they are in the same world or different worlds. When the range of worlds is the same, strong supervenience theses entail weak supervenience theses, but the latter do not in general entail the former. It is important to note, however, that when A is restricted to intrinsic properties, strong and weak supervenience are arguably equivalent; see Section 4.3.4.

Occasionally philosophers appeal to weak supervenience rather than strong supervenience. Hare, for example, said that his claim that value properties supervene on other properties was intended to be an appeal only to weak supervenience (1984, 4). And Davidson similarly claimed that his appeal to supervenience was intended to be an appeal only to weak supervenience (1985, 1993, esp. 4n4). (He said this in response to Kim (1984), who argued that Davidson cannot appeal to strong supervenience on pain of commitment to strict psychophysical laws, which are incompatible with Davidson’s well-known thesis of the anomalism of the mental, according to which there are no strict psychophysical laws. See the entry on anomalous monism.)

But appealing to weak supervenience while denying strong generates a certain explanatory burden. You will recall that we always want an explanation of why a supervenience relation holds (see Section 3.7). Thus someone who asserts a weak supervenience thesis but denies the corresponding strong supervenience thesis must provide an explanation of why the weak supervenience thesis is true that does not entail that the relevant strong supervenience thesis is true as well. And that can look mysterious: if there can be things in different worlds that are A-discernible but not B-discernible, why can’t there be two such things within a single world? If everything within each world that is B-indiscernible is A-indiscernible, how can different worlds enforce different BA property pairings? (See Blackburn on the need to explain the “ban on mixed worlds,” 1973, 1985, and especially 1984, 184.)

Sometimes there is an explanation of why weak supervenience holds despite the fact that strong supervenience does not. If, within a world, two individuals assert exactly the same propositions, then they are exactly alike vis-à-vis having asserted a true proposition: the one asserted at least one true proposition if and only if the other did. The reason is that a proposition will have a unique truth-value relative to a world. The following weak supervenience thesis thus holds: for any world w, and any individuals x and y in w, if x and y are indiscernible with respect to what propositions they have asserted, then they are indiscernible with respect to having asserted a true proposition. Contingent propositions, however, are true in some worlds and false in others. It is thus possible for two individuals in different worlds to assert exactly the same propositions, and yet differ with respect to having asserted a true proposition. The one might assert many true propositions, while the other fails to assert any true proposition. It follows that the following strong supervenience thesis is false: for any worlds w1 and w2, any individuals x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 is indiscernible from y in w2, with respect to what propositions they have asserted, then x in w1 is indiscernible from y in w2 with respect to having asserted a true proposition.

In contrast, it is by no means clear why mental properties would weakly supervene on physical properties without strongly supervening on them; and the analogous question arises for moral properties and nonmoral properties. Davidson and Hare owe us an explanation of why mental and moral properties weakly supervene, respectively, on physical and nonmoral ones—and it must be an explanation that does not entail that strong supervenience holds as well. Simon Blackburn’s well-known argument against moral realism basically constitutes an attempt to answer this question for Hare. Though Blackburn speaks of ‘supervenience’ and ‘necessitation’ rather than weak and strong supervenience, his argument against moral realism rests on exactly the demand for explanation that we have been exploring. He claims, 1) that moral properties weakly supervene on nonmoral properties, but do not strongly supervene on them, 2) that this requires explanation, and 3) that projectivists can do this better than moral realists (1973, 1985.) We are content to note that some such answer is required from anyone who holds a weak supervenience thesis without the corresponding strong supervenience thesis.

One final matter concerning the notions of weak and strong supervenience remains to be discussed. This is that they are sometimes formulated differently, by means of modal operators rather than quantification over possible worlds:

A weakly supervenesm on B if and only if necessarily, if anything x has some property F in A, then there is at least one property G in B such that x has G, and everything that has G has F, i.e., iff

□∀xFA[Fx → ∃GB(Gx & ∀y(GyFy))]

A strongly supervenesm on B if and only if necessarily, if anything x has some property F in A, then there is at least one property G in B such x has G, and necessarily everything that has G has F, i.e., iff

□∀xFA[Fx → ∃GB(Gx & □∀y(GyFy))]

(Kim 1984)

Notice that strong superveniencem is formulated just like weak superveniencem, except that it contains one more necessity operator.

Kim initially maintained that the modal operator versions are equivalent to the above possible world definitions of weak and strong supervenience respectively (see esp. 1987, 79–82). But they are not; they are stronger. On certain assumptions (e.g. that modal operators are to be understood as quantifiers over worlds), the modal operator versions of strong and weak supervenience respectively entail the possible world versions; but not vice versa (McLaughlin 1995).

The reasoning here is basically the same as that given in Section 3.2 above for why supervenience does not guarantee entailment. Both weakm and strongm supervenience say i) that it is necessary that everything that has an A-property has some B-property or other, and ii) that that B-property entails the A-property. But neither i) nor ii) follows from the possible world versions of either weak or strong supervenience—unless B is assumed to be closed under the Boolean operations of complementation, infinitary conjunction, infinitary disjunction, and property-forming operations involving quantification (McLaughlin 1995). Without that assumption, the possible worlds versions allow things with A-properties to lack B-properties altogether, and a fortiori to lack any B-property that entails their A-properties. Of course, possible worlds supervenience requires that each pair of B-less intraworld (weak) or interworld (strong) individuals must have the same A-properties, but the possible world versions allow B-less individuals to have A-properties. The modal operator versions do not.

It should therefore come as no surprise that the cases that served as counterexamples to the claim that supervenience is a form of entailment also serve as counterexamples to the equivalence of the possible worlds and modal operator formulations of supervenience. Being F strongly supervenes on being not-F, but fails to even weakly supervenem on it. {P & Q} strongly supervenes on {P, Q}, but fails to even weakly supervenem on it. The possible world versions of weak and strong supervenience are weaker than the corresponding modal operator versions. The latter go beyond the basic idea that there cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference. Again, though, the modal operator versions are equivalent to the possible worlds versions if the base set B is closed under Boolean operations, and operations involving quantification.

4.2 Regional Supervenience

Terence Horgan (1982) has proposed a version of supervenience in terms of individual regions of space-times, rather than in terms of objects. A weak and a strong version of Horgan’s “regional supervenience” can be formulated as follows:

A-properties weakly regionally supervene on B-properties if and only if for any possible world w and any space-time regions r1 and r2 in w, if r1 and r2 are B-duplicates in w, then they are A-duplicates in w.

A-properties strongly regionally supervene on B-properties if and only if for any possible worlds w1 and w2 and any space-time regions r1 in w1 and space-time region r2 in w2, if r1 in w1 is a B-duplicate of r2 in w2, then r1 in w1 is an A-duplicate of r2 in w2.

Regional supervenience is a form of individual supervenience that takes the individuals to be regions of space-time. Nonetheless, it is worth separate mention because Horgan (1982) has argued that it has some of the attractive features of global supervenience.

4.3 Global Supervenience

Often, claims of the form ‘there cannot be an A-difference without a B-difference’ are not made about individuals, nor about nonmaximal space-time regions, but rather about entire possible worlds. This is global supervenience, typically formulated as follows:

A-properties globally supervene on B-properties if and only if for any worlds w1 and w2, if w1 and w2 have exactly the same world-wide pattern of distribution of B-properties, then they have exactly the same world-wide pattern of distribution of A-properties.

The notion of a global supervenience thesis has been employed for a number of philosophical purposes. Notably, it has been used to characterize physicalism (see Section 5.4), and to capture David Lewis’ Humean supervenience thesis: “all there is to the world is a vast mosaic of local matters of particular factÉ all else supervenes on that” (1986a, ix-x).

Global supervenience is often claimed to serve purposes that neither strong nor weak individual supervenience will serve. First, it is sometimes claimed that global supervenience naturally handles relational properties like being an original Van Gogh or being a dollar bill. As we shall see, however, strong or weak supervenience can handle relational properties too. Second, global supervenience naturally handles the supervenience of factors other than properties or relations. On a Humean view of laws of nature, for instance, laws of nature are general facts that supervene on particular facts. But that can be captured by individual property supervenience, even if only in a baroque way. A third potential difference between global and individual supervenience is that the former, but not the latter, is compatible with the supervening and subvening properties being possessed by different individuals (see Haugeland 1982). Thus, for example, global supervenience is useful if there can be distinct but spatio-temporally coincident objects—it leaves room to say that the properties of a clay statue supervene upon the properties of the distinct lump of clay that constitutes it (see Section 5.5).

What the difference between individual and global supervenience really comes to will be discussed throughout the rest of this section.

4.3.1 Strong Individual Supervenience and Global Supervenience

It is clear that strong individual supervenience entails global supervenience (see Kim 1984). The question that has attracted attention is the converse—whether global supervenience entails strong individual supervenience. In this section, we describe the initial stages of this debate, which took place when the going notion of global supervenience was that outlined just above. In Section 4.3.2, we explain how that notion has been replaced by a family of more precise notions, and explore how it affects the question of whether global supervenience entails strong individual supervenience. (Most of the reminder of this section paraphrases McLaughlin 1995, 55–56.)

The debate began when Kim purported to show that “global supervenience is nothing but strong supervenience” (1984, 168). In response, Brad Petrie (1987) argued that global supervenience does not entail strong supervenience. His strategy was to try to provide a counterexample to a strong supervenience thesis that is not a counterexample to the corresponding global supervenience thesis. Here is his case. Let set A = {S} and that B = {P}. Consider two worlds w1 and w2 that are as follows: world w1 contains exactly two objects, x and y. And world w2 contains exactly two objects, x* and y*. The following purports to be a complete depiction of the contents of those worlds:

W1 W2
Px Px*
Sx ~Sx*
Py ~Py*
~Sy ~Sy*

The existence of w1 and w2 is incompatible with the thesis that A strongly individually supervenes on B because x in w1 is B-indiscernible but A-discernible from x* in w2. But the existence of these worlds is not itself a counterexample to the global supervenience of A on B. Since w1 and w2 do not have the same global pattern of distribution of B-properties, it seems not to matter that the worlds do not have the same global pattern of distribution of A-properties. Thus Petrie claimed that “since global supervenience is, and strong supervenience is not, consistent with this example, the two concepts of supervenience are not equivalent” (1987, 121).

In response, Kim conceded that global supervenience fails to entail strong supervenience (1987, 318), and went on to claim that Petrie’s example also shows that global supervenience fails to entail weak. Notice that w1 alone violates the weak supervenience of A on B, but also fails to be a counterexample to the global supervenience of A on B. Kim thus concluded that global supervenience fails to entail weak or strong individual supervenience.

Paull and Sider pointed out that these argument strategies are no good (1992). The problem is that one cannot simply point to two worlds that do not themselves falsify a global supervenience thesis, and then claim that the case is compatible with that thesis. Those two worlds might entail the existence of other worlds that are not compatible with the global supervenience thesis. A global supervenience thesis is a claim about all worlds, not just two. The upshot is that although a global supervenience thesis fails to entail either a weak or strong supervenience thesis in virtue of logical form, it might nevertheless be the case that plausible metaphysical principles entail that whenever the former holds, so does the latter.

Paull and Sider appeal to a plausible principle to show that the existence of Petrie’s w1 and w2 entail the existence of a pair of worlds that constitutes a counterexample to the global supervenience of A-properties on B-properties (1992, 838). The basic idea is that for any object in any possible world, there is another world containing an “isolated duplicate” of it. Intuitively, the duplicate exists all alone in its world; more precisely, an object y is isolated in a world “if and only if that world contains only (i) y, (ii) y’s parts, and (iii) objects whose existence is entail by any of the objects mentioned in (i) and (ii)” (1992, 838–9). Crucially, isolated duplicates share the intrinsic properties of the things with which they are duplicates. (Two caveats. First, this is not intended to be a definition of ‘intrinsic’. For some attempts to do so, see e.g., Lewis 1983a, Langton and Lewis 1998, and a variety of articles in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 63). Second, notice that the principle does not say that each thing can itself exist in isolation; it simply says that each thing has a duplicate that does. It consequently does not entail that nothing has any essential extrinsic properties.)

Paull and Sider’s isolation principle does the job. Consider again the worlds w1 and w2 that Petrie described. Petrie purported to describe the worlds in full. Thus, P and S are presumably supposed to be intrinsic properties. It follows from the isolation principle that there is a world w3 that contains an isolated duplicate of x—call it “z”—and a world w4 that contains an isolated duplicate of x*—call it “z*.” As Paull and Sider note, these worlds will be as follows:

W3 W4
Pz Pz*
Sz ~Sz*

Unlike w1 and w2, w3 and w4 constitute a counterexample to the global supervenience of A-properties on B-properties. They have the same pattern of distribution of B-properties, but different patterns of distribution of A-properties. So, Paull and Sider claim that Petrie failed to show that global supervenience does not entail strong supervenience.

But Paull and Sider went on to provide a new argument for that claim. They appealed to a set B containing just two properties, P and Q, and a set A containing only one property, M. An object has M just in case it has P, and some other object is Q. That is to say, Mx =df Px & ∃yQy. This definition guarantees that A globally supervenes on B. They then described the following two worlds:

W W*
Ma ~Mc
Pa Pc

This pair of worlds shows that A does not strongly supervene on B. And the principle of isolation cannot be applied to generate a counterexample to global supervenience. An isolated duplicate of a would be both A- and B-indiscernible from c (an isolated duplicate of a would not have M). Consequently, Paull and Sider concluded that global and strong supervenience are not equivalent. (1992, 841).

Klagge (1995) objected to this line of argument. He pointed out that Paull and Sider include an extrinsic property M in the supervenient set A, but only intrinsic properties P and Q in the subvenient or base set B. And, he claimed, if we allow that there are the sorts of property-forming operations required to construct extrinsic property M, then Paull and Sider have not exhaustively characterized worlds w and w*. For, given those property-forming operations, it is plausible that there will, for instance, be a property P# that can be defined as follows: P# =df Px & ∃y(yx). (Basically, a thing is P# just in case something else is P.) a in w and c in w* differ on this property; a has P# while c does not. That is right. But Klagge took that to show that w and w* do not provide a counterexample to the strong supervenience of A on B after all. That, however, does not follow. It would follow only if a and c thereby counted as B-discernible, and they do not. Paull and Sider stipulate that B contains only P and Q. Thus, a and c are B-indiscernible, despite the fact that a has P# and c does not.

But Klagge was clearly right that Paull and Sider’s example involves a supervenient set A that contains an extrinsic property and a subvenient set B that contains only intrinsic properties, and he was right that this is important. It invites the question whether global supervenience might entail strong supervenience when A and B are sets of intrinsic properties. And it invites the question whether global supervenience might entail strong supervenience when A and B both include extrinsic properties of certain sorts. Indeed, in response to Paull and Sider, Kim suggests that “equivalence seems to fail, through the failure of implication from global to strong supervenience, only when extrinsic properties are present in the supervenient set but disallowed from the subvenient base” (1993, 170; see also McLaughlin 1997a, 215). We will return to these questions in the next several sections. Answering them requires getting clearer about global supervenience; to this we now turn.

4.3.2 Different Versions of Global Supervenience

Until now, we have been relying mainly on a notion of global supervenience that is defined in terms of what amounts to a notion of A/B-indiscernibility of worlds:

A-properties globally supervene on B-properties if and only if for any worlds w1 and w2, if w1 and w2 have exactly the same world-wide pattern of distribution of B-properties, then they have exactly the same world-wide pattern of distribution of A-properties.

But what is meant by a ‘world-wide pattern of distribution’ of A- or B-properties? The notion is usually cashed out by appeal to the notion of there being a certain kind of isomorphism or mapping between worlds. For any property set f, define the notion of an f-preserving isomorphism as follows:

An isomorphism I between the inhabitants of worlds w1 and w2 preserves f-properties if and only if for any x in w1, x has a f-property P in w1 just in case the image of x under I (the individual to which I maps x) has P in w2.

This purposely avoids appeal to any special relationship that the mapped individuals may bear to each other (such, e.g., occupying corresponding locations in their respective worlds). This is to remain as neutral as possible on such issues, and because any features used to pick out the mapped things would automatically then globally supervene on any properties whatever (see McLaughlin 1995, 1997a). See Steinberg 2014 for an alternative way of characterizing world-wide patterns of property distribution.

Given this notion, various different forms of global supervenience emerge. Stalnaker 1996, McLaughlin 1996, 1997a, and Sider 1999 all distinguish between a weak and a strong notion of global supervenience, as follows:

A-properties weakly globally supervene on B-properties iff for any worlds w1 and w2, if there is a B-preserving isomorphism between w1 and w2, then there is an A-preserving isomorphism between them.

A-properties strongly globally supervene on B-properties iff for any worlds w1 and w2, every B-preserving isomorphism between w1 and w2 is an A-preserving isomorphism between them.

Shagrir (2002) and Bennett (2004a) have both formulated an intermediate version:

A-properties intermediately globally supervene on B-properties if and only if for any worlds w1 and w2, if there is a B-preserving isomorphism between w1 and w2, then at least one isomorphism between them is both A-and-B-preserving.

Indeed, any number of versions of global supervenience can be formulated, simply by specifying exactly how many A-and-B-preserving isomorphisms there must be between worlds between which there is a B-preserving isomorphism. Such versions all count as forms of intermediate global supervenience, however, and will be ignored in what follows. Notice too that it is not always clear which version is intended when someone appeals to the notion of global supervenience. Shagrir (2002) and Bennett (2004a) suggest that there is some reason to think that people often intend intermediate; Leuenberger (2009) argues that none of the precisified versions really captures the original concept. Shagrir later argued that strong does the most “justice to the notion of global supervenience” (2013).

It is easy to see that strong global supervenience entails intermediate global supervenience, which in turn entails weak global supervenience. If every B-preserving isomorphism between two worlds must itself be A-preserving, then if there are any B-preserving isomorphisms between two worlds at all, at least one of them must be A-preserving. So, strong global supervenience entails intermediate. And if at least one of any existing B-preserving isomorphisms between two worlds must itself be A-preserving, then it obviously follows that if there is a B-preserving isomorphism between two worlds, there must also be an A-preserving one. Thus, intermediate global supervenience entails weak global supervenience.

It is also easy to see that strong individual supervenience entails strong global supervenience. Suppose that A-properties fail to strongly globally supervene on B-properties. That means that there are two worlds w1 and w2 between which there is a B-preserving isomorphism that fails to be A-preserving. So, for some x in w1, the image of x under I in w2—call it y—has all and only the same B-properties as x in w1, but differs from x in w1 in at least one of its A-properties. But that is just to say that x in w1 is B-indiscernible yet A-discernible from y in w2. It follows that B-properties fail to strongly supervene on A-properties. Thus, strong individual supervenience entails strong global supervenience, and thereby also entails intermediate and weak global supervenience as well.

But strong global supervenience fails to entail strong individual supervenience, at least when A and B are any nonempty sets of properties. Showing this only requires tiny modifications to Paull and Sider’s argument that the notion of global supervenience spelled out just in terms of world-wide patterns of distribution of properties fails to entail strong individual supervenience (Section 4.3.1), and so we will not state the argument here. (See Shagrir 2002, 188.) Once again, the key to the argument is a case in which the supervening set contains extrinsic properties, and the subvening set does not.

Let us now see what is the case when the supervening and subvening property sets are brought into line with each other. Recall the earlier hypothesis that global and strong individual are equivalent when Paull-Sider style cases are blocked (see Section 4.3.1). So, then, does strong global entail strong individual when the supervening set contains only intrinsic properties? When the subvening set contains both intrinsic properties and all of the extrinsic properties that can be generated from them?

The answer to both questions is “yes.” And it turns out that related argumentative strategies can also be reapplied back to the case of weak and strong individual supervenience. We outline these strategies in the next two sections. However, some of the proofs themselves are complicated, and we thus refer to the reader to the original literature.

4.3.3 Equivalences for an Extrinsic Base

Strong global supervenience entails strong individual supervenience as long as the base set B is taken to be closed under complementation, infinitary conjunction, infinitary disjunction, and property-forming operations involving quantification and identity. Kim anticipates this equivalence (1993, 170), and Robert Stalnaker provides the proof (1996, 238). It should also be noted that John Bacon argues that if sets of properties A and B are closed under the operations mentioned above and also an operation he calls “resplicing,” then weak and strong individual supervenience both hold or fail to hold together (1986). For B to be closed under resplicing is for it to be the case that for any property P such that its extension Pw in a world w is the extension of some property in B, P is a member of B.

We have already noted that it is controversial whether such property-forming operations are legitimate, and, even if they are, we are often interested in property sets that are not closed under them. See Section 3.2. Still, so long as the property-forming operations are legitimate, then even if B itself is not closed under them, there will always be a larger set B+ which is. That is good enough to entail that for every strong global supervenience thesis there is a logically equivalent strong individual supervenience thesis. Indeed, if all of these property-forming operations (including Bacon’s resplicing) are legitimate, then there are property sets with respect to which weak individual supervenience, strong individual supervenience, and strong global supervenience are all equivalent.

But since there has been considerable dispute over the legitimacy of the various alleged property-forming operations, the issues remain unresolved.

4.3.4 Equivalencies for Intrinsic Properties

If we bring the property sets into line by restricting both the supervening and subvening sets to intrinsic properties—however exactly the notion of an intrinsic property is to be captured (see e.g. Langton and Lewis 1998)—we get even clearer results. Many varieties of supervenience turn out to be equivalent for intrinsic properties.

Both Shagrir (2002) and Bennett (2004a) argue that strong individual supervenience is equivalent to strong global supervenience when A and B are sets of intrinsic properties. Bennett also argues that in such a case even weak global supervenience entails strong individual supervenience. The argument relies upon Paull and Sider’s isolation principle, explained in Section 4.3.1 above; the basic idea is to show that any counterexamples to strong individual supervenience can be “isolated” to generate counterexamples to weak global supervenience—i.e., pairs of worlds between which there is a B-preserving isomorphism but no A-preserving one.

Here, again, we can also obtain related results about individual supervenience. Mark Moyer (2008) argues that weak and strong individual supervenience are equivalent in the special case of intrinsic properties. He appeals to a recombination principle similar to Paull and Sider’s principle of isolation, but with a twist. The intuitive idea is that any two things in any two worlds can be isolated from their surroundings and then put into a world with each other. More formally:

Recombination Principle. For any worlds w1 and w2, any individual x in w1 and any individual y in w2, there is a world w3 that contains individuals x′ and y′ such that x′ in w3 is an intrinsic-duplicate of x in w1 and y′ in w3 is an intrinsic-duplicate of y in w2.

If this principle is right, then any cross-world pair of individuals that witness the violation of a strong supervenience claim have intrinsic-duplicates within a single world. If the supervening properties are intrinsic, those duplicates will violate weak supervenience as well.

If all of these results are right, then weak individual supervenience, strong individual supervenience, weak global supervenience, intermediate global supervenience, and strong global supervenience are all equivalent in the special case when A and B are sets of intrinsic properties.

4.3.5 Individual and Global Supervenience Redux

In Section 4.3.3, we saw that weak and strong individual supervenience are equivalent to strong global supervenience in the special case in which the base set B is closed under certain property forming operations. And in 4.3.4, we saw that weak and strong individual supervenience, and weak, intermediate, and strong global supervenience are all equivalent in the special case in which A and B are sets of intrinsic properties. The upshot is that strong global and strong individual supervenience come apart “only when extrinsic properties are present in the supervenient set but disallowed from the subvenient base,” as Kim and others predicted (Section 4.3.1). See Shagrir 2009 for discussion of the case of relations.

However, weak and intermediate global supervenience are not equivalent to strong individual supervenience even when extrinsic properties are let into the base—more precisely, when the base is closed under the relevant property-forming operations. So, perhaps they have distinctive philosophical work to do, work that cannot be done by strong individual supervenience. For example, Sider (1999) appeals to weak global supervenience to handle cases of spatio-temporal coincidence, though he retracts this in his (2008). See Section 5.5.

But it is controversial whether these forms of supervenience are strong enough to be philosophically useful. As both Shagrir (2002) and Bennett (2004a) have pointed out, only strong global supervenience guarantees that the world-wide distribution of B-properties determines the world-wide distribution of A-properties. Both weak and intermediate global allow what is called ‘intraworld variation’—both allow B-indiscernible individuals in a world to have different A-properties. (Contrast weak individual supervenience, which allows crossworld variation, but does ban “mixed worlds.”) Indeed, weak global supervenience allows the A-preserving and B-preserving isomorphisms to be utterly independent of each other. Suppose some property being griffic merely weakly globally supervenes on the physical. Then although a world physically just like this one has to contain the same number of griffic things as this world, it does not matter which things they are. In this world it might be the Eiffel Tower and the Queen Mother; in the physical duplicate it might be a tea towel and the Grand Canyon.

In any case, those who assert a weak or intermediate global supervenience thesis while denying the corresponding strong global supervenience thesis need to provide an explanation of why weak or intermediate global supervenience holds that does not entail that strong global supervenience holds. (Recall the discussion of weak and strong individual supervenience in 4.1). That is, they need to explain what enforces the links between A- and B-preserving isomorphisms that are required by weak and intermediate global, without also enforcing the claim that every B-preserving isomorphism itself be A-preserving.

At present, these issues remain open, and the status of weak and intermediate global supervenience is controversial.

4.4 Similarity Based Supervenience

This essay has thus far focused on varieties of indiscernibility-based supervenience. But in some cases we might be interested in a notion according to which things that are very much alike in B-respects must also be very much alike in A-respects. This is similarity-based supervenience (Kim 1987). (The remainder of this section closely paraphrases McLaughlin 1995).

Weak and strong versions of similarity-based supervenience can be defined in the expected fashion:

A weakly supervenessim on B if and only if for any world w, and for any x and y in w, if x and y are not largely different with respect to B-properties, then they are not largely different with respect to A-properties.

A strongly supervenessim on B if and only if for any worlds w1 and w2, and for any x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 is not largely different from y in w2 with respect to B-properties, then x in w1 is not largely different from y in w2 with respect to A-properties.

These are versions of individual supervenience; global versions can also be formulated. Strong implies weak, but not conversely, except for the special case of intrinsic properties. (The latter can be shown by slight modification of Moyer’s argument mentioned in Section 4.3.4.)

Similarity-based supervenience is logically independent of indiscernibility-based supervenience: neither implies the other. Similarity-based supervenience fails to imply indiscernibility-based supervenience. It may be that there can be A-differences without B-differences, but that there cannot be large A-differences without large B-differences. And indiscernibility-based supervenience likewise fails to imply similarity-based supervenience. The reason is that there may be small B-differences that are critical points for big A-differences. When that happens, similarity-based supervenience will fail, even though indiscernibility-based supervenience may hold. For example, it might well be the case that small physical differences can be accompanied by large mental and moral differences. Similarly, a small physical difference like a misplaced brush stroke might have a large effect on the aesthetic value of a painting. Suffice it to note that it remains an open question whether there are any interesting philosophical uses of similarity-based supervenience.

4.5 Multiple Domain Supervenience

Thus far this essay has focused primarily on single domain supervenience (the exceptions are the discussions of weak and intermediate global supervenience). A form of supervenience counts as single domain when and only when the A- and B-properties are possessed by the very same individuals—when the way something is in A-respects is a function of the way it is in B-respects. Both weak and strong individual supervenience are clear cases of single domain supervenience. But in some cases, what we want to say is that there cannot be an A-difference in certain things without a B-difference in certain other things—distinct things to which the former things are related in a certain way. When and if this is the case, there is multiple domain supervenience.

One place such a notion seems useful is in discussions of coincidence and material constitution. Those who think that a clay statue is distinct from the lump of clay that make it up will claim that certain properties of the statue must supervene on properties of the lump of clay that constitutes it. For example, there could not be two statues that are discernible in shape without the statues being constituted by lumps of clay discernible in shape. For further discussion, see Section 5.5.

Kim (1988) has formulated a weak and strong version of multiple domain supervenience. Let D1 and D2 be non-empty domains of individuals, R be a relation between D1 and D2, and R|x be the subset of D2 to which x is R-related. We can define the following notions:

(A, D1) weakly multiple domain supervenes on (B, D2) relative to R just in case necessarily for any x and y in D1, if R|x and R|y are B-indiscernible, then x and y are A-indiscernible.
(A, D1) strongly multiple domain supervenes on (B, D2) relative to relation R just in case for any x and y in D1 and any worlds w1 and w2, if R|x in w1 is B-indiscernible from R|y in w2, x in w1 is A-indiscernible from y in w2. (Kim 1998)

When R is identity, these are equivalent, respectively, to single domain weak and single domain strong individual supervenience. It is because R might be a relation other than identity, for example material constitution, that the definitions have the potential for added utility. Here again, slight modification of Moyer’s argument (Section 4.3.4) can be used to show that weak and strong multiple domain supervenience are equivalent when the supervening set is intrinsic.

Coincidence-friendly supervenience is another kind of multiple-domain supervenience (proposed by Dean Zimmerman 1995, 88)). It can be formulated as follows (see Bennett 2004, 520):

Coincidence-Friendly Supervenience : For all x and y, and all worlds w1 and w2, if x in w1 is B-indiscernible from y in w2, then for each thing x* in w1 to which x is R-related, there is something y* in w2 that is R-related to y and that is A-indiscernible from x*.

That is a strong version, but a weak version can be formulated as follows:

Weak Coincidence-Friendly Supervenience: For any world w and any x and y in w, if x in w is B-indiscernible from y in w, then for each thing x* to which x is R-related in w, there is something y* that y is R-related in w and x* is A-indiscernible from y*.

Here again, when R is identity, these forms of supervenience are equivalent, respectively, to weak and strong individual supervenience. And here again, the weak and strong versions are equivalent when A is a set of only intrinsic properties.

Weak and strong coincident-friendly supervenience count as kinds of multiple-domain supervenience, but they differ from Kim’s weak and strong multiple domain supervenience in at least one important respect. The final quantifier in the definitions of coincident-friendly supervenience is existential, rather than universal as it is in Kim’s weak and strong multiple domain supervenience. As a result, Kim’s multiple domain supervenience says that if a and b are B-indiscernible, each thing R-related to a must be A-indiscernible from everything R-related to b. Coincidence-friendly supervenience says only that each thing R-related to a must be A-indiscernible from something R-related to b. This matters if R is B-indiscernibility, as it plausibly is in the case of spatio-temporal coincidence—the main philosophical application of multiple-domain supervenience.

Finally, Ralf Bader (2013) has developed versions of multiple-domain supervenience to model relations between complex entities and their parts, including those permitted by non-classical metrologies.

5. Applications

5.1 An Argumentative Strategy

Recall that everyone agrees that the reduction of A to B implies the supervenience of A on B (Section 3.3). This gives rise to one central use of supervenience. Arguing against a supervenience thesis that must be true if some program of reduction or conceptual analysis is to succeed is a common way of arguing that the program cannot succeed. McLaughlin (1984, 1995) calls this style of argumentation ‘argument by appeal to a false implied supervenience thesis’—or, for short, argument by appeal to a FIST.

Here are a few well-known arguments by appeal to a FIST. Suppose someone claims that there are neurophysiological properties, perhaps yet to be discovered, to which intentional properties like believing that P reduce. This claim implies that intentional properties supervene on neurophysiological properties. The Twin Earth thought experiments given by Tyler Burge (1979) and Hilary Putnam (1975) are (putative) counterexamples to that supervenience claim; they are cases of neurophysiologically indiscernible people whose thoughts have different contents.

Another argument by appeal to a FIST is Chalmers’ appeal to the (putative) metaphysical possibility of zombies (see Section 3.1 and Section 5.4). This is intended to show that phenomenal properties do not metaphysically supervene on, and thus do not reduce to, physical properties. This line of argument is available even though physicalists have not yet proposed any such reduction. If it succeeds, then the project of reducing phenomenal properties to physical properties is doomed to failure.

Consider a third example, from epistemology. A simple causal theory of perceptual knowledge says that a subject’s perceptual knowledge that P can be analyzed in terms of P’s bearing the right kind of causal relation to the subject’s belief that P. To test this claim, we need not await proposals as to what the kind of causal relation in question is. For this project of conceptual analysis can succeed only if two believers that P cannot differ with respect to perceptually knowing that P without differing with respect to how P is causally connected to their belief that P. Alvin Goldman’s fake barn country case (1976) yields a (putative) counterexample to this supervenience claim.

Of course, it is controversial whether any of these arguments succeed, because it is controversial whether the alleged counterexamples to the supervenience claims are really possible. But in all three cases, the style of argument is the same—argument by appeal to a FIST. (See McLaughlin 1984, 1995.)

5.2 Internalism/Externalism

Distinctions between internalism and externalism arise in many areas in philosophy—philosophy of mind, philosophy of language, epistemology, and ethics. All of these distinctions can be characterized by means of supervenience theses. For example, an internalist about mental content accepts, and an externalist denies, that what a mental state is about supervenes upon neurophysiological properties, or “what’s in the head.” The dispute is about whether two thinkers can differ in the contents of their mental states without also differing in some neurophysical respect. Similarly, an internalist about epistemic justification accepts, and an externalist denies, that whether a belief is justified supervenes upon the mental properties of the believer. The dispute is about whether two believers can differ in whether their beliefs are justified without also differing in some mental respect. And an internalist about moral motivation accepts, and an externalist denies, that moral motivation supervenes upon moral judgment. The dispute is about whether two (rational) people can differ in how they are motivated to act without also differing in their judgments about which of those actions they ought to perform.

Relatedly, supervenience can also be used to capture the traditional distinction between internal and external relations. As Lewis has noted (1986b, 62), an internal relation (such as being taller than) supervenes on the intrinsic natures of its relata. An extrinsic relation (such as being 3 kilometers from ) does not. The main difference between this case and those above is that here there is no real dispute about whether the supervenience thesis holds or not; it is widely agreed that there are two kinds of relations.

5.3 Haecceitism

Haecceitism is the view that identity properties, like being Kofi Annan or being that particular table, do not supervene on qualitative properties. On this view, every two numerically distinct things differ haecceitistically, but no other difference follows. Questions about whether there could be qualitatively indiscernible but numerically distinct things becomes important in modal metaphysics.

The issue here is an instance of something more general. Supervenience plays a useful role in answering questions about the identity and individuation conditions for things belonging to some kind. As Davidson pointed out, there is a prima facie puzzle (1980, ch. 5) about how to address such questions. The answer to the question “When are two events identical?” is trivial—“Never.” And the answer to the question “When is an event identical with itself?” is likewise trivial—“Always.” But surely there is a substantive question lurking here. Davidson himself opted to get around this worry by means of semantic ascent. But an alternative is to move to what David Lewis calls ‘a nonduplication principle’ (see J. Bennett 1988). Instead of asking when two events are identical, we can ask a fill in the blank question: ‘no two events can be just alike with respect to ______’? Davidson would fill in the blank with ‘their causes and effects’. Kim would fill in the blank with ‘their subject, time, and constitutive property’ (1976); others fill in the blank in other ways.

What matters here is just that nonduplication principles are supervenience theses. They are supervenience theses that take the supervening set A to be the identity facts for particular entities of whatever kind is in question. There cannot be a difference in whether an event has a property like being event e without a difference in its causes and effects (Davidson) or in its subject, constitutive property, and time (Kim). Note that any view that accepts a nonduplication principle for some sort of entity is ipso facto anti-haecceitist. Both Davidson and Kim are anti-haecceitists about events.

5.4 Characterizing Physicalism

Roughly speaking, physicalism is the view that somehow or other, everything is settled by the physical. This is of course vague along a number of dimensions. One question, beyond the scope of this essay, is what exactly ‘physical’ means (see Stoljar’s entry on physicalism). Another question is about the scope of the quantifier: should it really range over everything, or should the thesis be restricted to the mental (thus leaving room for non-physical entities like platonic numbers, abstract universals, or God)? While the sociological question of which of these theses is usually intended is also beyond the scope of this essay, the distinction will appear again. And a third question is what exactly ‘settled by’ means.

This last question is the relevant one here, because for a roughly 30 year period beginning with Davidson’s “Mental Events” (1970, 214), philosophers used supervenience as a placeholder for the needed relation. That is, physicalism was regularly characterized as the view that everything—or perhaps just the mental—supervenes on the physical. More specifically, it was frequently characterized as a i) metaphysically necessary ii) strong global supervenience thesis that is iii) restricted to only a certain range of worlds. We shall say a bit about each in turn, before mentioning the more recent turn to instead characterizing physicalism in terms of grounding.

5.4.1 Why say that the thesis is metaphysically necessary?

Physicalists take the supervenience thesis to hold with metaphysical necessity, because a merely nomologically necessary supervenience thesis is compatible with dualism. Dualists can maintain that there are fundamental psychophysical laws that maintain the supervenience connection (McLaughlin 1992, Chalmers 1996). Since no physicalist will agree, capturing physicalism requires a supervenience thesis that holds with full-blown metaphysical necessity.

5.4.2 Why use strong global supervenience?

Physicalism is characterized in terms of global supervenience as opposed to individual supervenience because an individual’s mental states do not locally supervene on her intrinsic brain states for reasons that do not impugn physicalism as intuitively understood. Notably, the contents of her propositional attitudes depend upon the surrounding environment if any kind of externalism is true (See Putnam 1975 and the entry on externalism).

But why strong global supervenience instead of one of the weaker two varieties, intermediate or weak (see 4.3.2)? The answer is that neither of those is strong enough. An intermediate global supervenience thesis would allow a world physically indiscernible from this one, in which precisely the same mental properties are instantiated as are instantiated here, but in which physically indiscernible individuals swap mental lives. A weak global supervenience characterization of physicalism would go further. It would allow a world physically indiscernible from this one, in which precisely the same mental properties are instantiated as are instantiated here, but in which they are differently distributed among entities without any restriction. For example, a weak global supervenience characterization of physicalism is compatible with the existence of a world physically indiscernible from this one in which Taylor Swift and Peter Singer exchange mental lives (see 4.3.5). Physicalism should not allow either sort of mental property swapping.

5.4.3 Why restrict the thesis to a certain range of worlds?

Still, physicalism cannot just be the thesis that the mental facts (or all the facts) strongly globally supervenience with logical/metaphysical necessity on the physical facts and laws, because many physicalists want to allow for the metaphysical possibility of things like ghosts or Cartesian souls. They think that there actually aren’t any such things, not that there could not be any, nor even that there could not be any compatibly with the physical facts of our world. They thus do in fact allow that two worlds could be physical duplicates but differ mentally, in virtue of only one of them containing disembodied spirits, say. (Note that because the worlds are physical duplicates, those spirits either exert no causal influence on the physical at all, or else only exert redundant, ‘overdeterministic’ causal influence on the physical.)

Various philosophers have offered various ways of defining physicalism to allow for this possibility, while continuing to rely upon global supervenience. The key in all cases is to limit the range of worlds in which the global supervenience thesis holds. For example, David Lewis took physicalism to be the claim that

Among worlds where no natural properties alien to our world are instantiated, no two differ without differing physically; any two such worlds that are exactly alike physically are duplicates (Lewis 1983b, 364).
Jackson offers the following:
Any world which is a minimal physical duplicate of our world is a duplicate simpliciter (Jackson, 1998, 12).

where a minimal physical duplicate is what results from duplicating all the physical facts and “stopping right there.” And David Chalmers says that physicalism is true in a world w just in case every positive fact that obtains in w also obtains in any world physically indiscernible from w (1996, 39–40). Each of these three definitions allows for worlds in which physicalism fails: worlds that are physical duplicates of the actual world, and in which there are ghosts or souls.

5.4.4 Beyond supervenience physicalism

Unfortunately, even these sophisticated supervenience formulations fail to provide an adequate characterization of physicalism. There are at least three reasons for this failure, and necessarily existing entities or necessarily obtaining facts generate not one but two of them.

Recall that necessary beings (whether entities, facts, or whatever) supervene on anything whatsoever, for the simple reason that such things exist in every world. Because no two worlds can differ in whether they exist, full stop, no two worlds can differ in whether they exist without differing in x, for whatever x you like (see section 3.5).

The first problem that necessary beings pose is only a problem for wide scope physicalism, the version of the view that says that truly everything, not just the mental facts, supervenes on the physical facts. The difficulty is that some putative necessarily existing things, like Platonic numbers or God, do not seem physicalistically kosher. Yet their actual existence is compatible with a global supervenience formulation of physicalism.

The second problem is a problem for both wide scope physicalism and a narrower version only about the mental. As discussed in section 3.5), the fact that necessarily existing things supervene on anything whatsoever shows that supervenience is not ontological dependence or determination. After all, the putative fact that God exists globally supervenes on the fact that my cat is named Snoop without the former in any way depending on the latter. This is supervenience on the cheap, not anything strong enough for physicalism. (For other putative counterexamples to the sufficiency of the supervenience thesis, see Witmer 1999 and Hawthorne 2002.)

The third issue is closely related to the second, though it doesn’t turn on necessary existence in particular. It is that many think the correct statement of physicalism should be in some way explanatory in a way that the bare supervenience claim is not. One version of this is to say that physicalism should say that the physical facts explain the mental ones. The supervenience claim alone says no such thing, as shown by the case of necessary existents as well as the case of properties supervening on their negations. A different version of this is to say that physicalism requires ‘superdupervenience’—that physicalism should explain why the relevant global supervenience theses holds (see Blackburn 1984, Horgan 1993, Melnyk 2003, and Wilson 2005). Concerns like these should be familiar from sections 3.5 and 3.7).

Some think that these concerns can be avoided by moving from characterizing physicalism in terms of supervenience to characterizing physicalism in terms of grounding (e.g. Rosen 2010, 111; Dasgupta 2014, 557; Schaffer 2017, section 4). Because grounding is supposed to be hyperintensional, it is not the case that necessary beings or facts are grounded by just anything. And grounding is supposed to back explanations as well.

However, whether the appeal to grounding really advances anything is a matter of dispute (Wilson 2016). See Stoljar’s entry on physicalism for further discussion. Further, note that we have only raised challenges for the claim that a strong global supervenience thesis is sufficient for physicalism. It remains open that some such thesis is necessary for physicalism. If it is, then grounding physicalism needs to entail supervenience physicalism. (For considerations against, see Skiles 2014; for considerations in favor, see Bennett 2017, 3.3.) And if it is, physicalism would remain testable by exposing it to would-be arguments by appeal to FISTS, such as the zombie argument.

5.5 Coincident Entities and the “Grounding Problem”

It is fairly widely held that more than one object can occupy the same spatio-temporal location. Such objects are said to be spatio-temporally coincident. The classic example is a statue, Goliath, and the lump of clay that constitutes it, Lumpl (see Gibbard 1975). On one version of the story, Lumpl sits around on a shelf for a few days before the sculptor shapes it into Goliath on a Thursday morning. It looks like Lumpl existed on the previous Wednesday and that Goliath did not, and consequently looks like Leibniz’s Law entails that they are distinct objects. On another version of the story, Lumpl and Goliath are created and destroyed at precisely the same moment. Here the two do not have different temporal properties, but they do have different modal ones—Lumpl would still exist if we squashed it into a ball, but Goliath would not. Again, Leibniz’s Law apparently entails that they are distinct. (See Rea 1997a for many interesting papers on this issue.)

The main objection to the view that Goliath and Lumpl are distinct is what can be called ‘the grounding problem’. How can Lumpl and Goliath differ in their modal properties, given that they are alike in every other way? What grounds their difference in persistence conditions? In virtue of what do they have the persistence conditions they do?

The grounding problem is sometimes characterized in terms of supervenience failure. Lumpl and Goliath differ in their persistence conditions without differing in their physical or categorical properties (see Yablo 1987 for a discussion of categoricity). And it is true that many forms of supervenience fail: weak and strong individual supervenience and strong global supervenience all fail. But there are forms of supervenience that can hold. Both weak and intermediate global supervenience hold, as does (as the name suggests) coincidence-friendly supervenience, and possibly other versions of multiple-domain supervenience (c.f. Zimmerman 1995, Rea 1997b, Sider 1999, Baker 2000). All of these forms hold on the plausible assumption that any two regions physically/categorically just like this one will contain an object with Goliath’s persistence conditions, and an object with Lumpl’s persistence conditions.

But the crucial question is not whether any form of supervenience holds, but rather whether those that hold constitute a satisfactory answer to the grounding problem. For a defense of the positive answer, see Sider 1999; for a defense of the negative answer, see Bennett 2004b. For a new take, see Sider 2008.


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