Theological Voluntarism

First published Tue Jul 2, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jun 4, 2019

There is a class of metaethical and normative views that commonly goes by the name ‘divine command theory.’ What all members of this class have in common is that they hold that what God wills is relevant to determining the moral status of some set of entities (acts, states of affairs, character traits, etc., or some combination of these). But the name ‘divine command theory’ is a bit misleading: what these views have in common is their appeal to the divine will; while many of these views hold that the relevant act of divine will is that of commanding, some deny it. So we would do well to have a label for this class of views that does not prejudge the issue of the relevant act of divine will. The label that I will use, following Quinn 1990, is ‘theological voluntarism.’

I have three aims in this article. I want first to distinguish metaethical versions of theological voluntarism from normative versions of that view, putting to the side normative versions. Second, I will say something about the main lines of defense of theological voluntarism, the various theoretical options that confront defenders of theological voluntarism, and some of the reasons for affirming or rejecting these different possible formulations. And finally I will say a bit about the sort of difficulties that seem to confront any such views. (I do not, however, give an account of the history of theological voluntarism in moral philosophy; for an anthology of readings covering a broad swath of this history, see Idziak 1979.)

1. Metaethical and normative theological voluntarism

To be a theological voluntarist with respect to some moral status is to hold that entities have that status in virtue of some act of divine will. But some instances of this view are metaethical theses; some instances of it are normative theses.

Consider, for example, theological voluntarism about the status of acts as obligatory or non-obligatory. One might hold that there is a single supreme obligation, the obligation to obey God. Every particular type of act that one might perform thus has its moral status as obligatory or non-obligatory in virtue of God’s having commanded the performance of acts of that type or God’s not having commanded acts of that type. This is a common version of divine command theory, according to which all of the more workaday obligations that we are under (not to steal from each other, not to murder each other, to help each other out when it would not be inconvenient, etc.) bind us as a result of the exercise of God’s supreme practical authority.

The view just described is a version of normative theological voluntarism. It is a normative view because it asserts that some normative state of affairs obtains—namely, the normative state of affairs its being obligatory to obey God. And it is a version of theological voluntarism because it holds that all other normative states of affairs, at least those involving obligation, obtain in virtue of God’s commanding activity.

Metaethical theological voluntarism, by contrast, does not assert the obtaining of any normative state of affairs. (For a contrary view, see Heathwood 2012, p. 7.) It is possible for one to be a metaethical theological voluntarist and to hold that no normative states of affairs obtain. Rather, metaethical theological voluntarists aim to say something interesting and informative about moral concepts, properties, or states of affairs; and they want to say something interesting and informative about them by connecting them to acts of the divine will. Metaethical theological voluntarists might claim that (e.g.) obligation is a theological concept, or that the property of being obligatory is a theological property, or that obligations are caused immediately by the divine will. But note that none of these views asserts that there are any obligations.

1.1 Theological voluntarism and theism

One does not have to be a theist in order to be a theological voluntarist. One can affirm normative theological voluntarism or metaethical theological voluntarism while failing to affirm theism; atheists and agnostics can be theological voluntarists of either stripe. With respect to normative theological voluntarism: one might claim that while it is true that any being that merits the title of ‘God’ merits obedience, we should not believe that there is such a being. (Compare: if, through some glitch in promotions, there happened to be no lieutenants in the army at some time, it would not cease to be true that privates ought to obey lieutenants. One could believe that that there are no lieutenants while believing that privates ought to obey their lieutenants.) With respect to metaethical theological voluntarism: one might claim that, for example, the concept of obligation is ineliminably theistic, though there is no God; that God does not exist counts not against metaethical theological voluntarism but rather against the claim that the concept of obligation has application. (Compare: one might believe that ‘sin’ is properly defined as ‘offense against God.’ One can clearly affirm this definition while rejecting God’s existence; all that one is committed to thereby is that there really are no sins.)

1.2 Theological voluntarism and moral skepticism

Call a ‘moral skeptic’ one who disbelieves or withholds judgment on the claim that any normative state of affairs obtains. One can affirm metaethical theological voluntarism while being a moral skeptic; one cannot affirm normative theological voluntarism while being a moral skeptic. A metaethical theological voluntarist might claim that no normative state of affairs could be made to obtain without certain acts of divine will, but because there is no God, or because there is a God that has not performed the requisite acts of will, no normative states of affairs obtain. A normative theological voluntarist cannot, however, be a moral skeptic. Because the normative theological voluntarist is committed to the obtaining of at least one normative state of affairs—for example, its being obligatory to obey God—the conjunction of moral skepticism and normative theological voluntarism is not a coherent combination of views.

My concern in the rest of this article will be with the metaethical version of theological voluntarism; any further references to theological voluntarism are, unless otherwise noted, to the metaethical version of the position. Theological voluntarism thus understood is consistent either with the affirmation or with the denial of theism and moral skepticism. Taking a negative stand on theism or a positive stand on moral skepticism should not prevent one from taking seriously theological voluntarism as a philosophical position. This is an important point, because it is often thought that theological voluntarism is only for theists, or only for moral nonskeptics. While it is true that some of the arguments for theological voluntarism take theism, or the existence of moral obligations, as premises, not all of them do.

2. Metaethical theological voluntarism

Metaethics is concerned with the formulation of interesting and informative accounts of normative concepts, properties, and states of affairs; and a metaethics that is a version of theological voluntarism will formulate such accounts in terms of some acts of divine will. This statement of the position is highly abstract, but it cannot be made less abstract without making difficult choices among rival formulations of the view.

2.1 Considerations in Favor

The considerations to be offered in favor of theological voluntarism are, at this level, similarly abstract. I will discuss three types of consideration: historical, theological, and metaethical.

Historical considerations in favor of theological voluntarism

Some of the considerations in favor of metaethical theological voluntarism are historical. Both theists and nontheists have been impressed by the extent to which at least some moral concepts developed in tandem with theological concepts, and it may therefore be the case that there could be no adequate explication of some moral concepts without appeal to theological ones. On this view, it is not merely historical accident that at least some moral concepts had their origin in contexts of theistic belief and practice; rather, these concepts have their origin essentially in such contexts, and become distorted and unintelligible when exported from those contexts (see, for example, Anscombe 1958).

Theological considerations in favor of theological voluntarism

Some of the considerations in favor of theological voluntarism have their source in matters regarding the divine nature. Several such arguments are summarized in Idziak 1979 (pp. 8–10). Some appeal to omnipotence: since God is both omnipotent and impeccable, theological voluntarism must be true: for if God cannot act in a way that is morally wrong, then God’s power would be limited by other normative states of affairs were theological voluntarism not the case. Some appeal to God’s freedom: since God is free and impeccable, theological voluntarism must be true: for if moral requirements existed prior to God’s willing them, requirements that an impeccable God could not violate, God’s liberty would be compromised. Some appeal to God’s status as supremely lovable and deserving of allegiance: if theism is true, then the world of value must be a theocentric one, and so any moral view that does not place God at its center is bound to be inadequate. Even if individually insufficient as justifications for adopting theological voluntarism, collectively they may suggest some desiderata for a moral view: that God must be at the center of a moral theory, and, in particular, that the realm of the moral must be dependent on God’s free choices. It seems that any moral theory that met these desiderata would count as a version of theological voluntarism.

Metaethical considerations in favor of theological voluntarism

A third set of considerations in favor of theological voluntarism has its source in metaethics proper, in the attempt to provide adequate philosophical accounts of the various formal features exhibited by moral concepts, properties, and states of affairs. One might claim, that is, that theological voluntarism makes the best sense of the formal features of morality that both theists and nontheists acknowledge.

Consider first the normativity of morals. Both theists and nontheists have been impressed by the weirdness of normativity, with its very otherness, and have thought that whatever we say about normativity, it will have to be a story not about natural properties but nonnatural ones (cf. Moore 1903, section 13). John Mackie, an atheist, and George Mavrodes, a theist, have both drawn from this the same moral: if there is a God, then the normativity of morality can be understood in theistic terms; otherwise, the normativity of morality is unintelligible (Mavrodes 1986; Mackie 1977, p. 48). As Robert Adams has suggested, given the serious difficulties present in understanding moral properties as natural properties, it is worthwhile taking seriously the hypothesis that morality is not just a nonnatural matter but a supernatural one (Adams 1973, p. 105). For the standard objections against understanding normativity as a nonnatural property concern our inability to say anything further about that nonnatural property itself and about our ability to grasp that property (see, e.g., M. Smith 1994, pp. 21–25). But if morality is to be understood in terms of God’s commands, we can give an informative account of what these unusual properties are; and if it is understood in terms of God’s commands, then we can give an informative account of how God, being the creator and sustainer of us rational beings, can ensure that we can have an adequate epistemic grasp of the moral domain (Adams 1979a, pp. 137–138).

Consider next the impartiality of morals. The domain of the moral, unlike the domain of value generally, is governed by the requirements of impartiality. To use Sidgwick’s phrase, the point of view of morality is not one’s personal point of view but rather “the point of view … of the Universe” (Sidgwick 1907, p. 382). But, to remark on the perfectly obvious, the Universe does not have a point of view. Various writers have employed fictions to try to provide some sense to this idea: Adam Smith’s impartial and benevolent spectator, Firth’s ideal observer, and Rawls’ contractors who see the world sub specie aeternitatis come to mind most immediately (Smith 1759, Pt III, Ch 8; Firth 1958; and Rawls 1971, p. 587). But theological voluntarism can provide a straightforward understanding of the impartiality of morals by appealing to the claim that the demands of morality arise from the demands of someone who in fact has an impartial and supremely deep love for all of the beings that are morality’s proper objects.

Consider next the overridingness of morals. The domain of the moral, it is commonly thought, consists in a range of values that can demand absolute allegiance, in the sense that it is never reasonable to act contrary to what those values finally require. One deep difficulty with this view, formulated in a number of ways but perhaps most memorably by Sidgwick (1907, pp. 497–509), is that it is hard to see how moral value automatically trumps other kinds of value (e.g. prudential value) when they conflict. But if the domain of the moral is to be understood in terms of the will of a being who can make it possible that, or even ensure that, the balance of reasons is always in favor of acting in accordance with the moral demand, then the overridingness of morals becomes far easier to explain (Layman 2006; Evans 2013, pp. 29–30).

Consider next the content of morals. There is a strong case to be made that moral judgments cannot have just any content: they must be concerned, somehow, with what exhibits respect for certain beings, or with what promotes their interests (cf. Foot 1958, pp. 510–512; M. Smith 1994, p. 40; Cuneo & Shafer-Landau 2014, pp. 404–407). Theological voluntarism has a ready explanation for the content of morals being what it is: it is that moral demands arise from a being that loves that being’s creation.

So there are some general reasons to think theological voluntarism promising. The reasons are stronger yet when one is proceeding from theistic starting points. (This is not trivial, since a number of theistic philosophers reject theological voluntarism.) But these reasons, while suggestive, are rather generic: they point to the promise possessed by theological voluntarism, though they do not fix for us on a particular formulation of the view. The general schema for a particular theological voluntarist position is ‘evaluative status M stands in dependence relation D to divine act A’ (cf. Quinn 1999, p. 53, which I follow here except to substitute the more general ‘evaluative’ for Quinn’s more specific ‘moral’). So there are at least three choices that have to be made. We need to say something about what sorts of evaluative statuses depend on God’s will. We need to say something about what are the relevant acts of divine will. And we need to say something about what the dependence relation is supposed to be. (These are not independent questions, of course.)

2.2 Which evaluative statuses?

A metaethical view can be more or less comprehensive, aiming to cover more or fewer evaluative statuses. A metaethical view might claim to provide an account of all evaluative notions, or of all normative notions, or of all moral notions, or or some set of moral notions. (Roughly, and taking the notion of an evaluative property as fundamental: for a notion to be normative is for it to be a certain sort of evaluative notion, one that is essentially action-guiding; for a notion to be moral is for it to be a certain sort of normative notion, one that exhibits impartiality.) No one claims that theological voluntarism provides an account of all evaluative notions. The real contenders are the latter three.

There are good reasons to reject the claim that all normative notions are to be understood in relation to God’s will. The main reason is that, as we will see below, it is important that there be items with normative statuses independent of God’s will in order to explain how God’s will, even if free, is not arbitrary. And it is not as if the view that some normative statuses are not to be explained in terms of God’s will must be repugnant to a theocentric metaethics: for, after all, one might understand such statuses in theological, even if not voluntaristic, terms. Adams, for example, understands some notions of goodness in terms of likeness to God, an understanding that is unquestionably theocentric though not voluntaristic (Adams 1999, pp. 28–38; also Murphy 2011, pp. 148–160).

Most of the current debate over the evaluative statuses to be explained by theological voluntarism, then, concerns whether the entire set or only some proper subset of moral statuses is to be understood in both theological and voluntaristic terms. Quinn’s 1978 work offers a theological voluntarist view on which all moral statuses are to be understood in terms of God’s will. But Adams rejects this view, and Quinn, following Adams and Alston (1990), eventually rejected it as well. These writers hold that only moral properties in the “obligation family,” properties like those of being obligatory, being permissible, being required, and being right (where being right involves a constraint on conduct, rather than being merely fitting), are to be understood in theological voluntarist terms. Call their view the restricted moral view; call the view that all moral statuses are to be understood in voluntarist terms the unrestricted moral view.

The restricted moral view has been defended with more and less impressive arguments. (See Murphy 2012.) The less impressive arguments are those that appeal to the idea that there must be moral properties that are not explained in terms of God’s will in order to deal with some of the classic objections to theological voluntarism. To preserve the notion that God is good, one might say, we need to restrict the aspirations of theological voluntarism to those of explaining a proper subset of moral notions, leaving the remainder for an account of God’s goodness; or, to make intelligible the commands that God chooses to give, we need to set aside some group of moral notions to be explained in other than theological voluntarist terms and that can therefore enter into our account of the intelligibility of God’s choices to give certain commands rather than others. But these considerations are not, after all, entirely persuasive. For one might well explain the notion that God is good and account for the intelligibility of divine commands by appeal to normative notions that are nonmoral. (See Section 3 below for further discussion of these arguments.)

More plausible are arguments that suggest that there is something in particular about obligation that makes it fit for a theological voluntarist explanation, some feature that is not shared with notions like moral virtue and moral good. Adams suggests, with some plausibility, that the notion of obligation is ineliminably social, that it must involve a relationship between persons, a relationship in which a demand is made (Adams 1987b, p. 264; also Adams 1999, pp. 245–246; for a nontheistic view defending a similar position, see Darwall 2006). This feature of obligation makes it different from notions of goodness and virtue, which do not seem to have this essentially social element. That obligation is special in this way does not, of course, show that notions of moral virtue and moral goodness do not also need to be treated in a theological voluntarist way. It could be that even if obligation most obviously requires this treatment, the points made earlier about the promise of theological voluntarism also extend to other moral notions, even if in a less pressing way. (See Section 3.3 for further discussion, and evaluation, of this point.)

There are no obviously decisive reasons for the theological voluntarist to adhere to either the restricted or the unrestricted moral view. (For a set of arguments that the restricted theological voluntarists have failed to avoid objections to theological voluntarism while leaving the positive arguments for the view intact, see Murphy 2012.) But theological voluntarists have wanted to say at least that the properties in the obligation family are to be accounted for in terms of this view. In the remainder of this article, it will be assumed that theological voluntarism is about properties in the obligation family, though we will occasionally consider how the view could be extended to other moral properties as well.

2.3 Which act of divine will?

Assume, then, that theological voluntarism is an account of obligation-type properties. A second issue concerning the proper formulation of the view concerns the relevant act of divine will. Is the requisite act of divine will to be understood as an act of commanding, or instead as some mental act like choosing, intending, preferring, or wishing? And if one holds that the act of the divine will is a mental act, should the mental act to which the theological voluntarist appeals in order to account for obligation be one whose object is the action that is made obligatory, or one whose object is the state of affairs that the action is obligatory? We have, to simplify matters, three options:

  • (1) That it is obligatory for A to φ depends on God’s commanding A to φ.
  • (2) That it is obligatory for A to φ depends on God’s willing that A φ.
  • (3) That it is obligatory for A to φ depends on God’s willing that it be obligatory for A to φ.

One might think that the central issue here would be to decide between the speech-act view (1) and the mental acts views (2) and (3); it might be thought to be less important, an issue of intramural interest only, to decide between (2) and (3). But this is not right. The important debate is between (1) and (2). For (3) is, understood in one way, no competitor with either (1) or (2); and understood differently, it has little argumentative support.

The dispute between (1) and (2)

There is an ongoing debate whether (1) or (2) is the better formulation of theological voluntarism about obligation. There are initially plausible points on both sides of the issue. In favor of (1), one might appeal to the centrality of the image of God as commander in the Abrahamic faiths. In favor of (2), one might appeal to the centrality to theistic belief and practice of the idea that doing God’s will is the standard for the moral life.

With only these initial points, there can be no resolution, and so defenders of these two formulations of theological voluntarism have sought other argumentative routes. One might try to reduce (2) to absurdity. One who is rational does not intend what one knows will not happen; and, on the orthodox conception of God, God is both rational and omniscient. This entails that God will never intend something that will not happen. If obligation arises from divine intentions, though, then no obligations will ever be violated. Since this is absurd, one should prefer (1) over (2). But defenders of (2) have a plausible response. First, defenders of (1) are in no better a position than defenders of (2). For it is a sincerity condition on the giving of commands that the commander intend that the commanded perform the action; and so if this objection reduces (2) to absurdity, the only way that the defender of (1) can avoid having his or her position reduced to absurdity is by holding that God is not necessarily sincere. Second, the notion of intention admits of various readings, and there is a reading of intention suitable for theological voluntarism that does not have the untoward result that no created rational beings could ever act contrary to a divine intention. It is standard to distinguish between God’s antecedent and God’s consequent will: God’s consequent will is God’s will absolutely considered, as bearing on all actual circumstances; God’s antecedent will is God’s will considered with respect to some proper subset of actual circumstances. (To use an example of Aquinas’s, one drawn from the discussion in which the distinction between antecedent and consequent will is made [Summa Theologiae, Ia, Q. 19, A. 6]: while in one way God wills that all persons be saved, in another way God does not will that all be saved; indeed, God wills that some persons be damned. What makes this coherent is that the sense of willing in which God wills that all be saved is antecedent: prior to a consideration of all of the particulars of persons’ situations, God wills their salvation; but in light of all of the particulars of persons’ situations—including the circumstance that some persons have willingly rejected friendship with God—God wills their damnation.) So while there is a sense in which it is true that all that God intends must come to pass, this sense is that of consequent intending rather than antecedent intending. On (2), then, one can say that the theological voluntarist holds that obligation depends on certain of God’s antecedent intentions. (See also Murphy 1998, pp. 17–21.)

We might ask, in order to bring the differences between these views better out into the light, what our considered opinion is in cases in which a divine antecedent intention that A φ and a divine command that A φ pull apart. It is far from clear that it is a real option for God to command that A φ while not intending that A φ. Though this possibility is endorsed by Wierenga 1983 (p. 390) and is at least entertained in Murphy 1998 (p. 9), for God to issue such a command would be for God to command insincerely—something that many would be loath to allow. (See also Adams 1999, p. 260 and Murphy 2002, 2.5). But the other option appears unproblematic enough. God might intend for humans to act a certain way while not commanding them to do so. In such a scenario, one might ask, is obligation engendered? If yes, then it seems to count in favor of the divine will view (2); if no, then it seems to count in favor of the divine command view (1).

Adams claims that obligations are not engendered in such cases; actually made demands are necessary. He offers three reasons for preferring the command conception in these cases. The first is that holding that obligation is a matter of divine command rather than divine will makes possible a distinction between the obligatory and the supererogatory: we can say that while God’s commands somehow makes certain acts obligatory, if God does will that we perform some act but does not command it, performing that act is supererogatory. The second is an appeal to the idea that theological voluntarism is a social conception of obligation: obligation arises in the context of the social relationship between God and created rational beings. (Not all versions of theological voluntarism affirm this; see the discussion of (3) below.) But, Adams says, in social relationships obligations arise only when demands are actually made. And the third reason is that there is something unsavory about obligations allegedly resulting from an act of divine will that is not expressed as a command: “Games in which one party incurs guilt for failing to guess the unexpressed wishes of the other party are not nice games. They are no nicer if God is thought of as a party to them” (Adams 1999, p. 261).

But the defender of the divine will view (2) has some responses available. The defender of this view can say, with respect to the first point, that a divine will view can capture the difference between the obligatory and the supererogatory not by appeal to the difference between acts of divine will that are expressed as commands and those that are not but rather as a difference between distinct types of act of divine will: the difference, say, between what God intends that we do and what God merely prefers that we do (cf. Quinn 1999, p. 56). Or, in the alternative, the distinction can be made within the divine will: one might characterize as obligatory those actions that God wills that one perform, and as supererogatory those actions that God wills that one perform if one is willing to do so, so that if one performs the action, one is doing what God wills, but if one does not, one is not doing what God wills that one not do. With respect to the second and third points, the defender of the divine will view can directly challenge Adams’ view that obligations generated within social relationships must always be expressed as demands. Spouses, for example, often take themselves to be obligated by what their spouses intend with respect to their behavior; indeed, it would be unseemly to hold oneself to be bound by one’s spouse’s will only if the spouse has actually made a demand on one. (“How can you blame me for not helping you empty the dishwasher? You didn’t tell me to!” does not often go over well.) One often wants another to perform some action without being told to; many actions have their value only through being performed without being prompted by a command. But, on (1), no act of the form ‘φ-ing, though God has not told me to φ’ could ever be obligatory.

Here is a thought experiment that may help to decide the dispute between these two camps. For it to be possible for one to give another a command to φ, there must be a linguistic practice available to the addressee in terms of which the speaker can formulate a command. This is not just for the sake of having the means to communicate a command: rather, commands are essentially linguistic items, and cannot be defined except in such terms. Imagine, though, that a certain created rational being, Mary, inhabits a linguistic community in which there is no practice of commanding. One can successfully make assertions to Mary, and among these assertions can be assertions about one’s own psychological states, but one cannot successfully command Mary to do anything. Here is the question: so long as Mary’s linguistic resources are confined to those afforded by this practice, can God impose obligations on her? The defender of (1) will have to say No: for Mary cannot be commanded to do anything. The defender of (2) will have to say Yes: God could have an antecedent intention that Mary perform some action and (to sidestep worries about being under an obligation that one cannot know about) could inform Mary that God has that intention with respect to her conduct.

The debate between defenders of (1) and defenders of (2) is ongoing, and at present far from conclusive. (For some recent interventions into this debate, see Mann 2005b, Miller 2009a, and Jordan 2012.)

Option (3)

The other formulation of theological voluntarism that we noted is that in which the act of divine will is that of willing that the state of affairs that it is obligatory for A to φ obtain. Unlike the formulations (1) and (2), which admit of various sorts of dependence relationship between the act of divine will and the obligation, (3) is limited to something like a causal picture. (It obviously could not be that its being obligatory for A to φ is identical to God’s willing that it be obligatory for A to φ, on pain of a vicious regress.) The idea expressed here is that ultimately all obligations are present because of efficacious acts of the divine will, in particular, acts of willing that those obligations be in force.

This account is compatible with (1) and (2), because it could be that the way that God makes it the case that an act is obligatory is necessarily through the giving of commands (as in (1)) or through antecedently intending (as in (2)) the performance of that action. So it is not really, in its most general form, a competitor to (1) and (2). It could be made a competitor by adding claims about the way that the divine will brings it about that these obligations obtain. A defender of (3) might add that on his or her view the divine intention that A be obligated to φ is the immediate, total, and exclusive cause of its being obligatory for A to φ (cf. Quinn 1999, p. 55). If so, then a divine command that A φ or a divine antecedent intention that A φ could not be partial or mediate causes of its being obligatory for A to φ. But note that even thus strengthened (3) is compatible with (1) or (2) understood as an identity claim: if the claim is that obligations just are divine commands or divine intentions, then the compatibility with (1) and (2) is reestablished.

Even if it turns out that (3) is not an obvious competitor with (1) and (2), it is still worth asking whether it is true. Though Quinn eventually rejected (3), at one point he argued for it by appeal to divine sovereignty: because every state of affairs that obtains that does not involve God’s existing depends on God’s will, a fortiori every normative state of affairs that does not involve God’s existing depends on God’s will. (Quinn thought that its being obligatory to obey God is a state of affairs that involves God’s existing [Quinn 1990, pp. 298–299], but for a reason to reject that claim see Murphy 1998, pp. 12–13.) It does not seem, though, that this argument would support (3) in the strengthened version that holds that the dependence must be immediate, total, and exclusive. After all, very few folks want to say that every state of affairs that is brought about by God’s will is brought about by God’s will exclusively, totally, and immediately. While it is plausibly part of theism that every state of affairs that obtains, apart from those that involve God, is somehow dependent on God’s will, this does not show that deontic states of affairs are more interestingly connected to the divine will than states of affairs involving mathematics, or physics, or accounting (Murphy 1998, pp. 14–16).

We may put (3) to the side, then. While some formulations of it may very well be true, those formulations for which there is argumentative support do not establish much in the way of interesting metaethical conclusions. The debate concerning whether (1) and (2) is the more adequate formulation of theological voluntarism is ongoing, and we should thus proceed in a way that is as far as possible neutral between the two (though admittedly unwieldy) by saying that As moral obligations to φ depend on God’s commands/intentions that A φ. (By ‘intentions’ I will mean antecedent intentions.) Allowing for both of these possibilities, what can be said about the relationship of dependence holding between divine commands/intentions and moral obligations?

2.4 What sort of dependence?

The third issue that must be dealt with in providing a formulation of theological voluntarism is that of the specification of the dependence relationship that holds between divine commands/intentions that A φ and the moral obligation of A to φ. There have been several options considered whose nature and merits are worth discussing here. On an analysis view, it is part of the meaning of ‘it is morally obligatory for A to φ’ that God commands/intends that A φ. On a reduction view, the state of affairs its being obligatory for A to φ is the state of affairs God’s commanding/intending that A φ. On a supervenience view, its being obligatory for A to φ supervenes on God’s commanding/intending that A φ. On a causal view, necessarily, its being obligatory for A to φ is caused by God’s commanding/intending that A φ, and necessarily, God’s commanding/intending that A φ causes it to be obligatory for A to φ.


The causal view is defended by Quinn (1979, 1990, 1999), and in a particularly strong form: on Quinn’s view, the causal connection between God’s antecedently intending that A φ and its being obligatory for A to φ exhibits totality, exclusivity, activity, immediacy, and necessity.

There are at least three serious difficulties for the causation formulation. The first we may call the ‘Humean worry’. Once we allow that its being morally obligatory to φ is distinct from God’s commanding/intending φ-ing, there is the question of what reason we would have for thinking that its being morally obligatory to φ necessarily obtains if God’s commanding/intending φ-ing obtains. And whatever answer the defender of this view offers, it must be consistent with the causation formulation of theological voluntarism. But it is unclear what would do the trick. One way to try to make this necessary connection is by holding that there is a prior moral obligation to obey God; and so, whenever God gives a command/has an intention that one perform some action, it follows that one is morally obligated to perform the action commanded/intended. But we cannot take this route, because if the causation formulation is correct, then all moral obligations are caused entirely by God’s commanding/intending activity; there cannot be, then, this prior moral obligation to obey God that would serve as part of the explanans for the necessary connection between divine commands/intentions and moral obligations.

The causal view that is a version of (2) (that is, that its being obligatory for A to φ depends causally on God’s willing that A φ) should be distinguished carefully from the causal view that is a version of (3) (that is, that its being obligatory for A to φ depends causally on God’s willing that it be obligatory for A to φ). The causal formulation of (3) has at least some plausibility as a result of God’s sovereignty and omnipotence—though it is in the end unclear why we should move from the claim that God is the ultimate source of all being to the claim that, for all deontic states of affairs, God’s willing that that deontic state of affairs obtain is the immediate, total, and exclusive cause of its obtaining. Most of us would not, after all, find intuitively compelling a move from the claim that God is ultimate source of all being to the claim that, for all physical states of affairs, God’s willing that that physical state of affairs obtain is the immediate, total, and exclusive cause of its obtaining. (That view is ‘occasionalism’, and occasionalism is a distinctly minority view even among theists; see Murphy 2011 (pp. 140–142) for a comparison between theological voluntarism and occasionalism.) The causal view as an instance of (2), though, seems to have even less in the way of argumentative support. Why would one think that God’s intending that A φ is an immediate, total, and exclusive cause of a deontic state of affairs’ obtaining? In the absence of some evidence for such a connection, it is hard to see why one would be attracted to this formulation of theological voluntarism.

The second worry about the causal formulation I will call the ‘lack of precedent worry’. Moral properties and states of affairs supervene on nonmoral properties and states of affairs. The intuitive idea is that there can be no differences in moral status without some difference in nonmoral status. The causal formulation satisfies the supervenience constraint—the differences in nonmoral status concern God’s commands/intentions—but it does so in a way that is unprecedented and mysterious. When we look at the specific ways in which changes in nonmoral facts can make a difference to the moral facts that hold, there is a pretty limited number of intelligible relationships that can hold between these nonmoral facts and the moral facts that supervene on them. A nonmoral fact can be part of what constitutes a reason to perform an action. (That you promised to φ can be cited in explaining why you have a reason to φ your promising to φ constitutes, at least in part, the reason that you have to φ.) It can be part of an enabling condition for that reason. (The existence of a social practice of promising can be cited in explaining why you have a reason to φ; the existence of that practice might explain why your promise has the reason-giving force that it has.) It can be cited as a defeater-defeater for a reason. (While the fact the promisee told you that you need not fulfill your promise to φ typically releases you from your promise to φ, the fact that you threatened to beat up the promisee if he or she did not tell you that you need not fulfill your promise invalidates that release, and can be cited in explaining why you have a reason to φ.) But while theological voluntarism holds that a fact—the fact that God commands/intends that one φ—explains why one has a reason (in this case, an obligation) to φ, the causal view holds that this fact falls into none of the familiar explanatory categories: it is not constitutive of the reason, it is not an enabling condition for the reason, it is not a defeater-defeater for the reason. The way that the fact is supposed to explain the reason is merely causal: it just brings the reason about, exclusively, totally, immediately. This is an entirely unfamiliar phenomenon: nowhere else do we encounter a merely causal connection between a nonmoral fact and a moral one. (The appeal to the very strangeness of divine causation itself is not sufficient to answer the objection. For there is an extra strangeness here: that the relationship between nonmoral and moral facts is in every case with which we are familiar a rational relationship, whereas on the causal formulation of theological voluntarism the relationship is merely causal. Creation ex nihilo does not constitute carte blanche to multiply strangenesses. Interestingly, though, Wielenberg 2018 (p. 18), which rejects the project of theistic ethics, appeals to just this sort of causation to explain the supervenience of the moral on the non-moral.)

The third worry is the ‘no authority worry’. Theological voluntarism can be defended on the basis of considerations proper to metaethics—that, for example, theological voluntarism provides the best explanation for the impartiality of morals, or for its overridingness, or for its normativity, or for its content. But theological voluntarists have tended to argue that theological voluntarism has something specific to offer to theists. One of these benefits on offer is that theological voluntarism fits well with the centrality of the virtue of obedience in theistic thought and practice (Quinn 1992, p. 510; Adams 1973, pp. 99–103). God is a being who is to be obeyed, is someone who is a practical authority over us.

For one to be a practical authority over another is, at least, for one to have some sort of control over others’ reasons for action. Whatever else practical authority is, it is the ability to make a difference with respect to someone’s reasons to act. The control involved in practical authority is, however, of a specific sort: it is constitutive control. When a party is an authority over another, his or her dictates constitute, at least in part, reasons for action for that other. (One piece of evidence for this is that when we take A to be an authority over us, we will cite ‘A told us to’ as a reason for action.) But if God’s commands to φ have merely causal power to bring about obligations to φ, then the resultant state of affairs that is the reason for action is its being obligatory to φ—a state of affairs that need not be in any way constituted by God’s issuing any commands. No version of theological voluntarism that is built simply around God’s causal role in actualizing moral obligations implies that God is a practical authority. (See Murphy 2002, 4.3.)


The supervenience account is defended by Hare (2001). Suppose that we continue to interpret supervenience intuitively as the no-difference-in-moral-properties-without-some-difference-in-nonmoral-properties thesis. We can see very quickly that the theological voluntarist has to say something more about the sort of supervenience he or she has in mind in order to present what is genuinely a theological voluntarist account of moral obligation. For suppose that one puts forward a view on which both of the following claims are true: the moral law does not depend on, nor is it identical with, God’s commands; but God necessarily commands us to follow the moral law. While it is obvious is that this not a version of theological voluntarism at all—moral obligation in no way depends on divine command—it satisfies the intuitive description of what is involved in the supervenience of the moral on the nonmoral: for there could be, on this view, no differences in moral status without some difference in divine commands. So if one is to put forward a supervenience formulation of theological voluntarism, then one will have to either be a little bit more doctrinaire about the supervenience relationship, so that it will exclude the nonvoluntarist view just described, or one will have to say more than that moral obligations supervene on divine commands. For our purposes here, they come to the same thing: that there is something more to the supervenience formulation of theological voluntarism than the claim that there are no differences in agents’ moral obligations without some differences in the divine commands that have been imposed on that agent.

What is called for here is, pretty obviously, just some particular relationship of ontological dependence. It will not be that of causation, for reasons we have already examined. But neither does the defender of the supervenience view want it to be the extreme dependence of moral obligations on divine commands affirmed by the reduction formulation, on which moral obligations just are divine commands. To avoid collapse into the reduction formulation, it has to hold that moral obligations are distinct from divine commands. It can make this distinction in one of two ways. It could say that moral obligation is wholly distinct from divine command—that is, that the state of affairs its being morally obligatory to φ is not constituted even in part by God’s commanding φ-ing. Or it could say that moral obligation is only partially constituted by divine command—that is, that the state of affairs its being obligatory to φ, while not identical with God’s commanding φ-ing, includes the state of affairs God’s commanding φ-ing (and some other state of affairs besides). Let us consider each of these possibilities in turn.

Suppose first that the defender of the supervenience view affirms that moral obligation is wholly distinct from divine command. If so, then all of the arguments that were raised against the causation formulation can be leveled against the supervenience view. The no authority issue will arise. Because the states of affairs its being obligatory to φ and God’s commanding φ-ing will be distinct, the supervenience account lacks the resources to underwrite divine authority. For God is authoritative only if God’s commands are themselves reasons for action, but if the states of affairs its being obligatory to φ and God’s commanding φ-ing are distinct, then God’s commands will not be themselves reasons for action on the adequately strengthened supervenience view. And if these commands are not themselves reasons for action, then God does not constitutively actualize reasons for action by His commands; and if God does not constitutively actualize reasons for action by His commands, then God is not authoritative. The lack of precedent issue will arise. For the adequately strengthened supervenience view cannot view obligations as constituted by divine commands, and no theological voluntarist worthy of the name will see God’s commands as merely enablers or defeater-defeaters for obligations; and so the relationship between divine commands and moral obligations is bound to be unprecedented and mysterious. And the Humean issue will arise. For the causation view is, after all, just the adequately strengthened supervenience view plus the claim that the dependence relationship involved in a particular sort of causal dependence. So, understood as affirming a dependence relationship between wholly distinct moral obligations and divine commands, the supervenience view has all of the problems of the causation view.

So the only hope for the supervenience formulation is to hold that God’s commands are proper parts of moral obligations: for if those commands are identical with moral obligations, then the supervenience view collapses into the reduction view, and if moral obligations are wholly distinct from divine commands, then the supervenience view fails for the reasons that the causation view fails. There are, however, serious difficulties for this partial constitution version: in particular, if one is committed to saying that God’s commanding φ-ing partly constitutes its being morally obligatory to φ, it is hard to see what state of affairs the theological voluntarist would be tempted to say is also necessary for moral obligation to be fully constituted. Obviously this other state of affairs cannot be one that involves moral obligation, on pain of circularity. (So, the theological voluntarist cannot say that its being morally obligatory to φ just is the complex state of affairs consisting both of God’s commanding φ-ing and its being morally obligatory to do what God commands.) Further, in order to remain faithful to the basic idea of the supervenience version, we would have to say that any state of affairs that is held to constitute its being morally obligatory to φ along with God’s commanding φ-ing must be a state of affairs that is certain to obtain if God’s commanding φ-ing obtains. Otherwise, it might be the case that its being morally obligatory to φ does not supervene on God’s commanding φ-ing, for there would be two possible worlds, in both of which God’s commanding φ-ing obtains, but in only one of which does its being morally obligatory to φ obtain. This runs contrary to even the basic idea of the supervenience view, on which there are no differences in moral obligations without a difference in divine commands.

These limitations make it hard to imagine what a motivated version of this form of the supervenience view would look like. We have to imagine a view of the following form. It is nonnegotiable that the state of affairs its being morally obligatory to φ is partially constituted by God’s commanding φ-ing. It is nonnegotiable that there is, apart from God’s commanding φ-ing, at least one state of affairs S that partially constituted its being morally obligatory to φ. It is nonnegotiable that S either obtains necessarily or at the very least necessarily obtains if God’s commanding φ-ing obtains (otherwise moral obligation would not supervene on divine command). And it is nonnegotiable that S not involve moral obligation. The only remotely plausible candidates for S that come to mind are normative states of affairs that fall short of the obligatory, for example, φ-ing’s being good (or virtuous, or praiseworthy). One might say, for example, that its being morally obligatory to φ is constituted jointly by God’s commanding φ-ing and φ-ing’s being virtuous. But it is unclear what motivation one would have for affirming such a position. It cannot be for the sake of making sure that God cannot impose a moral obligation to do something that is not virtuous: for, ex hypothesi, we know already that φ-ing’s being virtuous obtains whenever God’s commanding φ-ing obtains, for otherwise its being morally obligatory to φ would not supervene on God’s commanding φ-ing.

The difficulty that faces the defender of the supervenience view can be framed as a dilemma. If the defender of that view holds that the state of affairs its being morally obligatory to φ is wholly distinct from God’s commanding φ-ing, then he or she is refuted by the considerations that refute the causation view. If, on the other hand, the defender of the supervenience view holds that the state of affairs its being morally obligatory to φ is partially but not wholly constituted by God’s commanding φ-ing, then there is pressure to explain why he or she does not simply affirm the reduction view, on which its being morally obligatory to φ just is God’s commanding φ-ing. Unless the defender of the supervenience view identifies the state of affairs that, in addition to God’s commanding φ-ing, makes for a moral obligation to φ, then his or her unwillingness to adopt the reduction view will look unmotivated and arbitrary.


According to the analysis view, defended in Adams 1973, the concept of the morally obligatory is to be analyzed as that of being commanded by a loving God. Adams did not put this view forward as an account of the meaning of ‘obligation’ generally, but only of its meaning as employed in Judeo-Christian moral discourse. As evidence for this analysis, Adams appealed to the freedom with which users of that discourse moved between claims of the form ‘x is obligatory’ and ‘x is God’s will’ or ‘x is God’s command.’

There are a couple of central difficulties for this position. The first is that it seems to imply that those inside and those outside the Judeo-Christian practice of moral discourse have never disagreed when one has affirmed a claim of the form ‘ φ-ing is obligatory’ and the other denied a claim of that form. For they do not, on Adams’ account, mean the same thing when they use these terms. In atheistic moral discourse, a masterful user of the language can say ‘it is not true that God has commanded φ-ing, but φ-ing is nonetheless obligatory’; in Judeo-Christian moral discourse, on Adams’ view, one shows oneself to be either unintelligible or not a masterful user of moral language if one were to speak thus. Adams was aware of this difficulty, and attempted to mitigate it: he argued that the agreement over which items the term ‘obligatory’ applied to, and the appropriate attitudinal and volitional responses to those things correctly described as ‘obligatory,’ made possible substantive moral discourse (Adams 1973, pp. 116–120). But all this seems to do is to explain how a simulacrum of genuine moral discourse is preserved; it does not show that what we get is the real thing.

The second difficulty is that of dealing with those within the Judeo-Christian tradition of moral discourse who employed or continue to employ moral language in a way that is out of step with Adams’ analysis. Now, it is not sufficient to refute a suggested analysis of some term that users of that term have questioned or even rejected that analysis. But if we take the task of analyzing terms to be that of making explicit and systematizing the platitudes employing that term affirmed by masterful users of that term (Smith 1994, pp. 29–32), and we note that many thoughtful Jews and Christians who otherwise appear to be masterful users of the language of moral obligation have rejected, either explicitly or implicitly, the notion that an act is obligatory if and only if it has been commanded by God, then we would have some reason to doubt whether the analysis formulation of theological voluntarism is defensible.


Adams’ maneuver in the face of these difficulties was to move from the analysis to the reduction version of theological voluntarism. He decided that the meaning of the term ‘morally obligatory’ was common to theists and nontheists. There is a common concept of the morally obligatory, a common concept that makes possible substantive agreement and disagreement between theists and nontheists. This common concept is neutral between theism and nontheism. But, following the now standard Kripke-Putnam line, Adams affirms that there are necessary a posteriori truths, among which are included property identifications. He argued that the property being wrong is identical to the property being contrary to the commands of (a loving) God because the property being contrary to the commands of (a loving) God best fills the role assigned by the concept of wrongness (Adams 1979a, pp. 133–142; see also Adams 1999, pp. 252–258). By conceptual analysis alone we can know only that wrongness is a property of actions (and perhaps intentions and attitudes); that people are generally opposed to what they regard as wrong; that wrongness is a reason, perhaps a conclusive reason, for opposing an act; and that there are certain acts (e.g. torture for fun) that are wrong. But given traditional theistic beliefs, the best candidate property to fill the role set by the concept of wrongness is that of being contrary to (a loving) God’s commands. For that property is an objective property of actions. Further, given Christian views about the content of God’s commands, this identification fits well with widespread pre-theoretical intuitions about wrongness; and given Christian views about human receptivity to divine communication and God’s willingness to communicate both naturally and supernaturally, God’s commands have a causal role in our acquisition of moral knowledge (Adams 1979, p. 139; see also Adams 1999, pp. 257).

The reduction formulation avoids the most troublesome implications of the analysis formulation, for it allows that there is a common concept of obligation, so that those within the Judeo-Christian tradition and those outside it can engage in moral debate and can have substantive agreements and disagreements with each other, and so that those within the Judeo-Christian tradition can raise substantive questions about the relationship between God and obligation without ipso facto excluding themselves from the class of masterful users of the moral concepts of that community. The reduction formulation allows that the concept of obligation may be nontheistic while the property that best fills the role assigned to it by that concept is a theistic one.

Analysis vs. reduction

Nevertheless, it remains an open question whether the reduction view is superior to the analysis view. One might argue that Adams’ analogy to ‘H2O is water’ is inappropriate, as the identification with water with H2O is clearly a posteriori, whereas the identification of the morally obligatory with the commanded by God is a priori. For if Adams is right in his characterization of the concept of obligation, it is not as if those who do not have the ability to infer from ‘this is morally obligatory’ to ‘this is commanded by a loving God’ (and vice versa) are just missing out on an interesting extra fact, the way that those without rudimentary chemistry are missing out on an interesting extra fact if they do not know that water is H2O. The term ‘water’ can play its role in our practical lives perfectly well without our knowing that it is H2O. The term ‘morally obligatory’ cannot play its role in our practical lives without our knowing that the morally obligatory is the commanded by God. No unintelligibility creeps into the life of agents that do not grasp that water is H2O; unintelligibility creeps into the life of agents that do not grasp that the morally obligatory is what is commanded by God.

Why might one think that the masterful use of ‘morally obligatory’ requires recognition that the morally obligatory is what is commanded by God? If Adams is right, it is part of the meaning of obligation that obligations are social in character (Adams 1999, p. 233) and involve actually made demands by one party in the social relationship on another (Adams 1999, pp. 245–246). It is the fact that a demand is actually made that gives sense to the notion that one has to perform an action, rather than merely that it would be good, even the best, to do it (Adams 1999, p. 246). But if it is part of the meaning of ‘morally obligatory’ that one is part of a certain social relationship in which demands are actually made, then it is no longer just an interesting further fact that the property that best answers to the concept ‘morally obligatory’ is the property being commanded by God. Rather, one who denies that there is a God or that God actually makes demands on human beings must fail to use the term ‘morally obligatory’ masterfully. For think of the other marks of the moral, especially those of impartiality and overridingness. For one to think of an act as obligatory is for one to think of it as being actually imposed on one as a demand; for every obligation, on Adams’ view, there is someone who imposes that obligation by commanding. It is clear a priori that the only being that could impose the sort of obligation that could plausibly be classified as moral would be God. How, then, could one be a masterful user of ‘moral obligation’ without grasping that moral obligations are demands imposed by God?

This analysis view would not, unlike Adams’ earlier formulation, require the subdivision of linguistic communities. One could say that the meaning of ‘morally obligatory’ includes ‘being commanded by God,’ for both theists and nontheists. Those who do not grasp that it is of the essence of obligations to be divinely commanded—whether theists or nontheists—fail to be masterful users of the language of moral obligation. To embrace this view is to return to the position of Anscombe 1958, according to which we should hold that the concept of obligation is inherently theological. On this view, we should not allow that Judeo-Christian moral practice has a different concept of obligation. Rather, the theological understanding of obligation is the authentic one, and nontheological concepts of obligation are unintelligible truncations.

3. Perennial difficulties for metaethical theological voluntarism

Apart from the difficulties that must be handled by particular formulations of theological voluntarism, there are a number of objections that have been levelled against theological voluntarist views as such. A wide variety of these objections are helpfully discussed in Quinn 1999 (pp. 65–71) and Evans 2013 (pp. 88–117). Here I will consider only two objections, but they are the two that are characteristically taken to be the most powerful perennial objections to theological voluntarism: first, that theological voluntarism is incompatible with any substantive sense in which God is good; second, that theological voluntarism entails the arbitrariness of morality. While these objections have been answered plausibly in recent formulations of theological voluntarism, the way that these objections have been answered leave theological voluntarists open to a different objection: that theological voluntarism is not adequately motivated as a philosophical position, even for theists. I conclude with a brief discussion of this worry.

3.1 Theological voluntarism and God’s goodness

God is, by definition, good. This is both a fixed point concerning God’s nature and a plausibility-making feature of theological voluntarism. If one were to deny that God is good (understood de dicto—that is, ‘if there is a being that qualifies as God, then that being is good’), one would call one’s own competence in use of the term ‘God’ into question. And even if it were allowed that one can employ the term ‘God’ masterfully while denying that God is good, if one were to deny that God is good, then one would undercut one’s capacity to defend theological voluntarism. For theological voluntarism is plausible only if God is an exalted being; but a being that is not good is not an exalted being.

That God is good is a fixed point for theistic discourse in general and for theological voluntarism in particular provides the basis for a common objection to theological voluntarism: that theological voluntarism makes it impossible to say that, in any substantive sense, God is good. The most straightforward formulation of the objection is as follows. For God to be good is for God to be morally good. But if moral goodness is to be understood in theological voluntarist terms, then God’s goodness consists only in God’s measuring up to a standard that God has set for Godself. While this is perhaps an admirable resoluteness—it is, other things being equal, a good thing to live up to your own standards—it is hardly the sort of thing that provokes in us the admiration that God’s goodness is supposed to provoke.

Now, one might dispute the claim that if God’s goodness consists simply in God’s living up to a standard that God has set for Himself, then that goodness is far less admirable than we would have supposed. (See, for a nice discussion of this issue, Clark 1982, esp. pp. 341–343.) Suppose, though, that we grant this part of the argument. How powerful is the objection from God’s goodness against theological voluntarism?

As we noted earlier, theological voluntarism comes in a variety of strengths. One dimension along which a theological voluntarist view might be assessed as stronger or weaker is in terms of the range of normative properties that it attempts to account for in theological voluntarist terms. The strength of the objection from God’s goodness is directly proportional to the size of the range of normative properties that one wishes to explain in theological voluntarist terms (see also Alston 1990). If one wishes only to account for a proper subset of moral notions, such as obligation, with one’s theological voluntarism, then the objection from God’s goodness is very weak; if one wishes to provide a sweeping account of normativity in theological voluntarist terms, then the objection is much stronger.

Suppose, for example, that one defends a version of theological voluntarism that accounts only for obligation. If moral obligation only is dependent on acts of the divine will, one can appeal to moral notions other than deontic ones in order to provide a substantive sense in which God is good. Granting to some extent the force of the objection, we can say, on this view, that God’s moral goodness cannot consist in God’s adhering to what is morally obligatory. But there are other ways to assess God morally other than in terms of the morally obligatory. Adams, for example, holds that God should be understood as benevolent and as just, and indeed concedes that his theological voluntarist account of obligation as the divinely commanded is implausible unless God is thus understood (Adams 1999, pp. 253–255). The ascription to God of these moral virtues is entirely consistent with his theological voluntarism, for his theological voluntarism is not meant to provide any account of the moral virtues. One can hold that God’s moral goodness involves supereminent possession of the virtues, at least insofar as those virtues do not presuppose weakness and vulnerability. God is good because God is supremely just, loyal, faithful, benevolent, and so forth. It seems that ascribing to God supereminent possession of these virtues would be enough to account for God’s supreme moral goodness: it is, after all, in such terms that God is praised in the Psalms.

It has been argued that this appeal to God’s justice is illegitimate within a theological voluntarist account, because what is just is a matter of moral requirement, and so to suppose that God’s acting justly is metaphysically prior to God’s imposing all moral requirements by way of commanding is incoherent (Hooker 2001, p. 334). But the theological voluntarist may deny that acting justly is morally required prior to God’s commanding it, any more than acting courageously, temperately, or prudently are morally required prior to God’s commanding us to act courageously, temperately, or prudently. Just as one can coherently acknowledge the excellence of temperance while wondering whether one is morally obligated to act temperately, one can coherently acknowledge the excellence of justice while wondering whether one is morally obligated to act justly. It thus seems an available strategy for the theological voluntarist who holds a restricted view of the range of moral properties explained by God’s commands/intentions to appeal to justice in accounting for God’s goodness.

Matters become more difficult for theological voluntarist views that aim to provide accounts of all moral notions in terms of God’s will. If one held to such an ambitious version of theological voluntarism—if one were to hold, say, that a state of affairs is morally good because it is a state of affairs that God wishes to obtain for its own sake, and that a character trait is a moral virtue because it is a property that God wants one to have for its own sake, and that an action is morally obligatory because it is antecedently intended by God, and so forth—then obviously the gambit employed by the less ambitious theological voluntarist is unavailable. The more ambitious theological voluntarist should hold, instead, that God’s goodness is not to be understood in moral terms. God’s being good might be understood in terms of God’s being good to us, where us includes all created rational beings, or all created sentient beings, or whatever class of created beings to which one thinks that God has a special relationship. What it is for God to be good to us would be for God to be loving—to will each of our goods, and to do so in a way that plays no favorites. This understanding of ‘loving’ does not run afoul of theological voluntarism construed as an account of all moral goods, because ‘our goods’ is to be interpreted in terms of prudential goodness, what makes each of us well-off (but see Chandler 1985).

Suppose, though, that one were to go all the way, holding that theological voluntarism is the correct account of all normative notions: on this extremely ambitious view, anything that is intrinsically action-guiding depends on God’s will. I think that the ‘God is good to us’ understanding of God’s goodness is ruled out on this approach: for the notion of ‘good to us’ is a normative notion. Perhaps one could hold, on this view, that ‘God is good’ affirms of God some sort of metaphysical goodness, fullness of being. This surely makes God exalted, but it is not clear whether the will of such a being is plausibly understood as the source of all normative statuses. It is also less than clear that ‘God is good,’ on this reading, is the claim that God possesses a particular perfection, rather than is merely a reminder that God has a variety of perfections.

To sum up, then: for each of the various formulations of theological voluntarism, there seems to be some way of answering the charge that the view undercuts the notion that God is good. But the strain needed to answer the charge becomes greater the wider the range of normative properties that the formulation of theological voluntarism aims to explain.

3.2 Theological voluntarism and arbitrariness

It is also an extraordinarily popular charge against theological voluntarism that it entails, objectionably, that morality is arbitrary. There is, however, more than one objection here, and the different objections need to be distinguished and answered individually. One claim is that theological voluntarism implies that God’s commands/intentions, on which moral statuses depend, must be arbitrary. A distinct claim is that theological voluntarism implies that the content of morality is itself arbitrary, that it is of the essence of morality to exhibit a certain rational structure, and that theological voluntarism precludes its having that structure. I will consider each of these objections in turn.

One arbitrariness objection against theological voluntarism is that if theological voluntarism is true, then God’s commands/intentions must be arbitrary; and it cannot be that morality could wholly depend on something arbitrary; and so theological voluntarism must be false. In favor of the claim that if theological voluntarism were true, then morality would be arbitrary: morality would be arbitrary, on theological voluntarism, if God lacks reasons for the commands/intentions that God gives/has; but because theological voluntarism holds that reasons depend on God’s commands/intentions, it is clear that there could ultimately be no reason for God’s commanding/intending one thing rather than another. In favor of the claim that morality could not wholly depend on something arbitrary: when we say that some moral state of affairs obtains, we take it that there is a reason for that moral state of affairs obtaining rather than another. Moral states of affairs do not just happen to obtain.

Just as in the case of the objection from God’s goodness, the strength of this version of the objection from arbitrariness depends on the formulation of theological voluntarism that is being attacked. The arbitrariness objection becomes more difficult to answer the stronger the relationship between God’s intentions/commands and moral properties is held to be; and it becomes more difficult to answer the more normative properties one attempts to account for by appeal to God’s intentions/commands.

The arbitrariness objection has less force if one holds that, say, only moral obligations are to be accounted for by theological voluntarism. The claim made by the objector is that morality is arbitrary on theological voluntarism, because God has no reason for having one set of commands/intentions rather than another. But this is so only if one appeals to the very strong form of theological voluntarism on which all normative states of affairs depend on God’s will. If one holds that only moral obligations are determined by God’s will, then God might have moral reasons for selecting one set of commands/intentions rather than another: that, for example, one set of commands/intentions is more benevolent, or just, or loyal, than another. If one holds that all moral properties are determined by God’s will, then God might have nonmoral reasons for selecting one set of commands/intentions rather than another: that one set of commands/intentions is more loving than another. The fewer normative properties that a version of theological voluntarism attempts to account for, the less susceptible it is to the claim that theological voluntarism implies the arbitrariness of God’s commands/intentions. (For further discussion of the role that restriction of theological voluntarism to a proper subset of normative statuses has had in answering these perennial objections, see Murphy 2012.)

Now, one might respond on behalf of this version of the arbitrariness objection that even if it is true that there can be reasons for God to choose the commands/intentions that God chooses, it is unlikely that these reasons would wholly determine God’s choice of commands/intentions, and so there would be some latitude for arbitrariness in God’s choices/intentions. But of itself this is not much of a worry. The initial claim pressed against theological voluntarism was that it made all of God’s commands/intentions ultimately arbitrary, and morality could not depend on something so thoroughly arbitrary. But the chastened claim—that there is some arbitrariness in God’s commands—is far less troubling on its own. We are already familiar with morality depending to some extent on arbitrary facts about the world: if one thinks about the particular requirements that he or she is under, one will note straightaway the extent to which these requirements have resulted from contingent and indeed fluky facts about oneself, one’s relationships, and one’s circumstances. It does not seem that allowing that God has some choices to make concerning what to command/intend with respect to the conduct of created rational beings that are undetermined by reasons must introduce an intolerable arbitrariness into the total set of divine commands/intentions. (See also Carson 2012.)

Allowing for such pockets of divine discretion does not provide backing for this version of the objection from arbitrariness, but rather offers a premise for the other version of the objection from arbitrariness. This other version of the objection from arbitrariness holds that moral states of affairs exhibit a certain rational structure that they would not have if theological voluntarism were true. Here is the idea, roughly formulated. Suppose that some moral state of affairs obtains—that it is the case that murder is wrong, or that lying is objectionable, or that courage is a virtue, or that Sharon’s snubbing me in that way was unforgivable. The idea is that for any such moral state of affairs, the following is true: either we can provide a justification for the obtaining of that moral state of affairs, or that moral state of affairs is necessary. A justification of an obtaining moral state of affairs A is some obtaining moral state of affairs B (where A is not identical with B), which in conjunction with the other non-moral facts entails that A obtains. So, for example: it may be the justification for murder’s being prima facie wrong that murder is an intentional harm (non-moral fact) and intentionally harming is prima facie wrong (obtaining moral state of affairs). Now, presumably not all moral states of affairs can be justified: eventually there will be basic moral states of affairs, for which no justification can be given. But it would be very unsatisfactory to say that these basic moral states of affairs just happen to obtain. So any basic moral states of affairs must obtain necessarily. Perhaps unrelieved suffering’s being bad is a state of affairs of this sort, or perhaps rational beings’ being worthy of respect.

The claim that the structure of morality is not arbitrary is, put positively, the claim that every obtaining moral state of affairs either has a justification or is necessary. And, thus, what those who claim that theological voluntarism entails that morality is objectionably arbitrary mean is that if theological voluntarism is true, then there are some moral states of affairs that both lack a justification and are not necessary. The view that God’s commands/intentions are not wholly determined by reasons offer our basis for holding that there are some moral states of affairs that both lack a justification and are not necessary. For consider some act of φ-ing that is not subsumed under any other issued divine command and which is such that God lacks decisive reasons to command or not to command its performance. In the possible world in which God issues a command to φ, there is a moral state of affairs—its being obligatory to φ—which lacks a justification (for the action is subsumed under no other divine command) and is not necessary (for God might have failed to command the action).

One might respond to this sort of worry by proposing that what God commands/intends with respect to human action, God commands/intends necessarily. But this seems either to understate the divine freedom or to overstate the determination of God’s commands by reasons (Murphy 2002, pp. 83–85). More plausible is the denial of the claim that morality must exhibit the particular structure presupposed in the objection. While I think that in general the subsumption model of justification is innocuous enough—even particularists can affirm it, if they affirm even the most minimal doctrine of moral supervenience—its appeal to necessary moral states of affairs as the only proper starting point is dubious. It is not clear why the starting points for justification have to be necessary moral states of affairs, for two reasons.

First, if these moral states of affairs are basic, then of course their moral status must not be explained by appeal to other moral states of affairs, but that does not mean they must be necessary; they might be contingent, and have their moral status explained in some way other than an appeal to another moral state of affairs. It could be, for example, that the explanation of them appeals to a contingent nonmoral state of affairs plus some necessary state of affairs concerning a connection between that contingent nonmoral state of affairs and the moral state of affairs. Theological voluntarism would be an instance of this latter model. (For a discussion of a similar objection raised against theological voluntarism by Ralph Cudworth (1731), and a similar response on behalf of theological voluntarism, see Schroeder 2005.)

Second, the appeal to necessary moral states of affairs as the stopping point for explanation seems to assume that necessary moral states of affairs somehow are not in need of explanation. But the very fact that some state of affairs obtains necessarily does not entail that its obtaining does not require explanation, and there is no reason why moral states of affairs would be special on this score. So one might think that not only is it possible for justifications to bottom out in contingent moral states of affairs, there is no reason to think that such justifications are as such any less adequate than justifications that bottom out in necessary moral states of affairs. (See Murphy 2011, pp. 47–49.)

3.3 Is theological voluntarism adequately motivated?

Both with respect to the objection from God’s goodness and with respect to the objection from arbitrariness, the now-standard theological voluntarist response is not to bite the bullet but rather to restrict the range of normative properties of which theological voluntarism is supposed to provide an account. So Adams, Quinn, and Alston all recommend theological voluntarism only as a theory about properties like being morally obligatory, and not about any other normative properties. The worry is that allowing that there is adequate motivation to refuse to understand these other normative properties in theological voluntarist terms might commit one to holding that there is adequate motivation to refuse to understand obligation-type properties in theological voluntarist terms. Look, one might say: if you are willing to hold that all moral properties other than those in the obligation family are to be understood in non-theological voluntarist terms, what is to stop us from holding that obligation is to be understood in non-theological voluntarist terms as well? If we are willing to give up theological voluntarism in some moral domains, why not in all of them?

The most well-developed account of why we should treat obligation as special is Adams’, on which obligation is apt for theological voluntarist treatment because of its intrinsic link to demands made within social relationships (Adams 1987b, and Adams 1999, pp. 231–258; see also Evans 2014, p. 27). But it is also unclear whether this is persuasive. We may grant that obligations result from demands, but only if we emphasize (as Adams does) that it is demands from authorities that result in obligations. But what makes someone an authority is that by his or her dictates he or she can give reasons for action of a certain kind. There is some dispute over what kind of reasons they must be, but for our purposes we can just follow Joseph Raz, who holds that genuine authorities give “protected reasons” by their dictates, where a protected reason to φ is a reason to φ and a reason to disregard some reasons against φ-ing. If one is an authority over another with respect to φ-ing, then one’s dictate that the other φ is a protected reason for the other to φ (Raz 1979, p. 18).

But now here is the question. We agree that obligations arise from authoritative dictates. And we agree that for a dictate to be authoritative is for it to constitute a certain sort of reason, let us say a protected one. But why, then, would we identify obligations with protected reasons that result from demands, rather than (as Raz does) with protected reasons themselves, whatever their source? If, after all, there were other ways of producing protected reasons other than through the giving of commands, what would be the point of saying ‘oh, but though there is a protected reason to φ, it isn’t really obligatory to φ.’ Surely if there were any point to this remark it would be purely verbal, and of no philosophical / normative interest.

It turns out, then, that whether Adams’ move is enough to motivate theological voluntarism about obligation is dependent on whether there are in fact any protected reasons (or reasons of whatever structure that one thinks that authoritative dictates must give) that are not dependent on demands being made. If there are such reasons—which natural law theorists, for example, would hold—then Adams’ gambit will not work, and the theological voluntarist will have to look elsewhere for motivation to understand obligation in those terms.

Now, one might say that by appealing to the idea that obligations arise from demands made within social relationships as the basis for the theological voluntarist’s account of moral obligation, we are misconstruing the key claim that they make about the social nature of obligation. The social nature of obligation, voluntarists might retort, first and foremost concerns the fact that when one is under an obligation, there is someone else who is entitled to hold one accountable for failures to adhere to the content of that obligation (Adams 1999, p. 233; Evans 2013, p 14). In the case of the moral law, the party who has standing to hold us accountable is God.

Even if one accepts this claim about the nature of obligation — it has some plausibility, as there is some basis for holding that not everything that one has protected reason to do counts as obligatory — and the claim that only God has adequate standing to hold us accountable for adhering to morality, it is still not at all clear how to provide a satisfactory rationale for a theological voluntarist view of moral obligation. For theological voluntarism with respect to moral obligations holds that the existence of moral obligations depends on God’s bringing them about via God’s command or some other act of divine will; but there is no obvious argument for the view that God’s being essential to holding us accountable for following the norms of morality entails God’s commanding or willing those moral norms into existence. Even if we grant, then, to the theological voluntarists their desired premises regarding the social character of obligation and God’s ideal status as someone to hold us accountable for adhering to the norms of morality, theological voluntarists still have a worrisome gap to overcome in offering positive reasons to affirm that view.


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