Affirmative Action

First published Fri Dec 28, 2001; substantive revision Fri Jun 21, 2024

“Affirmative action” means positive steps taken to increase the representation of women and minorities in areas of employment, education, and culture from which they have been historically excluded. When those steps involve preferential selection—selection on the basis of race, gender, or ethnicity—affirmative action generates intense controversy.

The ebb and flow of public controversy over affirmative action can be pictured as three spikes on a line, the first spike representing a period of passionate debate that began around 1972 and tapered off after 1980, and the second indicating a resurgence of debate in the 1990s leading up to Supreme Court’s decisions in 2003 and 2016 upholding certain kinds of affirmative action in higher education. The third spike reflects the Supreme Court’s decision in 2023 voiding race-conscious-programs at Harvard and the University of North Carolina, potentially opening a new era of conflict.

The first spike encompassed controversy about gender and racial/ethnic preferences alike. This is because in the beginning affirmative action was largely about the factory, the firehouse, the office, and the classroom podium. The second and third spikes represent a quarrel about race and ethnicity. This is because the debate at the turn of the twentieth-first century focused on college admissions. At selective colleges, women need no boost; African-Americans and Hispanics seemingly do.[1] The first part of this entry looks at affirmative action’s origins in the employment context. The longer second part concentrates on the college admissions controversy.

1. In the Beginning

In 1972, affirmative action became an inflammatory public issue. True enough, the Civil Rights Act of 1964 made something called “affirmative action” a remedy federal courts could impose on violators of the Act. Likewise, after 1965 federal contractors fell subject to President Lyndon Johnson’s Executive Order 11246, requiring them to take “affirmative action” to make sure they were not discriminating in their employment practices. But what did this 1965 mandate amount to? The Executive Order assigned to the Secretary of Labor the job of specifying rules of implementation. In the meantime, as the federal courts were enforcing the Civil Rights Act against discriminating companies, unions, and other institutions, the Department of Labor mounted ad hoc attacks on the construction industry by cajoling, threatening, negotiating, and generally strong-arming reluctant construction firms into a series of region-wide “plans” in which they committed themselves to numerical hiring goals. Through these contractor commitments, the Department could indirectly pressure recalcitrant labor unions, who supplied the employees at job sites, to desegregate.

While the occasional court case and government initiative made the news and stirred some controversy, affirmative action was pretty far down the list of public excitements until the autumn of 1972, when the Secretary of Labor’s Revised Order No. 4, fully implementing the Executive Order, landed on campus by way of directives from the Department of Health, Education, and Welfare. The Revised Order’s predecessor, Order No. 4, first promulgated in 1970, cast a wide net over American institutions, both public and private. By extending to all contractors the basic apparatus of the construction industry “plans,” the Order imposed a one-size-fits-all system of “underutilization analyses,” “goals,” and “timetables” on hospitals, banks, trucking companies, steel mills, printers, airlines—indeed, on all the scores of thousands of institutions, large and small, that did business with the government, including a special set of institutions with a particularly voluble and articulate constituency, namely, American universities.

At first, university administrators and faculty found the demands of Order No. 4 murky but hardly a threat to the established order. The number of racial and ethnic minorities receiving PhDs each year and thus eligible for faculty jobs was tiny. Any mandate to increase their representation on campus would require more diligent searches by universities, to be sure, but searches fated nevertheless largely to mirror past results. The 1972 Revised Order, on the other hand, effected a change that punctured any campus complacency: it included women among the “protected classes” whose “underutilization” demanded the setting of “goals” and “timetables” for “full utilization” (Graham 1990, 413). Unlike African-Americans and Hispanics, women were getting PhDs in substantial and growing numbers. If the affirmative action required of federal contractors was a recipe for “proportional representation,” then Revised Order No. 4 was bound to leave a large footprint on campus. Some among the professoriate exploded in a fury of opposition to the new rules, while others responded with an equally vehement defense of them.[2]

As it happened, these events coincided with another development, namely the “public turn” in philosophy. For several decades Anglo-American philosophy had treated moral and political questions obliquely. On the prevailing view, philosophers were suited only to do “conceptual analysis”—they could lay bare, for example, the conceptual architecture of the idea of justice, but they were not competent to suggest political principles, constitutional arrangements, or social policies that actually did justice. Philosophers might do “meta-ethics” but not “normative ethics.” This view collapsed in the 1970s under the weight of two counter-blows. First, John Rawls published in 1971 A Theory of Justice, an elaborate, elegant, and inspiring defense of a normative theory of justice (Rawls 1971). Second, in the same year Philosophy & Public Affairs, with Princeton University’s impeccable pedigree, began life, a few months after Florida State’s Social Theory and Practice. These journals, along with a re-tooled older periodical, Ethics, became self-conscious platforms for socially and politically engaged philosophical writing, born out of the feeling that in time of war (the Vietnam War) and social tumult (the Civil Rights Movement, Women’s Liberation), philosophers ought to engage with real issues, not merely talk about words and concepts. In 1973, Philosophy & Public Affairs published Thomas Nagel’s “Equal Treatment and Compensatory Justice” (Nagel 1973) and Judith Jarvis Thomson’s “Preferential Hiring” (Thomson 1973), and the philosophical literature on affirmative action burgeoned forth.[3]

In contention was the nature of those “goals” and “timetables” imposed on every contractor by Revised Order No. 4. Weren’t the “goals” tantamount to “quotas,” requiring institutions to use racial or gender preferences in their selection processes? Some answered “no” (Ezorsky 1977, 86). Properly understood, affirmative action did not require (or even permit) the use of gender or racial preferences. Others said “yes” (Goldman 1976, 182–3). Affirmative action, if it did not impose preferences outright, at least countenanced them. Among the yea-sayers, opinion divided between those who said preferences were morally permissible and those who said they were not. Within the “morally permissible” set, different writers put forward different justifications.

2. The Controversy Engaged

The essays by Thomson and Nagel defended the use of preferences but on different grounds. Thomson endorsed job preferences for women and minorities as a form of redress for their past exclusion from the workplace. Preferential policies, in her view, worked a kind of justice. Nagel, by contrast, argued that preferences might work a kind of social good, and without doing violence to justice. Institutions could for one or another compelling reason properly depart from standard meritocratic selection criteria because the whole system of tying economic reward to earned credentials was itself indefensible.

Justice and desert lay at the heart of subsequent arguments. Several writers took to task Thomson’s argument that preferential hiring justifiably makes up for past wrongs. Preferential hiring seen as redress looks perverse, they contended, since it benefits individuals (minorities and women possessing good educational credentials) least likely harmed by past wrongs while it burdens individuals (younger white male applicants) least likely to be responsible for past wrongs (Simon 1974, 315–19; Sher 1975, 162; Sher 1979, 81–82; and Goldman 1976, 190–1).[4] Instead of doing justice, contended the critics, preferential treatment violated rights. What rights were at issue? The right of an applicant “to equal consideration” (Thomson 1973, 377; Simon 1974, 312), the right of the maximally competent to an open position (Goldman 1976, 191; Goldman 1979, 24–8), or the right of everyone to equal opportunity (Gross 1977a, 382; Gross 1978, 97). Moreover, according to the critics, preferential treatment confounded desert by severing reward from a “person’s character, talents, choices and abilities” (Simon 1979, 96), by “subordinating merit, conduct, and character to race” (Eastland and Bennett 1979, 144), and by disconnecting outcomes from actual liability and damage (Gross 1978, 125–42).

Defenders of preferences were no less quick to enlist justice and desert in their cause. Mary Anne Warren, for example, argued that in a context of entrenched gender discrimination, gender preferences might improve the “overall fairness” of job selections. Justice and individual desert need not be violated.

If individual men’s careers are temporarily set back because of…[job preferences given to women], the odds are good that these same men will have benefited in the past and/or will benefit in the future—not necessarily in the job competition, but in some ways—from sexist discrimination against women. Conversely, if individual women receive apparently unearned bonuses [through preferential selection], it is highly likely that these same women will have suffered in the past and/or will suffer in the future from…sexist attitudes. (Warren 1977, 256)

Likewise, James Rachels defended racial preferences as devices to neutralize unearned advantages by whites. Given the pervasiveness of racial discrimination, it is likely, he argued, that the superior credentials offered by white applicants do not reflect their greater effort, desert, or even ability. Rather, the credentials reflect their mere luck at being born white. “Some white…[applicants] have better qualifications…only because they have not had to contend with the obstacles faced by their African-American competitors” (Rachels 1978, 162). Rachels was less confident than Warren that preferences worked uniformly accurate offsets. Preferences might do injustice to some whites; yet their absence would result in injustices to African-Americans who have been unfairly handicapped by their lesser advantages.

Rachels’ diffidence was warranted in light of the counter-responses. If racial and gender preferences for jobs were supposed to neutralize unfair competitive advantages, they needed to be calibrated to fit the variety of backgrounds aspirants brought to any competition for these goods. Simply giving blanket preferences to blacks or women seemed much too ham-handed an approach if the point was to micro-distribute opportunities fairly (Sher 1975, 165ff).

3. Rights and Consistency

To many of its critics, “reverse discrimination” was simply incoherent. When “the employers and the schools favor women and blacks,” objected Lisa Newton, they commit the same injustice perpetrated by Jim Crow discrimination. “Just as the previous discrimination did, this reverse discrimination violates the public equality which defines citizenship” (Newton 1973, 310).[5]

William Bennett and Terry Eastland likewise saw racial preferences as in some sense illogical:

To count by race, to use the means of numerical equality to achieve the end of moral equality, is counterproductive, for to count by race is to deny the end by virtue of the means. The means of race counting will not, cannot, issue in an end where race does not matter (Eastland and Bennett 1979, 149).[6]

When Eastland and Bennett alluded to those who favored using race to get to a point where race doesn’t count, they had in mind specifically the Supreme Court’s Justice Blackmun who, in the famous 1978 Bakke case (discussed below), put his own view in just those simple terms. For Blackmun, the legitimacy of racial preferences was to be measured by how fast using them moves us toward a society where race doesn’t matter (a view developed in subtle detail by Richard Wasserstrom in Wasserstrom 1976). While the critics of preferences claimed to find the very idea of using race to end racism illogical and incoherent, they also fell back on principle to block Blackmun’s instrumental defense should it actually prove both reasonable and plausible. “The moral issue comes in classic form,” wrote Carl Cohen. “Terribly important objectives…appear to require impermissible means.” He went on to ask, “might we not wink at the Constitution this once” and allow preferences to do their good work (Cohen 1995, 20)? Neither he nor other critics thought so. Principle must hold firm. “[I]n the distribution of benefits under the laws all racial classifications are invidious” (Cohen 1995, 52).

But what, exactly, is the principle—constitutional or moral—that always bars the use of race as a means to “terribly important objectives”? Alan Goldman did more than anyone in the early debate to formulate and ground a relevant principle. Using a contractualist framework, he surmised that rational contractors would choose a rule of justice requiring positions to be awarded by competence. On its face, this rule would seem to preclude filling positions by reference to factors like race and gender that are unrelated to competence. However, Goldman’s “rule” blocked preferences only under certain empirical conditions. Goldman explained the derivation of the rule and its consequent limit this way:

The rule for hiring the most competent was justified as part of a right to equal opportunity to succeed through socially productive effort, and on grounds of increased welfare for all members of society. Since it is justified in relation to a right to equal opportunity, and since the application of the rule may simply compound injustices when opportunities are unequal elsewhere in the system, the creation of more equal opportunities takes precedence when in conflict with the rule for awarding positions. Thus short-run violations of the rule are justified to create a more just distribution of benefits by applying the rule itself in future years (Goldman 1979, 164–165).

In other words, if “terribly important objectives” having to do with equalizing opportunities in a system rife with unjust inequalities could in fact be furthered by measured and targeted “reverse discrimination,” justice wouldn’t stand in the way. Goldman’s principle did not have the adamantine character Cohen and other critics sought in a bar to preferences. Where can such an unyielding principle be found? In the next two sections I examine different efforts to answer this question.

4. The Campus Wars

In the 1970s, while campuses were embroiled in debate about how to increase blacks, Hispanics, and women on the faculty, universities were also putting into effect schemes to increase minority presence within the student body. Very selective universities, in particular, needed new initiatives because only a handful of African-American and Hispanic high school students possessed test scores and grades good enough to make them eligible for admission. These institutions faced a choice: retain their admissions criteria unchanged and live with the upshot—hardly any African-Americans and Hispanics on campus—or fiddle with their criteria to get a more substantial representation. Most elected the second path.

The Medical School of the University of California at Davis exemplified a particularly aggressive approach. It reserved sixteen of the one hundred slots in its entering classes for minorities. In 1973 and again in 1974, Allan Bakke, a white applicant, was denied admission although his test scores and grades were better than most or all of those admitted through the special program. He sued. In 1977, his case, Regents of the University of California v. Bakke, reached the Supreme Court. The Court rendered its decision a year later (Bakke 1978).

An attentive reader of Title VI of the Civil Rights Act—“[N]o person…shall, on the ground of race, color, or national origin, be excluded from participation in, be denied the benefits of, or be subjected to discrimination under any program or activity receiving Federal financial assistance”—might have thought this case was an easy call. So, too, thought four Justices on the Court, who voted to order Bakke admitted to the Medical School. Led by Justice Stevens, they saw the racially segregated, two-track scheme at the Medical School (a recipient of federal funds) as a clear violation of the plain language of the Title.

Four other members of the Court, led by Justice Brennan, wanted very keenly to save the Medical School program. To find a more attractive terrain for doing battle, they made an end-run around Title VI, arguing that, whatever its language, it had no independent meaning itself. It meant in regard to race only what the Constitution meant. Thus, instead of having to parse the stingy and unyielding language of Title VI (“no person shall be subjected to…on the ground of race”), the Brennan group could turn their creative energies to interpreting the broad and vague language of the Fourteenth Amendment (“no person shall be denied the equal protection of the laws”), which provided much more wiggle-room for justifying racial preferences. The Brennan Justices persuaded one other member, Justice Powell, to join them in their view of Title VI. But Powell didn’t agree with their view of the Constitution. He argued that the Medical School’s policy was unconstitutional and voted that Bakke must be admitted. His vote, added to the four votes of the Stevens group, meant that Allan Bakke won his case and that Powell got to write the opinion of the Court. The Brennan strategy didn’t reap the fruit it intended.

Against the leanings of the Brennan group, who would distinguish between “benign” and “malign” uses of race and deal more leniently with the former, Powell insisted that the Fourteenth Amendment’s promise of “equal protection of the law” must mean the same thing for all, black and white alike. To paraphrase Powell:

The Constitution can tolerate no “two-class” theory of equal protection. There is no principled basis for deciding between classes that deserve special judicial attention and those that don’t. To think otherwise would involve the Court in making all kinds of “political” decisions it is not competent to make. In expounding the Constitution, the Court’s role is to discern “principles sufficiently absolute to give them roots throughout the community and continuity over significant periods of time, and to lift them above the pragmatic political judgments of a particular time and place” (Bakke 1978, 295–300 [Powell quoting Cox 1976, 114]).

What, then, was the practical meaning of a “sufficiently absolute” rendering of the principle of equal protection? It was this: when the decisions of state agents “touch upon an individual’s race or ethnic background, he is entitled to a judicial determination that the burden he is asked to bear on that basis is precisely tailored to serve a compelling governmental interest” (Bakke 1978, 300).

Powell, with this standard in hand, then turned to look at the four reasons the Medical School offered for its special program: (i) to reduce “the historic deficit of traditionally disfavored minorities in medical schools and the medical profession;” (ii) to counter “the effects of societal discrimination;” (iii) to increase “the number of physicians who will practice in communities currently underserved;” and (iv) to obtain “the educational benefits that flow from an ethnically diverse student body” (Bakke 1978, 307). Did any or all of them specify a compelling governmental interest? Did they necessitate use of racial preferences?

As to the first reason, Powell dismissed it out of hand.

If [the School’s] purpose is to assure within its student body some specified percentage of a particular group merely because of its race or ethnic origin, such a preferential purpose must be rejected not as insubstantial but as facially invalid. Preferring members of any one group for no reason other than race or ethnic origin is discrimination for its own sake.

As to the second reason, Powell allowed it more force. A state has a legitimate interest in ameliorating the effects of past discrimination. Even so, contended Powell, the Court,

has never approved a classification that aids persons perceived as members of relatively victimized groups at the expense of other innocent individuals in the absence of judicial, legislative, or administrative findings of constitutional or statutory violations (Bakke 1978, 308).
And the Medical School does not purport to have made, and is in no position to make, such findings. Its broad mission is education, not the formulation of any legislative policy or the adjudication of particular claims of illegality.…[I]solated segments of our vast governmental structures are not competent to make those decisions, at least in the absence of legislative mandates and legislatively determined criteria (Bakke 1978, 309).

As to the third reason, Powell found it, too, insufficient. The Medical School provided no evidence that the best way it could contribute to increased medical services to underserved communities was to employ a racially preferential admissions scheme. Indeed, the Medical School provided no evidence that its scheme would result in any benefits at all to such communities (Bakke 1978, 311).

This left the fourth reason. Here Powell found merit. A university’s interest in a diverse student body is legitimated by the First Amendment’s implied protection of academic freedom. This constitutional halo makes the interest “compelling.” However, the Medical School’s use of a racial and ethnic classification scheme was not “precisely tailored” to effect the School’s interest in diversity, argued Powell.

The diversity that furthers a compelling state interest encompasses a far broader array of qualifications and characteristics of which racial or ethnic origin is but a single though important element. [The Medical School’s] special admissions program, focused solely on ethnic diversity, would hinder rather than further attainment of genuine diversity (Bakke1978, 316).

The diversity which provides an educational atmosphere “conducive to speculation, experiment and creation” includes a nearly endless range of experiences, talents, and attributes that students might bring to campus. In reducing diversity to racial and ethnic quotas, the Medical School wholly misconceived this important educational interest.

In sum, although the last of the Medical School’s four reasons encompassed a “compelling governmental interest,” the School’s special admissions program was not necessary to effect the interest. The special admissions program was unconstitutional. So concluded Justice Powell.

5. Equality’s Rule

This was a conclusion Justice Brennan tried vigorously to forestall. Brennan agreed with Powell that “equal protection” must mean the same thing—that is, remain one rule—whether applied to blacks or whites. But the same rule applied to different circumstances need not yield the same results. Racial preferences created for different reasons and producing different outcomes need not all be judged in the same harsh, virtually fatal, manner. This point was the crux of Brennan’s defense of the Medical School’s policy.

Powell thought there was no principled way to distinguish “benign” from “malign” discrimination, but Brennan insisted there was. He argued that if the Court looked carefully at its past cases striking down Jim Crow laws, it would see the principle at work. What the Court found wrong in Jim Crow was that it served no purpose except to mark out and stigmatize one group of people as inferior. The “cardinal principle” operating in the Court’s decisions condemned racial classifications “drawn on the presumption that one race is inferior to another” or that “put the weight of government behind racial hatred and separation” (Bakke,1978, 358 [Brennan, dissenting]). Brennan agreed with Powell that no public racial classification motivated by racial animus, no classification whose purpose is to stigmatize people with the “badge of inferiority,” could withstand judicial scrutiny. However, the Medical School’s policy, even if ill-advised or mistaken, reflected a public purpose far different from that found in Jim Crow. The policy ought not be treated as though it were cut from the same cloth.

Brennan granted that if a state adopted a racial classification for the purpose of humiliating whites, or stigmatizing Allan Bakke as inferior and confining him to second-class citizenship, that classification would be as odious as Jim Crow. But the Medical School’s policy had neither this purpose nor this effect. Allan Bakke may have been upset and resentful at losing out under the special plan, but he wasn’t “in any sense stamped as an inferior by the Medical School’s rejection of him.” Nor did his loss constitute a “pervasive injury,” in the sense that wherever he went he would be treated as a “second-class citizen” because of his color (Bakke 1978, 376 [Brennan, dissenting]).

In short, argued Brennan, the principle expressed in the Equal Protection Clause should be viewed as an anti-caste principle, a principle that uniformly and consistently rejects all public law whose purpose is to subject people to an inferior and degraded station in life, whether they are black or white.[7] Of course, given the asymmetrical position of whites and blacks in our country, we are not likely to encounter laws that try to stigmatize whites as an inferior caste (much less succeed at it). But this merely shows that a principle applied to different circumstances produces different results. Because the Medical School’s program sought to undo the effects of a racial caste system long-enduring in America, it represented a purpose of great social importance and should not be found constitutionally infirm: so maintained Brennan (Bakke 1978, 363 [Brennan, dissenting]).

Justice Powell never successfully engaged this way of reading “constitutional equality.” His insistence on clear, plain, unitary, absolute principle did not cut against the Brennan view. The issue between Powell and Brennan was not the consistency and stringency of the principle but its content. If the Constitution says, “The state cannot deliberately burden someone by race if its purpose is to create or maintain caste,” then constitutional law doesn’t block any of the Medical School’s justifications.

If we turn away from exegesis of the Constitution, are we likely to find in political theory itself any principle of equality implying that every use of racial preferences in every circumstance works an intolerable injustice?

The prospects seem dim. Won’t very general notions of equality lend themselves both to defending affirmative action (and the social inclusion it effects) as well as condemning it (and the racial non–neutrality it involves)? The challenge here is well-illustrated by Carl Cohen’s effort, in a debate with James Sterba, to extract a strict prohibition on racial preferences from the Aristotelian principle that “equals should be treated equally” (Cohen and Sterba 2003, 23). This principle, urges Cohen, “certainly entails at least this: It is wrong, always and everywhere, to give special advantage to any group simply on the basis of physical characteristics that have no relevance to the award given or the burden imposed” (Cohen and Sterba 2003, 25). Whether anything interesting follows from this proposition depends on how we construe “relevance.” Cohen admits that public policy may rightly treat some people differently because of their physical characteristics. For example, the state might offer special assistance to the old or disabled. Now, this example lends itself to the thought that the relevance of physical differences is something independent of social policy. Age and disability, it seems, are real features of persons and public policy simply tracks them. However, the relevance that differences have is not something itself given by nature; it is determined by public purposes. Age and disability are made relevant in this manner—in the one case, by the social purpose of assuring that people do not have to live in poverty when they can no longer work; in the other case, by the social purpose of assuring that people are not foreclosed from developing and marketing their talents by impediments in the (largely constructed) physical environment.

Purpose determines relevancy, and this is true whether or not the relevant differences are physical. If the nation thinks it desirable to change white institutions so that they are less uniformly white, that purpose links skin color to recruitment.

Because the Aristotelian principle by itself doesn’t rule out racial preferences (since blacks and whites may be relevantly different with respect to certain legitimate public purposes), it is not surprising that Cohen also invokes a substantive conception of equality: “All members of humankind are equally ends in themselves, all have equal dignity—and therefore all are entitled to equal respect from the community and its laws” (Cohen and Sterba, 24). This principle, however, brings us back to the interpretive questions about “equal protection of the laws” played out in the Powell-Brennan exchange in Bakke. What do “equal dignity” and “equal respect” mean?

In a series of essays beginning in the 1970s, Ronald Dworkin marked out and developed a view of equality that generalized elements of the Brennan argument in Bakke. He emphasized a distinction between “two different sorts of rights…the right to equal treatment…[and] the right to treatment as an equal.” The latter “is the right… to be treated with the same respect and concern as anyone else.”

In some cases (voting, for example) equal treatment applies: government must treat every eligible voter the same. In other contexts, however, government distinguishes among groups and individuals in making policy for the common good (marking differences between the young and old in the example noted above). In this classifying process, “[a]n individual’s right to be treated as an equal means that his potential loss must be treated as a matter of concern, but that loss may nevertheless be outweighed by the gain to the community” (Dworkin 1977, 227). Treating the individual’s loss “as a matter of concern” means that the ingredients which go into making public policy cannot include public contempt or hatred toward the individual (and the group of which he/she is a member).

Every citizen has a constitutional right that he not suffer disadvantage, at least in the competition for any public benefit, because the race or religion or region or other artificial group to which he belongs is the subject of prejudice or contempt (Dworkin 1985, 300–301).
The equal protection clause is violated, not whenever some group has lost an important decision on the merits of the case or through politics, but when its loss results from its special vulnerability to prejudice or hostility or stereotype and its consequent diminished standing…in the political community. The clause does not guarantee each citizen that he will benefit equally from every political decision; it guarantees him only that he will be treated as an equal—with equal concern and respect—in the political processes and deliberations that produce those decisions (Dworkin 2000, 411).
It is true that the equal protection clause lays down a general principle of political morality, and that its contemporary interpreters must remain faithful to that general principle. If racial classifications were inherently morally wrong, then they might well be deemed unconstitutional for that reason. But…racial classifications are not inherently wrong, any more than other classifications based on physical or genetically grounded properties (Dworkin 2000, 417; footnote omitted).

Carl Cohen disagreed (Cohen 1995, 47). But he never specified a conception of equality in which bearing unequal burdens on behalf of urgent social ends invariably amounts to an assault on dignity if the burden happens to be assigned by race. He insisted (like Lisa Newton above) that “[u]sing race to award benefits now does injustice in precisely the same way injustice was done originally [to blacks], by giving moral weight to skin color itself.” But comparing affirmative action to Jim Crow can’t be right, unless the purpose and effects of a policy have no bearing on its moral standing.[8]

6. Diversity’s Dominion

How, if it held the Medical School’s policy unconstitutional, did Justice Powell’s Bakke opinion become the basis upon which universities across the land enacted—or maintained—racially preferential admissions policies?

If Powell had concluded with his assessment of the Medical School’s four justifications, Bakke would have left university affirmative action in a precarious situation. However, he didn’t stop there. In an earlier ruling on Bakke’s lawsuit, the California Supreme Court had forbidden the Medical School to make any use of race or ethnicity in its admissions decisions. Powell thought this went too far. Given higher education’s protected interest in “diversity,” and given that a student’s race or ethnicity might add to diversity just in the same way that her age, work experience, family background, special talents, foreign language fluency, athletic prowess, military service, and unusual accomplishments might, Powell vacated that portion of the California Supreme Court’s order.

Then he added some dicta for guidance. If universities want to understand diversity and the role that race and ethnicity might play in achieving it, they should look to Harvard, proposed Powell, and he appended to his opinion a long statement of Harvard’s affirmative action admissions program. In such a program, Powell contended, racial or ethnic background might

be deemed a “plus” in a particular applicant’s file, yet it does not insulate the individual from comparison with all other candidates for the available seats.…This kind of program treats each applicant as an individual in the admissions process. The applicant who loses out on the last available seat to another candidate receiving a “plus” on the basis of ethnic background will not have been foreclosed from all consideration for that seat simply because he was not the right color or had the wrong surname. It would mean only that his combined qualifications…did not outweigh those of the other applicant. His qualifications would have been weighed fairly and competitively, and he would have had no basis to complain of unequal treatment under the Fourteenth Amendment (Bakke, at 318, 319).

In these off-hand comments, universities saw a green light for pushing ahead aggressively with their affirmative action programs. Justice Powell’s basic holding could not have been plainer: any system like the Medical School’s that assessed applications along two different tracks defined by race or that used numerical racial quotas must fail constitutional muster. Yet by the mid-1980s universities across the land had in place systems of admissions and scholarship programs that exhibited one or both of these features. When the University of Maryland’s Banneker scholarships—awarded only to African-American students—were held in violation of the Constitution in 1994, the house of cards forming university affirmative action began to fall (Podberesky v. Kirwan 1994). In 1996, the Court of Appeals for the Fifth Circuit struck down the University of Texas Law School’s two-track admissions program (Hopwood v. Texas 1996). In 1998, the Court of Appeals for the First Circuit struck down a Boston plan assigning students to selective high schools by race (Wessman v. Gittens 1998). In 2001, two more schools saw their admissions programs invalidated by federal courts: the University of Georgia (Johnson v. Board of Regents 2001) and the University of Michigan Law School (Grutter v. Bollinger 2001). In many of these cases, educational institutions were using schemes that made race something very much more than Justice Powell’s “plus” factor.[9] The Fifth Circuit Court’s ruling in the University of Texas case (Hopwood v. Texas 1996) threw a cloud even over Powell’s small window for affirmative action, boldly asserting that the Bakke holding was now dead as law and that race could not be used at all in admissions.

Given Justice Powell’s singular opinion, supported by no one else on the Court, and given the drift of Supreme Court decisions on racial preferences since 1978,[10] the Hopwood court was not outlandish, if a bit presumptuous, in declaring Powell’s holding in Bakke dead. As it happened, Powell’s opinion was far from dead. In the University of Michigan Law School case, Grutter v. Bollinger, eventually decided by the Supreme Court in June 2003, Justice Sandra Day O’Connor’s lead opinion declared: “today we endorse Justice Powell’s view that student body diversity is a compelling state interest that can justify the use of race in university admissions” (Grutter 2003, 330). Diversity was alive after all. But how it worked its affirmative action elixir remained as unclear in 2003 as it had been in 1978.

To see why, consider how in Grutter Justice O’Connor posed the issue:

The [Law School’s] policy aspires to “achieve that diversity which has the potential to enrich everyone’s education and thus make a law class stronger than the sum of its parts.”…The policy does not restrict the types of diversity contributions eligible for substantial weight in the admissions process, but instead recognizes “many possible bases for diversity admissions.”…The policy does, however, reaffirm the Law School’s longstanding commitment to “one particular type of diversity,” that is, “racial and ethnic diversity with special reference to the inclusion of students from groups which have been historically discriminated against” (Grutter 2003, 325).

Now, posing the issue this way and allowing the Law School to assert a special interest in “one particular type of diversity” invites the conflation of general diversity—a diversity of opinions, experiences, backgrounds, talents, aspirations, and perspectives—with ethnic and racial diversity that Justice Powell appeared strongly to resist. Nevertheless, Justice O’Connor’s went on:

We find that the Law School’s admissions program bears the hallmark of a narrowly tailored plan. As Justice Powell made clear in Bakke, truly individualized consideration demands that race be used in a flexible, non-mechanical way. It follows from this mandate that universities cannot establish quotas for members of certain racial groups (Grutter 2003, 334).

What vindicated the Law School in O’Connor’s eyes was its “highly individualized, holistic review of each applicant’s file, giving serious consideration to all the ways an applicant might contribute to a diverse educational environment” (Grutter 2003, at 339). This “individualized consideration” is crucial; in Gratz v. Bollinger, decided the same day as Grutter, Justice O’Connor switched sides to hold unconstitutional the undergraduate admissions process at the University of Michigan. The undergraduate admissions office operated differently than the Law School. It computed an index score for each applicant by assigning numerical points for academic factors such as high school grades, admissions test scores, quality of high school, strength of curriculum; and for nonacademic factors such as being a resident of Michigan, a child of an alumnus, a recruited athlete, or a member of “an underrepresented minority group.” An applicant falling in this last category automatically received 20 points (Gratz 2003, 287). In O’Connor’s view, this “mechanical” procedure meant that the undergraduate admissions office did not fully take account in each application “of all factors that may contribute to student body diversity” (Gratz 2003, 288).

But O’Connor’s conclusion here leaves a question hanging. Why should the undergraduate admissions office take account of all the factors that may contribute to student body if it especially wants to select from certain parts of the diversity spectrum? Why can’t it, like the law school, claim a special interest in “one particular type of diversity”?

Moreover, why bar the undergraduate admissions office from using an effective tool to promote its interest even if the tool is “mechanical”? In fact, the Law School’s “non-mechanical” procedure differed from the undergraduate admissions policy only on its face, not in its results. During admissions season, the Law School’s director of admissions frequently consulted the “daily reports” that “kept track of the racial and ethnic composition” of the incoming class. He did so to make sure a “critical mass” of minority students was included (Grutter 2003, 326). In short, the Law School “managed” its admissions process so that roughly 6 to 7 percent of each entering class was African-American. The undergraduate admissions procedure, with its index scores, yielded a similar outcome (Grutter 2003, 367–69 [Rehnquist, dissenting] and 374 [Kennedy, dissenting]). Only surface appearance distinguished the two procedures. Justice Scalia called the Law School’s “holistic” admissions process “a sham,” and not without some reason (Grutter 2003, 375 [Scalia, dissenting]).

As it turned out, Grutter failed to close the book on university affirmative action. A new legal challenge soon arose, this time against the University of Texas, which had revised its own admissions program in 2004 to emulate the scheme validated in Grutter. The case, Fisher v. Texas, wound its way through the courts for a decade, twice landing on the steps of the Supreme Court before final disposition in 2016.

Justice Kennedy, writing for the Court, left the Grutter defense of racial preferences intact, essentially retracing Justice O’Connor’s opinion. Universities bent upon pursuing the “educational benefits that flow from student body diversity,” he wrote, are due a degree of judicial deference (Fisher 2016, 2419).

The University explains that it strives to provide an ‘academic environment’ that offers a ‘robust exchange of ideas, exposure to differing cultures, preparation for the challenges of an increasingly diverse workforce, and acquisition of competencies required of future leaders.’ … All of these objectives … mirror the ‘compelling interest’ this Court has approved in its prior cases (Fisher 2016, 2211).

Persuaded that race–neutral policies didn’t allow the University fully to succeed in deriving the “educational benefits” of diversity, the Court majority found the University’s modest use of race permissible.

But despite these legal victories, have universities actually made a case for diversity as the justifying basis for race–conscious admissions? Caught napping in the mid–1990s when the legal challenges began, higher education rushed to put meat on the Bakke bones and turn Justice Powell’s off–hand remarks into a full–fledged defense. As the University of Michigan cases approached a final test in 2003, the Supreme Court was bombarded with scores of friend–of–the–court briefs from business groups, military officers, higher education associations, coteries of scholars, and other interested parties lauding the benefits of diversity. A similar outpouring preceded the decision in Fisher.

Consider some of the claims in these briefs. “[S]tudent body diversity is essential” if universities are to provide students with “skills necessary for…success in an increasingly globalized world” (Leading Public Research Universities 2015, 11–12; emphasis added). Racial and ethnic diversity on campus are “vital” to securing a capable workforce; “it is essential that [students] be educated in an environment where they are exposed to diverse people, ideas, perspectives, and interactions” (65 Leading American Businesses 2003, 1, 2; emphasis added). Otherwise, the education of students is “degraded” (823 Social Scientists 2015, 5; emphasis added). “[S]tudents today must receive direct experience with people of different backgrounds” (American Council on Education 2015, 6; emphasis added). The “only means of obtaining properly qualified employees is through diversity at institutions of higher education…[Appropriate] skills can only be developed through exposure to widely diverse people, culture, ideas, and viewpoints” (Fortune 100 and Other Leading Businesses 2013, 3, 5; emphasis added). “Diversity is an indispensable prerequisite to establishing the most productive problem–solving groups” (Social and Organizational Psychologists 2015, 47; emphasis added).

According to the briefs the positive effects of diversity are bountiful. They include “improvements in cognitive abilities, analytical problem solving skills and complex thinking skills…[C]ross racial interactions are more strongly linked with cognitive growth than are interactions with non–racial diversity” (American Educational Research Association 2012, 12). “[R]esearch shows that by increasing diversity, universities can help their graduates enter society with better problem–solving capabilities than students who are not exposed to diversity” (Social and Organizational Psychologists 2015, 37).

Now consider four points. First, the promiscuous use of “diversity” in the argument for affirmative action opens the door to waffling and equivocation. Students learn through “exposure to widely diverse people, culture, ideas, and viewpoints” announces the Fortune 100 brief. Of course. But the issue at hand is racial diversity. Wrapping the latter into the former is not an aid to precision.[11] Second, can we imagine that the University of Michigan or the University of Texas would abandon its affirmative action program if studies showed no particular educational benefit to diversity? Suppose it turns out that students in general don’t show additional “cognitive growth” from increased racial diversity. Suppose it turns out students would best prepare for our “increasingly globalized world” by learning Mandarin Chinese or Spanish.

Third, the straining by academics to show that cross-racial interaction is essential, indispensable, vital, necessary, or imperative to a good education, if taken at face value, leads to an unpleasant conclusion, namely that a lot of black college students suffer a deficient education. The young woman who excels at Dunbar High School in Washington, DC (enrollment 95 % black, 1 % white) and then gets her Bachelor of Science degree in statistics magna cum laude at Spelman College (enrolling, in 2017, one white among its 2097 students) is, according to Fortune 100 companies, not the sort of employee they want. Graduates of Fisk University (0.7% white) or Tougaloo (0.6% white) or Florida A & M (3.5% white) haven’t achieved enough cognitive growth, haven’t sufficiently honed their problem–solving skills—is that what we are supposed to conclude? The University of Texas (enrolling 25% Hispanics and 5% blacks) contends that without a “critical mass” of minority students it can’t reap “the educational benefits of diversity.” Does this mean that Prairie View University, two hours down the road from Austin and enrolling 7% Hispanics and 1.8% whites, has to do without those benefits? Are its students poorly prepared for “our increasingly diverse workforce and society” (Fisher 2016, 2210, 2211)? Defenders of affirmative action should think twice about claiming an education in a “non–diverse” setting must be degraded.

Fourth, there is a noticeable lack of “fit” between university affirmative action practices and the diversity rationale (see, for example, Anderson 2002, 27; Anderson 2004, 1217, 1221; Anderson 2010, 142–143). Race is not treated just like any other special factor that might warrant an admission “plus.” Recall that “special interest” asserted by the Michigan Law School. Universities work diligently to maintain a relatively constant percentage of black and Hispanic enrollees but give variable attention to other of the myriad qualities students can bring to campus. As one proponent of affirmative action notes, “affirmative action programs…do not look or operate as if they were testing for ‘diversity’.” He suggests that many supporters of affirmative action nevertheless disregard this fact, believing “that there is no harm in [a] miscast reliance on diversity because, with a wink and a nod, everyone understands that diversity is really a proxy for integration” (Issacharoff 2002, 30, 34; emphasis added; more generally see Jones 2005, Bell, 2003, Lippert-Rasmussen 2020, 124–143; Sabbagh 2007, 31–48).

7. Legitimacy

In the midst of her recitation in Grutter of the educational values of diversity, Justice O’Connor introduced a new argument, one that didn’t locate the value of diversity in students’ “cognitive growth” or in their future skills in negotiating a “diverse world,” but in its contribution to the health of major American institutions.

Leading up to oral arguments in the case, among the amici briefs the Court received was one by retired Army General Julius Becton and twenty-eight former Defense Department officials and retired high-ranking military officers. It explained the crucial role racial preferences play at the service academies and ROTC programs in maintaining an integrated officer corps (Consolidated Brief 2003, 1–30).[12] This brief obviously had a considerable impact on the Justices, several of whom during oral argument pressed the lawyers representing the parties to address its claims (Grutter 2003 Oral Argument, 1–23). The brief prompted Justice O’Connor to include its concerns in her opinion. She noted that

high-ranking retired officers and civilian leaders of the United States military assert that, “based on [their] decades of experience,” a “highly qualified, racially diverse officer corps…is essential to the military’s ability to fulfill its principal mission to provide national security….” At present, “the military cannot achieve an officer corps that is both highly qualified and racially diverse unless the service academies and ROTC used limited race-conscious recruiting and admissions policies”…To fulfill its mission, the military “must be selective in admissions for training and education for the officer corps, and it must train and educate a highly qualified, racially diverse officer corps in a racially diverse setting” (Grutter 2003, 331, citations omitted).
And then she quickly expanded the scope of her observation:
We agree that “it requires only a small step from this analysis to conclude that our country’s other most selective institutions must remain both diverse and selective”…The United States as amicus curiae, affirms that “ensuring that public institutions are open and available to all segments of American society, including people of all races and ethnicities, represents a paramount government objective” (Grutter 2003, 331, citations omitted).
Moreover, universities, and in particular, law schools, represent the training ground for a large number of our Nation’s leaders…Individuals with law degrees occupy roughly half the state governorships, more than half the seats in the United States Senate, and more than a third of the seats in the United States House of Representatives…The pattern is even more striking when it comes to selective law schools. A handful of these schools accounts for 25 of the United States Senators, 74 United States Court of Appeals judges, and nearly 200 of the more than 600 United States District Court judges…In order to cultivate a set of leaders with legitimacy in the eyes of the citizenry, it is necessary that the path to leadership be visibly open to talented and qualified individuals of every race and ethnicity. All members of our heterogeneous society must have confidence in the openness and integrity of the educational institutions that provide that training (Grutter 2003, 332; emphasis added).

This new argument has little to do with the standard educational diversity claims. West Point and Annapolis are not seeking new, enlarged, unusual perspectives. They are in the business of molding their students to a uniformly traditional point of view. There is no African American or Hispanic way to fight a war; there’s just an “Army way” and a “Navy way” (Levinson, 584). The armed services seek out African American and Hispanic students to integrate the officer corps. When officers roughly mirror the racial and ethnic profile of the enlisted ranks, military leaders seem legitimate to those they lead; and the military as a whole seems legitimate to the citizens it serves. The history of dysfunction that spread throughout combat operations—especially ground operations—during the Vietnam War testifies to the importance of “seeming legitimate.”

Consider another example, one that extends Justice O’Connor’s remarks about the importance of law schools. The Supreme Court is composed of four women and five men. Two of the Justices are black, one is Hispanic. This composition is no accident. Administrations since the 1960s—Republican and Democrat alike—have been sensitive to the gender and racial/ethnic make-up of the Court. President Lyndon Johnson seized the opportunity in 1967 to appoint Thurgood Marshall. When Marshall retired, President George H. W. Bush appointed another black Justice, Clarence Thomas. In 1981, President Ronald Reagan appointed Sandra Day O’Connor, after pledging in his 1980 campaign to appoint the first woman to the Court. She was followed by Ruth Bader Ginsburg, appointed in 1993 by President Bill Clinton; by Sonia M. Sotomayor and Elena Kagan, appointed in 2009 and 2010 by President Barack Obama; by Amy Coney Barrett, appointed in 2020 by President Donald Trump; and by Ketanji Brown Jackson, appointed in 2022 by President Joe Biden.

These appointments were not made blindly—they were neither color-blind nor gender-blind. They were made with an eye toward political gain, no doubt, but also with an eye toward sustaining the legitimacy of the Court before the American public. Moreover, the composition of the Court reflects the fact that Harvard and Yale, because of their affirmative action policies, had been producing a significant number of black and Hispanic law graduates in the 1970s, 1980s, and 1990s. The current Justices possess law degrees from Harvard (4), Yale (4), and Notre Dame. Excluding current members of the Court, Justices appointed since 1950 came from Harvard (6), Yale (4) Northwestern (2), Stanford (2), Columbia, and other (3).

O’Connor’s legitimacy argument constituted a strong counter-point to the standard diversity line. It directed attention away from the “cognitive growth” and “enhanced problem-solving skills” in students’ heads and toward the necessity of integrating major American institutions. In a similar vein Elizabeth Anderson has argued for integration as a value the Court should recognize as a compelling interest:

Given the realities of race in the U.S., people of different race occupy different walks of life. So in the U.S., democracy requires racial integration of the main institutions of civil society, the places where discussion of public import among citizens take place: public accommodations, workplaces, schools, and neighborhoods. The same applies to society’s elites, those who play a pivotal role in formulating and adopting policies of public import. Elites, to be legitimate, must serve a representative function: they must be capable of and dedicated to representing the concerns of people from all walks of life, so that the policies they forge are responsive to these concerns. An elite drawn only from segments of society that live in isolation from other segments will be ignorant of the circumstances and concerns of those who occupy other walks of life (Anderson 2004, 22; emphasis added; see also Anderson 2002; for a discussion of Anderson’s full integration argument, see Lippert-Rasmussen 2020, 144–158).

Unfortunately Justice O’Connor offered her legitimacy argument as though it were a continuation of the standard diversity justification, inserting it unexpectedly and then abandoning it just as quickly to resume tracing the byways of diversity. Then she undermined the argument by suggesting that race-conscious admissions shouldn’t be necessary after another 25 years. Such measures must be time limited (Grutter 2003, 343).

8. Diversity’s Limit

On June 29, 2023, the Supreme Court decided Students for Fair Admissions v. Harvard. (It also decided a companion case, Students for Fair Admissions v. University of North Carolina. I will dwell here only on the Harvard decision. The issues in the two cases are similar, differing only in minor details.) Students for Fair Admissions (SFFA) contended that Harvard’s affirmative action policy violated Title VI of the Civil Rights Act of 1964 (and by extension the Fourteenth Amendment to the Constitution) by discriminating against Asian American applicants. And it asked the Court to overturn Grutter.

The deciding opinion, written by Chief Justice Roberts, is something of a puzzle. It ruled that Harvard’s policy transgressed the Constitution but it did not overrule Grutter and it did not find that Harvard discriminated against Asian American applicants (although it’s admissions policy had a “negative effect” on them).[13]

The Chief Justice employed the Grutter framework to make his case against Harvard. The main elements of his decision were these: (1) Harvard’s purported aims—training future leaders, producing new knowledge through the clash of different perspectives, and the like—were “not sufficiently precise” to be measured by the Court (SFFA 2023, 22–23); (2) the racial and ethnic categories used by Harvard were so “opaque” and incoherent that Harvard couldn’t plausibly establish a tight connection between means (using racial classifications) and ends (producing new leaders, new knowledge, and so on) (SFFA 2023, 24–26); (3) Harvard’s use of race fostered stereotypes (something Justice Powell in Bakke and Justice O’Connor in Grutter warned against) (SFFA 2023, 28–29); and Harvard’s policy had no end point (SFFA 2023, 30).

The Chief Justice fully embraced Justice O’Connor’s proposition that race-conscious affirmative action policies must have an end point. Otherwise, he never addressed her reasoning in Grutter that the University of Michigan Law School’s “holistic” search for diversity satisfied the strictures of the Constitution. Nor did he did he address her legitimacy argument. The closest he came was in a footnote:

The United States as amicus curiae contends that race-based admissions programs further compelling interests at our Nation’s military academies. No military academy is a party to these cases, however, and none of the courts below addressed the propriety of race-based systems in that context. This opinion also does not address that issue, in light of the potentially distinct interests that military academies may present (SFFA 2023, 22, ftnt 4).

But it was Justice O’Connor who in 2003 broached these interests and gave them weight. More importantly, she extended her observations about the military academies to colleges and universities in general: by propelling blacks and Hispanics into elite levels of leadership, affirmative action was helping legitimate major American institutions.

The Chief Justice’s footnote was a red flag. Within months SFFA had brought suit against the United States Naval Academy at Annapolis and the United States Military Academy at West Point.[14]

In the aftermath of the Court’s decision, proponents of affirmative action did not rise up loudly to defend “diversity in the head” (students’ cognitive growth and analytical skill development) as a still viable justification of racial and ethnic preferences in admissions. They turned their sights to other targets. “Legacy” admissions—favorable admission decisions extended to sons and daughters of an institution’s alumni—immediately jumped to the top of the list. A commentator in the Wall Street Journal expressed a very common view:

Fairness requires equal opportunity for all and special privileges for none. Yet today admission to elite colleges and universities is rife with preferences that have nothing to do with race and give additional advantages to the advantaged…Such policies [in particular legacy preferences] are flatly inconsistent with the nation’s promise of equal opportunity, and institutions like Harvard—whose endowment at the end of fiscal 2022 amounted to $51 billion—can afford to change them (Galston 2023).

So obviously unjust do legacies seem that after the Supreme Court’s SFFA decisions, two different bills were introduced in Congress to ban them. States are getting into the act, too, passing or contemplating passing legislation of their own.[15]

Likewise, standardized tests used in college and professional school admissions—especially the SAT, ACT, and LSAT—are attracting renewed scrutiny. They long have been charged as biased against black and Hispanic students, who score less well on them than whites and Asian Americans. In recent years many selective colleges and universities made the SAT or ACT optional, especially so during the pandemic. But a shift back may be underway: MIT, Yale, Brown, and Dartmouth recently reinstated the SAT.[16]

Indeed, the whole idea of “merit” is up for grabs now, drawing on, among other sources, the debate spawned by Michael Sandel’s (2022) thoroughgoing critique of the meritocratic ideal.

Race-conscious affirmative action is not broadly popular (Gramlich 2023; Borter 2023). Nine states have banned it by law. California began the trend with Proposition 209, passed by popular vote in 1996. In 2020, fifty-seven percent of California voters defeated an effort to roll it back. No national groundswell of protest against the SFFA decisions has emerged paralleling the reaction to the Dobbs 2022 decision overturning Roe v. Wade.

As Chief Justice Roberts observed in his decision, the issue isn’t diversity or no diversity (read: racial and ethnic representation), it’s how much (SFFA 2023, 23). And by what means. Three years after the Grutter decision in 2003, voters in Michigan amended its constitution to forbid racial and ethnic preferences in admissions. How has the Law School fared since? Its class of 2026 is 9% black, 10% Hispanic, 4% Native American, 17% Asian American, and 62% white (Morioka 2023). Is that enough? Too little?

The moral arguments for and against the use of racial and ethnic preferences have not changed much since the 1970s. They ring variations on a few common themes. For those readers who want to understand these arguments in depth, the essential resource is Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen’s Making Sense of Affirmative Action (2020). He shows that the most common arguments that proponents and opponents deploy are much more complex than they imagined. But he deftly guides the reader through the complexities; all he requires is close attention.


Roe v Wade, 1973, 410 U.S. 113.
University of California Regents v. Bakke, 1978, 438 U.S. 265.
Wygant v. Jackson, 1986, 476 U.S. 267.
Richmond v. J. A. Croson Company, 1989, 488 U.S. 469.
Podberesky v. Kirwan, 1994, 38 F. 3d 147 (Fourth Circuit).
Hopwood v. Texas, 1994, 861 F. Supp. 551 (Western District, Texas).
Adarand Constructors v. Pena, 1995, 515 I.S. 200.
Hopwood v. Texas, 1996, 78 F. 3d 932 (Fifth Circuit).
Wessman v. Gittens, 1998, 106 F. 3d 798 (First Circuit).
Johnson v. Board of Regents, 2001, 263 F. 3rd 1234 (Eleventh Circuit).
Grutter v. Bollinger, 2001, 137. F. Supp. 2d 821 (Eastern District, Michigan).
Gratz v. Bollinger, 2003, 539 U.S. 244.
Grutter v. Bollinger, 2003, No. 02–241, Oral Argument, April 1.
Grutter v. Bollinger, 2003, 539 U.S. 306.
Fisher v. University of Texas, 2015, No. 14–981, Brief for the University, October 26.
Fisher v. University of Texas, 2016, 136 S. Ct. 2198.
Students for Fair Admissions v. President of Harvard College, 2019, 397 F. Supp. 3d 126 (District, Massachusetts).
Students for Fair Admissions v. President of Harvard College, 2020, 980 F. 3d 157 (First Circuit).
Dobbs v. Jackson Women’s Health Organization, 2022, 142 S. Ct. 2228.
Students for Fair Admissions v. President and Fellows of Harvard College, 2022, No. 20–1199, Oral Argument, October 31.
Students for Fair Admissions v. President and Fellows of Harvard College, 2023, 600 U.S.
Students for Fair Admissions v. University of North Carolina, 2023, 600 U.S.


  • 65 Leading American Businesses, 2003: Brief Supporting Respondents in Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U.S. 244: 1–11.[available online]
  • 823 Social Scientists, 2015: Brief Supporting Respondents in Fisher v. University of Texas, 136 S. Ct. 2198 (2016): 1–42.[available online]
  • Adams, Matthew, 2021, “Nonideal Justice, Fairness, and Affirmative Action,” Journal of Ethics and Social Philosophy, 20 (November): 310–341.
  • Allen, Anita L., 1990–1991, “On Being a Role Model,” Berkeley Journal of Gender, Law and Justice (formerly Berkeley Women’s Law Journal), 6: 22–42.
  • –––, 2011, “Was I Entitled or Should I Apologize? Affirmative Action Going Forward,” Journal of Ethics, 15 (September): 253–263.
  • Alon, Sigal, 2015, Race, Class, and Affirmative Action, New York: Russell Sage Foundation.
  • ––– and Marta Tienda, 2005, “Assessing the Mismatch Hypothesis: Differences in College Graduation Rates by Institutional Selectivity,” Sociology of Education, 78 (October): 294–315.
  • American Council on Education and 37 Other Higher Education Organizations, 2015: Brief Supporting Respondents in Fisher v. University of Texas, 136 S. Ct.2198 (2016): 1–23.[available online]
  • American Educational Research Association et. al., 2013: Brief Supporting Respondents in Fisher v. University of Texas, 570 U.S. 297: 1–37.[available online]
  • American Psychological Association, 2015: Brief Supporting Respondents in Fisher v. University of Texas, 136 S. Ct. 2198 (2016):1–37.[available online]
  • Anderson, Elizabeth S., 2002, “Integration, Affirmative Action, and Strict Scrutiny,” New York University Law Review, 77 (November): 1195–1271.
  • –––, 2004, “Racial Integration as a Compelling Interest,” Constitutional Commentary, 21 (Spring): 15–40.
  • –––, 2010, The Imperative of Integration, Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2011, “Affirmative Action Is About Helping Us All,” Chronicle of Higher Education, 57 (38): 811–813.
  • Appiah, Kwame Anthony, 2000, “Stereotypes and the Shaping of Identity,” California Law Review, 88: 41–54.
  • –––, 2011, “Group Rights and Racial Affirmative Action,” Journal of Ethics, 15 (September): 265–280.
  • ––– and Amy Gutmann, 1996, Color Conscious: The Political Morality of Race, Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • Arcidiacono, Peter et al., 2011a, “Representation versus Assimilation: How Do Preferences in College Admissions Affect Social Interaction?” Journal of Public Economics, 95 (February): 1–15.
  • –––, 2011b, “Does Affirmative Action Lead to Mismatch? A New Test and Evidence,” Quantitative Economics, 2 (November): 303–333.
  • –––, 2012, “What Happens After Enrollment? An Analysis of the Time Path of Racial Differences in GPA and Major Choice,” IZA Journal of Labor Economics, 1 (October).
  • –––, 2014, “Affirmative Action and University Fit: Evidence from Prop 209,” IZA Journal of Labor Economics, 3: 1–29.
  • ––– and Jacob L. Vigdor, 2010, “Does the River Spill Over? Estimating the Economic Returns to Attending a Racial Diverse College,” Economic Inquiry, 48 (3): 537–557.
  • ––– and Cory Koedel, 2014, “Race and College Success: Evidence from Missouri,” American Economic Journal:Applied Economics, 6 (3): 20–57.
  • ––– and Michael Lovenheim, 2015, “Affirmative Action and Quality–Fit Tradeoff,” National Bureau of Economic Research: Working Paper No. 20–962: 1–84.
  • Arnold, N. Scott, 1998, “Affirmative Action and the Demands of Justice,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 15 (Summer): 133–175.
  • Astin, Alexander W. and Dongbin Kim, 2004, “Cross-Racial Interaction Among Undergraduates: Some Consequences, Causes, and Patterns,” Research in Higher Education, 45 (August): 529–554.
  • Ayers, Ian and Richard Brooks, 2005, “Does Affirmative Action Reduce the Number of Black Lawyers?” Stanford Law Review, 57 (May): 1807–1854.
  • Barnes, Katherine Y., 2007, “Is Affirmative Action Responsible for the Achievement Gap Between Black and White Law Students?” Northwestern University Law Review, 101 (Fall): 1759–1808.
  • –––, 2011, “Is Affirmative Action Responsible for the Achievement Gap Between Black and White Law Students? A Correction, a Lesson and an Update,” Northwestern University Law Review, 101 (Spring): 791–812.
  • Beauchamp, Tom L., 1998, “In Defense of Affirmative Action,” Journal of Ethics, 2: 143–158.
  • Beckwith, Francis J., 1999, “The ‘No One Deserves His or Her Talents’ Argument for Affirmative Action: A Critical Analysis,” Social Theory and Practice, 25 (Spring): 53–60.
  • ––– and Todd E. Jones (eds.), 1997, Affirmative Action: Social Justice or Reverse Discrimination? Amherst, New York: Prometheus Books.
  • Bell, Derrick, 2003, “Diversity’s Distractions,” Columbia Law Review, 103 (October): 1622–1633.
  • Bergmann, Barbara R., 1996, In Defense of Affirmative Action. New York: Basic Books.
  • Berrey, E., 2015, The Enigma of Diversity: The Language of Race and the Limits of Racial Justice, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Black, Virginia, 1974, “The Erosion of Legal Principles in the Creation of Legal Policies,” Ethics, 84 (January): 93–115.
  • Bleemer, Zachary, 2023, “Affirmative Action and Its Race-Neutral Alternatives,” Journal of Public Economics, 220: 1–16.
  • Blum, Lawrence, 2015, “Race and Class Categories and Subcategories in Educational Thought and Research,” Theory and Research in Education, 13: 87–104.
  • Boddie, Elise C., 2016, “The Constitutionality of Racially Integrative Purpose,” Cardozo Law Review, 38: 531–550.
  • Boonin, David, 2011, Should Race Matter? Unusual Answers to the Usual Questions, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Borter, Gabriella, 2023, “Most Americans Think College Admissions Should Not Consider Race,” Reuters/Isos Poll, February 15.[available online]
  • Boudreaux, Paul, 2004, “Diversity and Democracy,” University of Cincinnati Law Review, 72: 961–976.
  • Bovens, Luc, 2016, “Selection Under Uncertainty: Affirmative Action at Shortlisting Stage,” Mind, 125: 421–437.
  • Bowen, Dierdre M., 2010, “Brilliant Disguise: An Empirical Study of a Social Experiment Banning Affirmative Action,” Indiana Law Journal, 85 (Fall): 1197–1254.
  • Bowen, William G. and Derek Bok, 1998. The Shape of the River: Long-Term Consequences of Considering Race in College and University Admissions, Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press
  • –––, Matthew M. Chingos, and Michael S. McPherson, 2009, Crossing the Finish Line: Completing College at America’s Public Universities, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Boxill, Bernard, 1972, “The Morality of Reparation,” Social Theory and Practice, 2 (Spring): 113–123.
  • –––, 1978, “The Morality of Preferential Hiring,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 7 (Spring): 246–268.
  • –––, 1984, Blacks and Social Justice, Totowa, New Jersey: Rowman and Allanheld; revised edition, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield, 1992.
  • –––, 2010, “Discrimination, Affirmative Action, and Diversity in Business,” in George G. Brenkert and Tom L. Beauchamp (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Business Ethics,Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp.535–562.
  • ––– and Jan Boxill, 2003, “Affirmative Action” in R. G. Frey (ed), A Companion to Applied Ethics, Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell Publishing, pp. 118–127.
  • Boylan, Michael, 2002, “Affirmative Action: Strategies for the Future,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 33 (Spring): 117–130.
  • Bridges, Khiara M., 2017, “The Deserving Poor, the Undeserving Poor, and Class-Based Affirmative Action,” Emory Law Journal, 66: 1049–1114.
  • Brown, Kevin, 2010, “Perspective and Point of View on Affirmative Action,” Indiana Law Journal, 85 (Fall): 1301–1313.
  • ––– and Jeannine Bell, 2008, “Demise of the Talented Tenth: Affirmative Action and the Increasing Underrepresentation of Ascendant Blacks at Selective Higher Educational Institutions,” Ohio State Law Journal, 69: 1229–1284.
  • Burns, Prue and Jan Schapper, 2008, “The Ethical Case for Affirmative Action,” Journal of Business Ethics, 83 (December): 369–379.
  • Cahn, Steven M. (ed.), 1993, Affirmative Action and the University: A Philosophical Inquiry, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1995, The Affirmative Action Debate, New York: Routledge. [Contains main articles from the 1970s.]
  • Camilli, Gregory and Kevin G. Welner, 2011, “Is There a Mismatch Effect in Law School, Why Might It Arise, and What Would It Mean?” Journal of College and University Law, 37: 491–527.
  • ––– and Darrel D. Jackson, 2011, “The Mismatch Hypothesis in Law School Admissions,” Widener Journal of Law, Economics, and Race, 2: 165–209.
  • Campbell, Colin and Dale Smith, 2017, “Deliberative Freedoms and the Asymmetric Features of Anti-Discrimination Law,” University of Toronto Law Journal, 67: 247–287.
  • Capaldi, Nicholas, 1985, Out of Order: Affirmative Action and the Crisis of Doctrinaire Liberalism, Buffalo, New York: Prometheus Books.
  • –––, 1998, “The Liberal Paradigm in Affirmative Action Law,” Loyola Law Review, 43 (Winter): 525–568.
  • Card, Robert F., 2005, “Making Sense of the Diversity–Based Legal Argument for Affirmative Action,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 19 (January): 11–24.
  • Carleton, Francis and Jennifer Nutt Carleton, 1998, “An Ethic of Care Applied: A Critical Analysis of Affirmative Action Jurisprudence,” Temple Political & Civil Rights Law Review, 8: 87–111.
  • Carnevale, Anthony P. and Stephen J. Rose, 2003, Socioeconomic Status, Race/Ethnicity, and Selective College Admissions, New York: The Century Foundation.
  • Carter, Stephen L., 1991, Reflections of an Affirmative Action Baby, New York: Basic Books.
  • Chambers, David L., Timothy T. Clydesdale, William Kidder, and Richard O. Lempert, 2005, “The Real Impact of Eliminating Affirmative Action in American Law Schools: An Empirical Critique of Richard Sander’s Study,” Stanford Law Review, 57 (May): 1855–1898.
  • Chang, Mitchell J. et al. (eds.), 2003, Compelling Interest: Examining the Evidence on Racial Dynamics in Colleges and Universities, Stanford, California: Stanford University Press.
  • Clarke, Simon, 2006, “The Case for Affirmative Action,” The Philosopher’s Magazine, Issue 33 (First Quarter): 73–77.
  • Cohen, Carl, 1995, Naked Racial Preference, Lanham, Maryland: Madison Books.
  • –––, 1998, “The Corruption That is Group Preference,” Academic Questions, 11 (Summer): 14–22.
  • –––, 2007, “The Michigan Civil Rights Initiative and the Civil Rights Act of 1964,” Michigan Law Review First Impressions, 105: 117–122.
  • ––– and James Sterba, 2003. Affirmative Action and Racial Preferences: A Debate, New York: Oxford University Press. Reviewed by:
    • Beauchamp, T. L., 2006, “Affirmative Action and Racial Preference: A Debate,” Mind, 115 (July): 747–750.
    • Ball, Stephen W., 2005, “Affirmative Action and Racial Preference: A Debate,” Ethics, 116 (October): 226–228.
    • Kershnar, Stephen, 2004, “Review of Carl Cohen, James Sterba, Affirmative Action and Racial Preference,” Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, July 6. [available online]
  • –––, 2011, “Review: The Next Twenty Five Years: Affirmative Action in Higher Education in the United States and South Africa,” Academic Questions, 24 (March): 31–33.
  • Cohen, Marshall et al. (eds.), 1977, Equality and Preferential Treatment, Princeton: Princeton University Press. [Contains the early articles in Philosophy & Public Affairs.]
  • Cokorinos, Lee, 2003, The Assault on Diversity:An Organized Challenge to Racial and Gender Justice, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Consolidated Brief of Lt. General Julius W. Becton, Jr., et al., 2003, in Grutter v. Bollinger, S. Ct. Nos. 02-241 & 02-516, pp. 1–30.
  • Corlett, J. Angelo, 1993, “Racism and Affirmative Action,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 24 (Spring): 163–175.
  • –––, 2003, Race, Racism, and Reparations, Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press.
  • Cowan, J. L., 1972, “Inverse Discrimination,” Analysis, 33 (October): 10–12.
  • Cox, Archibald, 1976, The Role of the Supreme Court in American Government, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Crosby, Faye L., 2004, Affirmative Action Is Dead: Long Live Affirmative Action, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Crenshaw, Kimberle W., 2007, “Framing Affirmative Action,” Michigan Law Review First Impressions, 105: 123–133.
  • Curry, George E. (ed.), 1996, The Affirmative Action Debate, Reading, Massachusetts: Addison-Wesley Publishing Company.
  • Darby, Derrick, 2009, “Educational Inequality and the Science of Diversity in Grutter: A Lesson for the Reparations Debate in the Age of Obama,” Kansas Law Review, 57: 755–793.
  • Davis, Michael, 1981. “Racial Quotas, Weights, and Real Possibilities,” Social Theory and Practice, 7 (Spring): 49–84.
  • Dale, Stacy Berg and Alan B. Krueger, 2002, “Estimating the Payoff to Attending a More Selective College: An Application of Selection on Observables and Nonobservables,” Quarterly Journal of Economics, 117 (November): 1491–1527.
  • –––, 2014, “Estimating the Effects of College Characteristics over the Career Using Administrative Earnings Data,” Journal of Human Resources, 49: 323–358.
  • Delgado, Richard, 2007, “Rodrigo’s Riposte: The Mismatch Theory of Law School Admissions,” Syracuse Law Review, 57 (3): 637–656.
  • DeVille, Kenneth and Loretta M. Kopelman, 2003, “Diversity, Trust, and Patient Care: Affirmative Action in Medical Education 25 Years after Bakke,” Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 28 (August): 489–516.
  • Dhingra, Neil and Campbell Scribner, 2021, “An Aristotelian Defence of Affirmative Action: Alasdair MacIntyre, Sandra Day O’Connor, and Grutter v. Bollinger,” Journal of Philosophy of Education, 55 (1): 83–98.
  • Dieterle, J. M., 2005, “Affirmative Action and Desert,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 19: 81–94.
  • Dixon, Jeffrey C. and Michael S. Rosenbaum, 2004, “Nice to Know You? Testing Contact, Cultural, and Group Threat Theories of Anti-Black and Anti-Hispanic Stereotypes,” Social Science Quarterly, 85 (June): 257–284
  • Dombrowski, Daniel, 2002, “Moral Individualism and Affirmative Action,” Professional Ethics, 10 (1): 39–60.
  • Dreyfuss, Joel and Charles Lawrence III, 1979, The Bakke Case: The Politics of Inequality, New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich.
  • Durlauf, Steven N., 2008, “Affirmative Action, Meritocracy, and Efficiency,” Politics, Philosophy and Economics, 7 (May): 131–158.
  • Dworkin, Ronald, 1977, Taking Rights Seriously, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press (Chapter 9, “Reverse Discrimination,” 223–239).
  • –––, 1985, A Matter of Principle, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press (Chapter 14, “Bakke’s Case: Are Quotas Unfair?” 293–303; Chapter 15, “What Did Bakke.Really Decide?” 304–315).
  • –––, 1998, “Is Affirmative Action Doomed?” New York Review of Books, 45 (November 5): 56–60.
  • –––, 2000, Sovereign Virtue: The Theory and Practice of Equality, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press (Chapter 11, “Affirmative Action: Does It Work?” pp. 386–408; Chapter 12, “Affirmative Action: Is It Fair?” pp. 409–426).
  • –––, 2003, “The Court and the University,” New York Review of Books, May 15.
  • –––, 2012, “The Case Against Color-Blind Admissions,” New York Review of Books, May 15.
  • Edwards, John, 1995, When Race Counts: The Morality of Racial Preference in Britain and America, London: Routledge.
  • Eastland, Terry, 1996, Ending Affirmative Action: The Case for Colorblind Justice, New York: Basic Books.
  • ––– and William J. Bennett, 1979, Counting By Race: Equality from the Founding Fathers to Bakke and Weber, New York: Basic Books.
  • Edley, Christopher, Jr., 1996, Not All Black and White: Affirmative Action and American Values, New York: Hill and Wang.
  • Elliott, Rogers et al., 1996, “The Role of Ethnicity in Choosing and Leaving Science in Highly Selective Institutions,” Research in Higher Education, 37 (December): 681–709.
  • Epstein, Richard A., 2002, “A Rational Basis for Affirmative Action: A Shaky but Classical Liberal Defense,” Michigan Law Review, 100 (August): 2036–2061.
  • Erler, Edward J., 1997, “The Future of Civil Rights: Affirmative Action Redivivus,” Notre Dame Journal of Law, Ethics and Public Policy, 11: 15–65.
  • Espinshade, Thomas et al., 2004, “Admission Preferences for Minority Students, Athletes, and Legacies at Elite Universities,” Social Science Quarterly, 85: 1422–1446.
  • Estlund, Cynthia L., 2000, “Working Together: The Workplace, Civil Society, and the Law,” Georgetown Law Journal, 89: 79–85.
  • Executive Order 11246, 1965, September 24.
  • Ezorsky, Gertrude, 1991, Racism and Justice: The Case for Affirmative Action, Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1977, “Hiring Women Faculty,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 7 (Autumn): 82–91.
  • Feinberg, Walter, 1998, On Higher Ground: Education and the Case for Affirmative Action, New York: Teachers College Press.
  • –––, 2003, “Affirmative Action,” in Hugh LaFollette (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Practical Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 272–299.
  • Fischer, Mary J. and Douglas S. Massey, 2007, “The Effects of Affirmative Action in Higher Education,” Social Science Research, 36: 531–549.
  • Fiscus, Ronald J., 1992, The Constitutional Logic of Affirmative Action, Durham, North Carolina: Duke University Press.
  • Fishkin, James S., “Liberty Versus Equal Opportunity,” Social Philosophy & Policy, 5: 32–48.
  • Fiss, Owen, 1976, “Groups and the Equal Protection Clause,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 5 (Winter): 107–177.
  • Forde-Mazrui, Kim, 2004, “Taking Conservatives Seriously: A Moral Justification for Affirmative Action and Reparations,” California Law Review, 92 (May): 683–753.
  • Fortune 100 and Other Leading American Businesses, 2013: Brief Supporting Respondents in Fisher v. University of Texas,570 U.S. 297: 1–19.[available online]
  • Fullinwider, Robert K., 1975, “Preferential Hiring and Compensation,” Social Theory and Practice, (Spring): 307–320.
  • –––, 1980, The Reverse Discrimination Controversy: A Moral and Legal Analysis, Totowa, New Jersey: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • –––, 1986a, “Reverse Discrimination and Equal Opportunity,” in Joseph P. DeMarco and Richard M. Fox (eds), New Directions in Ethics: The Challenge of Applied Ethics, New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 173–189.
  • –––, 1986b, “Achieving Equal Opportunity,” in Fullinwider and Mills (eds.), 99–114.
  • –––, 1994, “Indefensible Defenses of Affirmative Action,” in M. N. S. Sellers (ed.), An Ethical Education: Community and Morality in the Multicultural University, Oxford: Berg Publishers, 233–242.
  • –––, 1997, “The Life and Death of Racial Preferences,” Philosophical Studies, 85 (March): 163–180.
  • –––, 2002, “Diversity and Affirmative Action,” in Verna V. Gehring and William A. Galston (eds.), Philosophical Dimensions of Public Policy, New Brunswick, New Jersey: Transaction Publishers, 115–124.
  • –––, 2007, “The Case for Reparations,” in Michael T. Martin and Marilyn Yaquinto (eds.). Redress for Historical Injustices in the United States, Durham, North Carolina: Duke University Press, 121–132.
  • ––– and Claudia Mills, eds.), 1986, The Moral Foundations of Civil Rights, Totowa, New Jersey: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • ––– and Judith Lichtenberg, 2004, Leveling the Playing Field: Justice, Politics, and College Admissions, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Gahringer, Robert E., 1979, “Race and Class: The Basic Issue of the Bakke Case,” Ethics, 90 (October): 97–114.
  • Gallegos Ordorica, Sergio A., 2015, “Prospects of a Dusselian Ethics of Liberation Among U S Minorities: The Case of Affirmative Action in Higher Education,” Inter-American Journal of Philosophy, 6: 1–15.
  • Galston, William A., 2023, “End College Legacy Preferences,” Wall Street Journal, July 5: A13.
  • Ghassemian, Andrew J. III, 2003, “Compensatory Justice in Affirmative Action,” Current Surgery, 60 (November): 596–597.
  • Gitlin, Adam, 2007, “What the MCRI Can Teach White Litigants about White Dominance,” Michigan Law Review First Impressions, 105: 134–138.
  • Glazer, Nathan, 1975, Affirmative Discrimination: Ethnic Inequality and Public Policy, New York: Basic Books.
  • –––, 1998, “For Racial Dispensation in Admissions,” Academic Questions, 11 (Summer): 22–32.
  • Goldman, Alan, 1975, “Reparations to Individuals or Groups?” Analysis, 35 (April): 168–170.
  • –––, 1976, “Affirmative Action,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 5 (Winter): 178–195.
  • –––, 1979, Justice and Reverse Discrimination, Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1987, “The Justification of Equal Opportunity,” Social Philosophy & Policy, 5: 88–103.
  • Gramlich, John, 2023, “Americans and Affirmative Action: How the Public Sees the Consideration of Race in College Admissions, Hiring,” Pew Research Center, June 16.[available online]
  • Graham, Hugh Davis, 1990, The Civil Rights Era: Origins and Development of National Policy 1960–1972, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Greenawalt, Kent, 1983, Discrimination and Reverse Discrimination, New York: Alfred A. Knopf.
  • Gross, Barry R., 1978, Discrimination in Reverse: Is Turnabout Fair Play? New York: New York University Press.
  • –––, (ed.), 1977a. Reverse Discrimination, Buffalo, New York: Prometheus Books.
  • –––, 1977b, “Is Turn About Fair Play?” in Gross (ed.), 379–408.
  • Guenin, Louis M., 1997, “Affirmative Action in Higher Education as Redistribution,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 11 (April): 117–140.
  • Guinier, Lani and Susan Sturm, 2001, Who’s Qualified? Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Gurin, Patricia, 1999, Expert Report, Grutter v. Bollinger, Michigan Journal of Race and Law, 5 (Fall): 363–425.
  • –––, Eric L. Day, Sylvia Hurtado, and Gerald Gurin, 2002, “Diversity and Higher Education: Theory and Impact on Educational Outcomes,” Harvard Educational Review, 72 (Fall): 330–337.
  • –––, Brian A. Nagda, and Gretchin E. Lopez, (2004), “The Benefits of Diversity in Education for Democratic Citizenship,” Journal of Social Issues, 60 (March): 17–34.
  • Gutmann, Amy and Dennis Thompson, 1996, Democracy and Disagreement, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press.
  • Hajdin, Mane, 2002, “Affirmative Action, Old and New,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 33 (Spring): 83–96.
  • Hansson, Sven Ove, 2004, “What are Opportunities and Why Should They Be Equal?” Social Choice & Welfare, 22 (April): 305–317.
  • Harris, Luke C., 2003, “Contesting the Ambivalence and Hostility to Affirmative Action within the Black Community,” in Tommy L. Lott (ed.), A Companion to African-American Philosophy, Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell Publishing, 324–332.
  • ––– and Uma Narayan, 1994, “Affirmative Action and the Myth of Preferential: A Transformative Critique of the Terms of the Affirmative Action Debate,” Harvard Journal of Ethnic and Racial Justice (formerly Harvard Blackletter Law Journal), 11: 1–35.
  • Haslett, D. W., 2002, “Workplace Discrimination, Good Cause, and Color Blindness,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 36: 73–88.
  • Hasnas, John, 2002, “Equal Opportunity, Affirmative Action, and the Anti-Discrimination Principle: The Philosophical Basis for the Legal Prohibition of Discrimination,” Fordham Law Review, 71 (November): 423–542.
  • Heilman, Madeline E., 1997, “Sex Discrimination and the Affirmative Action Remedy: The Role of Sex Stereotypes,” Journal of Business Ethics, 16 (June): 877–889.
  • Hess, Ryan C., 2007, “A Sheep in Wolf’s Clothing: The Michigan Civil Rights Initiative as the Savior of Affirmative Action,” Michigan Law Review First Impressions, 105: 139–143.
  • Hill, Thomas E., 1991, “The Message of Affirmative Action,” Social Philosophy & Policy, 8 (Spring): 108–129.
  • Himma, Kenneth Einar, 2001, “Discrimination and Disidentification: The Fair-Start Defense of Affirmative Action,” Journal of Business Ethics, 30 (April): 277–289.
  • –––, 2002, “Desert, Entitlement, and Affirmative Action: A Response to Francis Beckwith,” Social Theory and Practice, 28 (January): 157–166.
  • Hinrichs, Peter, 2014, “Affirmative Action Bans and College Graduation Rates,” Economics of Education Review, 42: 43–52.
  • Ho, Daniel E., 2005, “Why Affirmative Action Does Not Cause Black Students to Fail the Bar: A Reply to Sander,” Yale Law Journal, 114 (June): 1997–2004.
  • Hull, George, 2015, “Affirmative Action and the Choice of Amends,” Philosophia, 43: 113–134.
  • –––, 2017, “Discrimination and Diversity,” in Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen (ed.), The Routledge Handbook of the Ethics of Discrimination, New York: Routledge, pp. 407–420.
  • Ibarra, Robert A., 2001, Beyond Affirmative Action: Reframing the Context of Higher Education, Madison, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Issacharoff, Samuel, 2002, “Law and Misdirection in the Debate Over Affirmative Action,” University of Chicago Legal Forum, 2002(1): 11–43, available online.
  • Jacobs, Lesley A., 2004, Pursuing Equal Opportunities: The Theory and Practice of Egalitarian Justice, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jaggar, Alison, 1997, “Gender, Race, and Difference: Individual Consideration versus Group-Based Affirmative Action in Admission to Higher Education,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 35 (Spring): 21–51.
  • Johnson, Kevin R.and Angela Onwuachi–Willig, 2005, “Cry Me a River: The Limits of A Systemic Analysis of Affirmative Action in American Law Schools,” African-American Law and Policy Report, 7 (1): 1–29.
  • Johnson, Susan M. and Xia Li Lollar, 2002, “Diversity Policy in Higher Education: The Impact of College Students’ Exposure to Diversity on Cultural Awareness and Political Participation,” Journal of Education Policy, 17 (June): 305–321.
  • Jones, Trina, 2005, “The Diversity Rationale: A Problematic Solution,” Stanford Journal of Civil Rights & Civil Liberties, 1: 171–215.
  • Joshi, Yuvraj, 2017, “Measuring Diversity,” Columbia Law Review Online, 117: 54–69.
  • Kahlenberg, Richard D., 1996, The Remedy: Class, Race, and Affirmative Action, New York: Basic Books.
  • –––,(ed.), 2010, Rewarding Strivers: Helping Low–Income Students Succeed in College, New York: Century Foundation.
  • –––, 2012, A Better Affirmative Action: State Universities That Created Alternatives to Racial Preferences, New York: The Century Foundation.
  • Kahn, Jonathan, 2017, Race on the Brain: What Implicit Bias Gets Wrong About the Struggle for Racial Justice, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Kang, Jerry and Mahzarin R. Banajiff, 2006, “Fair Measures: A Behavioral Realist Revision of Affirmative Action,” California Law Review, 94: 1063–1118.
  • Kennedy, Randall, 2015, For Discrimination: Race, Affirmative Action, and the Law, New York: Vintage Books
  • Kershnar, Stephen, 1997, “Strong Affirmative Action at State Institutions Cannot Be Justified Via Compensatory Justice,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 11 (October): 345–363.
  • –––, 1999, “Uncertain Damages to Racial Minorities and Strong Affirmative Action,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 13 (January): 83–98.
  • –––, 1999, “Strong Affirmative Action Programs and Disproportionate Burdens,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 33 (June): 201–209.
  • –––, 2004, “Why Equal Opportunity is Not a Valuable Goal,” Journal of Applied Philosophy, 21 (August): 159–173.
  • Ketchum, Sara Ann and Christine Pierce, 1976, “Implicit Racism,” Analysis, 36 (January): 91–95.
  • Kidder, William c., 2016, “How Workable Are Class-Based and Race-Neutral Alternatives at Leading American Universities?” UCLA Law Review Discourse, 64: 100–131.
  • ––– and Richard O. Lempert, 2015, “The Mismatch Myth in U.S. Higher Education: A Synthesis of Empirical Evidence at the Law School and Undergraduate Levels,” in Uma Jayakumar and Liliana M. Garces (eds.), Affirmative Action and Racial Equality, New York: Routledge, 105–129.
  • Klor de Alva, Jorge, 1996, “Is Affirmative Action a Christian Heresy?” Representations, 55 (Summer): 59–73.
  • Kocis, Robert A., 2010, “Discriminatory Privileges, Compensatory Privileges, and Affirmative Action,” in Christi Favor et al.(eds.), Essays in Philosophy, Politics, and Economics, Stanford, California:: Stanford University Press, 139–156.
  • Koppelman, Andrew and Donald Rebstock, 2007, “On Affirmative Action and Truly Individualized Consideration,” Northwestern University Law Review, 101 (Spring): 1469–1481.
  • Kull, Andrew, 1992, The Color Blind Constitution, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press.
  • Landau, Iddo, 1997, “Are You Entitled to Affirmative Action?” International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 11 (Winter-Spring): 17–22.
  • Lawrence, Charles R. III, 2001, “Two Views of the River: A Critique of the Liberal Defense of Affirmative Action,” Columbia Law Review, 101 (May): 928–976.
  • ––– and Mari J. Matsuda, 1997, We Won’t Go Back: Making the Case for Affirmative Action, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • Leach, Bryan W., 2004, “Race as Mission Critical: The Occupational Need Rationale in Military Affirmative Action and Beyond,” Yale Law Journal, 113 (March): 1093–1143.
  • Leading Public Research Universities, 2015: Brief Supporting Respondents in Fisher v. University of Texas, 136 S. Ct. 2198 (2016): 1–33.
  • LeFevre, Joseph, 2003, “The Value of Diversity: A Justification of Affirmative Action,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 34 (March): 125–133.
  • Leiter, Brian, 2017, “Is ‘Diversity’ the Best Reason for Affirmative Action?” Chronicle of Higher Education, 64 (September 29): 1.
  • Lempert, Richard, 2016, “Mismatch and Science Desistance: Failed Arguments against Affirmative Action,” UCLA Law Review and Discourse, 64: 136–174.
  • –––, David L. Chambers, and Terry K. Adams, 2000, “Michigan’s Minority Graduates in Practice: The River Runs Through Law School,” Law and Social Inquiry, 25 (April): 395–505.
  • Libertella, Anthony F., Sebastian A. Sora, and Samuel M. Natale, 2007, “Affirmative Action Policy and Changing Views,” Journal of Business Ethics, 74 (August): 65–71.
  • Lichtenberg, Judith and David Luban, 2002, “The Merits of Merit,” in Verna V. Gehring and William A. Galston (eds). Philosophical Dimensions of Public Policy, New Brunswick, New Jersey: Transaction Publishers, 101–113.
  • Lindgren, J. Ralph, 1981, “The Irrelevance of Philosophical Treatments of Affirmative Action,” Social Theory and Practice, 7 (Spring): 1–19.
  • Lippert–Rasmussen, Kasper, 2008, “Discrimination and the Aim of Proportional Representation,” Philosophy, Politics and Economics, 7 (May): 159–182.
  • –––, 2011, “‘We Are All Different’: Statistical Discrimination and the Right to Be Treated as an Individual,” Journal of Ethics, 15: 47–59.
  • –––, 2017, “Affirmative Action, Historical Injustice, and the Concept of Beneficiaries,” Journal of Political Philosophy, 5: 72–90.
  • –––, 2020, Making Sense of Affirmative Action, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Loury, Glenn, 1987, “Why Should We Care About Group Inequality?” Social Philosophy & Policy, 5: 72–90.
  • Lukes, Timothy J., and Bonnie G. Campodonico, 1996, “Merit Badgering: Dissecting a Slippery Concept in the Affirmative Action Debate,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 10 (July): 219–227.
  • MacIntyre, Alasadair, 2016, Ethics in Conflicts of Modernity: An Essay on Desire, Practical Reasoning, and Narrative, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (Chapter 5, “Four Narratives”).
  • Malamud, Deborah C., 1997, “Assessing Class–Based Affirmative Action,” Journal of Legal Education, 47 (4): 452–471.
  • –––, 2011, “Class Privilege in Legal Education: A Response to Sander,” Denver University Law Review, 88 (4): 729–750.
  • Massey, Douglas S. et al., 2007, “Black Immigrants and Black Natives Attending Selective Colleges and Universities in the United States,” American Journal of Education, 113 (February): 243–271.
  • ––– and Margarita Mooney, 2007, “The Effects of America’s Three Affirmative Action Programs on Academic Performance,” Social Problems, 54: 99–117.
  • Massey, Stephen J., 1981, “Rethinking Affirmative Action,” Social Theory and Practice, 7 (Spring): 21–47.
  • Matthew, D. C., 2015, “Rawlsian Affirmative Action: A Reply to Robert Taylor,” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 19: 324–343.
  • McHugh, Peter, 2005, “Shared Being, Old Promises, and the Just Necessity of Affirmative Action,” Human Studies, 28 (2): 129–156.
  • Melguizo, Tatiana, 2008, “Quality Matters: Assessing the Impact of Attending More Selective Institutions on College Completion Rates of Minorities,” Research in Higher Education, 49: 214–236.
  • Meshelski, Kristina, 2016, “Procedural Justice and Affirmative Action,” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 19: 425–443.
  • Mills, Nicolaus (ed.), 1994, Debating Affirmative Action: Race, Gender, Ethnicity, and the Politics of Inclusion, New York: Dell Publishing.
  • Moreau, Sophia, 2010, “What Is Discrimination?” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 38:143–172.
  • –––, 2010, “Discrimination as Negligence,”Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 36 (December): 123–149.
  • Morioka, Sharon, “Meet Michigan Law’s JD Class of 2026,” Michigan Law News, [available online]
  • Mosley, Albert G., 1998, “Policies of Straw or Policies of Inclusion? A Review of Pojman’s ‘Case against Affirmative Action’,” International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 12 (Fall): 161–168.
  • ––– and Nicholas Capaldi, 1996, Affirmative Action: Social Justice or Unfair Preference? Lanham, Maryland: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Murray, Dale, 2005, “The Affirmative Action Debate,” Teaching Philosophy, 28 (June): 284–287.
  • Nagel, Thomas, 1973, “Equal Treatment and Compensatory Discrimination,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 2 (Summer): 348–363.
  • –––, 2003, “John Rawls and Affirmative Action,” Journal of Blacks in Higher Education, 28 (June): 284–287
  • Newton, Lisa, 1973, “Reverse Discrimination as Unjustified,” Ethics, 83 (July): 308–312.
  • Nickel, James W., 1972, “Discrimination and Morally Relevant Characteristics,” Analysis, 32 (March): 113–114.
  • –––, 1974, “Should Reparations Be to Individuals or Groups?” Analysis, 34 (April): 154–160.
  • –––, 1987, “Equal Opportunity in a Pluralistic Society,” Social Philosophy & Policy, 5: 104–119.
  • Nieli, Russell (ed.), 1991, Racial Preference and Racial Justice: The New Affirmative Action Controversy, Washington, D.C.: Ethics and Public Policy Center.
  • –––, 2012, Wounds That Will Not Heal: Affirmative Action and Our Continuing Racial Divide, New York: Encounter Books.
  • Nunn, William A., 1974, “Reverse Discrimination,” Analysis, 34 (April): 151–154.
  • O’Neil, Robert M., 1975, Discriminating Against Discrimination: Preferential Admissions and the DeFunis Case, Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press.
  • O’Neill, June Ellenhoff, 1987, “Discrimination and Income Inequality,” Social Philosophy & Policy 5: 169–187.
  • O’Neill, Onora, 1987, “Rights to Compensation,” Social Policy & Philosophy, 5: 72–87.
  • Onwuachi-Willig, Angela, 2007, “The Admission of Legacy Blacks,” Vanderbilt Law Review, 60: 1138–1231.
  • Orfield, Gary with Michael Kurlaender (eds.), 2001. Diversity Challenged: Evidence on the Impact of Affirmative Action, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard Education Publishing Group.
  • Orlans, Harold and June O’Neill (eds.), 1992, Affirmative Action Revisited, Newbury Park, California: Sage.
  • Owen, Matthew S. and Danielle S. Barbour, 2007, “Disparate Impact and the Use of Racial Proxies in Post–MCRI Admissions,” Michigan Law Review First Impressions, 105: 144–148.
  • Paul, Ellen Frankel et al. (eds.), 1991, Reassessing Civil Rights, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Pell, Terence J., 2003, “What’s the Big Deal about Racial Preferences?” Journal of Social Philosophy, 34 (Summer): 326–329.
  • –––, 2004, “The Nature of Claims about Race and the Debate over Racial Preferences” International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 18 (1): 13–26.
  • Pidot, Justin, 2006, “Intuition or Proof: The Social Science Justification for the Diversity Rationale in Grutter v. Bollinger and Gratz v. Bollinger,” Stanford Law Review, 59 (December): 761–808.
  • Pojman, Louis, 1992, “The Moral Status of Affirmative Action,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 6 (April): 181–206.
  • –––, 1998, “The Case against Affirmative Action,” International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 12 (Spring): 97–115.
  • –––, 1998, “Straw Man or Straw Theory? A Reply to Albert Mosley,” International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 12 (Fall): 169–180.
  • Post, Robert, 1998, “Introduction: After Bakke,” in Robert Post and Michael Rogin (eds.), Race and Representation: Affirmative Action, New York: Zone Books, pp. 13–27.
  • Purdy, Laura, 1994. “Why Do We Need Affirmative Action?” Journal of Social Philosophy, 25 (Spring): 133–143.
  • Rachels, James, 1978, “What People Deserve,” in John Arthur and William Shaw (eds.), Justice and Economic Distribution, Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice-Hall, 150–163.
  • Radin, Margaret Jane, 1991, “Affirmative Action Rhetoric,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 8 (Spring): 130–149.
  • Rawls, John, 1971, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2001, Justice as Fairness: A Restatement, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press.
  • Reynolds, William Bradford, 1984, “Individualism vs. Group Rights: The Legacy of Brown,” Yale Law Journal, 93 (May): 995–1005.
  • Rosenberg, Alexander, 1987, “The Political Philosophy of Biological Endowments: Some Considerations,” Social Philosophy & Policy, 5: 1–31.
  • Rosenfeld, Michel, 1991, Affirmative Action and Justice: A Philosophical and Constitutional Inquiry, New Haven, Connecticut: Yale University Press.
  • Rothman, Stanley, S. M. Lipset, and Neil Nevitte, 2002, “Diversity and Affirmative Action: The State of Campus Opinion,” Academic Questions, 15 (Fall): 52–67.
  • –––, 2003, “Racial Diversity Reconsidered,” Public Interest, 151 (Spring): 25–38.
  • Rothstein, Jesse and Albert H. Yoon, 2008, “Affirmative Action in Law School Admissions: What Do Racial Preferences Do?” University of Chicago Law Review, 75 (Spring): 649–714.
  • Rush, Sharon, 1994, “Understanding Affirmative Action: One Feminist’s Perspective,” in M. N. S. Sellers (ed.). An Ethical Education: Community and Morality in the Multicultural University, Oxford: Berg Publishers, 195–132.
  • Sabbagh, Daniel, 2007, Equality and Transparency: A Strategic Perspective on Affirmative Action in American Law, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Sandalow, Terrance, 1999, “Identity and Equality: Minority Preferences Reconsidered,” Michigan Law Review, 97 (May): 1874–1916.
  • Sandel, Michael J., 2009, Justice: What’s the Right Thing to Do? New York: Farrar, Strauss and Giroux.
  • –––, 2020, The Tyranny of Merit: Can We Find the Common Good? New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux.
  • Sander, Richard H., 1997, “Experimenting with Class–Based Affirmative Action,” Journal of Legal Education, 47 (4): 472–503.
  • –––, 2004, “A Systemic Analysis of Affirmative Action in American Law Schools,” Stanford Law Review, 57 (November): 367–484.
  • –––, 2005, “A Reply to Critics,” Stanford Law Review, 57 (May): 1963–2016.
  • –––, 2011, “Class in American Legal Education,” Denver University Law Review, 88 (4): 631–682.
  • ––– and Jane Bambauer, 2012, “The Secret of My Success: How Status, Eliteness, and School Performance Shape Legal Careers,” Journal of Empirical Legal Studies, 9: 893–930.
  • ––– and Stuart Taylor, Jr., 2012, Mismatch: How Affirmative Action Hurts Students It’s Intended to Help, and Why Universities Won’t Admit It, Philadelphia: Basic Books.
  • Sartorelli, Joseph J., 1994, “Ruse on Gay Rights and Affirmative Action,” Analysis, 54 (April): 84–91.
  • –––, 1997, “The Nature of Affirmative Action, Anti-Gay Oppression, and the Alleviation of Enduring Harm,” International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 11 (Winter-Spring): 23–30.
  • Schmidt, Peter, 2008, “Scholars Mount Sweeping Effort to Measure Affirmative Action in Higher Education,” Chronicle of Higher Education, 54 (January 19): A19.
  • Schmill, Stu, 2022, “We are reinstating our SAT/ACT requirement for future admissions cycles,” MIT [available online]
  • Segev, Re’em, 2019, “Affirmative Action: Well-Being, justice, and Qualifications,” Ratio Juris, 32 (June): 138–156.
  • Shelby, Tommie, 2014, “Integration, Inequality, and Imperatives of Justice: A Review Essay,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 42 (Summer): 253–285.
  • Sher, George, 1975, “Justifying Reverse Discrimination in Employment,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 4 (Winter): 159–170.
  • –––, 1979, “Reverse Discrimination, the Future, and the Past,” Ethics, 90 (October): 81–87.
  • –––, 1997, Approximate Justice: Studies in Non-Ideal Theory, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Shiner, Roger, 1973, “Individuals, Groups and Inverse Discrimination,” Analysis, 33 (June): 185–187.
  • Silvestri, Philip, 1973, “The Justification of Inverse Discrimination,” Analysis, 34 (October): 31.
  • Simon, Robert L., 1974, “Preferential Hiring: A Reply to Judith Jarvis Thomson,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 3 (Spring): 312–320.
  • –––, 1978, “Statistical Justification of Discrimination,” Analysis, 38 (January): 37–42.
  • –––, 1979, “Individual Rights and ‘Benign’ Discrimination,” Ethics, 90 (October): 88–97.
  • Skrentny, John David, 1996, The Ironies of Affirmative Action: Politics, Culture, and Justice in America, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2001, Color Lines: Affirmative Action, Immigration, and Civil Rights Options for America, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Smyth, Frederick L. and John J. McArdle, 2004, “Ethnic and Gender Differences in Science Graduation at Selective Colleges with Implications for Admission Policy and College Choice,” Research in Higher Education, 45 (June): 353–381.
  • Social and Organizational Psychologists, 2015: Brief in Support of Respondents in Fisher v. University of Texas, 136 S. Ct. 2198 (2016):1–44.
  • Sowell, Thomas, 2004, Affirmative Action Around the World: An Empirical Study, New Haven, Connecticut: Yale University Press. [Reviewed by Carl Cohen in Commentary, 117 (April 2004): 73–76, and by Bernard Boxill in Ethics & International Affairs, 18: 114–115).
  • Stark, Susan, 2004, “Taking Responsibility for Oppression: Affirmative Action and Racial Injustice,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 18 (July): 205–221.
  • Steiner, Hillel, 1987, “Capitalism, Justice and Equal Starts,” Social Philosophy & Policy, 5: 49–71.
  • Sterba, James P., 2003, “Defending Affirmative Action, Defending Preferences,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 34 (June): 285–300.
  • –––, 2004, “The Michigan Cases and Furthering the Justification of Affirmative Action,” International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 18 (1): 1–12.
  • –––, 2009, Affirmative Action for the Future, Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 2011, “Responses to Allen, Appiah, and Lawson,” Journal of Ethics, 15 (September): 291–306.
  • Strasser, Mark, 2010, “On Disguises, Tokens, and Affirmative Action Policies,” Indiana Law Journal, 85 (Fall): 1293–1301.
  • Stroud, Sarah, 1999, “The Aim of Affirmative Action,” Social Theory and Practice, 25 (Fall): 385–408.
  • Stroup, Timothy, 1982, “Affirmative Action and the Police,” International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 1 (Fall): 1–19.
  • Sturm, Susan and Lani Guinier, 1996, “The Future of Affirmative Action: Reclaiming an Innovative Ideal,” California Law Review, 84 (July): 953–1036.
  • Suk, Julie, 2017, “Discrimination and Affirmative Action,” in Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen (ed.), The Routledge Handbook of the Ethics of Discrimination, New York: Routledge, pp. 394–406.
  • Sumner, L. W., 1987, “Positive Sexism,” Social Philosophy & Policy, 5: 204–222.
  • Symposium, 1979, “Bakke—Civil Rights Perspectives,” Harvard Civil Rights-Civil Liberties Law Review, 14 (Spring).
  • Symposium, 1996a, “Race-Based Remedies,” California Law Review, 84 (July).
  • Symposium, 1996b, “The Meanings of Merit—Affirmative Action and the California Civil Rights Initiative,” Hastings Constitutional Law Quarterly, 23 (Summer).
  • Syverud, Kent D., 1999, Expert Report: Grutter v. Bollinger, Michigan Journal of Race and Law, 5 (Fall): 451–454.
  • Tam, Mo Yin S. and Gilbert W. Bassett, Jr., 2004, “Does Diversity Matter? Measuring the Impact of High School Diversity on Freshman GPA,” Policy Studies Journal, 32: 129–144.
  • Taylor, Paul, 1973, “Reverse Discrimination and Compensatory Justice,” Analysis, 33 (June): 177–182.
  • Taylor, Robert S., 2009, “Rawlsian Affirmative Action,” Ethics, 119 (April): 476–506.
  • Thernstrom, Stephan and Abigail Thernstrom, 1997, America in Black and White: One Nation, Indivisible, New York: Simon and Schuster.
  • –––, 1999, “Reflections on The Shape of the River,” UCLA Law Review, 46 (June): 1583–1631.
  • Thomas, Laurence, 2004, “Equality and the Mantra of Diversity,” University of Cincinnati Law Review, 72: 931–965.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis, 1973, “Preferential Hiring,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 2 (Summer): 364–384.
  • Tushnet, Mark, 1991, “Change and Continuity in the Concept of Civil Rights: Thurgood Marshall and Affirmative Action,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 8 (Spring): 150–171.
  • University of Texas, October 2015: Brief for Respondents, Fisher v. University of Texas, 136 S. Ct. 2198 (2016): 1–37.
  • Urofsky, Melvin I.,2022, The Affirmative Action Puzzle, New York: Skyhorse Publishing.
  • U. S. Commission on Civil Rights, 2007, Affirmative Action in American Law Schools, Washington, D.C.
  • Valls, Andrew, 1999, “The Libertarian Case for Affirmative Action,” Social Theory and Practice, 25 (Summer): 299–323.
  • Van Laar, Colette, Shana Levin, and Stacey Sinclair, 2008, “Social Identity and Personal Identity Stereotype Threat: The Case of Affirmative Action,” Basic and Applied Social Psychology, 30 (4): 295–310.
  • Van Patten, Jim, 1995, “Affirmative Action: Retrospect and Prospect,” Contemporary Philosophy, 17 (November-December): 2–7.
  • Van Roojen, Mark, 1997, “Affirmative Action, Non-Consequentialism, and Responsibility for the Effects of Past Discrimination,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 11 (July): 281–301.
  • Waldron, Jeremy, 1998, “Humility and the Curse of Injustice,” in Robert Post and Michael Rogin (eds.). Race and Representation: Affirmative Action, New York: Zone Books, 385–389.
  • Warnke, Georgia, 1998, “Affirmative Action, Neutrality, and Integration,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 29 (Winter): 87–103.
  • Warren, Mary Anne, 1977, “Secondary Sexism and Quota Hiring,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 6 (Spring): 240–261.
  • Washington, Tanya, 2004, “The Diversity Dichotomy: The Supreme Court’s Reticence to Give a Capital R,” University of Cincinnati Law Review, 72: 977–1009.
  • Wasserstrom, Richard, 1976, “Racism, Sexism, and Preferential Treatment: An Approach to the Topics,” UCLA Law Review, 24 (February): 581–622.
  • West–Faulcon, Kimberly, 2017, “Obscuring Asian Penalty with Illusions of Black Bonus,” UCLA Law Review, 64: 590–645.
  • Westmoreland, Robert, 2004, “A New and Improved Affirmative Action,” University of Cincinnati Law Review, 72: 909–929.
  • Wilkins, David B., 2000, “Law School Affirmative Action: An Empirical Study Rollin’ on the River: Race, Elite Schools, and the Equality Paradox,” Law and Social Inquiry, 25 (April): 527–555.
  • –––, 2005, “A Systematic Response to Systematic Disadvantage? A Response to Sander,” Stanford Law Review, 57 (May): 1915–1961.
  • Williams, Doug, 2013, “Do Racial Preferences Affect Minority Learning in Law Schools?” Journal of Empirical Legal Studies, 10 (June): 171–195.
  • –––, Richard H. Sander, Marc Luppino, and Roger Bolus, 2011, “Revisiting Law School Mismatch: A Comment on Barnes (2007, 2011),” Northwestern University Law Review, 105 (2): 813–828.
  • Williams, Reginald, 2005, “Affirmative Action, the ‘May the Best Person Win’ Intuition, and Mill’s The Subjection of Women,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 19 (January): 65–80.
  • Wise, Tim, 2005, Affirmative Action: Racial Preference in Black and White, New York: Routledge.
  • Wolf-Devine, Celia, 1988, “An Inequity in Affirmative Action,” Journal of Applied Philosophy, 5 (March): 107–108.
  • –––, 1997, Diversity and Community in the Academy: Affirmative Action in Faculty Appointments, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Wood, Peter, 2003, Diversity: The Invention of a Concept, San Francisco: Encounter Books.
  • Woodruff, Paul, 1976, “What’s Wrong with Discrimination?” Analysis, 36 (March): 158–160.
  • Yates, Steven, 1994, Civil Wrongs: What Went Wrong with Affirmative Action, San Francisco: Institute for Contemporary Studies.
  • Young, Iris Marion, 1990, Justice and the Politics of Difference, Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • Xiang, Alice and Donald B. Rubin, 2015, “Assessing the Potential Impact of a Nationwide Class–Based Affirmative Action System,” Statistical Science, 30 (3): 297–327.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2024 by
Robert Fullinwider <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free