Equality of Opportunity

First published Thu Aug 3, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Gideon Elford replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Despite its familiarity and apparent popularity, the idea of Equality of Opportunity has proved at once contested and elusive. Such is the variety of ideas to which the term Equality of Opportunity has been used to refer, some have been tempted to question whether there is a coherent single core concept at stake at all (Westen 1985) or have called for it to be abandoned altogether (Radcliffe Richards 1997). For this reason, a substantial amount of the philosophical work that explicitly reflects on the notion of Equality of Opportunity involves unpacking and distinguishing the range of different ideas that fly under that banner (for example, Arneson 2018; Green 1989; Riva 2015). If there is a broad unifying theme between conceptions of Equality of Opportunity, it is the notion of a justified hierarchy or inequality which classifies some factors as being inappropriate determinants of persons’ success. Equality of Opportunity is contested partly because people differ over which factors do or do not qualify as obstructions on persons’ opportunities to succeed in the relevant sense. Different conceptions of Equality of Opportunity can be roughly ordered along a spectrum—from formal to substantive—according to the range of factors that are deemed obstructions on relevant opportunities.

1. Equality of Opportunity—Constraint or State of Affairs

The essentials of Equality of Opportunity are most clearly illustrated through a contrast with Equality of Outcome (for critical reflections on the contrast see Joseph 1980; Phillips 2004; Strauss 1992). According to an everyday understanding, the notion of Equality of Outcome entails that people should receive the same amount of some good or goods, or enjoy the same rank or status, and deviations are always bad. Whilst “Equality” as an ideal has profound socio-political resonance in popular consciousness, it is comparatively rare to see Equality of Outcome receive an explicit defence (see Tawney 1931, for a forthright defence from the recent past). Dworkin (2000: 2) goes further and suggests that not only is Equality of Outcome unlikely to seem like a serious political ideal to anyone, but there is nothing to be said for it whatsoever (but, see Phillips 2004, who defends Equality of Outcome between groups as an indicator for Equality of Opportunity between individuals). In contrast, the ideal of Equality of Opportunity commands far more widespread support (Swift 2014: 102; Temkin 2016. For a critique see Cavanagh 2002). Under Equality of Opportunity differences in outcome are justifiable, provided that individuals enjoy the “opportunity” for the good or rank in the relevant sense (for critical reflections on this thought, see Chambers 2009).

Equality of Opportunity can be “competitive” in that it refers to a process by which persons compete for a good where some persons’ successful pursuit of the good will mean that others fail—such as prospective employees applying for a job (for emphasis on this facet, see Jacobs 2004). Less commonly, it can be “non-competitive” in that it refers to cases where persons’ enjoyment of the good does not directly depend on whether others attain it—such as eligibility for unemployment benefit (see Sreenivasan 2014 for some reflections on how Equality of Opportunity is sometimes ambiguous between the two)

The term Equality of Opportunity can be understood in two broadly different, albeit related, ways, which are sometimes combined in particular accounts (for work drawing attention to these broad differences see Mason 2006; Holmes 2005; Radcliffe Richards 1997: 265–268) First, Equality of Opportunity is primarily seen as a constraint on selection or distribution decisions for scarce positions or goods. For example, it might be claimed that Equality of Opportunity prohibits race and gender discrimination in employment hiring decisions, to provide applicants with the due consideration they are owed in the process. Here Equality of Opportunity is understood in terms of permissible and impermissible criteria determining the allocation of positions. Second, Equality of Opportunity is seen as a social ideal concerning the structure of society as a whole concerning which factors should play a role in determining how well people fare, perhaps in comparison with one another. For example, it might be claimed a society manifests Equality of Opportunity only when social class does not hinder a person’s overall prospects for success. Here Equality of Opportunity is understood as a quality of the social order, rather than a feature of selection procedures.

The basic difference between these respective ways of thinking about Equality of Opportunity is that the former focuses primarily on the way allocative and selective decisions ought to be made and which criteria should inform those decisions, whereas the latter focuses primarily on whether people enjoy Equality of Opportunity as an overall state of affairs. In line with a broad distinction drawn in the context of conceptions of equality more generally, we might call the former “deontic” conceptions of Equality of Opportunity and the latter “telic” conceptions of Equality of Opportunity (see Holmes 2005, for exploration of further complexities).

Despite the general difference between deontic and telic ideas of Equality of Opportunity, the distinction between these ways of thinking about Equality of Opportunity should not be overdrawn. Both ways of thinking about Equality of Opportunity focus on the factors which are relevant or irrelevant to the determination of the attainment of advantages but are different to the extent that one relates this to the quality of a decision-making process, and the other relates this to the broader distributive profile of society. Moreover, the deontic and telic views may be connected in several ways. For instance, one might hold a deontic view of Equality of Opportunity that prohibits sex discrimination in hiring precisely because prohibiting sex discrimination is judged necessary to instantiate a version of telic Equality of Opportunity, under which no-one suffers generally lower social prospects because of their sex (for a view that links the wrongfulness of discrimination to Equality of Opportunity see Segall 2013). One might also hold that a given deontic view of Equality of Opportunity is conditional on some form of telic Equality of Opportunity. For instance, in university selection processes, one might hold that it is appropriate to select the best qualified candidates (a deontic version of Equality of Opportunity) only when all candidates have enjoyed relevantly equal opportunities to achieve qualifications (a telic version of Equality of Opportunity) (Clayton 2012: 421). See section 10 below for further discussion.

2. Conceptions of Equality of Opportunity

Equality of Opportunity is contested (Joseph 1980; Gross 1987), and different conceptions of Equality of Opportunity can be distinguished from one another according to the factors which are seen as inappropriate influences on persons’ prospects for success. Take a committee tasked with selecting between university admissions applications trying to determine the appropriate selection criteria whilst honouring the requirement to ensure Equality of Opportunity for all candidates. One view amongst the committee could be that Equality of Opportunity is satisfied when there is no explicit race or sex discrimination in the selection process. A further view might be that this is necessary but insufficient, and Equality of Opportunity is only satisfied when legacy admissions, giving preferential treatment to family of alumni, are also disallowed. Others on the committee might argue that although it is right that race, sex, and legacy discrimination should be ruled out in order to ensure Equality of Opportunity, the selection criteria should also take into account the social disadvantages which result in some candidates being better qualified than others. Their view is that selection criteria based on which candidates are best qualified means that socially disadvantaged candidates do not enjoy relevantly equal opportunities to gain admission. The different views voiced within the committee represent different views about the factors which are inappropriate to consider when deciding who is selected and, in that way, they reflect different conclusions about what Equality of Opportunity requires. The broader point, then, is that different conceptions of Equality of Opportunity differ regarding which factors render the “opportunity” an unequal one.

The fact that conceptions of Equality of Opportunity differ in this way helps explain why the notion of Equality of Opportunity is contested. People take different views about which factors are morally significant, and, in turn, which factors should or should not affect persons’ prospects for a position or good. In that way, Equality of Opportunity can be seen as an essentially contested concept (Gallie 1955). The widespread agreement that Equality of Opportunity is a good thing in fact conceals importantly different views about what Equality of Opportunity actually consists in. The term “opportunity” in Equality of Opportunity indicates that a good is in some sense available but not necessarily guaranteed. (Westen [1985: 839], for instance, suggests an “opportunity” is less than a guarantee but more than a mere possibility.) Depending on one’s conception of Equality of Opportunity, possessing an “opportunity” may not, however, mean that one has any realistic prospect of attaining the position or good in question (Mason 2006: 22–26). For instance, it might be claimed of a given society that everyone enjoys the Equal Opportunity to become a professional athlete, given that there are no formal constraints on eligibility, however there will be many for whom their physical limitations make this wholly unrealistic (for discussion of “opportunity” in relation to “freedom”, see Campbell 1974–75). Cases such as this lead G. A. Cohen (1989: 916–917) to draw a distinction between Equality of Opportunity and Equality of Access. The thought here is that although we don’t normally say that someone lacks an opportunity simply because their physical or mental capacities limit their ability to achieve something, we still need a term—“access”—with which to articulate inequalities that derive from those sources. On this view, although there may be Equal Opportunity to become a professional athlete, physical inequalities mean that there is unequal access to becoming one. Cohen’s recommendation notwithstanding, there are conceptions of Equality of Opportunity that do use the language of “opportunity” to refer to such sources of inability. For instance, it might be argued that demarcating separate categories for women’s sports is a way of providing Equality of Opportunity for women in sport because an unsegregated category would deprive women of the chance to compete on fair terms, given the physical differences between men and women (for a critique of this view, see Tannsjo 2007). Or it might be argued that the structure of sporting competition as a whole (for instance, the range of available sports) should be organized so as to provide for a wider range of physical advantages so as to offer Equal Opportunity in sport (English 1978).

There is also disagreement over whether or not “opportunity” ought to be understood as a subject dependent concept in the sense that an individual’s values bear on whether something qualifies as relevantly open. For instance, Parekh (2000: 241) argues that something fails to qualify as an opportunity in the relevant sense if taking that path involves transgressing a person’s deeply held commitments—such as an orthodox Jew being required to take off their yarmulke as a precondition for doing a certain job. On the other hand, Brian Barry (2001: 36–38) contends that the range of opportunities a person faces is a matter of the “objective state of affairs” and not dependent on the values of the person facing those opportunities and the choices they make between them. What this indicates, then, is that “opportunity” is really a placeholder for the idea that certain factors should not obstruct the availability of a good or a person’s prospects for success (even if other factors, deemed legitimate, render the good unavailable).

This way of thinking about different conceptions of Equality of Opportunity suggests that the range of different conceptions of Equality of Opportunity is very broad indeed. Each conception will be distinctive depending on which constellation of factors is deemed to obstruct the prospects of success in a way that renders the opportunities unequal. One way of roughly ordering different conceptions of Equality of Opportunity on a continuum of sorts is, therefore, to situate them according to the breadth of factors which obstruct Equality of Opportunity. Conceptions which identify relatively few factors which obstruct Equality of Opportunity will be at one end of the continuum, with conceptions identifying a larger number of factors towards the other end (for this broad approach to organizing conceptions of Equality of Opportunity, see Cohen 2009: 4–6; Miller 2013: 118–119; Segall 2013: 3–4; Swift 2014: 102–109). Although imprecise, this is a useful way of distinguishing thinner, formal conceptions of Equality of Opportunity from thicker, more substantial ones.

3. Formal Equality of Opportunity

The term Formal Equality of Opportunity is often used to pick out a particular conception of Equality of Opportunity, but it may be better understood to refer to a family of conceptions under which Equality of Opportunity obtains when advantages are in some sense “open to all”, even though there are a potentially significant range of further background factors which will determine how likely it is for individuals to be able to successfully secure them. A particularly thin conception of Formal Equality of Opportunity might hold that persons enjoy equal opportunities simply when there is no legal impediment or other coercive restriction on access to the position or good. Laws against women serving in the military, for instance, would mean that women lacked the Equality of Opportunity to serve, as would formal exclusion from consideration in the application process, or women being coercively intimidated not to apply to serve. On this view of Equality of Opportunity, the only factors which render the opportunities unequal are certain restrictions on the freedom of some individuals to compete for or access the position or good in question.

A slightly thicker conception of Equality of Opportunity might expand this to include a greater range of restrictions on freedom, beyond legal restriction, formal exclusion, and overt coercion. For instance, it might be argued that enjoying a meaningful opportunity to compete for a position depends on being in a position to know about the existence of the competition. For this reason, it might be thought that Equality of Opportunity for positions requires that they be publicized to a reasonable degree. It might also be argued that Equality of Opportunity is undercut by artificially constructed technical barriers to success deliberately designed to effectively exclude certain persons. A clear case of this would be the US during the late nineteenth and twentieth century where literacy tests and “grandfather voting clauses”—whereby voting was disallowed unless one’s grandfather had voted—were aimed at the de facto exclusion of “black” Americans from exercising their formal voting rights.

These very thin ways of conceiving of Equality of Opportunity identify only a limited range of factors which count as opportunity-undermining. Thus understood, Equality of Opportunity rules out caste hierarchy and manifest constraints on competing for or obtaining a good but fails to address a broad swathe of other factors which might plausibly be considered relevant for Equality of Opportunity. For this reason, as a political ideal of society or as a generally appropriate standard for competitive selection in areas like employment and education, these thin conceptions are often considered to be inadequate ways of thinking about Equality of Opportunity.

A still thicker conception of Equality of Opportunity, but still appropriately classified as Formal, also holds that factors such as nepotism and direct discrimination based on factors such as race, sex, and religion undermine Equality of Opportunity. Such a way of thinking about Equality of Opportunity thereby identifies a further range of factors that are impermissible determinants of different persons’ prospects for success. A useful shorthand is to think about this conception of Equality of Opportunity as including an anti-discrimination principle, under which certain factors, like race and sex, should not enhance or detract from a person’s prospects of success in a competitive application. This matter is complicated by a number of further considerations. First, some racialized or sex-based characteristics may, for some positions or roles, be considered appropriate criteria for selection—such as selecting an actor to play the part of a member of a particular racialized group. Second, there is a difference between taking certain factors as themselves a reason to select someone and using those factors as proxies for identifying other reasons for selection—such as taking honesty and conscientiousness as criteria for selection and drawing on profiling data which suggests that women are generally more likely to have such qualities in greater measure. Third, even when applicants are not directly discriminated against on the basis of factors such as race and sex, other criteria for selection might indirectly discriminate against individuals with those characteristics—such as criteria which downgrade applicants who may need extended leave and the potential this has to indirectly discriminate against women during and after pregnancy.

4. Meritocratic Equality of Opportunity

To this point, conceptions of Equality of Opportunity have been arranged according to the factors which are identified as inappropriate determinants of people’s prospects for success. By implication this leaves open which further factors should in fact determine who succeeds in a competition or who obtains a good. There is an influential way of conceiving of Equality of Opportunity which includes the aforementioned conditions on Equality of Opportunity—no legal barriers, no formal exclusion, anti-discrimination protections—but also adds the requirement that applicants for a position be selected according to who is best qualified. Equality of Opportunity, thus understood, requires both that the competition for positions and advantages is open in the relevant ways, and also that the criteria for successful pursuit should be governed by whatever it is which makes competitors best qualified to perform a role (James Fishkin 1983; Flew 1981; Daniels 1978; Mason 2001; Miller 1999: chs. 7–9; Sher 1988). This might be termed a “meritocratic” conception of Equality of Opportunity inasmuch this conception requires that persons be judged on their “merits” in relation to the post they are competing for, although it is worth noting that the label “meritocratic” is itself deployed differently in different work. This idea of an open competition, in which success is determined by one’s qualifications for a role, is also sometimes referred to as “careers open to talents”. It is worth recalling here that there can be telic or deontic versions of the meritocratic conception. Although the notion of the “best qualified” lends itself most naturally to deontic principles concerning the appropriate selection criteria for positions, it is coherent to make judgements about a meritocratic society overall, and to consider how far people’s prospects overall are determined by their merit as opposed to other factors.

The relationship between formal Equality of Opportunity, as elaborated above, and meritocratic Equality of Opportunity is contested. Radcliffe Richards (1997: 260–263), for instance, argues that the two ideas are radically discontinuous and do not have any necessary implications for one another. On the other hand, Mason (2006: 29–32) argues that it is hard to establish what counts as unfair discrimination under the formal view without some account of what makes something a legitimate qualification, which leads us towards a meritocratic view.

There are several further things to note about the meritocratic conception of Equality of Opportunity. First, there is nothing in the meritocratic view which entails distribution via free market mechanisms, even though such a view is commonly associated with the free market. It is consistent to conceive of a centrally planned distribution of social positions which is governed by best qualified criteria (Mason 2006: 20). Indeed, an unregulated free market may quite conceivably involve violations of meritocratic Equality of Opportunity if firms discriminate against some applicants. It might be tempting to think that a free market naturally tilts towards adopting a meritocratic conception of Equality of Opportunity, given that firms in the market will be incentivized to hire employees who will best serve firms’ interests. This is predicated on at least two further suppositions which may not necessarily be true. First, that the “best qualified” candidate under a meritocratic view will in fact generally best serve the firm’s interest. Second, that firms generally make rational hiring decisions, or at least will be forced to make rational hiring decisions over time.

Indeed, there are a range of further complexities which means that it is not straightforwardly true that the “best qualified” candidate is the same as the candidate which best advances a firm’s interest. For one thing, there are different ways of thinking about the value of an open competition which selects the best qualified. On one meritocratic conception of Equality of Opportunity, what matters is whether a position is filled with the best qualified candidate, rather than this being done through an “open competition”. It would be consistent with this view to headhunt particular individuals for roles if this were more efficient at identifying the best qualified. This might still be considered an open competition under Equality of Opportunity inasmuch as there were no relevant constraints on others becoming the best qualified (and then being headhunted). On a different meritocratic conception, though, there is a reason to value an open competition, even if that will sometimes result in a less well-qualified candidate being selected, because doing so putatively gives potential candidates a relevantly fair chance at attaining the position. The difference between these views, at bottom, is how far one values Equality of Opportunity for the outcomes it delivers (the best qualified attaining the positions) as compared with the procedures it instantiates (the opportunities afforded to all to attain the position under a best qualified selection criteria). Both outcome and procedural oriented versions of the meritocratic conceptions of Equality of Opportunity are consistent with condemning certain kinds of profiling, even when profiling would be a rational way of furthering a firm’s interest (for a survey of reasons to be troubled by statistical discrimination of this kind, see Lippert-Rasmussen 2007). For instance, suppose data supported the conclusion that appealing to sex or racialized group membership was a good proxy for performance in a certain role, and that a firm could make substantial efficiency savings in the hiring process by using such a proxy. A procedural version of meritocratic Equality of Opportunity might naturally condemn this form of profiling as inconsistent with a relevantly open competition for the position, given that potentially qualified individuals are disadvantaged using the proxy. But even an outcome-oriented version has scope for condemning the profiling, either on the grounds that it violates a moral side-constraint, or on the grounds that it remains imperfect at identifying the best qualified (even if it is more efficient than other alternatives).

Furthermore, it may be morally troubling for an employer to take into account certain employee characteristics, even when those characteristics render an employee “better qualified” for a role in a way that serves the employer’s interest. Consider a restaurant owner seeking to hire a new waiter. The restaurant owner wants to appoint the candidate who is the best qualified according to criteria which include being punctual, diligent, honest, and likely to promote repeat custom amongst the clientele, with the latter being overwhelmingly important. Suppose, however, that the restaurant is in an area rife with racist prejudice against members of certain racialized minority groups and that members of those groups are held in contempt by the majority of the local population, who constitute the vast majority of the restaurant clientele. Though the restaurant owner does not harbour any racial prejudice themselves, they also know that hiring a racialized minority will positively undermine repeat custom. An antidiscrimination principle, which prohibits directly discriminating against applicants on racialized grounds, seems to be in tension with an unmodified meritocratic principle that requires appointing the best qualified in this sense. Any racialized minority individual will be less “well-qualified”, given the racial prejudice present in the local community. In this way, norms and preferences which would be inadmissible to directly consider might nevertheless filter through to determine who is successful in the competition by determining who satisfies the “best qualified” criteria.

Because such qualifications—like the ability to encourage repeat custom—depend on the reactions of recipients of a service, they are sometimes referred to as “reaction” qualifications (Alexander 1992; Lippert-Rasmussen 2009; Lippert-Rasmussen 2014: ch. 9; Mason 2017; Wertheimer 1983). Many reaction qualifications will appear quite unproblematic. For instance, a department store might want to hire customer-facing staff that are considered polite, or a comedy club might want to hire acts that punters find funny. However, examples such as the case of the racist local community cast doubt on whether this is true of all reaction qualifications and raise the question as to which kinds of reactions are legitimate to take into account and which are not (Lippert-Rasmussen 2009; Mason 2017). The spectre of morally suspect reaction qualifications is a further indication that the relationship between firms’ interests and a meritocratic conception of Equality of Opportunity might not be straightforward.

More generally, it is worth remembering that the meritocratic conception of Equality of Opportunity—an open competition selecting the best qualified—does not itself tell us which positions should exist in society; what makes someone “best qualified” for those positions; and how those positions should be rewarded. Nothing in the meritocratic conception, for instance, tells us which jobs should be available and at what levels of differential reward. Indeed, although the meritocratic conception tends to be seen as a justification for inequalities, it is technically consistent with a meritocratic conception of Equality of Opportunity that different social positions do not offer differential levels of reward.

Moreover, just as the meritocratic conception is consistent with non-free market allocation of positions, it is also consistent with positions in society being organized in a range of different ways, provided the selection for those positions is open to all and filled according to the best qualified criteria. Suppose we have a factory production line with a number of workstations which each require very different skills to operate. The first requires heavy lifting, the second requires quick thinking, the third requires manual dexterity, the fourth requires attention to detail. There are different ways in which working practices could be organized amongst employees. One option would be to have each employee specialize in working only one station. Another option would be to have each employee work each station for a period of several weeks and then rotate to work another station for several weeks and so on. A further option would be to have employees work each of the stations throughout the day, so that they followed the good they are producing and worked with it at each station. The meritocratic conception is indifferent as to how the factory work practices are organized, provided the employees are selected under an open competition according to their qualifications. Yet which workplace practices are adopted may have significant implications for whom it is appropriate to select as an employee. The first option may favour selecting those who are adept at specializing in one of the relevant workplace tasks; the second option may favour selecting those who are versatile in the sense that they are able to acquire a number of different skills; the third option may favour selecting those who are adaptable in the sense that they are able to efficiently shift between different tasks during the same process. The same is true when it comes to the structure of society as a whole, such that which positions are available will have profound implications for who has the best chance to attain them (for critiques which emphasize these factors, see Markovits 2019; Sandel 2020). And there will be a further question with respect to level of reward different positions ought to be given. Because meritocratic Equality of Opportunity, thus understood, is silent on these further questions concerning how society should be organized, and how far persons should have an equal opportunity to become the best qualified, it is regarded by some as a relatively limited component of the justice of society as a whole.

5. Substantive Equality of Opportunity

The meritocratic conception above is a relatively formal view of Equality of Opportunity. It holds that persons enjoy equal opportunities in the relevant sense provided they are not obstructed by legal or certain technical obstacles or by some forms of discrimination, and that under such conditions persons should compete for positions under a process designed to select the best qualified. In one sense, the meritocratic conception is quite a strict one concerning the factors which are allowed to determine who successfully takes advantage of their opportunities, in that, under the “best qualified” criteria, only qualities appropriate to the position or good rightly determine the outcome of competitive applications. However, the meritocratic conception remains relatively formal in that it does not take into account broader obstacles to getting qualified (or, indeed, which qualifications ought to be rewarded) and so does not take into account a wider range of factors which might have a substantial bearing on persons’ chances to successfully compete for social advantages (B. Barry 2005: ch.8)

A famous illustration of this concern is given by Bernard Williams, who offers the example of a society in which great prestige is attached to membership in a certain warrior class (Williams 1962 [1973]). Historically, members of the class were recruited from the wealthy class in society only, but reforms have resulted in the competition for membership now becoming open to all members in society. Under the terms of the competition the warriors are selected based on their physical strength. Although the competition for selection is now an open one, it transpires that warriors are still only selected from the wealthy class in society because the population in other social classes is so under-nourished that they lack the physical strength to successfully compete for warrior status. It might be argued that meaningful Equality of Opportunity for membership in the warrior class has not really been achieved because the means to compete on relevantly equal terms are denied to some competitors—those from poorer social classes lack a realistic prospect for successfully satisfying the criteria for selection, in this case physical strength. One response here might be to argue that Equality of Opportunity is satisfied because those from poorer social classes are not being excluded because they are poor, but simply because they are physically weaker, which is a relevant criterion for selection to the warrior class. In reply, it might be argued that this would amount to a merely formal and insubstantial way of thinking about Equality of Opportunity, given that those from the poorer social classes are effectively excluded, even if they are not explicitly barred (see Williams 1962 [1973: 244–245]).

For this reason, it might be thought that Equality of Opportunity requires that people enjoy the substantive means to take advantage of the formal opportunities available to them through open competition. Views which take this line can be broadly categorized as substantive conceptions of Equality of Opportunity. As with different formal conceptions of Equality of Opportunity, substantive conceptions differ with respect to the way in which the opportunities should be substantive.

Suppose we complicate slightly Williams’ warrior society example and say that warrior selection is based on physical strength, agility, and sword skills. Suppose that adequate nutrition is necessary for physical strength, and sufficient physical strength is in turn required to develop the right agility and wield the heavy sword that the warriors use. One substantive view might hold that Equality of Opportunity is secured when, and only when, citizens from all social classes enjoy adequate nutrition. All citizens then have some realistic prospect of developing the physical strength which is necessary to procuring the further qualities that enable them to meaningfully compete for warrior positions. However, suppose further that the schools to which members of the wealthy class send their children offer agility training and sword skills classes as part of the curriculum, whereas children from poorer classes go to schools without these lessons. It might be argued that although children have nutrition sufficient to give them some degree of meaningful competition, they do not have a relevantly equal prospects, given the other educational disadvantages they face relative to others. These educational inequalities might be countered by instituting an outreach program which rolls out the same forms of training in education to all other schools in less wealthy parts of the society.

One might take the view that this would now be sufficient to create the conditions for Equality of Opportunity, given that these educational inequalities across different social classes have been addressed. The elimination of those educational inequalities is likely to result in increased competition for selection to the warrior class, given that a larger pool of children possess a more meaningful prospect of developing the necessary qualities. As a consequence, suppose that wealthy families begin investing in private sword skill tuition for their children and that the tuition is far too expensive for parents in poorer social classes to afford. If this tuition gives children from wealthy social classes a competitive advantage, it might be argued that this undermines Equality of Opportunity, given that opportunities for children to successfully enter the warrior class are not relevantly equal. It should be clear from this, then, that different substantive views can be distinguished depending on the range of factors they identify as those which undermine Equality of Opportunity.

6. Fair Equality of Opportunity

One prominent substantive conception of Equality of Opportunity which addresses factors such as the investment in sword skill tuition by parents in the wealthy social class is the one offered by John Rawls that he labels Fair Equality of Opportunity (FEO). There are two components to FEO. First, offices and positions are to be open to all in a formal sense under “careers open to talent”, or, as it has been labelled above, the meritocratic conception (Rawls 1999: 53, 57, 62). This is supplemented with the further requirement that all should have the fair chance to attain those offices and positions (Rawls 1999: 63; 2001: 43–44). A fair chance here means that

those who have the same level or talent and ability and the same willingness to use these gifts should have the same prospects of success regardless of their social class of origin. (Rawls 2001: 44)

In other words, it is consistent with FEO that persons’ prospects for success vary depending on their levels of talent and abilities and their willingness to use them, however persons’ social class should not differentially affect those prospects (see also Miller 1996).

Rawls’s FEO is substantive by way of taking account of the background conditions which differentially affect persons’ respective chances of fulfilling the meritocratic selection criteria. FEO does not obtain when social class structure results in persons from some social classes facing diminished prospects for obtaining the skills and qualifications necessary to compete on relevantly equal terms with others. For instance, if children from less privileged social backgrounds face lower quality education which results in lesser prospects for developing the skills and self-discipline to compete for rewarding jobs, FEO fails to obtain, even though selection for those jobs is based on meritocratic criteria. In this context, income inequalities between social classes and the education system, broadly construed, are plausibly important factors in determining how far persons face relevantly equal prospects.

On its face, Rawls’s FEO is a simple idea. Talent and effort are appropriate criteria for success in the competition for socially advantageous positions and roles, but differences in social class background should neither directly influence the competition, nor indirectly influence how far persons can develop talent or make an effort. That simplicity belies many further complications, however (for a forthright critique see Arneson 1999).

First, Rawls frames FEO as opposing the unequal effects of “social class” (Rawls 1999: 63). At other times, Rawls presents FEO as addressing differences in “income class” (Rawls 1999: 270). He also uses the term “sectors in society” to seemingly refer to the same idea (Rawls 1999: 63). It is not clear whether Rawls intends these different terms to be equivalent. After all, one can in principle envisage a society in which income levels are all equal and yet a social class system of some form exists, whereby there is a hierarchy of rank and status and citizens in the upper echelons enjoy social goods and opportunities unrelated to income (for some discussion of the relation between material inequality and social inequality, see B. Barry 1998; Wolff 2017). If only income class differences are objectionable influences on persons’ opportunities under FEO, then this social hierarchy is unobjectionable, even if it has a profound effect on the chances different persons have to compete for social positions. A sensible reading of Rawls takes him to understand social class to include income differences without being exhausted by such differences. This, of course, raises the further question of what is to count as a “social class” or “social sector” based inequality.

The focus on social class specifically also makes FEO appear relatively narrow. Insofar as FEO holds that social class should not affect persons’ prospects to succeed, it seems to imply that unequal prospects within social classes are unobjectionable. For instance, if children from rich backgrounds generally receive a better education which gives them a substantial advantage in the job market, this would be clearly incompatible with FEO. However, consider the case where this is not true as a general matter but simply that only some rich families invest heavily in their children’s education such that only that subset of children from rich backgrounds have substantial advantages. Alternatively, in a still more contrived example, suppose that social class is completely uncorrelated with public educational development and that state education is equalized across society but that particular families, randomly distributed across different social classes, invest heavily in their children’s education to give them a competitive advantage in later life. In both instances, the inequalities in prospects do not appear to be objectionable under FEO if FEO is understood to object to inequalities resulting from social class. However, if FEO is designed to ensure a fair chance to obtain jobs and positions and this means, in Rawls’s terms, “that those with similar abilities and skills should have similar life chances” (Rawls 1999: 63), then it seems that these other non-class-based inequalities should also be deemed objectionable.

Second, it might be argued that there is a tension inherent in FEO. On the one hand social class inequality is considered to be an inappropriate source of competitive advantage. On the other hand, under FEO, differences in talent and effort are appropriate criteria for competitive selection for jobs. And yet, it is natural to suppose that social class affects the development of talent and has an impact on how much effort people are willing to make (Anderson 2004; Elford 2016; Swift & Marshall 1997; for related discussion see Chambers 2009: 379–381). One option to avoid this tension would be to say that differences in native talent and native disposition to make an effort are appropriate determinants of success in competition for social advantage. So even though developed levels of talent and effort will differ due to social class influences, we should select for jobs based on the native characteristics. The problem, here, is that it is not clear whether native talent and native disposition to make an effort pick out anything especially socially significant (Anderson 2004), or straightforwardly measurable. And this seems to be a radical departure from most ways of understanding what makes a candidate “best-qualified” under the meritocratic element of FEO. A tall, well-coordinated and exceptionally athletic person might have very high native talent for becoming a basketball player, but if they have not spent any of their life developing a talent for basketball they are hardly more “well-qualified” for team selection than someone with less native talent but who has otherwise much more advanced skill at basketball. In short, it seems to be talent and effort at the more developed end (or at least with enough remaining potential to be developed) which seem to matter under the meritocratic conception, and yet the “fair chance” element of FEO seems to hold that it is inappropriate for those with superior developed talent to have an advantage in the competition for positions when the superiority of that talent is the result of social class factors (James Fishkin 1983: 30–32).

A third complication when thinking about FEO is that social class cleavages might reflect factors which account for unequal opportunities without it being straightforwardly the case that social class directly causes those unequal opportunities. Suppose social class stratification is well-correlated with later success in the competition for jobs, such that social class is a strong predictor for job market success. As illustrated above, one typical way in which social class might result in unfair chances to compete for socially advantageous positions is by giving children from privileged social classes better education, broadly construed, in order to give them a better prospect at becoming the best qualified. Consider a possible alternative explanation of the correlation. It could be the case that there is a higher level of native talent in the more advantaged social class and very little inter-class mixing, such that citizens in the advantaged social class only tend to meet, partner up with, and bear children with fellow members of the same social class. Perhaps this results in native talent levels being inherited by the children born in that same social class, leading to the same process continuing. In that way, the high native talent levels are self-perpetuating and the lack of inter-class mixing results in the correlation between social class and job market success continuing over time. The question is what should FEO say about this? Social class position is a strong predictor of job market success, but not because social class factors influence the development of talent and effort. Of course, it could still be said that social class plays a formative role in the relationship between social class and job market success precisely because social class norms and expectations shape and condition the degree of inter-class mixing in the society. So, the resulting stratification of talent and effort along class lines is not itself independent of the operation of social class. Still, although social class is a part of the explanation for the inequalities in the competition for social positions, the role it plays seems importantly different. In this case social class does not directly influence the development of talent and effort for children who already exist—by way of greater educational resources for some children over others, for instance—but, rather, social class determines which children are born in which social classes to begin with.

A further case in which social class and the development of talent might be connected is in the development of native talent during gestation. For instance, if pregnant women from less advantaged social classes lack the means for adequate nutrition, this may affect the “native talent” of the children they bear. In that sense social class might differentially affect a child’s prospects in the competition for socially advantageous position even before birth, and not simply by way of post-birth education and development (B. Barry 2005: 47–50; Kollar & Loi 2015; Loi, Del Savio, & Stupka 2013).

Fourth, as with formal equality of opportunity, FEO does not itself address which rewards ought to be attached to the different roles and positions (although other parts of Rawls’ theory constrain permissible inequalities). As a consequence, it’s possible that, under FEO, winning or losing in the competition for certain social positions will have substantial implications for one’s later opportunities. The clearest illustration of this are the opportunities afforded in later life through success in the education system. Success in the competition for school and university places results in the development of merit and the enhancement of qualifications for those successful candidates, which in turn gives them advantages when it comes to the competition for desirable social roles and positions. The cycle continues where success in that later competition for entry level social roles can similarly offer advantages in competition for further social roles. Success within the education system can thereby set some those successful candidates on a pathway towards a range of subsequent opportunities whilst cleaving away unsuccessful candidates to a position of disadvantage, unable to compete for a range of roles and positions for which success in an earlier competition in education was required. And yet, this is apparently consistent with FEO, provided all individuals enjoyed a relevantly fair chance to compete on the basis of merit for those earlier opportunities in education. Joseph Fishkin (2014) labels this type of structure of opportunities a “bottleneck” and commends a mechanism of “opportunity pluralism” to address it. Under opportunity pluralism there are a larger number of pathways over the course of persons’ lives to successfully compete for different goods, rather than a narrower route to securing those goods through success in a limited range of competitions earlier in life (Joseph Fishkin 2014: ch. 3). Similarly, Jacobs (2004) argues that a defensible conception of Equality of Opportunity ought to regulate the rewards and losses (the “stakes”) in competitions for role and positions and both broaden the distribution of opportunities to gain as well as limit the degree to which individuals can gain and lose in each competition.

A fifth complication again relates to the potential narrowness of FEO as Rawls states the idea. Social class is typically understood to relate to a stratification of persons along a rough cluster of social and economic dimensions. In that sense it is different from other ways in which people might be grouped together and face disadvantages as members of a group. It is different, for example, from racialized group membership, gender, and sex. Insofar as FEO addresses only social class disadvantages, rather than these other potential sources of unfair disadvantages, it might be thought to fail to address other factors which undermine meaningful Equality of Opportunity (Wolff 2017). For instance, although direct race, gender, and sex discrimination in hiring is ruled out under FEO (by dint of the requirement that positions be “open to all”), racialized group membership, gender, and sex might be a source of unfair disadvantage in less direct ways (Rawls 1999: 129–130). Susan Moller Okin (1989) argues, for example, that the gendered structure of the family is a major obstacle to Equality of Opportunity for women and girls, particularly because women are usually the primary caregivers for children. The unequal share of household labour undercuts Equality of Opportunity for women, both within and outside the family unit itself, given that women’s opportunities for economic success and attainment of political office are so constrained by what is required of them in the home (Okin 1989: 116, 123; for discussion of some of the measures which might be taken to equalize opportunities between men and women in relation to this, see Bergmann 2008; Brighouse & Wright 2008; Gheaus & Robeyns 2011; Gornick & Meyers 2008).

There are at least four mechanisms by which such factors might affect how far people enjoy meaningfully equal opportunities. First, societal factors related to racialized group membership and gender might influence the development of the talents relevant for selection under the meritocratic conception. For instance, suppose conceptions of children’s aptitude for certain subjects in schools are prejudiced on racialized or gender lines, resulting in members of some racialized groups or one gender being disproportionately streamed into classes where the quality of education is lower. In this case, their prospects for future success in the job market are diminished by factors other than social class. Second, societal factors other than social class might be thought to affect the development of ambition and the disposition to make an effort. Take a society where conceptions of race and gender are socially salient, and children’s pursuit of career paths tends to be heavily influenced by whether or not they see others with the same racialized or gender characteristics succeeding in those vocations. Children might simply fail to recognize a vocation as a possible path “for someone like them” if there are very few others succeeding in that vocation who share their characteristics. In this way, it might be argued that factors other than social class can dampen ambition and effort-making dispositions in ways that undercut meaningful equal opportunity for certain jobs and roles. Third, there might be certain social constraints on participation in the competition for socially advantageous positions that are non-developmental but reflect more general norms and expectations concerning who should apply for jobs and what a person has to sacrifice to do so (Phillips 2006). For instance, dominant social expectations concerning women’s role as primary caregivers might be thought to constrain equal opportunity for participation in the labour market beyond the household. Fourth, and relatedly, as noted above in section 5, because FEO leaves open what constitutes a talent, a scheme of FEO might, in principle, leave in place systematic disadvantages for members of certain groups. For instance, even if there is no direct sex-based discrimination against women in employment selection, a lack of workplace accommodation for leave during pregnancy, and measures designed to ensure that such absence is not disadvantageous, might be considered indirect discrimination against women. To address such potential sources of inequality, it might be argued that FEO should be broadened (Miller 2013: 122–123, although Miller is skeptical that Rawls can accommodate all of the inequality upsetting effects of family life). Under such an adapted version of FEO, then, enjoyment of a “fair chance” to develop the talent and effort required for success in the competition for role and offices must take account of factors beyond “social class”. Which factors do and do not undermine a “fair chance” will, of course, be a matter of further debate between different conceptions of FEO thus construed.

7. Equality of Opportunity and the Family

One thing these matters draw our attention to, however, is the potential for Equality of Opportunity to conflict with other considerations and values. A substantial amount of work has been devoted to the scope for conflict between the demands of Equality of Opportunity and the role of the family in particular (Brighouse & Swift 2009; James Fishkin 1983; 1987; Joseph Fishkin 2014: 48–56; MacLeod, 2002; Mason 2006: ch. 3; Miller 2013; Munoz-Dardé 1999; Okin 1989; Swift 2005). As indicated above, different families will foster different environments and take different measures for children which will often manifest in differences in prospects. Indeed, Rawls himself notes that “the family may be a barrier to equal chances between individuals” given that

the internal life and culture of the family influence, perhaps as much as anything else, a child’s motivation and his capacity to gain from education, and so in turn his life prospects. (Rawls 1999: 265)

Rawls maintains that FEO does not require the eradication of such differences across families, because it only requires correcting for social class inequality (Rawls 1999: 265, although other passages in Rawls seem in tension with this, for instance where he concedes that FEO can “be only imperfectly carried out, at least as long as some form of the family exists” (1999: 64)). Nevertheless, because the existence of the family as a social institution will always result in unequal chances for different individuals, he poses the question

Is the family to be abolished then? Taken by itself and given a certain primacy, the idea of equality of opportunity inclines in this direction. (Rawls 1999: 448)

There is a tension, then, between the existence of the family and the realization of equal prospects for all individuals in society. What is more, as Rawls’s remarks suggest, the tension does not seem to be particular only to modes of family organization in present-day societies but seems to pertain to any conceivable form of the family (James Fishkin 1983: 48–49). This provokes the question of whether the family is inconsistent with a defensible conception of Equality of Opportunity and, if they are incompatible with one another, how far, if at all, should the activities of the family be circumscribed by the requirements of Equality of Opportunity (for an argument that they are not necessarily incompatible, see Arneson 2002 [2015]).

A number of considerations will have a bearing on the answer to that question, including the kinds of values that the family embodies or serves (for instance, manifesting intimate relationships and nurturing responsible, conscientious future citizens), which kinds of activities are integral to the family and its service of those values (for instance, family members engaging in shared leisure and learning), whether there are alternative sources of those values other than the family as traditionally organized (such as, perhaps, state-run collective child-rearing), how far the equality-disrupting effects of the family can be mitigated by other social measures (for instance, by compensation or affirmative action), and, of course, which factors can justly affect differences in peoples’ social prospects.

One thing worth noting here is that there are different ways of conceiving of Equality of Opportunity in relation to such questions. The first independently identifies which factors obstruct persons’ enjoyment of a fair chance—such as facing a less nurturing family environment—and then considers how far such unfairness should circumscribe the activities of the family and/or commend other corrective social measures. On this approach, for instance, one might conclude that differential family nurturing does indeed disrupt Equality of Opportunity—because it undermines fair life chances—but one might conclude that the values served by the family justify tolerating some degree of loss of Equality of Opportunity. The second involves specifying Equality of Opportunity after taking into account other values, such as those served by the family. On this approach, one might conclude that the nurturing role played by the family is so fundamentally important that even though it creates unequal prospects, those unequal prospects are a price worth paying for a society organized around familial care. On this second way of thinking about Equality of Opportunity, however, those unequal prospects do not undermine Equality of Opportunity precisely because they are justified by the value of an institution such as the family. The former uses the label “Equality of Opportunity” to pick out the pro tanto consideration of unfairness involved in differential prospects, the latter uses the label “Equality of Opportunity” to pick out the “more-things-considered” conclusion about which differential prospects remain unjustified by other values. The difference between these two ways of thinking about Equality of Opportunity is not necessarily substantive. Rather, they differ in respect of the degree to which “Equality of Opportunity” as an ideal takes into account values other than inequality in prospects.

One account famous for its advocating the abolition of the family is found in Plato’s Republic (V 457). Even those who place significant weight on a thick understanding of Equality of Opportunity have tended to resist this conclusion, not necessarily because they conclude that Equality of Opportunity can be entirely reconciled with the existence of the family, but because the existence of the family is often defended as indispensable for serving certain values.

An apparently straightforward reason to object to the abolition of the family is that it would place constraints on the freedom and autonomy of parents to raise children. Although it is widely accepted that parental rights to rear children are limited by the interests of the children within the family, for many parents raising children is an important source of flourishing and the abolition of the family would constitute a constraint on this. Indeed, whether or not child-rearing is in fact a source of flourishing for any given potential parent, it might still be thought to constrain a potential parent’s autonomy if the state were to prohibit that life-choice. One challenge to such a parent-centred defence of the family and the parental rights associated with it, draws attention to the difficulty of justifying rights of control over others based on the controlling party’s own interests (Brighouse & Swift 2006: 82). Rather than justifying the institution of the family on the grounds of parents’ interest, one might point to other interests at stake in the form of the interests of children, or in the interests of third parties.

One such suggestion is that the family is more reliable at cultivating certain capacities for flourishing in children than any alternative social arrangement (Brennan & Noggle 1997; Munoz Dardé 1999). There are a range of accounts here, but the basis of broad alignment is that familial relationships are generally of important service to children’s interests, either in order to equip children with the wide range of capacities necessary for healthy development and self-determination (Munoz Dardé 1999), or in order to provide the preconditions for a flourishing childhood (Brennan 2014). A child-centred account of this kind still seems to need to explain why the family should not still be subject to substantial constraints when such constraints are necessary to help equip other children, outside the family, with such capacities. If there are certain goods that can only be provided for children through parental nurture within the family, what does this imply for broader social obligations to ensure that all children enjoy relevantly equal opportunities to enjoy those goods?

A further, compatible, claim is that the institution of the family can be justified by its service to the interest of third parties. It is sometimes argued that children are a type of public good (Folbre 1994; 2008; Olsaretti 2013) whose development as future citizens has significant implications for the social order as a whole. In this context, Jennifer Roback Morse (1999) argues, for instance, that the family plays an indispensable role in raising persons capable of trust, co-operation, and self-restraint. A well-functioning society depends on sufficient numbers of citizens possessing such traits such that they can engage in the forms of social co-operation necessary to sustain collective self-governance.

Perhaps the most notable parent-centred account in recent years is offered by Brighouse and Swift (2006), who argue that parents’ interests are served by certain control rights over children and that those parental interests also permit certain forms of parental partiality towards children which will naturally disrupt Equality of Opportunity (2009). They argue that

Parents enjoy a distinctively valuable relationship with their children; one that is intimate and mutually loving,

and that

the institution of the family allows [the parent] to have [this] relationship of a kind that cannot be substituted for by relationships with other adults. (Brighouse & Swift 2009: 53–54)

In other words, the internal life of the family, along with shared activities, experiences and even values between its members, support a distinctive source of intimacy between parent and child which offers a distinctive source of flourishing for parents. Other relationships are not substitutable with those between parent child, so the abolition of the family would mean that a particular, and valuable, source of flourishing would be lost. In order to create, sustain, and enjoy relationships of such value, parents need to be able to do things with and for their children, and this will inevitably tend to create differences between families, leading some children to benefit more than others. Although this will almost certainly disrupt Equality of Opportunity, Brighouse and Swift suggest that the value of these intimate relationships is a potential justification for such inequality. Some activities will be necessary to nourish these relations of intimacy, whereas others will not. In the group of activities that will be necessary, Brighouse and Swift (2009: 57) give the examples of reading bedtime stories to children and parents enrolling children in associations which will enable them to participate in communities of value that can be shared between parent and child. In contrast, it is very unlikely that enrolling children in expensive private schools designed to maximize their future opportunities, or investing in trust funds, will be essential for parent and child to enjoy the goods distinctively supported by family relationships (Brighouse & Swift 2009: 58). If those other activities are to be justified, given the inequality they tend to perpetuate, it must be on the basis of other values, rather than this special familial intimacy.

In work that explores the societal factors which tend to result in unequal life chances between different persons the family is understandably foregrounded in discussion. This is because it is so formative as a developmental pathway which has a bearing on the prospects for acquiring the traits to be successful in social competition (for a good analysis of the mechanisms by which families transmit advantages see Swift 2005). At bottom, however, the conflict is more general. For it seems that when persons exercise their associational freedom in different ways this generates inequality. The tension between the family and Equality of Opportunity reflects a more general tension between freedom—to organize associations, to favour some over others—and equality (James Fishkin 1987). The tension manifests to different degrees and in different ways, depending on the thickness of one’s conception of Equality of Opportunity, but it seems present to at least some degree for all conceptions. For instance, the freedom to racially discriminate is constrained by relatively thin, formal conceptions of Equality of Opportunity. Meritocratic conceptions go further and constrain the freedom to select on grounds other than the best qualified. More substantive conceptions of Equality of Opportunity go still further, and imply a tension between relevantly equal life chances and the freedom to associate and promote the good of particular others, which manifests different prospects between different persons.

8. Radical/Luck Egalitarian Equality of Opportunity

To this point, the entry has largely focused on the “societal factors” which determine differential prospects for success—whether in the form of legal constraints on opportunities, discrimination in hiring, family background etc. The range of conceptions of Equality of Opportunity canvassed to this point tend mostly to take for granted that there are at least some natural or non-societal factors that differentially affect persons’ prospects for success without undermining Equality of Opportunity. Under FEO and associated conceptions of Equality of Opportunity, for instance, it is acceptable for more talented people to enjoy greater chances of success in social competition than those who are less talented, provided those chances were not themselves influenced in the wrong ways by social factors, such as class, family, and perhaps other associational sources of inequality.

This position is challenged by a still thicker conception of Equality of Opportunity, which might be termed Radical Equality of Opportunity (Segall 2013; Swift 2014) and is often called Luck Egalitarianism (LE) (also labelled “Socialist Equality of Opportunity” by Cohen 2009). Roughly, under the LE conception of Equality of Opportunity no factors other than persons’ own responsible choices should affect differential prospects for success (for some prominent early defences see Cohen 1989; Temkin 1993). LE thereby goes beyond FEO and not only condemns the influence of societal inequalities but also differences in natural talent and ability. Suppose, in a simplified case, that the highest paying jobs in a given society select according to intellectual aptitude and that, even when society is organized to a point where class, gender-based, racialized, familial etc. inequalities do not affect persons’ different prospects for success, natural differences in persons’ intelligence determine who does or does not get the highest paying jobs. Unequal prospects based upon those natural differences are inconsistent with true Equality of Opportunity under the LE view, because those with lower intelligence still have relevantly unequal opportunities to succeed as compared with others.

For some, the intuitive appeal of the LE view is that differential prospects for success should be relevantly under the control of each individual. Echoing concerns first voiced by Rawls (1999: 87, 274, 447) in his A Theory of Justice, what drives the Luck Egalitarian view is an objection to the distributive influence of factors that are arbitrary from a moral point of view and, by that token, unfair determinants of inequality. As such, only differences that are the result of individuals’ own responsible choices (and, it is claimed, therefore non-arbitrary) create fair inequalities in success. The range of factors that are unacceptable determinants of differential success under the LE is therefore broader than under thinner conceptions of Equality of Opportunity and excludes everything other than the results of one’s own choices. The details of the LE version of Equality of Opportunity will be further unpacked in what follows, but it is worth noting that the LE view tends to differ from FEO and other thinner conceptions of Equality of Opportunity in other respects as well. Many of the conceptions of Equality of Opportunity surveyed above have a relatively limited scope inasmuch as they are concerned with opportunities for certain goods, often in the context of competition—usually socially advantageous positions of certain kinds, like jobs, offices, places in education. LE tends to be understood more broadly—as a view about overall fairness of persons’ life prospects (Segall 2013). It is therefore concerned with persons’ opportunities in general with respect to whatever has value in life—what has become known as the “currency” of egalitarian concern. Broadly, the LE view holds that if someone is worse off than others, in terms of the overall “currency” of what matters, because of factors other than their own choices, then this is an unfair violation of Equality of Opportunity. The LE view is therefore consistent with persons facing unequal opportunities to obtain particular jobs or roles, provided persons enjoy equal overall prospects for success, measured in whatever “currency” is favoured. The LE view also naturally tends towards a global application in a way that distinguishes it from some of the other conceptions. Thinner conceptions of Equality of Opportunity are frequently consistent with criteria for success which exclude or disadvantage people on the basis of their nationality or geographical proximity. For instance, university admissions may give priority to domestic applicants or even exclude foreign students from eligibility altogether. Certain jobs will require candidates to travel for interview and relocate in the event that they are successful, which will effectively exclude many people from being able to compete for or accept the role. These constraints will often pass as acceptable under conceptions of Equality of Opportunity surveyed in the above, but for the LE view they are just another potential source of inequality which may stand in the way of realizing Equality of Opportunity (for more see section 10.2).

LE lies near the thickest end of the continuum by which we can organize various conceptions of Equality of Opportunity. It holds that only choice is an appropriate source of unequal prospects for success. A still thicker conception might deny that even choice should determine differences, and, instead, that no factors are acceptable determinants of unequal success (for a qualified version of such a view see Persson 2007). This would amount to Equality of Opportunity as equal outcome. Whether or not this is a justified position, it might be strained to label this an Equal Opportunity view. Although LE occupies this place on the continuum of conceptions, where few factors are acceptable determinants of unequal prospects, it is misleading to think of LE as commending equal chances for success. Equal chances of success could be secured by simply having an equal lottery between everyone, the outcome of which results in some people faring very well and others faring very poorly. This would be straightforwardly inconsistent with LE, because the inequalities would not be a result of persons’ own choices but, rather, the outcome of the lottery (for an example of this type see B. Barry 1988)

At the heart of LE is the distinction, first introduced by Ronald Dworkin, between “option luck” and “brute luck”. Option luck is

a matter of how deliberate and calculated gambles turn out—whether someone gains or loses through accepting an isolated risk he or she should have anticipated and might have declined. (Dworkin 1981: 293)

Brute luck is defined in contradistinction to option luck as “a matter of how risks fall out that are not in that sense deliberate gambles” (1981: 293). To illustrate the distinction, Dworkin continues:

If I buy a stock on the exchange that rise, then my option luck is good. If I am hit by a falling meteorite whose course could not have been predicted, then my bad luck is brute. (1981: 293)

Roughly, then, brute luck is a matter of things that happen to us which are relevantly independent of our choices, including both things that happen to us over the course of our lives and things which we are born with, whereas option luck is a matter of the reasonably foreseeable consequences for us of the choices we could reasonably have avoided making. For LE, inequalities in brute luck are unfair and unjust, whereas inequalities in option luck are fair and just. Persons therefore enjoy Equality of Opportunity in the relevant way when their brute luck is equal with others and outcomes differ only as a result of differences in option luck—namely the foreseeable outcomes of their own responsible choices. These essentials of the LE view have been further refined in various work, and the LE view has generated substantial debate (for some critical views see Anderson 1999; Fleurbaey 2001; Scheffler 2003; 2005; Seligman 2007; for some defences, see Arneson 2004; N. Barry 2006; Elford 2017; Knight 2005; Lippert-Rasmussen 2016; Segall 2007; Stemplowska 2013; Voigt 2007).

Beyond matters of substantive debate between critics and defenders of LE, there are various complexities pertaining to the application of the LE view. One is that persons’ choices are generally, if not always, made in the context of pre-existing unfair inequality. Suppose we have two young people—Sydney and Miriam—who face a choice between going to university to acquire new skills or working a low paying job. The outcome of that choice will affect their prospects for success in applications for high paying jobs in the future, and the earnings from those jobs will far exceed what they are able to earn in a low paying job, even when they take up that low paid work immediately. Sydney enjoys the good brute luck of having been born into a rich family, which can help pay for her university fees and are not themselves suffering from any financial hardship. Miriam, on the other hand, is from a poor family, which does not have the means to help her financially through university and struggles to pay domestic bills. Suppose Sydney opts to go to university, Miriam chooses to take a low paying job, and as a result Sydney enjoys far better prospects in the competition for higher paying jobs. Although the differences in advantage between Sydney and Miriam were partly the result of their respective choices (and, to that extent, constitute option luck), those choices were made in the context of considerably different circumstances, which themselves represent unfair brute luck differences between the two (see Swift 2008: 364 for a note on how critics of LE have sometimes overlooked this important qualifier). This brief illustration indicates that the question of how far persons should be held liable for option luck disadvantage (or entitled to option luck advantage) under conditions of unequal brute luck is a profoundly difficult one. To add to the complexity, choices may not only be influenced in the sense that they are taken in the context of a certain range of options, which may differ, unfairly, for different persons, but persons’ choices are themselves informed by different dispositions, inclinations, and knowledge bases which themselves depend partly on brute factors (Voorhoeve 2008). How much effort a person is inclined to make, which options they view as being viable or valuable, and how focused different persons become on tasks are all things which differ across persons and may be affected, to one degree or another, by brute luck factors such as a person’s social circumstances or their genetic predisposition to think in certain ways. Again, the question of how to disentangle brute from option luck considerations looks immensely challenging.

Still further, circumstances constrain which options are reasonable for people to pursue and to that extent might affect which choices qualify as “deliberate gambles” in Dworkin’s sense. Suppose, in the example above, that Miriam has a gravely ill mother who urgently needs expensive medication that she can only get if Miriam immediately begins earning money in whichever job is available. It is plausible to think that going to university, rather than earning immediate money, is simply an unreasonable option for Miriam, given what it would mean for her mother’s health. For this reason, one might argue that Miriam’s resulting disadvantage in the future employment stakes is more brute luck than option luck, even though it issued from a choice she made (for analysis of a similar case, see de Shalit and Wolff 2011).

The most well-developed theory attempting to grapple with some of the challenges of this sort is offered by John Roemer (1998; 2002; 2003). Roemer starts from the perspective that there are aspects of a person’s environment which are relevantly beyond that person’s control—their “circumstances”—which can be distinguished from a person’s acts of autonomous volition—their “effort”. Roemer offers a proposal designed to help policymakers determine the extent to which persons’ outcomes are a result of their circumstances or their efforts. That proposal involves sorting people into “types” based on how advantageous their circumstances are. Distributive differences within each types reflect the differential “effort” individuals make. Equality of Opportunity requires equalizing between types (given that the difference between types is based on “circumstances”—factors outside of individuals’ control in the relevant sense) but not equalizing to eliminate differences in individuals’ place within types (given that such differences are based on “effort”). To crudely illustrate, suppose we have an “advantaged” type (e.g., from a rich background) and a “disadvantaged” type (e.g., from a poor background), and within each type we have “low effort” and “high effort” groups. Roemer’s proposal involves equalizing between “high effort” “advantaged” and “high effort” “disadvantaged” individuals and also equalizing between “low effort” “advantaged” and “low effort” “disadvantaged” individuals but does not require further equalization between “high effort” and “low effort” (for critiques see Hurley 2003: ch. 7; Phillips 2006: 20–23; Risse 2002).

Although the LE conception of Equality of Opportunity has classically involved a view of option luck which appears to take for granted Dworkin’s original way of specifying the idea, this aspect of LE has been scrutinized and developed in other work (Arneson 2004; Dekker 2009; Elford 2018; Olsaretti 2009; Stemplowska 2009; Temkin 2011). Suppose Taylor chooses to stay at home and take care of her two children and that this leaves her worse off than she would have been by going out to work a full-time job. Assuming her choice was relevantly unconstrained by those circumstances, her being worse off looks like a matter of option luck. She made a choice and should be held liable for its foreseeable consequences. LE views have often implicitly supposed that it is the actual foreseeable consequences of choice, or the consequences determined by the uncoerced responses from others (for instance through the free market) which ought to determine the consequences. But this might be questioned, as the basic distinction between choices and circumstances at the root of LE is, in fact, consistent with a range of different views regarding the consequences that persons should be held liable for/entitled to as a result of their choices (Arneson 2004; Olsaretti 2009; Stemplowska 2009). Perhaps care-giving choices should be rewarded more highly than the market rewards them, and perhaps more highly than the other vocations. One could argue for this conclusion on various grounds (Olsaretti 2009: 182–186). Perhaps it would be valuable to incentivize care-giving choices in a way that the market presently fails to do, or, for a different reason, because there is something basically valuable about care-giving that means such choices are deserving of reward (Temkin 2011). The point is that the Equality of Opportunity aspect of LE—that persons should only fare better or worse than others as a result of their own choices—is consistent with a range of accounts concerning which benefits or liabilities ought to pertain to different choices.

The LE position has engendered a substantial amount of debate since its inception. Some lines of criticism point to its putatively implausible implications for policymaking (Wolff 1998).However, the LE conception of Equality of Opportunity is an abstract, ideal conception which few, if any, of its advocates believe can be perfectly instantiated (Arneson 2004: 13–14). Almost all those who hold an LE conception also tend to view it as one consideration of justice, to be considered against other values. LE is a view concerning which inequalities are fair, even if unfair inequalities can be justified on other grounds. For instance, just as with FEO, LE fairness is in tension with the family inasmuch as the existence of the family generates brute luck inequalities between different children. It is consistent with LE to hold that the family is an all-things-considered justified and valuable social mode of organization, whilst contending that it standardly generates lamentable, unfair inequalities which we have reason to mitigate.

There are different approaches to the inequalities that are justified under the LE view. LE is sometimes understood as a view which merely permits those inequalities, such that the elimination of those inequalities would not be bad. This LE conception of Equality of Opportunity would be consistent with redistributive measures to create equal outcomes, even if it would not mandate the elimination of option luck inequality (Segall 2013). Alternatively, LE is sometimes understood as a view that requires option luck inequalities, under which redistribution to eliminate option luck inequalities would be positively unfair (Cohen 2006: 444), even if that might be justified by other values. Understood in this way, LE shares with the meritocratic conception the notion that some differences in prospects are required (the more qualified should be advantaged in the competition), rather than merely permitted.

9. Equality of Opportunity in Practice

In section 2, we saw that Equality of Opportunity can be understood in deontic or telic terms. To recall, a deontic view of Equality of Opportunity is primarily concerned with processes and decisions by which goods or positions are allocated, whereas a telic view is concerned with persons’ enjoyment of equal opportunities as a matter of the overall state of affairs. Rawls’ conception of FEO, for example, explicitly combines both deontic and telic elements. It includes a deontic requirement that offices and positions are to be distributed according to the talents and willingness to work of those competing for such positions (a meritocratic conception, or, as Rawls calls it, formal equality of opportunity), and it includes a telic principle that persons ought to enjoy conditions which provide them with a fair chance to compete under those terms. LE is most naturally understood as a telic ideal, given that it evaluates how a person fares overall in comparison with others. It is possible to conceive of LE as a deontic approach, however. Such an approach might specify allocative requirements as being those which, if adhered to, would best instantiate LE outcomes (Segall 2013). Even so, because LE is concerned with persons’ levels of overall advantage, any principles regulating the allocation of jobs and positions specifically would either be insufficient to ensure LE Equality of Opportunity (because only jobs and positions, along with their attendant rewards, would be allocated), or they would need to take into account wider sources of inequality.

This points us in the direction of a tension between telic and deontic considerations of Equality of Opportunity. To take Rawls’ FEO as an illustration, we can see that the deontic element—that offices and positions should be allocated according to meritocratic principles—is separable from the telic element—that persons should enjoy a fair chance to compete for social advantages. These elements can come apart in different ways. A society could offer an equal chance for social advantage whilst violating the meritocratic principle. Suppose we have a society sharply divided along racialized lines but in a way that is equal between groups. Members of each racialized group are systematically discriminated against in hiring practices, but this balances out overall to give each citizen no lesser chance than others at competing for social advantage. Though fanciful, this illustrates how meritocratic considerations are importantly distinct from, and only contingently related to, the issue of equal prospects for success overall. If we object to the racialized discrimination in a case like this, it suggests that our reasons for objecting to it are not reducible to its liability to create inequalities in life chances (though we may not be objecting to it qua being discrimination; Segall 2013: 122). More realistically, a society could instantiate meritocratic hiring practices without giving citizens a relevantly fair chance to compete.

This second scenario provokes a further important question: namely, how should deontic principles of Equality of Opportunity be applied in contexts where telic Equality of Opportunity is imperfectly instantiated? (For some reflections, see Joseph Fishkin 2014: 56–65.) For instance, when society fails to ensure that persons have a fair chance to compete for offices and positions, should hiring practices be adjusted in light of this, or not (Clayton 2012)? Suppose society manifests substantial class inequality which leads to systematic differences between children from the prosperous class and a poor class when it comes to their prospects of success in an employment market that is regulated by meritocratic principles. Children from the prosperous class have a much greater chance at obtaining the qualifications that will help secure them the advantaged positions. Suppose that those inequalities remain unaddressed by direct means (for instance, the redistribution of wealth or education reforms).

One measure here would be to institute workplace adaptations to offset disadvantages. That is, the available range of jobs could be reconstituted to ensure that advantaged positions depend less on the talents that are cultivated by the prosperous social class and depend on traits that are more evenly distributed across the social spectrum. This would be consistent with adhering to principles of meritocratic Equality of Opportunity. Competitive hiring would still be decided by a “best qualified” criteria, but the range of relevant qualifications is simply changed to counter unfair inequalities in access to the jobs. This measure might seem to have limited mileage, however (although for a related proposal in a sporting context, albeit in response to natural physiological differences, see English 1978). Quite apart from the fact that there might be reasons of efficiency for organizing the workplace in certain ways rather than others, it is also likely that the sources of social inequality in a society divided along class lines would be responsive to changes in how the workplace is organized. If families in prosperous social classes are intent on funnelling resources into their children’s development to give them the highest chances of success, their money will simply follow whichever set of qualifications happen to do that.

Sometimes social advantage can allow people to gain qualifications which advantage them in competitive applications, even though those qualifications are not necessarily reflective of higher underlying talent or ability. For a stark illustration of this, suppose that children of wealthy families can gain preferential access to prestigious and high calibre universities, and that, whilst there, they are given lenient grading given the quality of their work. They reach the job market with exceptionally strong qualifications—in the sense that their educational portfolio is strong—even though this is not an accurate reflection of their underlying ability. In the context of advantages of this kind—where social advantage buys “surface qualifications”, rather than enhancing “talent for the job”—it might be that some degree of unfair inequality in the competition for social advantage can be offset by ensuring that hiring and admissions practices consistently admit those with the highest underlying ability (and effort), rather than those who have the best “surface qualifications”.

An example may help to illustrate. Take a competitive application for a degree course in mathematics. Suppose the criteria for being “best qualified” for selection is the level of aptitude at maths that the student will reach at the end of the course. The university begins with a selection procedure that uses school grades as the sole appropriate indicator as to which candidate is best qualified in that sense. It might be that school grades are an imperfect indicator because less well-qualified students from more prosperous backgrounds are able to go to schools which successfully allow them to get high grades, even though this does not necessarily reflect their superior underlying ability in maths. One measure the university might take to apply the “best qualified” criteria more accurately, then, might be to design a maths test which more accurately discriminates between candidates based on underlying ability than school grades do.

This would not necessarily be a compromise of the meritocratic conception of Equality of Opportunity, but a requirement to apply it more accurately. For instance, it could be that using “surface qualifications” is a useful proxy for identifying underlying ability and is otherwise more efficient than implementing a more accurate, but also more costly, procedure. Offsetting this source of unequal chances may involve requiring institutions like firms and universities to invest additional resources in more accurate procedures.

Alternatively, it might be argued that to counter the lack of equal chances for members of socially disadvantaged groups, we should depart from meritocratic principles in hiring and admissions. For instance, a quota system might be used to require the inclusion of members of certain disadvantaged groups, even though they may be less qualified than non-members (Mason 2006: 19, 78 ; Mason 2001: 767).This is importantly different from the above thought that measures might be taken to discount the social advantages that some have when it comes to portraying themselves as ultimately best qualified. It is not simply a matter of eliminating the social advantages some candidates have concerning how successfully they can navigate the competitive procedures (for instance, through better qualifications on paper) but it is a matter of saying that members of certain groups should get an advantage over those who are in fact better qualified for the position. In the case of applications to study maths at university, for instance, it could be that children from more prosperous backgrounds receive an education that not only gives them better grades, but it also genuinely enhances their ability at maths. In this case they are genuinely better qualified in the relevant sense, rather than simply appearing to be, but their educational advantages could be said to give them an unfair chance in the competition to study maths at university. A quota system requiring that a greater proportion of students be admitted from less prosperous backgrounds would thereby involve compromising the deontic, meritocratic element of FEO in order to better satisfy the telic, fair chances element.

A quota system of this kind might fall under the umbrella of measures often referred to as “affirmative action” or “positive discrimination”, under which members of some groups receive preferential treatment in the competition for roles and positions in a way that departs from meritocratic criteria (see the entry on affirmative action). This need not necessarily come in the form of a quota but could be simply that membership of a certain group gives a candidate some advantage in the competition, say, by simply giving some extra weight to those applications (Dworkin 2002b; Jacobs 2004: ch. 5). There are a range of reasons offered for pursuing such measures. The measures could be pursued to make the competition for scarce roles and positions fairer, as in the above example of admitting a greater proportion of children from less prosperous backgrounds to a maths course. They could be pursued as a matter of compensation for historical disadvantage (Nickel 1972; Thomson 1973; Valls 1999; for criticism, see Anderson 2010: 137–141; Lippert-Rasmussen 2020: ch. 2; Sher 1975). The measures could be pursued to try to counteract would-be unfair inequalities more generally, and not specifically to equalize chances for the members of the group who are being favoured. For instance, it might be argued that by bolstering the numbers of individuals from disadvantaged or marginalized groups in certain roles or jobs, this helps to facilitate access to those positions more generally, or to work against broader forms of injustice. Perhaps admitting a larger proportion of children from underprivileged social backgrounds into university helps encourage members of those groups to see university as a realistic ambition when, because of past social conditions, it has not been considered attainable from their point of view (for discussion, see Thomson 1973: 367). Or perhaps increasing the numbers of members of racialized minority groups in a workforce will play some part in broader efforts to destigmatize racialized differences between groups. One thing worth noting about this rationale is that on a broad enough understanding of what makes someone “best qualified” for a role it might be that such measures do not constitute a compromise of the meritocratic requirement to select the best qualified after all (Anderson 2010: ch. 7; Dworkin 2002a: 109). This might be the case if the relevant purpose of the role included these broader social effects.

10. The Scope of Equality of Opportunity

Different conceptions of Equality of Opportunity tend to be aligned with different views about what might be called the “scope” of Equality of Opportunity. There are two dimensions of the scope of Equality of Opportunity which might be helpfully distinguished. First, there is the matter of the range of goods or positions that considerations of Equality of Opportunity are relevant for. Narrower views of the scope of Equality of Opportunity restrict its application to a limited range of offices and positions allocated through a competitive process. Wider views of the scope might encompass a broader range of positions, goods, and relationships. Call this the “goods scope” of Equality of Opportunity. Second, there is the matter of the range of persons deemed relevant for Equality of Opportunity. Suppose it is claimed that French society offers Equality of Opportunity for holding political office, in the sense that there are no formal or informal constraints of relevance which stand between any French citizen and seeking to hold such office. Still, it might be that only French citizens are eligible to run for political office, so the scope of application of Equality of Opportunity is limited to French citizens. Call this the “person scope” of Equality of Opportunity.

10.1 Goods Scope of Equality of Opportunity

As much of the preceding material indicates, it is familiar to think of the application of Equality in relation to socially advantageous roles and positions involving a competitive application process, the paradigm of such cases being jobs and competitive admissions processes in education. We could think about this in terms of persons enjoying Equality of Opportunity for particular roles (for example, for a given teaching job) or for a type of role (for example, for teaching jobs in general), or for roles more generally (for example, jobs in general). Equality of Opportunity is also sometimes used to refer to persons’ access to goods other than socially advantageous roles such as healthcare. One example of healthcare concerns that might be framed in terms of Equality of Opportunity is the matter of the so-called “postcode lottery” in the UK. This refers to the fact that where one lives in the UK can sometimes determine how readily available certain drugs and treatments are under the National Health Service. If citizens in one county have access to drugs that are far less available through the service to citizens in another county, this might be framed as a failure of Equality of Opportunity for healthcare. Similar claims might be made about the distribution of many other goods like this, which do not take the form of competition for roles and positions, but which involve the distribution of scarce resources according to a given eligibility criteria. When people claim that there is a failure of Equality of Opportunity, they may not be claiming that everyone should have equal amounts of the good, or even equal access to the good, but that the distribution ought to be determined by justified criteria of eligibility, rather than by other factors which are deemed illegitimate. So, for instance, in the postcode lottery case, the claim might be that healthcare should be distributed according to need, rather than according to the arbitrary fact of which county one happens to live in. As such, even though this application of the notion of Equality of Opportunity pertains to goods other than competitive application practices, it involves the same idea—that some factors are legitimate determinants of the distribution and others are not.

Whilst Equality of Opportunity is very commonly understood to have a scope that encompasses socially advantageous positions that are part of formalized institutions—such as jobs and other institutional roles, and places in education—it might also be understood more broadly, to encompass more informal “positions” in society which have value or constitute social advantages, including, for instance, to competitions for prizes and honours. Still more broadly, the notion of Equality of Opportunity might be applied to much less formalized social relations that constitute, or lead to, advantages. It might be applied, for instance, to one’s opportunity to be a parent, or even one’s opportunity for marriage. Again, the notion of Equality of Opportunity here can be used in a way that ties it closely to the institutional or political measures that might be taken to ensure fair access to certain goods or relationships, or it might be applied more broadly to take account of the wider social explanation for some persons enjoying a good where others do not. For instance, some conceptions of Equality of Opportunity for parenthood or for marriage will hold that persons enjoy equal opportunities when there are no state-instituted barriers against certain persons marrying or, say, adopting children. Other conceptions will go further, and contend that Equality of Opportunity requires, for instance, subsidizing IVF treatment and adoption processes, or widening access to marriage procedures. And, indeed, there will be some conceptions which go still further and hold that social norms and the behaviour of one’s fellow citizens can themselves prove barriers to Equality of Opportunity. To illustrate, suppose we can clearly identify a level of bias against certain members of a particular racialized group in dating apps, leading to those persons’ faring less well at matching with others. It might be argued that this reflects a lack of Equality of Opportunity for such individuals to form romantic relationships.

10.2 Person Scope of Equality of Opportunity

This dimension of the scope of Equality of Opportunity has thus far been framed as a matter of the range of persons to whom the conception of Equality of Opportunity is to be applied. However, it is worth noting that we can think about this issue in slightly different terms—understanding the identity or status of the person as one of the factors which should or should not affect a distribution. The example of Equality of Opportunity for political office in France can be understood as having a scope that is limited to French citizens, or, alternatively, it could be understood to have a global scope but where citizenship is a relevant factor which determines who should or should not be able to run for office. Though it is true on a technical level that all such scope claims can be translated into the factors which should or should not affect success in a competition, it seems clearer to conceive of this in terms of the scope of application across persons, given that it is a persons’ identity which disbars them from consideration altogether.

Furthermore, particularly when we think about telic ways of thinking about Equality of Opportunity in terms of persons enjoying fair prospects for success, it seems more sensible to think of conceptions of Equality of Opportunity in terms of being scope limited across persons, rather than adding a person’s identity to the range of factors which legitimately affect the prospects for success. Consider, for instance, the claim under Rawls’ FEO that social class should not affect persons’ prospects for securing socially advantageous positions. It seems clear that children in the poorest social class in, say, Afghanistan will have worse prospects for success than the most prosperous social class in, say, Norway. And yet Rawls does not class it as a failure of Equality of Opportunity if Afghan children fare worse in the competition for offices and positions in Norway than do Norwegian children. Rather than saying that FEO has global scope but also includes the condition that prospects can legitimately vary according to nationality, it seems more sensible to say that Rawls’ conception of FEO is limited in scope to those persons within a particular social scheme.

Whether Equality of Opportunity has a scope that traverses national borders is closely related to wider questions concerning the scope of justice (see the entries on global justice and international distributive justice) and is a debated matter (for defences of such a position, see Caney 2000a,b; B. Barry 1991; Moellendorf 2002; Pogge 1994; for accounts critical of coherent global scheme of Equality of Opportunity, see Boxill 1987; Miller 2005). There is no strict relationship between how formal or substantive a conception of Equality of Opportunity is and how wide its person scope is. LE conceptions of Equality of Opportunity tend to be associated with a global person scope, although LE is technically consistent with a more limited person scope. LE tilts in favour of a global person scope because conceptions of LE generally see all factors other than responsible choice—including citizenship and nationality—as morally arbitrary, and hence improper determinants of how well a person fares in comparison with others (Caney 2005: 123).

11. Concluding remarks

The term Equality of Opportunity is really used to refer to several distinct ideas, thematically unified by some form of commitment to permitting differential access to goods or positions based on certain factors and condemning it in relation to others. The thinness of that basis of unity helps to illuminate the apparent widespread (although not by any means universal) agreement over the value of Equality of Opportunity. It also serves to expose the sense in which that degree of agreement is ultimately illusory, and that surface agreement concerning the value of Equality of Opportunity can often conceal underlying substantive disagreement over the respects in which individuals ought to be made equal with one another.


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The author would like to thank Andy Mason for helpful thoughts during the drafting process for the entry.

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