Samuel Alexander

First published Mon Jun 2, 2014; substantive revision Wed Jul 13, 2022

Australian-born philosopher Samuel Alexander (1859–1938) was a prominent figure in early twentieth-century British philosophy. He is best known for advancing “British Emergentism”, a movement that held mind “emerges” from matter. Alexander rejected idealism, and accordingly can be labelled a “new realist” alongside the likes of Bertrand Russell; however, unlike other new realists, Alexander maintained close ties with British idealism throughout his career, and his ontology arguably bears similarities to the Absolute Idealism of F. H. Bradley. Alexander’s mature metaphysical system is set out in his greatest work Space, Time, and Deity (1920). Alexander conceives the world as a hierarchy of levels: space and time sit at the lowest level, and through a process of emergence give rise to the levels of matter, life, mind, and deity. These levels are pervaded by “categorial” features of reality, such as substance, universals, and causality. Although Alexander is primarily known as a metaphysician, he wrote extensively on many other philosophical topics, including the history of philosophy, ethics, aesthetics, and the philosophy of religion. Alexander spent most of his professional career at the University of Manchester, where he supported various moves in education and feminism. On his death, Alexander left his philosophical papers and correspondence to the John Rylands Library at Manchester, and this collection constitutes an important philosophic archive of the period.

Alexander’s work was widely celebrated during his lifetime. J. H. Muirhead (1939: 3) wrote that, after Bradley’s death in 1924, Alexander was “the leading figure in British philosophy, and whom all schools, whatever their differences, were delighted to honour as their chief”. John Laird (1939: 61–5) described Space, Time, and Deity as “the boldest adventure in detailed speculative metaphysics” since Hobbes. Although he never founded a school of philosophy, Alexander is credited with having an influence on figures as diverse as new realists Laird, C. D. Broad, and Edwin B. Holt; the process philosopher A. N. Whitehead; John Anderson, “father of Australian philosophy”, and his school at Sydney; British idealists May Sinclair and Hilda Oakeley; and philosopher of history R. G. Collingwood. A number of studies were produced on Alexander’s work in the mid-twentieth century, but it then saw a period of neglect. Over the last decade or so, interest has increased, as indicated by Fisher’s (2021) collection Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity.

1. Life

Alexander was born in Sydney on 6 January 1859, to a Jewish family. He was the third son of Samuel Alexander, a British emigrant and saddler. Alexander’s father died a few weeks after his birth, and five years later the remaining family moved to Melbourne. Alexander was home-educated by tutors before entering Wesley College in 1871. Alexander entered the University of Melbourne in 1875, and subsequently won awards in arts, sciences, languages and natural philosophy. In 1877, Alexander sailed for England, in an attempt to win a scholarship at Oxbridge. He successfully obtained a scholarship at Balliol College, Oxford, and went on to win a First in 1881. The following year, Alexander was awarded a Fellowship at Lincoln College, Oxford.

At this time, the Oxford philosophical scene was dominated by British idealism, and Alexander formed lifelong ties with the Absolute idealists F. H. Bradley, A. C. Bradley, and Bernard Bosanquet. This idealist influence is evident in Alexander’s earliest works, on Hegel and moral progress. Arguably, it is also evident in his later works on metaphysics too. As a student, Alexander also read Plato—under the tutelage of the idealist Benjamin Jowett—and Hegel.

Although Alexander remained largely UK-based, in 1882 he travelled to Germany for a year, spending at least some of this time at the University of Berlin, where he became familiar with the physiological psychology of Hermann von Helmholtz. In 1890 he travelled to Freiburg, Germany, to spend roughly another year working in Hugo Münsterberg’s new psychological laboratory.

In 1893, Alexander accepted a Professorship at the University of Manchester. He took an active part in the university life there, and strongly supported feminism. Alexander remained at Manchester for the rest of his life, and in 1902 he brought various family members over—including his mother and three of his siblings—from Australia to Manchester. He did not marry. Although Alexander never returned to Australia he maintained a correspondence with several Australian philosophers, including the Scottish-born John Anderson.

As Alexander developed his anti-idealist views, he published on naturalism and realism. He corresponded at length with fellow British emergentists C. Lloyd Morgan and C. D. Broad on psychology and metaphysics. Whilst he rejected idealism, he also continued to correspond with F. H. Bradley and Bosanquet. During the War, Alexander canvassed for recruits, and assisted Belgian refugees.

Interest in Alexander’s work grew as he became President of the Aristotelian Society from 1908–1911 (he became President again, from 1936–1937). He was invited to deliver the Gifford lectures during the war years 1917 and 1918. These were called ‘Space, time, and deity’ and would form the basis of his (1920) Space, Time, and Deity. Laird reports that, after the war, Alexander struggled with writing its two volumes: “He was overwhelmed by a sense of his littleness in comparison with the task to which he was tied” (Laird 1939: 61). Nonetheless, Space, Time, and Deity was finally finished, assuring Alexander’s place within the British philosophical landscape. It was praised by new realists and idealists alike. As John Passmore puts it:

…even when he [Alexander] broke with the Idealists, they continued to speak of him with a respect they rarely showed to the New Realists—although this charity did not survive the bleakness of Cambridge, where McTaggart, forgetting his own blackened pots, complained of Space, Time, and Deity that “in every chapter we come across some view which no philosopher, except Professor Alexander, has ever maintained”. It would be inhuman to expect the arch-enemy of Time to praise its arch-prophet. (Passmore 1957: 268)

Bleakness of Cambridge aside, Alexander received many honours during his lifetime. These include his election as a Fellow of the British Academy in 1913, an honorary D.Litt from Oxford in 1924, an honorary Litt.D from the University of Liverpool in 1925, and another from the University of Cambridge in 1934. In 1923, Alexander retired from Manchester. In a speech, he described how proud and happy he was during his time as a professor there, “during which I tried to do my part” (Alexander, cited in Laird 1939: 71).

Alexander’s retirement did not stem the tide of his output. Having completed Space, Time, and Deity, Alexander continued to produce a stream of articles as prolific as it was diverse. He wrote several pieces comparing his metaphysics to that of Spinoza, and Alexander took pride—rooted partly in their shared Jewish heritage—in the deep similarity he perceived there. Alexander also wrote on the nature of art, history, Moliere, Pascal, theology, and Jane Austen. Alexander was a lifelong fan of Austen, and particularly loved Persuasion. His friend and colleague, J. H. Muirhead, suggested that Alexander’s love of literature may have resulted from partial deafness, which made it difficult for him to appreciate music.

Ultimately, Alexander turned his philosophic attention away from metaphysics to art and value. Lord Listowel describes Alexander’s move towards aesthetics:

But why, of the many unsailed seas he must have been tempted to chart, did his insatiable curiosity launch him on a last voyage into the rough waters of aesthetic theory? There is no certain answer to this question. What we do know is that the third person of the hallowed trinity whose members are Truth, Goodness, and Beauty had hitherto been sadly neglected as compared with the first two, and that a treatise on aesthetics was urgently required as the coping stone of a neatly finished philosophical system. Yet it would be a grievous error to suppose that his fondness for the subject was due solely or even mainly to systematic grounds. Art, in its manifold shapes, attracted him irresistibly… [he] wrote and talked about Art because he really loved the pictures, statues, mansions, poems, novels, and plays that are its concrete manifestations. (Listowel 1939: 181)

Alexander’s full system of aesthetics can be found in his final monograph, Beauty and Other Forms of Value (1933).

In his late years, Alexander continued to publish, but Laird reports that Alexander was greatly troubled from the 1930s by the suffering of Jewish refugees; Alexander did all he could to help with pen and purse (Laird 1939: 94). Alexander died on 13 September 1938, and his ashes lie in the Manchester Southern Cemetery. He bequeathed the majority of his estate, and his philosophical papers, to the University of Manchester. A bust of Alexander, by the artist Epstein, stands in the University of Manchester’s Samuel Alexander Building (formerly known as the Hall of the Arts Building). Alexander reportedly said that he would be happy to have Erravit cum Spinoza engraved on his funeral urn; Muirhead suggested that instead he should have Ut alter Spinoza philosophatus[1] (Muirhead 1939: 14).

A biography of Alexander can be found in Laird’s (1939) memoir; see also Muirhead (1939) and G. F. Stout (1940).

2. Early Writings

2.1 History of Philosophy: Hegel and Locke

Alexander’s first publication, “Hegel’s Conception of Nature” (1886), reveals Alexander’s philosophic upbringing in Oxford’s British Hegelian enclave. Alexander aims to set out Hegel’s conception of nature, “so fantastic and so poetical that it may often be thought not to be serious”, as clearly as possible. He also aims to show where it agrees with, and diverges from, contemporary science. The article explains that science leads to a philosophy of nature through observation—for example, transforming seemingly isolated individuals into universals by discovering their general character—and the discovery of laws. Alexander also compares Hegel’s account to contemporary theories of evolution, and argues there is a “great likeness” (Alexander 1886: 518). Arguably, some of the positions that Alexander attributes to Hegel are similar to his own mature views; for example, Alexander reads Hegel as holding that space and time are “in the world” as much as matter (Alexander 1886: 506).

Alexander’s early monograph Locke (1908) discusses John Locke’s Essay on ethics, politics, and religion. This short book reveals Alexander’s admiration for Locke, and Lockean empiricism. Whilst this work is mainly of scholarly interest, Alexander spends one chapter “Observations on the Essay” critiquing Locke, and here Alexander reveals the bent of his own early views. For example, Alexander complains that Locke might have gone further had he applied his observations regarding the continuity of mental experience to substance (Alexander 1908: 52). This is suggestive, given that one of Alexander’s later key claims concerning spacetime—the stuff of substances—is that it is continuous.

2.2 Evolutionary Ethics

Alexander’s first monograph, Moral Order and Progress (1889), defends evolutionary ethics, the naturalist thesis that human morality is a product of biological evolution. The monograph is based on a dissertation written by Alexander at Oxford, for which he won the 1887 T. H. Green Moral Philosophy Prize. In the preface, Alexander writes,

I am proud to have my work connected, however indirectly, with the name of T. H. Green; and I feel this all the more because, though, as will be obvious, my obligations to him are very great, I have not scrupled to express my present dissent from his fundamental principles. (vii)

The preface also reveals the strong idealist backdrop against which Alexander’s work is set: the monograph is dedicated to A. C. Bradley, and in the preface Alexander personally thanks D. G. Ritchie, William Wallace, R. L. Nettleship, and J. S. Haldane. Alexander adds that he owes a special debt of gratitude to F. H. Bradley, who went through the essay with him (Alexander 1889: ix). Alexander continued to exchange philosophic ideas with many of these idealists throughout their lives.

Alexander opens the monograph by stating that the proper business of ethics is the study of moral judgements, such as “It is wrong to lie”. Alexander sets out to discover the nature of morality, asking what these judgements actually express (Alexander 1889: 1–3). He does so by examining a selection of “working conceptions” in ethics—including right, wrong, and duty—and asking what they correspond to. In the same way that the working conceptions of physics—including energy, matter and motion—are ordered according to a “natural coherence”, Alexander aims to order ethical conceptions. Alexander concludes that these working conceptions correspond to ways of maintaining equilibrium in society. For example, ideas of good or right imply nothing more than “an adjustment of parts in an orderly whole”: the equilibrium of different persons in society.

[T]he predicate ‘good’ applied to an action… means that the act is one by which the agent seeks to perform the function required of him by his position in society. (Alexander 1889: 113)

Alexander takes this thesis to be the common ground of at least two current rival ethical theories:

Now nothing is more striking at the present time than the convergence of the main opposing ethical theories, at any rate, in our own country—on the one hand, the traditional English mode of thought, which advancing through utilitarianism has ended in the so-called evolutionary ethics; and on the other, the idealistic movement which is associated with the German philosophy derived from Kant… Both these views recognise that kind of proportion between the individual and his society, or between him and the law, which is expressed under the phrase, organic connection. (Alexander 1889: 5–6)

Alexander’s perception of progress in ethical theory, towards this correct end point, is Hegelian in style.

Alexander’s ethical system is a kind of evolutionary ethics, akin to that of Leslie Stephen. By applying evolution to ethics, Alexander explains that one can mean either the mere integration of the biological into the ethical sphere, or treating morals as one part of a comprehensive view of the universe, in which a steady development from the lower to the higher can be observed, a development which follows the law of the survival of the fittest (Alexander 1889: 14). Alexander, of course, means both. He emphasises that while his ethical system, based on the organic nature of society, is due in part to the influence of the biological sciences, it would be an “entire misapprehension” to think that it were entirely due to this influence; his views are also the result of progress in ethics and politics (Alexander 1889: 7–8).

It is worth noting that, despite the spectre of Hegelian idealism hovering in the background of this work, Alexander firmly resists idealism’s tendency towards monism, the view that the universe is in some sense One:

[T]he conception of a common good is apt to suggest an absolute identity of good… in greater or less degree all forms of so-called Monism, which hold that in the good act the individual is at one with others, and with the Universal Being, are victims of the misconception. (Alexander 1889: 174)

In other words, Alexander is arguing that just because he is putting forward one conception of goodness—organic connection within society—we should not accept that individuals within society are not individuals.

3. Metaphysics and Related Views

3.1 Realism and Compresence

Although Alexander may have defended realism from his earliest works, his mature realism can be found in a battery of later papers, published in quick succession: including his 1909–10, 1912a, 1912b and 1914. These papers advance theses that Alexander would expand on in Space, Time, and Deity (1920).

In “The Basis of Realism” (1914), Alexander rejects idealism in favour of realism. He writes that the “temper” of realism is to de-anthropomorphise: to put man and mind in their proper places in the world of things. Whilst mind is properly understood as part of nature, this does not diminish its value (Alexander 1914: 279–80). For Alexander, realism is thus naturalistic. This paper is an expansion of Alexander’s less rigorous (1909–10), where he compares the new conception of mind as a mere part of the universe—as opposed to being at the centre of the universe—to the move from geocentrism to heliocentrism.

A key part of Alexander’s view is that minds exist in the world alongside other things. Minds are “compresent” with other objects in the world, such as tables and mountains. In fact, all existents are compresent with each other:

There is nothing peculiar in the relation itself between mind and its objects; what is peculiar in the situation is the character of one of the terms, its being mind or consciousness. The relation is one of compresence. But there is compresence between two physical things. The relation of mind and object is comparable to that between table and floor. (Alexander 1914: 288)

According to Alexander, we perceive the world directly: we do not perceive representations or ideas of tables, but the tables themselves (or aspects of the tables). We are conscious of our perceptual process, a consciousness he labels “enjoyment”. Any direct theory of perception must account for error. If we perceive the world directly, how do we make mistakes about it? Alexander’s answer is that we do not perceive the world incorrectly, but we can incorrectly apply partial perceptions to wholes. For example, we may correctly perceive a table as having a flat edge, but incorrectly apply that perception to the table as a whole.

Alexander also argues here that minds emerge from lower-level living organisms, and are no less real for it:

[M]ind, though descended on its physical side from lower forms of existence, is, when it comes, a new quality in the world, and no more ceases to be original because in certain respects it is resoluble into physical motions, than colour disappears because it is resoluble into vibrations. (Alexander 1914: 304)

The biology that informed Alexander’s early (1889) work on ethics survives in his account of mind: mind emerges in the world through evolution. This theory of “emergent evolution” is akin to that advanced by C. Lloyd Morgan; Alexander later references Morgan’s Instinct and Experience (1912). Alexander adds here that the lowest level of existence is space and time—that they are “the foundation of all reality”—and he greatly expands on this view in his book (1920).

On Alexander’s realism, including the motivations underlying it and the question of whether realism can be found in his earliest work, see Weinstein (1984), Fisher (2017; 2021b), and Thomas (2021).

3.2 Space, Time, and Deity

This difficult two-volume work sets out Alexander’s grand metaphysical picture, a sweeping system that offers a cosmogony, an explanation of how the world came to be in its current state; and a hierarchical ontology based on emergence that attempts to account for matter, life, mind, value, and deity. Alexander does not argue for this picture. Rather, he intends that his picture should provide a description of the world. This is in line with his general methodology.

Philosophy proceeds by description; it only uses argument in order to help you to see the facts, just as a botanist uses a microscope. (Alexander 1921b: 423)

The idea is that Space, Time, and Deity offers a description of the world that best fits the facts.

The first chapter of Space, Time, and Deity opens with Alexander’s proclamation that all the vital problems of philosophy depend on space and time (Alexander 1920i: 35). Alexander conceives space and time as the stuff out of which all things are made: space and time are real and concrete, and out of them emerge matter, life, and so on. Space and time are unified in a four-dimensional manifold, spacetime. This single vast entity does not move but contains all motions within itself, and so Alexander labels it “Motion”. In this respect, Alexander’s spacetime bears some resemblance to F. H. Bradley’s (1893) Absolute: neither Motion nor the Absolute move or exist in time, but they both contain motion and time within themselves.

Alexander presents a metaphysical argument for the unity of space and time, arguing they are merely distinguishable aspects of Motion. He argues that space and time must be unified because, when abstracted away from each other, it becomes clear that they could not exist independently. Time would become a mere “now”, incapable of succession; and space would become a mere “blank”, without distinguishable elements (Alexander 1920i: 47). Motion is both successive and boasts distinguishable elements - this is because it is the union of space and time. Alexander’s metaphysical argument for this union was severely criticised by Broad (1921a,b).[2] Alexander considered his account of spacetime to be in line with the physics of his day. The following might be understood as an argument from physics for his position:

Our purely metaphysical analysis of Space-Time on the basis of ordinary experience is in essence and spirit identical with Minkowski’s conception of an absolute world of four dimensions, of which the three-dimensional world of geometry omits the element of time. (Alexander 1920i: 87)

Alexander goes on to distinguish between the characters of empirical existents that are variable—such as life, redness or sweetness—and those that are pervasive.

[These pervasive qualities] belong in some form to all existents whatever. Such are identity (numerical identity for example), substance, diversity, magnitude, even number… The pervasive categories of existence are what are known from Kant’s usage as the categories of experience, and I shall call them, in distinction from the empirical ones or qualities, categorial characters. (Alexander 1920i: 184–5)

Categorial qualities are the properties of spacetime, and this is why the categories apply to all things within spacetime. This discussion builds on Alexander’s “The Method of Metaphysics; and the Categories” (1912). In a later paper, “Some Explanations” (1921b), which aims to answer critics’ worries, Alexander explains that the existence of the categories implies the existence of something that contains them: spacetime.

[F]or me the doctrine of the categories, taken along with the notion of S-T [spacetime], is central… What is “relation” in virtue of which duration is a whole of related successive moments? What does relation stand for in our experience? I answer that it already implies S-T, and that until it receives its concrete interpretation it is in metaphysics a word. (Alexander 1921b: 411–2)

The idea is that, by supposing the existence of spacetime, we explain the existence of relations (characteristics of reality that hold between all things). Similarly, the existence of spacetime explains the existence of all other categories. For more on relations, see Alexander’s (1921b).

The second volume of Space, Time, and Deity asks how spacetime is related to the various levels of existence within it: matter, life, mind and deity. Alexander argues we should model the emergence of levels within spacetime on the emergence of mind from body:

Empirical things are complexes of space-time with their qualities, and it is now my duty to attempt to show how the different orders of empirical existence are related to each other… [T]he nature of mind and its relation to body is a simpler problem in itself than the relation of lower qualities of existence to their inferior basis; and for myself it has afforded the clue to the interpretation of the lower levels of existence. (Alexander 1920ii: 3)

Analogous to the way that Alexander takes mind to emerge from body, new levels of being emerge from spacetime when the motions within spacetime become complex enough:

Empirical things or existents are… groupings within Space-Time, that is, they are complexes of pure events or motions in various degrees of complexity. Such finites have all the categorial characters, that is, all the fundamental features which flow from the nature of any space-time… [A]s in the course of Time new complexity of motions comes into existence, a new quality emerges… The case which we are using as a clue is the emergence of the quality of consciousness from a lower level of complexity which is vital [i.e., life]. (Alexander 1920ii: 45)

Alexander has been criticised for explaining the emergence of qualities within spacetime by analogy with mind-body emergence, as the latter kind of emergence is rarely taken to be as unproblematic as Alexander appears to conceive it. For more on this, see for example Emmet (1950).

According to Alexander, the emergence of new levels of being within spacetime is driven by a “nisus”, a striving or felt push towards some end:

There is a nisus in Space-Time which, as it has borne its creatures forward through matter and life to mind, will bear them forward to some higher level of existence. (Alexander 1920ii: 346)

This means that the emergence of qualities in spacetime is not merely a process, it is a progress. Exactly what the nisus is has divided commentators.[3] but however it is best understood, it pushes the emergence of new qualities within spacetime, and this includes the push towards deity.

The second volume of Space, Time, and Deity also contains a relatively brief discussion of beauty, and other forms of value. Alexander hugely expands on this account in his 1933 monograph; see Section 4.2 below.

Alexander engaged in extended correspondence on Space, Time, and Deity: his letters with F. H. Bradley, C. D. Broad, and C. Lloyd Morgan are particularly important. Some of the Bradley correspondence can be found in Bradley’s (1999) Collected Works. Other letters can be found in Samuel Alexander Papers, John Rylands Library, Manchester.

Secondary literature on Alexander’s spacetime metaphysics includes Brettschneider (1964), Broad (1921a,b), Murphy’s (1927–1928) series, Emmet (1950), Thomas (2013), Fisher (2015), and Rush (2021). Schaffer’s (2009) argues for the identification of spacetime with matter, and traces this line of thought to Alexander. Secondary literature on Alexander’s account of mind-body emergence include classic critiques from Broad (1921a,b), Calkins (1923) and Emmet (1950). Stout (1922) discusses and rejects Alexander’s theory of perception. There has been more recent work on Alexander’s account of emergence in general; see McLaughlin (1992), Gillet (2006), and O’Connor and Wong (2012).

3.3 Philosophy of Religion

One of the optimistic conclusions of Space, Time, and Deity is that, in the future, deity will emerge as a quality of the universe as a whole. This deity-world emergence is akin to mind-body emergence. In the following passage, Alexander explains that we should not identity God with spacetime. Instead, the spacetime system is in the process of “engendering” God:

The universe, though it can be expressed without remainder in terms of Space and Time, is not merely spatio-temporal. It exhibits materiality and life and mind. It compels us to forecast the next empirical quality of deity. On the one hand, we have the totality of the world, which in the end is spatio-temporal; on the other the quality of deity engendered or rather being engendered, within that whole. These two features are united in the conception of the whole world as expressing itself in the character of deity, and it is this and not bare Space-Time which for speculation is the ideal conception of God. (Alexander 1920ii: 353–4)

For Alexander, God is the whole world possessing the quality of deity (Alexander 1920ii: 353). However, the “whole world” does not yet exist because Alexander’s universe is one of process; the universe is in progress towards becoming complete, and this is why Alexander claims the universe is in process towards deity. The whole world, which will possess the quality of deity, does not yet exist, but part of it does: “As an actual existent, God is the infinite world with its nisus towards deity” (Alexander 1920ii: 353). The quality of deity has not yet arrived—and indeed, may never arrive—but God exists in the sense that part of his body, the growing world, does.

A potential problem for Alexander is that God is frequently perceived as being atemporal. In contrast, on Alexander’s system, God is both spatial and temporal. Alexander recognises that this could be considered a problem, but argues that in fact it is an advantage. If God does not “precede” the world, but rather is the product of it, you can avoid one formulation of the problem of evil, on which God creates the world and allows suffering within it (Alexander 1920ii: 399).

God is then not responsible for the miseries endured in working out his providence, but rather we are responsible for our acts. (Alexander 1920ii: 400)

A created deity makes our positions as free agents more important.

Alexander’s account of deity is explored further in his 1927 “Theism and Pantheism”, reprinted in his Philosophical and Literary Pieces (1939). This paper argues that theology is a kind of science aiming to account for a certain kind of experience: one’s sense of the divine in the world (Alexander 1939: 316). Alexander discusses a particular philosophical problem facing theism, the question of whether transcendence (i.e., being beyond the material world) and immanence (i.e., living within the world) can be combined in one being, as is often claimed of God. Alexander argues he can offer a solution: God can be understood as being transcendent and immanent if he will emerge from the world:

God… is himself in the making, and his divine quality or deity a stage in time beyond the human quality. And as the root and leaves and sap of the plant feed its flower, so the whole world, as so far unrolled in the process of time, flowers into deity… God’s deity is thus the new quality of the universe which emerges in its forward movement in time. (Alexander 1939: 330)

God is transcendent in the sense that he is still in the making, and immanent in the sense that he will bloom from the whole world.

Extended discussions of Alexander’s theism can be found in Titus (1933) and Thomas (2016). Brief discussions can be found in McCarthy (1948) and Stiernotte (1954). Emergentist theologies, holding that in some sense God will emerge from the universe, are currently enjoying a revival, and in this context Clayton (2004) discusses Alexander’s system as a rival to his own.

4. Late Writings

4.1 History of Philosophy: Spinoza

After the publication of Space, Time, and Deity, Alexander reportedly came across the system of Spinoza for the first time. In a late series of papers, including Spinoza and Time (1921a) and “Lessons from Spinoza” (1927), Alexander reconstructs his system as a “gloss” of Spinoza.

Alexander argues that philosophy and physics has only just begun to “Take time seriously” and, had Spinoza been aware of these developments, his ontology would ultimately have resembled Alexander’s. Alexander particularly refers to the thesis that space and time should be combined into the four dimensional manifold spacetime.

Spinoza’s Ethics argues there is only one substance, and this substance is identical with God and nature. The substance has an infinite number of attributes, including spatial extension, and it supports an infinity of dependent modes. Alexander argues that his system is similar to Spinoza’s except that he understands the single substance—Motion—to have only two attributes, space and time.

In our gloss upon Spinoza the ultimate reality is full of Time, not timeless but essentially alive with Time, and the theatre of incessant change. It is only timeless in the sense that taken as a whole it is not particularised to any one moment of duration, but comprehends them all… Reality is Space-Time or motion itself, infinite or self-contained and having nothing outside itself. (Alexander 1921a: 39)

Alexander argues his gloss solves problems in Spinoza’s original system. He also praises Spinoza for successfully combining religious values and naturalism (Alexander 1927: 14). Alexander concludes one of his pieces on this topic by saying that he takes pride in the similarity between his system and Spinoza’s (Alexander 1921a: 79). Alexander was corresponding at this time with the Spinoza scholar Harold Joachim.

There is very little secondary literature on this aspect of Alexander’s thought, although Thomas (2013) has argued Alexander is best understood through Spinoza.

4.2 Art and Other Forms of Value

Alexander’s writing on art falls into two kinds. First, there are essays on literature and art. These are all reprinted in Alexander’s (1939), and cover a wide range of topics: from the art of Jane Austen, to the writings of Pascal, to the origin of the creative impulse. Second, there are the pieces comprising Alexander’s account of value. Alexander’s early interest in ethics—exemplified in his first monograph (1889)—survived in his later work as a preoccupation with the nature of value, albeit with a focus on the aesthetic value of beauty. Alexander’s (1920) contained several chapters on the nature of value, and he goes on to supplement these with further papers on the same theme. These include “Naturalism and Value”, and “Value”, both reprinted in Alexander’s Philosophical and Literary Pieces (1939); and “Morality as An Art” (1928). These papers culminate in another monograph, Beauty and Other Forms of Value (1933), Alexander’s most important work on the topic. His writings on value are of greater philosophic interest than those on literature and art.

The views that Alexander expresses in “Morality as An Art” provide a useful introduction to his full account. In this paper, Alexander argues we can fruitfully understand morality by comparing it with fine art. He argues that, just as the value of beauty found in art is a human construction, so are moral values:

For it is the most obvious feature of fine art that it is a human construction. But it is not so evident that truth and morality are as much constructions of ours as beauty is… I am here to plead the opposite doctrine. The highest so-called values, truth, beauty, and goodness, are all of them human inventions, and the valuable is what satisfies certain human instincts or impulses. (Alexander 1928: 143)

An objection to this view is that beauty is not constructed; we might find it in a natural landscape, for example. Alexander replies to this that landscapes and other natural phenomena are rendered beautiful by the parts that we pick out, akin to a photographer composing a picture. As such, the beauty of nature is composed by us (Alexander 1928:149). This entails that there is no difference in kind between natural beauty and art; for more on this, see Alexander’s “Art and the Material” (reprinted in Alexander 1939).

Alexander argues we construct values in response to certain needs. For example, beauty satisfies the impulse of constructiveness in humans. In “Value”, Alexander connects human art to the dam building of beavers (Alexander 1939: 296). Analogously, morality satisfies the impulse of gregariousness or sociality in humans.

[I]t is humanized out of the purely animal sociality… which we find in animals that live in herds like wild dogs, or form societies like bees. (Alexander 1928: 150)

Beauty and other forms of Value (1933) expands on this account. Alexander perceives his naturalistic account of value to be similar to that offered by Spinoza. In “Naturalism and Value”, Alexander tells us that Spinoza’s is the “true” naturalism: everything is extension, including value, and yet everything is still divine (Alexander 1939: 279).

Building on the many smaller pieces that preceded it, Beauty and Other Forms of Value provides a full naturalist account of value. Alexander’s approach is to discuss the supreme values in turn, beginning with beauty, and moving on to truth and goodnes. He continues down to lesser values. He aims to explain not just what values are, but also how they came to be.

Alexander argues that anything can have value if it matters to a thing. In this sense, food is valuable to an animal, and moisture is valuable to a plant. However, the “supreme” values—beauty, goodness and truth—can be distinguished from others because they are the only values that are valuable in themselves, for their own sake:

When we come to the highest values, the beautiful, the true and the good, these in one respect are like wheat and apples: they are objects of a certain constitution—statues and sonatas, landscapes, generous deeds, chemistry. Their pre-eminence as values is that they have no being apart from their value. That is because they are not merely found, like apples, and their value, like the value of apples for food, then discovered, but are made to have value, come into existence along with their value. (Alexander 1933: 293)

The claim that these values come into existence along with their value is of course referring to Alexander’s thesis, also given in his Beauty and other forms of Value (1933), that the supreme values are human inventions.

As we saw above, Alexander argues that humans construct values in response to certain needs or instincts. The final part of Beauty and Other Forms of Value identifies the animal origin of our supreme values. For example, there is an analogy to be drawn between the social impulse in humans and in bees. “Naturalism and Value” explains that in the same way that bees’ instinct for finding honey once seemed to be “magical” and yet has been explained by biology in naturalistic terms, similarly values appear to be magical and yet can be explained naturally (Alexander 1939: 282). He goes on to argue that Darwin’s theory of evolution plays an important role in the development of value:

[T]he doctrine of natural selection may be described as the history of how value makes its entry into the organic world. So far as it is a necessary part of the process by which species are established, it is the principle which constitutes the history of value, for it shows how the mere interests of individual organisms come to be well-founded and to be values. (Alexander 1933: 287)

The idea is that, for animals, things that have value are usually those that will further the survival of the species, such as food. Animals whose interests do not help to maintain their existence succumb under the conditions of their existence, and “leave the field” for others. In this way, natural selection provides a history of value. More on this can be found in Alexander’s “Naturalism and Value” (reprinted in Alexander 1939). This integration of the theory of evolution into Alexander’s aesthetics should come as no surprise to us, being as it is a theme in Alexander’s larger work.

Alexander’s writings on art and value were well received in their day:

[Alexander’s] happy blending of Herbert Spencer’s patient empiricism with the bolder systematic sweep of Bradley and the giant figures of German idealism was nowhere more fruitful than in his treatment of aesthetics. (Listowel 1939: 183)

The secondary literature includes Listowel (1939), Fox (1934), Hooper (1950), and Innis (2017).

4.3 The Historicity of Things

“The Historicity of Things” (1936) is one of Alexander’s last papers. One reason it is valuable is that it gives a concise overview of Alexander’s spacetime metaphysics in his own words. Another reason it is valuable is that it tackles an unusual theme: the relationship between history and nature. Alexander argues that while some of the contributions to philosophy from science are clear, it is less clear what philosophy can learn from history (Alexander 1936: 12). Alexander argues that, as time and motion belong to the most fundamental level of reality, all that exists is “historical”. As such, science begins with history:

History can claim to be mistress of science, as much as mathematics, though in a different sense. They stand for the two vital elements in every science which cannot be separated, if they can be considered separately, the constructive process by which we discover by our thought the order inherent in things, and the raw material itself… It must be remembered, however, of course, that historical science is but one of the sciences which arise from the facts and happenings of the world. (Alexander 1936: 24)

Alexander’s characterisation of history as having the whole world as its subject matter is interesting not least because it proved so controversial. Both R. G. Collingwood and Hilda Oakeley, two philosophers of history associated with British idealism, took strong issue with Alexander’s description; see Collingwood’s reprinted Principles of History (1938 [1999: 56]) and Oakeley’s “The World as Memory and as History” (1925–6).

Both Oakeley and Collingwood corresponded with Alexander, and what has survived of their correspondence can be found in the Samuel Alexander Papers at the John Rylands Library. The Alexander-Collingwood correspondence has been published in Kobayashi (2021), who also provides discussion.

5. Alexander’s Legacy

Alexander’s work impacted a wide variety of thinkers, and he was especially widely read from the 1910s to the 1930s. His work was used and referenced by the likes of British new realists Bertrand Russell, G. E. Moore, and G. F. Stout, John Laird, C. D. Broad; and by American realists Edwin B. Holt, and George P. Adams; for a longer list, see Fisher (2021a).

The last decade has seen increasing scholarly interest in tracing Alexander’s influence on other philosophers. For example, his work was also picked up by John Anderson, who attended Alexander’s 1917–1918 Gifford lectures. Lines of thought stemming from Alexander can be found in Anderson’s Australian student, D.M. Armstrong; and in American philosopher Donald C. Williams. On Alexander’s influence on Anderson and Armstrong, see Gillett (2006), Fisher (2015), Cole (2018, §1; §5.2); and Weblin (2021). On Williams, see Fisher (2015) and Williams (2021). Metaphysician Dorothy Emmet’s (2021) piece shows her work also owed a lot to Alexander.

The extent of Alexander’s intellectual relationship with philosopher of history R. G. Collingwood is only recently coming to be appreciated; see O’Neill (2006), Connelly (2021), and Kobayashi (2021). Unusually for a realist, Alexander’s work was also picked up by at least two British idealists, May Sinclair and Hilda Oakeley; see Thomas (2015; 2019).


Works by Alexander

  • 1886, “Hegel’s Conception of Nature”, Mind, 11: 495–523.
  • 1889, Moral Order and Progress: An Analysis of Ethical Conceptions, London: Trubner & Co.
  • 1908, Locke, London: Archibald Constable & Co.
  • 1909–10, “Ptolemaic and Copernican Views of the Place of Mind in The Universe”, The Hibbert Journal, 8: 47–66.
  • 1912a, “The Method of Metaphysics; and the Categories”, Mind, 21: 1–20.
  • 1912b, “On Relations; and in Particular the Cognitive Relation”, Mind, 21: 305–28.
  • 1914, “The Basis of Realism”, Proceedings of the British Academy, 5: 279–314.
  • 1920, Space, Time, and Deity (2 volumes), London: Macmillan & Co Ltd.
  • 1921a, Spinoza and Time, London: Unwin Brothers.
  • 1921b, “Some Explanations”, Mind, 30: 409–428.
  • 1928, “Morality as An Art”, Journal of Philosophical Studies, 3: 143–57.
  • 1927, “Lessons from Spinoza”, Chronicon Spinozanum, 5: 14–29.
  • 1933, Beauty and other forms of Value, London: Macmillan & Co.
  • 1939, Philosophical and Literary Pieces, edited by John Laird. London, Macmillan & Co.
  • 2021, Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.

Other Primary Literature

  • Bradley, F. H., 1893, Appearance and Reality, London: Swan Sonnenschein.
  • Collingwood, R. G., 1938 [1999], The Principles of History, W. H. Dray & W. J. Van der Dussen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Morgan, C. Lloyd., 1912, Instinct and Experience, London: Methuen.
  • Oakeley, H. D., 1926–7, “The World as Memory and as History”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 27: 291–316.
  • Spinoza, Ethics, in Edwin Curley, translator, The Collected Writings of Spinoza (Volume I), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985.

Secondary Literature

  • Bateman, J. V., 1940, “Professor Alexander’s Proofs of the Spatio-Temporal Nature of Mind”, The Philosophical Review, 49: 309–324.
  • Bradley, F. H., 1999, Collected Works of FH Bradley, Volumes 4 &5, Selected Correspondence, edited by Carol A. Keene, Chippenham: Theommes Press.
  • Brettschneider, Betram, 1964, The Philosophy of Samuel Alexander, New York: Humanities Press.
  • Broad, C. D., 1921a, “Professor Alexander’s Gifford Lectures I”, Mind, 30: 25–39.
  • –––, 1921b, “Professor Alexander’s Gifford Lectures II”, Mind, 30: 129–150.
  • Calkins, Mary Whiton, 1923, “The Dual Role of the Mind in the Philosophy of S. Alexander”, Mind, 32: 197–210.
  • Clayton, Philip, 2004, Mind and Emergence, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Cole, Creagh McLean. 2018. John Anderson. In Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Edward N. Zalta.
  • Connelly, James M. (2021). “Becoming Real: The Metaphysics of Samuel Alexander and R.G. Collingwood”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp. 193–210, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.
  • Emmet, Dorothy, 1950, “Time is the mind of space”, Philosophy, 25: 225–234.
  • –––, 2021. “Samuel Alexander in Manchester”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp. 77–88, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.
  • Gillet, Carl, 2006, “Samuel Alexander’s Emergentism: Or, higher causation for physicalists”, Synthese, 153: 261–296.
  • Fisher, A. R. J., 2015, “Samuel Alexander’s Theory of Categories”, The Monist, 98: 246–267.
  • –––, 2017, “Samuel Alexander’s Early Reactions to British Idealism”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies 23: 169–96.
  • –––, 2021a, “Introduction”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp. 1–20, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland
  • –––, 2021b, “Samuel Alexander and the Psychological Origins of Realism”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp.165–192, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.
  • Fox, A. C., 1934, “Professor Alexander’s Ethical Views”, International Journal of Ethics, 44: 405–417
  • Hooper, Sydney E., 1950, “A Reasonable Theory of Morality (Alexander and Whitehead)”, Philosophy, 25: 54–67.
  • Innis, Robert. E, 2017, “Aesthetic Naturalism and the «Ways of Art»: linking John Dewey and Samuel Alexander”, Rivista Di Storia Della Filosofia, 3: 513–532.
  • Kobayashi, Chinatsu, 2021, “Collingwood’s Letters to Alexander”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies 27: 145–196.
  • Laird, John, 1939, “Memoir” in Alexander’s Philosophical and Literary Pieces, J. Laird (ed.), London: Macmillan & Co.
  • Listowel, Lord, 1939, “The Aesthetic Doctrines of Samuel Alexander”, Philosophy, 14: 180–191.
  • McCarthy, John, 1948, The Naturalism of Samuel Alexander, New York: Macmillan.
  • McLaughlin, B., 1992, “The rise and fall of British Emergentism”, in Emergence or Reduction?, A. Beckerman, H. Flohr and J. Kim (eds.), pp. 49–39, Berlin: Walter de Gruyer.
  • Muirhead, J. H., 1939, “Samuel Alexander”, Philosophy, 14: 3–14.
  • Murphy, Arthur E., 1927a, “Alexander’s Metaphysic of Space-Time I”, The Monist, 37: 357–383.
  • –––, 1927b, “Alexander’s Metaphysic of Space-Time II. Space-Time and the Categories”, The Monist, 37: 624–644.
  • –––, 1928, “Alexander’s Metaphysic of Space-Time III: Space-Time and Knowledge”, The Monist, 38: 18–37.
  • O’Connor, Timothy and Hong Yu Wong, 2012, “Emergent Properties”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • O’Neill, Michael, 2006, “On the Role of Time in Collingwood’s Thought”, in Alexander Lyon Macfie (ed.) The Philosophy of History, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Passmore, John, 1957, A Hundred Years of Philosophy. London: Duckwork.
  • Rush, Michael, 2021, “Samuel Alexander on Motion”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp. 129–148, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan, 2009, “Spacetime as the One Substance”, Philosophical Studies, 145: 131–148.
  • Simons, Peter, 2021, “Samuel Alexander’s Categories”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp. 149–164, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.
  • Stiernotte, Alfred, 1954, God and Space-Time, New York: Philosophy Library.
  • Stout, G. F., 1922, “Prof. Alexander’s Theory of Sense Perception”, Mind, 31: 385–412.
  • –––, 1940, “S. Alexander (1859–1938): Personal Reminiscences”, Mind, 49: 126–129.
  • Thomas, Emily, 2013, “Space, Time, and Samuel Alexander”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 21: 549–569.
  • –––, 2015, Hilda Oakeley on Idealism, History and the Real Past. British Journal for the History of Philosophy 23 (5): 933–953.
  • –––, 2016, “Samuel Alexander’s Spacetime God: A Naturalist Rival to Current Emergentist Theologies”, in Alternative Concepts of God, Y. Nagasawa and A. Buckareff (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 225– 273.
  • –––, 2019. The Idealism and Pantheism of May Sinclair. Journal of the American Philosophical Association 5(2): 137–157.
  • –––, 2021, “Samuel Alexander’s Place in British Philosophy: Realism and Naturalism from the 1880s Onwards”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp. 113–128, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.
  • Titus, Harold, 1933, “A Neo-realist’s Idea of God”, Journal of Religion, 13: 127–38.
  • Weblin, Mark, 2021, “The Rise and Fall of Australian Empiricism”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp. 211–236, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.
  • Weinstein, Michael, 1984, Unity and Variety in the Philosophy of Samuel Alexander, West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press.
  • Williams, Donald C., 2021, “Samuel Alexander and the Analytical Introverts”, in Fisher, A. R. J. (ed.), Marking the Centenary of Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, pp. 89–110, Palgrave Macmillan: Cham, Switzerland.

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