Emergent Properties

First published Mon Aug 10, 2020

The world appears to contain diverse kinds of objects and systems—planets, tornadoes, trees, ant colonies, and human persons, to name but a few—characterized by distinctive features and behaviors. This casual impression is deepened by the success of the special sciences, with their distinctive taxonomies and laws characterizing astronomical, meteorological, chemical, botanical, biological, and psychological processes, among others. But there’s a twist, for part of the success of the special sciences reflects an effective consensus that the features of the composed entities they treat do not “float free” of features and configurations of their components, but are rather in some way(s) dependent on them.

Consider, for example, a tornado. At any moment, a tornado depends for its existence on dust and debris, and ultimately on whatever micro-entities compose it; and its properties and behaviors likewise depend, one way or another, on the properties and interacting behaviors of its fundamental components. Yet the tornado’s identity does not depend on any specific composing micro-entity or configuration, and its features and behaviors appear to differ in kind from those of its most basic constituents, as is reflected in the fact that one can have a rather good understanding of how tornadoes work while being entirely ignorant of particle physics. The point generalizes to more complex and longer-lived entities, including plants and animals, economies and ecologies, and myriad other individuals and systems studied in the special sciences: such entities appear to depend in various important respects on their components, while nonetheless belonging to distinctive taxonomies and exhibiting autonomous properties and behaviors, as reflected in their governing special science laws. (The point might be generalized yet further to include human artifacts which are not the object of any natural science, but whose conditions of individuation are tied to human language and practice. But artifacts are set aside in this entry, as these raise distinctive issues that are discussed in the entry on material constitution. Whether there are composites that are neither artifactual nor amenable to scientific analysis is controversial, and if there are, they plausibly will not meet candidate autonomy conditions on emergence. But this will not be explored further here.)

The general notion of emergence is meant to conjoin these twin characteristics of dependence and autonomy. It mediates between extreme forms of dualism, which reject the micro-dependence of some entities, and reductionism, which rejects macro-autonomy.

1. Introduction

Although debates concerning the reality or precise nature of emergence are largely driven by contemporary scientific theorizing, the basic notion has quite a long history stretching back at least to Aristotle (384–322 BC). On Aristotle’s view, human beings, like other “secondary” substances, arise from a distinctive arrangement of the four material elements. While the mental powers of human beings require and are necessitated by such an arrangement, these powers are distinct from, and downwardly causally efficacious with respect to, any non-mental powers. Furthermore, Aristotle’s form/matter compound conception of material substances is consonant with the standard emergentist stance between substance dualism and reductionism. For detailed discussion, see Caston (1997). Among Peripatetic philosophers, Alexander of Aphrodisias (late 2nd–early 3rd century AD; in On the Soul) and Galen (129–c.200; in On the Elements According to Hippocrates and elsewhere) develop distinctive versions of Aristotle’s basic emergentist picture to apply to chemical compounds and other non-living phenomena as well as living beings. (For discussion of several texts, see again Caston 1997: 347–353.)

Aristotle’s philosophy of nature is re-appropriated in the medieval era, first by Persian and Arabic philosophers such as Avicenna/Ibn Sina (980–1037) and then, with the translation of many of Aristotle’s key texts into Latin, by philosophers in the West, including Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274). In the Latin West, Aristotelian ideas, once introduced, become pervasive throughout the era. In particular, Aristotle’s matter/form conception of substance and his concomitant rejection of atomism become axiomatic points of departure in theorizing about the nature of particular kinds of bodies and the distinctive kinds of processes associated with them. (On Aquinas, see Pasnau 2001 and Stump 2003, Part II; Pasnau 2011 examines in detail a wide range of views of substance in the post-Aquinas scholastic period.)

The consensus around the Aristotelian philosophy of nature was dismantled by the Scientific Revolution, with Aristotle’s physics being the first casualty. René Descartes advances an austerely mechanistic and reductionist conception of material bodies, and this broad outlook becomes widespread. However, Descartes argues that the human mind or soul is a non-material substance, and so endorses a substantial form of mind-body dualism. For those also accepting the reductionist conception of the physical world, the alternatives to Descartes’ substance dualism are stark: idealism (on which matter is a mere “phenomenon” to be analyzed in terms of sensations, as advocated by George Berkeley) or reductionist materialism, as exemplified by Julien de la Mettrie’s L’homme Machine (Man the Machine, 1747).

This menu of options is rejected in the nineteenth century by the so-called British Emergentists (with Lewes [1875] first using the term “emergence” for the philosophical position). In “On the Composition of Causes” (A System of Logic, 1843: Ch. 6), John Stuart Mill (see entry) argues that the behavior of living beings involves a failure of aggregativity or linearity of influence among their elements. He proposes an account that distinguishes “homopathic” and “heteropathic” laws and effects involving organized phenomena, maintaining that the latter laws (governing emergent phenomena) supplement without supplanting basic physical laws of more general scope.

Samuel Alexander (see entry) suggested that life was a “new quality” that emerges from physico-chemical processes and brings with it “special laws of behavior” and which must “be accepted with the ‘natural piety’ of the investigator. It admits no explanation” (1920: vol.2, 46–47). Even so, he insists that he is endorsing “a species of the identity doctrine” (1920: 9), which suggests that he is seeking to articulate a more intimate relationship between levels of the natural world, perhaps very much akin to weak emergence accounts discussed in section 3 below.

Finally, British Emergentism reaches its most developed form in C. D. Broad’s (see entry) The Mind and Its Place in Nature (1925). Broad uses an epistemological criterion for what he intends to be a metaphysical condition of emergent autonomy:

the characteristic properties of the whole R(A, B, C) [where R marks their structural arrangement] cannot, even in theory, be deduced from the most complete knowledge of the properties of A, B, and C in isolation or in other wholes which are not of the form R(A, B, C). (1925: 61)

He adds that emergent features are “completely determined” by such lower-level features, in that

whenever you have a whole composed of these […] elements in certain proportions and relations you have something with the [compound’s] characteristic properties and […] nothing has these properties except a whole composed in this way. (1925: 64)

Reminiscent of Mill, he distinguishes “intra-ordinal” from emergent “trans-ordinal” laws (1925: 77–8) which, although dealing solely with complex phenomena, are “unique and ultimate” (1925: 64–5). As a consequence:

On the emergent theory we have to reconcile ourselves to much less unity in the external world and a much less intimate connexion between the various sciences. At best the external world and the various sciences that deal with it will form a kind of hierarchy. (1925: 78)

The popularity of the emergentist vision waned beginning shortly after Broad’s writing, with important scientific developments eroding the boundaries between adjacent “levels” (most notably quantum chemistry and molecular biochemistry—see McLaughlin 1992 for discussion). However, attention to emergence was substantially reinvigorated starting in the 1970s with the discovery and creation of non-linear complex systems of both natural and artifactual varieties. There is now a large recent literature developing accounts of emergence motivated by such systems. It has gradually broadened to encompass mental phenomena that seem to resist physicalist treatment (e.g., consciousness and free will) and some have even begun to re-think received wisdom concerning the relationship of chemistry and biology to lower-level sciences. These debates are of considerable importance for our understanding of the natural world and of our own place within it. As the bibliography attests, the questions at issue here engage philosophers and scientists alike. This should be unsurprisingly, for these questions are neither simply empirical nor wholly a priori in character, but are rather such that plausible (if not uncontroversial) answers require consideration of and support for metaphysical interpretations of the structure of natural reality in light of our best empirical theories.

Affirming that there are emergent phenomena that are both dependent on and yet autonomous with respect to underlying physical structures leaves a great deal open, however, as both of the characteristics have been explicated in diverse ways (see Van Gulick 2001, Gillett 2002, Wilson 2015, and Humphreys 2016 for discussions highlighting this diversity). Accounts of the dependence at issue may appeal to relations of composition, supervenience, realization, grounding, or causation. Accounts of the autonomy at issue may appeal to fundamental or non-fundamental novelty of powers, properties, forces, laws, or effects; irreducibility; non-aggregativity; or non-linearity.

Though diverse, accounts of ontological emergence can be usefully grouped by a basic division between those that are and are not compatible with physicalism, understood as the thesis that all natural phenomena are wholly constituted and completely metaphysically determined by fundamental physical phenomena. This thesis is standardly understood to entail “the causal closure of the physical”, according to which (roughly) any fundamental-level physical effect has a purely fundamental physical cause. “Strong” emergence accounts are inconsistent with physicalism and causal closure (as just elucidated) while weak emergence accounts are consistent with it.

The general division into weak and strong varieties of ontological emergence frames much of the discussion to follow:

  • Section 2 (“Ontological emergence: features”) surveys the main options for understanding the primary characteristics of dependence and autonomy, noting whether they are more commonly associated with weak emergence, strong emergence, or both.
  • Section 3 (“Weak emergence”) explains the primary motivations for and challenges to weak emergence as a general approach and presents a range of possible accounts.
  • Section 4 (“Strong emergence”) explains the primary motivations for and challenges to strong emergence as a general approach and presents a range of possible accounts.
  • Section 5 (“Weak vs strong emergence: contested phenomena”) canvasses phenomena recently proposed as potential cases of (the more controversial) strong emergence and briefly notes arguments for and against their having that status.

2. Ontological Emergence: Features

This section considers the core features of dependence and autonomy in turn, noting the variety of ways theorists of emergence have elucidated them.

2.1 Dependence

Emergents depend on micro-configurations. That the objects or systems manifesting emergent features and patterns are exhaustively composed by lower-level physical entities is assumed by almost all theorists (but see section 4.3). But there are at least three different ways one might suppose the features and patterns themselves to depend on the features and patterns exhibited by those parts.

2.1.1 Dependence: modal (supervenience)

Accounts of emergence of both strong and weak varieties typically suppose that emergents modally depend on their physical bases, such that it is necessary that if an emergent occurs, some or other physical basis occurs, and it is further necessary that if that basis occurs the emergent occurs. The holding of both directions of necessary correlation corresponds to what is called “strong” supervenience (Kim 1984: 165):

A strongly supervenes on B just in case, necessarily, for each x and each property F in A, if x has F, then there is a property G in B such that x has G, and necessarily, if any y has G, it has F.

Here A and B are families of properties (the supervening and supervenience base properties, respectively).

Emergence may differ with respect to the strength of these two modal correlations. Accounts of weak emergence typically specify the necessity as metaphysical necessity (absolute or unconditional necessity), indicating that emergent phenomena are (in a somewhat hazy sense) “nothing over and above” their subvening base phenomena. Accounts of strong emergence specify it as (merely) nomological necessity (conditional on the holding of relevant laws of nature), indicating a greater ontological distinctness between emergent features and their bases. Indeed, it has sometimes been suggested that the difference between strong and weak varieties of emergence is best understood in terms of the distinction between merely nomological and metaphysical supervenience (Chalmers 1996, Noordhof 2010).

2.1.2 Dependence: functionally realized

Philosophy of mind in the past half-century has been dominated by the thesis that (many) mental concepts are functional concepts, specifying mental states (or properties or events) in terms of the functional or causal roles they play in response to incoming stimuli, in relation to each other, and in generating goal-directed behavior (see, e.g., Putnam 1967, Fodor 1974, and Shoemaker 1984). Functionalists who are also physicalists maintain that mental states are “functionally realized”, in that their defining roles are implemented, on any given occasion, by lower-level physical processes. As a schematic example, the mental state of being a certain kind of physical pain is a state caused by certain kinds of injury to one’s body, and which causes certain kinds of behaviors in response (certain vocal expressions, treating or getting help for the injury, etc.), and (supposes the physicalist), this functional/causal role is always played by some lower-level physical process.

One account of (weak) emergent dependence is just this sort of functional realization. A concomitant of such a functionalist approach is that any token power (i.e., particular instance of it) associated with a weak emergent feature will be identical to a token power of its realizer (Wilson 1999, 2015). This will render emergence compatible with the physicalist thesis of physical causal closure. However, if properties have non-causal quiddities—primitively individuating aspects that are the property equivalent of individual haecceities—additional to their causal powers, then token identity of powers will not necessarily guarantee that a functionally realized emergent property is dependent on its lower-level base in a way compatible with physicalism (Melnyk 2006). (It has become common in recent metaphysics to invoke a primitive notion of “grounding” relating the more fundamental to the less fundamental, so the reader may be surprised not to see it listed as a distinct option here. The reason is two-fold: it is not often used by theorists of emergence, and it is a generalized notion that encompasses the present, more specific notion of functional realization. For discussion of the relative merits of deploying more specific notions or a more general unifying notion in discussions of forms of ontological dependence, see the exchange between Wilson 2014 and Schaffer 2016.)

2.1.3 Dependence: nomological or causal

Accounts of strong emergence commonly characterize dependence as (merely) nomological or causal. Such external relations are consistent with strong emergents being “over and above” the physical entities upon which they depend in a straightforward way. It also leads to a rejection of physical causal closure, often through the posit of fundamentally novel “compositional” powers or forces (as described by, but not endorsed in McLaughlin 1992). One might take strong emergents to be diachronically caused by base-level events (O’Connor & Wong 2005) or maintain that they are synchronically nomologically dependent on their bases, with new fundamental interactions, powers, or laws appearing solely at the operative level of complexity (Broad 1925).

2.2 Autonomy

Discussion of stronger and weaker varieties of emergent dependence inevitably hints at differences in the ways one might specify the correlate thesis that emergents are to some extent autonomous from their physical bases. The commonality to the genus of autonomy is distinctness: emergents are not identical to their bases—at least at the level of types, and perhaps also at the level of tokens. What follows are three central ways of understanding the source of such distinctness.

2.2.1 Autonomy: non-aggregativity

Emergent autonomy might be characterized in terms of a specific elucidation of the idea of compositional or structural “non-aggregativity”. Wimsatt (1994), an early proponent of non-aggregativity as key to emergence, defines aggregativity in terms of the “associativity, commutativity, inter-substitutivity, linearity, and invariance under decomposition and reaggregation” of a system’s parts (1994: 237), with varieties of non-aggregativity simply being the failure of such conditions. More direct and positive characterizations of non-aggregativity appeal to distinctive, self-organizing group-level behaviors, such as ant colonies and flocking birds, whereby “interaction among the parts generates properties which none of the individual components possess” (Mitchell 2012: 179). (Other developments of this approach are found in Kauffman 1993 & 1995, Thompson & Varela 2001, Camazine et al. 2001, and Thompson 2007.)

2.2.2 Autonomy: multiple realizability

A second way one might characterize the autonomy of emergent entities is through realization by base properties that does not depend on any specific realization. Physical realization secures a clear form of dependence on base properties (section 2.1.2). But realized functional properties and processes are (or appear to be) consistent with a variety of possible realizer properties (e.g., having a headache, even of a highly specific type, is consistent with different precise neural states, and more general mental state types may be realized more widely still, across biological species and perhaps in alien or artificial minds). They are multiply realizable, dependent on there being some physical property or process or other within a range, without depending on any specific such feature. There are other varieties of realization beyond the functional that might be apt candidates for understanding particular cases of emergent autonomy. For example, emergent properties might be determinables which are determined by different lower-level determinates (Macdonald & Macdonald 1986, 1995 and Yablo 1992); types and/or tokens which are proper parts of lower-level types or tokens (Clapp 2001 and Shoemaker 2000 [2001]); or having strictly fewer degrees of freedom than do their bases (Wilson 2010). These options, which need not be mutually exclusive, are discussed further in section 3.2.

Multiple realizability, or something akin to it, is expressed in contemporary physical sciences by the notions of universalizability (where diverse systems behave in similar ways), stability under perturbation, and eliminations in micro-physical degrees of freedom, and many writers point to such phenomena as instances of emergence. See Batterman (2000 and 2001) for detailed examination of the scientific application of these notions.

2.2.3 Autonomy: distinctive efficacy

Almost all accounts of emergence suppose that emergents are not just distinct from, but also distinctively efficacious as compared to, their bases. Weak emergentists typically deny that emergents have any fundamentally new powers, on grounds that such new powers would be, either directly or indirectly, powers to produce certain basic physical effects, violating the causal closure of the fundamental physical realm. They maintain, however, that distinctive efficacy does not require having a new power. Distinctive efficacy might be understood in terms of distinctive counterfactual patterns over time, yoked to a counterfactual account of causation (LePore & Loewer 1987 and 1989); difference-making or “proportionality” considerations in accounting for macroscopic as against microscopic effects (Yablo 1992); or more generally through the proposal that special science laws track comparatively abstract levels of causal grain (Antony & Levine 1997, Wilson 2010).

Strong emergentists, by contrast, standardly take emergents to introduce fundamentally novel causal powers—powers that their lower-level physical bases do not have. These are often taken to be powers of the high-level features themselves, and are directed “downwardly” at the structures from which they emerge (as well as “horizontally” in contributing to emergent features of the system at subsequent times). But some propose that high-level structural features induce novel powers in component entities; others suggest that systemic “transformations” occur in which parts either lose their identity when caught up in emergent wholes or have their behavior transformed in virtue of such embeddedness. Details concerning these proposals are provided in section 4.2 below.

3. Weak Emergence

Weak emergence affirms the reality of entities and features posited in the special sciences, while also affirming physicalism, the thesis that all natural phenomena are wholly constituted and completely metaphysically determined by fundamental physical phenomena, entailing that any fundamental-level physical effect has a purely fundamental physical cause.

Special sciences describe non-ubiquitous, structured phenomena (e.g., plate tectonics, molecular interactions, cellular repair, and organismic development) and successfully predict their behavior through higher-level laws. Weak emergentists take the existence of such stable and distinctive phenomena, amenable to high-level but not low-level explanation, as reason to accept the taxonomic categories of the special sciences into our ontology of the natural world, no less real than the categories of a final, completed physics. On this view, there are molecules, cells, organisms, and minded creatures, and they do not reduce to—are not identical to—complex combinations of basic physical entities or features. Correspondingly, explanations adverting to special science laws are to some extent autonomous from the explanations adverting to laws of lower-level physical theories.

3.1 Challenges to its viability

This section introduces two commonly pressed challenges to the in-principle viability of weak emergence. The accounts of weak emergence in the subsequent section are partly motivated as ways of meeting one or both of the challenges.

3.1.1 From parsimony

The simplest challenge to weak emergence is from parsimony, and it can be pressed from the side of reductionism or anti-realism (e.g., Heil 2003 and Ney 2010) or from the opposing side of strong emergentism (e.g., O’Connor & Churchill 2010a,b). The weak emergentist grants that the ontology and dynamical laws of a completed, true physics metaphysically determine all fundamental physical facts, and that the latter metaphysically determine all non-fundamental facts or associated truths about the world. In that case, why add to the ontology of the world? Why not parsimoniously rest with the lower-level physical ontology, and offer a deflationary account of truths that appear to refer to “higher-level” phenomena? One might, e.g., construe the phenomena as coarse-grained patterns running through the world of fundamental physical phenomena, and regard truths invoking concepts such as cell, metabolism, cat, and desire as referring (perhaps schematically) to distinctive types of arrangements of underlying physical entities and their qualities. This stance can grant that in practice we cannot dispense with special scientific claims. (The associated coarse-grained patterns are in some sense the starting point of empirical inquiry for creatures like us, and even were we to arrive at a true final physical theory, our cognitive limitations would make it impossible for us to track the evolution of the world in terms directly corresponding to such a fine-grained reality.) But (says the critic) such broadly pragmatic considerations should not guide our views concerning the world’s ontology; blocking such deflationary moves requires a stronger form of autonomy than physicalism allows.

3.1.2 From overdetermination (or “exclusion”)

Weak emergence accepts the following five premises:

  1. Supervenient Dependence. Emergent features (properties, events, or states) synchronically depend on their base features in that, the occurrence of an emergent feature at a time requires and is nomologically necessitated by the occurrence of a base feature at that time.
  2. Reality. Emergent features are real.
  3. Efficacy. Emergent features are causally efficacious.
  4. Distinctness. Emergent features are distinct from their base features.
  5. Physical Causal Closure. Every lower-level physical effect has a purely lower-level physical cause.

Jaegwon Kim (in, e.g., his 1993 and 1998) argues that these premises entail an unacceptable conclusion:

  1. Overdetermination. Emergent effects are generally causally overdetermined by distinct individually sufficient synchronic causes (akin in every case to otherwise unusual and perhaps merely possible cases as when two rocks are thrown independently and strike a target at the same time).

The present presentation of Kim’s argument follows Wilson 2015, with some modifications (see also the discussion in Sturgeon 1998). Emergent effects might be same-level, downward, or both (Efficacy is neutral). Suppose, first, that emergent E causes emergent E* (same level), while E superveniently depends on P and E* superveniently depends on P* (Supervenient Dependence). P* has a purely lower-level physical cause (Physical Causal Closure)—plausibly, P. If P causes P*, and P* necessitates E*, then it is plausible that P causes E*, by causing P*. So both P and E cause E*, and given that P and E are both real and distinct (Reality, Distinctness), E* is causally overdetermined.

Second, suppose that E instead causes some lower-level base feature P*. P* also has a purely lower-level cause (Physical Causal Closure)—again, plausibly P. So both P and E cause P*, and given that P and E are both real and distinct (Reality, Distinctness), P* is causally overdetermined.

Thus, whether we conceive emergent causation as same-level or downward, the weak emergentist’s commitments entail overdetermination (or as it is sometimes put, holding fixed non-overdetermination, emergent causation is causally excluded by the ubiquity of fundamental physical causes). Finding such systematic overdetermination to be implausible, Kim concludes that we should reject Distinctness and embrace reductionism.

Rejecting other premises leads to alternative stances. Eliminativists deny Realism, epiphenomenalists deny Efficacy, and substance dualists and some strong emergentists deny Supervenient Dependence. Strong emergentists commonly deny Physical Causal Closure, maintaining that emergent features are non-redundant causal contributors alongside lower-level physical factors to some lower-level physical effects. Weak emergentists instead point to the intimate relation they see between emergents and their bases in order either to show a way to resist the argument’s overdetermination conclusion or to make plausible that emergent and basal physical causes are non-competing in a way that renders overdetermination harmless.

3.2 Contemporary accounts

In this section, three broad accounts of weak emergence are introduced and proposed variations noted.

3.2.1 Token identity/type non-identity

One weak emergentist approach locates the distinctness and distinctive efficacy of emergents in feature or process types, while maintaining that every token feature or process is identical with a token fundamental physical entity. This view in a sense “splits the difference” with the reductionist, and so is the most minimalist of the weak emergent positions. One advantage of the view is that it provides a basis for resisting Kim’s argument for causal overdetermination. Causation is a token-token relation. If token higher- and lower-level entities are identical, then there is but one token cause of a given effect, which seems to dismantle the challenge. At the same time, the type-distinctness of weakly emergent and base features provides a basis for claiming distinctive efficacy through “causal relevance” considerations. We may query the cause of a token effect through the prism of distinct effect types, and which type we select will determine which cause type is relevant to its explanation.

Proponents of such accounts typically offer some specific account of the relation at issue, aimed at rendering it plausible that the features at issue might be type-but-not-token distinct. Cynthia and Graham Macdonald (1986, 1995) suggest that higher-level features are determinables of lower-level physical features and determinable types are reducible to disjunctions of determinate types. Given this combination of views, higher-level determinable features are type-distinct from associated lower-level determinate features (since a disjunctive type is not identical to any one disjunct type), but every instance of a higher-level determinable feature is token-identical with some lower-level determinate feature (since instances of disjunctive types are token-identical with instances of some or other disjunct type). Some critics object that higher-level features are not appropriately modeled as determinables of lower-level physical determinates (Ehring 1996), or that determinables cannot be reductively analyzed in terms of determinates (Wilson 2012).

Robb (1997) and Ehring (1996) offer token identity accounts on which features of things are “tropes” (particularized properties, such as the alleged particular whiteness of a given sheet of paper) and properties per se are sets or collections of tropes (see entry on tropes). We may suppose that every higher-level trope is identical with a lower-level physical trope, notwithstanding that the one trope is a member (or part) of different property-identifying sets of tropes, and hence of different types. Here again, the suggestion is that such a view avoids overdetermination while preserving a role for the distinctive efficacy/causal relevance of higher-level features.

3.2.2 Realization

Perhaps the most common approach to weak emergence is one appealing to one or other account of “realization”. (Recall the point made in section 2.1.2 that realization falls under the more general concept of grounding that is deployed more frequently in some other contexts.) The first accounts of realization were in functionalist terms, according to which a realized feature is characterized by a distinctive causal or functional role, which role is implemented, on any given occasion, by some or other lower-level physical feature. Hence, Putnam (1967) suggests that, just as a software program might be implemented on multiple hardware platforms, so mental states might be associated with causal-functional roles which are played by multiple neurological, and ultimately fundamental physical, states. Such an approach accommodates the ontological autonomy of weak emergents to the extent that a functionally associated type is not identified with any one of its realizer types. It would also appear to provide a basis for blocking concerns about causal overdetermination by analogy again to software programs, whose powers are inherited from their lower-level realizers. Given such an inheritance thesis for higher-level powers, even if there is a sense in which both realized and realizing features can cause a given effect, only one power is exercised, not two—in which case, it is maintained, the overdetermination is benign. (This functionalist perspective on special science entities and features was influentially developed by Fodor 1974.)

Other approaches to realization appeal to other specific relations. As noted above, one might endorse an account of weak emergence in terms of determination through the assumption that instances of determinables are token-identical to instances of their realizing determinates. But one might adopt this general approach while rejecting the assumption of token identity, either on grounds that determinable tokens as well as types have less specific essences than associated determinate tokens and types (Yablo 1992) or on grounds that determinable tokens as well as types are associated with fewer powers than associated determinate tokens and types (Wilson 1999, 2015). Yet another approach to realization is based in the part-whole relation, with higher-level types and tokens taken to be proper parts of lower-level types/tokens (Shoemaker 2000 [2001], Clapp 2001). Common to these particular strategies is the idea that token and type powers of a realized feature are a (non-empty) proper subset of the token or type powers of the lower-level physical feature upon which it depends (Wilson 1999, 2015). Causal autonomy can result from a higher-level feature’s having fewer, not more, powers than the feature upon which it depends because the latter encodes distinctive difference-making (e.g., if one’s neurological state had been slightly different, one would still have been thirsty and still have reached for the glass).

Finally, it has recently been proposed that a distinctive form of physical realization comes through implementing mechanisms: enduring structures of organized components that realize higher-level role functions, endowing higher level entities with novel, non-aggregative behaviors and properties (see Machamer et al. 2000, Craver 2007, and entry on mechanisms in science). Craver (2007) argues that in neuroscience and psychology in particular, we should think of minded biological agents as constituted by a hierarchy of mechanisms (or networks of such mechanisms). While he avoids use of the term “emergence”, which he associates with strong emergence (2007: 16), he is plausibly taken to advance a distinctive form of weak emergence. He defends the reality of such high-level, fully-realized powers on the grounds that they satisfy the conditions for causal relevance on the (manipulationist) account of causal explanation that he favors (2007: 216–220). Haug (2010) develops a mechanistic account of realization incorporating a distinction between what he calls “constitutive” and “integrative” mechanisms, associated with two distinct roles mechanisms play in the realization of special science properties. He argues that his mechanistic account contrasts favorably with determinable/determinate approaches (and more generally, “proper subset of powers” approaches) to realization, and that it provides a principled basis for claims of multiple realizability. (Gillett 2016 also emphasizes realizing mechanisms associated with novel powers in his account of emergence. But as he rejects physical causal closure, his account will be discussed under the rubric of strong emergence in section 4.)

3.2.3 Explanatory “incompressibility”

The appeal to unpredictability or other epistemic criteria plays a significant role in accounts of weak emergence (going all the way back to Broad’s [1925] highly influential discussion), even though the intended contrast with “reductionism” is ontological. It is near the surface in the non-aggregativity account of emergent autonomy summarized in section 2.2.1 above, in which the non-linearity of macro-system dynamics (resulting in practical unpredictability) is taken to be a hallmark of (weak) emergence. Bedau (1997, 2010) proposes that we build this distinctive discovery of modern complex systems research into our theoretical elucidation of emergence. Specifically, a feature of or process within a macro-system is weakly emergent just in case it is derivable from the prior micro-facts leading up to it, but only in an informationally incompressible way: describing its macro-state at prior times by aggregating all of its underlying micro-states at those times and iterating their micro-dynamics. When a system’s macro-evolution is explanatorily incompressible in this way, it is not dynamically characterizable in fundamental physical terms: its distinctive evolutionary patterns are not foreshadowed in any way in the micro-evolutionary patterns.

It is possible to see special cases, giving rise to distinct species of weak emergence, within the broad framework of non-linear dynamics. Rueger (2000) and McGivern and Rueger (2010) suggest that a form of diachronic (or evolutionary) emergence occurs when there is a sharp change in the behavior of a single system—behavior which is “qualitatively novel” with respect to its earlier behavior—as a result of a comparatively small perturbation in one of its underlying control parameters. There are well-documented cases of such transitional changes in a system’s behavior.

4. Strong Emergence

Strong emergentists maintain that at least some higher-level phenomena exhibit a weaker dependence/stronger autonomy than weak emergence permits. This often takes the form of rejecting physical realization, affirming fundamental higher-level causal powers, or both.

Perhaps the most commonly cited phenomena offered as requiring strong emergentist treatment have to do with the nature and capacities of the conscious mind in relation to its neural substrate. Other non-mental, scientific phenomena also have been advanced as possibly or plausibly requiring treatment in strong emergentist terms. Such claims are canvassed in section 5.

4.1 Challenges to its viability

This section introduces three commonly pressed challenges to the in-principle viability of strong emergence. Possible replies are noted in connection with certain accounts of strong emergence introduced in the subsequent section.

4.1.1 Incoherence or inexplicability

An initial worry about strong emergence is that there is a tension in the very idea of a feature that is both dependent and fundamental—a worry exacerbated by recent accounts of fundamentality according to which what it is to be fundamental is precisely to be independent (see Bennett 2017 and entry on fundamentality).

This worry might be resolved by distinguishing two senses of “fundamental”: first, a sense applying to an ingredient of physical reality that is ubiquitous (or “basic” in a building-block sense), and so not even dependent on any arrangements of other entities; and second, a sense applying to an ingredient of reality that is not (entirely) constituted by or otherwise internally (as opposed to external-causally) related to the structured arrangement of some other same-category entities. We might then use the term “basic” for the first sense and reserve “fundamental” for the second sense, which aligns the latter term with the way it is used in contemporary discussions of “grounding” or metaphysical dependence in metaphysics. So understood, there is no tension in the notion of an entity or feature that is fundamental but non-basic (O’Connor 2018).

Granting that there is no incoherence in the idea of a non-basic, fundamental entity or feature, one might be concerned that such an entity or feature would introduce an inexplicable (since fundamental) addition to reality at an arbitrary juncture. Avoiding such inexplicability might give reason to prefer a panpsychist accommodation of the irreducibility of consciousness to physical properties, as it (unlike strong emergence) posits proto-conscious qualitative character into the basic structure of the world (Nagel 1979 and Strawson 2006).

4.1.2 Anti-naturalism or evidential paucity

A second initial worry with strong emergence is that it is inconsistent with a “naturalist” point of view, insofar as (on most accounts) strongly emergent properties are associated with fundamentally novel powers or laws that apparently would interfere with more basic physical laws or processes. However, basic dynamical laws in contemporary physics have an open-ended character (Schrödinger’s equation, Hamiltonians or Lagrangians more generally), taking forces or energies as input. The notion of a strongly emergent force or energy is no more problematic than that of the standard physical forces or energies that physicists take to be input into the operative laws (McLaughlin 1992).

The real problem here, if there is one, is not inconsistency with physics, but rather that there is at present a lack of clear empirical evidence for strong emergence. If there were strongly emergent causal powers, forces, or laws, we might expect to see, in candidate emergentist contexts, evidence for a hitherto unrecognized configurational interaction, much as occurred with the weak nuclear interaction. But, McLaughlin avers, “there is not a scintilla of evidence” in support of there being such fundamental novelty (1992: 91). For strong emergentist replies to this contention, see section 4.2.2 and section 5.

4.1.3 Collapse

A final challenge to the viability of strong emergence is that such accounts are vacuous, in that any purportedly fundamentally novel power possessed by an emergent is, on any of a number of plausible accounts of powers, “already” possessed by its lower-level base goings-on.

On one version of this “collapse” objection, certain ways of individuating lower-level physical features entail that such features will have dispositions to produce any purportedly strongly emergent features, undermining the supposed metaphysical novelty of the emergent features in favor of an enriched understanding of the base features (O’Connor 1994: 98–9 and 2000: Ch.6, introduces this objection; see Howell 2009 and Taylor 2015 for development). On another version of the objection, certain ways of assigning powers to features entail that lower-level physical features will inherit any powers had by purportedly strongly emergent features (Kim 1998). For strong emergentist replies to the “collapse” challenge, see section 4.2.2.

4.2 Contemporary accounts

I now discuss a representative range of contemporary accounts of this form of emergence.

4.2.1 Formal characterizations

A metaphysically minimalist characterization of strong emergence is supervenience-based. In contrast to weakly emergent or physically reducible features, which are taken to supervene with metaphysical necessity on their physical dependence base, strongly emergent features are taken to supervene with merely nomological necessity (van Cleve 1990, Chalmers 2006, Noordhof 2010).

This approach assumes that the conceptual distinction between nomological and metaphysical necessity corresponds to a substantial one, such that fundamental causal laws are metaphysically contingent and what supervenes of metaphysical necessity on the fundamental physical domain is necessarily physical. Both these assumptions have been challenged. Moral anti-naturalists such as G.E. Moore maintain that fundamental moral features supervene of metaphysical necessity on natural features, and on neo-Aristotelian essentialist ontologies, strongly emergent features, were they to exist, would supervene with metaphysical necessity on physical features. See, however, Howell (2009) and Noordhof (2010) for strategies aimed at defending supervenience-based approaches to strong emergence.

One variant of this approach is epiphenomenalist (Jackson 1982, Kim 2005, and Chalmers 1996 all express sympathy for this view). It presumes that the most plausible candidates for strong emergence are the qualitative features of conscious experience—e.g., the way that the redness of a rose looks to a particular subject on a given occasion. On this approach, such “qualia” (qualitative features) are caused or otherwise nomologically necessitated by the neural processes underlying human experience, but they are themselves incapable of producing any effects, including on any mental states generated by the purely physical aspect of the perceptual process.

Epiphenomenal strongly emergent features are consistent with physical causal closure. For this reason, the account is less vulnerable than standard accounts to the objection that it entails presently unsupported empirical predictions about brain processes. (It is still incompatible with physicalism, since strongly emergent qualia are not physically realized, and so are wholly additional to token lower-level physical phenomena.) A special challenge for the view is that qualia would seem (paradoxically) explanatorily irrelevant to a subject’s beliefs concerning their existence (see Chalmers 1996: Ch.5, for possible responses).

On a second formalist explication, strongly emergent phenomena are those which are both fundamental and dependent, and where the notions of fundamentality (whose converse is the “grounded”) and dependence are each taken to be primitive (Barnes 2012). Such a primitivist account clearly blocks ontological reduction: if some goings-on are fundamentally novel vis-à-vis the goings-on upon which they depend, then the former are clearly not identical to the latter. A potential advantage of the approach is that it might capture the common denominator to all other, more distinctive accounts of strong emergence. A corresponding shortcoming is that its high level of abstraction leaves it without the resources of more specific accounts for addressing the general challenges facing strong emergence noted above (Paolini Paoletti 2018 and Pearson 2018).

4.2.2 Fundamental powers or laws

Another account of strongly emergent autonomy posits fundamentally new powers, forces, or laws directly associated with the emergent property of a complex object or system (O’Connor 1994, Silberstein & McGeever 1999, Wilson 2002, and O’Connor & Wong 2005). “Fundamental” here signifies that the power is not the resultant of any generalized kind of summation on the powers of the object’s constituents relative to the relational structure in which they are embedded. One variation on this basic account concerns the way emergents depend on their bases. One common variant holds that emergent features are synchronically nomologically necessitated by the base-level structure, where the necessitation, while law-governed, is not via causal production (Broad 1925, Silberstein & McGeever 1999, and Wilson 1999 and 2002). An alternative (naturally suited to a neo-Aristotelian causal powers metaphysics) maintains that emergent features are diachronically caused by a plurality of micro-properties acting jointly (perhaps together with other emergent features), under the triggering condition of the micro-properties’ being appropriately structurally organized (O’Connor & Wong 2005). This alternative can allow that, even granting that causal necessity is a species of metaphysical necessity, the supervenience of strongly emergent features on base phenomena will fail in (at least possible) scenarios in which the causal dependence between either base and emergent features or emergent features and their effects is non-deterministic. That said, whether supervenience does in fact fail for any actual cases of strong emergence is an empirical question (on which, see section 5.2).

The fundamental powers account of strong emergence is consistent with a range of replies to the challenges noted in section 4.1. The first challenge asserts that strongly emergent features are “inexplicable”, insofar as they appear only in certain organized structures and could not be predicted in principle through the laws of basic physics applied to emergent-antecedent conditions. One reply is simply to observe that in the history of physics itself there is precedent for adding new fundamental laws to explain what previously recognized laws could not (e.g., electromagnetism and the weak nuclear force—see Wilson 2002). When determining the fundamenta of the natural world, we must go where the evidence leads. An alternative reply in line with the second variant of the previous paragraph denies the charge of inexplicability by supposing that emergent features are the product of micro-structural dispositions that, unlike those which are more or less continuously manifested, have structural triggering conditions. A Laplacian observer of the unfolding universe prior to the initial onset of such emergent features would have no inkling of there being such latent dispositions towards collective emergent effects. But they are as fundamental as the more generally manifested dispositions associated with such properties as mass and charge (O’Connor & Wong 2005). And it might be contended that while it is rational to presume that the natural world is a causally unified totality, we cannot presume that it is causally uniform (O’Connor 2000: Ch.6).

The collapse challenge asserts that any purportedly strongly emergent powers would “collapse” into—that is, end up being associated with—their dependence bases. One might seek to block collapse by distinguishing between collective dispositions for producing certain powers and the powers themselves, or between direct and indirect having of powers; or by characterizing emergent powers as relative to specified sets of fundamental interactions (see O’Connor 1994: 98–99, and 2000, Ch.6, Wilson 2002, and Baysan & Wilson 2017). Two other reasons for resisting attempts to interpret (possible) discontinuous microphysical behavior in terms of micro-physical powers alone are epistemological. One might contend that we should seek to provide as unified an explanation as possible of such phenomena, and that an explanation in micro-physical terms alone would be highly complex and disunified compared to one that posits a family of emergent macroscopic determinables fitted to structures of organized complexity. Second, we can describe certain possible situations involving causal indeterminism that would be readily understandable in strong emergentist terms, whereas the only microphysical explanation possible would require an objectionable action at a temporal distance. (See O’Connor & Wong 2005 for development of these replies.)

Finally, possible responses to the final, evidential challenge to strong emergence are best considered in section 5, where a range of candidate emergent phenomena are introduced.

4.2.3 Novel component powers in configured wholes

Notwithstanding the replies just above to the collapse challenge, a recent trend in theorizing about strong emergence has been to embrace collapse, arguing that emergence is better understood as the introduction of novel powers had by components when embedded in configured wholes. This section introduces four ways this account has been developed.

In a series of articles culminating in a 2016 book, Carl Gillett advances a distinctive account of strong emergence rooted in a hierarchy-of-mechanism picture of complex systems that, he maintains, is strongly supported by a range of sciences. Gillett invokes considerable conceptual machinery in developing his view; making substitutions in linked definitions, we arrive at the following compact statement:

A property is strongly emergent just in case it is a property of a composed individual that is realized and that (in addition to having same-level effects) non-productively determines the individual’s parts to have powers that they would not have given only the laws/principles of composition manifested in simpler collectives.

There are two distinctive features of Gillett’s account. As noted, the account ascribes fundamentally novel properties not to the bearer of the emergent property, but to the bearer’s components. Second, a realized structural property of the whole is nonetheless said to be the emergent property in virtue of its “nonproductively determining” the components’ coming to have those novel powers. It is tempting to think of this last as also ascribing a novel (albeit non-productive) power to the emergent property, although Gillett does not describe it in these terms. Note that Gillett’s account does not squarely fit the strong emergence classification given in this entry, insofar as he takes strongly emergent properties to be “realized by” lower-level properties, when standing in a complex relation; nonetheless, the account properly belongs to the present strong emergent classification to the extent that it is inconsistent with the causal closure of the microphysical realm.

As regards the general charge that strong emergence is inexplicable, Gillett maintains that this account provides an intelligible, scientifically informed basis for making sense of strong emergence. As regards the charge of there being no evidence of strong emergence, Gillett suggests that while its reality has not been established empirically, it is seriously proposed by a number of contemporary theorists of complex systems (see section 5.2 and section 5.3 below).

David Yates (2016, forthcoming) has proposed an account with some similarities to Gillett’s. He discusses the way that the bent geometry of a water molecule determines its dipole moment, which latter feature confers a range of causal powers on the molecule, such as its disposition to align in an electric field and its being liquid at room temperature (2016: 822–225). He argues that this geometrical property, while fully realized by the spatial relations between the molecule’s atoms, confers a new conditional power on the molecule that in tandem with the causal powers inherited from the molecule’s basic constituents enables the molecule to produce its characteristic effects. Key to Yates’s proposal is the suggestion that higher-level features may be “qualitatively”, as opposed to functionally, realized: while a functionally realized property is characterized in terms of derivative causal powers, qualitatively realized properties are non-causally (e.g., spatiotemporally) characterized, making room for them to be causally fundamental. As he puts it:

[Q]ualitatively realized properties are defined by non-causal specifications, and their realization is not a matter of bestowing the right causal powers. Properties such as molecular geometry are causally fundamental […] because their bearers have certain causal powers in virtue of meeting their defining specifications, but not in virtue of the realizer properties in virtue of which they meet those specifications on a given occasion. (2016: 812)

Yates contends that these examples demonstrate the reality of his distinctive variety of strong emergence. A skeptic might press that the effects Yates cites as pointing to a distinctive kind of higher-level causal power are themselves all higher-level. Assuming that all macroscopic properties are microphysically realized, if one were able to take a wide-angle view of the evolving process in purely micro-physical terms throughout (including in characterizing the targeted token effects), it’s not clear that reference to anything other than the features of and basic relations among microphysical entities is required for explanation. It might well be the case that to explain the token effects under their macroscopic description requires equally macroscopic appeal to molecular geometry (where a given geometric shape is multiple realizable by distinct spatial arrays of atoms). But such explanatory irreducibility is, as we’ve seen, the hallmark of forms of weak emergence.

Jonardon Ganeri (2011) also advances an account with affinities to Gillett’s. On this account, in virtue of entering into certain configurations, elements are “transformed” in that they acquire new causal powers. He does not speak of “noncausal downward determination” from a configurational state to the component powers, though the view seems materially equivalent to Gillett’s in this regard. The account differs, however, in maintaining that in the evolving dynamic that follows the appearance of such new powers, there come to be emergent macro-states that together with the transformed micro-entities determine subsequent micro- and macro-states. The resulting account is thus a hybrid of Gillett’s view and the more familiar novel causal power of the whole view we saw in the previous section.

Sydney Shoemaker (2002, 2007), while agreeing with Gillett and Ganeri that emergence occurs within special kinds of organized objects or systems and features novel component powers, dispenses with any downward determination relation, causal or otherwise. But these powers are novel in a qualified way:

The component entities have powers that, collectively, determine the instantiation of the emergent property when they are combined in an emergence-engendering way. But these being cases of emergence, these cannot all be powers that manifest themselves when the components are not combined in emergence-engendering ways. Some of them must be “latent” powers. Or, since these powers do not remain latent when their possessors are combined in emergence-engendering ways, let us speak of them as “micro-latent” powers. We can contrast these with the “micro-manifest” powers which these same entities manifest when they are not combined with other entities at all, or are configured in ways that are not emergence-engendering. (Shoemaker 2007: 73)

The thesis that newly manifest powers are “latent” will appeal to those who both take causal power to be a primitive feature of fundamental reality and see it as fundamental to all explanatory linkages between earlier and later stages in the evolution of things. (We saw in the previous section that O’Connor 1994 and O’Connor & Wong 2005, who share these commitments, postulate that emergent and fundamental macro-states are “upwardly” determined by micro-structural states manifesting latent dispositions of fundamental individuals to jointly cause such states when so configured.)

4.2.4 Transformed elements independent of configured wholes

Finally, several recent authors have proposed “transformational emergence” accounts that severs the idea of a privileged class of hierarchically-organized wholes from the concept altogether. They advance an ontological framework in which basic and structured individuals undergo fundamental change, acquiring new powers that are not “latent” (in the sense of there being an antecedent, ontologically-grounded disposition for their subsequent appearance) and perhaps losing others. With the advent of new powers, there are new laws describing their evolution.

Santos (2015a,b) promotes such a view under the banner of “relational ontology”. The dynamic itself is constantly evolving, as elements are transformed through interactions with other elements.

[W]hole is just a word that names the relational totality of the individual relata and their relations, [which are] the only real causal agents…. (2015a: 28)

Santos suggests that such a view of things is indicated by modern cellular and developmental biology, but the theoretical descriptions he cites (e.g., 2015a: 30–32; 2015b: 439–440) appear to be consistent with the other metaphysical frameworks described in the previous two sections. The issue of whether enduring structured entities are essential or inessential to the broad frameworks embraced by the special sciences is a large issue that cannot be discussed here.

Humphreys (2016), while not committing to the ubiquity of “transformational emergence”, takes the account a step further away from those emphasizing structured wholes by making interactions inessential:

Transformational emergence occurs when an individual a that is considered to be a fundamental element of a domain D transforms into a different kind of individual a*, often but not always as a result of interactions with other elements of D…They possess at least one novel property and are subject to different laws…. (2016: 60)

As an intuitive (though perhaps not realistic) example, he notes that people undergo significant temporary psychological change when they are caught up in the interactions constituting a mob. His central realistic example comes from the Standard Model of particle physics, which describes partless muons as very quickly “decaying” into electrons, electron neutrinos, and muon neutrinos (2016: 66–67). Here there is fundamental change apart from any triggering interactions, and not merely a change within individuals but change of individuals from one kind to others. Humphreys further notes that his earlier “fusion” account of emergence (1997) is a special case of transformation. When fusion occurs, basal entities or certain of their properties are lost when they fuse with others in producing a unified whole (2016: 74–5). (For accounts similar to Humphrey’s, see Guay & Sartenaer 2016 and Sartenaer 2018.)

Transformational accounts clearly stretch the classical concept (which informs the taxonomy of the present article). The common thread is simply that of fundamental but lawlike change in the observable patterns in physical reality through time. For purposes of assessing how competing accounts fare in characterizing the range of empirical phenomena uncovered in the sciences, it may be necessary for greater terminological regimentation to emerge.

4.3 Strong emergence: from property to substance dualism?

Emergentists of all varieties standardly are physical substance monists about the natural world: all worldly (natural or artifactual) entities are composed or otherwise “made of” entities that would be described in a completed fundamental physics, whether physical particles, fields, strings, or something else. This view is common enough among emergentists that some influential theorists took it to be a defining element of the doctrine. One might maintain, consistent with substance monism, that wholes exhibiting strongly emergent, efficacious properties are fundamental, albeit composite objects or systems, on the grounds that quantification over them is required for a minimally adequate account of the world’s dynamics. This might also give rise to an objective basis for identity through time, even for organisms undergoing constant change of parts (see O’Connor & Jacobs 2003).

But one can argue that strong emergentism, at least with respect to some or all mental states, in fact requires a form of substance dualism. On a biological view of emergent thinkers, the micro-physical boundaries of such thinkers may inevitably be vague, for empirical reasons. But it is perhaps doubtful that fundamental causal laws associated with strongly emergent properties would reference vague conditions. The sole apparent alternative is that the properties are instantiated in a distinct, non-vague object instead, as a non-physical mind would be. (See Zimmerman 2010 and Hasker 2016 and, for a reply, O’Connor 2016.)

One might also argue for an emergentist form of substance dualism as necessary to account for (what many strong emergentists regarding consciousness accept) there being unified subjects of conscious experience (Nida-Rümelin 2007) or it being an objective matter whether a conscious subject does or does not survive certain kinds of radical change (Swinburne 2013). Finally, many general accounts of the categories of substance/object or physical substance/object in particular entail that if an object has non-physical properties, it will fail to count as a composed or physical substance (Francescotti 2001, Schneider 2012, and O’Connor 2018.)

Supposing that strong emergence does bring a new substance in its wake, the spirit if not the letter of the usual emergentist commitment to substance monism is maintained by the weaker constraint that no “higher-level” substances or subjects “float free”, actually or modally, from their dependence bases. It is for just this reason that both Lowe (2008) and Nida-Rümelin (2007) characterize their substance dualism as “non-Cartesian”.

5. Weak vs. Strong Emergence: Contested Phenomena

Certain phenomena and theoretical considerations motivating some contemporary theorists to endorse a strong emergentist construal of those phenomena. (It bears emphasis that strong emergentists typically also suppose that some interesting organized behavior is more plausibly understood either reductively or as weakly emergent: their strong emergentism is piecemeal.) This final section summarizes those phenomena and considers in general terms the different ways strong and weak emergentists might go about treating them.

5.1 The conscious mind

The conscious mind in its different aspects has long seemed to many to resist plausible ontological characterization in any physical terms, whether reductive or non-reductive (i.e., weak emergentist). (For a fairly comprehensive overview, see Chalmers 1996.)

5.1.1 Conscious awareness and its unity

Consider, for a start, our apparently direct awareness of our own conscious experiential states. (Conscious cognitive states such as beliefs and desires have complicating aspects that cannot be explored here. But see section 5.1.2 immediately below for a possible linkage between the two germane to strong emergentist conjecture.) The natural physicalist strategy for characterizing such awareness would be in terms of a distinctive form of informational flow among distinct physical states (the experiential state itself and a distinct state of awareness of the experience); yet any such account would seem consistent with the possibility of a nonstandard causal source of the state of awareness of the conscious state, such that the subject is utterly mistaken about its object, the subject’s current conscious state. Such strong fallibilism about the contents of consciousness seems implausible, as is shown by the fact that philosophers such as Descartes who entertain radical skeptical doubts about much of human knowledge do not typically extend it to our grasp of our current conscious experience. Is it, for example, conceivable that I am only seemingly (but mistakenly) aware of undergoing excruciating pain as of being laid out on the torturer’s rack, while in fact I am in a serene conscious state as of lying on a warm sandy beach? It seems not, but it is hard to account for this datum in physicalist terms.

Also puzzling for physicalism is the unity of conscious experience: the fact that our experiences engaging distinct sensory modalities and our conscious thoughts, moods, and feelings come together as aspects of one overall conscious state of a single conscious subject. On a plausible physicalist account, each of these aspects will be realized in distinct, physically-separated neural networks, but as yet there is no worked-out physicalist strategy for capturing the unity of these aspects in experience.

In recent decades, highly general functional characterizations of conscious awareness have been proposed, notably: higher-order theories, on which a state is conscious just in case it stands in the right kind of relationship to a higher-order state that represents it (Carruthers 2000; Rosenthal 2005; entry on higher-order theories of consciousness); global workspace theories, on which a state is conscious just in case its content is globally accessible to multiple cognitive subsystems (Baars 1997, Dehaene et al. 2006); and integrated information theory (Tononi & Koch 2015), on which a system is conscious just in case it carries more information than the sum of its parts (and is more conscious the greater the amount of such “integrated” information). Anti-physicalists have argued that the first of these theories implicitly denies or fails to adequately capture the two features of direct awareness and unity; the second and third are highly suggestive frameworks for theorizing about dynamical aspects of consciousness, but insofar as they are developed in purely neural terms, they seem to provide only a weaker surrogate for what we introspectively grasp concerning the unity of consciousness, and don’t speak clearly to the direct awareness relation.

That said, it is worth noting that these features, while present in standard conscious experience, are arguably absent or diminished in unusual clinical cases, and in particular in “split-brain” patients. (See Bayne 2008 and Schechter 2018 for philosophical exploration of clinical accounts regarding the reports of split-brain patients.) This suggests a physicalist strategy of using these unusual phenomena as a tool for chipping away at the ostensible phenomenological basis for rejecting the possibility of an eventual physicalist account of consciousness. (See entry on the unity of consciousness, Sect. 4 for a survey of such disorders of unified consciousness and discussions of their possible implications.) An alternative, perhaps complementary physicalist strategy is to argue that certain seeming aspects of consciousness are simply illusions which can be explained in terms of inevitable organizational tradeoffs in the construction of finite minds (see Pereboom 2011 and Chalmers 2018).

5.1.2 The qualitative and intentional character of mental states

Even more than the nature and unity of conscious awareness, certain seeming intrinsic characteristics—so-called “qualia”—of conscious states have seemed to many to require an anti-physicalist ontological account. The way a patch of redness appears in one’s visual field, or the sound of a trumpet note in one’s auditory field, do not seem to admit of characterization in terms of neural processes within the visual and auditory cortex. Rather, such experiential qualities seem to be distinctive in kind, engendering a mismatch with the physical-structural or functional kinds posited by physical theories, and to have a degree of simplicity that is incongruent with the massive physical complexity of the associated physical processes. (For two much-discussed arguments from these apparent characteristics of conscious experience to at least a modest form of physical-mental dualism, see Jackson 1982 and entry on qualia and the knowledge argument; and Chalmers 1996 and entry on zombies.)

Some accept this claim regarding these “phenomenal” qualities of conscious experience, but think that there is no corresponding deep challenge to physicalism with regards to the intentional properties of experiences, representing what the world around us is like (again, Jackson 1982 and Chalmers 1996). (This limited anti-physicalism most lends itself to—although it does not entail—the epiphenomenalist version of strong emergence discussed in 4.2.1 above, as it is consistent with the claim that information-processing intentional states are the only mental states that causally contribute to the individual’s future mental and physical states.) However, one may question the independence of phenomenal and intentional properties (see, e.g., Horgan & Tienson 2002), and some go so far as to conjecture that intentional properties are in some way constituted by phenomenal properties (Mendelovici 2018, Woodward 2019). If some such connection thesis is correct, then not only experiences, but other cognitive states such as belief and desire may resist purely physical characterization (see entry on phenomenal intentionality).

5.1.3 Conscious will & agency

Human and other animals are not only experiencers and knowers but also doers. (The nature of non-human animal choice or volition and their concomitant experience of action is here set aside, as it is difficult to conjecture concerning it with any confidence on present knowledge.) Many take Aristotle to have expressed a truism when he said that the choice of how to act is “up to us”, unlike the inevitable unfolding of causal processes lacking in rationality or other sources of deliberative choice. It is widely claimed that the human experience of conscious, deliberate choice (“willing”) is of direct, “top down” control over one’s action by the agent (see, e.g., O’Connor 2000: Ch.1&4; for an overview of discussions regarding agential experience, see Bayne 2017 and Woodward forthcoming). At least sometimes, we seem to ourselves not to be merely loci in which a host of psychological and merely physical influences converge and resolve themselves in behavior, but rather to exercise a power to decide which among the options we are considering we shall take, thereby determining whether and how these influences will be acted upon.

Such agential experience, if veridical, might indicate that the ability to freely choose is strongly emergent. On one account, free choice manifests a distinctive power that, unlike typical powers, is neither causally “triggered” by a stimulus condition nor is made more or less probable by antecedent factors (Lowe 2008, 2013). Alternatively, the kind of power agential experience represents is consistent with non-determining causal influences that collectively confer objective probabilities on possible choices (O’Connor 2008). On either understanding, conscious control over one’s own actions through exercising the power of choice is at odds with a physicalist conception on which all systemic behavior is fixed by the arrangement and activity of the system’s parts. Coupled with the plausible position that mental states of whatever variety depend on lower-level physical states, such a result might be seen as providing support for taking free will to be a strongly emergent power.

Agential experience is defeasible, and cognitive and social psychology and more recently neuroscience have been probing the determinants of choice and its relationship to conscious awareness. One particular form of study has been taken by many to undermine the veridicality of the experience of conscious control over arbitrary choice. Libet 1999 and more sophisticated successor studies aim to compare the self-reported time of occurrence of conscious choice with the time of occurrence of certain brain activity (a steadily increasing “readiness potential”) that Libet took to be associated with the production of the subsequent action. He interpreted the results as indicating that the behavior was unconsciously initiated by that brain activity just prior to the time of the subject’s awareness of having so chosen, and hence that the agent’s sense that she consciously initiated the action is illusory.

Philosophers have roundly criticized the “no free will” interpretation of these studies offered by Libet and some other neuroscientists (see Mele 2009 for a thorough discussion and Caruso 2012: 189ff, for a dissent from the consensus). Many have emphasized that the “choices” Libet’s subjects are asked to make depart from paradigmatically free cases in important ways. Some note that the ability of subjects to precisely time their own conscious events of any kind (including simple perceptual cues) have been shown to be not fully reliable: their estimates can be manipulated by conscious primes before and after the target event. (They also come in degrees of intensity, such that the onset of an event that might quickly intensify or otherwise evolve might be more difficult to determine than the event itself.) Others observe that the studies do not even purport to identify a determining physical antecedent to conscious choice. Finally, other recent studies (beginning with Schurger et al. 2012) have called into question just what kind of neural activity Libet-style studies are tracking, and in particular whether it is even involved in the production of choice and subsequent behavior. All this remains a subject of continued scientific study and debate. (A large-scale project is currently underway that is developing a wide array of experimental probes of conscious will and its physical determinants: < https://neurophil-freewill.org/> For an overview of philosophical and empirical issues concerning human free will, see entry on free will.)

5.2 Physical Science

5.2.1 Quantum Entanglement

A striking feature of quantum mechanics is known as “quantum entanglement”. When two (or more) quantum particles or systems interact in certain ways and are then (even space-like) separated, their measurable features (e.g., position and momentum) will correlate in ways that cannot be accounted for in terms of “pure” quantum states of each particle or system separately. In other words, the two need to be thought of as a coupled system, having certain features which are in no sense a compositional or other resultant of individual states of the system’s components (see Silberstein & McGeever 1999 and entries on holism and nonseparability in physics and quantum entanglement and information). Humphreys (2016) construes this as an instance of emergent fusion (section 4.2.4). Insofar as these features have physical effects, they indicate a near-ubiquitous failure of whole-part property supervenience at a very small scale. However, it should be observed that quantum entanglement does not manifest a fundamental novelty in feature or associated causal power, as it concerns only the value or magnitude of a feature/associated power had by its components. (Correlated “spin” values, e.g., are permutations on the fundamental feature of spin, rather than being akin to mass or charge as wholly distinctive features.) As such, it does not fit the criteria of many accounts of strongly emergence. It is, however, relevant to the epistemic status of such accounts: if one thinks that the existence of strong emergence is implausible on grounds that a kind of strong local supervenience is a priori very plausible for composed systems generally, then the surprising phenomenon of quantum entanglement should lead you to be more circumspect in your assumptions regarding how complex systems are put together.

5.2.2 Quantum Chemistry

The interface of physics with chemistry has long been thought to support ontological reductionism (or physicalism, more generally). This sentiment goes back to an early declaration by Paul Dirac, one of the founding figures of quantum mechanics:

The underlying laws necessary for the mathematical theory of a larger part of physics and the whole of chemistry are thus completely known, and the difficulty is only that exact applications of these laws lead to equations much too complicated to be soluble. (1929: 714)

In recent decades, there has recently been reconsideration of this perspective. Hendry (1998, 2010, 2017, 2019), following Woolley (1978, 1998) and Primas (1981), contends, to the contrary, that molecular structure is (or may well be) strongly emergent, in failing to be wholly determined by the arrangements of a molecule’s quantum constituents; isomers, which have distinct molecular structure yet the same subatomic constituents, are a particular focus in these discussions. Scerri (2012) criticizes this line of thought, suggesting that it overlooks the possibility that a molecule’s quantum-mechanical interaction with its environment may contribute to fixing its overall structure. It should be noted that the details of Scerri’s counter-proposal depend on a particular (collapse-based) interpretation of quantum mechanics. There has been a steady uptick of discussion of this issue among philosophers of chemistry, and it appears to be unresolved at present. This in turn suggests that, contra Dirac, strong emergence even at the interface of physics and chemistry remains a live possibility. (For further discussion, see Hettema (2015) and entry on philosophy of chemistry, Section 6.)

5.2.3 Spacetime

Fundamental physics encompasses two successful theories, General Relativity (GR) and Quantum Field Theory (QFT), that are mutually inconsistent. In recent years, a number of Quantum Gravity theories have been put forward as candidate deeper theories that can account for core dynamical principles and successful predictions of both theories within one consistent framework. Strikingly, in almost all such theories, spacetime is not part of the fundamental ontology, it being supplanted by a framework that lacks at least some of its structure. Many theorists say that the spacetime of GR is thereby rendered emergent. Its dependence is reflected in how the many roles that spacetime plays in GR and the spatiotemporally structured experimental observations themselves (and indeed, ubiquitous perceptions of everyday life!) are grounded in nonspatiotemporal structures in the proposed fundamental theories. Its autonomy takes the form of nonfundamental spacetime’s being qualitatively different from any feature of the fundamental theory.

The issues raised by such radical proposals are complex, and it is even debated whether they are empirically coherent, given the role that space and time play in our understanding of physical causation and empirical observation, and hence of empirical evidence itself. For present purposes, the key point is that such theories propose systematic theoretical reductions, akin to the reduction of thermodynamics to statistical mechanics, with a concommitant ontological reduction of the structures of the reduced theories. In this, the case appears unlike the relationship between physics and biology as weak emergentists see it, in which biological entities appear to be special kinds of organized physical structures that explain equally distinctive phenomena that are unexplained by more fundamental theories. For a non-technical introduction to some of the theories at issue and the case for describing them as entailing spacetime emergence, see Wüthrich (2019). For more general philosophical reflection on our ordinary concepts of space and time and their compatibility with theories that treat them as nonfundamental, see Chalmers (forthcoming).

5.3 Pluralist interpretations of the general ontology of the sciences

Champions of physicalism see the marked successes of the physical and biological sciences in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries as establishing, at a minimum, that the characteristic processes at all levels of these domains are fixed by fundamental physical states and processes. However, some draw a different conclusion from these advances, seeing new bases for strongly emergentist perspectives.

Many sciences treating complex systems of one or other variety have undergone extensive and impressive development in the last fifty years. Theorists in these disciplines freely use terms such as “emergence” and “top-down causation” to describe the phenomena they study. It is often unclear, however, whether they are best interpreted as describing weakly or strongly emergent states and associated behavior. Among those who have reflected recently on the state of their discipline, solid state physicist Laughlin (2005), systems biologists Noble (2006) and Boogerd (Boogerd et al. 2005, 2007), and neuroscientist Walter Freeman (1999, 2000) and cosmologist Ellis (2016) appear to advocate strongly emergentist accounts of aspects of solid state physics, biological life, and the human mind, respectively. They argue that the pertinent sciences encompassing these domains give equal, complementary places to “bottom up” and “top down” determinants and principles, and argue that we cannot understand the latter as themselves ultimately fixed by instances of the former. The general thrust of their detailed arguments is that there is no fully “bottom up” way to describe, let alone explain, certain organized phenomena. See also Ellis, Noble, and O’Connor (2012) for a collection of state-of-the-art overviews of the interaction of top-down and bottom-up principles in numerous scientific domains, from fundamental physics to sociology.

Finally, philosopher Nancy Cartwright (1983, 1994, 1999) has defended over several decades a thorough-going “patchwork” or pluralistic understanding of the relation between the sciences, as an alternative to the sort of “physics-at-the-bottom”, asymmetrical hierarchy common to weak emergentists and reductionists alike. She argues that close consideration of scientific practice suggests that fundamental physical laws hold only in certain artificial contexts limited to small-scale systems, which systems are maintained by macroscopic barriers and mechanisms serving to screen off “downward” causal effects. She suggests that such carefully contrived results can give us no reasonable confidence in a vision on which all of natural reality is fixed by the unfolding of bottom-up physical laws alone. While arguing in somewhat different ways, Dupré (1993) is sympathetic to the general pluralist or “anti-fundamentalist” thrust of Cartwright’s perspective. More generally, if anything like Cartwright’s view is correct, and the right ontological characterization of the underlying pluralism is one according to which there is fundamental novelty across the spectrum of natural reality, one might naturally take strong emergence to be much more prevalent than even its proponents have usually assumed. This perspective has affinities to the “transformational” accounts of emergence noted in section 4.2.4. For discussion of the broad issues raised by Cartwright, see Cat (1998) and entry on the unity of science, Section 5.


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Other Internet Resources


The author acknowledges the substantial contributions to the composition of this entry by Jessica Wilson. The entry was originally planned and drafted as a fully co-authored work, but Wilson needed to bow out late in the process. After that point, it was heavily revised and edited, and some new material was added, so she is in no way responsible for any flaws in the final product. Even so, the author is indebted to her.

This publication was made possible through the support of a joint grant from the John Templeton Foundation and the Fetzer Institute. The opinions expressed in this publication are those of the author(s) and do not necessarily reflect the views of the John Templeton Foundation or the Fetzer Institute.

Copyright © 2020 by
Timothy O’Connor <toconnor@indiana.edu>

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