Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Mental Properties and Causal Relevance

As noted in §6, the epiphenomenalist worry arises from two points that are absolutely basic to Anomalous Monism—first, that mental events are at the same time physical events, and, second, that while mental predicates cannot figure into strict causal laws, physical predicates must. Early criticisms moved very quickly from these points to the claim that mental properties were causally irrelevant relative to physical properties. Though it eventually became clear that this particular concern can get no traction within Davidson’s framework, it is instructive to follow out the line of argument. An early critic of Anomalous Monism, Ted Honderich (Honderich 1982—for related literature, see Campbell 2003), articulates the worry by arguing, first, that not all properties of an event are causally relevant to its effect. For instance, the color of a piece of fruit has no effect on its measurement—when the fruit is placed on a scale, the subsequent movement of the weight indicator is not influenced by the fruit’s color. According to Honderich, the color is therefore a causally irrelevant property of the event (of placing the green fruit on the scale), while the weight of the fruit is a causally relevant property. Honderich then asks: what accounts for this distinction between causally relevant and irrelevant properties? And he claims that only properties that figure in strict laws—physical properties—are candidates for causal relevance. There is no strict lawlike relation between being green and the resulting measurement, while, according to Honderich, there is such a relation between the weight of the fruit and that measurement.

Honderich thinks that this simple point generalizes and shows that, within the framework of Anomalous Monism, mental properties are not causally relevant because they are not lawlike. His argument can be understood as follows: since Anomalous Monism insists that mental events have physical properties that can be related, by strict law, to the effects of those events, and also insists that such events’ mental properties cannot be so related, it is only ‘by virtue’ of its physical (i.e., strict lawlike) properties that a mental event causes what it does. Its mental properties, and thus its being the particular kind of mental event that it is, play no role in its causal powers. Thus, Honderich suggests that the cause-law principle must be articulated slightly differently—as the Principle of the Nomological Character of Causally Relevant Properties. This nomological property principle rules out the causal relevance of anomic mental properties.

Honderich’s argument is instructive for a more general consideration of the wave of epiphenomenalist criticisms lobbed at Anomalous Monism. First, Honderich’s distinction between causally relevant and irrelevant properties is completely insensitive to the question of what is being explained or caused, which effect is under consideration (Macdonalds 1995 and Gibbons 2006 usefully discuss the importance of typing effects in addressing the epiphenomenalist objections). Consider the fruit example. While the color of the fruit has no causal relevance to its measurement, that is not the only effect of the event of putting the fruit on the scale. The color catches the eye of a customer, bleeds onto the scale and changes its color, and causes a host of other effects that are not salient when considering only the effect of the measurement. Salience is dependent on explanatory interests, and if we shift those interests, what was an irrelevant property with respect to one effect may be a relevant property with respect to another (see §6.2).

Second, Honderich arrives at the view that an event’s physical properties are the only causally relevant ones through reflecting on Anomalous Monism’s insistence on the cause-law principle in light of the anomalism principle. If mental events must instantiate physical properties—strict-law properties—and all causal relations must be covered by strict causal laws, then an event’s having such properties is a necessary condition for standing in causal relations. Davidson can agree with all of this. However, Honderich concludes from this that it is only ‘by virtue’ of its physical properties that an event stands in causal relations. This ‘by virtue’ claim then allows Honderich to move directly to the conclusion that only physical properties are causally relevant. What enables (i.e., is necessary for) causation is thus held to be responsible for causation (for a similar argument, see Kim 1993a, 22). But this is disputable. Not all necessary conditions of some phenomenon are explanatory conditions—conditions ‘responsible for’ that phenomenon. For example, a person can talk only if she was born—having been born is thus a necessary condition of her talking. However, her ability to talk is not explained by her having been born. It is not ‘by virtue’ of being born that she can talk, though the former is a necessary condition of the latter. Davidson himself expresses skepticism about the intelligibility of his critics’ use of the ‘by virtue’ locution in discussing Anomalous Monism (Davidson 1993, 6, 13) (see further §6.1, and for discussion of a related mistake concerning the bearing of physical determinism on freedom see Related Issues: 3.1 Anomalous Monism and Kant’s Theory of Freedom).

The point that causal explanation is interest-relative, and must be sensitive to what one wishes to explain, is not novel. But it is a point that often gets lost in epiphenomenalist criticisms of Anomalous Monism. However, it is also a point that invites important questions about the relations and differences between causation and explanation. As we have seen, Davidson insists on a firm distinction between causation, which is a metaphysical relation between particular events independently of how they are described, and explanation, which concerns events only as they are described in particular ways. Thus, he is inclined to dismiss the epiphenomenalist concerns about Anomalous Monism, and the locution of ‘causally relevant and irrelevant properties’ as based upon a confusion and certainly a different metaphysical framework than that assumed by Anomalous Monism. Events themselves—rather than any particular aspect or property of them—cause other events. Our descriptions of these events (what we speak of as their aspects or properties) explain why effects described in certain ways occur. Mental descriptions explain actions by rationalizing them—making them intelligible in light of the agent’s beliefs and purposes. The mental event that explains an action by rationalizing it is a cause of that action—otherwise, as discussed above (§2.2), there would be no way of answering the question concerning which of the many mental events that rationalize some action are the ones that actually explain its occurrence (see further the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism). That mental event is also a physical event (as is the action it explains), according to Anomalous Monism, because it stands in causal relations (the interaction principle), and thus (given the cause-law and anomalism principles) must instantiate physical (strict-law) properties. But properties themselves don’t cause anything, only instances of properties—and these are the events that bear or instantiate them.

Is this point really responsive to Honderich’s concern? It is instructive to observe how some proponents of Anomalous Monism (Macdonalds1986) have attempted to defend Davidson from epiphenomenalist concerns by exploiting the point in the following way. Honderich has insisted that the only causally relevant properties of events are strict-law properties. But properties don’t cause anything; only their instances do. And particular, causally interacting mental events are instances of strict-law properties, according to the monistic component of Anomalous Monism. (Recalling the discussion of the ‘because’ argument in §2.2, since reasons causally explain actions, and due to mental anomalism, actions must be physical, the claim that mental events cause physical events is justified.) So Honderich’s nomological property principle must itself be amended to the Principle of the Nomological Character of Causally Relevant Instances of Properties. Mental properties are causally relevant, according to this principle, because their instantiations are also instances of nomic properties, and nomic properties are paradigm examples of causally relevant properties.

However, it can reasonably be wondered how this line of thinking is responsive to the point that appears to be underlying Honderich’s nomological property principle. After all, the issue under consideration has been whether mental properties are relevant to explanation (recall the discussion of the color of the fruit). The Macdonalds’ insistence that they are turns on the point that only instances of properties cause anything. But instances are neither relevant nor irrelevant. At best, they either have or lack causal efficacy– they are or are not responsible for bringing about some effect or other. The Macdonalds have perhaps established that because physical events are paradigm examples of causally efficacious events, then since, according the Anomalous Monism, mental events are physical events, mental events inherit any causal efficacy had by physical events. But that is quite different than establishing that mental properties are explanatorily relevant—that an event’s being a mental kind of event matters to the occurrence of any effects in the world. (The Macdonalds (1995) later acknowledge this and develop an account of explanatory relevance; for discussion, see the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism.)

Copyright © 2019 by
Steven Yalowitz <>

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