Gertrude Elizabeth Margaret Anscombe

First published Tue Jul 21, 2009; substantive revision Mon May 30, 2022

Gertrude Elizabeth Margaret Anscombe was one of the most important philosophers of the twentieth century. She worked on an unusually broad array of topics: the entire range of the history of philosophy (ancient, medieval, modern, recent), metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of language, philosophy of mind/psychology, philosophy of action, moral philosophy, political philosophy, and the philosophy of religion. As a result, this entry will have to be very selective. Despite the fact that her work is often cryptic and difficult, it greatly influences philosophers working in action theory, moral philosophy, and the philosophy of mind. Like the work of her mentor Ludwig Wittgenstein, studying Anscombe’s work generates insight after study and struggle.

1. Life

She was born in Limerick, Ireland 18 March 1919 to Allen Wells Anscombe and Gertrude Elizabeth Anscombe (née Thomas). At the time of her birth her father was serving in the British Army. The family later returned to England where her father resumed his career as a schoolmaster, while her mother, a classical scholar, worked as a headmistress.

An inquisitive child, Anscombe decided to convert to Roman Catholicism in her early teens. She attended the Sydenham School, graduating in 1937, and went on to St. Hugh’s College, Oxford. During her early years at Oxford she met three young women who also had remarkable careers in philosophy: Iris Murdoch, Mary Midgley, and, above all, Philippa Foot, with whom she developed a deep friendship her entire life (Mac Cumhaill & Wiseman 2022). Anscombe received a First in Literae Humaniores (Classics and Philosophy) in 1941. After her graduation she remained at St. Hugh’s as a research student, and in 1942 moved to Newnham College, Cambridge, where she met Ludwig Wittgenstein. She believed that attending Wittgenstein’s lectures freed her from the trap of phenomenalism that had so plagued her (MPM, ix). In 1946 she was offered a Research Fellowship at Somerville College, Oxford, and was appointed to a teaching Fellowship there in 1964. She moved from Oxford to Cambridge in 1970 when she was awarded a Chair of Philosophy at Cambridge – the Chair formerly occupied by Wittgenstein. She remained at Cambridge until her retirement in 1986.

In 1938, at Oxford, she met the philosopher Peter Geach, who then was studying at Balliol. They were both receiving instruction from the same Dominican priest. They were married in 1941, and had three sons and four daughters.

In 1948, the young Anscombe read a paper [CSL] to the Socratic Club attacking an argument offered by C. S. Lewis in his book Miracles. In Chapter 3 of that book Lewis argued that naturalism is self-refuting. Lewis attended her talk, and, although accounts vary, some acquaintances report that he was crushed by her withering criticism. In any case, Lewis significantly rewrote the relevant chapter in the subsequent edition of his book.

Anscombe also became one of Wittgenstein’s good friends and then, after his death in 1951, the chief translator of his work into English. Ray Monk wrote that Anscombe was “…one of Wittgenstein’s closest friends and one of his most trusted students, an exception to his general dislike of academic women and especially of female philosophers.” (Monk 1991, 498).

Anscombe did not avoid controversy. In 1956 she publicly opposed Oxford University’s decision to award an honorary degree to Harry Truman, whom she considered a murderer for intentionally killing the civilians of Hiroshima and Nagasaki, Japan. She also courted controversy by coming out in print against contraception (see below), and engaging in civil disobedience at abortion clinics.

Anscombe famously flouted gender conventions: she did not take her husband’s name, she frequently wore men’s clothes, she smoked cigars, and she was prone to cursing and vulgar speech. Although influenced by several men – Frege, Wittgenstein, Geach, various Catholic thinkers historical and contemporaneous – Anscombe was a fiercely independent and original philosopher. Those who suspect she merely echoed or applied the views of another person are sorely mistaken.

Anscombe continued to produce original work beyond her retirement. Peter Geach, for example, reported in Analysis that she had constructed a novel paradox late in life (Geach 2006, 266–7).

Anscombe died in Cambridge on 5 January 2001.

2. Moral and Political Philosophy

Anscombe’s philosophical work does not form a system. But understanding her thoughts in moral and political philosophy helps one grasp some of her wider philosophical motivations, especially those on the topics of action and intention. We will first discuss several of her most well-known papers in moral and political philosophy, for this will shed light on her interest in these other areas.

In her infamous pamphlet “Mr. Truman’s Degree” (MTD) (1958), Anscombe protested Oxford’s decision to award Harry Truman an honorary doctorate. Some of the ideas in this pamphlet were later developed in “War and Murder” (WAM) (1972), written for a Christian venue.

She opposed Oxford’s decision to honor Truman on the grounds that Truman was a murderer. He was a murderer, because “choosing to kill the innocent as a means to your ends is always murder” (MTD, 66). The people of Hiroshima and Nagasaki were by and large noncombatants, neither fighting the Allies nor supplying Japan with the means of fighting them. She argued that killing these innocent people seemed necessary only because the Allies stupidly insisted that Japan unconditionally surrender.

One defense of Truman that she mentions and briefly opposes goes like this: Truman didn’t really kill anybody; he merely signed a piece of paper. Another goes like this: if killing innocent people were really murderous, then it would be murderous to kill enemy soldiers while they are sleeping, for at that moment they aren’t harming anyone (MTD, 67). Both of these moves rest on an implicit view of what action (e.g. killing, harming) is. Opposing this view of action motivated Anscombe’s own later work on action and intention, discussed below in Section 4.

In WAM, Anscombe wrote at greater length about the difference between murdering and other forms of killing. She distinguished choosing to kill the innocent as a means to your end, which is always murder, from choosing to do something else which you know as a statistical certainty will kill the innocent. Bombing civilian populations in order to provoke surrender is clearly a case of the former. The latter might or might not also be murder – it depends upon some details. It’s possible to administer a drug to alleviate the horrid pain of someone in mortal illness, knowing full well that, alas, the patient will thereby die sooner, but not thereby murder your patient. The patient’s death might not have been your end, nor a means to any such end. This difference in an action’s structure bears upon whether it constitutes murder. That is, what makes some forms of killing murder is not our opposition to it, nor the fact that it is unjust or wrong. Rather, some forms of killing are aptly described as murder, which we then might condemn and oppose.

In WAM, Anscombe also argued that human society is essential to human good, that the state is necessary for such society, and thus the state must have some right to use even deadly violence against those who attack it. (She defends some of these claims in greater detail in SAS.) But while pacifism is misguided, so too is the view that the state or its officers may do anything to defend itself. Killing is sometimes unjust, sometimes not. But warriors and police are often tempted to kill even those who are not unjustly attacking it, and, she holds, to kill the innocent deliberately is always murder, and, moreover, murder is always unjust.

To kill someone deliberately, she notes, is to kill someone either for its own sake or as a means to some further end. Such killing is intentional. By contrast, Anscombe claims that the distinction between the intended and the merely foreseen is “absolutely essential” to Christian ethics. Some actions (e.g. murder) Christian ethics always prohibits or forbids, and intentional killing of the innocent is on this list.

Some people had instead held that one can direct one’s intentions a certain way to achieve the desired result with moral impunity. If, for example, one tells oneself that by doing y one is really only intending x, then one is off the hook, even if y is forbidden.

The devout Catholic bomber secures by a “direction of intention” that any shedding of innocent blood that occurs is “accidental.” I know a Catholic boy who was puzzled at being told by his schoolmaster that it was an accident that the people of Hiroshima and Nagasaki were there to be killed; in fact, however absurd it seems, such thoughts are common among priests who know that they are forbidden by the divine law to justify the direct killing of the innocent (WAM, 59).

This teaching strikes Anscombe as quite absurd. She chalks this misunderstanding up to “Cartesian” psychology, a philosophy of psychology she works to oppose elsewhere.

A philosophical understanding of intention (and thus not just Catholic doctrine) is needed to show that killing innocent people as a means to ending a war (or whatever) just is intentionally killing the innocent, despite whatever thoughts are running through the mind of the killer at the time. Thus she argues for a proper understanding of Aquinas’s idea that it matters whether some action’s effect is intended or merely foreseen, something we must grasp if we are to see what motivates the Principle or Doctrine of Double Effect (See SEP entry for more about the pros and cons of the Doctrine of Double Effect). Anscombe does not so much argue for the principle, as insist that it has not been adequately understood. So to defend the Principle of Double Effect, a principle of ethics, we first need a sound understanding of the concepts of action and of intention. More on this in Section 4.

We will see the same need to understand the concepts of action and intention by studying her most well-known paper, “Modern Moral Philosophy” (MMP). There Anscombe presses three theses. First, doing moral philosophy is useless, and will remain so until we have an adequate philosophy of psychology, which is a long way away. Second, moral philosophers in any case should abandon the concepts of moral obligation, moral duty, and the moral “ought”, for these concepts make sense only in several conceptions of ethics none of which generally survives. Third, there are no important differences among the well-known English moral philosophers from Sidgwick onwards. Each of Anscombe’s three theses is bold; taken together, they are shocking.

We will start with her last thesis. Anscombe notes that despite their many differences, “every one of the best known English academic moral philosophers” thinks that killing the innocent is sometimes right, such as when the foreseeable consequences of not killing them would be catastrophic. She traces this to Sidgwick’s definition of intention, according to which one intends any and every foreseen consequence of one’s voluntary action. While the moral philosophers she criticizes don’t necessarily accept Sidgwick’s definition of intention, they do accept an ethical thesis based upon it: a person is always equally responsible for the intended and the merely foreseeable consequences of their voluntary actions. Anscombe identifies this move as the difference between the Utilitarianism of John Stuart Mill, who rejected the thought that it could ever be apt to calculate whether to kill an innocent person, and the consequentialism (a term she invented) of later English philosophers. Consequentialism, as she explains, is not directly a doctrine about what makes an action right – this meaning came about only later in the recent history of philosophy. Instead, consequentialism is about what one is responsible for. But the two topics are connected: if you are equally responsible for intentionally killing innocent people and for merely foreseeably killing innocent people, then why would it be wrong to kill one innocent person to save five? For if you don’t, you’d be just as responsible for the death of the five as if you had killed them yourself. Thus even many deontologists (like W.D. Ross) agree with Sidgwick that in some circumstances you have a moral duty to kill innocent people. (See also MTD, 71.) But Anscombe instead held that the consequentialist view of responsibility ultimately rests on a false view of what it is to act intentionally.

Here and elsewhere, MMP touched a nerve with the philosophers she targeted. One reason for this was the rather dismissive tone she took in some of her criticisms. Another is her rich use of irony. In addition to criticizing her contemporaries, she brusquely and perhaps uncharitably attacks Butler, Hume, Kant, Bentham, and Mill. One might sometimes guess that Anscombe is complaining about her colleagues because they favor new radical ideas, preferring philosophy that leaves everything in its place. But in fact she criticizes them on the grounds that the standards from which they begin are, in practice, the ones that happen to be current in their own society, and so modern moral philosophers wind up being very conventional. This was also the thrust of her BBC radio lecture “Does Oxford Moral Philosophy Corrupt the Youth?”, which she answered in the negative, on the grounds that English culture was already corrupt, and contemporary moral philosophy merely reflected rather than generated or opposed this turpitude.

The second thesis of MMP is that moral philosophers ought to abandon the concepts of moral obligation, moral duty, moral “ought”, and the like. (The generic ‘ought’ is fine.) These concepts, Anscombe argues, have a point only in a law-based ethics: if a moral legislator (e.g. God) commands you to do something, then you have a moral obligation or moral duty to do it. But in forms of ethics not based upon such a legislator, talk about moral obligation or moral duty is akin to those arguing about what is criminal in a society lacking criminal law or courts, or, alternatively, to castaways talking about whether their clothing accords with the new company policy – the necessary social framework for making such talk meaningful is absent. Unlike J. L. Mackie, who thought that moral thought and talk was false, Anscombe argued that it was nonsense, which is probably worse. She held that ethicists would do better to classify actions instead as, say, truthful or untruthful, just or unjust, … rather than as morally right or morally wrong.

Anscombe’s thought here resembled that of her contemporaries Philippa Foot and Iris Murdoch. All were opposed to Utilitarianism, and were suspicious of its emphasis on ‘thin’ evaluative terms. Our moral thought is far richer than that. Of course, their criticism was not restricted to Utilitarianism. Any moral theory predominantly employing thin moral concepts such as ‘morally right’ and ‘morally wrong’ were subject to this critique. Thin moral concepts are opposed to ‘thick’ ones. Bernard Williams famously characterized thick concepts this way:

If a concept of this kind applies, this often provides someone with a reason for action … We may say, summarily, that such concepts are “action-guiding.” … At the same time, their application is guided by the world. A concept of this sort may be rightly or wrongly applied, and people who have acquired it can agree that it applies or fails to apply to some new situation …. We can say, then, that the application of these concepts is at the same time world-guided and action-guiding. (Williams, 1985, 140)

To describe an action as ‘cowardly’ seems to provide much more information than to describe it as ‘wrong’. Further, thin terms can lead us astray. In MMP, after describing the Utilitarian commitment to be open, in principle, to “… judicially punishing a man for what he is clearly understood not to have done …”, which is clearly ‘unjust’, she writes:

And here we see the superiority of the term ‘unjust’ over the terms ‘morally right’ and ‘morally wrong’. For in the context of English moral philosophy since Sidgwick it appears legitimate to discuss whether it might be ‘morally right’ in some circumstances to adopt that procedure; but it cannot be argued that the procedure would in any circumstances be just. (MMP, 16)

No doubt Anscombe’s claims in MMP inspired some philosophers to develop modern versions of what’s now known as virtue ethics, a theory designed to be a full-fledged alternative to Kantianism, existentialism, utilitarianism, and other totalizing theories. But it is crucially important to notice that Anscombe herself did not advocate this development, and this brings us to the first thesis of MMP: it is not profitable for us at present to do moral philosophy until we have an adequate philosophy of psychology. Even if it would be in some ways “better” to theorize about ethics by using virtue concepts such as ‘truthful’ or ‘just’, rather than using concepts that now have no point, our efforts should really be directed to the philosophy of psychology, and not to moral philosophy at all. Even if we do know that some paths (e.g. those which fixate on moral obligation) take us in the wrong direction, we don’t know which of the many remaining paths to take.

What did she have in mind by ‘philosophy of psychology’? In MMP, she names several topics we would first need better conceptions of: ‘action’, ‘intention’, ‘pleasure’, ‘wanting’, and maybe one day ‘virtue’ and ‘flourishing’. She never developed an adequate conception of virtue nor of flourishing, and so she was never in a position even to begin doing moral philosophy. But she did, of course, contribute to the development of better conceptions of action and intention.

There is some controversy about whether Anscombe was being sincere in arguing we should stop doing moral philosophy. Crisp 2004 suspected that she was surreptitiously arguing for the superiority of a God-based moral philosophy over any secular moral philosophy, even one like Aristotle’s. He worried that Anscombe’s view that moral philosophers should turn to issues in moral psychology really applies only to those who deny divine law, and that Christians like her can continue to do moral philosophy.

In a sense, Crisp is right. Anscombe did believe in a divine moral law, and so must have thought that a theistic moral philosophy would have advantages over any other. And Anscombe, of course, did have views about how to live, had arguments for some of these views, and repeatedly opposed the zeitgeist by, say, protesting the use of atomic bombs and of abortion.

But when Anscombe said we (we secular or at least disunified philosophers) should stop doing moral philosophy until we have an adequate philosophy of psychology, she did not mean that we should abandon all of our ethical thought and talk. This is for two reasons. First, one need not think it’s profitable to do moral philosophy to have views about how to live or to coherently support or oppose various actions. Her plea to stop doing moral philosophy does not conflict with her having strong views about what to oppose, just as one might have all kinds of views about what is and isn’t illegal even if one never does any legal philosophy. Echoing Rousseau, you don’t need to be a philosopher in order to oppose (or support!) injustice.

Second, she did indeed think that some classes of action (e.g. murder) were “absolutely excluded” (MTD 71) for what we might call moral reasons. But most of her argumentative writings on such topics were aimed at audiences who already shared her view that one did not need the results of moral philosophy in order to live well. In the preface to a posthumous collection of essays, Luke Gormally explains that the bulk of her addresses in that volume were delivered to Catholic audiences, where she assumed “acceptance of authoritative Church teaching” [FHG, x]. If you and your audience trust that God has promised each of you that it is in your interest to avoid injustice, you don’t need to deeply understand the concept of flourishing or of virtue in order to talk to one another about how to live. Compare: if you trust your travel agent when she says that drinking alcohol on what appears to you to be a stateless island is in fact illegal, then you don’t need to do political philosophy in order to talk with your fellow travelers about whether to leave the alcohol at home.

Finally, as Aquinas exemplified, it’s possible to think that morality is based upon God and also believe that we need to understand the nature of our psychology in order to adequately understand morality. Her call to give moral philosophy a rest until we better understand the philosophy of psychology was addressed to us all, not just to a subset of moral philosophers.

3. Metaphysics

Some of Anscombe’s most influential work was on the nature of causation, a concept which is notoriously difficult to analyze. Part of her motivation for working on causation was to understand human freedom. Her paper “Causality and Determination” [CAD] challenged some of the empiricist orthodoxy of Hume’s account. She is concerned to distinguish causality from determination, arguing that one event can cause another even if the latter isn’t determined by its cause. When we note an event’s cause, we note from what it derived. She writes “Causality consists in the derivativeness of an effect from its causes” (CAD, 136). But that Y derives from X does not entail that X necessitated Y. So, we need not assume that every cause necessitates its effect. If causation always relates types of events (“Whenever an X-like event happens, a Y-like event happens”), then it might look like a cause necessitates its effect. But she challenged the view that the causal relation is actually characterized by constant conjunction of types, and thus whether causation entails necessitation. Discussing Feynman’s Geiger counter case, she writes:

An example of a non-necessitating cause is mentioned by Feynman: a bomb is connected to a Geiger counter, so that it will go off if the Geiger counter registers a certain reading; whether it will or not is not determined, for it is so placed near some radioactive material that it may or may not register that reading. (CAD, 145)

And yet, if the bomb explodes it was caused by the Geiger counter arrangement. Causation thus does not involve determination or necessity. Since the radioactive decay was not sufficient for this effect, the case tells against viewing causes as sufficient conditions. There need be no general connection between cause and effect. This challenge to the Humean account would turn out to be very influential – it helped push philosophers towards the development of probabilistic accounts of causation to account for the above type of case.

Instead, Anscombe was a singularist about causation, since she further rejected the Humean view that causation is not observable in a single instance. In her view, some perceivable events are themselves instances of causation. Anscombe produced examples from ordinary language that seem to show that we do perceive causation. Such examples are abundant. “I saw her clean the dishes” reports the perception of a causal process.

She was also an indeterminist about freedom of action. Actions are mostly physical movements, and “if these physical movements are physically predetermined by processes which I do not control, then my freedom is perfectly illusory” (CAD, 146). Our actions are surely caused, but not determined, and so there is still room for freedom. Yet she also recognized that indeterminism does not suffice for freedom; more is needed to establish that. We will need to understand what more is needed when we discuss her views about action.

In her paper “The First Person” [TFP], originally published in 1975, Anscombe argues for a thesis that seems patently false: the word “I” is not a referring expression. That is, while the function of a term like “Elizabeth Anscombe”, or “the daughter of Allen Anscombe”, or “that woman”, or “she” is referential, the term “I” does not function in the same way. “I” thus refers to nothing at all. (Compare with the use of ‘It’ in the thought “It is snowing.”) “The First Person” is probably Anscombe’s most difficult article – which is saying something – and even sympathetic scholars disagree about what the argument is supposed to be. She was clearly influenced by Geach 1957, and by Casteñada’s various papers on the first person. Later, Lewis 1979 discussed this issue in a distinct but by then familiar way.

Anscombe focuses approvingly on some aspects of Descartes’ use of ‘I’ in the Meditations. Famously, he cannot doubt ‘I exist.’ But on the same grounds that he can doubt ‘I have a body’, he also can doubt ‘I am Descartes.’ After all, ‘Descartes’ is just the name of a human being, and he can doubt that he is any human being whatsoever – he can wonder whether he’s instead a brain in a vat. So, if the argument indeed establishes the non-identity of himself with this body, it likewise establishes the non-identity of himself with Descartes!

This may seem strange, for this last thought may seem equivalent to “Descartes was not Descartes”, and that can’t be coherently denied. But Anscombe argues that these two thoughts are not equivalent. Why’s that?

We do tend to think of ‘I’ as simply being that expression people use to refer to themselves. However,

“When John Smith spoke of James Robinson he was speaking of his brother, but he did not know this.” That’s a possible situation. So similarly is “When John Smith spoke of John Horatio Auberon Smith (named in a will perhaps) he was speaking of himself, but he did not know this.” If so, then ‘speaking of’ or ‘referring to’ oneself is compatible with not knowing that the object one speaks of is oneself. (TFP, 47)

We might then wish to say “Smith can speak of himself without realizing that he is speaking of himself.” This shows that there are two distinct kinds of reflexive pronouns: the ordinary reflexive pronoun and the indirect reflexive pronouns. The first occurrence of ‘himself’ immediately above is the ordinary reflexive pronoun, and it refers successfully just in case it picks out the same object as its antecedent. It doesn’t matter how it does so, nor must the antecedent and pronoun share a sense. When above we say “Smith spoke of himself”, we are using the ordinary reflexive pronoun, for the person to whom Smith thereby referred was indeed the person who spoke.

Things are different if we are tempted to say “The word ‘I’ is a word each of us uses in speaking of himself.” This use of ‘himself’ can’t be the ordinary reflexive, because, as we just saw, a person can speak of himself in cases where he wouldn’t also use the word ‘I’ to refer to the same thing. The word ‘himself’ in this newer attempt at explaining the word ‘I’ gets its distinctive sense from that of the word ‘I’. But since the sense of the indirect reflexive pronoun ‘himself’ depends upon that of the word ‘I’, we cannot use the indirect reflexive pronoun, as though we understand it independently, to explain the word ‘I’. Things instead are the other way around. This discussion displays the problem that ‘I’ poses, but it doesn’t solve it.

How do we solve it? Anscombe thinks you can’t. In the bulk of the paper, Anscombe argues that the word ‘I’ isn’t a referring expression in a few steps. First, she argues that ‘I’ isn’t like other referring expressions: proper names, other pronouns, demonstratives, definite descriptions, and so on. So we can’t assimilate the use of the word “I” to other more tractable types of referring expressions. Second, she argues that the only remaining possibility is that the word “I” refers to an immaterial substance (a Cartesian ego), or at least a stretch of such a substance that exists so long as one is thinking a thought. But that would still leave us no way to identify the same referent in different “I”-thoughts at different times, an “intolerable” result. Moreover, Anscombe explicitly denied that there are immaterial substances. She described the very conception of an immaterial substance as “a delusive one” (IOS, 71).

So, having ruled out all the standard ways that terms refer, she concludes that the function of the word ‘I’ is non-referential. She says little about what its function is, although she notes that the word is dispensable – a language whose verbs are conjugated to reflect what we call ‘the first person’ (e.g. Latin, Spanish) can do without such a word. Her conclusion could be resisted if one produced a way of referring she hadn’t considered, or if one rebutted any of her arguments against the possibilities she does consider. Important discussions of this paper can be found in Doyle 2018, O’Brien 1994, and many other places, and it has clearly inspired the work of Rödl 2007.

4. Action Theory

Anscombe’s Intention is one of the classics of 20th century philosophy. Indeed, it continues to be a standard point of reference for those working in action theory and philosophical psychology, so much so that contemporary theories of action are often categorized as either Anscombean or Davidsonian.

On its back cover, David Velleman aptly quips that Intention is “often quoted, sometimes read, rarely understood”. Many readers are indeed puzzled by the significance and the lessons of what she writes. Intention is a work on the nature of agency through an understanding of the concept of intention. As we saw above, Anscombe wrote Intention after opposing supporters of Truman:

Perplexed by defenders of Truman she came to the conclusion that they had failed to understand the nature of his actions, and it was this that led her to write Intention, in which she pointed out that in doing one thing (moving one’s hand) one may intentionally be doing another (directing the death of human beings). (Haldane 2000, 1020)

Indeed we have seen many points in her work in moral philosophy where she calls us to understand the concepts of action and of intention better.

The best way to understand the argument of the book might be to consider its claims in a different order than the way the book lays them out. For the actual narrative of the books deliberately leads the reader into a bunch of dead ends and incomplete solutions before forwarding specific positive claims.

In what might reasonably be considered to be the conclusion of the book’s argument, she writes that “the term ‘intentional’ has reference to a form of description of events” (INT, 84). To unpack this cryptic thought, note first that the events she has in mind are some of those that we human beings are the subject of. It does not pick out things that merely happen to us.

Second, note that a single action can be described in various ways. Is he moving his arm up and down? Pumping water? Doing his job? Clicking out a steady rhythm? Making a funny shadow on the rock behind him? Well, it could be that all of these descriptions are true.

Third, note that even if the same action can be described in multiple ways, it usually won’t be intentional in every one of those ways described. For example, even though a man is pumping water intentionally, he might not be making a funny shadow on the rock behind him intentionally. But what determines which of the descriptions of his action are indeed intentional?

At first, Anscombe answers this disjunctively: she identifies several cases which are not intentional, and several other cases that are. If you ask someone “Why are you doing that?”, and they give one of a few types of answers, this establishes that the action is not intentional. Such ways of answering can include 1) “I didn’t know I was doing that.”, 2) “I (merely) observed/inferred that I was doing that”, 3) “I (merely) observed/inferred how my physical movement was caused.” By contrast, the following answers show that the action so described is indeed intentional: 1) an answer that mentions something future (“To end the war”), 2) an answer that interprets it (“Out of curiosity”) , 3) an answer that mentions something past that’s given as the ground for something good or bad for the person at whom it is aimed (“They attacked us first”), or, finally, 4) “No reason” (INT, 24).

Such a hodgepodge of answers sheds little light upon the concept of intention, her quarry. Thus, she shifts methods. She emphasizes that in every case of doing something intentionally, you don’t need to observe yourself in order to know that that’s what you are up to. For example, you know that you are reading this encyclopedia entry, and you know this not because somebody told you, nor did you merely infer it, nor did you see yourself in a mirror reading it. Rather, you know it in some distinctive way, what later writers will call a ‘first-personal’ way. Anscombe calls this knowledge of one’s own intentional actions “practical knowledge”, which is likewise obscure. But she concludes that “the notion of ‘practical knowledge’ can only be understood if we first understand ‘practical reasoning’” (INT, 57). Thus it is only by grasping what it is to reason practically that we will understand what practical knowledge and the concept of intention are.

What, then, is practical reasoning? There are two ways to think about it. One familiar way is via deliberation: we have some end, and we reason to some sufficient means to that end. Aristotle sketched things this way. Anscombe focuses on another way (although it winds up being equivalent to the first). She notes that the various ways to describe what someone does can bear a particular order to one another. A man might be moving his arm up and down because (and not just, and) he is operating the pump, which he’s doing because (and not just, and) he’s pumping water to the house, and so on. This is an order that really exists among events; it’s not merely the sum of merely physically described events going on in the world and, also somehow, what’s going on in his head. This order is the order of intention.

Of course, the man himself is in a special position to grasp this actually-existing order among the ways of describing what he’s doing. Anscombe compared this knowledge to the knowledge had by a man who directs a project like the erection of a building simply by giving orders for every little thing that anyone does, a project which he can’t see and gets no reports on. If all goes well, the director knows what’s done, and his knowledge is practical knowledge. His practical knowledge is his grasping the order of the events that unfold. Practical knowledge, then, isn’t fundamentally knowledge of certain atomic actions, e.g. thinking of a number, blinking. It’s knowledge of the entire means-end order among the things one does, an order which of course includes the actions constituting it. The man in the earlier example can say “I’m moving my arm up and down” because he can say “I’m moving my arm up and down because I’m pumping water”.

Indeed, many of the very concepts we use to describe movements involving human beings – e.g. ‘greeting’, ‘hiring’, ‘sending for’, even ‘offending’, ‘dropping’, ‘placing’ – are concepts we’d lack were we to lack the concept of intention. So the term ‘intentional’ refers not only to the aforementioned ‘because’ and what it structures, but to the very terms by which we conceptualize most human and animal movement. Intention is thus not something ‘added’ on to mere behavior we somehow first separately conceptualize. Rather, the order of intention is baked into the ways we represent our lives from the very start.

There are a wealth of other sections from Intention that have been “often quoted” and yet “rarely understood”. Consider, for example, this famous passage:

Let us consider a man going round a town with a shopping list in his hand. Now it is clear that the relation of this list to the things he actually buys is one and the same whether his wife gave him the list or it is his own list; and that there is a different relation where a list is made by a detective following him about. If he made the list itself, it was an expression of intention; if his wife gave it to him, it has the role of an order. What then is the identical relation to what happens, in the order and the intention, which is not shared by the record? It is precisely this: if the list and the things that the man actually buys do not agree, and if this and this alone constitutes a mistake, then the mistake is not in the list but in the man’s performance (if his wife were to say: “Look, it says butter and you have bought margarine”, he would hardly reply: “What a mistake! we must put that right” and alter the word on the list to “margarine”); whereas if the detective’s record and what the man actually buys do not agree, then the mistake is in the record. (INT, 56).

Anscombe draws attention to the fact that when there is a discrepancy between a piece of paper and what happens, the source of the error depends upon the “role” of the paper. If the paper has the role of a record, the error is in the paper. But if the paper has the role of an order or intention, the error is in what happens. Thus there can be two ways to fail to know what happens: by misrecording, and by misperforming. And one who practically knows doesn’t misperform.

Beginning with Searle (1975), a different thesis gets very widely attributed to Anscombe in the literature: one about ‘mental states’ like beliefs and desires, each of which supposedly has a different “direction of fit”. Anscombe, however, says nothing here about believing or desiring or other kinds of mental states; the example instead displays two ways of knowing. Her point is that you can know something either by believing something that is (already) true, or by intentionally doing something. Both are forms of knowledge, and indeed there can be two ways to know one and the same thing. (See Frost 2014.)

Anscombe applied her views on intention to clarify her own positions on controversial claims, such as the condemnation of contraception. One puzzle in the Catholic doctrine condemning contraception, and yet allowing for the ‘rhythm method’ of avoiding pregnancy, is to reconcile the rationales in a consistent way. Many charged the Church with inconsistency, since the intention to not get pregnant during intercourse is present in both cases. Anscombe claims there is an important difference:

The reason why people are confused about intention, and why they sometimes think there is no difference between contraceptive intercourse and the use of infertile times to avoid conception, is this: They don’t notice the difference between “intention” when it means the intentionalness of the thing you’re doing – that you’re doing this on purpose – and when it means a further or accompanying intention with which you do the thing. (CAC, 182)

Her claim is that the further intentions that accompany these actions may be the same, but there is a significant difference between the acts themselves. Her claim is that contraceptive intercourse, unlike timing intercourse to coincide with infertile periods, is a bad sort of action because in the case of contraceptive intercourse “…to intend such an act is not to intend a marriage act at all, whether or not we’re married” (CAC, 183). Having intercourse that has purposely been rendered infertile is itself a different act from having intercourse at an infertile time. Even though both types of action may have the further aim of, for example, limiting family size, the acts themselves differ. The “perversion of the sex act in marriage is, in this one way, like writing a forged check for a good cause”, she claims. The further intention of, let’s say, helping the needy is a worthy one but does not vindicate the action of forging the check.

Needless to say, this view was controversial. Bernard Williams and Michael Tanner criticized her argument for failing to consider one of her own theses – that actions, including sorts of actions, can fall under a variety of descriptions. On their view, she is picking and choosing descriptions of actions in order to get the outcome she wants – a distinction between the rhythm method and contraception that isn’t just a trivial distinction. But, they argue, she cannot do this convincingly. They argue that couples who employ the rhythm method are taking steps to achieve infertility just as those who take contraception are. Those steps are central to understanding the acts themselves, not simply the further purpose of the acts. (Williams and Tanner 1972)

5. Philosophy of Perception

What is it that we perceive? The world? Or only our ideas or sense-data? Something else? Anscombe deployed some of the conceptual machinery she had developed in the philosophy of action to topics in the philosophy of sense-perception. Three relevant theses from the philosophy of action include:

  1. Not any true description of what you do is an intentional action. (“She tripped over the rug”)
  2. The descriptions of what you intentionally do can be vague. (“I’m intentionally eating some jelly beans – but I’m not intentionally eating some specific number of them.”)
  3. When you make a mistake, you might not do what you intend. (“He intended to unlock the door, but he mistakenly broke the knob.”)

As we will see shortly, analogous claims can be made about sensation or perception.

But first, note that Anscombe distinguished sharply between two senses of the word “object” – one of which is material (“There are ten objects on the bowling lane”), while the other is intentional (“Immortality was the object of his desire”), which otherwise needn’t exist at all. An intentional object is given by a word or phrase which gives a description under which it is such (IOS, 9). She insists that neither sense of the word “object” is deviant nor philosophically uninteresting, but they are easily confused with each other.

She makes a foray into grammatical theory to illustrate the possibility of this distinction between senses of “object”. Consider the sentence “Luke gave Leia his lightsaber”. If asked “What object did Luke give Leia?”, we would reply “his lightsaber”. And if asked for the direct object of the sentence, we would again reply “his lightsaber”. But although “his lightsaber” is indeed the direct object of the sentence, Luke did not give Leia a direct object; to think otherwise is to confuse the two senses. Moreover, “his lightsaber” is the direct object of this sentence, even though no lightsaber materially exists. It would be foolish to object to the claim that the direct object of the sentence is “his lightsaber” on the grounds that lightsabers aren’t real. Anscombe’s insight is that likewise there are also objects of perception in both a material and an intentional sense.

In light of the three claims above, Anscombe makes three analogous claims about sense-perception:

  1. Not any true description of what you perceive is the intentional object of what you perceive. For example, what you see might be a picture of a duck-rabbit drawn by the Queen, but you might not see it as a picture of a duck-rabbit, nor as a picture drawn by the Queen – you happen to see only a picture of a duck, the intentional object of sight.
  2. You might perceive something vaguely. For example, although the tree you see has 125 leaves (material object), you see only a tree with an indeterminate number of leaves (intentional object).
  3. You can perceive something that doesn’t materially exist. For example, after rubbing your eyes you might see stars (intentional object), even though materially there are no stars to be seen.

Anscombe maintained that certain philosophical views look inescapable only if we conflate these two distinct senses. Idealism is the view that we see only sense data, taking what is the intentional object of perception also to be the material objection of perception. On the other hand, direct realism (or what she calls ‘ordinary language philosophy’) holds that we see only material objects without any intermediaries, overlooking or dismissing the legitimate use of saying things like “Now I see stars” after getting hit on the head. They thereby ignore or misunderstand the relevance of the intentional sense of sense-perception. Thus neither idealism nor direct realism recognizes the importance of the distinction between two ways of thinking about verbs of sense-perception. Both views thus fail to recognize the distinct intentionality of sensation.

Although these two senses are distinct, Anscombe notes that sometimes people use the word “see” and other verbs of sense-perception without definitely intending it either only materially or only intentionally. Only further questioning would nudge them to make their meaning more specific.

6. Testimony

Among the very many topics Anscombe worked on, her ideas about the role of testimony have prefigured or influenced much contemporary thought on the topic. We will summarize three of her short but important papers on testimony: “Hume and Julius Caesar” (HJC), “What Is It to Believe Someone?” (WBS), and “Authority in Morals” (AIM), each of which heralds ideas that gained prominence in philosophy only later.

In HJC, she considers Hume’s answer to the question, how do we know about historical events? For example, how do we know that Caesar was killed on the Ides of March? How do we even know that Caesar was a real man, and not a mythical figure like Electra? Hume’s answer was essentially that you perceive or remember someone (perhaps your school teacher) telling you about Caesar, and you next infer the cause of that – namely, that someone told them – and so on, until you infer that there were eyewitnesses in the Senate, who then witnessed Caesar’s death. You thus infer the original event through a series of causes terminating in something you perceive or remember perceiving.

Anscombe argued that Hume’s answer cannot be right. First, is it really true that we infer that Caesar was killed on the Ides of March from the thought there were many observant people in the Senate that day? No. If anything, it’s the other way around: given that we think that Caesar was killed then and there, we infer that there must have been eyewitnesses to his death. It is not that we first establish the presence of these people, and only then infer what caused them to say what they said.

Anscombe also discussed “one of the rare pieces of stupidity in the writings of Wittgenstein” (HJC, 89). He once wrote that if we were to find a piece of writing saying Caesar never existed, and was invented for other ends, this would be some evidence that Caesar never existed. Anscombe pushes us to think further about this. If we were to discover such a document, we would instead immediately conclude it to be worthless, this because it conflicts with so much we have been taught about the history of the West. She thus opposed the idea that our belief in Caesar’s existence rests upon any evidence we have for it, rather than from our directly trusting what we have been taught. A coherentist might reply that any document alleging Caesar’s nonexistence clashes with the preponderance of historical evidence we have about him, and that we can check the claims of this document against these other sources of evidence. But Anscombe rejoins that these other sources of “evidence” are themselves historians who straightforwardly believe much of what they have been taught, and we believe them. Thus, we cannot “reduce” testimony to some other source of justification. Believing testimony is basic.

She provocatively concludes the essay

[N]ot everything can be put up for checking. Von Neurath’s image of the ship which we repair – and, I suppose, build on to – while it is afloat: if this suggests that we can go round tapping every plank for rottenness, and so we might end up with a wholly different ship, the analogy is not good. For there are things that are on a level. A general epistemological reason for doubting one will be a reason for doubting all, and then none of them would have anything to test it(HJC, 92)

She thus opposes epistemological coherentism about justification, or at least a certain popular version of it. The many sources of information about Caesar’s life are themselves equally vulnerable to skepticism, and so we cannot actually test the former while trusting the latter. Without trusting what we have been taught, we have almost no historical knowledge.

Well before C. A. J. Coady’s masterful monograph on testimony (1992) that revived widespread interest in the topic, Anscombe published a little essay titled “What Is It to Believe Someone?”, anticipating many points he and others later developed. She wrote that the topic of believing someone is not merely neglected but actually unknown in the philosophical discussion of her time. Yet she avers that it is “of great importance in philosophy and in life”, for “the greater part of our knowledge of reality rests upon the belief that we repose in things we have been taught and told”. What is it, then, for a person, rather than a proposition, to be the object of belief?

Anscombe distinguishes believing a person from believing what a person says, for you can do the latter without the former – both when you already believe what is said, and when you believe that the person is both misinformed and yet trying to deceive you. Anscombe describes many “presuppositions” to believing someone: noticing the relevant sound or inscription, understanding it as an attempt to communicate, noticing that it is addressed to oneself, understanding it properly, understanding that it was produced by the person indeed producing it, and many more. Only once all these are in place do we come to the situation where we can ask: “Does he believe her?”

It is no small matter whether people trust you when you tell them things. Anscombe claimed “It is an insult and it may be an injury not to be believed” (WBS, 9). Although she does not elaborate upon the nature of the insult and injury, her claim foreshadows contemporary discussions of epistemic injustice. Interestingly, it can be insulting, she notes, not even to be heard as telling one something. For example, if you tell me p, but I fail to note that you were telling me anything – perhaps I thought you were just venting aloud – you might reasonably say that I disrespectfully failed to believe you. We can wrong one another by refusing to accept one another’s word, an idea that has recently become widely discussed at the intersection of epistemology and ethics.

In the third paper on testimony, “Authority in Morals”, Anscombe again considers a few related questions that only recently have become widely discussed: can one person aptly tell another what to think about morality, and can the hearer aptly trust what they are thus told? Given that the paper was originally presented at a conference in an abbey, much of her discussion involves trusting a religious authority about moral truths. But her points generalize.

Anscombe compares moral teaching to mathematical teaching: in both cases, one must do something to truly learn what is being taught, rather than merely accepting something as to be believed. Teaching someone either morality or mathematics thus won’t just involve the formation of belief. Even so, she denies that a proper understanding of autonomy is incompatible with trusting moral testimony: deciding to trust someone who tells you about a bit of moral truth can be a way of thinking for oneself. A man who does this and acts on this testimony is still “his own pilot” (AIM, 49).

Yet there are limits to moral testimony. Although she thinks certain dogmatic truths are religiously revealed and could not otherwise be known, this is not so for moral truths. Moral truths may be religiously revealed only per accidens. In other words, moral truths can always be known other than by trusting some source. There seems to be no room for moral truths that per se can be taken only through trust.

One way moral truths can be revealed per accidens is when someone relies on an authority for a moral claim that they in some sense could have thought out for themselves, but didn’t. Anscombe does not imply that so relying need be a sign of laziness; rather, she thinks that different people have already grasped different parts of the moral law (AIM, 45), and so seems to think that sharing moral truths is much like sharing other truths. For example, if you tell me what you ate for lunch, I can reasonably trust you even if in principle it’s true that I could have instead spied on you to find out. Likewise, I might reasonably believe you when you tell me some moral truth that I hadn’t worked out for myself (but, in theory, could).

The second way moral truths can be revealed per accidens is when their factual grounds are knowable only by religious revelation. For example, consider the ascetic life. As Hume noted, there seems to be nothing good about it. And so if someone were to tell you that it is indeed good, there would be no question of believing them.

But now suppose you come to accept certain ordinary (non-moral) truths of revealed religion: the doctrine of original sin, and the possibility of joining your suffering with that of Christ. Now in light of accepting these ideas, it becomes possible to see for yourself that there is indeed something good about the ascetic life. So, you need not accept this moral claim itself on the basis of religious revelation, but you accept it on the basis of other truths themselves accepted as revelation. Moral truths, however, always can in principle be graspable without needing to trust another. Even though there need be nothing bad about trusting an authority who teaches about morality, their teachings, if true, could be arrived at otherwise.

7. Conclusion

G. E. M. Anscombe’s work ranged over many years and many different areas in philosophy. The breadth of her work is impressive. She was systematic in her thinking, seeing and developing connections between metaphysics, moral psychology, and ethics that exhibited not simply a grasp of one particular problem, but a world view. Much of her works remains unpublished, although newly accessible through the Anscombe Papers Project at the Collegium Institute for Catholic Thought & Culture. Anscombe’s legacy is one of the broadest and deepest left by a 20th century philosopher.


Primary Literature

When abbreviations are used to cite Anscombe’s works in the text, the abbreviation begins the bibliographic item below.

Anscombe’s monographs include the following:

  • [IWT] An Introduction to Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, London: Hutchinson, 1959; 2nd edition, 1963; 3rd edition, 1971.
  • [INT] Intention, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1957; 2nd edition, 1963. Reprinted in 2000 by Harvard University Press.
  • [THP] Three Philosophers: Aristotle, Aquinas, Frege, with Peter Geach, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 2002.

Anscombe’s principal essays are collected in the following six volumes.

  • [FPW] From Parmenides to Wittgenstein (The Collected Philosophical Papers of G. E. M. Anscombe, Volume 1), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
  • [MPM] Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Mind (The Collected Philosophical Papers of G. E. M. Anscombe, Volume 2), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
  • [ERP] Ethics, Religion and Politics (The Collected Philosophical Papers of G. E. M. Anscombe, Volume 3), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
  • [HAE] Human Life, Action, and Ethics: Essays by G. E. M. Anscombe (St. Andrews Studies in Philosophy and Public Affairs, Volume IV), M. Geach and L. Gormally (eds.), Exeter: Imprint Academic, 2005.
  • [FPW] From Plato to Wittgenstein: Essays by G. E. M. Anscombe, M. Geach and L. Gormally (eds.), Exeter: Imprint Academic, 2015.
  • [LTM] Logic, Truth and Meaning: Writings by G. E. M. Anscombe, M. Geach and L. Gormally (eds.), Exeter: Imprint Academic, 2015.

Individual essays by Anscombe cited in the text, with page numbers referring to the reprinted version contained in the above collected volumes:

  • [MTD] “Mr. Truman’s Degree” (privately produced pamphlet); reprinted in [MPM], 62–71.
  • [WAM] “War and Murder,” in Nuclear Weapons: a Catholic Response, Walter Stein (ed.), London: Merlin, 1961, 43–62; reprinted in [ERP], 51–61.
  • [SAS] “On the Source of the Authority of the State,” Ratio 20 (1978); reprinted in [MPM], 130–155.
  • [MMP] “Modern Moral Philosophy,” Philosophy 33 (1958): 1–19; reprinted in [ERP], 26–42. [CAD] Causality and Determination: An Inaugural Lecture, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1971; reprinted in [MPM], 133–147.
  • [TFP] “The First Person,” in Mind and Language: Wolfson College Lectures 1974, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975, 45–64; reprinted in [MPM], 21–36.
  • [IOS] “The Immortality of the Soul” in [FHG], 69–83; previously unpublished. [CSL] “A Reply to Mr. C.S. Lewis’s Argument that ‘Naturalism’ is Self-Refuting,” Socratic Digest 4:2 (1948), 7–16; reprinted in [MPM], 224–232.
  • [CAC] “Contraception and Chastity,” The Human World 9 (1972): 41–51; reprinted in [FHG], 170–192.
  • [IOS] “The Intentionality of Sensation: A Grammatical Feature,” Analytical Philosophy (second series), R. J. Butler (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1965; reprinted in [MPM], 3–20.
  • [HJC] “Hume and Julius Caesar,” Analysis 34 (1973): 1–7; reprinted in [FPW], 86–93.
  • [WBS] “What Is It to Believe Someone?” in Rationality and Religious Belief, C. F. Delaney (ed.), Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1979, 141–151; reprinted in [FHG], 1–10.
  • [AIM] “Authority in Morals” in Problems of Authority, J. Todd (ed.), London: Darton, Longman and Todd, 1962; reprinted in [ERP], 43–50.

Translations by Anscombe

Major translations by Anscombe include:

  • Descartes, René, Philosophical Writings, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe and Peter Geach, London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1954.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig, Philosophical Investigations, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1953.
  • –––, Notebooks 1914–1916, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1961.
  • –––, On Certainty, translated by Denis Paul and G. E. M. Anscombe and edited by G. H. von Wright and G. E. M. Anscombe, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1969.
  • –––, Remarks on the Foundation of Mathematics, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe and edited by G. H. von Wright and R. Rhees, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1956.
  • –––, Zettel, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe, Oxford: Blackwell, 1967.

Secondary Literature

  • Bennett, Jonathan, 1966. “Whatever the Consequences,” Analysis, 26: 83–102.
  • –––, 1995. The Act Itself, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Boyle, Joseph, 1980. “Toward Understanding the Principle of Double Effect,” Ethics, 90: 527–538.
  • Bratman, Michael, 1987. Intention, Plans, and Practical Reason, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Coady, C. A. J., 1995. Testimony: A Philosophical Study, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Crisp, Roger and Michael Slote, 1996. Introduction to Virtue Ethics, Roger Crisp and Michael Slote (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Crisp, Roger, 2004. “Does Modern Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?,” in Modern Moral Philosophy (Royal Institute of Philosophy, Supplement 54), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 75–94.
  • Davidson, Donald, 1963. “Actions, Reasons, and Causes,” Journal of Philosophy, 60: 685–700.
  • Diamond, Cora, 2019. Reading Wittgenstein with Anscombe, Going on to Ethics, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • ––– and Jenny Teichman (eds), 1979. Intention and Intentionality: Essays in Honour of G. E. M. Anscombe, Harvester Press.
  • Doyle, James, 2017. No Morality, No Self: Anscombe’s Radical Skepticism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Ford, Anton, 2015. “The Arithmetic of Intention,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 52: 129–143.
  • –––, Jennifer Hornsby, and Frederick Stoutland (eds.), 2011. Essays on Anscombe’s Intention, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Foot, Philippa, 2002. Virtues and Vices: And Other Essays in Moral Philosophy, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Frey, Christopher & Frey, Jennifer A, 2017. “G. E. M. Anscombe on the Analogical Unity of Intention in Perception and Action,” Analytic Philosophy 58, 3: 202–247.
  • Frey, Jennifer A., 2019. “Anscombe on Practical Knowledge and the Good,” Ergo: An Open Access Journal of Philosophy, 6.
  • Frost, Kim, 2014. “On the Very Idea of Direction of Fit,” The Philosophical Review 123: 429–484.
  • Geach, Peter, 1957. “On Belief About Oneself,” Analysis 18: 23–24.
  • –––, 2006. “The Labels,” Analysis, 66: 266–67.
  • Gormally, Luke, David Albert Jones, and Roger Teichmann (eds.), 2016. The Moral Philosophy of Elizabeth Anscombe. Imprint Academic.
  • Haldane, John, 2000. “In Memoriam, G. E. M. Anscombe (1919–2001),” The Review of Metaphysics, 53: 1019–1021.
  • ––– (ed.), 2019. The Life and Philosophy of Elizabeth Anscombe. Imprint Academic.
  • Hlobil, Ulf & Nieswandt, Katharina, 2016. “On Anscombe’s Philosophical Method,” Klēsis Revue Philosophique 35: 180–198.
  • Hursthouse, Rosalind, 2000. “Intention” in Logic, Cause and Action: Essays in Honour of Elizabeth Anscombe, ed. Teichmann, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 83–105.
  • Lavin, Douglas, 2015. “Action as a form of temporal unity: on Anscombe’s Intention,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 45:609–629.
  • Lewis, C. S., 1960. Miracles: A Preliminary Study, 2nd edition. London, Fontana.
  • Lewis, David, 1979. “Attitudes de dicto and de se,” Philosophical Review 88: 513–543.
  • Mac Cumhaill, Clare & Wiseman, Rachael, 2022. Metaphysical Animals, New York: Doubleday.
  • Mackie, J. L., 1977. Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • Monk, Ray, 1991. Ludwig Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius, London: Vintage.
  • Moran, Richard & Stone, Martin J., 2011. “Anscombe on expression of intention: an exegesis” in Essays on Anscombe’s Intention, eds. Anton Ford, Jennifer Hornsby & Frederick Stoutland, Harvard University Press.
  • Murdoch, Iris, 1971. The Sovereignty of Good. Routledge.
  • Nagel, Thomas, 1979. “War and Massacre,” in Mortal Questions, New York: Cambridge University Press, 53–74.
  • O’Brien, Lucy, 1994. “Anscombe and the Self-Reference Rule,” Analysis 54: 277–281.
  • Passmore, John, 1966. A Hundred Years of Philosophy, 2nd edition, New York: Basic Books.
  • Rödl, Sebastian, 2007. Self-Consciousness, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Schwenkler, John, 2019. Anscombe’s Intention: A Guide. New York, USA: Oxford University Press.
  • Searle, John R., 1975. “A Taxonomy of Illocutionary Acts,” In Language, Mind and Knowledge, ed. K. Gunderson, University of Minnesota Press, 344–369.
  • Teichman, Jenny, 2002. “Gertrude Elizabeth Margaret Anscombe: 1919–2001,” in Biographical Memoirs of Fellows I (Proceedings of the British Academy, Volume 115), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 31–50.
  • Teichmann, Roger (ed.), 2000. Logic, Cause and Action: Essays in Honour of Elizabeth Anscombe, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2008. The Philosophy of Elizabeth Anscombe, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Thompson, Michael, 2011. “Anscombe’s Intention and practical knowledge,” in Essays on Anscombe’s Intention, eds. Anton Ford, Jennifer Hornsby & Frederick Stoutland, Harvard University Press.
  • Vogler, Candace, 2006. “Modern Moral Philosophy Again: Isolating the Promulgation Problem,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 106: 347–364.
  • –––, 2016. “Nothing Added: Intention §§19 and 20,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 90: 229–247.
  • Williams, Bernard, 1985. Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • ––– and Michael Tanner, 1972. “Comment on Contraception and Chastity,” The Human World, 9: 41–51.
  • Wilson, George, 1989. The Intentionality of Human Action, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Wiseman, Rachael, 2016. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Anscombe’s Intention. Routledge.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1980. Philosophical Remarks, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Other Internet Resources


We would like to thank an editor for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for his or her extremely helpful comments on earlier drafts. We would also like to thank Simon Blackburn, Roger Crisp, and John Schwenkler for their very helpful feedback on this essay.

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Julia Driver

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