Bodily Awareness

First published Tue Aug 9, 2011; substantive revision Wed Jul 8, 2020

At the sensory level we continuously receive a flow of information about our own body through external and internal perceptions. Not only can we see our body and touch it, but we also have several inner receptors that convey information about the position of our limbs, the balance of our body, and its physiological condition. Unlike external perception, the inner sensory flow never stops and cannot be voluntarily controlled. Thus, an important amount of information is constantly available whether we want it or not, whether we pay attention to it or not. In that respect, our body qualifies as the object that we know best. Yet, despite numerous sources of information, the phenomenology of bodily awareness is limited. In painful and learning situations, our body appears at the core of our interest, but when we walk in the street, we are rarely aware of the precise position of our legs and of the contact of the floor on our feet. Schwitzgebel (2007), for instance, asked how frequently participants wearing a device beeping at random intervals had tactile experiences in their left foot just before the beeping sound. He found a high variability in the answers, but one participant reported tactile sensations only 16% of the time. Our conscious field is primarily occupied by our environment, instead of the bodily medium that allows us to perceive it and to move through it. Hence, the most permanent and preponderant object in life may also be the most elusive one (Leder 1990; Merleau-Ponty 1945; O’Shaughnessy 1980).

One may then question whether we are completely unaware of it. Except in rare illusory or pathological cases, we never feel fully disembodied. James (1890: 242), for instance, claims that we are constantly conscious of the presence of our body, although at the margin of the stream of our consciousness:

Our own bodily position, attitude, condition, is one of the things of which some awareness, however inattentive, invariably accompanies the knowledge of whatever else we know.

Similarly, Gurwitsch (1985: 60) asserts:

We are immediately and directly aware of our body, at least in marginal form, at every moment of our lives, under all circumstances, and at whatever place we might happen to find ourselves.

But what is the content of this marginal body consciousness? It seems to be reducible to the “feeling of the same old body always there” or to a mere “feeling of warmth and intimacy” (James 1890: 242). But can we go beyond this rough and metaphorical description?

Although for a long time the exclusive province of phenomenology (Husserl 1913; Gurwitsch 1985; Merleau-Ponty 1945; Henri 1965; de Preester 2007; Gallagher 2005; Legrand 2006; Mishara 2004; Carman 1999), bodily awareness has attracted more and more attention from philosophers from all traditions, leading among others to several monographs and multidisciplinary volumes (for instance, see Bermúdez et al. (eds.) 1995; Knoblich et al. (eds.) 2005; Fulkerson 2014; Vignemont & Alsmith (eds.) 2017; Bermúdez 2018; Vignemont 2018; Guillot & García-Carpintero (eds.) forthcoming; Tsakiris & de Preester (eds.) 2018; Vignemont, Serino et al. (eds.) forthcoming). This runs in parallel with a boom of research in cognitive neuroscience. In particular, bodily illusions have raised a wide range of philosophical questions about the underlying mechanisms of bodily self-awareness, questions that are still open nowadays. For instance, it has been found that if one looks at a rubber hand, while one’s own hand is hidden, and both the rubber and the real hands are synchronously stroked, one can report feeling as if the rubber hand were one’s hand (Botvinick & Cohen 1998). The rubber hand illusion has been taken as the key for understanding bodily self-awareness. Yet, after more than twenty years of research, what have we really learnt about the body and the self?

The entry first describes the special way one has of knowing one’s body from the inside. After comparing it with visual awareness and assessing its epistemological significance, it will ask whether it should be understood as a form of perception. The entry will then discuss the involvement of mental representations for bodily awareness, specifically exploring its relation with action and the notion of body schema. In the last section, the entry will review several accounts of the sense of bodily ownership.

1. The body from the inside

The body is a material entity located in space and time in the same way as a rock, a tree or a bird. But do we perceive and experience our body like those other objects? Most philosophical interest for bodily awareness has come from its peculiarities. It is precisely because we assume that we are aware of our body differently from other objects that it raises many questions. But what makes it unique? The most intuitive answer is that it bears a special relation to the self, and to self-awareness. As noted by O’Shaughnessy (1980: vol. 1, p. 138),

Now there is every reason for expecting it to be a highly unusual relation. For we are talking about the epistemological link between a man and in all probability himself qua material object! and in any case the one object in the universe that is his own body. Is not that likely to be unusual?

However, although introspectively familiar, it is hard to exactly pinpoint the nature of the specific relation. One way to characterize it is to say that many bodies, including our own, can appear to us from the outside but only our own body appears to us from the inside. Most definitions of the inside mode then amount to little more than list the internal ways of gaining knowledge about our body. However, it is not clear that they form a unified category. What they have in common is that they seem to all guarantee that bodily judgments are immune to error through misidentification relative to the first-person. But are body senses the only ones to guarantee bodily immunity and are bodily judgments still immune when the grounds of bodily awareness are multimodal?

1.1 Varieties of bodily experiences

Most discussions on bodily sensations focus on the privileged relation they have with the subject’s body and assume a unified account for bodily awareness, as if it made no difference whether one feels pain, touch or hunger. However, there are clear physiological, phenomenological, and epistemic differences among them. Here is a brief overview of the specificities of each type of bodily sensations:

Tactile sensations are mediated by cutaneous mechanoreceptors (see Entry on Touch). Touch carries information both about the object one is in contact with and about the body part in contact (Katz 1925; Fulkerson 2014; Richardson 2013; Vignemont and Massin, 2015). For some, it is the most important sense because it gives us an experiential access to the reality of the world we are in contact with:

There is no commoner remark than this, that resistance to our muscular effort is the only sense which makes us aware of a reality independent from ourselves. (James 1880: 29; see also Armstrong 1962; Condillac 1754; Maine de Biran, 1812)

However, there is a large debate in the literature about how to distinguish touch from other senses. For instance, are thermal sensations tactile sensations or not? Should one distinguish sensory touch and affective touch (McGlone et al. 2014)?

Proprioceptive experiences provide information about the position and movement of the body, although the notion of proprioception is sometimes enlarged to refer to all bodily sensations (Bermúdez 1998). The mechanisms of proprioception include muscle spindles, which are sensitive to muscle stretch, Golgi tendon organs, which are sensitive to tendon tension, and joint receptors, which are sensitive to joint position. One question is whether these signals give rise to sensations or not (Anscombe 1962).

The sense of balance depends on vision, touch, and more importantly on the vestibular system in the inner ear, which provides information about the balance of the body. It includes three roughly orthogonal semicircular canals, which are sensitive to motion acceleration as our head moves in space, and two otolith organs, which are sensitive to the pull of gravity. It replies to two questions: (1) ‘Which way is up?’ and (2) ‘Where am I heading?’. As for proprioception, one may question whether there is a phenomenology of balance. Besides cases of dizziness, there seems to be indeed a paucity of vestibular experiences in normal consciousness. The vestibular system has been ascribed a major role for self-location by anchoring the subject to her location and in orienting the subject in the world (Wong 2017).

Pain raises many challenges for philosophers (see Pain entry), and the variety of painful experiences makes the problems even more complex (Corns 2014). From a physiological level, we have nociceptors on the skin that respond to dangerously intense mechanical stimuli, to mechanothermal stimuli or to thermal and chemical stimuli. According to the dominant theory, noxious signals are inhibited, enhanced or distorted by various factors via a gating mechanism at the level of the spinal cord that controls the amount of signals from the periphery to brain structures and via a central gating mechanism (Melzack & Wall 1983). A major issue is to account for both the sensory component of pain, which represents the felt location and intensity of the sensation, and for the affective component, its unpleasantness, which motivates protective behaviors. To do so, recent representationalist theories propose that pain has evaluative content (Bain 2013) or imperative content (Klein 2015; Martinez 2011; Hall 2008).

Interoceptive awareness provides information about the physiological condition of the body in order to maintain optimal homeostasis, namely, cardiovascular, respiratory, energy (feeding and glucose), and fluid (electrolyte and water) balances. It has been recently suggested that interoception plays a major role for grounding the “bodily self” (Damasio 1999; Craig 2003; Seth 2013; Tsakiris & de Preester 2018). There is, however, a debate on how to define interoception (Ceunen, Vlaeyen, & Van Diest 2016). Does it include only information about the homeostatic state of the organism, as originally proposed by Sherrington (1906), or any sensation with an affective component, thus including pain and affective touch, as recently assumed by Craig (2003)?

David Armstrong (1962) has been the only one to offer a taxonomy of all these bodily experiences. He draws a first contrast between bodily sensations and bodily feelings. Sensations, such as touch and pain, are local whereas feelings, such as thirst, hunger, fatigue, sleepiness, dizziness, and shortness of breath, are global. For instance, you can distinguish the local sensation of pinprick at the tip of your index finger with the diffuse feeling of fatigue in your whole body. Or consider the case of thirst: it reveals the general state of the entirety of your body missing water. More generally, interoceptive feelings inform us about the welfare of the organism as a whole. Their spatial principle of organization is thus holistic. Within the category of bodily sensations, Armstrong further distinguishes transitive and intransitive bodily sensations. One experiences a mind-independent object in transitive sensations, as in touch, but it does not seem so in intransitive ones, as in pain. As described by Reid (1764: 56),

If a man runs his head with violence against a pillar … he feels nothing in the stone but feels a violent pain in his head. It is quite otherwise when he leans his head gently against the pillar, for then he will tell you that he feels nothing in his head, but feels hardness in the stone.

To Armstrong’s list, one may add what has been called existential feelings (Ratcliffe 2008; Billon 2015). All those bodily sensations listed above describe the ‘anecdotal’ state of the body, so to speak, that is, the state of the body that keeps changing (e.g., its posture, its temperature, its movement, and so forth). However, there is another aspect of bodily awareness, which is less directly connected to sensory receptors, and which concerns the enduring state of the body, its ‘fundamental’ properties. Imagine having a terrible nightmare in which you are floating in the sky but then suddenly start falling down. After waking up, you become aware that you are alive and that all your limbs are intact. You are aware of your body being here in your bedroom, no longer floating up in the sky. You also regain awareness that this body has two legs and two arms that can cycle and swim, but that cannot fly. You are finally aware that this body is of a highly peculiar significance for you: it is yours, or maybe even it is you. It includes the sense of bodily presence (awareness of one’s body as being here), the sense of bodily ownership (awareness of one’s body as being one’s own), and the sense of bodily agency (awareness of one’s bodily capacities for action). These senses are rarely at the forefront of consciousness because they normally do not vary, and thus do not attract attention.

1.2 Immunity to error through misidentification

Despite their differences, all bodily experiences seem to display the same epistemological signature: they ground the immunity to error through misidentification relative to the first-person of bodily self-ascriptions. Self-ascription of a property is said to be immune to error if and only if one cannot rationally doubt who instantiates the property when one has gained information about the property in the appropriate way (although one can be mistaken about the property that one ascribes to oneself) (Shoemaker 1968; Evans 1982). For instance, if I think that I am anxious because I feel anxious, my thought is immune to error through misidentification of the subject. But if I think that I am anxious because my psychoanalyst told me so, my thought is not immune to error. Indeed, the psychoanalyst may have confused me with another patient, who is the person suffering from anxiety. To be immune, my thought must be grounded in introspection, that is, on a way of gaining information about one’s mental states from the inside. The question is whether the self-ascription not only of mental properties, but also of physical properties (such as body posture) can be immune to error in such a way. Consider the following example. I form the judgment that my legs are crossed while I am seated around a small table with several other persons. Can I rationally doubt that they are mine? If I make this judgment on the basis only of my seeing legs, then I can confuse my legs with the legs of the person seated next to me. By contrast, if I make this judgment because I feel my legs as being crossed, then the answer is negative. The inside mode of body senses guarantees immunity to error (IEM) because they provide a privileged informational access to one’s own body only. Because of this privileged relation, the judgement “my legs are crossed” is not grounded in the judgement “these legs are crossed” and in the identification “these legs are mine”. Proprioceptive experiences suffice to justify bodily self-ascriptions such that no intermediary process of self-identification is required (Bermúdez 1998; Brewer 1995; Cassam 1995; Evans 1982).

Bodily IEM has been taken by some as evidence that the self is embodied. For instance, Evans (1982) and Cassam (1997) use bodily IEM as an argument against the Cartesian view of the self. In a nutshell, one can self-ascribe bodily properties as well as mental properties to the self without self-identification. Hence the object of such judgments, the self, is not a Cartesian ego, but a bodily subject of both mental and physical properties. However, others wonder if one is entitled to draw such a metaphysical conclusion from the epistemological fact of bodily IEM (Chen 2011; J. Smith 2006). Some further deny that bodily self-ascriptions display the same type of IEM as mental self-ascriptions (Shoemaker 1968; Coliva 2012). The IEM of pain self-ascriptions, for instance, is said to be absolute or logical. On this view, there is no possible world in which one can feel pain and be mistaken about who is feeling pain. By contrast, one can easily conceive a case of a cross-wiring scenario such that A is connected through A’s proprioceptive system both to A’s body and to B’s body. Then A can feel B’s legs being crossed. The question then is whether this cross-wiring scenario invalidates bodily IEM. One can also wonder about actual breach of bodily IEM, such as the rubber hand illusion in which subjects self-ascribe a hand that does not belong to them (Mizumoto & Ishikawa 2005). However, one might reply that none of these thought experiments or bodily illusions show that bodily sensations fail to guarantee IEM because the epistemic grounds of bodily self-ascriptions in these cases differ from ordinary somatosensory judgments (Salje 2017; Vignemont 2012). At most, they show that bodily IEM is only de facto (Evans 1982).

To recapitulate, although the debate of IEM has mainly focused on the ascription of mental states, the ascription of bodily properties raises three major questions: (i) Can bodily self-ascriptions be immune to error, and if so, what are the appropriate grounds that secure bodily IEM? (ii) Is bodily IEM of a different type from mental IEM? (iii) Does bodily IEM reveal the bodily nature of the self?

1.3 The body from the outside

As just seen, it is generally assumed that vision, and other external senses, do not guarantee bodily IEM. Ernst Mach famously reported stepping onto a bus and noticing a man who looked like a shabby pedagogue. In fact, he was seeing himself in a large mirror at the far end of the bus (Mach 1914). Conversely, if we see a broken arm, we can mistake it for our own, although it is another person’s arm that is mixed up with ours (Wittgenstein 1958). On the basis of such examples, it is said that no judgement based on external senses is immune to error through misidentification. There is a gap between visually knowing that a body is F and visually knowing that it is my own body that is F. Consequently, when people discuss bodily awareness, they rarely mean the visual awareness one can have of one’s body.

Some, however, are opposed to such a contrast between external senses and body senses. For instance, the psychologist Gibson (1979) argues that even while looking at the external world, our visual experiences carry information about our own body:

I maintain that all the perceptual systems are propriosensitive as well as exterosensitive, for they all provide information in their various ways about the observer’s activities… Information that is specific to the self is picked up as such, no matter what sensory nerve is delivering impulses to the brain. (Gibson 1979: 115)

The fact is that when I have the visual experience of a tree in front of me, I cannot have the following doubt: “someone is standing in front of a tree, but is it I?” (Evans 1982: 222). Evans concludes that visual experiences of the external world from an egocentric perspective guarantee the IEM of self-locating judgments (Cassam 1995; Bermúdez 1998; Peacocke 2012; Schwenkler 2014). Likewise, one may argue that visual experiences of the body could also guarantee IEM in some ecologically valid situations (Evans 1982: 220 fn 26; Peacocke 2012). Proprioception guarantees bodily IEM because of some biological facts about the human body (i.e., the proprioceptive neural system is connected only to one’s own body). In the same vein, one may suggest that there are some other basic biological facts that secure the link between certain visual contents and one’s own body. For instance, I can see my nose if I close one eye and I cannot doubt that this is my own nose when I see it from this specific angle.

The fact that the inside mode exclusively results from body senses, with no influence from external senses, has also been questioned by recent empirical evidence (Stein & Meredith 1993; Ernst 2006; van Beers et al. 1999; Welch & Warren 1980). Information from one modality can affect information in another modality. Multisensory effects occur very early on in sensory processing and they are often automatic and mandatory. Consequently, the ‘normal’ way of gaining bodily self-knowledge is not on the basis of body senses only, but rather on the basis of their integration with vision. Take the rubber hand illusion, which results from the incorrect integration of somatosensory information and visual information about the rubber hand. It induces not only a sense of ownership for the rubber hand, but also proprioceptive drift (i.e., one mislocalizes one’s hand in the direction of the location of the rubber hand) and referred sensation of touch (i.e., one feels touch on the rubber hand). It can be explained by three major facts about the sensory systems. First, optimal estimates of bodily properties require combination of information from various sensory channels. Second, vision can dominate over proprioception and touch because it often offers more accurate and precise spatial information. Third, visual information can affect the phenomenal content of bodily experiences. What we feel is determined not only by information from body senses, but also by information from external senses. Our access to the intrinsic properties of our body is also partly based on vision. Although O’Shaughnessy (1989: 56) claims that that our body image is nothing more than a collection of information from body senses, it has been found that blind individuals have a less accurate representation of the size of their body parts compared to sighted individuals (Kinsbourne & Lempert 1980: 37). The fact is that vision is the only sensory modality that can directly and reliably (though not perfectly) process size information (Longo & Haggard 2010). As concluded by the neurologist Schilder (1935: 38) a long time before multisensory research had started to take off:

It is not the case that the schema of the body has two different parts, the one optic and the other tactile. It is in essence a synaesthesia (…) The synaesthesia, therefore, is the normal situation.

The notion of multimodality has become of interest to philosophers only recently (Bennett and Hill, 2014; O’Callaghan 2020). Unfortunately, there is already little agreement in philosophy on the way to individuate the modalities themselves, let alone on how to understand multimodality. One crucial question is whether these multisensory effects show that vision plays only a causal role in fixing the spatial content of bodily experiences or whether bodily experiences are constitutively multimodal (Vignemont 2014). One may also ask whether some features can be represented only thanks to multisensory integration (Briscoe forthcoming). A final question is whether multimodality comes at the cost of bodily IEM. If bodily self-ascriptions are grounded not only in the body senses, which secure IEM, but also in vision, which does not always guarantee IEM, then can one still claim that bodily self-ascriptions are immune to error?

2. The perceptual model of bodily awareness

The previous section highlighted that I am aware from the inside only of my own body. Does it prevent bodily awareness to be perceptual? Do the body senses qualify as sensory modalities? Aristotle lists only five of them (sight, hearing, touch, olfaction, smell) and if we added the body senses, we would end up with possibly more than ten. The question then is whether these so-called body senses behave like sensory systems that lead to perceptual experiences. At first sight, it may seem that some types of bodily experiences (like touch) are perceptual, but not others (like pain, tickles, itches, thirst or hunger) because they seem subjective and incorrigible (Aydede 2009). But even if we focus on transitive bodily sensations, they differ from visual experiences on several respects. They are continuously active and they function largely outside consciousness. They often do not appear to provide a sensory field in which perceptual objects can be presented (Martin 1992, 1993; Wong 2017). Finally, there are important epistemic asymmetries, bodily sensations appearing as less reliable than visual sensations (Munro forthcoming).

Some of the worries outlined above may just evaporate if one gives up theories of perception that treat vision as the paradigm of sense perception. It is indeed controversial that every external sense, including olfaction for example, meets all the constraints posited by visuo-centric models and more recent works on perception go beyond vision (e.g., McPherson (ed) 2011; Matthen (ed) 2015; Gatzia & Broogard (eds) 2020). Furthermore, what implications, if any, do multisensory effects have for the perceptual debate? In brief, as outlined in the previous section, I am aware that legs are crossed on the basis of the integration between vision and proprioception. Does the involvement of visual information suffice to make my sense of posture perceptual?

This section will focus on four issues: the notion of the body as a perceptual object, the spatial peculiarities of bodily awareness, the alleged epistemic failure for bodily sensations to ground bodily knowledge, and the relationship between bodily awareness and action.

2.1 The body as a perceptual object

McGinn (1996: 8) claims: “bodily sensations do not have an intentional object in the way perceptual experiences do”. His view is shared by many, for at least two reasons: (i) the body cannot both anchor our perception of the world and be an object of perception for risk of infinite regress; and (ii) the body senses do not need to identify and reidentify the body since they give information about nothing else.

The first objection comes from Merleau-Ponty (1945: 92), who claims: “The body is not one more among external objects”. He draws the distinction between the objective body made of muscles and bones, and the lived body (corps propre), that is, the body that we experience in pre-reflective awareness. He argues that the lived body is not an object that can be perceived from various perspectives, left aside or localized in objective space. On the contrary, it is the zero-point (Husserl 1913), from which one can see the objective space. If one were to adopt an objective stance on the lived body, then the objectified body could no longer anchor the way one perceives the world. Likewise, Gallagher (2003) argues that bodily experiences should not be understood in perceptual terms. Using Wittgenstein’s distinction between the self as a subject and the self as an object, Gallagher argues that the lived body must be conceived as subject. Only then can it ground our conscious experience of the world. However, subjectivity is not incompatible with intentionality. Arguably, one can perceive the self as a subject (Bermúdez 1998). Furthermore, the lived body can be a perceptual object without being transformed into an object among others. Dokic (2003), for instance, claims that bodily sensations display a special kind of perceptual awareness, but it is still perceptual.

The second objection against the perceptual model follows from Shoemaker’s (1994) standard model of perception. On his view, one key condition of perception is that the way of gaining information allows for identification and re-identification of the perceived objects. The difficulty with the body senses is that they seem to give access only to a single object, namely, one’s body. Several answers have been offered to this objection. For instance, Schwenkler (2013) replies that the body senses still convey facts about different objects insofar as they convey facts about different parts of the body. It is not clear, however, whether this suffices to refute the objection. Martin (1995), on the other hand, defends what he calls the sole-object view, according to which bodily sensations are only about one’s body and when they are not, they are illusory or hallucinatory. Still, on his view, this does not prevent bodily sensations to be perceptual. One indeed experiences one’s body as a bounded object. By becoming aware of bodily boundaries, one then becomes aware of a larger space that contains one’s body as well as other objects (see also Bermúdez 1998).

2.2 The spatiality of bodily awareness

One can also question the perceptual character of bodily sensations on the basis of their peculiar spatiality. We experience sensations “at-a-part-of-body-at-a-point-in-body-relative-space” (O’Shaughnessy 1980). In Bermúdez’s (2005) terms, bodily sensations have both A-location (i.e., bodily frame of reference independent of the posture of the body) and B-location (i.e., external frame relative to the posture of the body). But how to account for A and B-location? As Merleau-Ponty (1945: 98) warns, “ordinary spatial relations do not cross” the experience of the space of the body. It seems indeed that the way we experience bodily space does not follow some basic spatial rules (Coburn 1966; Vesey 1964; Margolis 1966; K. Baier, 1964; Holly 1986). For instance, the pain that I feel in my thumb is not felt in my mouth when my thumb is in my mouth (Block 1983). Nor does it seem to make sense to claim that the pain in my thumb is far from the pain in my foot. How can one envisage accounting for bodily space in terms of Cartesian reference frame when one cannot provide a center of this frame, nor suggest axes on which one could compute distances and directions (Bermúdez 2005)? One may conclude that the claim that one feels pain in the finger does not indicate the location of the sensation, but rather the state of the finger (Noordhof 2001; for discussion see Tye 2002). One may then question whether bodily sensations themselves are intrinsically spatial. According to the Local sign theory, as defended in the 19th century by psychologists such as Wundt, Titchener and James, each sensible nerve gives rise to its own characteristic sensation that is specific to the body part that is stimulated but spatial ascription does not derive from the spatial content of bodily sensations themselves. As described by James (1890: 798), the Local sign theorists deny

that there can be in a sensation any element of actual locality, any tone as it were which cries to us immediately and without further ado, “I am here”, or “I am there”.

However, there seems to be no non-spatial differences between sensations in one’s right and left hands (Holly 1986; O’Shaughnessy 1980; Margolis 1966; Coburn 1966). How then do I feel the right or the left hand to be touched? And how to account for sensations felt to be located in phantom limbs (K. Baier 1964)? It is hard to explain spatial ascription of bodily sensations if bodily sensations are not intrinsically spatial.

According to A. D. Smith (2002), perception requires the possibility of achieving different perspectives on perceptible objects through self-movement. This comes with the existence of perceptual constancies (see Burge 2010 for the importance of perceptual constancies). However, unlike other perceptual objects, the body cannot be felt from different perspectives. Smith thus claims that bodily sensations are mere sensations; they do not count as perceptual. Likewise, Matthen (forthcoming) distinguishes within the sense of touch the tactual sensation on one’s skin and the haptic perception of the object. These are two distinct types of experiences and only haptic experiences are truly spatial, and thus truly perceptual. On the contrary, Martin (1992) claims that there is no reason to draw a distinction within tactile experiences: one can simply shift one’s attention from the bodily side to the exteroceptive side of the same perceptual experience (see also O’Shaughnessy 1989). Nonetheless, according to Martin (1992), touch differs from vision insofar as it has no unified tactile field equivalent to the visual field (see also Richardson 2013; Hopkins 2011).

2.3 Knowledge without observation

A different type of criticism of the perceptual model of bodily awareness can be found in Wittgenstein (1978), and later Anscombe (1962). They claim that the ability to report how the limbs are located and how they move does not depend on sensations of position. It thus differs from perceptual knowledge. I know that the sky is blue in virtue of having a visual experience of the blueness of the sky but I know that my legs are crossed independently of any sensation. According to Anscombe, bodily knowledge cannot be grounded in sensations because only sensations whose content is “independently describable” can play an epistemic role. The sense of position is thus what Anscombe calls a kind of knowledge without observation: “It is without observation, because nothing shews him the position of his limbs” (Anscombe 1957: 13).

The interpretation of the notion of knowledge without observation has given rise to many debates. A first concerns Anscombe’s epistemological theory. Why do contents have to be independent to ground judgments? The second problem is that it seems that her argument ultimately relies on her phenomenological intuitions: “no question of any appearance of the position to me, of any sensations which give me the position” (Anscombe 1962). However, one may question this claim on the basis of bodily illusions (Harcourt 2008; for a reply, McDowell 2011). For instance, if the tendon of the biceps is vibrated, one can “feel” one’s arm moving though one knows the arm actually remains still. But does that suffice to show that the sensation is independently describable? The problem is that the notion of independent description is not clear. Why does “the visual impression of a blue expanse” (Anscombe 1962: 57) qualify as independent but not the impression of one’s arm moving? It may sometimes be difficult to see why bodily awareness does not fall into the same category as perceptual awareness.

2.4 Bodily awareness and action

Interestingly, both the phenomenological and the analytic traditions that reject the perceptual model emphasize the role of action and bodily know-how in their account of bodily awareness. Anscombe describes knowledge without observation as a form of practical knowledge. In a nutshell, knowing that your legs are crossed is not feeling them to be crossed; it is knowing how to uncross them. Along the same lines, Merleau-Ponty claims that the lived body is a space of possibilities for actions. There is, however, a major difference. For the phenomenologist tradition, what we feel is determined by what we know how to do. For Anscombe, on the contrary, we do not feel anything. Instead, one should say that what we report is determined by what we know how to do. Furthermore, the emphasis on action does not necessarily entail giving up the perceptual model of bodily awareness and one should be careful distinguishing the two claims.

Two main sensorimotor views of perceptual awareness have indeed recently been proposed (see Entry on Action-based theories of perception). According to the enactive approach, perceptual experiences consist in sensorimotor expectations (O’Regan & Noë 2001; Noë 2004; Hurley 1998; Thompson 2005; O’Regan 2011). According to the dispositional approach, the spatial content of perceptual experiences is made possible by dispositions to act (Evans 1982; Brewer 1995; Briscoe 2009; A. J. T. Smith 2009; Mandrigin forthcoming). Despite apparent similarities, the two views make different claims. The enactive view aims to account for consciousness in general, for its phenomenal character (O’Regan 2011). By contrast, the dispositional account applies only to egocentric content. Furthermore, the enactive view makes a constitutive claim: bodily experiences are inseparable from sensorimotor expectations (for discussion of the constitutive claim, see Block 2005). By contrast, the dispositional view does not claim that the spatial content represents dispositions to act. It only makes “a claim about the conditions under which a visual experience will have such content” (Briscoe 2014: 208).

A major challenge for the sensorimotor approaches is to account for dissociations between perception and action. Such dissociations have been found for vision, leading Milner and Goodale (1995) to propose a dual model of visual processing: the ventral pathway is dedicated to conscious perception whereas the dorsal pathway is dedicated to visuomotor transformation perception. Dissociations have also been reported in the case of bodily awareness. For instance, patients with numbsense have no tactile awareness, but retain a surprising ability to point to where they were touched (Paillard et al., 1983; see also Anema et al. 2009 for further dissociation). The rubber hand illusion as well indicates that bodily know-how can be at odds with bodily experiences: participants accurately grasp the stimulated hand with their opposite hand at its real location, and not at the illusory location that they report (Kammers et al. 2009). Proponents of the enactive view may have difficulties accounting for this type of results, which indicate that sensorimotor knowledge is neither necessary nor sufficient for bodily experiences (Vignemont 2011). However, perception-action dissociations are less problematic for the dispositional view (Mandrigin forthcoming).

We have just asked whether bodily awareness requires action. But one may also ask whether action requires bodily awareness (O’Shaughnessy 2000; Wong 2015). Action requires detailed information about the long-term and short-term properties of the bodily effectors. But does the information need to reach the threshold of awareness, even at the margin? Action requires fast processing of information, whereas bodily awareness takes time. Furthermore, deafferented subjects who have no kinaesthetic and tactile awareness of their body retain their ability to control their movements as long as they receive visual feedback. Hence, kinaesthetic experiences do not seem to be necessary for action. The body is not always immediately present in all its details to the subject, even when acting. Yet as Descartes pointed out, we are not like pilots in a ship. The difference is that we are able to feel our ship from the inside. Hence, there must still be a connection, still to be explored, between our capacity to act directly with our body and our capacity to feel our body from the inside (Wong 2015).

3. Mental representations and the body

When one discusses the relationship between bodily awareness and action, one frequently appeals to the notion of body schema. It is used, however, in many different ways. One of the main controversies is whether it should be conceived as a specific type of mental representation of the body. For Merleau-Ponty (1945), and more recently for Gallagher (2008), the body schema should be conceived as a sensorimotor function, devoid of intentional content. Their definition is in line with a general trend in the last thirty years that rejects the necessity to posit representations in the mind (Gallagher 2008; Thelen & Smith 1994; Turvey & Carello 1995; van Gelder 1995; Thompson 2005; Zahavi & Parnas 1998). On this view, representations are inadequate because they are too costly and they are unnecessary because they can be easily replaced by sensorimotor loops. The body ca be conceived as “its own best model”, to use Brooks’s (1991) expression. If biological systems only know what they need to in order to get their job done (Clark 1997), is the body really something that the brain needs to represent in this sense? All that may be needed is to pay attention to it (Kinsbourne 1995; Hochstetter 2016).

3.1 Why body representations?

Until the end of the 19th century, bodily awareness was typically understood in terms of a bundle of internal bodily sensations. Bonnier (1905) first introduced the term schema to refer to the spatial organization of these bodily sensations. But it was only in Head and Holmes (1911)’s fundamental paper (discussed in the next section) that one finds the first systematic analysis of the way(s) the brain represents the body. They initiated what might be called the representationalist approach to bodily awareness (e.g., O’Shaughnessy 1980; Bermúdez 1998; Vignemont 2018; Carruthers 2008; Alsmith forthcoming; Murillo Lara 2018). Proponents of the representationalist approach claim that in order to account for bodily awareness one needs to appeal to mental representations of the body. According to a minimal definition, a body representation is an internal structure that has the function to track the state of the body and encode it, that can misrepresent it and that can be decoupled from it. It plays the role of model that represents in virtue of its resemblance to the structure of the body (Alsmith forthcoming; Gadsby & Williams 2018). Now the question is why positing such internal models.

The first reason is to account for disturbances in bodily awareness. Most of the literature on body representation can be found in patient studies (Head & Holmes 1911; Lhermitte 1942; Cole & Paillard 1995, Schwoebel & Coslett 2005; Sirigu et al. 1991; Gadsby 2017). With the help of the notion of body representation, and thus of body misrepresentation, one can easily explain how the way the body is experienced can be at odds with the physical reality of the body. On the one hand, amputated patients can still feel the presence of their absent limb because the physically missing limb is still represented. On the other hand, patients with xenomelia can wish their perfectly healthy limbs to be amputated because these limbs are not incorporated in their body representation (Hilti & Brugger 2010).

The second reason focuses on the spatial organization of bodily awareness (Bonnier 1905; O’Shaughnessy 1980, 1995; Murillo Lara 2018). Over an extended period, all bodily experiences share the same spatial content of the structural shape of the body. To account for this commonality, O’Shaughnessy posits the existence of a long-term body image that plays a structural role in spatially shaping bodily experiences. One may then propose a hierarchical model of body representations on the model of Marr’s theory of vision: the primal sketch, the 2.5D sketch, and the 3D sketch (Marr 1982). At each step, more information is extracted from the original sensory input until it switches from a viewer-centered perspective to an object-centered perspective. At each stage, the representation of the body gains in complexity and spatial richness (Longo 2017; Haggard et al. 2017). The level of the primary somatosensory area (SI) corresponds to the primal body sketch, which takes the shape of a “homunculus” (Penfield & Rasmussen, 1950). Although it generally follows natural anatomical divisions, associating cortical areas to specific parts of the body, some are over-represented (e.g., hand), and others under-represented (e.g., torso). Furthermore, the homunculus does not represent anatomical contiguity (e.g., the hand-specific area is next to the face-specific area). Consequently, the primal body sketch cannot play the role of supplying information about body metrics and configuration (Medina & Coslett 2016). This is done at a higher level of integration (integration among body parts and among multiple sensory sources), at which a kind of 3D body sketch is generated. Its function is to reliably covariate with the spatial organization and dimensions of the body and its segments, in order to spatially organize information coming from the body senses. This level of body representation is partly independent from online inputs.

The body model thus seems to play an explanatory role. It remains unclear, however, what kind of representation it consists in. On one interpretation, it can be conceived as a kind of scenario in Peacocke’s (1992) sense. A scenario is a nonconceptual, analogue, unit-free, spatial representation that uses a set of labelled axes in relation to body parts. Peacocke describes scenarios that depict the subject’s environment, but arguably, one can have a scenario that depicts the subject’s body, with similar properties. On another interpretation, it can be conceived as an action-orientated representation (Brewer 1995; Bermúdez 2005):

The intrinsic spatial content of normal bodily awareness is given directly in terms of practical knowledge how to act in connection with the bodily locations involved. (Brewer 1995: 302)

3.2 Taxonomies of body representations

Now one may ask whether we have only one model that depicts the whole body or whether it is sufficient to have a collection of local models (Alsmith forthcoming). Try, for instance, using a hand to touch your foot whilst using the other to touch your face. To perform this task, is it sufficient to have local body models that represent individual body parts? Or do we also need a global body representation whose function would be to structure these local representations?

One may further ask whether one can functionally defined different types of body representations. One single body representation does not seem to suffice to account for the variety of bodily disorders and for the variety of aspects of bodily awareness. There needs to be more, but how many? In 1911, Head and Holmes present the first taxonomy of the representations of the body. In addition to what they call a body image, which constitutes the conscious percept of the body, they distinguish two types of unconscious representations, called body schemata: one records every new posture or movement whereas the other maps the surface of the body on which sensations are localized. However, for a long time, the terms of body schema and body image had been used interchangeably (see Schilder 1935, for instance), whereas the fine-grained distinction between the two types of body schema had almost completely disappeared. Nonetheless, since the eighties there has been a renewal of interest for distinguishing various types of body representation (O’Shaughnessy 1980; Paillard 1999; Gallagher 1986), although there is little agreement, neither on the way to individuate the distinct types of body representations, nor on their precise number. Here is a sample of the characteristics that have been used so far to distinguish them:

  • Availability to consciousness (unconscious/conscious)
  • Dynamics (short-term/long-term)
  • Functional role (action/perception)
  • Format (sensorimotor/visuo-spatial/linguistic/affective)
  • Modality of input (proprioception/vision/interoception)
  • Bodily information (enduring properties such as body metrics/body posture/internal balance)
  • Perspective (first-person/third-person)
  • Direction of fit (mind-to-world/world-to-mind)

These distinctions give rise to different taxonomies (e.g., Schwoebel & Coslett 2005; Sirigu et al. 1991; Paillard 1999; Dijkerman & de Haan 2007; O’Shaughnessy 1980; Gallagher 1995), which sometimes lead to opposite interpretations of the very same bodily disorders. For instance, personal neglect (i.e., lack of exploration of half of the body) has been interpreted as resulting from a deficit of body schema (Coslett 1998), or from a deficit of body image (Gallagher 1995). Furthermore, although most taxonomies rely on neuropsychological dissociations, it does not seem likely that they can account for all bodily disorders. Even three types of body representation might not suffice to explain all the possible dissociations. On the other hand, one may wish to avoid a quasi-infinite list of body representations.

Even the definition of the body schema, which appears the less controversial notion, often remains vague. The term ‘body schema’ functions as a general term that groups together various body representations intervening at different stages in motor control, representing short-term or long-term body properties, used for positive or negative affordances. It is commonly defined as the representation of the body for action. But many states can contribute to action planning, including some very high-level states. Imagine for instance that you want to cut a cake into six equal slices. To do so, you can exploit your mathematical knowledge that 360 degrees divided by 6 equals 60 degrees. This knowledge can guide your hand while splitting the cake. Your ability to do maths can thus play a role in guiding your action, but clearly, the body schema must be more intimately connected to action. What makes the body schema so special? The type of information that it represents? The way this information is represented? Or the function of the representation? Furthermore, the distinction between the body schema and the body image has become the stock in trade of much recent work in cognitive neuroscience and philosophy. Yet little is known about the interactions between these two types of body representations (Gadsby 2018; Pitron, Alsmith, & Vignemont 2018). In our everyday life the body we perceive does not conflict with the body we act with. One needs to account not only for dissociations in rare cases, but also for convergence most of the time.

4. The sense of body ownership

According to Peacocke (2014, 2017), we must distinguish among three degrees of self-representations:

  • Degree 0: Mental states that do not represent anything as standing in certain relations to the subject. For example, a proprioceptive experience with nonconceptual content of the type [this leg is bent].
  • Degree 1: Mental states whose nonconceptual content represents the subject as standing in relations to other objects and events. For example, a proprioceptive experience with nonconceptual content of the type [my leg is bent].
  • Degree 2: Mental states that can use the conceptual first person. For example, a proprioceptive judgment with conceptual content of the type [my leg is bent].

Theories of the sense of bodily ownership try to answer the following question: how does one go from degree 0 to degree 2, from a proprioceptive experience with the nonconceptual content [this leg is bent] to a proprioceptive judgment with the conceptual content [my leg is bent]? These theories pursue two objectives. First, to avoid positing new phenomenal properties unless necessary (Wu forthcoming). Secondly, to account for empirical data. On the one hand, the rubber hand illusion provides an experimental window in what is required for one to experience a hand as one’s own. On the other hand, one needs to understand how it is possible for an individual not to experience one’s limb as one’s own in disownership syndromes, as in somatoparaphrenia (Romano & Maravita 2019), depersonalization disorder (Billon 2017), Cotard syndrome (Billon 2015, 2016), and xenomelia (Brugger et al. 2013), as well as in chronic pain (Moseley et al. 2012) and complex post-traumatic disorder (Ataria 2018). The interpretation of these various results, however, is controversial (Alsmith 2015; Wu forthcoming; Bradley forthcoming; Chadha 2018), and at most one can only offer an inference to the best explanation.

4.1 The feeling of myness

The notion of myness, which can be defined as the de se property of belonging to the subject, has recently attracted increasing attention in the literature (Guillot 2017; Guillot & García-Carpintero forthcoming). The hypothesis then is that one experiences one’s body as one’s own in virtue of having a feeling of myness. Nonconceptual myness content can then provide rational ground for conceptual myness content. The myness hypothesis, however, is not without raising a number of controversies and most recent views have rejected it (Alsmith 2015; Bermúdez 2011; Chadha 2018; Martin 1995; Vignemont 2020; Wu forthcoming). A first worry concerns the origin of myness. Unless one posits myness as an irreducible primitive phenomenal property (Billon 2017), the nonconceptual myness content itself requires explanation. Another worry is that it does not seem salient in our phenomenology. Chadha (2018) argues that by default, the content of bodily experiences is not self-referential. On her view, disownership syndromes do not result from the lack of myness, but from an unusual feeling of the hand not being one's own. One may also argue that the feeling of myness is not compatible with a parsimonious conception of the admissible contents of perception, according to which only low-level somatosensory properties such as pressure, joint angle, and temperature can be represented in the content of bodily experiences. Finally, Bermúdez (2011, 2015, 2018) appeals to Anscombe’s argument for knowledge without observation. He argues that one cannot give a separately describable description of the feeling of myness, which thus cannot constitute a legitimate ground for ownership judgments.

Denying the existence of myness feelings, however, does not entail denying the phenomenology of ownership:

ownership is phenomenologically salient … when we experience our bodies we experience them as our own … there is a phenomenology of ownership. (Bermúdez 2015: 38)

In other terms, it makes a phenomenological difference when one is not aware of one’s body as one’s own and when one is not. The question then is how to best interpret this phenomenological difference: in sensory terms (Wu forthcoming; Bermúdez 2011; Martin 1995; Dokic 2003), in cognitive terms (Alsmith 2015), in agentive terms (Peacocke 2017), or in affective terms (Vignemont 2018).

4.2 The deflationary conception

According to what Bermúdez (2011: 167) calls the deflationary conception,

the sense of ownership consists, first, in certain facts about the phenomenology of bodily sensations and, second, in certain fairly obvious judgments about the body (which we can term judgments of ownership).

Likewise, Martin (1995: 278) states that the sense of ownership is not an additional quality to the sensory qualities of bodily experiences and that it is “somehow already inherent within them”. For instance, in the rubber hand illusion participants do not report only ownership towards the rubber hand, but also referred tactile sensations on the fake hand. One may then argue that experiencing the rubber hand as one’s own is nothing more than feeling sensations in it (Wu forthcoming). One intuitive way to spell out the deflationary conception is indeed in spatial terms: “when one feels a bodily sensation to have a location there is no issue over whose body it appears to belong to” (Martin 1992: 201). Martin claims that the spatial phenomenology can account for the sense of ownership because there is an identity between one’s own body and the body in which one locates bodily experiences. According to the sole-object view that he defends, for an instance of bodily experience to count as an instance of perception, it must indeed be an experience of what is in fact the subject’s actual body. However, one can be aware of the boundaries of one’s body without being aware of the boundaries of one’s body qua one’s own (Dokic 2003; Serrahima forthcoming). A further problem for all deflationary conceptions comes from dissociation between bodily sensations and the sense of ownership. They indeed predict that it is inconceivable for one to experience sensations in a limb and fail to experience this limb as one’s own (Martin 1995; Dokic 2003). However, it has been found that patients with disownership syndromes can still experience some bodily experiences (e.g., Moro et al. 2004). The question then is whether this type of results can invalidate the deflationary conception or not (Bradley forthcoming).

4.3 The cognitive conception

Instead of appealing to the way one perceives one’s body, one can appeal to the way one thinks about one’s body in order to account for the sense of ownership:

A cognitive account of the sense of ownership holds that one experiences something as one’s own only if one thinks of something as one’s own. (Alsmith 2015: 881)

The cognitive conception does not preclude the existence of a phenomenology of ownership, at least if one grants the possibility of cognitive phenomenology (as in noetic feelings, for instance).

The question then is how to account for the fact that the sense of ownership (or its lack) is cognitively impenetrable. Participants in the rubber hand experiment are aware that the rubber hand is a fake hand and they rarely endorse the belief that the rubber hand is their own hand. Vice-versa: some patients know that their hand belongs to them, and yet it still seems to them as if it did not, as described by this patient: ‘my eyes and my feelings don’t agree, and I must believe my feelings. I know they look like mine, but I can feel they are not, and I can’t believe my eyes’ (Nielsen 1938: 555). Cognitive impenetrability is classically taken as the signature of experiential states. For instance, in the Müller-Lyer illusion one cannot help but experience the two lines as being different despite having the belief that they are actually of the same size. However, there are attitudes other than feelings and sensations that can be immune to the influence of beliefs (McDowell 2011). The question then is what kind of attitude: propositional imagination (Alsmith 2015), agreement towards a proposition (Wu forthcoming), perceptual seeming (Lyons 2011), or alief (Gendler 2008). Whatever attitude it may be, it will have to be not only cognitive impenetrable, but also beyond the subject’s control. Subjects cannot decide at will to experience the rubber hand illusion. In the case of disownership syndromes, it also seems that the attitude they are in should be affectively-loaded. Patients indeed are greatly distressed when they report that they do not feel their hand as their own.

4.4 The agentive conception

Many theories appeal to the notion of action in relation to the sense of ownership, and even more to the sense of disownership. The fact is that disownership syndromes often involve some more or less extreme motor impairment. Most somatoparaphrenic patients are paralyzed, and those who are not suffer from the Anarchic hand sign (that is, they cannot control their limb, which seems to have a will of its own). Patients frequently complain about the uselessness of their ‘alien’ limb. There are then several ways the agentive conception has been spelled out: in terms of body schema (Vignemont 2007), agentive feelings (B. Baier & Karnath 2008), or general agentive ability (Peacocke 2017). The challenge that the various versions face is that the sense of bodily ownership can be preserved in patients who are paralyzed or who have lost the awareness of their actions as their own. For example, anarchic patients report that they have no control over their limbs but they still claim that their limbs belong to them (Marchetti & Della Salla 1998). The rubber hand illusion is also difficult to account for agentive conceptions. It has been shown that there is no agentive contrast between synchronous and asynchronous conditions, not only at the phenomenological level (subjects report no agentive feelings toward the rubber hand, Longo et al. 2008), but also at the sensorimotor level (the way they perform their movements is not altered by the illusion, Kammers et al. 2009). Peacocke’s (2017) agency-involving account may then seem the most promising because it appeals to the notion of action at a relatively high level of generality. On his view (Peacocke 2017: 293), a subject can experience that this is her own hand if and only if:

  1. there is a range of action notions A for which the creature must be capable of being in mental states… with the content c is A-ing where the state… is produced by the initiation of an A-ing by the reference of c;
  2. there is a range of notions F of bodily properties, spatial properties, and past tense properties F such that the creature is capable of being in mental states… with the content c is F; where in these attributions, c is F is accepted (in central basic cases) if and only if this body is F is also accepted.

Paralyzed patients still know what it is like to act and that should be sufficient for them to still feel their inert limbs as their own (Peacocke 2019). One might also say that in the rubber hand illusion, participants know what it is like to act with a hand in general although they do not feel they could act with this specific rubber hand. However, this account puts so few constraints on what it takes to experience one’s body as one’s own, that one may wonder how it is even possible to lose the sense of bodily ownership. What is the agency-involving difference between the paralyzed patients who deny ownership and those who do not?

4.5 The affective conception

These last 20 years have seen an explosion of experimental work on interoception. Recent accounts of interoception have highlighted its role for self- awareness, positing it at the core of what is sometimes called the “sentient self” (Craig 2003), the “proto- self” (Damasio 1999), the “embodied self” (Seth 2013), or the “material me” (Tsakiris 2017). Even Descartes in his Meditations on First Philosophy take interoceptive feelings to be the key for our unique relationship with our body:

Nature likewise teaches me by these sensations of pain, hunger, thirst, etc., that I am not only lodged in my body as a pilot in a vessel. (Descartes 1641 [2016] Meditation VI, p. 56)

However, even if interoception can ground some notion of the self, it is not clear that it is specifically involved in the sense of bodily ownership. Imagine a creature that only receives interoceptive signals. It receives information about its body, and its body only. But there is a difference between self-specificity (information exclusively about the body that happens to be one’s own) and self-reference (awareness of the body qua one’s own). The problem is that on the basis of interoception only, there is no need to discriminate the inside from the outside since the body is only an inside. It is so fixated on its own body that it can dispense with representing whose body is hungry or thirsty. The fact is that one usually says “I am thirsty”, without any reference to bodily ownership, let alone to the body.

There is, however, another way to spell out the affective conception without appealing to interoception. Instead it appeals to the notion of affective significance (Vignemont 2018). On what is called the Bodyguard hypothesis, there is a specific affective phenomenology that goes over and above the sensory phenomenology of bodily experiences. It expresses the unique value of the body for the self, a value that is evolutionarily rooted. In brief, survival involves preservation of one’s body. The sense of ownership then individuates the one body that matters to the subject for self-preservation more than anything else. In line with this view, it has been found that participants who report ownership for the rubber hand display an increase of arousal when the rubber hand is under threat (Ehrsson et al. 2007). Vice-versa, patients with somatoparaphrenia show no increase in arousal when they see the hand that they felt as alien under threat (Romano et al. 2014).

One may object that evolutionary significance is only a consequence of the fact of bodily ownership: this body matters because it is mine. Consequently, affective phenomenology should be just the consequence of the sense of bodily ownership: I feel that this body matters because I am aware that it is mine. However, one may reply that what happens to the body that has this significance happens to me. Why is it so? One possibility is that it is because I am my body or more simply because we evolved in a world such that for the self to survive, its body must survive. Hence, for my body to have such significance is for it to be the body to protect for the organism’s evolutionary needs. Biology here provides an independent ground to the notion of significance. The impact on what happens on this body for oneself gives immediate ground for labeling it as one’s own. Hence, one is entitled to judge that this is one’s own body when one feels that this body matters in this special way, because under normal circumstances the body that matters in such a way is one’s own body.

5. Conclusion

Bodily awareness reveals a new rich territory for philosophical exploration in its own right, but it also provides a new approach to general issues of perception, action, self and space. Empirical research on body representations, bodily sensations, bodily illusions, and self-awareness has grown exponentially. A comprehensive understanding of bodily awareness will likely require taking on board its insights.


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