Representational Theories of Consciousness

First published Mon May 22, 2000; substantive revision Thu Oct 19, 2023

The idea of representation has been central in discussions of intentionality for many years. But only more recently has it begun playing a wider role in the philosophy of mind, particularly in theories of consciousness. Indeed, there are now multiple representational theories of consciousness, corresponding to different uses of the term “conscious,” each attempting to explain the corresponding phenomenon in terms of representation. More cautiously, each theory attempts to explain its target phenomenon in terms of intentionality, and assumes that intentionality is representation.

An intentional state represents an object, real or unreal (say, Mage or Pegasus), and typically represents a whole state of affairs, one which may or may not actually obtain (say, that Mage wins the Kentucky Derby again in 2024). Like public, social cases of representation such as writing or mapmaking, intentional states such as beliefs have truth-value; they entail or imply other beliefs; they are (it seems) composed of concepts and depend for their truth on a match between their internal structures and the way the world is; and so it is natural to regard their aboutness as a matter of mental referring or designation. Sellars (1956, 1967) and Fodor (1975) argue that intentional states are states of a subject that have semantical properties, and the existent-or-nonexistent states of affairs that are their objects are just representational contents.

So much is familiar and not very controversial. But problems of consciousness are generally felt to be less tractable than matters of intentionality. The aim of a representationalist theory of consciousness is to extend the treatment of intentionality to that of consciousness, showing that if intentionality is well understood in representational terms, then so can be the phenomena of consciousness in whichever sense of that fraught term.

The notions of consciousness most commonly addressed by philosophers are the following: (1) “Conscious states” in the very specific sense of: states whose subjects are directly, internally aware of them. (2) Introspection and one’s privileged access to the internal character of one’s experience itself. (3) Being in a sensory state that has a distinctive qualitative property, such as the color one experiences in having a visual experience, or the timbre of a heard sound. (4) The phenomenal matter of “what it’s like” for the subject to be in a particular mental state, especially what it is like for that subject to experience a particular qualitative property as in (3). Block (1995) and others have used “phenomenal consciousness” for sense (4), without distinguishing it from sense (3). (A further terminological complication is that some theorists, such as Dretske (1995) and Tye (1995), have used the expression “what it’s like” to mean the qualitative property itself, rather than the present higher-order property of that property. This entry will mainly use “qualitative” to allude to sensory qualities of the sort that figure in (3), and “phenomenal” as applying to “what it’s like.”)

For each of the four foregoing notions of consciousness, some philosophers have claimed that that type of consciousness is entirely or largely explicable as a kind of representing. This entry will deal mainly with representational theories of consciousness in senses (3) and (4). The leading representational approaches to (1) and (2) are “higher-order representation” theories, which divide into “inner sense” or “higher-order perception” views, “acquaintance” accounts, and “higher-order thought” theories. For discussion of those, see the entry on higher-order theories of consciousness.

1. Qualitative Character as Representation

Qualitative properties and phenomenal features of mental states are each often called “qualia” (singular, “quale”). In recent philosophy of mind that term has been used in a number of confusingly different ways. There is a specific, fairly strict sense that comes to us from C.I. Lewis (1929) by way of Goodman (1951) (though there is plenty of room for exegetical disagreement about Lewis’ own usage). A quale in this sense is a qualitative property inhering in a sensory state: the color of an after-image, or that of a more ordinary patch in one’s visual field; the pitch or volume or timbre of a subjectively heard sound; the smell of an odor; a particular taste; the perceived texture of an object encountered by touch. (The term “inhering in” in the preceding sentence is deliberately vague, and neutral on as many metaphysical issues as possible. In particular, qualia may be properties of the experiences in which they inhere, or they may be related to those experiences in some other way.) For reasons that will become clear, we may call this sense of “qualia” the “first-order” sense. Notice that it differs from the broader and vaguer sense defined in the entry on qualia (“the introspectively accessible, phenomenal aspects of our mental lives”), and from the much more heavily laden sense of Block (1990, 1995, 1996), according to which “qualia” are by stipulative definition neither functional nor intentional properties. To avoid further confusion, let us speak of sensory qualities.

A sensory quality can be thought of as the distinctive property of an apparent phenomenal individual. An “apparent phenomenal individual” is anything of the sort that Bertrand Russell would have taken to be a “sense-datum,” such as (again) a colored region of one’s visual field, or a heard sound or an experienced smell. But it is important to see that qualities of this kind do not presuppose the existence of sense-data or other exotica. Sensory fields are pervaded by such qualities both in everyday veridical experience and in less usual cases. In our first-order sense of the “q”-word, the latter point is the merest common sense, and to deny it would be to take a very radical position. Of course philosophers will immediately debate the nature of these commonsensical qualities and further claims about them, but it is generally agreed that that they are introspectible, apparently monadic or nonrelational, and describable in ordinary English words such as “green,” “loud,” and “sweet” (though it may be questioned whether those words have just the same senses as when they are applied to physical objects and events).

Sensory qualities pose a serious problem for materialist theories of the mind. For where, ontologically speaking, are they located? Suppose Bertie is experiencing a green after-image as a result of seeing a red flash bulb go off; the greenness of the after-image is the quality. Actual Russellian sense-data are immaterial individuals; so the materialist cannot admit that the greenness of the after-image is a property of an actual sense-datum. Nor is it plausible to suggest that the greenness is exemplified by anything physical in the brain (if there is some green physical thing in your brain, you are probably in big trouble). To sharpen the problem:

  1. Bertie is experiencing a green thing.
  2. Suppose that there is no physical green thing outside Bertie’s head. But
  3. There is no physical green thing inside Bertie’s head either.
  4. If it is physical, the green thing is either outside Bertie’s head or inside it. Thus,
  5. The green thing is not physical. [1,2,3,4] Thus,
  6. Bertie’s experience contains a nonphysical thing. [1,5] Thus,
  7. Bertie’s experience is not, or not entirely, physical. [6]

This is a valid deductive argument against materialism, and its premises are hard to deny.

The modern representational theory of sensory qualities originates with Hall (1961), Anscombe(1965) and Hintikka (1969); early adherents include Kraut (1982), Lewis (1983), Lycan (1987, 1996), Harman (1990), Shoemaker (1994), Tye (1994, 1995, 2003a), Dretske (1995), Clark (2000), Byrne (2001), Crane (2001, 2003), and Thau (2002). The representational theory is usually (though not always) an attempt to resolve the foregoing dilemma compatibly with materialism. According to the theory, sensory qualities are actually intentional contents, represented properties of represented objects. Suppose Ludwig is seeing a real tomato in good light, and naturally it looks red to him; there is a corresponding red patch in his visual field. He is visually representing the actual redness of the tomato, and the redness of the “patch” is just the redness of the tomato itself. But suppose George Edward is hallucinating a similar tomato, and there is a tomato-shaped red patch in his visual field just as there is in Ludwig’s. George Edward too is representing the redness of an external, physical tomato. It is just that in his case the tomato is not real; it and its redness are nonactual intentional contents. But the redness is still the redness of the illusory tomato. (Note that the representation going on here is good old first-order representation of environmental features, not higher-order as in the “higher-order representation” theories of awareness.)

What about Bertie’s green after-image? On the representationalist (sometimes “intentionalist”) analysis, for Bertie to experience the green after-image is for Bertie to be visually representing a green blob located at such-and-such a spot in the room. Since in reality there is no green blob in the room with Bertie, his visual experience is unveridical; after-images are illusions. The sensory quality, the greenness of the blob, is (like the blob itself) a nonactual intentional content. Of course, in cases of veridical perception, the color and the colored object are not merely intentional contents, because they actually exist, but they are still intentional objects, representata.

And that is how the representationalist resolves our dilemma. As P1 has it, there is a green thing that Bertie is experiencing, but it is not an actual thing. That “there is” is the same lenient non-actualist “there is” that occurs in “There is something that Bertie believes in but that doesn’t exist” and in “There is at least one mythical god that the Greeks worshipped but that no one worships anymore.” (In defending his sense-data, Russell mistook a nonactual material thing for an actual immaterial thing.) Thus, P5, understood as delivering an actual green entity, does not follow.

A slightly surprising but harmless consequence of the representational view as formulated here is that sensory qualities (“qualia” in our strict first-order sense) are not themselves properties of the experiences that present them: Sensory qualities are represented properties of represented objects, and so they are only intentionally present in experiences. The relevant properties of the experiences are, representing this quality or that. Of course, one could shift the meaning slightly and speak of “qualia” as properties of experiences, identifying them with representational features, such as the feature of representing this strict-sense sensory quality or that; nothing much hangs on this terminological choice. (As before, “what it’s like” properties are something else again.)

Most representationalists agree that the perceptual representation of color and other sensible properties is “nonconceptual” in some sense—at least in that the qualitative representations need not be easily translatable into the subject’s natural language. Of course, some psychosemantics would be needed to explain what it is in virtue of which a brain item represents greenness in particular. Dretske (1995) offers one, as does Tye (1995); both accounts are teleologized versions of “indicator” semantics.

2. Varieties of Representationalism

The mere representation of redness does not suffice for something’s looking red to a subject, much less for a sensory quality of red and still less for a phenomenal “something it is like” to experience that quality. One could say the word “red” aloud, or semaphore it from a cliff, or send it in Morse code, or write the French word “rouge” on a blackboard, or point to a color chip. The representation must be specifically a visual representation, produced by either a normal human visual system or by something functionally like one. Similar points would be made for nonvisual qualities, such as subjective bitterness, which would require alluding to the gustatory system.

Thus, the representational theory of sensory qualities cannot be purely representational, but must appeal to some further factor, to distinguish visual representations from other sorts of representations of redness. Dretske (1995) cites only the fact that visual representation is sensory and what he calls “systemic.” Tye (1995) requires that the representation be nonconceptual and “poised,” though he also argues that visual representations of color would differ from other sorts of representations in being accompanied by further representational differences. Lycan (1996) appeals to functional role.

2.1 Pure, Strong, and Weak Representationalism

Thus we may distinguish different grades of representationalism about sensory qualities.

Pure representationalism would be the view that representation alone suffices for a sensory quality. But no one holds that view, for the reason just given: representation alone is cheap and ubiquitous. (Lloyd (1991) and Thau (2002) perhaps come close; Thau suggests that representing a certain special sort of content does suffice for a sensory quality.)

Strong representationalism (defended by Dretske, Tye and Lycan) is the view that representation of a certain kind suffices for a sensory quality, where the kind can be specified in functionalist or other familiar materialist terms, without recourse to properties of any ontologically “new” sort. (A mixed representational-functional view is what Block (1996) calls “quasi-representationism.”) We might further contrast (a) theories that appeal to functional considerations only to separate sensory qualities from other represented properties with (b) theories that use functional considerations more ambitiously, to distinguish qualitatively different experiences that have the same intentional content.

Weak representationalism says only that qualitative states necessarily have representational content, which admission is compatible with sensory qualities also necessarily involving features that are ontologically “new” (Block (1990, 1996), Chalmers (1996)). Weak representationalism has been fairly uncontroversial (though it would have been denied by Russell, who showed no sign of thinking that his sense-data represented anything, and by behaviorists and Wittgensteinians who are hostile to the whole idea of mental representation). At the very least, one who rejects it must try to explain why we distinguish between veridical and unveridical experiences; but more recently new opponents such as Campbell (2002), Travis (2004), Noë (2005), Brewer (2006), and Fish (2009) have attempted just that.

Throughout the rest of this entry, unless otherwise noted, “representationalism” shall mean the strong representationalist view. The mixed sort of account that Block calls “quasi-representationism” is a version of strong representationalism, since it does rule out qualitative features that are both nonintentional and nonfunctional.

Also, we shall consider strong representationalism as applying to all sensory states, including bodily sensations as well as visual and other perceptions. Weak representationalism is somewhat controversial for pains, itches and other sensations, since it is not obvious that such sensations represent anything at all. Accordingly, strong representationalism will be all the less defensible for them.

There are further issues that divide strong representationalists, generating different versions of the view. One is the question, of whether sensory qualities themselves, in our very specific sense, exhaust all of what has usually been thought of as a sensory state’s overall phenomenal character. Dretske and Tye maintain that they do; Lycan (1998) and others argue that they do not. This matter will be discussed below, in the context of what is called the “transparency” thesis.

2.2 Narrow and Wide Representationalism

A more important division is that of “narrow” vs. “wide.” In the literature on propositional attitudes beginning with Putnam (1975), the representational content of an attitude is generally thought to be “wide” in that it does not supervene on the contents of the subject’s head; on this view, two molecularly indistinguishable people could have different belief or desire contents, determined in part by objects in their respective environments. Since according to the representational theory, sensory qualities themselves are real or unreal environmental properties, the theory suggests that the qualities too are wide, and molecularly identical subjects could experience different qualities. Dretske (1996) and Lycan (1996, 2001) have explicitly defended this “phenomenal externalism,” though in our present terminology it should be called “qualitative” externalism. Some other representationalists reject this idea and believe sensory qualities to be narrow, necessarily shared by molecular duplicates. Shoemaker (1994), Horgan (2000), Kriegel (2002b), Levine (2003) and Chalmers (2004) defend narrow representationalism. (Rey (1998) calls his view “a narrow representationalist account of qualitative experience,” but it is not an account of sensory qualities in the present sense; if anything Rey favors the elimination of those qualities.) For some arguments on each side, see Section 4.6.

2.3 Representational Contents

Within wide representationalism or within narrow, there may be disagreement about what kinds of properties are represented. In the previous section, it was assumed that the putative representata are environmental features such as the colors of physical objects. But others have been suggested (Byrne (2001), Levine (2003)): e.g., perceptual experience might instead represent sense-data, or nonexistent colorish properties that physical objects do not really have. Shoemaker (1994) defends the view that a color experience represents a dispositional property, viz., the disposition to cause an experience of just that type. (Kriegel (2002b) and Levine (2003) defend versions of Shoemaker’s view in order to keep sensory qualities narrow and to handle various inversion cases.) On one interpretation at least, Thau (2002) posits a special sort of quasi-color property, distinct from but related to actual colors.

Notice that even on the straightforward view that the representata are the ostensible colors of physical objects, the representational theory does not presuppose color realism. It is true that we have been using color words such as “green” to mean public properties of physical objects, and one could not (without circularity) explicate phenomenal greenness in terms of represented real-world public color and then turn around and construe the latter real physical greenness as a mere disposition to produce sensations of phenomenal greenness, or in any other way that presupposed phenomenal greenness. But one may hold an error theory of physical color, taking the colors of physical objects to be ultimately illusory, and yet maintain that physical color concepts are explanatorily and/or conceptually prior to phenomenal ones.

(There can be more general issues, in other sense modalities, of identifying the relevant worldly representata. E.g., Gray (2003) argues that sensations of heat represent neither heat, nor temperature, nor conductivity, nor energy.)

Chalmers (2004) calls attention to the distinction between Russellian contents and Fregean contents. The former can be a singular proposition or a configuration of objects and their properties. Though the proposition may be believed (etc.) under a mode of presentation, the mode of presentation is not part of the content itself. By contrast, a Fregean content includes the mode of presentation, and does not include individual objects themselves. Representationalists have most often thought in Russellian terms about perceptual contents, but Chalmers argues that the content of a perceptual experience is Fregean. Because it neglects the objects themselves, the Fregean option would lend itself to a narrow representationalist account, if such is wanted; also, it helps to accommodate inversion examples (Section 4.4).

2.4 Reductive vs. Nonreductive

As Crane (2003) and Chalmers (2004) have pointed out, representationalism need not be reductive. One might agree with the strong representationalist that sensory qualities are identical with intentional contents, but also contend that the latter intentional content properties cannot be characterized without reference to sensory qualities, so despite the identity there cannot be reduction without circularity. Maintaining in this vein that “qualia” require a special phenomenal manner of representation and holding that that manner cannot be reduced to the functional, Chalmers defends a nonreductive representationalism. Representationalists who sympathize with the view (of, e.g., Searle (1990) and Siewert (1998)) that intentionality requires consciousness would also be motivated to remain nonreductive. Levine (2003) argues that Shoemaker’s (1994) view is nonreductive, on the grounds that it explicates the qualitative character of an experience in terms of representing a property that is in turn characterized in terms of experiences having that qualitative character (Levine does not consider the apparent circularity vicious). But many other representationalists are motivated by materialism and by the desire to reduce sensory qualities to intentionality, holding that intentionality is the more materialistically tractable of the two.

3. Arguments in Favor of the Representational Theory of Sensory Qualities

There are at least four direct arguments in favor of the representational theory.

3.1 The Argument from Materialism

Many representationalists hold that the theory not only preserves materialism while accommodating sensory qualities, but is the only very promising way of doing so. For the only viable alternative resolution of our Bertie dilemma seems to be belief in actual Russellian sense-data or at least in immaterial properties. The anti-materialist may not mind sense-data ontologically, but s/he will also inherit the nasty epistemological problems that Russell never succeeded in overcoming: If sensory experience presents us with sense-data and nothing but, the sense-data wall us off from whatever may be the rest of reality, and we are left with a justificatory gap between our beliefs about sense-data and our beliefs about the external world.

More likely, an opponent will hold the line at property dualism, as do Jackson (1982) and Chalmers (1996). That is quite bad enough for the materialist, but of course one who holds no brief for materialism in the first place will not be convinced by the present argument.

There are still nonrepresentationalist alternatives. For example, a materialist might suggest a type-identity of Bertie’s phenomenal greenness with something neurophysiological, but it is not plausible to think that a smoothly and monadically green patch in one’s visual field just is a neural state or event in one’s brain. At best, the type-identity theorist would have to do away with the important claim that greenness itself, rather than some surrogate property, figures in Bertie’s experience; the suggestion would be an error theory, and would have to explain away the intuition that, whatever the ultimate ontology, Bertie really is experiencing an instance of greenness.

Two further alternate materialist treatments of sensory qualities are an “adverbial” theory of the sort recommended by Chisholm (1957) and Sellars (1967), and outright eliminativism.

According to the adverbial theory, Bertie’s experience involves no thing, either actual or nonactual, that is green. Rather, Bertie senses greenly, greenly-sensing being just a type of visual sensing. Our main question, “Where, ontologically, is the green thing?,” thus has a false presupposition and there is no problem. Adverbialism dominated materialists’ thinking for so long that the latter question was hardly ever raised. But (as was not often noticed), adverbialism is a semantical thesis about the logical forms of sensation statements, and as such it has been severely and tellingly criticized, e.g., by Jackson (1977), Butchvarov (1980) and Lycan (1987).

Eliminativism about sensory qualities is suggested if not championed by Dennett (1991) and by Rey (1983, 1998). But if Bertie or anyone else says, “I am visually experiencing greenness,” it is hard either to call that person a liar or to explain how s/he could be subject to so massive a delusion. (Levine (2001) discusses eliminativism at more length.)

Dretske (1996) maintains that there is nothing intrinsic to the brain that constitutes the difference between a red quality and a green one. Unless there are Russellian sense-data or at least immaterial properties, what distinguishes the two qualities must be relational, and the only obvious candidate is, representing red or green. But as before, if one has no objection to sense-data or immaterial properties, one will be unmoved. The neurophysiological type-identity theorist would protest here too, though the same rejoinders apply. A less commissive objection is that, contra Dretske, there are candidate relations besides that of representing: some wide functional relation, perhaps, or a typical-cause relation (where neither of these is itself taken to constitute representing).

3.2. The Argument from Veridicality

We distinguish between veridical and nonveridical visual experiences. How so? It is fairly uncontentious that Bertie’s experience is as of a green blob and has greenness as an intentional object, and that what the experience reports is false. That is hard to dispute. If one instead accepts Russellian sense-data, and thinks of the after-image itself as an actually and independently existing individual—indeed one of the world’s basic building blocks—one then need not also think of it as representational. But one will then have to give an oblique account of the notion of veridicality. If one joins Campbell (2002) et al. in rejecting perceptual representation entirely, one will still have to reconstruct veridicality in some ad hoc way.

The representationalist further argues that the experience’s veridicality condition, i.e., there being a green blob where there seems to Bertie to be one, seems to exhaust not only its representational content but its qualitative content. Once the greenness has already been accounted for, what qualitative content is left?

Since weak representationalism does not entail strong, opponents may offer serious nonrhetorical answers to the argument’s concluding rhetorical question. For example, Block (1996) maintains that Bertie could introspect a certain qualitative property in addition to the greenness of the after-image. And we shall definitely encounter a further kind of content in Section 4.5 below, that may or may not be the same sort of property Block has in mind.

3.3 The Argument from Transparency

Harman (1990) offers the transparency argument: We normally “see right through” perceptual states to external objects and do not even notice that we are in perceptual states; the properties we are aware of in perception are attributed to the objects perceived. “Look at a tree and try to turn your attention to intrinsic features of your visual experience. I predict you will find that the only features there to turn your attention to will be features of the presented tree, including relational features of the tree ‘from here’” (p. 39). Tye (1995) and Crane (2003) extend this argument to bodily sensations such as pain.

The transparency argument can be extended also to the purely hallucinatory case. Suppose you are looking at a real, richly red tomato in good light. Suppose also that you then hallucinate a second, identical tomato to the right of the real one. (You may be aware that the second tomato is not real.) Phenomenally, the relevant two sectors of your visual field are just the same; the appearances are just the same in structure. The redness involved in the second-tomato appearance is exactly the same property as is involved in the first. But if we agree that the redness perceived in the real tomato is just the redness of the tomato itself, then the redness perceived in the hallucinated tomato—the red quality involved in the second-tomato appearance—is just the redness of the hallucinated tomato itself.

The appeal to transparency makes it immensely plausible that visual experience represents external objects and their apparent properties. But as noted above, that weak representationalist thesis is not terribly controversial. What the transparency argument as it stands does not show, but only claims, is that experience has no other properties that pose problems for materialism. The argument needs to be filled out, and typically is filled out by a further appeal to introspection. The obvious additional premises are: (i) If a perceptual state has relevant mental properties in addition to its representational properties, they are introspectible. But (ii) not even the most determined introspection ever reveals any such additional properties.

(ii) is the transparency thesis proper. (Kind (2003) calls it “strong transparency” and usefully distinguishes it from weaker claims, such as that we are very hard put to introspect additional properties or that we only rarely or abnormally do.) Transparency is vigorously defended by Tye (1995, 2002) and by Crane (2003). Dretske (2003) endorses a radical version of it: that we cannot introspect anything about a perceptual experience, if “introspect” has its usual meaning of internally attending to the experience.

Objections to the transparency thesis typically take the form of counterexamples, mental features of our experiences that can be introspected but allegedly are nonrepresentational. Harman (1990) and Block (1996) speak of “mental paint,” alluding to introspectible intrinsic features of a perceptual representation in virtue of which it represents what it does. Harman precisely denies the existence of mental paint, but Block holds that, in particular, he can introspect the nonintentional, nonfunctional items that he calls “qualia” in a sense quite different from that of sensory qualities. Loar (2003) grants that vision is normally transparent, but argues that we can therapeutically adopt what he calls the “perspective of oblique reflection,” perform a certain imaginative exercise, and thereby come to detect “qualia” in something like Block’s heavily laden sense of that term.

Block further mentions bodily sensations and moods whose representational contents are minimal but which are vividly introspectible. Lycan (1998) argues on similar grounds that the qualities inhering in a sensory experience are only part of that experience’s “overall feel” or phenomenal character in sense (4). Kriegel (2017) adds that, in particular, sensory experiences have affective components that are part of the mode or manner of representing rather than of the representatum.

Turning back to perception, Block notes that if one’s vision is blurry, one can introspect the blurriness as well as the visual representata. (More on blurriness in Section 4.5.2 below.) The point may also be made that the vividness of a perception, say of color, can be introspected over and above the sensed content, but Bourget (2017b) offers to explain vividness in terms of representata.

A more straightforward objection to transparency is that in perceptual experience, we can introspect the relevant sense modality in addition to the content, i.e., whether the representatum is sensed visually, aurally, olfactorily, or whatever. It may be claimed, as by Lycan (1996), that those differences are functional only. However, Tye (2002) has maintained that they can be captured in terms of representational contents. Moreover, Bourget (2017a) argues in some detail that only by individuating the sense modalities in terms of contents can we give the best account of “multimodal” or multi-sensory experiences, ones which unify distinct sub-experiences occurring in different modalities, such as those of drinking a cup of coffee or encountering a barking dog. (Related arguments had been made by Tye (2007) and Speaks (2015).)

Finally, it would seem that for any sensory quality, one can introspect the higher-order property of what it is like to experience that quality (cf. notion (4) listed in the fourth paragraph of this entry). Indeed, doing that seems to be one of introspection’s standard tasks.

These apparent counterexamples take a lot of overcoming. Tye (2003a) addresses some of them, arguing in each case that what appears to be a nonrepresentational difference between two experiences is actually a difference in representata.

As representationalism has been defined here, it does not require the transparency thesis. Representationalism itself is a claim only about sensory qualities, while transparency is about features of experience more generally. Even if transparency fails and there are introspectible nonrepresentational features of experiences, those features are presumably not sensory qualities. (Though some of the foregoing examples have also been used against representationalism; see Section 4.) Of course, if representationalism should be construed as applying to features of experience more broadly, then the existence of some such features may be troublesome for the view so construed; but they may be acceptable to the materialist, e.g., because they are functional.

3.4 The Argument from Seeming

Byrne (2001) and Thau (2002) appeal to the notion of the way the world seems to a subject. Very briefly, as Byrne puts it: “if the way the world seems to him hasn’t changed, then it can’t be that the phenomenal character of his experience has changed” (p. 207), where by “phenomenal character” in the context Byrne means sensory qualities. Suppose a subject has two consecutive experiences that differ in qualitative character. If she is “competent” in the sense of having no cognitive shortcomings (in particular, her memory is in good working order) and is slightly idealized in one or two other ways, she will notice the change in qualitative character. If so, Byrne argues, the way things seems to her when she has the second experience must differ from the way they seemed to her while she was having the first. For suppose that consecutive experiences are the same in content. Then the world seems exactly the same to the subject during both. She “has no basis for” noticing a change in qualitative character either, and by the previous premise it follows that there was no change in qualitative character (p. 211). The argument generalizes in each of several natural ways, and Byrne concludes that experiences cannot differ in qualitative character without differing in representational content.

If this sounds too close to being another simple appeal to transparency—and/or to beg the question against mental paint—Byrne hastens to add that his argument does not require transparency and is compatible with the existence of mental paint (pp. 212–13). So far as a subject is aware of mental paint, her experience is “partly reflexive” and represents its own paint. Therefore, a difference in paint would be another difference in representatum, not a qualitative difference unaccompanied by a content difference.

From the orthodox representationalist point of view, that may seem a dangerous concession. Byrne does hew to the representationalist’s line of supervenience (no qualitative difference without an intentional difference), but if his argument does not rule out mental paint, an anti-representationalist may construct inversion cases such as that of Block’s (1990) “Inverted Earth” (see Section 4.4 below), and argue that the paint is a nonfunctional intrinsic mental feature of the experience given in introspection, which is close enough to a “quale” in Block’s special sense, even if the feature does happen to be reflexively represented by the experience itself.

An anti-representationalist might also complain that Byrne has equivocated on “seems.” Block (1996) argued that “looks” (as in “That thing looks red to me”) is ambiguous, as between an intentional or representational sense and a separable phenomenal sense, and he believes inversion cases show that the two sorts of looking can come apart. No doubt he would hold the same of “seems.” Whether or not one is persuaded of that claim, Byrne’s argument presupposes that it is false. While doing that does not strictly beg the question, the argument does help itself to an assumption that is unlikely to be granted by the anti-representationalist.

3.5 The Argument from Hallucination

Pautz (2007, 2010) appeals to hallucinatory experience. Suppose you hallucinate (simultaneously) a red ellipse, an orange circle, and a green square, without ever previously having encountered any of those colors or shapes. That experience directly gives you the capacity to form beliefs about the external world, e.g., that there is a red ellipse, that red is more like orange than like green, and that ellipses are more like circles than like squares. This “grounding property” of the experience motivates a “relational” view of it, according to which having the experience puts the subject in a relation to “items involving properties which, if they are properties of anything at all, are properties of extended objects” (2007, p. 524). Pautz offers two further arguments for relationality, based respectively on the “matching property” and the “characterization property.”

Given relationality, representationalism still has three rivals: sense-data, Peacocke’s (2008) “sensationalist” theory, and Alston’s (1999) “theory of appearing.” But each of the rivals succumbs to objections; so representationalism is true of hallucinatory experience. Now, why not extend representationalism to experience across the board? At this point there is just one still unrefuted opponent: the “positive” disjunctivist who maintains that veridical experience differs radically in kind from hallucination. Pautz argues that that view is not worth the complications it enforces.

It remains to show that an experience’s characteristic qualitative properties can be identified with its representational properties. At this point Pautz appeals to the assumption that for any qualitative difference between two visual experiences, the difference has a spatial component, either in distinguishing two subregions of one’s visual field or in attending to one rather than another. In no case, Pautz maintains, is there going to be an experiential difference without a representational difference.

Since Pautz has proceeded by objecting to various competing views, we must hear what their respective proponents will say in rebuttal.

3.6 Awareness of sensory qualities

The discussion in this past section and in the next focus on the nature of sensory qualities themselves. According to the representationalist, the qualities are not mental; the corresponding mental property of a sensory state is that of representing the relevant quality. Of course, it is sensory states and experiences themselves that interest philosophers of mind, and some critics of representationalism will protest that merely representing a quality cannot be all there is to having the qualitative character that needs explaining; we shall return to that complaint in section 4.2 below.

As yet we have said nothing about what it is to be aware of a quality.

If a sensory quality is an intentional object of a mental state, then presumably the state’s owner is aware of the quality in whatever way a person is aware of the intentional contents of her/his mental states generally, including those of nonsensory propositional attitudes. The general issue is problematic and is much discussed in the “self-knowledge” literature. There are various options: higher-order representation; self-representation; attentional modulation; “acquaintance” of some sort more intimate than any of the foregoing; or the automatic replication of a first-order state’s content in any other state directed upon the first. In any case, however, the problems of awareness of content are already with us, and do not afflict the representational theory of sensory qualities in particular.

4. Objections to the Representational Theory

The (strong) representational theory entails the obvious supervenience claim: that there can be no difference in sensory qualities without a representational difference. Objections to the theory have most often come in the form of counterexamples to that thesis. But we shall begin with four more general complaints.

4.1 Objections to the Nonactual

Some philosophers are squeamish about the representationalist’s commitment to nonactual objects in cases of hallucination or perceptual illusion. For example, Loar (2003) imagines comparing the experience of seeing a lemon and a subjectively indistinguishable case of hallucinating an exactly similar lemon. “A way of putting this is representational: the two experiences present the real lemon and a merely intentional object as exactly similar, and that is what makes the experiences indistinguishable…. At the same time, one has a good sense of reality, and so wants to hold that the merely intentional lemon is nothing at all, and so not something that can resemble something else” (p. 84). A similar sentiment is sympathetically attributed to Fred Dretske by Levine (2003, p. 59n). The representational theory is sometimes assimilated to Alexius Meinong’s fanciful view that along with the many things that actually exist, there are plenty of other things that are like the things that exist except for happening to lack the property of existing. (Thus, Mage exists but does not have wings; Pegasus lacked existence but had wings.)

But it is important to see that the metaphysics of nonexistence is everyone’s problem, not peculiarly that of the representationalist (or of one’s current opponent on whatever issue in the philosophy of mind). There are things that do not exist, such as a hallucinated pink rat or a hallucinated lemon. However troublesome it is for fundamental ontology, that fact does not entail Meinong’s exegesis of it, or David Lewis’ concretist interpretation, or any other particular metaphysical account of it. The representational theory of sensory qualities is neutral on such underlying issues; it says only that when you hallucinate a lemon, the yellowness you experience is that of the lemon. Of course, neither the lemon nor its color actually exists, but as before, there are plenty of things that do not exist. (And one should question whether, as Loar maintains, nonactual things and people cannot resemble actual ones.)

4.2 Unconscious Representation

Sturgeon (2000), Kriegel (2002a) and Chalmers (2004) argue that representation cannot suffice for a sensory quality (or for there being something it is like for the subject to do the representing, but that is not our topic for now), because representation can occur unconsciously. This appears to refute pure representationalism, since according to that view representation of the relevant sort of property does necessarily constitute a sensory quality. The point is not highly significant, since as before, pure representationalism is an unoccupied position. The real question is, whether the concern behind this objection carries over to “quasi-” or other strong representationalism.

Sturgeon does seem to hold the stronger view that not even representation of whatever special sort is appealed to by the quasi-representationalist can suffice for a sensory quality, because any such representation can occur unconsciously. Since the quasi-representationalist maintains precisely that a sensory quality is simply a representatum of the relevant sort, this would be an outright refutation.

This objection rests on the crucial assumption that sensory qualities can occur only consciously. That assumption shares the usual multiple ambiguity of “conscious.” The interpretation on which the objection’s premise is most obviously true is that of sense (1) or sense (2) above: Representation can occur without its subject’s being aware of it, and/or without the subject’s introspecting it. But if we then understand the tacit assumption in the same way, it would be independently rejected by most representationalists, who already hold that a sensory quality can occur without being noticed by its host. (Consider the driver driving “on autopilot” who obviously saw the red light, and saw its redness in particular, but who was daydreaming and quite unaware of the redness, or even of applying the brake.) If, rather, sense (3) is intended, the assumption would be fine, because tautologous (a quality cannot occur without a quality occurring); but the objection’s premise would be, in effect, a flat and question-begging denial of strong representationalism, saying that the relevant representation can occur without a sensory quality occurring.

What of sense (4)? Here the objection gets a slightly better foothold. The premise is true; representation can occur without there being something that representing is like for the subject. And there is at least a sense of the phrase “what it’s like” in which the tacit assumption is true also: Recall that some theorists have used that phrase simply to mean a sensory quality (in sense (3)); so again the assumption would be tautologous. But the present concern is for sense (4), and at this point the objection breaks down. For so far as has been shown, a (first-order) quality can occur without there being anything it is like for the subject to experience that quality on that occasion; the subject may be entirely unaware of it.

In virtue of what, then, does an experience contain, or have inhering within it, a sensory quality? The representationalist’s answer is, in virtue of representing that quality in a distinctive way. What are distinctive about that mode of representation are (a) the functional considerations needed to specify the relevant sense modality, and (b) assuming “experience” implies awareness of the sensory quality, whatever is called for by one’s account of awareness-of.

4.3 “Phenomenal Intentionality”

Terry Horgan and co-authors, beginning with Horgan (2000) and Horgan and Tienson (2002), inaugurated the “Phenomenal Intentionality Research Program.” (The view was anticipated by Siewert (1998), and see, e.g., the essays collected in Kriegel (2013), as well as Mendelovici (2018).) It was inspired in part by an idea of Loar’s (1987, 2003), but its approach is different and its claims are much more ambitious. Its proponents defend an internal, narrow type of intentionality that (Horgan and Tienson say) is not only determined by phenomenology but is constituted by it (pp. 520, 524); indeed, they contend (p. 529) that their internal intentionality is “the fundamental kind of intentionality: the narrow, phenomenal kind that is a prerequisite for wide content and wide truth conditions.” And by “phenomenal,” they seem to mean “what it’s like” properties in the higher-order sense.

This would imply that “what it’s like” properties are conceptually or at least metaphysically prior to intentionality. Put together with representationalism about sensory qualities, it would follow that “what it’s like” properties are prior to those, which is quite contrary to the spirit of (though not flatly incompatible with) representationalism, and certainly it poses a general threat of circularity. Moreover, some proponents concede that it is anti-naturalistic and may require a departure from materialism; but Mendelovici and Bourget (2014) argue that naturalistic considerations actually favor phenomenal intentionality.

An obvious objection is that many perceptual states and other clearly intentional occurrent states are not conscious in sense (1) above; their subjects are entirely unaware of them, and they have no phenomenology at all. Kriegel (2011) replies, contending that the intentionality of such states is not “intrinsic” but “interpretivist,” merely charitable interpretation à la Donald Davidson and D.C. Dennett. Mendelovici (2018, Ch. 8) reviews several further strategies and proposes a combination of those.

A further objection is that since phenomenal intentionality is narrow, the view cannot account for the wide intentionality of everyday mental states. Proponents reply either that wide “contents” are not really contents (e.g., Horgan and Tienson, Bourget (2010)), or that they are derived in a deflationary way from the narrow phenomenal contents (e.g., Siewert, Kriegel, Farkas (2008)).

The “phenomenal intentionality” view will have to be considered on its merits, and after we have seen what account it affords of the sensory qualities. (However, it blocks any direct argument for representationalism based on transparency. Indeed, Kriegel (2007, p. 321) appeals to transparency in support of phenomenal intentionality.) For further discussion, see the entry on phenomenal intentionality.

4.4 “Laws of appearance”

Pautz (2017) points out that there are restrictions on sensory appearances that have no parallel for other intentional states such as beliefs. For example, a surface cannot appear both round and square, or both pure red and pure yellow at the same place at the same time; nor can anything seem round or red but not extended. Pautz contends that such impossibilities are metaphysical in strength. In contrast, there is nothing metaphysically or even nomologically impossible, but only irrational, about contradictory or otherwise anomalous beliefs or desires. How is a representationalist to explain the existence of such laws?

Speaks (2017) responds by questioning whether the laws are metaphysically necessary. Perhaps they arise simply from how we are built. We might have had sense modalities that worked differently, in such a way as to allow representation of the anomalous states of affairs.

Further, even if the impossibilities are metaphysical, they may arise from the metaphysics of functional roles of sensory states rather than from the sense modalities’ representational capacities.

4.5 Counterexamples

Now we come to the cases in which, allegedly, either two experiences differ in their sensory qualities without differing in intentional content or they differ entirely in their intentional content but share sensory qualities. Let us start with the degenerate case in which (supposedly) there is no intentional content to begin with.

4.5.1 Nonintentional mental states

If every sensory quality is a represented property, then phenomenal character in sense (3) is exhausted by the intentionality of the relevant experience. Since vision is pretty plainly representational, it is no surprise that representationalists have talked mainly about color qualities. But many other mental states that have phenomenal character are not intentional and do not represent anything: bodily sensations, and especially moods. Rey (1998): “Many have noted that states like that of elation, depression, anxiety, pleasure, orgasm seem to be just overall states of oneself, and not features of presented objects” (p. 441, italics original). For that matter, it is hardly obvious that every specifically perceptual experience represents—smell, for example, does not clearly do so.

The representationalist has several options here. First, s/he could restrict the thesis to perceptual experiences, or to states that are admitted to be intentional. But that would be ad hoc, and would leave the phenomenal character of the excluded mental states entirely unexplained.

Second, representationalists such as Lycan (1996, 2001) and Tye (1995, 2003b) have, in some detail, defended Brentano’s thesis that in fact every mental state is intentional, including bodily sensations and moods. It is easy enough to argue that pains and tickles and even orgasms have some representational features (see Tye (1995) and Lycan (1996)). For example, a pain is felt as being in a certain part of one’s body, as if that part is disordered in a certain way; that is why pains are described as “burning,” “stabbing,” “throbbing” and the like. Though it is harder to maintain that a mood has intentional content, it is plausible to say that a state of elation, for example, represents one’s surroundings as being beautiful and exciting, and free-floating anxiety represents that something bad is about to happen. However, this does not answer the previous objection that even when it is admitted that a pain, a tickle, or a general depression does represent something, that representational content does not loom very large in the overall phenomenal character of the mental state in question.

Third, if transparency is rejected, other introspectible features of an experience can be allowed to count as part of its phenomenal character. Lycan (1998) argues that for some mental states, sensory qualities do not exhaust their “overall feel.” Consider pains. Armstrong (1968) and Pitcher (1970) argued convincingly that pains are representational and have intentional objects, real or unreal as usual, which objects are unsalutary conditions of body parts; pain is a kind of proprioception. But those intentional objects are not all I can introspect about a pain. I can also introspect its awfulness, its urgency. We should distinguish the pain’s sensory quality, its specifically sensory core (say, the throbbing character of a headache) from the pain’s affective and conative aspect that constitutes its awfulness. Those are not normally felt as distinct, but two different neurological subsystems are responsible for the overall experience, and they can come apart. The quality is what remains under morphine; what morphine blocks is the affective aspect—the desire that the pain stop, the distraction, the urge to pain-behave. It is then open to the materialist to treat the affective components as functional rather than representational, and that is not ad hoc.

Fourth, recall the distinction between senses (3) and (4) of the tricky term “phenomenal character.” As always, the representational theory addresses only sense (3). But sense (4), that of “what it’s like” to entertain a given sensory quality, can be generalized: It is not only qualities that have the higher-order what-it’s-like property; arguably propositional attitudes and other states that do not involve qualities in sense (3), such as occurrent thoughts, have it too (Siewert (1998), Pitt (2004)). So the representationalist can accuse the present objection of confusing (4) with (3). It remains to be argued how plausible that accusation would be.

4.5.2 Same intentional contents, different sensory qualities

Peacocke (1983) gave three examples of this kind, Block (1995, 1996) a few others; for discussion of those, see Lycan (1996). Tye (2003a) provides an extensive catalogue of further cases, and rebuts them on the representationalist’s behalf. In each case, the representationalist tries to show that there are after all intentional differences underlying the qualitative differences in question.

Trees. In Peacocke’s leading example, your experience represents two (actual) trees, at different distances from you but as being of the same physical height and other dimensions; “[y]et there is also some sense in which the nearest tree occupies more of your visual field than the more distant tree” (p. 12). That sense is a qualitative sense, and Peacocke maintains that the qualitative difference is unmatched by any representational difference.

Tye (1995) and others have rejoined that there are after all identifiable representational differences constituting the qualitative differences in the trees example. Tye points to the fact that one of the trees subtends a larger visual angle from the subject’s point of view, and he argues that this fact is itself (nonconceptually) represented by the visual experience. Lycan contends that perceptual representation is layered, and vision in particular represents physical objects such as trees by representing items called “shapes,” most of which are nonactual; in the trees case differing shapes are represented. Much more promisingly, Schellenberg (2008) appeals to “situation-dependent” properties of external objects, by perceiving which we also perceive the high-level properties of the same objects. Byrne (2001) merely observes that one of the trees is represented as being farther from the subject than the other. Bourget (2015) even less commissively points out that your experience represents fewer small features of the farther tree. For further discussion, see Millar (2010).

Peacocke’s second and third examples concern, respectively, binocular vision and the Necker reversible-cube illusion. On the former, see Tye (1992) and Lycan (1996). The latter has given rise to a distinctive literature.

Aspect-perception and attention. The Necker cube is one of a growing family of alleged counterexamples involving aspect-perception or selective attention. Others include ambiguous pictures such as the famous duck-rabbit; arrays of dots or geometric figures which can be “grouped” by vision in alternate ways; or other displays which can be attended to in multiple ways. In each case, a single and unchanging figure that seems to be univocally represented by vision nonetheless gives rise to differing visual experiences.

Representationalists of course respond by trying to specify distinct properties as characteristic representata in the differing experiences. For example, a “duck” experience of the duck-rabbit will represent the property of being a bill without representing that of being an ear; the “rabbit” experience will do the opposite. One way of grouping dots will mobilize the concept of a row but not that of a column, etc. Macpherson (2006) offers a rich survey of such examples and rebuts representationalist replies both existing and anticipated.

One of the most interesting recent examples (not discussed by Macpherson) is offered by Nickel (2007):

Figure 1
Figure 2
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Nickel says we can see an arbitrarily chosen set of constituent squares “as prominent.” For example, in Figure 1 we can see the squares corresponding to 1, 3, 5, 7, and 9 as prominent, or alternately see 2, 4, 6, and 8 as prominent, without changing where we look and, it seems, while representing just the same figure and its elements all the while. In particular, we need not change the focus of our vision, but leave it on the center of Figure 1, yet have different experiences.

The representationalist has several options here. First, focusing on Nickel’s phrase “see as prominent,” s/he could claim that a distance illusion is created, so that the “farther away” relation is represented; or, noting that the preposition “as” seems already to be representational language, s/he could appropriate Nickel’s own term “prominent” as designating a property and just leave it unexplicated. Second, the representationalist could insist that the figure is pictorial, and then invoke some version of figure-ground, or assimilate the case to seeing-as of some other sort (assuming s/he had already provided a representational account of seeing-as more generally). Third, s/he might reject Nickel’s assumption that the whole figure is actually seen at one time, writing off the contrary impression as what Noë (2004) calls “presence as absence.” And there are other possibilities, though each is bound to be contentious.

Block (2010) offers cases in which shifts of attention seem to change sensory qualities (Carrasco (2006)). “The effect of attention is experienced in terms of appearance of contrast, speed, size, color saturation, etc. Attended things look bigger, faster, more saturated, and higher in contrast” (p. 44). Realism about contrast, speed and the rest being assumed, it would seem clear that if an attended thing looks (e.g.) bigger than its actual size, that is just a false or inaccurate representation. But Block takes pains to forestall that inference.

For further defense of representationalism against these and still more examples of subjective differences in “grouping” and/or “prominence,” see Green (2016).

Blurry vision. We must revisit that case (which actually was introduced as a problem for representationalism by Boghossian and Velleman (1989)), because it requires a wrinkle in the representationalist strategy. The normal representationalist move would be to say that the visual experience represents the relevant part of the world as being blurry, but here we want to concede that there is a phenomenal difference between seeing an object as being blurry and blurrily seeing a nonblurry object. Tye (2003a) points out that that difference can be characterized informationally: In the former case, as when looking at a blurry painting, vision represents the blurred edges as such, and just where they lie. But in the latter, vision provides less information, and fails to represent the sharp edges. Tye distinguishes similarly between nonveridically seeing a sharp object as blurry, which experience incorrectly represents the boundaries as fuzzy, and seeing the same object blurrily, which does not represent them, except to place them within broad limits. Allen (2013) contends, to the contrary, that a blurry visual experience represents objects as having multiple boundaries. Bourget (2015) argues that, whatever the positive details, a blurry experience loses some of the content that would be represented by a sharper experience of the exact same scene.

4.5.3 Inversions

Inversion examples in the tradition of Locke’s “inverted spectrum” form a special category of alleged counterexamples to representationalism. Some fit the foregoing model (same intentional contents, different sensory qualities), some do not. Lockean inversion was that of color qualities with respect to behavioral dispositions, which is regarded as possible by everyone except behaviorists and Wittgensteinians. To find an inversion counterexample to the representational theory, the objector would have to posit qualities inverted with respect to all representational contents, or, in the case of “mixed” or “quasi-” representationalism, qualities inverted with respect to all representational contents and all the relevant functional etc. properties. (It is important to see that the latter inversion hypothesis is much more ambitious and should be much more controversial than the original Lockean idea.)

Shoemaker (1991) contends that this strong sort of inversion is possible, i.e., that sensory qualities could invert with respect to representational contents. But his only argument seems to be that such an inversion is imaginable, or conceivable in a thin sense. Since the representationalist’s claim is precisely that sensory qualities just are representational contents of a certain kind, but not that this is analytically or conceptually true, Shoemaker has given her/him no reason to think that the inversion is really, metaphysically, possible. (Also, it is too easy to think of color looks inverting with respect to mere representation; cf. the opening paragraph of Section 2. One has to try to imagine their inverting with respect to visual representation of the appropriate type.) Yet there are further inversion scenarios, supported by argument, that the representationalist must take seriously.

Fish-heads. Building on an example of Byrne’s (2001), Levine (2003) supposes that there are creatures whose eyes are on opposite sides of their heads and whose heads are fixed, so that they never look at an object with both eyes. Now, imagine one such creature whose eyes’ lenses are color-inverted with respect to each other. (It is not that one lens has been inverted; the creatures are born thus mismatched.) It seems that identically colored objects simultaneously presented will look, say, green to one eye but red to the other. Yet the same worldly color property (i.e., a reflectance property of whatever sort) is being represented by each eye. Now, every eye is normal within the population, so neither can easily be described as misrepresenting the colors of red objects. Each eye just sees the colors differently, and so the difference is not exhausted by the common representatum.

The first point to be made on the representationalist’s behalf is that, as Levine goes on to admit (p. 71), the eyes seem to be representing the world differently; “space appears differently filled on the two sides of the head.” Also, if the fish-head were able to turn and look at the same object first with one eye and then with the other and back again, the object would successively appear to it to be different colors. So we do not here have a case of phenomenal difference without representational difference.

But there is still a puzzle. If the two eyes are representing different properties and neither is misrepresenting, and only the one surface reflectance property is involved, what are the two distinct representata? Several options are available. (i) One could try to find a basis for saying that one of the eyes is (after all) misrepresenting, though it is hard to imagine what basis that might be. (ii) As Levine points out, one could fall in with the view of Shoemaker (1994) mentioned in Section 2, that the eyes are representing distinct dispositions even though the dispositions are realized by the same physical properties. (iii) If the eyes are mutually color-inverted, then they differ functionally. A psychosemantics such as Dretske’s (1986) that makes essential reference to function might therefore distinguish representata here. (iv) To the extent that each creature’s two eyes differ functionally from each other, the creature has two different and nonequivalent visual systems. Perhaps, then, we cannot say that either eye represents its red object as red, or as green; the same reflectance property is one color for one of the visual systems and a different color for the other, as it might be between two different species of organism, and we do not know what those colors are. That the realizing reflectance property is the same in each case does not establish sameness of representatum, because that property may be a common disjunct of each of two distinct disjunctive properties that are respectively colors for the two types of visual system.

Inverted Earth. Block (1990) appeals to an “Inverted Earth,” a planet exactly like Earth except that its real physical colors are (somehow) inverted with respect to ours. The Inverted Earthlings’ speech sounds just like English, but their intentional contents in regard to color are inverted relative to ours: When they say “red,” they mean green (if it is green Inverted objects that correspond to red Earthly objects under the inversion in question), and green things look green to them even though they call those things “red.” Now, an Earthling victim is chosen by the customary mad scientists, knocked out, fitted with color inverting lenses, transported to Inverted Earth, and repainted to match that planet’s human skin and hair coloring. Block contends that after some length of time—a few days or a few millennia—the victim’s word meanings and propositional-attitude contents and all other intentional contents will shift to match the Inverted Earthlings’ contents, but, intuitively, the victim’s color qualities will remain the same. Thus, sensory qualities are not intentional contents.

A natural representationalist reply is to insist that if the intentional contents would change, so too would the qualitative contents. Block’s nearly explicit argument for denying this is that “qualia” (he fails to distinguish sensory qualities, sense (3), from their higher-order “what it’s like” properties, sense (4)) are narrow, while the intentional contents shift under environmental pressure precisely because they are wide. If sensory qualities are indeed narrow, and all the intentional contents are wide and would shift, then Block’s argument succeeds. (Stalnaker (1996) gives a version of Block’s argument that does not depend on the assumption that the qualities are narrow; Lycan (1996) rebuts it.)

Three replies are available, then: (i) To insist that the visual intentional contents would not shift. Word meanings would shift, but it does not follow that visual contents ever would. (ii) To hold that although all the ordinary intentional contents would shift, there is a special class of narrow though still representational contents underlying the wide contents; sensory qualities can be identified with the special narrow contents. (iii) To deny that qualitative content is narrow and argue that it is wide, i.e., that two molecularly indistinguishable people could indeed experience different qualities. This last is the position that Dretske (1996) has labelled “phenomenal externalism,” though (again) in our terminology that would have been “qualitative” externalism.

Reply (i) has not been much pursued. (ii) has, a bit, by Tye (1994) and especially Rey (1998). Rey argues vigorously that “qualia” are narrow, and then offers a narrow representational theory. (But as previously mentioned, it turns out that Rey’s theory is not a theory of sensory qualities; see Section 4.5.) Note that Fregean as opposed to Russellian representationalism is well suited to (ii); even if the Russellian contents shift, the Fregean contents need not. Chalmers (2004) advocates such a view. (Papineau (2014) offers a fourth alternative: to say that although sensory states do represent worldly properties such as color and shape, the sensory qualities themselves are simply not representata and do not shift when the environment is inverted; rather, they are just narrow properties of subjects. He tries to explain away our feeling that sensory qualities are presented to the mind as worldly.)

Reply (iii) has been defended by Dretske (1995, 1996), Tye (1995) and Lycan (1996, 2001). A number of people (even Tye himself (1998)) have since called the original contrary assumption that sensory qualities are narrow a “deep / powerful / compelling” intuition, but it proves to be highly disputable. Here are two arguments, though not very strong arguments, for the claim that the qualities are wide.

First, if the representational theory is correct, then sensory qualities are determined by whatever determines a psychological state’s intentional content; in particular, the color properties represented are taken to be physical properties instanced in the subject’s environment. What determines a psychological state’s intentional content is given by a psychosemantics, in Fodor’s (1987) sense. But every known plausible psychosemantics makes intentional contents wide. Of course, the representational theory is just what is in question; but if one grants that it is independently plausible or at least defensible, the further step to externalism is not a giant step.

Second, suppose sensory qualities are narrow. Then Block’s Inverted Earth argument is plausible, and it would show that either the qualities are narrow functional properties or they are properties of a very weird kind whose existence is suggested by nothing else we know (see Ch. 6 of Lycan (1996)). But sensory qualities are not functional properties, at least not narrow ones: recall the Bertie dilemma. Also, they are ostensibly monadic properties, while functional properties are all relational; and see further Block’s anti-functionalist arguments in Block (1978). So, either sensory qualities are wide or weirdness is multiplied beyond necessity. Of course, that dichotomy will be resisted by anyone who offers a narrow representationalist theory as in (ii) above.

The Scrambler. Biggs (2009) constructs a complicated example in which a human-like species has evolved in such a way that the sensory qualities inhering in its members’ perceptual states are entirely disconnected both functionally and causal-historically from their worldly environments. Biggs argues that those states simply lack representational content, and he anticipates and rebuts the most likely replies.

4.6 Arguments against Wide Representationalism

Although until the mid-1990s the assumption that sensory qualities are narrow had been tacit and undefended, opponents of wide representationalism have since defended the assumption with vigor. Here are (only) some of their arguments, with sample replies. (For a fuller discussion, see Lycan (2001).)

Introspection. Block’s Earthling suddenly transported to Inverted Earth or some other relevant sort of Twin Earth would notice nothing introspectively, despite a change in representational content; so the sensory quality must remain unchanged and so is narrow.

Reply: The same goes for propositional attitudes, i.e., the transported Earthling would notice nothing introspectively. Yet the attitude contents are still wide. Wideness does not entail introspective change under transportation.

Narrow content. In the propositional-attitude literature, the corresponding transportation argument has been taken as the basis of an argument for “narrow content,” viz., for something that is intentional content within the meaning of the act but is narrow rather than, as usual, wide. The self-knowledge problem aforementioned, and the problem of “wide causation” (Fodor (1987), Kim (1995)), have also been used to motivate narrow content. And, indeed, any general argument for narrow content will presumably apply to sensory representation as well as to propositional attitudes. If there is narrow content at all, and sensory content is representational, then probably sensory states have narrow content too. Thus, sensory qualities can and should be taken to be the narrow contents of such states.

Replies: First, this begs the question against the claim that the qualities are wide. Even if there are indeed narrow contents impacted within sensory states, independent argument is needed for the identification of sensory qualities with those contents rather than with wide contents. Second and more strongly, narrow sensory contents still would not correspond to sensory qualities in our sense. So far as has been shown, the redness of a patch in my visual field is still a wide property, even if some other, narrow property underlies it in the same way that (mysterious, ineffable) narrow contents are supposed to underlie beliefs and desires.

Modelling a shift of qualities. If perceptual contents are wide and the environment is subject to change, we should expect a shift, even if the perceptual contents would not shift as readily as attitude contents would. Perhaps they would eventually shift after several centuries on Inverted Earth, if a subject could stay alive that long. But how would a distinctive quality even imaginably undergo such a shift? For example, suppose that a quality is supposed to shift from blue to yellow. A shift from blue to yellow might reasonably be supposed to be a smooth and gradual shift along the spectrum that passes through green. But it is hardly plausible that one would experience such a shift, or a period of unmistakable greenness in particular.

Reply: We have no plausible model for a shift of everyday attitude content either. How would a type of belief state smoothly go from being about blue to being about yellow? Presumably not by being about green in between. So our presumed quality shift is no worse off than the attitudinal shift in this regard; if the present argument works for the former case, it also works for the latter, contrary to hypothesis.

To this it may be rejoined that attitude contents are more tractable, in that they may yield to some view of aboutness according to which reference can divide for a time between contents such as blue and yellow. (E.g., Field’s (1973) theory of “partial reference.”) It is harder to imagine “divided” phenomenology.

Modes of presentation (Rey (1998); Chalmers (2004) defends a similar view). There is no such thing as representation without a mode of presentation. If a sensory quality is a representatum, then it is represented under a mode of presentation, and modes of presentation may be narrow even when the representational content itself is wide. Indeed, many philosophers of mind take modes of presentation to be internal causal or functional roles played by the representations in question. Surely they are strong candidates for qualitative content. Are they not narrow qualitative features?

Reply: Remember, the sensory qualities themselves are properties like subjective greenness and redness, which according to the representational theory are representata. The modes or guises under which greenness and redness are represented in vision are something else again.

But it can plausibly be argued that such modes and guises are qualitative or phenomenal properties of some sort, perhaps higher-order properties. See the next section.

Memory (Block (1996)). “[Y]ou remember the color of the sky on your birthday last year, the year before that, ten years before that, and so on, and your long-term memory gives you good reason to think that the phenomenal character of the experience has not changed…. Of course, memory can go wrong, but why should we suppose that it must go wrong here?” (pp. 43–44, italics and boldface original). The idea is that memory acts as a check on the sensory qualities, and can be used to support the claim that the qualities have remained unchanged despite the wholesale shift in representational contents.

Reply: Memory contents are wide, and so by Block’s own reasoning they will themselves undergo the representational shift to the Inverted-Earth complementary color. Thus, your post-shift memories of good old Earth are false. When you say or think to yourself, “Yes, the sky looks as blue as it did thirty years ago,” you are not expressing the same memory content as you would have when you had just arrived on Inverted Earth. You are now remembering or seeming to remember that the sky looked yellow, since for you “blue” now means yellow. And that memory is false, since on the long-ago occasion the sky looked blue to you, not yellow; memory is not after all a reliable check on the sensory qualities. (Lycan (1996) takes this line; Tye (1998) expands it in more detail.)

Structural mismatch. Following Hardin (1988) and others, Pautz (2014, 2019) argues that the structural properties of a sensory field, paradigmatically resemblance relations, match the neural substrates of the relevant experiences rather than the chemical or physical properties of the representata. For example, the sensory quality blue resembles purple more strongly than it resembles green, but the reflectances underlying worldly objects are the other way around: the blue reflectance type resembles the green reflectance type more than it does the purple. Even more dramatic mismatches obtain in the case of smell. Therefore, it seems that a sensory quality is a narrow property rather than the wide worldly one predicted by standard externalist psychosemantics.

Reply: First, that a sense modality represents two worldly properties as being similar to degree n does not entail that they are thus similar; there may be illusion regarding resemblance. Second, there will be room for debate regarding exactly what chemical or physical properties do constitute the representata, and regarding what psychosemantics connects those properties to the sensory experience.

Hardly anyone will accept all of the foregoing replies. But no one should now find it uncontestable either that sensory qualities are narrow or that they are wide. The matter is likely to remain controversial for some time to come.

5. What It’s Like

Some philosophers (e.g., Dretske (1995), Tye (1995)) use this troublesome expression simply to mean a sensory quality, and this is one of the two meanings it has had in recent philosophy of mind. But in the fourth paragraph of this entry, the phrase was introduced in the context, “‘what it’s like’ for the subject to be in a particular mental state, especially what it is like for that subject to experience a particular qualitative property,” which indicates that there is another sense (4) in which (when the mental state does involve a sensory quality) the “what it’s like” is something over and above the quality itself. In fact, since this second “what it’s like” is itself a property of the quality, it cannot very well be identical with the quality. It is the property of what it is like to experience that quality; alternately, the relevant introspectible property of the experience itself. Let us now just speak of “what it’s like” (WIL) properties, meaning just this higher-order phenomenal sort.

5.1 Higher-order “What It’s Like,” Distinct from Sensory Qualities

Block (1995), like many other writers, fails to distinguish WIL properties from sensory qualities. But Carruthers (2000) elaborates nicely on the distinction: A quality in the first-order sense presents itself as part of the world, not as part of one’s mind. It is, e.g., the apparent color of an apparently physical object (or, if you are a Russellian, the color of a sense-datum that you happen to have encountered as an object of consciousness). A sensory quality is what the world is or seems like. But what it is like to experience that color is what your first-order perceptual state is like, intrinsically mental and experienced as such.

Here are two further reasons for maintaining such a distinct sense of the phrase. First, a sensory quality can be described in one’s public natural language, while what it is like to experience the quality seems to be ineffable. Suppose Ludwig asks Bertie, “How, exactly, does the after-image look to you as regards color?” Bertie replies, “I told you, it looks green.” “Yes,” says Ludwig, “but can you tell me what it’s like to experience that ‘green’ look?” “Well, the image looks the same color as that,” says Bertie, pointing to George Edward’s cloth coat. “No, I mean, can you tell me what it’s like intrinsically, not comparatively?” “Um,….” —In one way, Bertie can describe the phenomenal color, paradigmatically as “green.” But when asked what it is like to experience that green, he goes mute. So there is a difference between (a) “what it’s like” in the bare sense of the quality, the phenomenal color that can be described using ordinary color words, and (b) “what it’s like” to experience that phenomenal color, the WIL property, which cannot easily be described in public natural language at all.

Second, Armstrong (1968), Nelkin (1989), Rosenthal (1991), and Lycan (1996) have argued that sensory qualities can fail to be conscious in the earlier sense of awareness; a quality can occur without its being even slightly noticed by its subject. But in such a case, there is a good sense in which it would not be like anything for the subject to experience that quality. (Of course, in the first, Dretske-Tye sense there would be something it was like, since the quality itself is that. But in another sense, if the subject is entirely unaware of the quality, it is odd even to speak of the subject as “experiencing” it, much less of there being something it is like for the subject to experience it.) So even in the case in which one is aware of one’s quality, the second type of “what it’s like,” the WIL property, requires awareness and so is something distinct from the quality itself.

5.2 Arguments against Materialism Based on “What It’s Like”

It is the second sense of “what it’s like” that figures in anti-materialist arguments from subjects’ “knowing what it’s like,” primarily Nagel’s (1974) “Bat” argument and Jackson’s (1982) “Knowledge” argument, Chalmers’ (1996, 2003) Conceivability argument, and Levine’s (1983, 2001) Explanatory Gap arguments. To begin with the first of those: Jackson’s character Mary, a brilliant color scientist trapped in an entirely black-and-white laboratory, nonetheless becomes omniscient as regards the physics and chemistry of color, the neurophysiology of color vision, and every other public, objective fact conceivably relevant to human color experience. Yet when she is finally released from her captivity and ventures into the outside world, she sees colors for the first time, and learns something: namely, she learns what it is like to see red and the other colors. Thus she seems to have learned a new fact, one that by hypothesis is not a public, objective fact. It is an intrinsically perspectival fact. This is what threatens materialism, since according to that doctrine, every fact about every human mind is ultimately a public, objective fact.

Upon her release, Mary has done two things: She has at last hosted a red sensory quality, and she has learned what it is like to experience a red quality. In experiencing it she has experienced a “what it’s like” in the first of our two senses. But the fact she has learned has the ineffability characteristic of our second sense of “what it’s like”; were Mary to try to pass on her new knowledge of a WIL property to a still color-deprived colleague, she would not be able to express it in English.

We have already surveyed the representational theory of sensory qualities. But there are also representational theories of “what it’s like” in the second sense (4). A common reply to the arguments of Nagel and Jackson (Horgan (1984), Van Gulick (1985), Churchland (1985), Tye (1986), Lycan (1987, 1990, 1996, 2003), Loar (1990), Rey (1991), Leeds (1993)) is to note that a knowledge difference does not entail a difference in fact known, for one can know a fact under one representation or mode of presentation but fail to know one and the same fact under a different mode of presentation. Someone might know that water is splashing but not know that H2O molecules are moving, and vice versa; someone might know that person X is underpaid without knowing that she herself is underpaid, even if she herself is in fact person X. Thus, from Mary’s before-and-after knowledge difference, Jackson is not entitled to infer the existence of a new, weird fact, but at most that of a new way of representing. Mary has not learned a new fact, but has only acquired a new, introspective or first-person way of representing one that she already knew in its neurophysiological guise.

(As noted above, the posited introspective modes of presentation for sensory qualities in the first-order sense are strong candidates for the title of “qualia” in a distinct, higher-order sense of the term, and they may well be narrow rather than wide. This is what Rey (1998) seems to be talking about.)

This attractive response to Nagel and Jackson—call it the “perspectivalist” response—requires that the first-order qualitative state itself be represented (else how could it be newly known under Mary’s new mode of presentation?). And that hypothesis in turn encourages a representational theory of higher-order conscious awareness and introspection. However, representational theories of awareness face powerful objections, the perspectivalist must either buy into such a theory despite its liabilities, or find some other way of explicating the idea of an introspective or first-person perspective without appealing to higher-order representation. The latter option does not seem promising. And a further question raised by the perspectivalist response concerns the nature of the alleged first-person representation itself.

It has become popular, especially among materialists, to speak of “phenomenal concepts,”and to suppose that Mary has acquired one which she can now apply to her first-order qualitative state; it is in that way that she is able to represent the old fact in a new way. Phenomenal concepts figure also in responses to the Conceivability and Explanatory Gap arguments.

The Conceivability argument (Chalmers 1996, 2003) has it that “zombies” are conceivable—physical duplicates of ordinary human beings, that share all the human physical and functional states but lack phenomenal consciousness in sense (4); there is nothing it is like to be a zombie. The argument then moves from bare conceivability to genuine metaphysical possibility, which would refute materialism. According to the Explanatory Gap argument (Levine 1983, 2001), no amount of physical, functional or other objective information could explain why a given sensory state feels to its subject in the way it does, and the best explanation of this in turn is that the feel is an extra fact that does not supervene on the physical.

Lormand (2004) offers a very detailed linguistic analysis of the formula “There is something it is like for [creature] c to have [mental state] M,” and on its basis defends the claim that instances of that formula as well as more specific attributions of WIL properties can in fact be conceptually deduced at least from “nonphenomenal” facts about subjects.

What the Knowledge, Conceivability and Explanatory Gap arguments have in common is that they move from an alleged epistemic gap to a would-be materialism-refuting metaphysical one. Though some materialists balk at once and refuse to admit the epistemic gap, more grant the epistemic gap and resist the move to the metaphysical one. The epistemic gap, on this view, is created by the “conceptual isolation” of phenomenal concepts from all others, and it is conceptual only rather than metaphysical. Stoljar (2005) calls this the “phenomenal concept strategy”. There are a number of distinct positive accounts of phenomenal concepts and how they work; such concepts are: “recognitional” (Loar (1990), Carruthers (2000), Tye (2003c)); proprietary lexemes of an internal monitoring system (Lycan (1996)); indexical (Perry (2001), O’Dea (2002), Schellenberg (2013)); demonstrative (Levin (2007), Stalnaker (2008), Schroer (2010)); “quotational” or “constitutive” (Papineau (2002), Balog (2012)); “unimodal” (Dove and Elpidorou (2016)). Some of those accounts are minimal, aspiring only to block the key inferences in the anti-materialist arguments aforementioned. Others, particularly the constitutive account, are more detailed and offer to explain more specific features of WIL properties. For example, Papineau points out that the constitutive account explains the odd persistent attractiveness of some of the obviously fallacious antimaterialist arguments. He and Balog each argue that the account, according to which a phenomenal concept token is at least partly constituted by the very mental state-token that is its referent, explains the special directness of the reference: no feature of the state is appealed to (and a fortiori no neural, functional, causal etc. feature); Balog adds that since the referent is literally contained and present in the concept token, “there will always be something it is like” to do the tokening (p. 7).

The phenomenal concept strategy is criticized by Raffman (1995), Stoljar (2005), Prinz (2007), Chalmers (2007), Ball (2009), Tye (2009), Demircioglu (2013), and Shea (2014). For further works and references see Alter and Walter (2007), Sundström (2011) and Elpidorou (2015). Chalmers offers a “Master Argument” meant to refute any version of the strategy: it is a dilemma based on whether it is conceivable that the complete fundamental physical truth holds yet we possess no phenomenal concepts (having whichever features). The argument is criticized by Papineau (2007), Carruthers and Veillet (2007), and Balog (2012).

5.3 “Illusionism”

It is possible simply to deny the existence of WIL properties, as do Dennett (1991) and Dretske (1995); see also Humphrey (1992, 2011), Hall (2007), Pereboom (2011) and Tartaglia (2013). To do that is of course not to defend a representational theory or any other theory of them. But it would be good to explain away the majority belief in such properties, and some theorists do that in representational terms, arguing that other, real properties are misrepresented in introspection as WIL properties; Frankish (2016) calls this strategy “illusionism.” An obvious instance of such a misrepresentation would be to mistake a sensory quality for a WIL property; since the conflation of the two is already rife even among sophisticated philosophers, WIL deniers may suggest that what was introspected was only a sensory quality. (That is one way of understanding Dretske’s position, bar his resistance to the very notion of introspection as in Dretske (2003).) And as before, the phrase “what it’s like” has nontendentiously been used as referring to a sensory quality rather than to a property of a whole experience. Several authors point out that to reject WIL properties is not to grant Chalmers’ (1996) claim that for a zombie lacking WIL properties, “all is dark inside” (pp. 95–6).

Rey (1992) suggests that introspection mistakes the lack of detail it delivers for the accurate representation of a simple ineffable property. Alternately or in addition (1995), having detected stable and identifiable complexes of involuntary responses to states of ourselves and to living creatures who look and behave like us, for example the commonsense causal, representational, conative and affective syndrome we lump together using the word ‘pain’, we project a simple quality onto the others and into ourselves. Rey and Pereboom each compare the projection of WIL properties into the mind by introspection to vision’s projection of simple homogeneous color properties onto environmental objects.

Illusionism is criticized by Strawson (2006), Prinz (2016), Balog (2016), Nida-Rümelin (2016), Schwitzgebel (2016), and Chalmers (2018). Though highly sympathetic to illusionism, Kammerer (2018) argues that no previously existing account can explain the strength of the illusion. For general discussion, see the essays collected in Frankish (2017), and for further defense, see Shabasson (2022).


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