Charlie Dunbar Broad

First published Fri Sep 3, 2010; substantive revision Mon Aug 9, 2021

Charlie Dunbar Broad (1887–1971) was an English philosopher who for the most part of his life was associated with Trinity College, Cambridge. Broad’s early interests were in science and mathematics. Despite being successful in these he came to believe that he would never be a first-rate scientist, and turned to philosophy. Broad’s interests were exceptionally wide-ranging. He devoted his philosophical acuity to the mind-body problem, the nature of perception, memory, introspection, and the unconscious, to the nature of space, time and causation. He also wrote extensively on the philosophy of probability and induction, ethics, the history of philosophy and the philosophy of religion. The ample scope and scale of Broad’s work is impressive. In addition he nourished an interest in parapsychology—a subject he approached with the disinterested curiosity and scrupulous care that is characteristic of his philosophical work.

Broad did not have “a philosophy”—if by that phrase is meant highly original philosophical theories, and a highly original way of approaching philosophical problems. He writes: “I have nothing worth calling a system of philosophy of my own, and there is no philosopher of whom I should be willing to reckon myself a faithful follower” (1924, p. 77). The reader is nonetheless likely to reap philosophical insights from Broad’s manner of meticulously setting out and carefully assessing the theories that prima facie provide solutions to a given philosophical problem. This feature of his writings is aptly described by A. J. Ayer: “The subject is discussed from every angle, the various possibilities judiciously set out, the precedents cited, the fallacious arguments exposed: nothing is skimped: looking for reason, we are not fobbed off with rhetoric” (Part of my Life, 1977, pp. 117–8). Broad combines fairness, astuteness as well as rare powers of observation.

Philosophers who influenced Broad were (apart from the great philosophers of the past) his teachers at Cambridge, Russell and Moore, and J. M. E. McTaggart and W. E. Johnson; at St. Andrew’s he received important additional influence from G. F. Stout and A. E. Taylor. The diversity of their thought is mirrored in Broad’s own exceptional range of interests.

Broad led a relatively uneventful life—“not unlike,” he says in his “Autobiography,” “that of a monk in a monastery” (1959b, p. 67). He hadn’t been out of the British Isles until 1946 when he visited Sweden—a country he “fell in love with,” and returned to nearly every year. On a professional level he made acquaintances with several Swedish philosophers (such as Konrad-Marc Wogau at Uppsala University). In the academic year 1953–4 Broad visited the University of Michigan at Ann Arbor and the University of California at Los Angeles. He writes with great warmth of the “kindness and hospitality” with which he was received, and adds with characteristic modesty: “It was good fun to be treated as a great philosopher” (1959b). Broad was a homosexual, and never married.

1. Brief Chronology of Life and Works

  • 1887, born in Harlesden, now a suburb of London, on December 30.
  • 1905, wins a science scholarship to Trinity College, Cambridge.
  • 1911, elected to a fellowship at Trinity; assistant to G. F. Stout, at the University of St. Andrew’s.
  • 1914, lecturer at Dundee (at the time a part of St. Andrew’s); during World War I combines lecturing duties with work in a chemical laboratory for the Ministry of Munitions; publication of Perception, Physics, and Reality.
  • 1920, elected Professor of Philosophy at the University of Bristol.
  • 1923, Fellow and Lecturer in Moral Science at Cambridge; publication of Scientific Thought.
  • 1925, publication of The Mind and Its Place in Nature.
  • 1930, publication of Five Types of Ethical Theory.
  • 1933, Knightbridge Professor of Moral Philosophy at Cambridge; publication of Examination of McTaggart’s Philosophy, Vol. I.
  • 1938, publication of Examination of McTaggart’s Philosophy, Vol. II.
  • 1953, retires from Knightbridge Professorship; publication of Religion, Philosophy and Psychical Research.
  • 1962, publication of Lectures on Psychical Research.
  • 1971, dies age 83 on March 11 in his rooms in Trinity College, Cambridge.

2. Perception

Broad dealt with perception in several works. He is well known as an advocate of The Theory of Representational Realism, according to which our perceptions are indirect cognitive transactions with the world: a perceptual experience of a worldly object is not an immediate awareness of the object itself, but mediated by an immediate awareness of a sensum. For example, when we see a coin from a certain angle we are immediately aware of an elliptical sensum.

2.1 Naïve Realism Delineated

Broad’s treatment of perception in The Mind and Its Place in Nature sets off with a careful description of Naïve Realism. And this seems a suitable place to begin our exposition of his theory of perception. What, then, does Naïve Realism say? To pre-philosophical reflection perception seem to provide us with some sort of immediate cognitive contact with a physical object, for example a bell. Consider a situation where we perceive a bell. Compare this situation with one where we are merely thinking of a bell. There is a deep difference between the situations. We could “vaguely express one part of this difference by saying that in the perceptual situation we are ‘in more immediate touch with’ the bell than in the thought-situation” (1925, p. 144).

This rough and ready picture of the Naïve Realist view must, however, be slightly modified. Suppose we visually perceive an apple. Clearly there is a sense in which we do not perceive “all” of the apple. There is a sense in which we are aware of only a part of its surface; and we are (in that sense) aware only of the sensible colour of that part but not of its sensible temperature. Thus perception provides us with a cognitive contact a part of the apple, but no more. It is, then, strictly speaking only a part of the apple with which we are acquainted; it is only a part of the apple that is sensuously manifested to us. (1925, pp. 148–50.)

Broad does not equate or identify the perception of a worldly object with the sort of immediate acquainting awareness we have (or seem to have) with its facing surface (pace Chisholm, 1957, p. 154). He is, on the contrary, careful to point out that the experience features more than this awareness: it also has an intentional content. Broad designates this the external reference of the experience. By virtue of its external reference the experience of the apple represents the sensuously manifested constituent as an integral part of a larger spatio-temporal whole, having a whole array of properties not sensuously manifested to us. (1925, pp. 150–4.)

What is the nature of the external reference? Broad warns against the risk of unduly “intellectualising” perception. The external reference is not reached by inference from what is sensuously manifested; nor is it a belief or judgement simply accompanying the awareness of the manifested constituent: “At the purely perceptual level, people do not have the special experience called ‘belief’ or ‘judgment’” (1925, p. 153).[1]

2.2 Prehension: the Core Notion of Perceptual Immediacy

When we visually perceive the apple we have an experience in which its facing red surface is a sensuously manifested objective constituent; we perceive the apple but are, strictly speaking, only acquainted with a portion of it.[2] Broad sometimes prefers to say that we prehend the facing surface (or ostensibly prehend the surface). Now the notion of prehension is fundamental for an understanding of Naïve Realism as well as Representational Realism, so it seems advisable to briefly take a somewhat closer look on Broad’s account of it.

Broad does not think it is possible to give a strict definition of phrases such as “S prehends x as red” or the equivalent phrase “x sensibly presents itself to S as red”.[3] What one can do is to contrast the notion of prehension with other notions: “The meaning of these phrases cannot be defined, it can only be exemplified. One thing that is certain is that to prehend x as red is utterly different from judging that it is red or knowing that it is red” (1952a, p. 13; italics in original). For example, in the dark and with my eyes shut I may very well judge (or know) that the apple is red. But in such conditions I am “not prehending anything as red, or, what is precisely equivalent, nothing is sensibly presented to me as red” (ibid, p. 14). Broad notes that this is substantiated by the fact that a cat or a dog that lacked concepts might, it seems, have a prehension of something as red even though it cannot (lacking the requisite concepts) literally know or judge that it is red.

Prehension is, however, intimately related to knowledge. Broad asks us to consider a subject “which has appropriate general concepts and is capable of making judgements and knowing facts”. Suppose this subject prehends a certain particular object as red. Then this “suffices to enable him to know the fact that it is red. Whether he does or does not actually contemplate this fact at the time depends on various contingent circumstances” (1952a, p. 14; Broad’s emphasis).[4]

2.3 Naïve Realism Dismantled

Naïve Realism, properly articulated, says that when we perceive a physical object it is only a part of the apple that is sensuously manifested to us: this, and only this, is an objective constituent in the perceptual situation. Now can this view be defended? Broad does not think so. He levels several arguments against Naïve Realism, two of which will receive attention here.

The Argument from Hallucination. Consider a veridical perception and compare it with a subjectively indistinguishable delusive or hallucinatory perception, for example that of a drunkard hallucinating a pink rat. Neither a pink rat nor a part of a pink rat could be a sensuously manifested constituent in the delusive situation.

And, since there is no relevant internal difference between the veridical and the delusive perceptual situation, it is reasonable to suppose that in no case does a perceptual situation contain as a constituent the physical object which corresponds to its epistemological object, even when there is such a physical object. (1925, p. 156; italics added.)

It might be held that the subjective indistinguishability of a veridical perceptual and a hallucinatory situation entails that the experiences have an identical constitution (and that, therefore, no material object is a constituent even in the veridical situation). That is, however, not Broad’s position: it could be that a material object is an objectively manifested constituent in a veridical situation (whilst not in the indistinguishable hallucinatory situation). He holds, however, that that is not the more reasonable view of the matter.

The Argument from Illusion. Consider a person perceiving a penny from a series of slightly different angles and distances. He would unhesitatingly assume that in each of the slightly differing perceptual situations the facing brownish surface of a certain penny is sensuously manifested to him. But in Broad’s view this could not be so: “If he carefully inspects the objective constituents of these perceptual situations he will certainly find that they seem to be of different shapes and sizes” (1925, p. 158). The objective constituent will in most of the situations seem elliptical rather than circular. This indicates, Broad claims, that in each perceptual situation, the constituent—the sensuously manifested item—cannot be the top of the penny. What happens is that instead of being immediately aware of the circular surface of the penny (as he takes himself to be) he is immediately aware of an elliptical item, an elliptical sensum. Hence it is an elliptical sensum rather than the circular surface of the penny that is manifested to the subject. The same holds mutatis mutandis when we perceive a white sheet of paper dimly lit by a candle. On careful consideration it seems clear that the paper looks yellowish to us. So what we are immediately aware of is a yellowish sensum rather than the white sheet of paper we are looking at.

In order to bring out at least some of the facets of Broad’s theory it seems advisable to turn to a few of the many objections that have been raised against it.

(1) It has sometimes been objected that the argument from illusion is flawed from the start since there is usually no risk of anyone being taken in by the situation. Broad’s response to this objection is clear. When we look at the penny from an oblique angle it appears elliptical, but not in the sense that anyone is taking in by the situation, and mistakenly comes to believe or judge that the penny is elliptical. He is explicit on the point: “‘looking elliptical to me’ stands for a peculiar experience, which, whatever the right analysis of it may be, is not just a mistaken judgement about the shape” (1923, p. 237). The penny sensibly appears elliptical. And it is this rather than any supposed tendency to be deceived which creates problem for Naïve Realism (pace Austin 1962, p. 26).

(2) It has often been objected that philosophers who have made use of the argument from illusion that they neglect the fact of perceptual constancy. In his later works Broad admits that this complaint is justified. However, the “recognition of the phenomenon of constancy merely shifts the point of application of the argument” (1947b, p. 112). There is a class of perceptual experiences of a material object, X, where constancy holds; there is also a class of experiences of X where constancy breaks down. In theory it is logically possible to hold that the facing surface of X is sensuously presented in the perceptual experiences belonging to the first class but not in the experiences belonging to the second class. “But, in view of the continuity between the most normal and the most abnormal cases of seeing, such a doctrine would be utterly implausible and could be defended only by the most desperate special pleading” (1952a, p. 9).

What I just said might create the impression that Broad’s phenomenology is rather unsophisticated or crude. On the whole that is certainly not the case. For example, he points out that “the visual field” is three-dimensional: “A sphere does look different from a circle, just as a circle looks different from an ellipse” (1923, p. 290; Broad’s emphasis). And the same holds, mutatis mutandis, for the intimately related characteristics distance and depth; these are also purely visual characteristics of the visual field (pp. 295–300).[5]

(The constancy objection to any argument of illusion that appeals to cases such as the penny seen obliquely is a compelling one, to say the least. In spite of that I will, for convenience of exposition, occasionally make use of the example below.)

(3) A stock objection to sense-data theories has been that they invite scepticism with regard to the external world. Broad regrets the sceptical consequences but—given the strength of the case for the sense-datum theory—does not consider them sufficient grounds for dismissal. Seeking to preserve as much as possible of the common sense notion of material objects he argues for the existence of such objects conceived of as having “primary qualities” such as shape, size, and position (apart from such properties as electric charge and mass). (1925, pp. 195–204.) Not surprisingly, he rejects the idea that material objects have “secondary properties” such as (phenomenal) redness or (phenomenal) hotness. Broad is perfectly clear that it does not follow from the fact that such properties are never sensuously manifested in our perceptual experiences that the material objects causing our experiences lack these properties: it does remain possible that there are red and green, hot and cold material objects even though they are not objects of acquaintance. He argues, however, that there is no reason to believe that material objects have these properties. (1925, pp. 205–6.)

2.4 Rivalling Accounts of Perceptual Sensations

Now Broad is perfectly clear that the sensum analysis of perception cannot be established simply by pointing to such phenomena as the penny seen obliquely. He does not for a moment suppose that it is possible to logically infer that there is an elliptical sensum from the proposition that something sensibly appears elliptical (pace Barnes 1945, p. 113). What he claims is that there are considerations that can be adduced in support of the sensum analysis. When we look at the penny from the side we certainly seem to be aware of something elliptical. So we certainly seem to have before our minds something that is elliptical. Obviously “we can quite well mistakenly believe a property to be present which is really absent, when we are dealing with something that is only known to us indirectly, like Julius Cæsar or the North Pole” (1923, p. 241; Broad’s emphasis). But there are phenomenological differences between perception and belief (or thought) that seem to call for different accounts of their nature. In perception we seem to be dealing with properties that are presented to us. Consider the case of perceiving a stick half immersed in water. Here

we are dealing with a concrete visible object, which is bodily present to our senses; and it is very hard to understand how we could seem to ourselves to see the property of bentness exhibited in a concrete instance, if in fact nothing was present to our minds that possessed that property. (1923, p. 241; Broad’s emphasis; see also pp. 244–5)

I believe that what Broad is driving at here is that perceptual consciousness has a presentational nature, and it is this that makes it plausible to regard it as involving the literal presence of objects with various qualities, such as colours in the case of visual perception, sounds in auditory, etc.

Broad’s theory of perception employs an act-object analysis of sensations. Lest it should be thought that he should be incapable to think of any alternative account it should be noted that he examines such an analysis as early as in 1921. G. F. Stout and H. A. Prichard defended such an alternative (both of whom Broad held in the highest regard). Their account could be considered an early version of the adverbial analysis of sensations. Broad asks us to consider a headache. “It is by no means clear that a headache means a state of mind with a headachy object [i.e. an act with a certain object]; it seems on the whole more plausible to say that that it is just a headachy state of mind” (1921b, p. 392). To have a headache is not to be aware of a headachy object but to feel in a certain way.[6] The alternative account claims that this holds mutatis mutandis for any type of sensation. Thus what is described as ‘a sensation of red’ is a unitary state of mind, and strictly speaking not a state which decomposes into an act of sensing and a sensed red patch.

Broad provides a fairly thorough discussion of the relative merits of the adverbial and the act-object analysis. In a nutshell, his conclusion is that although the adverbial analysis is highly plausible regarding such mental phenomena as bodily feelings; but it is implausible when it comes to those of visual and auditory experiences: the act-object analysis is the more plausible account of such experiences, in Broad’s opinion. (See Broad 1923, pp. 252–7.)[7]

So much for sensations. What about sensa? What are they on Broad’s account? A brief answer must suffice here. Sensa are a certain kind of transitory particulars, which in the case of visual perception have such properties as shape, size, colour, etc (1925, p. 181f.).[8]

2.5 The Theory of Representative Perception

The position Broad reaches is the following. A perceptual experience has a certain intentional content. It differs from thought- and belief-episodes by including a sensory phase, and it is primarily this that is responsible for the distinctive phenomenology of perception. The sensory phase consists of sensations. These decompose into acts of sensing and object sensed, sensa. A sensum has the phenomenal properties that the perceived object (sensibly) appears to have—red or warm or squeaky. An act of sensing a sensum constitutes an immediate acquainting awareness of the sensum in question. Although our perceptual experiences seem to grant us an acquaintance with the facing surfaces of material objects, sensa are the only items we are acquainted with.

The intentional content—the external reference—of a perceptual experience is in a certain sense based upon sensa (thought not in the sense that there is a train of swift inference leading from the presence of a sensum to the mind to a certain perceptual belief). (1923, pp. 246–7.) It is this content which represents the environment as featuring a physical object so-and-so. Sensa are clearly incapable of carrying such content. Furthermore, from the very nature of the case the general notion of physical object “cannot have been derived by abstraction from observed instances of it, as the notion of ‘red’ no doubt has been.”[9] In fact, general concept of a physical object “is not ‘got out of’ experience until it has been ‘put into’ experience. It is best described as an innate principle of interpretation which we apply to the data of sense-perception” (1925, p. 217).

3. Time

It is possible to distinguish roughly three different phases in Broad’s philosophy of time.

In his (1921a) Broad defends a Russellian theory of time. On this Eternalist view past, present, and future are equally real. There is nothing ontologically special about the present: the present is no more real than the past or the future. Accordingly Broad rejects Presentism—the view that only the present is real—as “mere rhetoric rooted in confusion” (1921a, p. 226). Presentism has its roots in two errors. One of these errors is to equivocate between two different senses of “co-existence”. “In one sense the parts of any related whole co-exist; in another only those events that occupy the same moment of time co-exist.” The whole course of the history obviously cannot co-exist in the latter sense, but this does not “prevent it from co-existing in the first”. The other error is to believe that “past, present, and future are essential characteristics of objects in time in the same way as before and after are, instead of being analysable into the temporal relations of states of mind and their objects” (p. 337). Thus Broad rejects the view that past, present, and future are characteristics possessed by objects in time. These “characteristics” are a mere reflection of our subjective perspective on objects. Some of our mental states are essentially contemporary or simultaneous with their objects, e.g. our immediate awareness of sense data. Other states are essentially later than their objects, e.g. memories. (Cf. p. 336.) A related, and perhaps more important facet of Broad’s (1921a) position here, is his adoption of a Russellian analysis of tensed discourse. According to this analysis—versions of which were later to become orthodox—the function of tensed verbs or temporal adjectives in tensed statements is performed in the analysans by a tenseless copula, IS, and a temporal relation—earlier than, simultaneous with, or later than. Thus “It is raining” (or “It is raining now”) is unpacked as “It IS raining at a moment simultaneous with my assertion that it is raining”; “It has rained” (or “It rained in the past”) is analysed as “It IS raining at a moment earlier than my assertion that it has rained”; “It will rain” (or “It will rain in the future”) is read as “It IS raining at a moment later than my assertion that it will rain”. (Cf. p. 331.)

In Scientific Thought (1923) Broad rejects the Eternalism he had defended in his (1921a) article. He now advances a theory that “accepts the reality of the present and the past, but holds that the future is simply nothing at all” (1923, p. 66). An all-important corollary of this Growing Block Theory is the thesis that temporal passage is a fundamental feature of reality. This feature is accounted for in terms of what Broad holds is the most fundamental form of change, becoming. Becoming is the coming into existence of events.

Nothing has happened to the present by becoming past except that fresh slices of existence have been added to the total history of the world. The past is thus as real as the present. On the other hand, the essence of a present event is, not that it precedes future events, but that there is quite literally nothing to which it has the relation of precedence. The sum total of existence is always increasing, and it is this which gives the time-series a sense [i.e. direction] as well as an order. A moment t is later than a moment t* if the sum total of existence at t includes the sum total of existence t* together with something more. (1923, p. 66–7; Broad’s italics.)

An event is present by virtue of being the most recent increment of reality; when the event is present there is, as Broad says, nothing to which it stands in the relation of precedence. The event becomes past by virtue of acquiring new relations, and it acquires these relations because the sum total of existence has been increased by the addition of fresh slices of reality. Temporal passage is the continual growth of the sum total of existence.[10]

One of the rivalling views on time Broad discusses is a theory that might be labeled The Moving Spotlight Theory. The Moving Spotlight Theory accepts the eternalist view that the past, the present, and the future are equally real; it regards “the history of the world as existing eternally in a certain order of events.” But it differs from the Russellian theory in that it accepts presentness as an irreducible feature of reality. So the fact that the leaf is falling now is not to be analysed as the fact that the event is simultaneous with an utterance or a specific type of mental state. The theory claims that presentness is a characteristic moving along the order of events: “Along [the order of events], and in a fixed direction, […] the characteristic of presentness [is] moving, somewhat like the spot of light from a policeman’s bull’s-eye traversing the fronts of the houses in a street. What is illuminated is the present, what has been illuminated is the past, and what has not yet been illuminated is the future” (1923, p. 59).

Broad is critical of this theory. To understand the nature of time, The Moving Spotlight Theory makes use of a spatial analogy. Such analogies “may be useful for some purposes, but it is clear that they explain nothing.” Firstly, Broad asks us to consider the successive lighting of presentness—now on one event and now on another, and so on. This is itself an event (or a series of events), “and ought therefore to be a part of the series of events, and not simply something that happens to the latter from outside” (1923, p. 60). If we suppose (as we seem compelled to) that it is not a part of the original series of events, we are launched on a vicious regress of time-dimensions. For then the successive lightning of later events would have to be conceived of as an event of the second order—happening in a time-dimension different from the original one formed by the series of first-order events. Secondly he presents a related line of reasoning—sometimes termed The Rate of Passage Argument: If anything moves, it must move with some determinate velocity. It will always be sensible to ask ‘How fast does it move?’ But since the series along which presentness is supposed to move is itself temporal, this question becomes: ‘how great a lapse of time 1 does presentness traverse in a unit of time 2?’ Again, a regress of time-dimensions is imminent. (Both of these arguments receive a clearer formulation and more extensive treatment in Broad (1938).)[11]

Broad’s later account of time differs in some significant respects from both of the earlier accounts. He now views what he calls absolute becoming as “the rock-bottom peculiarity of time”. Absolute becoming manifests itself “as the continual supersession of what was the latest phase by a new phase, which will in turn be superseded by another new one. This seems to me to be the rock-bottom peculiarity of time, distinguishing temporal sequence from all other instances of one-dimensional order, such as that of points on a line, numbers in order of magnitude, and so on” (1959, p. 766).

This theory has, in Broad’s opinion, various advantages. One advantage mentioned is that it seems to avoid the difficulties with the rate of times passage—difficulties which besets the Moving Spotlight Theory, but arguably also the Growing Block Theory. The proposed theory also avoids presupposing that “what has not yet supervened and what has already been superseded in some sense ‘co-exist’ with each other and with what is now occurring,” which he views as a defect of the Moving Spotlight Theory. More interestingly, it avoids what Broad now regards as a defect of the Growing Block Theory, viz. that of presupposing “that phases, which have already supervened and been superseded, in some sense ‘co-exist’ with each other and with that which is now happening” (1959, p. 767).

(For a book-length study on Broad's philosophy of time, see Oaklander 2020.)

4. Free Will

Broad discusses the topic of free will in his inaugural lecture “Determinism, Indeterminism, and Libertarianism” (1934). In this rather dense lecture he approaches the issue by associating free will with moral responsibility. More specifically, he frames it in terms of the conditions necessary and sufficient for the applicability of ‘ought’ and ‘ought not’ to actions. Everyone admits, he says, that there is some sense of ‘could’ in which ‘ought’ and ‘ought not’ entail ‘could’. The question revolves around the sense of ‘could’ involved here: in precisely what sense of ‘could’ is it that if you to ought to perform an action you could perform that action?

Let us introduce a couple of Broad’s stipulative definitions. An action is obligable if and only if it is an action of which ‘ought to be done’ or ‘ought not to be done’ can be predicated. An action is substitutable if either it was done but could have been left undone, or was left undone but could have been done.

An action is obligable if and only if it is, in a certain sense, substitutable. There are several different senses of ‘could’ and hence of substitutability. Initially Broad focuses on a sense of ‘could’ which he calls voluntary substitutability. Consider an action A that was not performed. Suppose that if the agent had willed (chosen, decided) to do A she would have done it. In that case A is voluntarily substitutable. Suppose, however, that she would not have done A even if she had willed to do it. If that’s the case, A is not voluntarily substitutable. Broad takes it as evident that voluntary substitutability is a necessary condition for obligability. That is, he takes it as evident that,

A is obligable only if A is voluntarily substitutable.

But is it also a sufficient condition? Is it also true that,

If A is voluntarily substitutable then A is obligable.

Broad presents an argument in favour of a negative answer, i.e. in favour of the answer that it could very well be true that someone would have done an action if he had willed to do it, while it is nonetheless false that the action is obligable (and hence false that it is voluntarily substitutable). We are asked to consider a person who gradually becomes addicted to a drug like morphine. At the earlier stages he could have willed with sufficient strength to ensure that the temptation would have been resisted. At the later stages he could not. “Now at every stage, from the earliest to the latest, the hypothetical proposition would be true: ‘If he had willed with a certain degree of force and persistence to avoid taking morphine, he would have avoided taking it’. Yet we would say at the earlier stages that he ought to have resisted, whilst at the final stages we should be inclined to say that ‘ought’ and ‘ought not’ have ceased to apply” (1934, p. 200). In other words, in the later stages we are inclined to hold that the action of abstaining from morphine has ceased to be obligable, in spite of the fact that it remains true that if he had willed with sufficient force and persistence to abstain he would have abstained.

This is Broad’s version of an argument sometimes raised against the classical compatibilist conditional analysis of ‘S could have done otherwise’.[12] According to the classical compatibilist analysis this is to be understood simply as ‘if S had willed to act differently S would have acted differently’. The argument shows that this will not do: there are situations where an agent would have acted otherwise if she had willed differently but nonetheless could not have acted differently simply because she could not have willed to act differently.[13]

So voluntary substitutability is not sufficient for obligability: for an action to be obligable it is not sufficient that the agent would have acted otherwise if she had willed otherwise. It is also clear that a further condition must be fulfilled, viz. that she could have willed to act otherwise. This leads us to the question as to the correct analysis of ‘could have willed differently’. Broad examines a conditional analysis according to which this means:

If S had willed differently in the past S’s conative-emotional dispositions and knowledge about S’s own nature would have been so constituted that S, at the time when S acted, would have willed differently.

Can we perhaps claim an action to be obligable if (a) it is voluntarily substitutable, and (b) the agent could have willed to do it, in the specified conditional sense of ‘could have willed’? In other words, is the joint condition of (a) and (b) sufficient for obligability? Broad rejects this proposal. Suppose the agent could not have willed differently in the past (say six months ago). It is “surely irrelevant to say that, if he had done so his conative dispositions would have been different at a later stage from what they in fact were then, and that he would have willed otherwise than he then did” (1934, p. 204). As he points out, at this juncture it is tempting to refer to still earlier volitions (say twelve months ago). He contends, however, that this is useless since the very same difficulty will reappear.

Broad holds, then, that neither ‘could have acted differently’ nor ‘could have willed differently’ can be given a conditional analysis. Having discarded conditional types of substitutability he turns to categorical substitutability. If an action is obligable it must be substitutable in a categorical sense. “We must be able to say of an action, which was done, that it could have been avoided, in some sense of ‘could’ which is not definable in terms of ‘would have, if’” (1934, p. 204). Note that the quoted passage merely states that categorical substitutability is a necessary condition of obligability. It is clear, however, that Broad also takes it to be a sufficient condition. Thus, his position is that,

A is obligable if and only if A is categorically substitutable.

Now precisely what is categorical substitutability? As we shall presently see, Broad claims that this notion is only partly intelligible.

Categorical substitutability involves a negative and a positive condition. These are necessary and jointly sufficient for obligability. The negative condition says that the agent’s willing of a certain action was not completely determined by the nomic and singular conditions which existed at the time of willing. Not surprisingly, Broad regards an action that merely fulfils this condition as “an accident, lucky or unlucky as the case may be.” Neither the agent nor “anything else in the universe can properly be praised or blamed for it” (1934, p. 212; Broad’s italics).

The positive condition (which must also be fulfilled) says that the willing of the action is “literally determined by the agent or self, considered as a substance or continuant, and not by a total cause which contains as factors events in and dispositions of the agent” (1934, p. 214–5; Broad’s italics). Thus a free action is an action that is caused by the agent.

(Note that the view that there are agent-caused effects is a form of indeterminism, since it says that there are certain events which, although they are indeed caused, are not fixed as a matter of natural law.)

Broad rejects the idea of agent-causation as unintelligible.

Now it is surely quite evident that, if the beginning of a certain process at a certain time is determined at all, its total cause must contain as an essential factor another event or process which enters into the moment from which the determined event or process issues. I see no prima facie objection to there being events which are not completely determined. But, in so far as an event is determined, an essential factor in its total cause must be other events. How could an event possibly be determined to happen at a certain date if its total cause contained no factor to which the notion of date has any application? And how can the notion of date have any application to anything that is not an event? (1934, p. 215; Broad’s emphasis.)

If an agent wills to perform an action at a certain time there must be a process or event that occurs at that time (or the moment before). Thus there must be something about the agent that explains why the willing of the action started precisely at that time rather than at a slightly earlier or later time. The agent per se will not do.

The position Broad reaches is a version of what is sometimes called free will pessimism: free will is incompatible with determinism, but there is no viable form of indeterminism which leaves room for free will, either; therefore, free will does not exist—indeed could not exist.

5. Emergentism

In the last chapter of his monumental The Mind and Its Place in Nature Broad defends an Emergentist position with respect to the relation between mind and matter: mental properties are, in his opinion, distinct from physical properties; they are properties that emerge when neurophysiological processes have attained a sufficiently high degree of complexity. His discussion and defense of Emergentism features two chief elements. Firstly, there is a meticulous examination of the concept of emergence as such; secondly, there is a discussion of whether there is reason to think that emergent phenomena actually exist.

5.1 The Concept of Emergence

Chapter Two of The Mind and its Place in Nature is devoted to a thorough discussion of the notion of emergence. In this chapter Broad is primarily interested in the notion or concept of emergence per se. Thus he is there not so much interested in the actual existence of emergent phenomena.

An emergent property of an aggregate or a whole is, very roughly, a property that is something over and above the properties of its parts and the way they are arranged in the aggregate. Broad prefers to capture this in epistemic terms: an emergent property of a whole is a property that it is impossible to logically infer from even the most complete knowledge of the properties of the parts of the whole. A property that can be so inferred is a reducible property. He captures the contrast between emergent and reducible properties in the following passage.

Put in abstract terms the emergent theory asserts that there are certain wholes composed (say) of constituents A, B, and C in a relation R to each other; that all wholes composed of constituents of the same kind as A, B, and C in relations of the same kind as R have certain characteristic properties; that A, B, and C are capable of occurring in other kinds of complex where the relation is not of the same kind as R; and that the characteristic properties of the whole R(A, B, C) cannot, even in theory, be deduced from the most complete knowledge of the properties of A, B, and C in isolation or in other wholes which are not of the form R(A, B, C). The mechanistic theory rejects the last clause of this assertion. (1925, p. 61)

‘The mechanistic theory’ is Broad’s label for the theory that today is termed ‘physicalism.’

Suppose a certain biological feature, e.g. the capacity for nutrition, is an emergent property. This means that the property is not a mere result of an immensely high degree of organisational complexity at the chemical level. The property is, to be sure, nomically dependent on the chemical level, but it is not a mere resultant of the properties, relations, and laws operative at that level. If nutrition were a mere resultant property it would be a reducible property; it would be a property that theoretically can be inferred from features at the chemical level (i.e. the properties, relations and laws which characterise the constituents in isolation or in other wholes than the one in question).

Broad’s concept of emergence is weakly epistemic; his notion is at heart metaphysical: the epistemic predicament that we are in vis-à-vis an emergent property reflects an important metaphysical fact about the property in question, viz. that it is neither identical with nor constituted by the properties and relations of the constituents of the whole in question. Thus Broad’s notion of emergence contrasts with a strongly epistemic notion which, very roughly, says that a property is emergent for a finite epistemic subject when provided with fairly extensive information about the properties and relations of the constituents the subject is still unable logically to infer that property from the information in question although the property in fact is reducible to the features of the constituents.

Hempel and Oppenheim (1948) raise several objections to Emergentism. Brief attention to two of their objections will help bring out at least a couple of the many facets of Broad’s subtle account. Firstly, to assume that emergent phenomena exist is to assume that there are certain phenomena that have “a mysterious quality of absolute unexplainability”. They confidently assert that “emergence […] is not an ontological trait inherent in some phenomena; rather it is indicative of the scope of our knowledge at a given time” (p. 119). This objection in effect implies that the metaphysical notion of emergence is dismissed in favour of a strongly epistemic notion.

Broad stresses that it is an empirical question whether a certain biological or chemical phenomenon is emergent or not. It is always possible that what strikes us as an emergent property of a biological of chemical phenomenon “is due to our imperfect knowledge of microscopic structure or to our mathematical incompetence” (1925, p. 81). He also emphasises the practical importance of seeking to devise reductions for as many properties as possible: that ambition is “the natural and proper ambition of the scientists” (1933, p. 268).

It should perhaps also be added that although emergent properties are indeed “unexplainable” in the sense that that they are not susceptible to a reductive explanation, this does not mean that they are “unexplainable” in every sense: the inherence of an emergent property in a particular whole does admit of an explanation by nomic subsumption. We can explain its inherence in terms of the nature of the whole and an emergent law. The law of course remain a brute fact. But surely, so do some laws on any account of the world.

Hempel and Oppenheim also object that Emergentists are erroneously committed to regard the mass or weight of a whole as an emergent property. (Weight is, of course, a reducible characteristic if there ever was one!) The reason they give for this is that not even the weight of a whole can be logically inferred from premises that solely contain propositions about the weight of the parts; in addition a law is needed which expresses the weight of the whole as some specific mathematical function of the weight of the constituent (1948, p. 119). However, Broad’s account clearly anticipates the objection. He provides the reason why a property such as weight (or mass) should not be conceived as an emergent property. To “explain the behaviour of any whole in terms of its structure and components we always need two independent kinds of information. (a) We need to know how the parts would behave separately. And (b) we need to know the law or laws according to which the behaviour of the separate parts is compounded when they are acting together in any proportion and arrangement” (1925, p. 61; Broad’s italics). So to know about the mass of a whole X we need to know the mass of X’s parts and the principle according to which the mass of a whole is determined by the mass of the parts. It is through experience that we have found that the mass of a whole is the mathematical sum of the mass of the parts; and it is through experience we have found that the very same principle (or law of composition) is applicable to any type of whole. To see this, consider the last clause of Broad’s characterisation of emergent properties above. The clause says that an emergent property of a certain whole cannot, even in theory, be logically inferred from the most complete knowledge of the properties of the parts in isolation or in other wholes which are not of the form to be found the whole in question. Is this applicable to the mass of a certain whole? Is it applicable to the mass of X? No, certainly not: we are able to logically infer the mass of any whole, including X, from knowledge of the masses of parts in isolation or in wholes other than X.

5.2 The Reality of Emergence

It is one thing to delineate the contours of the notion of emergence, another to argue that emergent phenomena actually exist. A wide variety of phenomena have been held to be emergent. Apart from consciousness, various chemical and biological phenomena have been held to be emergent. Broad is not willing to rule out a physicalistic reduction of chemistry and biology to physics: chemical and biological phenomena might, he believes, very well be reducible to complex microphysical processes. In his opinion, however, consciousness is a different matter. We will turn to consciousness in a moment. When it comes to biology and chemistry he declares that he does not see any “a priori impossibility in a mechanistic biology or chemistry” (1925, p. 72). He stresses that it is in practice enormously difficult to know whether, say, a certain biological feature such as nutrition is emergent or not. It is evident from what Broad says that he recognises that the Emergentist stance has its dangers in that it tends to encourage acceptance of laws and properties as ultimate and irreducible. There is a danger in this because, as he notes, reductive explanations have proved remarkably successful in the past, and there is the possibility that what we take to be an emergent phenomenon is in fact reducible.

5.3 Broad’s Knowledge Argument

In the last chapter of his book Broad presents a taxonomy of no less than seventeen different theories which are “possible theoretically on the relation between Mind and Matter” (1925, p. 607). By a process of elimination Broad arrives at a more wieldy number of theories. Two of the remaining rivalling theories are Physicalism—in Broad’s terminology, “Mechanism”—and Emergentism. Let us now take a closer look at his case for Emergentism.

Broad adduces a version of what has come to be known as The Knowledge Argument in favour of an Emergentist position with respect to the place of consciousness in nature. He asks us to assume that there is a mathematical archangel. The archangel’s mathematical and logical capability is unlimited; in addition he is gifted with the capacity to perceive “the microscopic structure of atoms as easily as we can perceive hay-stacks”. Now would there be any limit to the archangel’s knowledge of the world? Broad’s answer is Yes.

Take any ordinary statement, such as we find in chemistry books; e.g, “Nitrogen and Hydrogen combine when an electric discharge is passed through the mixture of the two. The resulting compound contains three atoms of Hydrogen to one of Nitrogen; it is a gas readily soluble in water and possessed of a characteristic smell.” If the mechanistic theory be true the archangel could deduce from his knowledge of the microscopic structure of atoms all these fact but the last. He would know exactly what the microscopic structure must be; but he would be totally unable to predict that a substance with this structure must smell as ammonia does when it gets into the human nose. The utmost that he could predict on this subject would be that certain changes would take place in the mucous membrane, the olfactory nerves and so on. But he could not possibly know that these changes would be accompanied by the appearance of a smell in general or of the peculiar smell of ammonia in particular, unless someone told him so or he had smelled it for himself. If the existence of the so-called “secondary qualities,” or the fact of their appearance, depends on the microscopic movements and arrangements of material particles which do not have these qualities themselves, then the law of this dependence are certainly of the emergent type. [1925, p. 71–2]

The archangel knows all the physicalistic (mechanistic) truths. There are, however, some truths that he does not know. But if Physicalism were true the archangel should know all truths. Physicalism is, therefore, false.

If sound, Broad’s argument establishes the negative conclusion that mental phenomena are distinct from neurophysiological processes. By itself it does not establish the Emergentist position, since the conclusion is consistent with the truth of, say, Substance Dualism (or what Broad calls “Dualism of incompatibles”). Broad’s overall argumentation for Emergentism, however, also includes a fairly thorough discussion that seeks to undermine various lines of argument to the effect that mental properties and physical properties are incompatible, i.e. arguments to the effect that a material whole such as a nervous system could not possibly have mental properties. These are arguments that, if successful, would rule out Emergentism (which is a form of property dualism) in favour of substance dualism. Broad’s case for Emergentism, then, includes more than his knowledge argument and the simple methodological point that Emergentism is a more ontologically economical position than substance dualism.

6. Metaphilosophy

Broad distinguishes two chief aspects of philosophical thinking. He labels these critical philosophy and speculative philosophy. Critical philosophy has two chief tasks, one of which is to analyse “certain very general concepts such as number, thing, quality, change, cause, etc.” (1924, p. 82). We make use of these and a whole host of other concepts in science and ordinary life. Although we are typically able to apply them fairly consistently, we are not able to analyse them. Nor are we able to state their precise relations to each other. One task of critical philosophy is to provide analyses of such concepts. It becomes evident that this is an important task as soon as it is realized that when we seek to apply these concepts to odd or exceptional cases we are often uncertain whether they are applicable. For example, it might be unclear whether a certain individual with a multiple personality disorder is a person or not.[14] Such difficulties arise because “we are not clear as to what we mean by ‘being a person’” (1924, p. 83). There is, therefore, a need for an intellectual discipline that seeks to analyse and define this and many other concepts.

In science and in daily life we do not merely use unanalysed concepts. “We also assume uncritically a number of very fundamental propositions. In all our arguments we assume the truth of certain principles of reasoning. Again, we always assume that every change has a cause. And in induction we certainly assume something—it is hard to say what—about the fundamental ‘make-up’ of the existent world” (1924, p. 84).

The second task of critical philosophy is to examine these and other fundamental assumptions; it is “to take these propositions which we uncritically assume in science and daily life and to subject them to criticism” (ibid.).[15]

In order to analyse a proposition we must seek to attain a clearer grasp of the concepts featured in the proposition. Thus the analysis and criticism of a proposition depends on the analysis of concepts. And vice versa: by reflecting on the propositions in which a certain concept occurs we clear up the meaning of it.

Now, critical philosophy is one part or aspect of philosophical thinking. But critical philosophy “does not include all that is understood by philosophy. It is certainly held to be the function of a philosopher to discuss the nature of Reality as a whole, and to consider the position and prospects of men in it” (1924, p. 96). This aspect of philosophical thinking is speculative philosophy.

Speculative philosophy seeks to work out a view of reality as a whole by taking into account the whole range of human experience—scientific, social, ethical, æsthetic, and religious: “Its business is to take over all aspects of human experience, to reflect upon them, and to try to think out a view of Reality as a whole which shall do justice to all of them” (1924, p. 96).

Broad’s idea is that the various aspects of human experience and (putative) facts linked to these provide a point of departure for philosophical reflection—an exceedingly important sort of reflection aiming at a reasoned view of Reality as a whole.

As can be gathered from the above, philosophical thinking features, according to Broad, a distinctive type of birds-eye view. He calls it synopsis. Let us take a somewhat closer look at this. The plain man as well as the professional scientist or scholar

conduct various parts of their living and their thinking in relatively watertight compartments; turn blind eyes to awkward, abnormal, or marginal facts; and skate successfully on the surface of the phenomena. But the desire to see how the various aspects of experience hang together does arise from time to time in most intelligent men, and philosophers are persons in whom it is especially strong and persistent. Now I understand by synopsis the necessary preliminary towards trying to satisfy this desire, viz. the deliberate viewing together of aspects of human experience which are generally viewed apart, and the endeavour to see how they are inter-related. (1947a, p. 4)

On reflection it is clear that the synoptic stance is necessary for the discovery of various inadequacies in our picture of reality, inadequacies resulting from a far too insular perspective on reality. The synoptic stance will, in effect, lead to the discovery of latent philosophical problems: “It is synopsis, revealing prima facie incoherence, which is the main motive to philosophical activity” (1958, p. 121; cf. 1947a, p. 16). And it is clearly only after we have discovered and successfully addressed these problems that we may lay claim to a satisfactory picture of reality as a whole.

Broad gives several examples of how synopsis is featured in philosophical thinking. One of these is taken from the free will problem (1947a, pp. 8–11). In a very condensed form the main facts germane to the problem are these: (i) When we consider a situation in which we did a certain action, we are quite convinced that we could have done otherwise: we could have performed an alternative action. On reflection it seems clear that ‘could’ is used in some sense that is not analysable in terms of ‘would have, if’. (ii) Our moral judgments seem to presuppose that a person who in fact willed to do a certain action could have willed otherwise. (iii) Given the past, the actual situation and the laws of nature it seems impossible that anything other should have happened than what in fact did happen. If so, how can our volitions be other than completely determined? (iv) It is difficult, then, to reconcile the notions of moral responsibility with the view that our volitions are completely determined.

The problem of free will is discovered when we look at (i) and (ii) in the light of (iii) In other words, the very problem is discerned only because we have envisaged these facts together, i.e. because we have taken a synoptic view of the facts.

7. Other Philosophical Work

Probability and Induction. Broad dealt with problems regarding induction—“the glory of science and the scandal of philosophy”[16] —in a number of papers. A sample of his work on the subject is the two early papers entitled “The Relation Induction and Probability” (1918, 1920). Broad’s focus is on the nature and justification of inductive inferences. He argues that unless the conclusions of such inferences are cast in terms of probability they all involve a formal fallacy. However in order to arrive at justified inductive conclusions we cannot simply place our confidence in any of the known principles of probability theory (such as those we employ in reasoning with regard to artificial situations with bags containing red and white balls, and the like): we need some further premise. Unfortunately, this premise is “extremely difficult to state […] so that it shall be at once plausible and non-tautologous” (1918, p. 389). Broad attempts to articulate the supreme principle needed. He argues at length that the principle needed says not simply (and crudely): “there is uniformity in nature.” It also says that the particular things or substances in the world subject to uniformity belong to a variety of natural kinds. Indeed, on closer reflection it is clear that “[t]he notions of permanent substances, genuine natural kinds, and universal causation are parts of a highly complex and closely interwoven whole and any of them breaks down hopelessly without the rest” (1920, p. 44). Notable also is the logic of conditions that Broad’s formulates in “The Principles of Demonstrative Induction” (1930b). He may quite well be the first who gave systematic attention to this topic.[17]

Causation. Causation is dealt with in several of Broad’s works (beginning as early as his first book, Perception, Physics and Reality, 1914). The logic of conditions formulated in (1930b) would square well with some version of the regularity theory of causation. However, in several works rather penetrating criticism of that theory is offered (e.g., in Ch. 3, 1925). In (1933) he tries to formulate an alternative. Causality involves something between regularity and logical entailment; there is some form of necessity, but not the kind involved in logical entailment. The latter is an absolute necessity. Consider the proposition ’Anything that has shape would have extension’. This is not only true in the actual world: it is true in all logically possible worlds; there could not have been a world in which there were things that had shape but lacked extension. Now compare the proposition ’Anything that had inertial mass would have gravitational mass’. There could not be things in the actual world which had inertial mass but lacked gravitational mass. But there could have been a world in which there were things that had inertial mass but lacked gravitational mass. The kind of necessity involved here is a contingent necessity. (Cf. 1933, pp. 242–3.) Broad is, however, rather skeptical of the alternative he has sought to formulate. He says with characteristic candor that the notion of a necessity which is contingent might very well be “sheer nonsense”.

The Unconscious. Broad examines issues surrounding “the unconscious” at some length in The Mind and Its Place in Nature. His objective is to capture a (literal) sense in which an experiential mental state may be said to be unconscious. Although he rejects the view that the notion of unconscious experience is incoherent he argues that there is no compelling reason to assume that such actually exist. The assumption that there is a pure neural state with causal properties that are similar to those of a certain mental state is sufficient to explain the facts.

Time Consciousness. Broad gave two different accounts of temporal experience.[18] Consider an experience of a succession of notes: DoReMi. The earlier account claims that what one is aware of is temporally extended; it includes the present note as well as the immediate past ones: “what is sensed at any moment stretches a little way back behind that moment” (1923, p. 348). What you are aware of when Mi is present extends to, and so includes the past notes Re and Do. On the later account we are strictly speaking aware only of the present note, Mi. But this awareness is coupled with a representation of the past notes under a distinctive mode of temporal presentation. Broad introduces the notion of presentedness. When you are aware of the present note Mi it is apprehended as possessing the maximum degree of presentedness, while the note Re is represented as possessing a less degree of presentedness, and Do a still lesser degree.

The Philosophy of Parapsychology. Parapsychology is the study of apparently paranormal events. Broad seeks to capture the nature and importance of the subject. A paranormal event is an event that seems prima facie to conflict with what he terms a basic limiting principle, i.e. a principle that “we unhesitatingly take for granted as the framework within which all our practical activities and our scientific theories are confined” (1953, p. 7). There are a number of such principles. One says that an event cannot begin to have any effect before it has occurred; another that knowledge of the future is impossible except in certain familiar manners, such as by inference from present facts. The basic limiting principles seem to “cover very satisfactorily an enormous range of well-established facts of the most varied kinds”. We are therefore “naturally inclined to think that they must be all-embracing” (p. 8). And for that reason these principles are of immense importance to our overall view of the universe and our place in it. But just in proportion to this importance is “the philosophic importance of any well-established exception to them” (p. 9).

The Philosophy of Religion. Broad’s writings on this subject have the virtues characteristic of everything he wrote—thoroughness, lucidity and fairness. Broad rejects the traditional arguments for the existence of God. His essay “Arguments for The Existence of God” (1939) features a searching critique of the cosmological argument and the ontological argument (regarding the argument from design, Broad states that he has nothing to add to the critique of Hume and Kant). He argues inter alia that the conclusion of the cosmological argument has a consequence that few would stomach, viz. that there are no really contingent facts, although many facts “seem contingent relative to our ignorance”. As to the ontological argument Broad claims that the notion of the greatest possible being is “meaningless verbiage” unless the properties that are essential to the notion of God admit of an intrinsic maximum. He argues that that condition is not satisfied. Therefore, the argument is “wrecked before ever it leaves port.” In the latter part of his essay Broad turns to the argument from religious experience (in what might quite well be the first systematic treatment of the argument). The position he takes is, in a nutshell, this. If a person has an experience that she takes to be an experience of an X, it is reasonable to conclude that she did experience an X unless there is some positive reason to think otherwise. To refuse to apply this principle to religious experiences is not reasonable. The question then is whether there is some positive reason to think that religious experiences are delusive. But on reflection it turns out there is no such reason. We may therefore conclude that religious experiences are probably veridical.

Ethics. In writings up to, and including Five Types of Ethical Theory Broad assumes that ethical sentences express judgements. He favours an intuitionist or non-naturalist analysis. In later works, however, he is undecided: it could be that ethical sentences express judgements; but, alternatively, they may express emotions or commands. Notwithstanding this, Broad fruitfully (and indefatigably!) classifies alternative types of ethical theories, uncovers their underlying assumptions, and draws out their logical consequences. As to normative ethics, Broad does not think the utilitarian view that there is one and only one criterion of right action can be sustained. Neither did he accept hedonism. There are, he argues, other bearers of intrinsic value and disvalue than pleasure and pain.

Broad made many specific contributions to the subject of moral philosophy that could be mentioned. Here are three of these. (i) There is a fine discussion of psychological egoism (a discussion where he, as he quite correctly says, gives the psychological egoist “the longest possible run for his money”).[19] After Butler there is hardly need of further nails in the coffin of that theory. But because of its shrewd and perceptive treatment of human motivation Broad’s essay is nonetheless of remaining interest. (ii) In Five Types Broad tentatively suggests a version of what is currently known as The Fitting Attitude Analysis of value. He writes with characteristic cautiousness: “I am not sure that ‘X is good’ could not be defined as meaning that X is such that it would be a fitting object of desire to any mind which had an adequate idea of its non-ethical characteristics” (p. 283).[20] (iii) In an early paper (1916), Broad seems to anticipate ideas gaining currency much later among moral and political philosophers. He suggests that the goodness of a complex state of affairs is not merely a function of the value of its parts. Its goodness is restrained by a condition which says, roughly, that the best possible state of affairs is one where the producers of some good are as nearly as possible identical with the enjoyers of that good. The principle says that the contributors to a cooperative scheme is bound by a duty of fairness. The principle Broad alludes to could be seen as an early version of the Principle of Fairness (later to be found in the work of H. L. A. Hart and John Rawls).[21]

The History of Philosophy. Broad wrote on a variety of scattered figures in the history of philosophy, e.g. Bacon, Butler, Berkeley, Newton, Leibniz and Kant. A notable work is Five Types of Ethical Theory that (alongside careful discussions of such philosophers as Spinoza and Hume) includes a pioneering study of Henry Sidgwick’s The Methods of Ethics (1874), written at a time when Sidgwick’s work had passed into nearly complete oblivion. Noteworthy here also are the two posthumously published book length studies on Leibniz and Kant, respectively. Both of these contain shrewd philosophical comment that are of general philosophical interest.


Primary Literature: Broad’s Works

[1914] Perception, Physics, and Reality, Russell and Russell, New York, 1973; this edition is a reissue of the work, originally published by Cambridge University Press in 1914.
[1915] “Phenomenalism,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 15: 227–51.
[1916] “On the Function of False Hypotheses in Ethics,” International Journal of Ethics, 26: 377–97; reprinted in Broad 1971, 43–62 and [available online].
[1918] “The Relation between Induction and Probability (I)” Mind, 27: 389–404. Reprinted in Broad (1968); page references to the original publication.
[1919] “Is there ‘Knowledge by Acquaintance’?” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 2: 206-20.
[1920] “The Relation between Induction and Probability (II)” Mind, 29: 11–45. Reprinted in Broad (1968); page references to the original publication.
[1921a] “Time,” in Encyclopedia of Ethics and Religion, J. Hastings, et al. (eds.), Vol. 12, Edinburgh and New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons.
[1921b] “The External World,” Mind, 30: 385–408.
[1923] Scientific Thought, London: Kegan Paul.
[1924] “Critical and Speculative Philosophy,” in Contemporary British Philosophy (First Series), ed. by J.H. Muirhead, London: Allen and Unwin.
[1925] The Mind and Its Place in Nature, London: Kegan Paul.
[1928] “Time and Change,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 8: 175–88.
[1930a] Five Types of Ethical Theory, London: Kegan Paul.
[1930b] “The Principles of Demonstrative Induction,” I and II, Mind, 39: 302–17, 426–39. Reprinted in Broad (1968); page references to the original publication.
[1933] An Examination of McTaggart’s Philosophy (Volume I), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
[1934] “Determinism, Indeterminism, and Libertarianism,” inaugural lecture delivered at Cambridge in 1934. Reprinted in Broad (1952); page references to this.
[1938] An Examination of McTaggart’s Philosophy (Volume II, Part 1), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1938.
[1939] “Arguments for The Existence of God,” I and II, in Broad (1953); originally in Journal of Theological Studies, 40: 16–30, 156–67.
[1942] “Berkeley’s Argument about Material Substance,” Proceedings of the British Academy, 28: 119–138; page references to the reprint by Haskell House Publishers, New York, 1976.
[1945] “Some Reflections on Moral Sense Theories in Ethics,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 45: 131–66.
[1947a] “Some Methods of Speculative Philosophy,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 21: 1–32.
[1947b] “Professor Marc-Wogaus Theorie der Sinnesdata” (I and II), Mind, 56: 1–30, 97–131.
[1949] “The Relevance of Psychical Research to Philosophy,” in Broad (1953); originally in Philosophy, 24: 291–309.
[1952a] “Some Elementary Reflexions on Sense-Perception,” Philosophy, 27: 3–17.
[1952b] Ethics and The History of Philosophy, London: Routledge.
[1953] Religion, Philosophy and Psychical Research, London: Routledge.
[1954a] “Berkeley’s Denial of Material Substance,” The Philosophical Review, 63: 155–81.
[1954b] “Emotion and Sentiment,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 13: 203–214.
[1958] “Philosophy,” Inquiry, 1: 99–129.
[1959a] “A Reply to My Critics,” in Schilpp (1959).
[1959b] “Autobiography,” in Schilpp (1959).
[1968] Induction, Probability, and Causation. Selected Papers by C. D. Broad, Dordrecht: Reidel.
[1971] Broad’s Critical Essays in Moral Philosophy, edited by D. R. Cheney; New York: Humanities Press.
[1975] Leibniz, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
[1978] Kant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
[1985] Ethics, C. Levy (ed.); Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff Publishers.

Secondary Literature

  • Alexander, Samuel, 1920. Space, Time, and Deity, 2 volumes, London: Macmillan & Co., Limited
  • Barnes, W.H.F., 1945. “The Myth of Sense-Data,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 45: 89–117.
  • Beckermann, A., 1992. “Supervenience, Emergence, and Reduction,” in Beckermann, A., H. Flohr, and J. Kim, eds. (1992).
  • Beckermann, A., H. Flohr, and J. Kim (eds.), 1992. Emergence or Reduction?, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Blake, R.M., 1925. “On Mr. Broad’s Theory of Time,” Mind, 34: 418–35.
  • Braithwaite, R.B., 1928. “Time and Change,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 8: 162–74.
  • Campbell, C.A., 1938. “In Defence of Free Will,” inaugural lecture; reprinted in Campbell (1967).
  • –––, 1967.In Defence of Free Will and Other Philosophical Essays, London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Chisholm, R.M., 1964. “Human Freedom and the Self,” The Langley Lecture, University of Kansas; reprinted in Chisholm’s On Metaphysics, 1989.
  • –––, 1957. Perceiving: A Philosophical Study, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Cowan, R., 2015. “C. D. Broad on Moral Sense Theories in Ethics,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Virtual Issue: Methods of Ethics), 3: 168–183.
  • Dainton, B., 2000. Stream of Consciousness: Unity and Continuity in Conscious Experience, London and New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 2001. Space and Time, Ithaca: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
  • Ducasse, C.J., 1959. “Broad on the Relevance of Psychical Research to Philosophy,” in Schilpp (1959).
  • Feigl, H., 1958. The ‘Mental’ and the ‘Physical’, Minneapolis, Minnesota University Press, 1967; originally in Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 2: 370–497.
  • Frankena, W.K., 1959. “Broad’s Analysis of Ethical Terms,” in Schilpp (1959).
  • Gustavsson, K., 2002. Emergent Consciousness. Themes in C. D. Broad’s Philosophy of Mind, Göteborg: Acta Philosophica Gothoburgensis.
  • Hare, R.M., 1959. “Broad’s Approach to Moral Philosophy,” in Schilpp (1959).
  • Hempel, C.G. & Oppenheim, P., 1948. “The Logic of Explanation,” in Readings in Analytical Philosophy, H. Regnell (ed.), Lund: Läromedelsförlagen, 1971; originally in Philosophy of Science, 15: 132-75.
  • Körner, S., 1959. “Broad on Philosophical Method,” in Schilpp (1959).
  • Kyburg, H. E., 1960. “Demonstrative Induction,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 21: 80–92.
  • Mabott, J.D., 1955. “The Specious Present,” Mind, 64: 376–83.
  • Marc-Wogau, K., 1959. “On C. D. Broad’s Theory of Sensa,” in Schilpp (1959).
  • –––, 1943. “Die Theorie der Veränderung bei C. D. Broad,” Theoria, 9: 91–123; translated as “C. D. Broad’s Theory of Change” in Marc-Wogau (1967).
  • –––, 1967. Philosophical Essays, Gleerup: Lund.
  • Markosian, N., 1993. “How Fast Does Time Pass?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 53: 829–44.
  • Maund, B., 2003. Perception, Bucks: Acumen, 2003.
  • McLaughlin, B.P., 1992. “The Rise and Fall of British Emergentism,” in Beckermann, A., H. Flohr, and J. Kim, eds. (1992).
  • McNaughton, D. and P. Rawling, “On C. D. Broad’s ‘On the Function of False Hypothesis in Ethics’,” Ethics, 125: 512–516.
  • Merricks, T., 2006. “Good Bye Growing Block” Oxford Studies in Metaphysics (Volume 2), D. Zimmerman (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Mundle, W.C.K., 1954. “How Specious is the ‘Specious Present’?” Mind, 63: 26–48.
  • –––, 1959. “Broad’s Views about Time,” in Schilpp (1959).
  • Nielsen, K., 1994. “Broad’s Conception of Critical and Speculative Philosophy,” Dialectica, 48: 47–54.
  • Oaklander, L.N., 2020. C. D. Broad’s Philosophy of Time, New York: Routledge.
  • O’Connor, T., 1994. “Emergent Properties,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 31: 91–104.
  • Price, H.H., 1932. Perception, London: Methuen & Co. Ltd., second revised ed., 1950.
  • –––, 1959. “The Nature and Status of Sense-Data in Broad’s Epistemology,” in Schilpp (1959).
  • Rashbrook, O. W., 2012. “Broad’s Account of Temporal Experience,” Journal for the History of Analytic Philosophy, 1: 1–25.
  • Redpath, Th., 1997. “Cambridge Philosophers VIII: C. D. Broad,” Philosophy, 72: 571–594.
  • Robinson, H.M., 1994. Perception, London: Routledge.
  • Rowe, W.L., 1982. “Religious Experience and The Principle of Credulity,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 13: 85–92.
  • Savitt, S.F., 2002. “On Absolute Becoming and The Myth of Passage,” in Time, Reality, and Experience, Craig Callender (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Schilpp, P.A. (ed.), 1959. The Philosophy of C. D. Broad, New York: Tudor Publishing Company.
  • Segelberg, I., 1953. Studier över medvetandet och jagidén, [Studies of Consciousness and The Idea of The Self], Stockholm, Svenska Tryckeriaktiebolaget; translated in Segelberg (1999).
  • –––, 1999. Three Essays in Phenomenology and Ontology, Stockholm, Thales, 1999; contains Segelberg’s three books, including Segelberg (1953), translated by Herbert Hochberg and Susanne Ringström Hochberg.
  • Smith, A. D., 2002. The Problem of Perception, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Stace, W.T., 1959. “Broad’s Views on Religion,” in Schilpp (1959).
  • Stephan, A., 1992. “Emergence—A Systematic View on its Historical Facets,” in Beckermann, A., H. Flohr, and J. Kim (eds.) (1992).
  • Thomas, E., 2019. “The Roots of C. D. Broad’s Growing Block Theory of Time,” Mind, 128: 527–549.
  • von Wright, G.H., 1959. “Broad on Induction and Probability,” in Schilpp (1959).

Other Internet Resources


I would like to thank Jan Almäng, Jens Johansson and the anonymous referees for helpful comments.

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