Edmund Burke, author of Reflections on the Revolution in France, is known to a wide public as a classic political thinker: it is less well understood that his intellectual achievement depended upon his understanding of philosophy and use of it in the practical writings and speeches by which he is chiefly known. The present essay explores the character and significance of the use of philosophy in his political thought. That thought is of the very first importance for intellectual history and for the conduct of politics. This essay is the first attempt to examine its philosophical character and to connect the latter with Burke’s political activity. In doing so it shows the importance of the philosophical elements in Burke’s thought and that these contribute important ways to his political thought.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Life
- 3. Intellectual orientation
- 4. Philosophical and Historical Writings
- 5. Political style: some parliamentary applications
- 6. Burke’s practical reasoning
- 7. Burke and the American Revolution
- 8. Philosophical Character of Political Disposition
- 9. The Revolution in France
- 10. Problems of Interpretation
- 11. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The name of Edmund Burke (1730–97)  is not one that often figures in the history of philosophy . This is a curious fate for a writer of genius who was also the author of a book entitled A Philosophical Enquiry. Besides the Enquiry, Burke’s writings and some of his speeches contain strongly philosophical elements—philosophical both in our contemporary sense and in the eighteenth century sense, especially ‘philosophical’ history. These elements play a fundamental role within his work, and help us to understand why Burke is a political classic. His writings and speeches therefore merit attention as examples of attention to both ideas and to history, and of the role of this attention in practical thought. His work is also, as we see shall see at the end of this entry, an achievement that challenges assumptions held by many of our contemporaries. One way or another, then, Burke is a vitally important figure. Yet there is very little academic writing about Burke and philosophy outside of that Enquiry. This is a significant omission from the history of political thought, for at least three reasons. One is that though much has been written about Burke, including work placing him in relation to other political writers, yet how he thought has not been made clear. A second is that the rational content of his thinking has not been made evident, precisely because its philosophical component has not been identified. Thirdly, because the manner and content of his thought have not been identified in the way the case warrants, we read of Burke’s ‘mystic spirit’ (Spurgeon 1922, p. 100) or the ‘irrationalism’ of his writing (Butler 1984, p. 35). This matters not only with respect to historical truth, important though that is, but also because Burke is sometimes treated as a symbolic or instructive figure for contemporary political action (cf., e.g., Norman 2013), and in significant ways marks an instructive contrast with some current ways of thinking. This being so, it is especially important to get the historical figure right.
Burke was born at Dublin in Ireland, then part of the British Empire, the son of a prosperous attorney, and, after an early education at home, became a boarder at the school run by Abraham Shackleton, a Quaker from Yorkshire, at Ballitore in County Kildare. Burke received his university education at Trinity College, Dublin, a bastion of the Anglican Church of Ireland. Thence he proceeded to the Middle Temple at London, in order to qualify for the Bar, but legal practice was less attractive to him than the broader perspective which had captured his attention at university (or earlier). It was first as a writer, and then as a public figure that he made his career. Burke’s intellectual formation did not suggest that his career would be purely philosophical. Indeed, for those without an independent income or a clerical vocation such a way of life was not very feasible in Britain or Ireland. Only the Scottish universities offered posts that did not require holy orders, but they were not very receptive to non-presbyterians. Burke married in 1756, and had a son by 1758, so that a career of Humean celibacy, in which philosophy was cultivated on a little oatmeal, was not for him.
Indeed, like Hume, Burke found that there was more money in narrative works and in practical affairs than in philosophy. Burke’s earliest writings include A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our Ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful (1757), and A Vindication of Natural Society (1756). Thereafter he was co-author of An Account of the European Settlements (1757) and began An Abridgement of English History (c.1757–62). From 1758, at least until 1765, he was the principal ‘conductor’ of the new Annual Register. In 1765, Burke became private secretary to the Marquis of Rockingham (who had just become First Lord of the Treasury) and was elected to the British House of Commons in the same year. He remained there, with a brief intermission in the Autumn of 1780, for nearly twenty-nine years, retiring in the Summer of 1794. Burke, who was always a prominent figure there and sometimes an effective persuader, gave a great many parliamentary speeches. He published versions of some of these, notably on American Taxation (1774), Conciliation with America (1775), and Fox’s East India Bill (1783). These printed speeches, though anchored to specific occasions, and certainly intended to have a practical effect in British politics, were also meant to embody Burke’s thought in a durable form. In that respect, they parallel his Thoughts on the Cause of the Present Discontents (1770), and Reflections on the Revolution in France (1790), amongst other non-oratorical writings.
Burke’s activity as a parliamentarian and political writer embraced a great many concerns. Prominent amongst these were the problems of British rule overseas, in North America, India and Ireland. His name, however, has been linked most strongly by posterity to a critique of the French Revolution. Burke was certainly more notable as a pundit than an executive politician, holding office only twice, for a few months in 1782 and 1783. His political life was punctuated in May 1791 by a break from some of his party colleagues over the significance of the Revolution. Thereafter, assisted not least by the turn it took in 1792–3, he became a largely independent commentator on domestic politics and international affairs in An Appeal from the New to the Old Whigs (1791), Letters on a Regicide Peace (1795–7), and A Letter to a Noble Lord (1796). Burke in his last years, especially from 1792, turned his attention to his native Ireland. He failed to found a political dynasty, and he left no lasting school in parliamentary politics: the last politician who can be regarded plausibly as a disciple, the addressee of A Letter to William Elliot (1795), died in 1818. As Sidgwick observed, ‘though Burke lives, we meet with no Burkites’ (Sidgwick 1877 [2000, 195]). Nor did Burke bequeath a straightforward legacy to any political party or to any ideological brand of thought, though plenty have tried to appropriate him wholly or partly. The difficulties that they might find in colonising his thought are apparent from an account of it that emphasizes its philosophical aspects.
3. Intellectual orientation
Burke’s mind, by the time he left Trinity, had two features of especial interest: one was an orientation towards religion, improvement and politics, the other a philosophical method. The latter derived from his university education, the former from reflection on the Irish situation. Burke was born into an Ireland where reflective intellect had its social setting in a small educational elite, much of it connected with the Church of Ireland. This elite contemplated a political class which owned much of the land, and consisted primarily of a gentry and peerage, headed by the King’s representative, the Lord-Lieutenant; but it saw too a tiny professional class, and a huge, illiterate, impoverished peasantry. The aim of the educational elite, which it shared with some of the political class, was improvement in the broadest sense, that is to say it connected self-improvement through the influence of the arts & sciences, and through the development of intellectual skills, with moral culture and with economic development. The ability of the educated, the politicians and the rich to take constructive initiatives contrasted starkly with the inability of the peasantry to help itself: peasants relieved their misery principally through spasms of ‘savagery’ against their landlords’ representatives, but such violence was repressed sternly and helped nobody. (For Burke, ‘savagery’ refers to any conduct that falls below certain standards.) The Irish situation suggested a general rationale of practice to those who wished to improve themselves and others: improvement, if it was to spread outside the educational elite, must spring from the guidance and good will of the possessing classes: from the landlord who developed his property, from the priest who instructed and consoled the poor, and from the lord lieutenant who used his power benevolently. The only obvious alternative was the use of force—and that was both destructive and fruitless. Burke retained all his life a sense of the responsibility of the educated, rich and powerful to improve the lot of those whom they directed; a sense that existing arrangements were valuable insofar as they were the necessary preconditions for improvement; and a strong sense of the importance of educated people as agents for constructive change, change which he often contrasted with the use of force, whether as method or as result.
This experiental orientation of Burke’s mind was turned from attitude into articulate thought through the educational medium of the Irish Enlightenment. For example, some points that may seem distinctively Burkean belonged first to Berkeley. Berkeley saw no advantages in improper abstraction or in a mythical golden age. Burke’s unwillingness to judge institutions and practices without first connecting them with other things, his disinclination ‘to give praise or blame to any thing which relates to human actions, and human concerns, on a simple view of the object in all the nakedness and solitude of metaphysical abstraction’ (RRF, W & S 1981–2015, viii.58), is a practical judgement that implies a conceptual counterpart like Berkeley’s view that ‘when we attempt to abstract extension and motion from all other qualities, and consider them by themselves, we presently lose sight of them, and run into great extravagancies’ (Berkeley, Principles of Human Knowledge [1948–57, vol. ii, 84].) In both cases, philosophical wariness matched a distaste for considering aspects of objects in permanent isolation from the other aspects with which they were essentially connected. This suspicion of abstract ideas accompanied a suspicion of schemes for considering people in abstraction from their present situation, and accompanied too doubts about a golden past: Berkeley rejected ‘the rude original of society’ (Berkeley, The Querist [1948–57, vol. vi, 141]) and had no time for ‘declaimers against prejudice’ who ‘have wrought themselves into a sort of esteem for savages, as a virtuous and unprejudiced people’ (Berkeley, Discourse addressed to Magistrates [1948–57, vol. vi, 206]), and it need not be emphasized that Burke shared such views. Both belonged to an elite which considered improvement to be necessary, and sought to make it through the agencies in church, state and education that were really available at the time. Above all, they shared an intellectual temper: they sought to see things how they are, with an eye to bettering the condition of society. But Burke was not Berkeley, and though their similarities indicate a shared philosophical orientation, Burke had his own way of developing it. To individuate him, we must turn to what he acquired from the Trinity syllabus, and how he used his acquisitions.
This syllabus, by the time Burke became an undergraduate student at the age of fifteen (1744), not only gave attention to Aristotelian manuals but also to ‘the way of ideas’ enshrined in Locke’s Essay concerning Human Understanding. Such a syllabus, in its Aristotelian aspect, indicated the unity of all departments of literature—or learning as we now call it — which was congenial to one with Burke’s passion for knowledge — he wrote of his furor mathematicus, furor logicus, furor historicus, and furor poeticus.  It also indicated the range of achievements, and the range of needs, that people had generated. The extent and variety of human activity impressed itself upon Burke. If his practical situation in Ireland suggested that not reason alone but also Christianity and persuasion were necessary to improvement, Burke could now understand these needs in terms of a scheme of learning, and indeed had the opportunity to develop the corresponding skills. At Trinity he founded a debating society, where he developed his oratorical technique on theological, moral and political topics, as well as commenting on the economic and literary life of Ireland in a periodical run by himself and his friends. This acquisition of skills was complemented by an opportunity for philosophical development. This applied in particular to Burke’s antecedent bent towards the imaginative branches of literature, especially romances of chivalry, such as the Faerie Queen by Edmund Spenser (the collateral ancestor from whom he derived his Christian name). Creations of alternative worlds by the mind now received a philosophical warrant from another part of the Trinity syllabus. Locke had recognized that the mind devised complex ideas. The mind had a power to receive simple ideas from the senses and from its own reflection on them, and to make out of this material further ideas that had no referent in the world of sensation. Burke’s interest did not extend to the centaurs that Locke had mentioned, but the ability to make complex ideas and to assemble them in new ways was central to Burke’s way of proceeding. His philosophical method involved thinking in terms of complex ideas about a connected range of matters, matters connected by their place in a programme of human improvement. Reason was fundamental to this method—but not reason alone, as we see in Burke’s sole work devoted wholly to philosophy, which made use of Locke on the way to an original destination.
4. Philosophical and Historical Writings
Locke’s Essay concerning Human Understanding of 1690 was the first attempt to give a survey of the mind’s workings that was both comprehensive and post-aristotelian. It soon fostered intense interest in epistemology, psychology and ethics. Burke seems to have worked on the imagination—the faculty of devising and combining ideas — as an undergraduate, and continued to do so into the 1750s. The result, A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our Ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful (1757) emphasized, unsurprisingly, the activity of mind in making ideas and the influence of these upon conduct. It was in the first place an exercise in clarifying ideas, with an eye to refining the ways in which the arts affect the passions: in other words, a refinement of complex ideas was taken to be the precondition of a refinement of practice.
The roots of human activity, Burke thought, were the passions of curiosity, pleasure and pain. Curiosity stimulated the activity of mind on all matters. Ideas of pain and of pleasure corresponded respectively to self-preservation and society, and society involved the passions of sympathy, imitation and ambition. Imitation tended to establish habit, and ambition to produce change. Sympathy did neither, but it did establish an interest in other people’s welfare that extended to mental identification with them. The scope of sympathy could embrace anyone, unlike compassion, which applied only to those in a worse situation than oneself. Such width of concern had an obvious reference to the social order (and may express also Burke’s thinking about the theatre). The passions, understood in Burke’s way, suggested at once that society as such answered to natural instincts, and that it comprised elements of continuity and improvement alike. Burke then proceeded to show that self-preservation and its cognates suggested the complex idea of the sublime, and not least the idea of a God who was both active and terrible. Beauty, on the other hand, comprised a very different set of simple ideas, which originated in pleasure. Sublime and beautiful therefore sprang from very different origins.
The diverse views rejected by A Philosophical Enquiry were united by the pervasive assumption that human nature in an unschooled condition, as it came from the hand of nature, and understood without direct reference to God, was in some sense adequate to the human condition. Rousseau’s Discourse on Inequality was at odds with Burke’s view of the naturalness of society, and with his view that solitude, because unnatural, was a source of pain, as well as with Burke’s position that sympathy, rather than merely compassion, was a key emotion. Burke’s view that the mind formed ideas of beauty from the ideas of pleasure it received contradicted the view of Shaftesbury and Hutcheson that beauty (like goodness) was a perception presented by a sixth or moral sense. Burke’s further view that our simple ideas of pain went towards a complex idea of a God who inspired terror, was very distant from the deists’ view that He could be understood by our natural faculty of reason alone and that as such He was known to be benevolent and not much besides. These three positions alike presumed that human faculties, unimproved by human effort and considered with little relation to God, were sufficient to inspire conduct. It is not surprising that Burke rejected them.
Burke not only thought that nature needed improvement, but also recognized its ambiguity. Ambition, for instance, was the source of enterprise and of improvement: but Burke did not suppose that the enterprise produced by this characteristic was in all its manifestations a benefit to its exponent, and indeed once called it ‘the cause of the greatest disappointments, miseries and misfortunes, and sometimes of dangerous immoralities’ . If Burke had a forward-looking mind, and believed that human nature both required and led to development, he did not think that progress was necessarily an unqualified gain: for instance, in discussing the civilizing of American ‘savages,’ he saw a diminution of their courage as well as an increase in their moral goodness. (For Burke, ‘savagery’ contrasts with civilisation, and unlike some other figures, did not suppose that savagery was equivalent to all behaviour of indigenous peoples).
A Philosophical Enquiry suggests that Burke was developing the loyalties of his youth through the medium of philosophical psychology. A God who presents Himself through nature in a way that is often found in the Bible, and who devises and sustains nature in a way that leads man to society and facilitates the improvement of that society, has set Himself to support Christianity, power and improvement, and probably education too. At the same time, however, other aspects of the book suggest that this support was delivered to them, not on their own terms, but on the terms of a philosophy which recognizes the ability of the imagination to transform people’s understandings of themselves and society.
Anyone who thinks in terms of complex ideas can see that these can be framed easily in different ways, none of which need correspond to anything found in the external world: combine the ideas of a man and a horse, as Locke had suggested, and you have the idea of a centaur. No one who reads romances would find difficulty in imagining a society differing beyond recognition from its current arrangements. A classic instance of political imagination, indeed, is Burke’s own Vindication of Natural Society, which presents as an alternative model of society an organization—if that is the word—devoid of civil government, church and significant private property.
Burke, in other words, could think through not only his own grouping of claims but also their opposites. This reflects, no doubt, other features of his mind apart from his understanding of complex ideas, such as the skill in seeing the strong side and the obverse of any argument, which Burke had acquired in his undergraduate study of rhetoric; and it reflects, too, a habit of versatility begun in his debating society, for there speakers were called upon to play roles; and no doubt it is reminiscent, again, of Burke’s undergraduate interest in the theatre. Yet beyond all of these, it suggests that in the large topics which experience had put before Burke—religion, morals, arts and sciences—argument had not produced an overwhelmingly decisive case. For A Vindication also seems to make a case against everything he had espoused.
If argument did not deliver incontestable conclusions, where was one to go? Burke’s answer, in his notes, was that where this was so, people should prefer the conclusions that accorded with their natural feelings. The complement to this emphasis upon feeling was to look to the results of affective preference—that is to say, a criterion for conduct in such a case was what tended to make people better and happier.
This was a judgement in the first place about personal conduct, and the manner of applying it to matters on the larger scale of civil society was less obvious. Here the judgement of benefit, whether ethical or pleasurable, might be harder to discern. In order to make it plain in A Vindication, Burke applied a reductio ad absurdum to principles in theology that he had rejected by showing their consequences for politics.
For that is what A Vindication provided. This short work was written in the persona of the recently deceased Henry St. John, Viscount Bolingbroke (1678–1751). Bolingbroke had been a Tory pillar of the state, and therefore of the church too; but the posthumous publication of his philosophical works revealed that far from being an Anglican, he had not been a Christian—but rather a deist. A Vindication suggested the ills that Bolingbroke had attributed to the artifice of revealed religion could be paralleled by those generated by civil society. One logic, indeed, was attributable on these terms to both Christianity and civil society: that just as the latter distributed the means of power unequally, so too did Christianity distribute those of salvation unequally (for not everyone had heard, and fewer believed, the Gospel). The deism of Bolingbroke implied the principle that God treated everyone impartially, and that the means to salvation were therefore to be found in a medium available to all, and thus available from the earliest point of human history, namely reason. It was easy to add, as Burke did, that if the principle that such an original nature was the mature expression of God’s ordinances were to be applied to civil society, the normative result would be a regression from complex and therefore civilised forms to a simple society, even to animal-like primitiveness—some of the matter of A Vindication paraphrases Rousseau’s Discourse on Inequality (Sewell 1938, 97–114). So Bolingbroke the deist and Bolingbroke the politician could be made to look very much at odds with each other. This gap offered Burke an opening. A Vindication satirized Bolingbroke’s schizophrenic position, employing a good deal of transparent exaggeration to make ‘his’ criticisms of civil (‘artificial’) society seem very absurd: and Burke added a preface to the second edition which made the disjunctive alternatives clear so that even he who ran might read.
Yet it is hard not to recognize that Burke himself was telling the reader, in a way that entered the consciousness all the more forcibly because it accompanied entertainment, that civil society really did involve some evils, just as he identified losses as well as gains from progress in other connexions. Burke’s Vindication, speaking in the voice of pseudo-Bolingbroke, lamented the situation of miners: and ‘the innumerable servile, degrading, unseemly, unmanly, and often most unwholesome and pestiferous occupations’ of ‘so many wretches’ was lamented by Burke without any such persona, thirty-four years later in Reflections on the Revolution in France. Such criticism, taken in itself, is undoubtedly telling. Burke never dissembled the existence of the real misery that he observed in civil society. Instead, he pointed out that wretched practices could not be detached from the larger pattern of habits and institution in which they were implicated, and that this pattern had a beneficial effect overall. Burke recognized misery, did not deny it, and therefore had a lively sense of the imperfection of arrangements, however civilized they might be. His sense of duality in nature and society resembles Adam Smith’s.
Burke’s position, therefore, was poised. But it was not merely a matter of pointing out what made for good and what for ill in civil society: it was a matter of responsibility—of choosing morally appropriate words. This was so for a philosophical reason, because of the very nature of the words involved. Burke’s Philosophical Enquiry divided words into three categories. First, there were aggregate words, which signified groups of simple ideas united by nature, e.g. man, horse, or tree. Second, there were simple abstract words, each of which stood for one simple idea involved in such unities, as red, blue, round or square. Thirdly, and most importantly for our purpose, came abstract compound words. These united aggregate words and simple abstract words. As such, they did not have a referent that existed in nature. A Philosophical Enquiry argued that no compound abstract nouns suggested ideas to the mind at all readily, and that in many cases they did not correspond to any idea at all, but instead produced in the mind only images of past experience connected with these words. This category included virtue, vice, justice, honour, and liberty, besides magistrate, docility and persuasion (Wecter 1940, 167–81). The centrality of such terms to a discussion of civil society requires no emphasis. The obvious inference from Burke’s philosophy of language was that to use abstract compound words was less to discuss ideas than to raise images which touched the affections of the listener or reader. To do this could scarcely to be thought part of a speculative activity: the effect would not be cognitive, but practical: not to develop ideas, but to influence conduct. The question was, with what arrangements were these words, and therefore pleasurable images, to be connected.
This understanding of the mind gave speakers and writers an unusually powerful role. It was in their hands to connect words which suggested pro-attitudes with arrangements of their choosing: for these words had did not imply only one set of conceptual contents, because they implied none. If one recollects the propensity to imitation that Burke found in mankind, this choosing was likely also to be leading. So Burke was exceptionally sensitive to the role of men of letters and public speakers in moulding opinion. By the same measure, he had an unusually lively sense of their responsibilities. It was they who had the power to guide people to the proper ends, or elsewhere. Guidance need not be directly didactic—indeed, it could not be, because there could be no definitions to expound — but would be a matter of providing a linguistic context which guided listeners and readers to goals that were ethically and politically beneficial.
One crucial approach that Burke himself developed was historiographical. In works of history or in oratory, discussion involving a compound abstract noun—such as ‘civilization’ or ‘liberty’— could take place in connexion with aggregate words like ‘Indians’ or ‘the English’, and, therefore, being discussed in relation to these, connected that noun with definite ideas rather than with further ideas that had no easily identifiable content—or no content at all. Almost all of Burke’s writings and his more important speeches have a strong historical element. That element is cast as a narrative in a way that connects compound abstract words with specific persons and specific transactions. Burke also wrote avowedly historical works in the years immediately after publishing A Philosophical Enquiry The content of these histories developed the preferences of his youth for improvement by embodying these in a way that made them integral to the origins and continuing character of modern arrangements in the Americas and in England.
Burke, like Smith again, wrote ‘philosophical’ history, that is to say gave a view of the key agencies that had shaped human destiny over the long run of human society. Indeed, he casually implied a four-stage theory of socio-economic history at a time when Scottish stadial history, except that in Dalrymple’s Feudal Property (1757), was either unwritten or unpublished. But his attention, primarily, lay elsewhere, as appears in An Account of the European Settlements. This work arose from the initiative of ‘booksellers’ alive to the reading public’s interest in North America, where Britain was then at war with France, and the work was co-written with Burke’s ‘cousin’ and friend William Burke. Edmund’s pen is evident in the passages which contrast ‘savagery’ with civilization. The book emphasized that the coming of Europeans to the New World brought with it a civilizing of ‘savages,’ who were far from noble, through the agency of institutionalised Christianity. This implicit distance from the cult of ‘the noble savage,’ and from primitivism in general, provided an identifiable complement to the implied rejections of A Philosophical Enquiry and the satire about ‘natural society’ in A Vindication.
A stage of human history rather later than that of ‘savages’ was delineated within An Abridgement of English History, which Burke wrote after 1757, but did not finish. So far as it goes, this provided a continuous account that ran from the Roman landings to Magna Carta. Christianity figured again in this narrative as a source of civilization, but the significance of the tale was more complex. This time the story was primarily political, and showed how one of the values most prized by Burke’s contemporaries, civil liberty, came to belong to England. The Norman Conquest of England established a powerful executive government and brought with it a uniform system of law; if these two were necessary conditions for the matching grace of civil liberty for all, however, they were not sufficient: the required addition came from an aristocracy, which had been taught the value of liberty by the Archbishop of Canterbury, and which had come to understand that its own power was insufficient to extract the requisite concessions from the crown unless popular support could be won. Burke’s sense of the double-edged character of civilization thus developed into a sense that the political regime required by an advanced society—the combination of strong institutions with civil liberty—came from sources that were contrary to each other, and not always beneficial in isolation (aristocracy as a form of government was an ‘austere and insolent domination’ (TCD, W & S, 1981–2015, ii. 268)): and as both a strong executive and civil liberty were needed, by the same token the forces making for each needed to be counterbalanced from the other side on a continuing basis. This balance of forces characterised a situation in which ‘liberty’ had an identifiable content, namely the specific civil liberties secured through political struggle and written into Magna Carta.
Burke’s narratives suggested that agencies antipathetic to each other, if properly connected to one another, might produce results that were both intelligible and valuable. One effect amongst several of this conception of cooperative conflict was a rehabilitation of the Roman Catholicism that was the historic heritage of Burke’s family. An Account and An Abridgement alike suggested that in its historical time and place Roman Catholicism, and, indeed, clericalism, whether embodied in Jesuit missionaries or in an English archbishop, had been a constituent needed to produce social and political benefits of a fundamental kind. As an historiographical exemplar, An Abridgement therefore showed an exceptional appreciation of the Middle Ages, which was to cause raptures to Lord Acton. It anticipated both Richard Hurd’s Letters on Chivalry and Romance (1762), and, still more, a great work that set the bearings for Anglo-American medievalists for many years, William Stubbs’ Constitutional History of England (1875–8). Burke, however, could not think in terms of an academic historiography, still less one that would be the exclusive intellectual preoccupation of its exponents: neither of these existed in his time. He could think, however, of subtly defusing anti-Roman prejudice in Georgian Britain.
Burke himself was not a Roman Catholic, and viewed enquiry into his personal background with alarm and suspicion. This was sensible enough in a Britain which still subliminally linked civil liberty with Protestantism, and therefore regarded Irishness as a likely pointer to popish subversion of its political values. Burke’s argumentative stance always benefited Roman Catholics, but he never found a kind word for the Pope: his was a position which emphasized the priority of civil interests over denominational claims in civil society. Indeed Burke considered that ‘the truth of our common Christianity, is not so clear as this proposition: that all men, at least the majority of men in the society, ought to enjoy the common advantages of it.’ (TPL, W & S 1981–2015, ix.464). This was a political development of the centrality he gave to the claims of improvement, and of the obvious necessity of its free development for the bettering of the human condition. It also silently defused any papal claim to civil dominance on theological grounds and, more audibly, suggested that the penalisation of Roman Catholic beliefs was wrong if these did not cause Catholics to interfere with others‘ civil interests. Burke’s presumptions about the priority of civil interests and a sense of the possible irrelevance of denominational opinion to civil society suggest a reading of Locke’s Letter concerning Toleration and Two Treatises of Government, the latter of which was common, though not prescribed reading at Trinity. It also implies that the proper terms in which to conceive civil interests are those of natural jurisprudence, because there people are considered without reference to any specific allegiances, religious or otherwise. Burke referred to natural law and natural rights directly when such reference advanced his own arguments, though he made no theoretical contribution to natural jurisprudence until quite late in life. His creative energies were mostly applied elsewhere.
Burke developed his thoughts about civil interests in a work that his executors entitled Tracts on the Popery Laws, which he drafted when he was employed as private secretary to the Chief Secretary for Ireland in the early seventeen-sixties. After this, Burke became involved more immediately in political practice, and, by one means or another, contributed to it until his death and (through the activities of his executors in publishing or reprinting his writings) from beyond the grave. This was one obvious route for practical development, even besides the amenities of status that it brought to Burke. For his view of the compound abstract words involved in civil discussion did not suggest that purely speculative study had unlimited potential either for the mind or for personal satisfaction, because a strictly speculative discussion was likely to be inconclusive at best: such words became more readily intelligible in connexion with the concrete, and therefore the practical. Hence, perhaps, Burke concluded that ‘man is made for Speculation and action; and when he pursues his nature he succeeds best in both.’ (Somerset 1957, 87). There was, on this understanding, intellectual benefit in political participation, and, equally, political practice might benefit from the speculative mind. This is likely to seem an implausible position nowadays, when political activity is frenetic, and learning is a matter of speciality; but in the eighteenth century, when an agile mind could manage at least the basics of several branches of learning, and the British legislature was often in session for less than six months each year, it was more plausible. Political participation, on Burke’s understanding, besides its intellectual possibilities, had an ethical potential. To the extent that thinking about politics was necessarily uncertain, the proper conduct of affairs depended upon an honest as well as a capacious mind, and on a well-disposed management of words.
It remains to show what Burke learnt from political activity, and what he conferred upon it. The picture is one in which the claims of practice enriched Burke’s mind and brought intellectual benefits to practice itself.
5. Political style: some parliamentary applications
Burke’s life was spent in parliamentary affairs from the mid-1760s, and this made a difference to his style of intellectual activity. This did not lie primarily in developing the cast of his mind, and if in 1771 Burke stated that ‘I have endeavoured all my life to train my understanding and my temper in the studies and habits of Philosophy’, at the same time he concluded that ‘my Principles are all settled and arranged’ . This did not preclude intellectual innovation. The difference made by participation lay not least in his reasons for applying his mind, and consequently in how he did so. The reasons were to influence opinion, both in Parliament and from his position as a member of the legislative, and to determine votes in the House of Commons itself. The matter common to both of these was Burke’s view that words were central to political understanding.
An obvious inference from Burke’s account of compound abstract words is that to use these is to touch the experience of reader or listener, and that persuasion was unavoidably central to discussing politics: this befitted a practical rather than a speculative subject. Indeed, these terms implied that the point of discussing politics must be to influence action, and nothing much else. Burke developed great skill in managing words, begun in debating at Trinity and carried forward at other venues, including the House of Commons. As such language was persuasive, its objective was to establish pro-attitudes and con-attitudes in mind of listener or reader.
This was not the only philosophical aspect in Burke’s political practice. A major conceptual tool in discussing politics was relation. Relation is one of those terms which was common to both the scholastics and Locke. It denotes both comparison and connexion. Comparison was an invaluable procedure because it enabled events, institutions and persons to be placed in any number of lights which would raise or lower their significance and standing. Connexion was scarcely less valuable, because the place that someone or something occupied could be used to sustain or criticise their role, as well as to demonstrate the value of co-operative contraries. Best of all, relation in either sense lent itself to a myriad of uses, for as LeClerc had remarked in his Logic (which Burke had read at Trinity) relations were beyond counting—sunt autem innumerae relationes (Le Clerc 1692, pt. 1, ch. 4, s. 1, p. 19).
Burke’s conception of philosophical history was also fundamental to his political practice. ‘Every age has its own manners and its politicks dependent upon them’ (TCD, W & S, 1981–2015, ii 258.) The manners Burke saw around him in England were continuous with those he had seen in the middle ages, or projected backwards thither, in which a powerful executive government was balanced by other agencies with the effect of securing civil liberty. Those agencies most obvious in Burke’s time had established the sovereignty of Parliament at the Glorious Revolution (1688–9), implied it in the Bill of Rights (1689), exercised it in the Act of Settlement (1701), and confirmed it by suppressing the attempts made from 1708 to 1746 to reassert the sovereignty of kings alone. Burke understood law in this arrangement as the guarantor of interests of the governed because it was law passed and secured by Parliament. It was secured in Parliament by the mutual dependence of Commons, Lords and King. That sovereignty had this public character made the British state a beneficiary of a very high degree of financial credit, and this increased the power of Parliament. The long, slow movement of British history from a conception of the realm understood as royal property to the state conceived as the expression of public will had in Burke’s time reached a stage at which this will was expressed through the decisions of Parliament in a manner heavily influenced by the monarch. Burke’s political activities therefore assumed parliamentary sovereignty.
If Burke’s view of words and relations gave him practical tools, and if parliamentary sovereignty provided him with a practical postulate, what did he assume was the proper end of sovereignty? We have seen that the relation between sovereign and the governed had for a primary purpose the protection of the latter’s civil interests. This much suggests continuity between Burke the philosopher/historian and Burke the political participant. But the former might also see that there were complications for the latter. One who sees the multiplicity of civil interests, and the variety of relations in which they can be considered, and the variety of contraries at work, will see that to put society at ease with itself may well imply conflict and see that such conflict is hard to avoid; he or she will see, too, that Parliament forms an arena for conducting it in a stylised and moderated way through the representation of interests, appropriate to a civilized state of society; and, even while participating in such a conflict, s/he might recognizes the necessity of both sides to the result. Here, opponents may be not only enemies but also co-workers, sharing at least some common assumptions about the system within which their lot was cast, although separated from others by the role required of them. In that situation, the question becomes, where do you take your place? The answer may depend on your own connexions, and on how you conceive them.
6. Burke’s practical reasoning
Let us turn to how Burke’s thinking was informed by his philosophical thinking, especially to his use of relation. Burke’s method for written composition often combined (i) identification of relations, with (ii) relevant history, and (iii) treatment in language that would attach pro-attitudes to one side or the other in a difference of opinion. This method is seen, for instance, in his Thoughts on the Cause of the Present Discontents (1770). Its central statement for our purpose is about (i) relation in the form of connexion: that the British constitution had been constructed in a manner that required the connexion (in this case the interdependence) of the parts of the sovereign in order to achieve mutual control. This statement contrasted with (ii) the historical statement that there was a new system of court politics which involved disconnecting those parts in order to make the monarch independent of the other parts of the political sovereign. Burke’s history showed the emergence of this new system, and illustrated its pernicious results in both domestic and foreign affairs. The contrast (iii) between the older system — which was represented as having benign results—was clear, and the disposition of pro-language obvious enough. Burke’s appeal lay to the standards which his contemporaries would take for granted, namely those implied in their beliefs about parliamentary sovereignty. As if it were not enough, the picture of the older order was reinforced by a sense of connexion in the Aristotelian sense that Burke’s society recognized and approved—that man was sociable, rather than being a solitary beast, and above all by the annexation of the key term of connexion to the side of the dispute that Burke favoured. All of these considerations suggested the appropriateness of ‘the good’ combining to counterbalance the efforts of court politicians, and so to sustain parliamentary sovereignty and its benefits.
This illustrates Burke’s remarkable ability to combine philosophical method and philosophical history, as well as the practical purpose to which he put them—forming an understanding of politics which was practical in the very particular sense of calling for activity in one direction to counterbalance forces coming from another. It was also practical in relation to advancing very specific interests. These considerations were used to situate quite another sense of connexion, namely political party, and especially the party of Lord Rockingham to which and to whom Burke had attached himself. Indeed Present Discontents was read in draft by his party’s leading lights before publication. On publication, the pamphlet was widely understood as a manifesto for this party. After publication Present Discontents became a manual from which fledging politicians learnt the rationale of their party, and, indeed, a source book for cat calls from the party colleagues from whom Burke separated in 1791. The philosophical and historical element in Burke’s positions is evident only to those who retrace all of his steps; an activity which his contemporaries lacked the will, and (as not all of his major works had been published) some of the means to do.
The educative effect of Burke’s writing is not to be underestimated in a civil society, which boasted many highly literate members but had very few with any formal education in political science (except, sometimes, at Scottish universities). Indeed, it is likely that Burke wrote in order to educate. Yet at the same time that the strength of his conceptual and historical arguments, and the skill with which he developed these, excites the reader’s admiration, they create unease. This is not merely because in Present Discontents the philosophical sense of connexion is used to adumbrate the claims of a party connexion: it is a more generalized disquiet. A politician inspires confidence, in part, because s/he is honest: and a good way to be thought honest is to convey the impression that you are not clever enough to deceive. As a philosopher commands interest when s/he is intellectually powerful, this impression is one that is naturally hard to achieve: but it can be done. C.D. Broad suggested that ‘Locke, we feel, is not so much cleverer than ourselves as to be capable of playing tricks with us even if he wanted to do so. He is the Mr Baldwin  of philosophy, and he derives from his literary style some of the advantages which that statesman owed to his pipe and his pigs.’ (Broad 1952, 39). This judgement does not apply to Burke, even though he did keep pigs. The reader carries away from Burke a sense of great creative power, dialectical skill, and verbal ingenuity: in short, a sense of being overborne by intellectual force. The listener probably received other and unwelcome sensations when these were seconded by personal raucousness. Such feelings generate unease, and unease is increased by Burke’s prose.
His literary style is to argue clearly, but in doing so to include a manifest carefulness of qualification that will permit subsequent shifts of position—for instance his self-description as a ‘true but severe friend to monarchy’ is consistent with his occupying any point within the generous spectrum of parliamentary sovereignty—and, indeed, the sense of historical change which pervades Present Discontents suggests that movement is a common experience. Unease, perhaps, is increased even further: for against one equipped with this intellectual repertoire, the accusation of inconsistency is irresistibly tempting and utterly useless. Again, Burke’s is a very sensible way for a statesman to think, but it is not how the public wishes politicians to appear on most occasions. Still less is it reassuring about Burke’s intellectual bona fides: for this is not how people innocent of political experience, who are the majority, conceive the role of political principles. Coleridge put his finger on an important point when he suggested that from ‘principles exactly the same’ Burke could draw ‘practical inferences almost opposite’ in different situations (Coleridge, Biographica Literaria, vol. i, 191). Burke’s philosophical and historical positions are clear, but they do not translate, and were not meant to translate, into a set of specific practical conclusions of permanent validity.
There was the contrast, too, between the breadth of view and of learning in the matured statements that Burke published, on the one hand, and, on the other, the ways of the parliamentary pugilist who was audible to fellow M.P.s and legible to others in the speeches reported by the daily newspapers. Burke’s manner was anything but ‘philosophical’ as the public understands the word. Partly this was, doubtless, because Burke was like that as a person, and not least because he had a weak voice that had to be raised if it was to be heard in the bear garden that was the House of Commons, but partly, too, because his Philosophical Enquiry had suggested that the best way to impart a mood to an audience was to display it oneself. So, for instance, if Burke needed to plead for moderation, he did so immoderately. Above all, perhaps, it was because this philosopher- turned-participant was not exempt from the need to win to his side enough minds to ensure that his side was not beaten (or, at any rate, demonstrated enough strength to remain in contention), and had at hand an exceptionally powerful range of persuasive tools. It is an evident fact, too, that the resources of Western civilization were sometimes invoked by Burke in order to produce votes in the House of Commons—votes, which, whatever else they were, were in the interests of his party. But, manifestly, these resources do not supply a rationale for only one policy, still less for only one party. The roles of thinker and party spokesman consort ill: and there were bound to be doubts about one
Who born for the Universe, narrow’d his mind,
And to party gave up, what was meant for mankind.
Tho’ fraught with all learning, kept straining his throat,
To persuade Tommy Townshend to lend him a vote.
(Goldsmith, lines 31–34).
An apparent disruption of this sort was always likely to suggest that Burke had profoundly personal motives for narrowing his mind, and when he was not being caricatured as an Irish Jesuit he was being satirized as a corrupt hack . Yet some sort of procedure of the type pursued by Burke was implied in his sense of practical reasoning. The ‘philosopher in action’ had the function of finding ‘proper means’ to ‘the proper ends of Government’ marked out by ‘the speculative philosopher’ (TCD, W & S, 1981–2015, ii. 45–51). Parliamentary votes, in the situation that Burke found himself, were amongst the proper means.
7. Burke and the American Revolution
Political participation generated scepticism about Burke as a person, some of which was unjust, though all of it was to be expected. What was perhaps less predictable, and is certainly more interesting philosophically, is that this participation was a precondition of the practical thought which made Burke famous in his own time and has given him a leading place in the canon of Western political thought. One very important example of this is his treatment of the American Revolution. This was informed, no doubt, by where Burke happened to find himself on the spectrum of practical politics in the years that followed 1766. But his conclusions for practice were informed also by his understanding of ideas – meaning ideas in a philosophical, precisely in a Lockean sense – and how these could be combined. In other words, the content of his political thought was informed importantly not only by where he was practically but also who he was philosophically.
Burke’s practical thinking about the dispute between the British parliament and its North American colonies began with a situation not of his making, that is to say the rejection of the Stamp Act by the colonists, and its withdrawal by the ministry headed by Lord Rockingham in 1765–6. The Rockingham ministry followed up this concession by way of letting the colonists alone with the explicit assertion of Parliament’s right to legislate for the colonies in the Declaratory Act of 1766. Burke’s task was to demonstrate to the House of Commons the plausibility of this package. He did so by combining two complex ideas—or at least two abstract compound nouns—in a new way. One idea was empire, which involved command. The other was liberty. These, Burke thought, were ideas difficult to combine—a sound reflection as they are diametrically opposed—but that they were combinable in the further idea of a British empire—one which combined legislative command with civil liberty. This idea implied letting alone certain matters of concern to the colonists, and so allowing them in some respects civil liberty on a de facto basis (SDR, W & S 1981–2015, ii. 317–18). This idea is considerably more ingenious than the average British position that ‘all the dominions of Great Britain are bound by Acts of Parliament’ . Burke’s view was explanatory, because it conceptualised the situation before Parliament in a way that made intelligible the points involved and established a connexion amongst them. It was also accommodating, because it made the British executive’s policy intellectually and therefore practically respectable at the same time that it made room for colonial preferences. In short, it was a small masterpiece of thinking about policy.
The repeal of the Stamp Act was followed by the passing of the Declaratory Act. Burke was practically successful in 1766 with the House of Commons because he was speaking for the executive, and a majority amongst Members of Parliament, ceteris paribus, tended to vote for the king’s ministers. In 1774 and 1775 he was practically unsuccessful, because he was now in opposition, but his conceptual achievement in dealing with the American question became much greater. By 1774, the issues dividing some American colonists from Parliament had changed. The former now resented the attempts of the latter to levy taxation on them directly, rather than by the authority of their own colonial legislatures, and they resented still more the project of backing the attempt, if need be, with coercion. Burke’s speech of 1774 on American Taxation did not delete the idea of imperial command, but rather elaborated his complex idea of the British empire in a new way in order to deal with the new situation.
Burke elaborated the complex idea in a way to which complex ideas lend themselves, that is to say, by adding a qualification. The sovereignty of the British parliament was an idea that certainly included a right to tax: but a right to tax could be understood to be consistent on principle with inaction as well as action. The right, in plainer language, need not be applied. Burke could accommodate, therefore, both the claims of Westminster and those of the colonists. To this point, of course, one might reply that Burke was merely making concessions. But observe: this situation provided a cue for conceptual innovation—Burke inserted a distinction into the idea of sovereignty. He distinguished ‘my idea of the constitution of the British Empire’ from ‘the constitution of Britain’ unconnected with overseas rule. It could be inferred that
The Parliament of Great Britain sits at the head of her extensive empire in two capacities: one of the local legislature of this island, providing for all things at home…The other…is what I call her imperial character, in which…she superintends all the several inferior legislatures, and guides, and controls them all without annihilating any. As all these provincial legislatures are only co-ordinate to each other, they ought all to be subordinate to her….It is necessary to coerce the negligent, to restrain the violent, and to aid the weak and deficient, by the over-ruling plenitude of her power. She is never to intrude into the place of the others, whilst they are equal to the common ends of their institution. But in order to enable parliament to answer all these ends of provident and beneficent superintendence, her powers must be boundless
so that Burke’s elaboration of the complex idea of the British empire suggests complementary roles for the British parliament and the colonial legislatures, an elaboration which would make the question of taxation irrelevant at a stroke, whilst simultaneously emphasizing the authority of Westminster.
Conceptual refinement provided a practical avenue that other, less gifted politicians had not devised. Burke’s position was altogether subtler than the implied tautology of a minister’s claim that ‘to say we have a right to tax America and are never to exercise that right is ridiculous’ (Sir Edward Thurlow, quoted in Gore-Brown 1953, 85), and of another politician’s despairing sense that ‘we must either insist upon their submission to the authority of the Legislature or give them up entirely to their own discretion.’ . These pundits, by failing to conceive a sufficiently complex idea of sovereignty and the sovereign’s right to tax, failed also to see that sovereignty did not imply an unpleasant choice between abrogating this right by disuse or applying it by force.
Events soon required a further elaboration of Burke’s idea of the British empire. The continued use of coercion made the colonists more, not less recalcitrant. The practical need seemed to be for terms on which they would stay, in some sense or senses, under British rule. Their crucial claim was now that their right to tax themselves by their own legislatures rested on charters from the Crown, and that they were subordinate to the Crown alone, and not to Parliament. Burke gave still closer attention to the idea of sovereignty. It would be tactless to emphasize the sovereignty of Parliament, but it would be self-defeating to withdraw it explicitly and concede a sovereign right over taxation to the colonial legislatures. So now, in Burke’s speech on Conciliation with America (1775), he focussed upon only one aspect of the complex idea of a parliamentary sovereign. The latter comprised in the British instance not only Lords and Commons, but also the king. Hence, by judicious emphasis, the item acquiesced in by the colonists could do some conceptual work: ‘my idea of an Empire…is…that an Empire is the aggregate of many States, under one common head; whether this head be a monarch or a presiding republick’; and it was emphasized that the rights of the colonists depended on this superior, for ‘the claim of a privilege seems rather, ex vi termini, to imply a superior power.’ As to a right to tax, Burke added on a later occasion, that though it ‘was inherent in the supreme power of society, taken as an aggregate, it did not follow that it must reside in any particular power in that society’, and therefore Parliament could delegate it to local legislatures. In short, ‘sovereignty was not in its nature an idea of abstract unity; but was capable of great complexity and infinite modifications.’ (SSC, W & S 1981–2015, iii. 193).
Whether Burke’s ‘infinite modifications’ would have assisted in keeping the thirteen colonies within the fold of the British empire is unknowable, for nothing like his proposals were tried until 1778, which was too late. It is clear, however, that Burke’s ability to make conceptual changes depended on his philosophical thinking. To think in terms of complex ideas is to recognize that they can be elaborated by adding further ideas; to distinguish between the roles of Parliament is to make that addition; and to analyse the powers of a parliamentary sovereign as a preface to relocating one of them is to use philosophy as a tool in practical reasoning. It is noteworthy, also, that these philosophical exercises were the means of coping, as Burke hoped, with practical changes. Neither was his work here primarily ideological, for though Burke had a practical goal in view, and at that one consistent with the Rockingham achievements of 1766, he worked philosophically to modify the conceptions in terms of which his contemporaries viewed their situation, rather than using his conceptual tools as ways of defending those conceptions without modifying them. Thus he added ideas to the stock of his day. It is fitting, though Burke’s proposals were not implemented in time, and though his goal was not attained, that his American speeches figured prominently in the schools and universities of both the U.K. and the U.S.A. well into the twentieth century. Burke, after all, was suspicious of poor ideas: he concluded that ‘one of the main causes of our present troubles’ was ‘general discourses, and vague sentiments’, and urged instead study of ‘an exact detail of particulars’ (SSC, W & S 1981–2015, iii. 185).
8. Philosophical Character of Political Disposition
Burke’s thinking about America also suggests a political disposition that owed something to his philosophical conceptions. Burke’s complaint in American Taxation against ministers was that ‘they have taken things…without any regard to their relations or dependencies’, and had ‘no one connected view.’ This was in part a straightforwardly cognitive position on which Burke laid an emphasis with prudential point: the world with which politicians dealt was complex, and to use ideas which were insufficiently complex to capture its contents and their relations was a short way to meet the rough side of reality. It was also, implicitly an ethical position: governments ought not to apply force to existing relations, at least those that were legitimate. This is, in one way, an obvious point from natural jurisprudence, and one that Burke had made transparently with respect to inroads by the government of Ireland against Catholic property. In another, and more interesting way, it reflected his view that abstract compound nouns and complex ideas evoke specific past experiences. To interfere forcibly with someone’s experientially-based expectations would be to break their mental association between experience and idea or word: and so the idea or the word would become meaningless and cease to influence action. If, therefore, ‘my hold of the Colonies, is in the close affection which grows from common names’, amongst other sources that were ‘though light as air…as strong as links of iron’, then ‘let the Colonies always keep the idea of their civil rights associated with your Government;—they will cling and grapple to you…But let it be once understood, that your Government may be one thing, and their Privileges another; that these two things may exist without any mutual relation; the cement is gone; the cohesion is loosened; and every thing hastens to decay and dissolution.’ (CWA, W & S 1981–2015, iii. 164). To break such mental associations was to break communities.
This point suggested that a genuinely prudent conduct of affairs would proceed without assaulting the mental associations of the governed, and, as change was omnipresent, would conduct its share under accepted names—in other words, by gradual and by moderate reform of institutions and practices rather than by immediate and total replacement, which Burke stigmatised as ‘innovation’. This, indeed, was what Burke claimed to be doing in his contributions of 1780–82 to the recasting of the royal household. The intellectual counterpart of this prudent conduct, namely the refinement of our existing ideas, rather than replacing them, is what he had done in his revisions of the idea of sovereignty.
This style of thinking gave Burke a very lively sense of the corrosive power of new ideas. Even new questions could have unpleasant results. When the innovations of the British government unsettled the colonists, ‘then…they questioned all the parts of your legislative power; and by the battery of such questions have shaken the solid structure of this Empire to its deepest foundations.’ The proper way to avoid such shakes to civil society was to ‘consult and follow your experience’ (ATX, W & S 1981–2015, ii.411, 457), for ‘experience’ according to Burke’s philosophy of language was a condition of continuity of mind, and, on the basis of mind, of a sustainable practice. His was therefore a philosophically conditioned attitude to practice, and one that was very sensitive to the hiatus that speculation could cause in the latter. Burke’s sensitivity can produce apodictic language in order to persuade people to make use of the ideas they have inherited, by urging ‘a total renunciation of every speculation of my own; and… [by recommending] a profound reverence for the wisdom of our ancestors’ (CWA, W & S 1981–2015, iii.139). Indeed, Burke can be found, sometimes, on such rational grounds, deprecating all explicit appeal to speculation of whatever hue, if it had a disturbing effect: ‘reason not at all—oppose the ancient policy and practice of the empire, as a rampart against the speculations of innovators on both sides of the question’ (italics added) (ATX, W & S 1981–2015, ii.166). His deprecation of speculation was logically anterior to taking sides in politics.
It was also, in effect, an appeal for ideas adequate to governing. This is evident in Burke’s criticism of ‘vulgar and mechanical politicians’,
a sort of people who think that nothing exists but what is gross and material; and who therefore, far from being qualified to be directors of the great movement of empire, are not fit to turn a wheel in the machine. But to men truly initiated and rightly taught,…ruling and master principles, which, in the opinion of such men as I have mentioned, have no substantial existence, are in truth every thing, and all in all,
so that ‘little minds’ could not govern ‘a great empire’ (CWA, W & S 1981–2015, iii.139), or, evidently, any empire at all, whereas better results might be expected from ‘men truly initiated and rightly taught.’
Burke himself, however much he might try to set the logic of his thought in a rich foliage of words generated by his literary skill with words—he is perhaps the only classic of political thought in the English language who is also a literary classic—was a philosophical thinker. As such, his practical conclusions could change, and did, as we have seen. Practical conclusions changed because they were meant to be serviceable in a world that itself was changing. Burke’s philosophical equipment, however, served him in the face of all external changes. The most dramatic of such changes came during the last eight years of his life with the French Revolution.
9. The Revolution in France
Burke’s name is indissolubly connected to his Reflections on the Revolution in France, though a more perceptive account of the causes of the Revolution of 1789 can be found in A Letter to William Elliot (1795), and the Letters on a Regicide Peace (1795–7) investigate the character and consequences of the Revolution from 1791 in a more thoroughgoing way. In an important sense, however, the judgement of posterity is right for our purposes, because Reflections illustrates very clearly the central importance of philosophy and ‘philosophical’ history for Burke’s writing about one of the greatest changes of his day.
This is true, in the first place, in terms of insight. Reflections was published on 1 November 1790, less than eighteen months after the storming of the Bastille. The intervening period had been characterised by a mixture of popular violence and peaceable, if feverish political activity in France, as its absolute monarchy gave way to a constitutional monarchy. A detached observer would be unsure of the future—whether destruction and violence would predominate or whether an enduring constitutional order would emerge was a question which events had not answered. In the event, of course, the Revolution would be characterised by violence and constitutional development alike at different times, but this was as unknowable in 1790 as it is obvious in the twenty-first century.
Burke’s Reflections may be divided (for the author did not provide any formal divisions) into two portions of unequal length. Both of these are concerned with relations. The first portion, about two-thirds of the text, suggests that the French, in their enthusiasm for the idea of liberty, had failed to understand that liberty was only one amongst a range of benefits, all of which were required in mutual connexion for a life under civil government that was civilized in the proper sense. The results which flowed from this deficiency of understanding included constitutional arrangements which, because they did not reflect an understanding of liberty that was subtle enough to grasp that the liberty of the many was power, did not qualify popular sovereignty in a way that would restrain the demos effectively. As if an unrestrained populace was not bad enough, an understanding of life only in terms of liberty swept away preceding elaborations of our ideas. This mattered, because the refinement of ideas had been a precondition of refinement of conduct and therefore of the progress of society in many respects. One key instance of these was the respectful treatment of women encouraged since the middle ages by Christian learning and by chivalry. But there was a newer philosophy: ‘on this scheme of things, a king is but a man; a queen is but a woman; a woman is but an animal; and an animal not of the highest order’. The retrogression of humanity itself to animality was not far in the future with ‘a swinish multitude’. The result, as people would no longer be moved by opinion, which had embodied refined ideas, would be that they would need to be governed by force. Force, too, was the ultimate destination of the second portion of Reflections. This suggested that the idea of equality had been connected only too pervasively with the institutional arrangements of the judiciary, the legislative and the executive power—and therefore had produced not the authority of command from a s strong government but institutionalised feebleness. At the same time, the perverse results of equality in fiscal arrangements had caused popular discontent and financial instability. The result was a situation which could be controlled only by the force of the military—if, indeed, military order was sustainable when soldiers had absorbed the idea of equality. France, it seemed, tended towards either disintegration or the rule of force.
Burke’s philosophical repertoire and historical understanding thus provided the structure of Reflections, and, perhaps more importantly, suggested insights into the character of the Revolution. The inattention of the revolutionaries to the relations that needed to be comprised in a modern government, especially in connexion with liberty, was matched by the inappropriateness to a sovereign regime of structuring its institutions around equality rather than around effective command. These insights suggested that a mis-structuring of the new constitution proceeded from an inadequate philosophical grasp. Such misunderstanding was matched by a failure to understand the historical development which had produced the elaboration of ideas about conduct that had underwritten government by opinion, and this failure suggested that the Revolution would cause retrogression from this civilized condition towards a less gentle way of proceeding, as well as a less effective one. In other words, Burke’s understanding of philosophy, and of the history of Europe, conceived ‘philosophically’, provided grounds for making fundamental claims about the Revolution.
Whether Burke was right in these claims about the Revolution, of course, is another question, and one that can never be answered: French readers of Reflections could take its lessons to heart, and, anyhow, events have a way of modifying tendencies independently of intention and interpretation. Indeed, none of this is to say that Reflections was intended as an academic work, or even an accurate factual statement, about the Revolution. It was calculated to produce a practical result, which was to dissuade the British from admiring the Revolution and so to dampen any propensity they might feel to imitate it: and thus to protect civilization in Britain. In the course of pursuing this goal, Burke was willing to satirize the Revolution and its British sympathizers unmercifully in order to make them as unattractive as possible to any sane reader, and he matched the satire with a panegyric on British social and political arrangements. There is, indeed, much in Reflections besides the elements that have been emphasized here (and indeed much in Burke’s later views on the Revolution which is not in Reflections): but without those elements neither the book nor Burke’s understanding of the Revolution would have been possible.
10. Problems of Interpretation
It is clear by now that neither ‘mystic spirit’ nor ‘irrationalism’ characterise Burke helpfully. These examples might be taken as extreme. At the same time they witness interpretative difficulties. Whilst Burke’s thought has never lacked interpreters from his own day to ours, on the whole they have not brought to bear the combined persistence of historical insight and strength of conceptual grasp required to do justice to him. Hence he has suffered an ironic fate for one who urged breadth and precision of thought. That is to say, he has figured as the spokesman for a very limited number of points or as one preoccupied with a limited number of themes. This type of treatment began in the nineteenth century, when Burke was invoked as an antidote to the confidence of the French Revolution by liberal thinkers who prized its principles, saw their narrowness, and required a sense of historical development to situate them properly in a viable civil society. It was continued when Matthew Arnold tried to treat Burke as a (pre-Home Rule) Gladstonian spokesman about Ireland. It went further still in the twentieth century, when Burke was pressed into service as a counter-revolutionary agent in the anti-Communist cause, and when the twenty-first dawned some were treating Burke as proponent of postmodernism. He himself could hardly have complained that his work has been put to practical use, but it remains true that academic justice has yet to be done to him. Chapters and essays on individual themes in his writings have been more plausible on the whole than attempts at general interpretation, which usually concentrate on a theme or themes of choice, or subordinate Burke’s thought to it or them, and so give the impression (deliberately or otherwise) that this is the whole of Burke, or at any rate that this is what matters about him. One response to this situation is to concentrate primarily on telling the story, and it is interesting that a number of recent works have taken this path.
In attacking the Revolution in France, Burke constructed a rogues’ gallery for French politicians, and stocked it also with quite a number of French thinkers. The figures who appeared to be rogues, however, were most of them only straw men, stuffed according to the prejudices of a British audience. More significantly for our purposes, Burke’s censure of the philosophes attributed to them complicity with the style of thought that had set up a limited range of simple principles as the norm for politics, and which was wholly inadequate to satisfy the connected and various needs of human nature under modern conditions. Burke preferred to emphasize that numerous principles, and practical thinking to combine them, were necessary to meet these needs, and so to sustain improvement, and emphasize, too, that such accommodation involved much more practical activity than speculative design. Correspondingly his own writings develop, not a political philosophy but rather a political style that had at its core philosophical elements—a style which, indeed, implicitly suggested that political philosophy was not feasible as a sort of knowledge, and, if it was, certainly not one sufficient to the task of ‘the philosopher in action’. The latter, at least as embodied by Burke himself, when he mentioned political philosophy, assumed that it was highly practical. It for its goal regulating opinion in order to produce good political results and to prevent bad ones. “It has ever been the great primary object of speculative and doctrinal philosophy to regulate opinion”, he wrote. “It is the great object of political philosophy to promote that which is sound, and to extirpate what is mischievous, and which directly tends to render men bad citizens in the community, and mischievous neighbours out of it” (RP2, W & S ix.295).
Such a style of thought emphasises the importance of combining a wide range of principles, and of remembering that principles, however numerous, are only one element in a satisfactory conduct of practice. There can be no doubt that analysis was involved in Burke’s proceedings: “let this position be analysed,” he instructed the House of Commons critically in 1794, “for analysis is the deadly enemy of all declamation.”  Though Burke could certainly conduct effective analyses of ideas and words even after more than twenty years at Westminster, as his Letter to Sir Hercules Langrishe (1792) demonstrates, his accent lay more decidedly upon the necessity of connecting ideas with each other, and the inclusion of non-conceptual elements in any treatment of politics that aspired to intellectual and practical validity. There is nothing in a style of doing philosophy that centres upon analysis that is logically inconsistent with these procedures. One temper of mind, however, which sometimes accompanies this manner of philosophising is antipathetic to Burke, whilst there is much in contemporary opinions about politics, including those held by at least some analytical philosophers, that he would have found dangerously naive. Amongst these a belief in a continuing popular sovereignty (the modern term of art for this is ‘democracy’)—rather than parliamentary sovereignty is only the most obvious example. If Burke is unlikely at present to be the darling of some philosophers and of some pundits; still less will he be of those who suppose that in discussing a small number of principles they provide a prescriptive and sufficient guidance for the conduct of policy; and even less of anyone who supposes it logically adequate to claim that ‘one very simple principle’ is ‘entitled to govern absolutely the dealings of society with the individual in the way of compulsion and control’ or any other matter (Mill 1859, ‘Introductory’). The complex character of ideas, their connexions with each other, the need to understand practice in terms of such relations, and to conduct it with attention to habitual linkages amongst people’s ideas and activities, suggest a different sort of thinking. So it is not surprising that Burke has been quietly ignored by many recent thinkers, or summarily dismissed from consideration by being labelled as a ‘conservative’—but it is of great interest that he has found many admirers amongst those who succeed in the conduct of practical politics. Whilst Burke would have been the first to point out that his specific conclusions belong to a time and a place, his intellectual style, is one with which any serious thinking about politics, whether reflective or practical, needs to engage.
Burke’s thought is philosophical in at least two senses. One is that it is constituted in part by thinking in terms of philosophical conceptions, especially complex ideas, particularly those of relation, as well as involving significant positions in philosophical psychology and the philosophy of language. The other sense is that it develops an account of the American, British and European past which is philosophical history, as the eighteenth-century understood the term. These senses, once put together, inform a style of practical thinking about politics which emphasizes the importance of synthetic as well as analytical thinking for practice, and suggests that a progressive practice requires not only the yields of past effort but also the intelligent application of mind to their further development if progress, rather than regress, is to result. Burke is perhaps the least studied of political classics, but he is certainly amongst the small number with whom anyone who aspires to have an adequate political education must engage.
There is no complete edition of Burke’s works: their quantity, the character of some of his manuscript materials and the manner in which many of his parliamentary speeches are preserved all make it very likely that this situation will continue. Neither have the editorial problems implied in his writings and speeches been overcome hitherto. For the present, there is, in nine, large substantive volumes,: Writings and Speeches of Edmund Burke, P. Langford (general editor), Oxford:Clarendon Press, 1981–2015. This, though not without further problems peculiar to itself, does provide a standard system reference for most of the items quoted here, and is cited above as W & S, and individual works are cited as follows:
[ATX] American Taxation. [CWA] Conciliation with America. [RRF] Reflections on the Revolution in France. [RP] Letters on a Regicide Peace. [SSC] Second Speech on Conciliation. [SDR] Speech on Declaratory Resolutions. [TCD] Thoughts on the Cause of the Present Discontents. [TPL] Tracts relating to Popery Laws.
- [Burke, William, and Edmund Burke], 1757, An Account of the European Settlements, London (and later editions).
- Somerset, H.V.F, ed., 1957, A Notebook of Edmund Burke, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
- Copeland, T.W., 1958–78, (general ed.), The Correspondence of Edmund Burke, Cambridge and Chicago, Cambridge University Press and University of Chicago Press, (ten volumes). Cited as Corr.
- Kelly, J., 2014, ‘A missing letter by Edmund Burke’, Eighteenth-Century Ireland, 29: 142–8.
- Lock, F.P., 1997, 1999, 2003 ‘Unpublished Burke Letters’, English Historical Review, 112: 119–141; 114: 636–657; 118: 940–982.
- Lonsdale, R., 1982, ‘An Uncollected Letter of Edmund Burke’, Notes and Queries, 29(3): 202.
- Walsh, P., 2009 ‘A new Burke letter from 1778’, Eighteenth-Century Ireland, 24: 159–63.
There is further unprinted correspondence in various repositories. The primary collections of Burke manuscripts are at Sheffield City Archives and Northamptonshire Record Office, both in the United Kingdom, but there is further material by Burke in a wider range of places; the material in manuscript bearing on him is extremely bulky, diverse and scattered.
There is relatively little recent literature primarily on Burke’s philosophical writings, however ‘philosophical’ is defined, though there is much that makes reference to or use of them: thus a bibliography of writings about his views on beauty, gender, and political organization, as well as his literary temper and practical activities would be disproportionately long. The reader is therefore invited to range freely. The secondary literature as a whole is listed up to about 1980 in Clara I. Gandy and Peter J. Stanlis, 1983, Edmund Burke: A Bibliography of Secondary Studies to 1982, New York, Garland. There are annual listings in the Modern Humanities Research Association’s volumes.
For matters discussed here, the reader is referred to:
- Burke, Edmund, 1958, Philosophical Enquiry, ed. J.T. Boulton, London, Routledge (later edition, Oxford, Blackwell, 1987)
- Canavan, F., 1957, ‘Edmund Burke’s College Study of Philosophy’, Notes and Queries (New Series), 4: 538–543.
- Sewell Jr, R.B., 1938, ‘Rousseau’s Second Discourse in England from 1755 to 1762’, Philological Quarterly, 17: 97–114.
- Wecter, D., 1940, ‘Burke’s Theory of Words, Images and Emotions’, Publications of the Modern Language Association, 55: 167–181.
Other works cited
- Berkeley, G., Principles of Human Knowledge, The Querist, and Discourse Addressed to Magistrates, in The Works of George Berkeley, A.A. Luce and T.E Jessop (eds.), , 9 volumes, London: Nelson, 1948–57.
- Broad, C.D., 1952, Ethics and the History of Philosophy, London: Routledge.
- Butler, M., 1984, Burke, Paine, Godwin and the Revolution Controversy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Coleridge, S.T., Biographica Literaria, James Engell and W. Jackson Bate (eds.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983.
- Freeman, M., 1992, ‘Edmund Burke’, in Volume 1 (109–11) of Laurence C. Becker and Charlotte B. Becker (eds.), Encyclopaedia of Ethics, 2 volumes, Garland: New York.
- Gore-Brown, R., 1953, Chancellor Thurlow, London: Routledge.
- Goldsmith, Oliver, 1774, Retaliation: a poem, London: G. Kearsly. [Goldsmith 1774 available online].
- Historical Manuscripts Commission, 1905, Report on the Manuscripts of the Marquess of Lothian, London: Stationery Office.
- Hull, C.H., and H.W.V. Temperley (eds.), 1911–12, ‘Debates on the Declaratory Act and the Repeal of the Stamp Act’, American Historical Review, 17: 563–586.
- Le Clerc, J., 1692, Logica: sive ars ratiocinandi, London: Awnsham & John Churchill.
- Mill, J.S., 1859, On Liberty, London: Longman.
- Norman, J., 2013, Edmund Burke. The First Conservative , New York: Basic Books.
- Robinson, Nicholas K., 1996, Edmund Burke: a life in caricature, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Sidgwick, H., 1877, ‘Bentham and Benthamism in Politics and Ethics’, in Essays on Ethics and Method, Marcus G. Singer (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
- Spurgeon, C.F.E., 1922, Mysticism in English Literature (edn.2) , Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Williamson, P., 1999, Stanley Baldwin, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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Other Internet Resources
- Search on “Edmund Burke” at the Bibliography of British and Irish History provides a selective listing of Burke’s works.
- The Edmund Burke Society sponsored by The Russell Kirk Center for Cultural Renewal considers Burke with reference to modern conditions from a conservative point of view.