The Philosophy of Childhood

First published Fri Sep 13, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jan 31, 2023

The philosophy of childhood has recently come to be recognized as an area of inquiry analogous to the philosophy of science, the philosophy of history, the philosophy of religion, and the many other “philosophy of” subjects that are already considered legitimate areas of philosophical study. In addition, philosophical study of related topics (such as parental rights, duties and responsibilities) has flourished in recent years. The philosophy of childhood takes up philosophically interesting questions about childhood, changing conceptions over time about childhood and attitudes toward children; theories of cognitive and moral development; children’s interests and children’s rights, the goods of childhood; children and autonomy; the moral status of children and the place of children in society. As an academic subject, the philosophy of childhood is sometimes included within the philosophy of education (e.g., Siegel, 2009). Recently, however, philosophers have begun to offer college and university courses specifically in the philosophy of childhood. And philosophical literature on childhood, parenting and families is increasing in both quantity and quality.

1. What is a Child?

Almost single-handedly, Philippe Ariès, in his influential book, Centuries of Childhood (Ariès, 1962), made the reading public aware that conceptions of childhood have varied across the centuries. The very notion of a child, we now realize, is both historically and culturally conditioned. But exactly how the conception of childhood has changed historically and how conceptions differ across cultures is a matter of scholarly controversy and philosophical interest (see Kennedy, 2006). Thus Ariès argued, partly on the evidence of depictions of infants in medieval art, that the medievals thought of children as simply “little adults.” Shulamith Shahar (1990), by contrast, finds evidence that some medieval thinkers understood childhood to be divided into fairly well-defined stages. And, whereas Piaget claims that his subjects, Swiss children in the first half of the 20th Century, were animistic in their thinking (Piaget, 1929), Margaret Mead (1967) presents evidence that Pacific island children were not.

One reason for being skeptical about any claim of radical discontinuity—at least in Western conceptions of childhood—arises from the fact that, even today, the dominant view of children embodies what we might call a broadly “Aristotelian conception” of childhood. According to Aristotle, there are four sorts of causality, one of which is Final causality and another is Formal Causality. Aristotle thinks of the Final Cause of a living organism as the function that organism normally performs when it reaches maturity. He thinks of the Formal Cause of the organism as the form or structure it normally has in maturity, where that form or structure is thought to enable the organism to perform its functions well. According to this conception, a human child is an immature specimen of the organism type, human, which, by nature, has the potentiality to develop into a mature specimen with the structure, form, and function of a normal or standard adult.

Many adults today have this broadly Aristotelian conception of childhood without having actually read any of Aristotle. It informs their understanding of their own relationship toward the children around them. Thus they consider the fundamental responsibility they bear toward their children to be the obligation to provide the kind of supportive environment those children need to develop into normal adults, with the biological and psychological structures in place needed to perform the functions we assume that normal, standard adults can perform.

Two modifications of this Aristotelian conception have been particularly influential in the last century and a half. One is the 19th century idea that ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny (Gould, 1977), that is, that the development of an individual recapitulates the history and evolutionary development of the race, or species (Spock, 1968, 229). This idea is prominent in Freud (1950) and in the early writings of Jean Piaget (see, e.g. Piaget, 1933). Piaget, however, sought in his later writings to explain the phenomenon of recapitulation by appeal to general principles of structural change in cognitive development (see, e.g., Piaget, 1968, 27).

The other modification is the idea that development takes places in age-related stages of clearly identifiable structural change. This idea can be traced back to ancient thinkers, for example the Stoics (Turner and Matthews, 1998, 49). Stage theory is to be found in various medieval writers (Shahar, 1990, 21–31) and, in the modern period, most prominently in Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s highly influential work, Emile (1979). But it is Piaget who first developed a highly sophisticated version of stage theory and made it the dominant paradigm for conceiving childhood in the latter part of the 20th Century (see, e.g., Piaget, 1971).

Matthews (2008, 2009), argues that a Piagetian-type stage theory of development tends to support a “deficit conception” of childhood, according to which the nature of the child is understood primarily as a configuration of deficits—missing capacities that normal adults have but children lack. This conception, he argues, ignores or undervalues the fact that children are, for example, better able to learn a second language, or paint an aesthetically worthwhile picture, or conceive a philosophically interesting question, than those same children will likely be able to do as adults. Moreover, it restricts the range and value of relationships adults think they can have with their children.

Broadly Aristotelian conceptions of childhood can have two further problematic features. They may deflect attention away from thinking about children with disabilities in favour of theorizing solely about normally developing children (see Carlson 2010), and they may distract philosophers from attending to the goods of childhood when they think about the responsibilities adults have towards the children in their care, encouraging focus only on care required to ensure that children develop adult capacities.

How childhood is conceived is crucial for almost all the philosophically interesting questions about children. It is also crucial for questions about what should be the legal status of children in society, as well as for the study of children in psychology, anthropology, sociology, and many other fields.

2. Theories of Cognitive Development

Any well-worked out epistemology will provide at least the materials for a theory of cognitive development in childhood. Thus, according to René Descartes, a clear and distinct knowledge of the world can be constructed from resources innate to the human mind (Descartes, PW, 131). John Locke, by contrast, maintains that the human mind begins as a “white paper, void of all characters, without any ideas” (Locke, EHC, 121). On this view all the “materials of reason and knowledge” come from experience. Locke’s denial of the doctrine of innate ideas was, no doubt, directed specifically at Descartes and the Cartesians. But it also implies a rejection of the Platonic doctrine that learning is a recollection of previously known Forms. Few theorists of cognitive development today find either the extreme empiricism of Locke or the strong innatism of Plato or Descartes completely acceptable.

Behaviorism has offered recent theorists of cognitive development a way to be strongly empiricist without appealing to Locke’s inner theater of the mind. The behaviorist program was, however, dealt a major setback when Noam Chomsky, in his review (1959) of Skinner’s Verbal Behavior (1957), argued successfully that no purely behaviorist account of language-learning is possible. Chomsky’s alternative, a theory of Universal Grammar, which owes some of its inspiration to Plato and Descartes, has made the idea of innate language structures, and perhaps other cognitive structures as well, seem a viable alternative to a more purely empiricist conception of cognitive development.

It is, however, the work of Jean Piaget that has been most influential on the way psychologists, educators, and even philosophers have come to think about the cognitive development of children. Piaget’s early work, The Child’s Conception of the World (1929), makes especially clear how philosophically challenging the work of a developmental psychologist can be. Although his project is always to lay out identifiable stages in which children come to understand what, say, causality or thinking or whatever is, the intelligibility of his account presupposes that there are satisfactory responses to the philosophical quandaries that topics like causality, thinking, and life raise.

Take the concept of life. According to Piaget this concept is acquired in four stages (Piaget, 1929, Chapter 6)

  • First Stage: Life is assimilated to activity in general
  • Second Stage: Life is assimilated to movement
  • Third Stage: Life is assimilated to spontaneous movement
  • Fourth Stage: Life is restricted to animals and plants

These distinctions are suggestive, but they invite much more discussion than Piaget elicits from his child subjects. What is required for movement to be spontaneous? Is a bear alive during hibernation? We may suppose the Venus flytrap moves spontaneously. But does it really? What about other plants? And then there is the question of what Piaget can mean by calling the thinking of young children “animistic,” if, at their stage of cognitive development, their idea of life is simply “assimilated to activity in general.”

Donaldson (1978) offers a psychological critique of Piaget on cognitive development. A philosophical critique of Piaget’s work on cognitive development is to be found in Chapters 3 and 4 of Matthews (1994). Interesting post-Piagetian work in cognitive development includes Cary (1985), Wellman (1990), Flavel (1995), Subbotsky (1996), and Gelman (2003).

Psychological research on concept formation has suggested that children do not generally form concepts by learning necessary and sufficient conditions for their application, but rather by coming to use prototypical examples as reference guides. Thus a robin (rather, of course, than a penguin) might be the child’s prototype for ‘bird’. The child, like the adult, might then be credited with having the concept, bird, without the child’s ever being able to specify, successfully, necessary and sufficient conditions for something to count as a bird. This finding seems to have implications for the proper role and importance of conceptual analysis in philosophy. It is also a case in which we should let what we come to know about cognitive development in children help shape our epistemology, rather than counting on our antecedently formulated epistemology to shape our conception of cognitive development in children (see Rosch and Lloyd, 1978, and Gelman, 2003).

Some developmental psychologists have recently moved away from the idea that children are to be understood primarily as human beings who lack the capacities adults of their species normally have. This change is striking in, for example, the work of Alison Gopnik, who writes: “Children aren’t just defective adults, primitive grownups gradually attaining our perfection and complexity. Instead, children and adults are different forms of homo sapiens. They have very different, though equally complex and powerful, minds, brains, and forms of consciousness, designed to serve different evolutionary functions” (Gopnik, 2009, 9). Part of this new respect for the capacities of children rests on neuroscience and an increased appreciation for the complexity of the brains of infants and young children. Thus Gopnik writes: “Babies’ brains are actually more highly connected than adult brains; more neural pathways are available to babies than adults.” (11)

3. Theories of Moral Development

Many philosophers in the history of ethics have devoted serious attention to the issue of moral development. Thus Plato, for example, offers a model curriculum in his dialogue, Republic, aimed at developing virtue in rulers. Aristotle’s account of the logical structure of the virtues in his Nicomachean Ethics provides a scaffolding for understanding how moral development takes place. And the Stoics (Turner and Matthews, 1998, 45–64) devoted special attention to dynamics of moral development.

Among modern philosophers, it is again Rousseau (1762) who devotes the most attention to issues of development. He offers a sequence of five age-related stages through which a person must pass to reach moral maturity: (i) infancy (birth to age 2); (ii) the age of sensation (3 to 12); (iii) the age of ideas (13 to puberty); (iv) the age of sentiment (puberty to age 20); and (v) the age of marriage and social responsibility (age 21 on). Although he allows that an adult may effectively modify the behavior of children by explaining that bad actions are those that will bring punishment (1762 [1979, 90]), he insists that genuinely moral reasoning will not be appreciated until the age of ideas, at 13 and older. In keeping with his stage theory of moral development he explicitly rejects Locke’s maxim, ‘Reason with children’ (Locke, JLE), on the ground that attempting to reason with a child younger than thirteen years of age is developmentally inappropriate.

However, the cognitive theory of moral development formulated by Piaget in The Moral Judgment of the Child (1965) and the somewhat later theory of Lawrence Kohlberg (1981, 1984) are the ones that have had most influence on psychologists, educators, and even philosophers. Thus, for example, what John Rawls has to say about children in his classic work, A Theory of Justice (1971) rests heavily on the work of Piaget and Kohlberg.

Kohlberg presents a theory according to which morality develops in approximately six stages, though according to his research, few adults actually reach the fifth or sixth stages. In this respect Kohlberg’s theory departs from classic stage theory, as in Piaget, since the sequence of stages does not culminate in the capacity shared by normal adults. However, Kohlberg maintained that no one skips a stage or regresses to an earlier stage. Although Kohlberg sometimes considered the possibility of a seventh or eighth stage, these are his basic six: the premoral (the 1st involving punishment and obedience, and the 2nd naive hedonism), the morality of conventional role conformity (the 3rd involving seeking good relations, the 4th maintaining authority) and the morality of accepted principles (the 5th involving the morality of contract, individual rights and accepted law, the 6th individual principles of conscience).

Kohlberg developed a test, which has been widely used, to determine the stage of any individual at any given time. The test requires responses to ethical dilemmas and is to be scored by consulting an elaborate manual.

One of the most influential critiques of the Kohlberg theory is to be found in Carol Gilligan’s In a Different Voice (1982). Gilligan argues that Kohlberg’s rule-oriented conception of morality has an orientation toward justice, which she associates with stereotypically male thinking, whereas women and girls are perhaps more likely to approach moral dilemmas with a “care” orientation. One important issue in moral theory that the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate raises is that of the role and importance of moral feelings in the moral life (see the entry on feminist ethics).

Another line of approach to moral development is to be found in the work of Martin Hoffman (1982). Hoffman describes the development of empathetic feelings and responses in four stages. Hoffman’s approach allows one to appreciate the possibility of genuine moral feelings, and so of genuine moral agency, in a very small child. By contrast, Kohlberg’s moral-dilemma tests will assign pre-schoolers and even early elementary-school children to a pre-moral level.

A philosophically astute and balanced assessment of the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate, with appropriate attention to the work of Martin Hoffman, can be found in Pritchard (1991). See also Friedman (1987), Likona (1976), Kagan and Lamb (1987), and Pritchard (1996).

While much of the discussion of children’s moral development has occurred within psychology, some recent philosophical work on the topic has emerged, with a particular focus on questions about whether children can be held resposible for either or both of morally praiseworthy actions and those that would be considered morally blameworthy if performed by adults (Burroughs 2020, Tiboris 2014).

4. Children’s Rights

For a full discussion of children’s interests and children’s rights see the entry on the rights of children.

5. Childhood Agency and Autonomy

Clearly children are capable of goal-directed behavior while still relatively young, and are agents in this minimal sense. Respect for children’s agency is provided in legal and medical contexts, in that children who are capable of expressing their preferences are frequently consulted, even if their views are not regarded as decisive for determining outcomes.

The exercise of childhood agency will obviously be constrained by social and political factors, including various dependency relations, some of them imposed by family structures. Whether there are special ethical rules and considerations that pertain to the family in particular, and, if so, what these rules or considerations are, is the subject of an emerging field we can call ‘family ethics’ (Baylis and McLeod 2014, Blustein, 1982, Brighouse and Swift 2014, Houlgate, 1980, 1999).

The idea that, in child-custody cases, the preferences of a child should be given consideration, and not just the “best interest” of the child, is beginning to gain acceptance in the U.S., Canada and Europe. “Gregory K,” who at age 12 was able to speak rationally and persuasively to support his petition for new adoptive parents, made a good case for recognizing childhood agency in a family court. (See “Gregory Kingsley” in the Other Internet Resources.) Less dramatically, in divorce proceedings, older children are routinely consulted for their views about proposed arrangements for their custody.

Perhaps the most wrenching cases in which adults have come to let children play a significant role in deciding their own future are those that involve treatment decisions for children with terminal illnesses. (Kopelman and Moskop, 1989) The pioneering work of Myra Bluebond-Langner shows how young children can come to terms with their own imminent death and even conspire, mercifully, to help their parents and caregivers avoid having to discuss this awful truth with them (Bluebond-Langner, 1980).

While family law and medical ethics are domains in which children capable of expressing preferences are increasingly encouraged to do so, there remains considerable controversy within philosophy as to the kind of authority that should be given to children’s preferences. There is widespread agreement that most children’s capacity to eventually become autonomous is morally important and that adults who interact with them have significant responsibility to ensure that this capacity is nurtured (Feinberg 1980). At the same time it is typical for philosophers to be skeptical about the capacity for children under the age of ten to have any capacity for autonomy, either because they are judged not to care stably about anything (Oshana 2005, Schapiro 1999), lack information, experience and cognitive maturity (Levinson 1999, Ross 1998), or are too poor at critical reflection (Levinson 1999).

Mullin (2007, 2014) argues that consideration of children’s capacity for autonomy should operate with a relatively minimal understanding of autonomy as self-governance in the service of what the person cares about (with the objects of care conceived broadly to include principles, relationships, activities and things). Children’s attachment to those they love (including their parents) can therefore be a source of autonomy. When a person, adult or child, acts autonomously, he or she finds the activity meaningful and embraces the goal of the action. This contrasts both with a lack of motivation and with feeling pressured by others to achieve outcomes desired by them. Autonomy in this sense requires capacities for impulse control, caring stably about some things, connecting one’s goals to one’s actions, and confidence that one can achieve at least some of one’s goals by directing one’s actions. It does not require extensive ability to engage in critical self-reflection, or substantive independence. The ability to act autonomously in a particular domain will depend, however, on whether one’s relationships with others are autonomy supporting. This is in keeping with feminist work on relational autonomy. See the entry on Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy.

The orthodox position that children are paradigmatic examples of a lack of autonomy has begun to change as more philosophers argue that even children far from the cusp of adulthood may be capable of acting autonomously in some areas of their lives (Bou-Habib and Olsaretti 2104, Hannan 2018a, Mullin 2007, 2014). However, others argue that even when children have capacities like those possessed by adults, societies shold protect children rather than deferring to their autonomy when children’s decisions might lead to very negative consequences for them (Betzler 2022, Claassen and Anderson 2012, Franklin-Hall 2013).

Children’s autonomy is supported when adults give them relevant information, reasons for their requests, demonstrate interest in children’s feelings and perspectives, and offer children structured choices that reflect those thoughts and feelings. Support for children’s autonomy in particular domains of action is perfectly consistent with adults behaving paternalistically toward them at other times and in other domains, when children are ill-informed, extremely impulsive, do not appreciate the long-term consequences of their actions, cannot recognize what is in their interest, cannot direct their actions to accord with their interests, or are at risk of significant harm (Mullin 2014).

6. The Goods (and Bads?) of Childhood

“Refrigerator art,” that is, the paintings and drawings of young children that parents display on the family’s refrigerator, is emblematic of adult ambivalence toward the productions of childhood. Typically, parents are pleased with, and proud of, the art their children produce. But equally typically, parents do not consider the artwork of their children to be good without qualification. Yet, as Jonathan Fineberg has pointed out (Fineberg, 1997, 2006), several of the most celebrated artists of the 20th century collected child art and were inspired by it. It may be that children are more likely as children to produce art, the aesthetic value of which a famous artist or an art historian can appreciate, than they will be able to later as adults.

According to what we have called the “Aristotelian conception”, childhood is an essentially prospective state. On such a view, the value of what a child produces cannot be expected to be good in itself, but only good for helping the child to develop into a good adult. Perhaps some child art is a counterexample to this expectation. Of course, one could argue that adults who, as children, were encouraged to produce art, as well as make music and excel at games, are more likely to be flourishing adults than those who are not encouraged to give such “outlets” to their energy and creativity. But the example of child art should at least make one suspicious of Michael Slote’s claim that “just as dreams are discounted except as they affect (the waking portions of) our lives, what happens in childhood principally affects our view of total lives through the effects that childhood success or failure are supposed to have on mature individuals” (Slote, 1983, 14).

Recent philosophical work on the goods of childhood (Brennan 2014, Gheaus 2014, Macleod 2010) stresses that childhood should not be evaluated solely insofar as it prepares the child to be a fully functioning adult. Instead, a good childhood is of intrinsic and not merely instrumental value. Different childhoods that equally prepare children to be capable adults may be better or worse, depending on how children fare qua children. Goods potentially specific to childhood (or, more likely, of greatest importance during childhood) include opportunities for joyful and unstructured play and social interactions, lack of significant responsibility, considerable free time, and innocence, particularly sexual innocence. Play, for instance, can be of considerable value not only as a means for children to acquire skills and capacities they will need as adults, but also for itself, during childhood.

Even more recently, some philosophers (Hannan 2018b, Hannan and Leland 2018) have questioned whether there are features of childhood that make childhood bad for children. Candidate bad-making features include children’s impaired practical identity, their being asymmetrically physically and emotionally vulnerable to their parents and needing extensive control by them, and their lack of a fixed practical identity. Any evaluation of features that are particularly valuable in childhood, and either uniquely or more easily accessed in childhood, should be balanced against consideration of features that make it a worse stage of life than adulthood. Bad-making features of childhood may be traced either to aspects of childhood that cannot be changed or to contingent social arrangements that may leave children vulnerable to abuse or neglect at the hands of their intimate caregivers, without much opportunity for recourse.

7. Philosophical Thinking in Children

For a full discussion of this topic see the entry on Philosophy for Children.

8. Moral Status of Children

It is uncontroversial to judge that what Mary Anne Warren terms paradigmatic humans have moral status (Warren 1992). Paradigmatic humans are adults with relatively standard cognitive capacities for self-control, self-criticism, self-direction, and rational thought, and are capable of moral thought and action. However, the grounds for this status are controversial, and different grounds for moral status have direct implications for the moral status of children. Jan Narveson (1988), for instance, argues that children do not have moral status in their own right because only free rational beings, capable of entering into reciprocal relations with one another, have fundamental rights. While Narveson uses the language of rights in his discussion of moral status (people have direct moral duties only to rights holders on his account), moral status need not be discussed in the language of rights. Many other philosophers recognize children as having moral status because of their potential to become paradigmatic humans without committing to children having rights. For instance, Allen Wood writes: “it would show contempt for rational nature to be indifferent to its potentiality in children.” (Wood 1998, 198)

When children are judged to have moral status because of their potential to develop the capacities of paradigmatic adults (we might call these paradigmatic children), this leaves questions about the moral status of those children who are not expected to live to adulthood, and those children whose significant intellectual disabilities compromise their ability to acquire the capacities of paradigmatic adults. There are then three common approaches that grant moral status to non-paradigmatic children (and other non-paradigmatic humans). The first approach deems moral consideration to track species membership. On this approach all human children have moral status simply because they are human (Kittay 2005). This approach has been criticized as being inappropriately speciesist, especially by animal rights activists. The second approach gives moral status to children because of their capacity to fare well or badly, either on straightforwardly utilitarian grounds or because they have subjective experiences (Dombrowski 1997). It has been criticized by some for failing to distinguish between capacities all or almost all human children have that are not also possessed by other creatures who feel pleasure and pain. The third approach gives moral status to non-paradigmatic children because of the interests others with moral status take in them (Sapontzis 1987), or the relationships they have with them (Kittay 2005). Jaworska and Tannenbaum (2018) offer a more recent version of such an account by arguing that children who are human and raised in a person-rearing manner have moral status.

Sometimes the approaches may be combined. For instance, Warren writes that young children and other non-paradigmatic humans have moral status for two sorts of reasons: “their rights are based not only on the value which they themselves place upon their lives and well-being, but also on the value which other human beings place on them.” (1992. 197) In addition to these three most common approaches, Mullin (2011) develops a fourth: some non-paradigmatic children (and adults) have moral status not simply because others value them but because they are themselves capable of being active participants in morally valuable relationships with others. These relationships express care for others beyond their serving as means for one’s own satisfaction. Approaches to moral status that emphasize children’s capacity to care for others in morally valuable relationships also raise interesting questions about children’s moral responsibilities within those relationships (see Mullin 2010).

For more on this topic see the entry on the grounds of moral status.

9. Other Issues

The topics discussed above hardly exhaust the philosophy of childhood. Thus, we have said nothing about, for example, philosophical literature on personhood as it bears on questions about the morality of abortion, or bioethical discussions about when it is appropriate for parents to consent to children’s participation in medical research or refuse medical treatment of their children. There has been increasing attention in recent years to questions about the appropriate limits of parental authority over children, about the source and extent of parents and the state’s responsibilities for children, and about the moral permissibility of parents devoting substantial resources to advancing the life prospects of their children. These and many other topics concerning children may be familiar to philosophers as they get discussed in other contexts, particularly within family ethics and bioethics. Discussing them under the rubric, ‘philosophy of childhood,’ as well in the other contexts, may help us see connections between them and other philosophical issues concerning children.


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