Children’s Rights

First published Wed Oct 16, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jan 24, 2023

‘In present-day political and moral philosophy the idea that all persons are in some way moral equals has become dogma’ (Steinhoff ed. 2015, xi). Yet in the collection of essays from whose Introduction this quotation comes and that seeks to explain and justify this foundational ‘dogma’, ‘children’ does not figure in its index and are barely discussed if at all. Whilst children are thought of as human beings and thus having a moral status such that it would be wrong to treat them in certain ways, it is also thought reasonable that there are things children may not do that adults may. In short, children are humans but not persons morally equal to adults. This is nowhere clearer than when considering what in law children are permitted or entitled to do as well as prevented from doing. In most jurisdictions, for instance, children are not allowed to vote, to marry, to buy alcohol, to have sex, or to engage in paid employment. Then there are things that should not be done to children because they are children, such as conscription into military service. Why should that be the case?

One very obvious way in which this issue of what distinguishes children from adults can be addressed is by asking the following questions, Do children have rights? If so, do they have all the rights that adults have and do they have rights that adults do not have? If they do not have rights how do we ensure that they are treated in the morally right way? Most jurisdictions accord children legal rights. Most countries—though not the United States of America—have ratified the United Nations Convention on the Rights of the Child which was first adopted in 1989. The Convention accords to children a wide range of rights including, most centrally, the ‘inherent right to life’ (Article 6), and the right of a child “who is capable of forming his or her own views … to express these views freely in all matters affecting the child” (Article 12) (United Nations 1989).

However, it is normal to distinguish between ‘positive’ rights, those that are recognised in law, and ‘moral’ rights, those that are recognised by some moral theory. That children have ‘positive’ rights does not then settle the question of whether they do or should have moral rights. Nevertheless, there are at least good political reasons why one might think that the UNCRC provides an exemplary statement—in the language of positive rights—of how children should be treated and regarded. The idea of children as rights holders has been subject to different kinds of philosophical criticism. There has also been philosophical consideration of what kinds of rights children have if they do have any rights at all. The various debates shed invaluable light on both the nature and value of rights, and on the moral status of children.

The question of how the putative rights of children stand in relation to the rights of those adults who, arguably, have rights over children broaches the issues of parental rights and responsibilities which is not discussed here. (See the entry on procreation and parenthood.)

1. Children and Rights

In the background of any consideration of children and rights are two matters: what counts as a child, and what is to be understood as capacity. The latter arises inasmuch as the question of whether children have rights and, if so, which ones normally turns on whether they have the relevant capacity.

What counts as a child and how we should understand ‘childhood’ are interesting philosophical questions. They are considered at length in Part I of Archard (2015). (See also the entry on childhood.) We may usefully distinguish a concept from a conception of the child as follows: ‘to have a concept of “childhood” is to recognise that children differ interestingly from adults; to have a conception of childhood is to have a view of what those interesting differences are’ (Archard 2015, 32). Having made this distinction we should recognise that conceptions of childhood vary across time and cultures. Moreover, conceptions of childhood may beg normative questions of why children have a different moral status to adults. In what follows a child is understood simply as a human being at a certain chronological stage of development. For instance, Article 1 of the United Nations Convention defines a child as any human being below the age of eighteen years ‘unless,’ it adds, ‘under the law applicable to the child, majority is attained earlier’ (United Nations 1989; Archard and Tobin 2019).

The concept of capacity is relevant to questions both of which theory of rights is correct as well as to which rights children might have. Other terms such as ‘competence’ and ‘ability’ are often used as if they were equivalent to ‘capacity’. However, it is important to be clear how ‘capacity’ is used (Cowden 2012). Here it is used as a dispositional concept. Someone has the capacity to do X if they could do X given the opportunity and in the appropriate circumstances. It is to be distinguished from an occurrent ability or competence to do X. Thus, a mature rational adult has the capacity to make autonomous choices, but may be temporarily unable to choose autonomously because, for instance, on this occasion their mind is disturbed, or their will is overborne. The notion of a child’s capacity should not be understood as meaning that they have it inasmuch as they would be able as an adult to do certain things. Nevertheless, the distinct claim – that allowing a child at some age to exercise a given right would encourage the acquisition of the qualifying capacity that is otherwise lacked – should be acknowledged and given due weight.

On the question of whether children have rights and which ones, some think it obvious that children do have rights and believe that the only interesting question is whether children possess all and only those rights which adults possess. Others are sceptical believing that given the nature both of rights and of children it is wrong to think of children as right-holders.

Fully and properly to address this issue it is necessary first to be clearer about the language of rights and to distinguish several different questions. First, we can inquire as to what it is for someone to have a right, or, put another way, we can ask what being a right-holder consists in.We can ask a second question, namely what must be true for there to be rights. That is, we can try to specify what have been called the ‘existence conditions for rights’ (Sumner 1987, 10–11). Third, we can ask what the different kinds of rights are. Finally, we can ask what the moral significance of having a right is, or what weight rights have. With regard to any acknowledged right we can identify it by means of its content (what is it a right to?) and its scope (who has it and against whom do they have it?), as well as its weight relative to other rights and to other moral considerations. Not all of these questions are relevant when we want to focus on the particular issue of whether or not children have rights, and, if so, which ones. However, the first question raised above is especially salient. In response, there are two competing theories whose respective virtues and vices have been extensively debated. In one camp is the will or choice theory (Hart 1973; Sumner 1987; Steiner 1994); in the opposing camp is the welfare or interest theory (MacCormick 1982; Raz 1984; Kramer 1998). The first theory sees a right as the protected exercise of choice. In particular to have a right is to have the power to enforce or waive the duty of which the right is the correlative. The second theory sees a right as the protection of an interest of sufficient importance to impose on others certain duties whose discharge allows the right-holder to enjoy the interest in question. It is natural to think that each theory is more appropriate for certain kinds of rights. The will theory fits rights actively to do things (to speak, to associate with others) whereas the interest theory fits rights passively to enjoy or not to suffer things (to receive health care, not to be tortured). However, the distinction between the theories of what it is to have a right is not, and does not coincide with the distinction between different kinds of rights, even if there are important relations between the two distinctions.

In this present context one alleged defect of the will theory is its exclusion of some humans from the category of right-holders. This is because whilst all humans, and perhaps many classes of non-humans such as animals, have interests that ought to be protected, not all humans have the capacity to exercise choice. Children—along with the severely mentally disabled and the comatose—cannot thus, on the will theory, be the holders of rights. For at least one prominent defender of the interest theory, the fact that children evidently do have rights is sufficient to display the falsity of the will theory, thus making children a ‘test-case’ for the latter (MacCormick 1982). Of course, someone who is convinced of the correctness of the will theory might readily concede that the theory entails the denial of rights to children but see no reason to abandon the theory. For her, the entailment is not, ‘Children have rights. Therefore, the will theory is false’. It is, ‘The will theory is true. Therefore, children cannot have rights’.

The following seven statements set out the arguments for the conclusions of the two competing theories of rights. 1 – 4 sets out the argument for the negative conclusion of the will theory, and 5 – 7 set out the argument for the positive conclusion of the interest theory:

  1. Rights are protected choices.
  2. Only those capable of exercising choices can be right-holders.
  3. Children are incapable of exercising choice.
  4. Children are not right-holders.
  5. Adults have duties to protect the important interests of children.
  6. Rights and duties are correlative.
  7. Children are right-holders.

(6) states an important view held by many that for each and every right there is a correlative duty. To say that I have a right to something is to say that someone else has a duty to me in respect of that thing. There may of course be some kinds of duties which do not correlate with any rights. Indeed, some critics of children’s rights will concede that adults have duties to protect important interests of children but deny that these interests correlate with rights held by children. (7) is thus true only insofar as the duties adults have in respect of children are such that they do correlate with rights held by children.

(3) is obviously a contestable, and contested, claim. But insofar as children cannot exercise choice and are required to do so on the will theory if they are to have rights, then it follows that they cannot have rights.

The upshot of setting the two theories out in this fashion is as follows: either children have rights, in which case the will theory cannot be true; or they do not, in which case that theory could be true.

However, a will theorist who did not want to deny that children have rights might resist affirming (2). This could be done by accepting that children are themselves incapable of exercising choice but allowing that children might have representatives or proxies, such as most obviously their parents or guardians, who could exercise the choices on behalf of the children. The representatives would choose for the children as the children would choose if they were capable of choosing for themselves. This proxy exercise of choice would take place only during the period when the children were incapable of exercising choice and in acknowledgment of the fact that the children will eventually be capable of exercising their own choices. The will theory’s most prominent defender (Hart 1973, 184 n.86) makes just such a modification of the will theory in respect of children.

Now such a modification must meet a number of challenges. First, how should the representatives be selected? Should those empowered to act as representatives be those who are most likely to choose as the children would choose if capable, or are there are other independent grounds on which they are selected—such as, most obviously, that they are the child’s parents? Second, if we think of such representation as a trust whose beneficiaries are children and whose trustees are the adults choosing for children, are the terms of the trust sufficiently clear and determinate? Is it, for instance, perspicuous and evident what a child would choose if capable of choosing? Note that the criterion is not what is in the best interests of the child for, consistent with the will theory, we must appeal to choices rather than interests. It is sometimes difficult to say what some adult who cannot currently choose—because she is, for instance, temporarily comatose—would choose if able. It is impossibly hard in the case of someone, a child, who is for the period of childhood simply incapable of making any choices. Third, how is the trust to be enforced and by whom? The representative may be presumed to have a duty to choose as the child would choose if able. If rights are correlative with duties then someone other than the representative and the child must be in a position to enforce or waive this duty. Could this be the state or its representative?

If the will theory can meet these formidable challenges, it can accord rights to children who are not then a straightforward ‘test-case’ for determining which theory of rights is correct. Moreover, the will theorist can make two further points. First, she might accept (6)—that rights and duties are correlative—but deny or at least significantly modify (5)—that adults have duties to protect the important interests of children. She could say that the duties that are rightly specified under (5) are not the duties that correlate with rights. This is just to say, as all rights theorists will repeatedly say, that rights do not exhaust the moral domain. What we are obligated to do because others have rights against us is not everything we must morally do. (6) asserts that for each and every right there is a correlate duty. It is not the eminently disputable claim that for each and every duty there is a correlate right. So, we should, as adults, ensure that the interests of children are protected and promoted. It would not follow that in consequence they have rights against us.

Second a will theorist might accept (5) and (6) as they stand but say that the rights which correlate with these duties are possessed not by the children but by adults who are in the best position to protect the children. Thus, even if the duties adults have in respect of children do correlate with rights it does not follow that the rights in question are held by those whose interests they protect. Indeed, it might be argued that it does not matter whether the rights are possessed by those whose interests they protect. Hillel Steiner thus asks rhetorically, Does it really matter whether the rights that correlate with adult duties to children are held by the children or by those who would act as best they could for the children? (Steiner 1998, 261).

This review of the will and interest theories has simply examined the issue of whether the denial of children’s rights can be thought of as a test case for the probity of the will theory. There may of course be other considerations that tell against the will theory and in favour of the interest theory; or the converse.

2. Critics of Children’s Rights

Grant that on either account of what it is to have a right children could, in principle, be the holders of rights. Ought children to have rights? And, if so, what rights should they have? Note that the rights can be moral or legal. Children do have rights in law (under the UN Convention most notably). These need not be accepted as moral rights. However, someone could believe that the best way, on balance, to protect the interests of children is by continuing to accord them the legal rights they have under something like the Convention. Someone might also believe that children should have legal rights but not those they are currently accorded. Conversely, if children do have moral rights, these need not be enshrined in law, although there would evidently be a strong presumption that they should. In the first instance, the question is whether children should have moral rights. If they should, then there would be a good case for thinking that these should be legally protected rights.

Those who claim that children should have all the rights that adults presently have are called ‘liberationists’ (to be discussed in the next section) and include Holt, Farson and Cohen (Farson 1974; Holt 1975; Cohen 1980). We can distinguish real from rhetorical liberationists. The latter are those who see the demand for equal rights for children as a means both of drawing attention to the discrimination that children suffer by comparison with adults in their treatment and for improving their condition. A rhetorical liberationist does not actually believe that children should be the equals of adults. Rather, he thinks that claiming as much is the best way of advancing their interests. A real liberationist does view children as the equals of adults. Then there are those who think that children should have some but not all of the rights which adults have. Finally, there are those who think that children should not have any rights. Or, put less brusquely, they are sceptical, for theoretical and political reasons, about attributing rights to children. Their case is made in three ways. The first is to assert what liberationists deny, namely that children are not qualified, as adults are, to have rights. The second is to argue that the ascription of rights to children is inappropriate because it displays a misunderstanding of what childhood is, what children are like, or what relationships children stand in to adults. The third is to argue that, notwithstanding their lack of rights, children can be assured of adequate moral protection by other means.

With respect to the first claim, the question of qualification is the question of whether children have the requisite capacity for rights. On the will theory of rights the relevant capacity qualifying children for possession of rights is that of the ability to choose. But there is a more general issue of capacity that is in dispute whatever theory of rights is defended and that follows from attention to the fact that rights have a content. Each right is a right to do, to be, or to have something. Arguably, only those rights can be possessed whose content can be appropriately attributed to their owners. A right to free speech cannot properly be possessed by an entity incapable of speech. One conventional way to think of rights in terms of their content is to distinguish between freedom rights (rights to choose, such as to vote, practise a religion, and to associate) and welfare rights (rights that protect important interests such as health).

Children in general lack certain cognitive abilities—to acquire and to process information in an ordered fashion, to form consistent and stable beliefs, to appreciate the significance of options and their consequences. They also lack certain volitional abilities—to form, retain and act in the light of consistent desires, and to make independent choices. Children are not unique amongst humans in this respect. Those adults who are seriously mentally impaired are also disqualified in this sense, which is of course just to say that these adults are childlike. Children are unique in the following regard. Not all humans are seriously mentally impaired, but all humans were once children. Thus every one of us was, during our early years, not qualified to be a holder of rights even if now we are so qualified.

It is worth distinguishing – as Schapiro (1999, 2003) does – between two ways in which a child is, relative to an adult, incapable. Schapiro argues that childhood is a ‘normative predicament’ wherein the child is in a state of nature, lacking any independent will whereby she might authoritatively and in her own voice order her desires. She is an ‘instinctual wanton’. On her account, the capacities a child lacks are not those of making good choices, but those of making any choices as such.

A child’s incapacity, in the senses indicated above, would seem to disqualify them from having liberty rights. Someone incapable of choosing cannot have a right whose content is a fundamental choice. If, as some maintain, all human rights are best interpreted as protecting human agency and its preconditions, then it would follow that those incapable of agency, such as young children, should not be accorded human rights (Griffin 2002). On the other hand, it could be maintained that, whilst children lack agency, they certainly have fundamental interests meriting protection and thus at least have welfare rights (Brighouse 2002). Moreover, it can be important to recognise that children become beings capable of making choices and that rights may be attributed in recognition of this gradual development (Brennan 2002).

The second claim that may be made in denying rights to children is that the ascription of rights to children is inappropriate because it displays a misunderstanding of what childhood is, of what children are like, or of what relationships children do or ought to stand in to adults. This claim comes in various forms.

On one view we should start our thinking about what morally we owe to children by specifying our obligations as adults to them (O’Neill 1988). There certainly exist what are called perfect obligations. These are obligations that are either owed to all children or to some specified set of children. They are perfect in that it is completely specified whom they are owed to and what is owed to them. We all are obliged not to maltreat any child, and parents have a particular duty to care for their children. But then there are imperfect obligations which are those of caring for children to whom we do not, as parents for instance, have specific obligations. All adults owe these, but they are not owed to all children (how could they possibly be?) nor is it specified what precisely is owed to them. The obligations are imperfect because which children we should care for is not specified nor is it specified precisely what is owed to them. Both are left to individual discretion, depending in part on circumstances.

Perhaps then we can agree that we are all under a duty to prevent the abuse of children. But clearly we cannot, as individuals, each act to stop every child being abused. Moreover what we ought to do—for instance, by reporting suspected cases of abuse—will depend on the circumstances, and also on what is in place by way of particular institutions and laws to deal with child abuse.

Crucially whilst perfect obligations correlate with rights, imperfect obligations do not. This means that anyone who starts and finishes thinking about what morally is owed to children in terms of their rights is unable to capture what imperfect obligations express. Yet this is to miss much of what is most important about the way in which, morally, we should as adults stand in relation to children. For the fulfilment of these imperfect duties of care and concern is what centrally protects and promotes the lives of children as children. Thinking ethically about children’s lives in terms of their putative rights is to misperceive what is of central importance and value in these lives.

One possible response to O’Neill’s argument is as follows (Coady 1992). She does not deny that perfect obligations correlate with rights. Thus, to the extent that we do have perfect obligations to children, they do have corresponding rights. Yet O’Neill denies that imperfect obligations correlate with rights. But why should we think that? The imperfect obligations are fundamental ones. They are not supererogatory, that is beyond duty. Adults must show consideration and kindness to children in general. So why cannot children claim such kindness and consideration from adults as their right? O’Neill does say that when imperfect obligations are institutionalised—when, for instance there are laws and institutions specifying who should act and how to detect and prevent child abuse—there are created positive special obligations to which correspond positive rights. But she adds that the obligations of, say, the social worker exceed the positive obligations associated with her job. However this is true of all our obligations, whether perfect or imperfect. A parent can have positive, that is legally recognised and sanctioned, duties to her child. Yet her perfect obligations to her children are not exhaustively specified by what the law requires of her.

O’Neill’s argument does not rely on any specification of the content of the obligations that might be owed by adults to children. Rather it is about the structure of our moral reasoning in respect of children, and the priority—false in the argument’s view—that is given to rights. As an argument it thus bears some comparison with a view that expresses general scepticism about rights in the context of adult-child relations and which emphasises the particular character of the family (Schrag 1980; Schoeman 1980). This view draws attention to the quality and nature of the relationships within a family. These are marked by an especial intimacy and by deep, unconditional love between its members. One can grant that many families do not conform to this ideal and yet acknowledge that when the family does conform to the ideal it is a distinctive, and distinctively valuable, form of human association.

What arguably follows from this ideal of the family is the inappropriateness of asserting or claiming rights. For to do so would be to subvert and ultimately destroy what constitutes the family as the distinctive form of human association it is. Appeal is being made here to a familiar and oft-drawn distinction between two ways in which individuals engaged in a common enterprise or bound together in some enduring association can be assured of their beneficent, or at least minimally good, treatment of one another. One way is by the recognition—in law or custom or shared morality—of rights that all individuals can claim, or by rules of justice—similarly and generally recognised—which provide an assurance of fair treatment. Another way is by reliance on the dispositions or attitudes that the individuals bound together have—spontaneously and naturally—towards one another. Thus, for instance, if each is motivated by general benevolence in respect of all then no one has any need to claim or assert what is due to him as of right or rule. In the case of the family, it is argued, neither justice nor benevolence suffices but love does. Of course children may have rights against those who are not family members (a right, for instance, that their school teachers provide them with information and skills). Some rights are held against particular individuals. Others, including the most important ones, are held against everyone, including parents and other family members

A further and quite distinct allegation is that not only is there no need for any such claims, but that allowing them to be made will erode, and in due course destroy, the dispositions and attitudes that rendered the need for rights and rules of justices unnecessary in the first place. This further claim is an influential one in the general critique communitarianism makes, within political philosophy, of what is characterised as a rights-based and individualistic liberalism (see, for instance, Sandel 1982, 32–5). In the context of the family the claim is that granting its members rights will subvert and bring about the end of the love between them that made rights superfluous in the first place.

The arguments considered thus far have appealed to the role that rights generally do and should play in our moral lives. A further argument considers what would actually follow from granting rights to children (Purdy 1992). The argument is that we need as adults to have acquired certain traits of character if we are to be able to pursue our goals and lead a valuable life. To acquire these traits it is essential that we not be allowed as children to make our own choices. Granting children the liberty to exercise rights is destructive of the preconditions for the possibility of having fulfilling adult lives. The central, and empirical, premise in this argument is that children do not spontaneously and naturally grow into adults. They need to be nurtured, supported, and, more particularly, subjected to control and discipline. Without that context giving children the rights that adults have is bad for the children. It is also bad for the adults they will turn into and for the society we share as adults and children.

The defence of the view that children should not, as the liberationist asserts, have all the rights that adults have has rested on the claims that, first, children lack the capacities that qualify adults for the possession of rights, and, second, that talk of children’s rights does not capture the truth about their lives or about the family or encourages a destructive permissiveness that has poor consequences for adults and their society. The third step in defence of the denial of rights to children is to provide reassurance that such a denial is not bad for children.

One can thus maintain that rights do not exhaust the moral domain. There are things we ought to do which do not correspond to the obligations we have as the correlates of rights. As adults we should protect and promote the welfare of children. It need not follow that they have rights against us.

To those who insist that children should, like other historically disadvantaged and discriminated groups, be emancipated by according them rights the reply (O’Neill 1988, 459– 463) is that such talk about rights talk misses what is distinctively different about children as a group. This is that childhood is not a permanently maintained status associated with oppression or discrimination. It is rather a stage of human development which all go through. Moreover the adults who deny that children do have rights may nevertheless also believe that it is their duty to ensure that the children for whom they have care do pass from childhood into adulthood.

3. Liberationism

The first claim in the defence of the denial of rights to children is that children are disqualified by virtue of their incapacity to have rights. Liberationists dispute this. Liberationists can allow that the key to the appropriateness of giving or not giving rights to children turns on capacity (Cohen 1980, ix). They will argue, however, that children are not disqualified from having rights by virtue of their lack of a capacity that adults do have. Note that on this view children are entitled to both welfare and freedom rights whereas those who concede that children lack the latter in virtue of a certain incapacity can still insist that they ought to have welfare rights where such an incapacity is not relevant. There are two respects in which this liberationist case might be modified or qualified. The first is in its scope. The liberationist might claim that all children are qualified to have rights, or she might claim only that some children are so qualified. The latter is the more plausible position in view of the fact that the very young infant is evidently incapacitated. Indeed some liberationists seem to recognise as much even whilst they insist that every child should have rights (Farson 1974, 31, 172, and 185). If the scope of the liberationist claim is thus limited it does not amount to the view that no line dividing human rights holders from humans who lack rights should be drawn. Rather it is the view that such a line has been drawn in the wrong place.

A second possible qualification of the liberationist view is that giving rights to children will play an important part in their acquiring the qualifying capacity. It is not thus argued that children are capable now and are illegitimately denied their rights. It is rather that they will only—or at least will more readily or will at an earlier stage—acquire that capacity if given their rights. The denial of rights to children is, on this account, one significant element in a culture that serves artificially to maintain children in their childlike state of dependence, vulnerability, and immaturity. Again the qualification can concede that children of a very young age are not capable enough to have rights, and will not acquire that capacity even if given rights. Yet it insists that the denial of rights to children of a certain age on account of their alleged incapacity is simply self-confirming. They cannot have rights because they are incapable but they are incapable only because they do not have these rights.

One plausible version of the claim refers to the facts of experience. Children, or at least children of a certain age, may not differ markedly from adults in respect of their cognitive and volitional capacities. They may be as capable as older humans of making their own minds up about what to do and be as independent in their resolution to act on their choices. But they may simply not have had as much experience of the world as their adult counterparts. Being thus naïve and inexperienced in the ways of the world they will not be as able, that is as qualified, as older (and wiser) humans are to make sensible choices. Grant that such a lack of experience can be attributed to a lack of opportunities to exercise choice. If such a lack of opportunity is in turn attributable not simply to not having been around for as long but to a denial of the freedom to make their own choices, then there is a powerful case for liberty rights being extended, even if cautiously, to these young people.

There are different ways in which the liberationist claim about capacity—whether qualified or not—can be made. One is by defending a ‘thin’ definition of capacity. For example it may be said that children can make choices if what this means is expressing preferences. Of course the response is that the ability to choose, thus minimally defined, is indeed possessed by children (even fairly young children), but it is not a capacity sufficient to qualify for rights ownership. What is needed for that is more than simply the ability to express or communicate a desire; what is needed is an ability to understand and appreciate the significance of the options facing one together with independence of choice. After all, the animal who moves from one feeding bowl to another may be said thereby to ‘choose’ the food in the latter bowl. But the animal does not have a general capacity of choice sufficient to qualify it as a holder of liberty rights.

4. Arbitrariness

Liberationists might move in the other direction and argue that the capacity which purportedly qualifies adults to have rights is in fact not a capacity that most, or perhaps any, adults possess. Thus, it will be said that no adult fully understands the nature of the choices she faces, nor is she consistent in her beliefs and desires, nor is she really independent of the influences of her environment and peers. Whether the liberationist urges a ‘thin’ definition of capacity—which the child satisfies as much as the adult—or argues that on a ‘thick’ definition of capacity neither adult nor child qualifies as capable, the point is the same. This is that the alleged differences between children and adults in respect of a qualifying capacity are not sufficient to warrant the ascription of rights to the latter and their denial to the former.

One way, then, to charge that age is an arbitrary means of distinguishing those qualified and those not qualified to have rights is that there is, in fact, no real division of capacities (Cohen 1980, 48). We should note that this claim can be supported by an ‘argument from marginal cases’, one that has been most influentially used in the case of animal rights. The argument in that context is that for whatever capacity is argued to distinguish the moral status of humans from animals there will be marginal cases – some humans will fail to possess it (Singer 1975, 265). In the present context, the argument would be that some older children display those abilities that supposedly distinguish children in general from adults (and some adults do not display those abilities that older children have). Whatever the merits of an argument from marginal cases the importance of being able to show that some children close to but below the age threshold (such as adolescents) do or do not merit the same treatment as other children is clear.

Another way to make the charge of arbitrariness turns on the idea that dividing lines as such—‘any’ lines—are arbitrary. Thus, either it will be said that this age is the wrong dividing point or that using any age is wrong. The first objection – ‘wrong age’- may concede that there is a better age to be used, just as the second objection – ‘age is wrong’ – may concede that there is a way, better than using age, to mark the division. The initial and obvious reply to the second objection is that age as such is not the issue but rather the reliable correlation of age with the acquisition of those capacities that qualify a person for the attribution of rights. Some liberationists may thus not dispute that there should be a threshold age—one beyond which adult rights are acquired—but think that the conventional or orthodox threshold is fixed too late. Liberationists may also simply deny that there should be any threshold on the grounds that there just is no difference between children and adults in respect of their respective capacities for any threshold age to mark. This version of the arbitrariness claim concedes that if age functions as a threshold it does so only inasmuch as it reliably correlates with the acquisition of capacities which are necessary qualifications for the possession of rights. In sum, the arbitrariness claim amounts either to the denial that the acquisition of the specified capacities does correlate with the threshold in question or to the denial that there is any age at which the capacities are acquired.

Setting aside this version of the arbitrariness claim, what remains of the charge that ‘[a]ny line which uses age to distinguish people with rights from people without can be shown to be arbitrary’? There are two ideas. The first is that although the threshold of age does serve to mark a difference within the class of human beings it is being human which is important. Or, relatedly, what is being distributed, namely rights, is so important that all humans should have them. It is being human which should make the difference not being of a certain age. Rights are too important to be denied to some humans on account of their (lesser) age and given to others on account of their (greater) age.

The reply is simple. Being human does matter and it is precisely because they are human beings, albeit young ones, that children are entitled to be treated in ways that non-humans may not. However, it is rights that are being distributed and to that end a threshold age does mark a significant point. Although having rights is better than not having them, those who lack rights do not lack any moral status whatever. Children are acknowledged to be humans meriting moral regard and yet to be young humans meriting a certain and age specific regard.

Some will still insist that a threshold age does not mark a significant enough difference. A 40-year-old differs greatly from a 4-year-old. Someone who is 18 years and 1 month does not differ greatly from someone who is 17 years and 11 months. It is understandable that the 40-year-old should have rights whereas the 4-year-old should not. But this is not the case for the latter pairing. This is a version of the marginal cases argument about the extent to which real differences between classes are displayed by the members of each class at the edge of these classes. The reply will be that the criticism concedes a difference between being too young to have rights and being old enough to have them. These differences are not arbitrary. Moreover, a threshold has to be fixed. The fact that there may not be significant—or significant enough—differences between the members of the two classes being distinguished at the edges of each class is the price one pays for having to operate with a threshold.

But is this price one that must be paid? The complaint is that age does not always reliably correlate with competence. Thus, using age may risk unfairly penalising some who are in fact competent just as it may risk unfairly rewarding some who are in fact incompetent. Moreover, the penalties and rewards in question—lacking or possessing rights—are far too important to run such risks. Why then should one not take each individual on her own and determine whether or not she is qualified to have rights?

The problems with the suggested use of a test are various. First, there is the sheer administrative scale of its employment in such a case as human rights. Second, there is the problem of agreeing on a determinate procedure for testing. How exactly are we to examine someone in respect of their competence to possess rights? Third, there is the problem of fairness. Any test must not unfairly disqualify some group of putative rights-holders by, for instance, having a bias in the testing procedure which, in effect, discriminates against that group. Fourth, the administration of any official test—and especially one whose passing yields such important goods—is subject to the risks of corruption or of misuse for the self-interested ends of those administering it. Again, this cannot be true of the use of age as a threshold. To summarise, these problems attaching to the use of a test are large and insuperable.

The counter-response to consider is that the burdens of any such test should be borne by the state inasmuch as there is a considerable risk of egregious wrong – the denial of rights – that is run by continuing only to use an age-based proxy for the existence of the relevant capacity (Godwin 2011, 286).

The charges of arbitrariness can be argued to be false or overstated. Children do differ from adults in respect of their competence to possess rights. A threshold of age may be the appropriate way to register that difference. One should, thus, acquire rights only on reaching a certain age. However, two riders to this summary are appropriate.

First, different rights may be acquired at different ages. After all, it is plausible to think that the capacities needed for, and qualifying a person to possess, different rights are themselves different. More particularly, different rights would seem to require different degrees of competence. Liberty rights entitle their possessors to make choices, and the matters in respect of which choices are made differ in their complexity, importance, and consequential impact. Those who are allowed to choose require greater or lesser amounts of maturity, independence, and deliberative proficiency in order to be able to make these different kinds of choice. The decisions to marry, consume alcohol, serve in the armed forces, undertake paid labour, vote, buy goods in a shop, travel unaccompanied, and open a bank account seem to presuppose different levels of understanding and autonomy. Assuming that these levels are progressively acquired at different ages, it makes sense to accord the corresponding rights not all at once but in stages.

Second, there should be an ordered but consistent acquisition of rights. If children are assumed to display the competence required for one kind of right, they should not be refused another kind of right which presupposes the same or even a lesser degree of ability. It would not make sense, for instance, to deny a young person the right to refuse medical treatment but allow them to choose to die in the armed services of their state.

The liberationist may make one last move. They may concede that children do lack the capacities that are a prerequisite for the possession of rights. However, they can suggest that children should be permitted ‘to borrow the capacities of others to secure whatever it is we are entitled to’ (Cohen 1980, 56). Child agents would advise their clients with a view to ensuring that the child’s right is properly exercised. However, to the various problems with the use of proxies or representatives, which have already been rehearsed in Section 1, we may add this question, Is the child still free to act or not on the advice given? If the child is not so free, then the role of the adviser is a strictly paternalist one, supplanting the child’s choice as to what is best for herself with her own choice. If on the other hand the child is free to reject the adviser’s advice, then the child is free to do what she wants anyway and the role of adviser is otiose and beside the point. One only needs to ‘borrow’ what one does not have. Not using what could be borrowed leaves one with the lack—and its consequences—that made the borrowing necessary. On the other hand, if a child can distinguish good from bad advice, then the borrowing is unnecessary. The child can give as good advice to herself as would be given to her by an adviser. But then no adviser is needed and this is precisely what Cohen denies.

5. Children’s Rights and Adult Rights

Those who deny that children do have rights can, as O’Neill argues, believe that the interests of children are nevertheless adequately protected through adults’ discharging relevant obligations. Yet, for some, the value of rights is not adequately captured in this manner. Joel Feinberg, for instance, believes that the value of a right lies in those who possess it being able to claim from others what is specified as its content (Feinberg 1970).

If having rights does have a distinctive and special value in this kind of way, then it matters greatly that children can have at least some rights. What might these be? As indicated at the outset, children are humans. They have at least the right to life that all humans have. Nevertheless, children are not thought to have all the rights that adult humans do. Central amongst these rights is that of self-determination, that is, the right to make choices in respect of one’s own life. This right is the basis of derivative rights to marry, have sex, choose one’s work, purse a course of education, and so on.

Most who believe that adults have rights which children do not have make the cut between liberty and welfare rights. Feinberg distinguishes between rights that belong only to adults (A-rights), rights that are common to both adults and children (A-C-rights), and rights that children alone possess (C-rights) (Feinberg 1980). Thus, a common position is that the A-rights include, centrally, the liberty rights, and that the A-C-rights include, centrally, the welfare rights. To repeat, liberty rights are rights of choice (how and whether to vote, what to say publicly, whether to practise a religion and which one, which if any association to join, and so on), whereas welfare rights protect important interests (such as health, bodily integrity, and privacy).

What might be included in the C-rights? Feinberg distinguishes between two sub-classes of C-rights. There are, first, those rights which children possess in virtue of their condition of childishness. Although Feinberg does not further divide this first sub-class of C-rights, this can be done. There are the rights children have to receive those goods they are incapable of securing for themselves and are incapable of so doing because of their dependence upon adults. These goods might include food and shelter. There are, second, the rights to be protected against harms which befall children because of their childlike vulnerability and whose harmfulness is a function of a fact that they befall children. These harms might include abuse and neglect. Note that some adults might be argued to merit the same degree of rights-based protection on account of their childlike vulnerability and dependence.

Finally, there are goods that children should arguably receive just because they are children. Those who have written on children’s goods do so for two reasons: first, to answer the question of what, as a matter of justice, is owed to children; and, second, to answer the question of whether, and why if so, childhood is itself intrinsically valuable (Gheaus 2015; Macleod 2010). Note that goods may be valuable to both children and adults, but of especial value to the former; or only of value to children. Candidate goods include play and innocence.

However, the most central, and contentious, example is a child’s right to be loved. This is not an A-C-right but it is arguably a C-right, and indeed is cited by many as a C-right (MacCormick 1976, 305). Various declarations of children’s rights include such a right and a respectable case can be made to meet the various objections normally raised against its attribution (Liao 2015).

It is standard to classify the rights listed in the UNCRC under the three P’s: those of protection (for example, against abuse), of provision (for example, of education), and of participation (for example, to speak and to associate freely). Protection rights will be accorded to children but not to adults inasmuch the condition or state of childhood calls forth and requires this protection. Children, along with adults, have provision rights but the content of these will differ between them because of the form that children’s needs and circumstances take. Thus, grant that both children and adults have a welfare right to health care. In the case of children, but not that of adults’, paediatric care and treatment is appropriate. But that fact is no different in its significance from the fact that amongst different adults the proper form of health care should vary in line with their various disabilities, diseases, and circumstances.

6. The Child’s Right to Grow Up

The second sub-class of C-rights are those which Feinberg characterises as ‘rights-in-trust’ and which he thinks can be subsumed under the single title of a ‘right to an open future’. These are the rights given to the child in the person of the adult she will become. They are the rights whose protection ensures that, as an adult, she will be in a position to exercise her A- and A-C-rights to the maximal or at least to a very significant degree. They keep her future open. Such rights impose limits on the rights of parents and also impose duties on the part of the state to protect these rights.

A couple of things are worth noting about these rights-in-trust. First, Feinberg refers to these C-rights as ‘anticipatory autonomy rights’, which might suggest that they are only A-rights-in-trust. But he also speaks of rights-in-trust of class C as protecting those future interests a child will have as an adult. This implies that they are also anticipatory welfare rights (Feinberg 1980, 126–7). Hence this sub-class of C-rights ensures that the adult can later exercise both her A-rights (liberty) and her A-C-rights (welfare).

Second, there is the question of how open a child’s future should be. Some interpret the demand for an education for an ‘open future’ as requiring individuals to acquire ‘to the greatest possible extent’ the capacity to choose between ‘the widest possible variety of ways of life’ (Arneson and Shapiro 1996, 388). Arneson and Shapiro have pointed out several objections to such a ‘maximising’ interpretation. It may not be possible to quantify in a determinate fashion the number of options open to a future adult. Furthermore, some fulfilling life choices are only available at the expense of denying the child a number of otherwise possible choices. For instance, a child intensively trained to realise his considerable innate musical abilities may be unable to pursue careers that would have been open to him in the absence of such a dedicated education. The following further criticisms can be added. Requiring that a child be brought up to be able eventually to choose between as many options as possible may impose unreasonable burdens on parents. It also seems implausible to think that a child suffers if she is denied one or even several possible insignificant further options beyond some threshold number of choices. Is it really harmful to a child that she does not learn to play all of the orchestral instruments and is thereby denied the opportunity to pursue a solo career in those she does not? Finally, some future options are surely morally base or in some other respect without value (Mills 2003).

Feinberg does sometimes talk only of the harms of closing off significant life choices. Yet he does also on occasion employ the language of maximisation. ‘[Education] should send [the child] out into the adult world with as many open opportunities as possible, thus maximising his chances for self-fulfilment’. (1980, 135; see also 151). However, it seems much more plausible to suggest that a child should have enough autonomy to be able to make reasonable life choices. The preconditions of autonomy are both internal (a capacity to think for oneself, to acquire and appreciate relevant information, and a volitional ability to act independently) and external (the provision of a range of feasible and valuable options). In respect of both conditions, it is perfectly possible to have a good sense of what counts as adequate autonomy, even if there is no clear bright line marking the point of sufficiency.

Closely related to Feinberg’s idea of ‘rights-in-trust’ is Eekelaar’s idea of a child’s ‘developmental’ rights (Eekelaar 1986). These are the rights of a child to develop her potential so that she enters adulthood without disadvantage. Whereas Feinberg attributes the rights to the child’s adult-self, the child holding them only in ‘anticipatory’ form, Eekelaar attributes the rights to the adult’s child-self. Arguably, this makes no difference, since the child and the adult are one and the same person. Although this is a metaphysically contentious claim (Parfit 1984), grant that child and adult are merely distinct temporal stages of a single individual. Whether each temporal stage of the person has the same interest in the child developing into an adult is a further issue which will be considered shortly.

However, child and adult do stand in an asymmetrical relationship to one another in a way that does not seem to be true of the different temporal stages of the same adult. After all, adult Smith can now exercise her liberty rights in such a fashion that at a later time she is not able to exercise them and her welfare rights to the same degree as she can now. Smith can, for instance, choose now to enter into a slavery contract or to engage in a dangerous sport that risks death or serious disability. A child, on the other hand, is denied the right to make choices that will fetter the adult exercise of her rights.

This can be justified by distinct thoughts. First, a child, unlike an adult, simply lacks the ability to make considered choices and should not have liberty rights. An adult can make unwise choices but is presumed to possess a general minimal capacity to make choices, which the child lacks. Second, what is done or not done in childhood can affect or shape the whole of one’s later life and in a way that is largely irreversible. By contrast, an adult is in a better position to change the course of her life. Third, a child may be thought to have the formal deliberative abilities to make choices (knowing what is to be decided) but simply lack the life experiences to appreciate and properly understand those choices.

Fourth, in the specific case of an adolescent – who is legally a child but on the edge of and at the beginning of adulthood – they may be judged as autonomous but nevertheless at a ‘life stage’ which merits paternalistic denial of choices (Franklin-Hall 2013).

Now consider the case of a child who will not develop into an adult, say someone who is suffering from a terminal disease that will prevent her living beyond the age of majority. Such a child lacks developmental rights. Or rather, she has them, but her circumstances do not allow for their protection. However, she does still have welfare and protection rights whose correlate duties can be discharged. The child has an interest in not suffering harm and in enjoying a certain standard of life even if she never lives beyond her childhood.

When, for instance, we provide a child with health care or protect her from abuse we not only thereby serve her immediate interests as a child, but we also ensure that she will grow into a mentally and physically healthy adult. At its simplest, a child’s welfare right not to be killed is a precondition of the very possibility of there being a future adult with any rights at all. Even the education of a child can be represented as not merely of instrumental worth to the future adult but of value to the child here and now. A child has an interest now in learning things and does so independently of what this might later mean for her future adult self. (Coady 1992, 51).

The child with the terminal illness will not develop into an adult. Can we say of anybody that she has an interest, as a child, in developing into an adult, an interest that is frustrated by her terminal condition? Or is there an interest in only being a child and never becoming an adult? Grant that the child-Q and the adult-Q are two stages of one and the same individual. Could we speak of a conflict between the present interest of child-Q in staying a child and the future interest of adult-Q in child-Q developing into her later adult self? The latter interest seems perfectly straightforward. However, it is at least controversial whether everybody does have an interest in growing up. Earlier cited work on the putative goods of childhood can be used to argue that childhood as such has a value that adulthood does not, with the further questions arising of whether the former value exceeds the latter and of whether they can be compared at all (Gheaus 2015; Hannan 2018). It has also been argued that it would be better for human beings never to have been born (Benatar 2008). Even if this is not a general truth, it may be true of some humans that not growing into adulthood and ceasing to exist is better than becoming an adult. This might be true, for instance, of somebody facing the prospect of a life of unrelieved, extreme pain and misery. Could there be an interest—even without such a prospect—in being forever a child?

Such an interest cannot be physically satisfied in this world. It is satisfied in the fictional world of Peter Pan; but the author of that fantasy, J.M. Barrie, clearly deprecates his eponymous hero’s infantile desire to escape the realities of the world (Barrie 1995). If we only mean, by the imagined interest, remaining childish it is hard to see how any individual in our world could, if rational, have such an interest. It is one thing to be a child forever in a child’s world as Peter Pan is. It is quite another to remain a child in our adult world. Childhood is something best appreciated by the child. It is also something that needs to be left behind. In the words of Paul, ‘When I was a child, I spoke as a child, I understood as a child, I thought as a child: but when I became a man I put away these childish things’ (I Corinthians 13:11).

7. Best Interests

If children are not thought to have the A-rights, and, chiefly, do not have the liberty rights to choose for themselves how to conduct their lives, nevertheless they are not morally abandoned to their own devices. In the first place, it is a standard principle of child welfare law and policy that the ‘best interests’ of a child should be promoted. Article 3.1 of the United Nations Convention on the Rights of the Child states that ‘In all actions concerning children, whether undertaken by public or private social welfare institutions, courts of law, administrative authorities or legislative bodies, the best interests of the child shall be a primary consideration’ (United Nations 1989).

Second, Article 12.1 of the Convention asserts that, ‘States Parties shall assure to the child who is capable of forming his or her own views the right to express those views freely in all matters affecting the child, the views of the child being given due weight in accordance with the age and maturity of the child’ (United Nations 1989).

Section 9 discusses the right to be heard. This section discusses the best interest principle, henceforward the BIP. The discussion is brief for the following reason: Article 3 does not accord to children a right to have their best interests protected and promoted. Indeed, it does not use the word ‘right’. The Article does impose on States parties an obligation to ensure that all relevant organizations and legislative bodies make the best interests of children a relevant consideration. However, the BIP sits oddly besides the other enumerated rights.

Moreover, the BIP has been subject to numerous criticisms (Kopelman 1997; Parker 1994) and claims of ambiguity, chief amongst which are the following. First, the weight given to best interests can be variously specified, a choice between ‘primary’ or ‘paramount’ being a significant one which preoccupied those drafting the Convention. (Alston 1994 12). Second, there is an important difference between its use in respect of ‘a’ (that is some particular) child and of ‘children’ (as a class of humans). Third, it is implausible to view the BIP as requiring that one must act ‘so as to promote maximally the good’ of the child (Buchanan and Brock 1989, 10). Construed in literally maximising terms (rather than merely what is good enough), the BIP is unfeasibly demanding of agencies charged with the care of children. Fourth, the BIP does not, as it stands, take account of the interests of others. We cannot be required to promote the best interests of a child over and above, and without regard to, the interests of any relevant adult.

Fifth, the interpretation of ‘best interests’ is unclear: it could be specified as what a child would choose for herself under specified hypothetical circumstances; or what is, as a matter of fact, best for the child, an account which is distinct from and independent of the child’s desires, actual or hypothetical. If it is the latter then, some argue, we cannot with certainty determine what is best for a child. We cannot in practice make complete and accurate assessments of what will be the outcome of each and every policy option that we might adopt in respect of a child (Mnookin 1979). The BIP is indeterminate even where there are only two possible decisions to be made (Elster 1989, 134–139). Such indeterminacy is compounded and complicated by the fact of moral pluralism (Rawls 1993, xvi-xvii), whereby individuals subscribe to different conceptions of what makes life valuable. If we cannot agree how to rank as better or worse different kinds of life, we will not be able to agree what is better or best for the growing child. The fact of extensive disagreement about what is best for children, or for a child, is often set in the context of broader cultural disagreements about morality in general. It is said that the BIP is subverted, or at least rendered deeply problematic, by the existence of these deep and pervasive cultural disagreements (Alston (ed.) 1994).

If we understand the BIP in terms of a child’s hypothetical choices, the most striking and influential thought is that we should choose what is best for the child as the child would choose for herself if the child were adult. For instance, John Rawls thinks the following formulation defines the acceptable paternalism of a guardian’s treatment of his child: ‘We must choose for others as we have reason to believe they would choose for themselves if they were at the age of reason and deciding rationally’ (Rawls 1999, 183). This apparently simple formulation is in fact susceptible of at least two quite different interpretations, each of which brings with it its own problems. In each case, we are seeking to specify the adult person who chooses for the child.

We might, first, mean that we should choose for this child as the adult the child will become would choose. However, this does not determine a unique choice for, crucially, the nature of the adult that the child will become precisely depends on the choices that are made for it whilst a child. We can conceive of each of the different adult selves the child might develop into approving, respectively, of the different choices made for its childhood self—choices which were responsible for the development of these different selves. Or, second, the adult person who chooses for the child is an adult analogue of the child. This is not the child’s future adult self, which as we have seen is indeterminate, but this child made into an adult version of itself. That is, we do not imagine this child developing in the future into its adult self. Rather we imagine a mature or grown-up version of this child now making choices. This interpretation however will still not work. The adult version of the child is one with childish beliefs and desires filtered out. But, in the first place, it is not clear what remains of the child in any choice situation rendered hypothetical in this fashion. For the child just is someone who has these childish beliefs and desires. What is it to be a child if not to think and want as a child does? Second, it is entirely indeterminate what should replace these beliefs and desires.

However, in the case of children, by contrast with adults, we cannot cash out the various hypothetical conditionals. We do not know what a child would choose if possessed of adult rational powers of choice, because what makes a child a child just is its lack of such powers (its ignorance, inconstant wants, inconsistent beliefs, and limited powers of ratiocination). At the same time, we cannot ask how an adult would choose if in the child’s situation just because an adult would not be in that situation, or would not be in a child’s situation. We must, it seems, choose for a child because a child cannot choose for itself, and we must choose what is best for a child not what some imagined adult version of the child would choose for itself.

To repeat, the BIP, despite its importance, is not a child’s right. Moreover, as well as being beset by these various problems, it is also arguably in tension with some of the other rights a child has. In particular, the obligation to do what is best for the child stands against an obligation to give serious consideration to a child’s own view of what is in their interests. This requirement is discussed in Section 9.

8. Children and the Reproduction of Values

The putative possession by a child of a right to an ‘open future’ together with the imperative to promote any child’s best interests raises the question of what, if anything, is wrong with the transmission to a child of values. These most obviously may be those values by which the child’s parent lives and which may also help to define the identity of a community. Article 2 of the UNCRC accords the child a right to non-discrimination on various grounds including ‘national, ethnic or social origin’; and Article 30 recognises that a child belonging to an ‘ethnic, religious or linguistic’ minority ‘shall not be denied the right, in community with other members of his or her group, to enjoy his or her own culture, to profess and practise his or her own religion, or to use his or her own language’.

Yet, for many liberals, there is a tension between the recognition of such rights and the requirement that a child not be inducted into a community in such a manner that his or her future adult choices are constrained. The main way in which this is set out is by means of an emphasis upon a liberal ideal of an autonomous life, one in which an individual is able both to form his or her own conception of the good life to lead and is not prevented – by external social circumstances or the actions of others – from being able to lead the preferred life. Often the target that is juxtaposed to such a liberal ideal is the values of religious minorities. The Supreme Court judgment that prompted Joel Feinberg’s defence of a child’s right to an ‘open future’, and which has been extensively discussed, is Wisconsin v. Yoder (1972). This exempted the Amish community from the requirement to keep their children in school to the age others are so required in the interests of maintaining that community’s identity. Arneson and Shapiro in response contrast ‘religious traditionalist’ and ‘secular worldly’ ways of life, seeing an education for the latter as the best preparation for an open future (Arneson and Shapiro 1996).

The problem with this approach is that the preferential treatment – in the way that children are schooled – is both discriminatory and may violate the central precept of liberal neutrality, the requirement that the state not, in its law and policies, favour any conception of the good (see the entry on Perfectionism in Moral and Political Philosophy). Moreover, some liberals will argue that the character traits and dispositions of autonomy, for instance steadfastness of character, are best taught by being raised in adherence to a particular way of life, such as one of religious faith (Callan, 2002; Burtt 1996).

Liberals may escape the charge of violating the principle of neutrality by arguing that a liberal society requires that its citizens be motivated by a sense of justice and an ability to participate effectively within democratic institutions. This requirement is satisfied only if children are brought up in certain values and are able, when adults, to make maximally autonomous choices. In this manner the promotion of autonomy and an open future can be seen as an indirect consequence of a necessary education in those civic capacities that are the necessary precondition of stable and sustainable liberal institutions.

The tension that is broached by a child’s right to an open future is given a clear and provocative reading in Matthew Clayton’s book (Clayton 2006). He argues that parents may not ‘enrol their children into comprehensive doctrines’, in other words, bring them up to believe in general truths about the best way to lead a life, whatever the provenance of those truths. Thus, his view is broader than a critique of a religious education. But at the same time, it would indict the vast majority of conscientious parents seeking to bring up their children as they see best.

His defence of this view relies on a claimed analogy between the exercises of political and of parental power. The former is only legitimate on liberal grounds in the absence of any appeal to the correctness of some comprehensive doctrine. Clayton thinks that the similarities between the two exercises of power are sufficiently strong and robust for parental conduct to be constrained by the same liberal principle of legitimacy.

In response it may be argued that the two domains of power are not analogous. It may also be suggested that there is a morally relevant difference between parents setting out to enrol their children in a comprehensive doctrine and children coming to share such a doctrine because of sharing their life with their parents (Archard 2002). Indeed, if the institution of the family as an essentially intimate and private community of adults and children can be defended and if, further, adults have a protected right to lead their lives by the light of their preferred conception of the good, then such unintended enrolment is inevitable. Others will argue that it is not possible to teach children that sense of justice which liberals see as critical to the sustainability of a fair society without embedding it in a comprehensive doctrine (Franklin-Hall 2019).

It is of course a further question of whether certain communal values violate liberal values other than autonomy – such as equality. For example, it would be wrong to rear boys and girls in gendered stereotypes that perpetuate inequality and discrimination.

9. The Right to be Heard

The right to be heard is a valuable right. What makes it valuable is both that there is a point to making one’s views known and, further, that making one’s views known makes a difference. It matters to me that I can speak out on political questions. It matters also, and probably more, if what I say leads to the changes I favour. Correlatively, it is true both that I do not want to be silenced and that I do not want the statement of my views to be ineffectual. As a further general point there will always be some issues on which it is more important that I be allowed to speak and that what I say about these issues carries weight in determining outcomes. Those are the issues that matter to me, and the more they matter the more important it is that I have the freedom to speak about them and be heard. On one account, since children’s views should not be ‘authoritative’, that is, determinative of what is done, they have only a ‘consultative’ role (Brighouse 2003). They may influence an outcome by, most obviously, providing those who do make the decisions affecting a child’s interests with a clearer picture of what in fact is in those interests. On another account, encouraging and according a weight to the expression of children’s views—even where this is unlikely to affect outcomes in line with the views’ content—is valuable just because the child is capable of expressing a view and deserves to be listened to (Archard and Skivenes 2009).

How is it with the child’s right to be heard? It will be important for the child to be listened to. But it is also important that the child is heard in the sense that her views are given due consideration and may influence what is done. Note that the child’s right to be heard on matters affecting its own interests is a substitute for the liberty right to make one’s own choices. The right to be heard is only a right to have the opportunity to influence the person who will otherwise choose for the child. The power to make those choices resides with the adult guardian or representative of the child. All the child retains is the right to try to motivate that adult to choose as the child herself would choose if she was allowed to.

Article 12.1 of the United Nations Convention on the Rights of the Child not only accords the child the right freely to express its views on matters affecting the child. It also, and crucially, gives the child an assurance that these views will be given ‘due weight in accordance with the age and maturity of the child’. Great emphasis is now placed on what are termed a child’s ‘participation rights’ as opposed to his or her ‘protection rights’. The latter, as the name suggests, protect the child from violent, abusive, cruel or exploitative treatment. ‘Participation rights by contrast, give children some entitlement to be the agents of their own lives. Article 12.1 provides a crucial underpinning justification for such rights. There are problems in understanding how practically to implement such rights (Ang, et al. 2006). There are also theoretical issues in making precise sense of what a right such as that enshrined in Article 12.1 might mean. Its complexities lie in understanding the difference between an adult’s power of choice and a child’s views on critical personal matters, in the different ways we might consider a child’s views, in how to weight those views and how their weighting makes a practical difference in coming to a decision (Archard and Uniacke 2020).

The celebrated British legal judgement in the Gillick case (Gillick [1986]) provides a useful contrast to Article 12. This judgement has been extensively discussed, and it has also been highly influential in matters relating to the consent of children to medical treatment.

The Gillick judgement arose from the dissatisfaction of a mother with the failure of her local health authority to withdraw an advisory circular to the area’s doctors. This advised doctors that they could counsel and inform young girls under the age of 16 about sexual matters as well as provide them with contraception, and that they could do this without the consent of the child’s parents. The mother, Victoria Gillick, went to court to have the circular declared unlawful. The final judgement by the British House of Lords was that the circular was not unlawful. A key issue, relevant to the present discussion, concerned the proper relationship between the child’s right to decide for itself and the parent’s right to decide for the child.

In deciding in favour of the health authority one of the Law Lords, Lord Scarman, made a statement crucial to his finding and one that has subsequently been much cited. It is worth reproducing:

The underlying principle of the law … is that parental right yields to the child’s right to make his own decisions when he reaches a sufficient understanding and intelligence to be capable of making up his own mind on the matter requiring decision. (Gilick [1986], 186)

I would hold that as a matter of law the parental right to determine whether or not their minor child below the age of 16 will have medical treatment terminates if and when the child achieves a sufficient understanding and intelligence to enable him to understand fully what is proposed. (Gillick [1986], 188–9)

Various questions arise. First, what does it mean for a child to get to a particular point in their development? On what could be called the threshold interpretation, once a child has achieved a certain level of competence, her views as to what shall happen to her have a determinate weight, either amounting to a liberty right of choice (on a strong version) or (on a weak version) being counted in the balance against her parents’ views and the state’s judgement of her best interests. On what could be called the proportionality interpretation, the child’s views progressively increase in weight as she gains a greater competence to choose for herself. They increase up to the acquisition of a full liberty right of choice.

Second, on either the threshold or the proportionality account we need a measure of that ability that marks the threshold or is simply progressively acquired. How much intelligence and understanding, for instance, is sufficient? In the first place, this measure must be taken independently of any judgement of what is in the child’s best interest. That a child would choose what is taken to be in her best interests is at most evidence that she does have sufficient intelligence and understanding of the relevant issue. Her making such a choice is not a necessary condition of her having the requisite ability. Similarly, the making by a child of a poor choice is not conclusive evidence of her general incapacity to choose for herself. Wise adults can occasionally make stupid decisions just as fools sometimes get it right.

In the Gillick judgement, Scarman required of the child that she manifest an understanding of the ‘nature’ of the contraceptive advice offered and ‘also have a sufficient maturity to understand what is involved’ (Gillick [1986], 189). We can distinguish here a number of possible elements. There is, first, knowledge of certain facts. One child, for instance, knows that a contraceptive acts to prevent conception that might otherwise result from sexual intercourse. Another child, by contrast, could simply be ignorant of or unable to comprehend the facts of reproduction. There is, second, an understanding of what follows for the child from an act or its omission. Thus, failure to use a contraceptive could lead a young person who had sexual intercourse to become pregnant. These two understandings together constitute knowledge of the ‘nature’ of the act. Finally, there is what arguably comes with ‘maturity’ which is the ability to appreciate the significance both of an act or its omission and of the relevant consequences. It is one thing to know what it is to become pregnant, and another to understand what that means. This latter understanding involves realising that pregnancy brings in its wake physical changes, that any resultant birth leaves a young person with a child to care for, and so on. Scarman even insisted that the child would need to have an appreciation of the ‘moral and family’ questions involved.

Third, it is important in measuring a child’s competence against that in respect of which he or she is expressing a view to distinguish between the complexity and the seriousness of the matter. A simple choice—for instance that between only two options such as whether to have a life-saving operation—may nevertheless be portentous, having enormous and far-reaching consequences. It may thus require much greater appreciation of what is involved than a more complex decision, one that ranges over many possibilities. Yet the latter kind of choice—consider choosing a five-course meal from a very large menu—is far less serious in its consequences. In short, the difficulty or complexity of a choice should not be confused with its importance or significance for the child.

Fourth, the English courts at least have detected a fundamental asymmetry between refusing and choosing to have treatment. A competent adult has a right both to choose to have treatment and to refuse it. Should this not also be the case with a competent child? A 15-year-old who wants to have a particular operation against her parents’ wishes and even contrary to the best judgement of her doctors may be judged competent and thus have her wishes respected. However, the English courts in a series of judgements after Gillick have argued that matters are somehow different when it is a case of a child refusing an operation.

Of course, there is no inconsistency if a refusal requires a greater degree of understanding and appreciation of the issues than a positive acceptance. But where the choice is a simple disjunction, it is hard to see how this can be the case. Are not the issues at stake the same for both disjuncts? If the courts believe that an obligation to act in the best interests of the child trumps one to respect the wishes of a competent child, it needs to be shown why this obligation does not have force in all circumstances. Why would a court not deny treatment to a child it does not believe in her best interests when it judges her competent to choose? If a child is competent then she is in all significant and relevant respects the equal of an adult and should be able both to choose and to refuse treatment.

Three final comments on the child’s right to choose are in order. First, what is deemed to be in the child’s best interests is evidence for, but not finally determinative of, a judgement as to the competence of the child. Nevertheless, balancing a child’s right to be heard against a child’s right to have its best interests promoted is difficult. Second, it is arguably enough to show a child’s competence that a child understands the nature of the act. After all, no more is needed for an adult’s consent to be informed. In the law of contract adults need only to know what they are signing up to. They do not need a full appreciation of the contract’s significance and of its import for their future lives. Third, Gillick competence as specified is very demanding. Indeed, there are many adults who, in making their choices, fail to display the maturity and ‘understanding of what is involved’ that is dictated as necessary for the child. Why then should a child have to display a competence that many adults lack both in general and in particular cases?

10. Summary

One important, indeed central, manner of understanding the moral status of the child is by questioning whether or not children have rights. It is normally thought that according to the ‘will’ theory of rights children cannot have rights, whereas according to the ‘interest’ theory they can. It is, however, at least possible on the ‘will’ theory that children could have rights, albeit ones that are exercised by trustees or representatives.

Child ‘liberationists’ claim that children have all the rights that adults do. Others deny this, either believing that children have no rights or believing that children have only some of the rights which adults possess. Those who believe children have no rights deny that children are qualified as adults are to have rights. They further argue that the ascription of rights to children manifests a misunderstanding of what children are like and of the nature of family relationships. Those who deny children all or some of the rights possessed by adults nevertheless believe that children, as humans, have a certain moral status that ought to be protected.

Those who say that drawing a line between adults and children in respect of their possession of rights is arbitrary may mean different things. To deny that different capacities are progressively acquired at different ages is implausible. To insist that drawing a line as such is wrong ignores the point of doing so, and recourse to the alternative of a competency test is not appropriate or practicable. On the standard view, children have welfare but not liberty rights, whereas adults have both. Adults also have the right that their childhood selves shall grow up to be adults of a certain sort. Children do not have an interest in remaining in childhood.

The best-interest principle with all its problems of interpretation sits oddly alongside the rights that are accorded to the child, especially that of a right to be heard in matters affecting its interests. This right in turn is a substitute not a complement to the right of choosing for oneself, and the Gillick competence which qualifies a child to exercise its rights of decision-making is arguably stringently defined.


References Cited

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Other Important Work

  • Aiken, W. and LaFollette, H. (eds.), 1980, Whose Child? Parental Rights, Parental Authority and State Power, Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Alston, P., Parker, S., and Seymour, J. (eds.), 1992, Children, Rights and the Law, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Archard, D. and Macleod, C. (eds.), 2002, The Moral and Political Status of Children: New Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bagattini, A. and Macleod, C. (eds.), 2015, The Nature of Children’s Well-Being, Theory and Practice, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Blustein, J., 1982, Parents and Children: The Ethics of the Family, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brennan, S. and Noggle, R., 1997, ‘The Moral Status of Children: Children’s Rights, Parents’ Rights, and Family Justice’, Social Theory and Practice, 23: 1–26.
  • Brighouse, H, and Swift, A., 2014, Family Values: The Ethics of Parent-Child Relationships, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Gheaus, A., Calder, G., and Wispeleare, J. de (eds.), 2019, Routledge Handbook of the Philosophy of Childhood and Children, London: Routledge.
  • Kleinig, J., 1976, ‘Mill, Children, and Rights’, Educational Philosophy and Theory, 8(1): 1–16.
  • O’Neill, O. and Ruddick, W. (eds.), 1979, Having Children: Philosophical and Legal Reflections on Parenthood, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Scarre, G., (ed.), 1989, Children, Parents, and Politics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Tomlin, P. 2018, ‘Saplings or Caterpillars? Trying to Understand Children’s Well-Being’, Journal of Applied Philosophy, 35 (1): 29–46.
  • Turner, S.M. and Matthews, G.B., eds., 1998, The Philosopher’s Child, Rochester: University of Rochester.
  • Wald, M., 1979, ‘Children’s Rights: A Framework for Analysis’, University of California at Davis Law Review, 12 (2): 255–282.
  • Worsfold, V.L., 1974, ‘A Philosophical Justification for Children’s Rights’, Harvard Educational Review, 44 (1): 142–57.
  • Wringe, C., 1981, Children’s Rights, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.

Other Internet Resources

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