First published Tue May 9, 2006; substantive revision Tue Jan 17, 2023

Colonialism is a practice of domination, which involves the subjugation of one people to another. At least since the Crusades and the conquest of the Americas, political theorists have used theories of justice, contract, and natural law to both criticize and justify European domination. In the nineteenth century, the contradiction between liberal ideals and colonial practice became particularly acute, as the dominion of Europe over the rest of the world reached its zenith. This entry begins with a definition of colonialism, and the second section explains how European thinkers justified, legitimized, and challenged the conquest of the Americas. The third section focuses on liberalism and the fourth section briefly discusses the Marxist tradition, including Marx’s own defense of British colonialism in India and Lenin’s anti-imperialist writings. The fifth section provides an introduction to contemporary “post-colonial theory.” This approach has been particularly influential in literary studies because it draws attention to the diverse ways that postcolonial subjectivities are constituted and resisted through discursive practices. The final section will introduce Indigenous critiques of settler-colonialism that emerge as a response to colonial practices of domination and dispossession of land, customs and traditional history and to post-colonial theories of universalism. The goal of the entry is to provide an overview of the philosophical response to the experience of European colonization.

1. Definition and Outline

Colonialism is not a modern phenomenon. World history is full of examples of one society gradually expanding by incorporating adjacent territory and settling its people on newly conquered territory. In the sixteenth century, colonialism changed decisively because of technological developments in navigation that began to connect more remote parts of the world. The modern European colonial project emerged when it became possible to move large numbers of people across the ocean and to maintain political control in spite of geographical dispersion. This entry uses the term colonialism to describe the process of European settlement, violent dispossession and political domination over the rest of the world, including the Americas, Australia, and parts of Africa and Asia.

The difficulty of defining colonialism stems from the fact that the term is often used as a synonym for imperialism. Both colonialism and imperialism were forms of conquest that were expected to benefit Europe economically and strategically. The term colonialism is frequently used to describe the settlement of North America, Australia, New Zealand, Algeria, and Brazil, places that were controlled by a large population of permanent European residents. The term imperialism often describes cases in which a foreign government administers a territory without significant settlement; typical examples include the scramble for Africa in the late nineteenth century and the American domination of the Philippines and Puerto Rico. The distinction between the two, however, is not entirely consistent in the literature. Some scholars distinguish between colonies for settlement and colonies for economic exploitation. Others use the term colonialism to describe dependencies that are directly governed by a foreign nation and contrast this with imperialism, which involves indirect forms of domination. Like colonialism, imperialism also involves political and economic control over a dependent territory. The etymology of the two terms, however, provides some clues about how they differ. The term colony comes from the Latin word colonus, meaning farmer. This root reminds us that the practice of colonialism usually involved the transfer of population to a new territory, where the arrivals lived as permanent settlers while maintaining political allegiance to their country of origin. Imperialism, on the other hand, comes from the Latin term imperium, meaning to command. Thus, the term imperialism draws attention to the way that one country exercises power over another, whether through settlement, sovereignty, or indirect mechanisms of control.

The confusion about the meaning of the term imperialism reflects the way that the concept has changed over time. Although the English word imperialism was not commonly used before the nineteenth century, Elizabethans already described the United Kingdom as “the British Empire.” As Britain began to acquire overseas dependencies, the concept of empire was employed more frequently. Imperialism was understood as a system of military domination and sovereignty over territories. The day to day work of government might be exercised indirectly through local assemblies or indigenous rulers who paid tribute, but sovereignty rested with the British. The shift away from this traditional understanding of empire was influenced by the Leninist analysis of imperialism as a system oriented towards economic exploitation. According to Lenin, imperialism was the necessary and inevitable result of the logic of accumulation in late capitalism. Thus, for Lenin and subsequent Marxists, imperialism described a historical stage of capitalism rather than a trans-historical practice of political and military domination. The lasting impact of the Marxist approach is apparent in contemporary debates about American imperialism, a term which usually means American economic hegemony, regardless of whether such power is exercised directly or indirectly (Young 2001).

Given the difficulty of consistently distinguishing between the two terms, this entry will use colonialism as a broad concept that refers to the project of European political domination that began in the early sixteenth century. While the national liberation movements of the post-World War II era brought formal colonization to an end in many parts of the world, Indigenous peoples still live in settler-colonial states, and there are on-going struggles to reclaim control of traditional territories. Post-colonialism will be used to describe the political and theoretical struggles of societies that experienced the transition from political dependence to sovereignty. This entry will use imperialism as a broad term that refers to economic, military, political domination that is achieved without significant permanent European settlement.

2. Natural Law and the Conquest of the Americas

The Spanish conquest of the Americas sparked a theological, political, and ethical debate about the use of military force to acquire control over foreign lands. This debate took place within the framework of a religious discourse that legitimized military conquest as a way to facilitate the conversion and salvation of indigenous peoples. The idea of a “civilizing mission” was by no means the invention of the British in the nineteenth century. The Spanish conquistadores and colonists explicitly justified their activities in the Americas in terms of a religious mission to bring Christianity to the native peoples. The Crusades provided the initial impetus for developing a legal doctrine that rationalized the conquest and possession of lands that were held by non-Christians. Whereas the Crusades were initially framed as defensive wars to reclaim Christian lands that had been conquered, the resulting theoretical innovations played an important role in subsequent attempts to justify the conquest of the Americas. The core claim was that the “Petrine mandate” to care for the souls of Christ’s human flock required Papal jurisdiction over temporal as well as spiritual matters, and this control extended to non-believers as well as believers.

The conversion of the native peoples, however, did not provide an unproblematic justification for the project of overseas conquest. The Spanish conquest of the Americas was taking place during a period of reform when humanist scholars within the Church were increasingly influenced by the natural law theories of theologians such as St. Thomas Aquinas. According to Pope Innocent IV, war could not be waged against infidels and they could not be deprived of their property simply because of their non-belief. Under the influence of Thomism, Innocent IV concluded that force was legitimate only in cases where infidels violated natural law. Nonbelievers had legitimate dominion over themselves and their property, but this dominion was abrogated if they proved incapable of governing themselves according to principles that every reasonable person would recognize. The Spanish quickly concluded that the habits of the native Americans, from nakedness to unwillingness to labor to alleged cannibalism, clearly demonstrated their inability to recognize natural law. This account of native customs was used to legitimize the enslavement of the Indians, which the Spanish colonists insisted was the only way to teach them civilization and introduce them to Christianity.

Some of the Spanish missionaries sent to the New World, however, noticed that the brutal exploitation of slave labor was widespread while any serious commitment to religious instruction was absent. Members of the Dominican order in particular noted the hypocrisy of enslaving the indigenous peoples because of their alleged barbarity while practicing a form of conquest, warfare, and slavery that reduced the indigenous population of Hispaniola from 250,000 to 15,000 in two decades of Spanish rule. Given the genocidal result of Spanish “civilization,” they began to question the idea of a civilizing mission. Bartolomé de Las Casas and Franciscus de Victoria were two of the most influential critics of Spanish colonial practice. Victoria gave a series of lectures on Indian rights that applied Thomism to the practice of Spanish rule. He argued that all human beings share the capacity for rationality and have natural rights that stem from this capacity. From this premise, he deduced that the Papal decision to grant Spain title to the Americas was illegitimate. Unlike the position of Pope Innocent IV, Victoria argued that neither the Pope nor the Spaniards could subjugate the Indians in order to punish violations of natural law, such as fornication or adultery. He noted that the Pope had no right to make war on Christians and take their property simply because they were “fornicators or thieves.” If this were the case, then no European king’s dominion would ever be safe. Furthermore, according to Victoria, the pope and Christian rulers acting on his mandate had even less right to enforce laws against unbelievers, because they were outside of the Christian community, which was the domain of Papal authority (Williams 1990).

Despite this strongly worded critique of the dominant modes of justifying Spanish conquest, Victoria concluded that the use of force in the New World was legitimate when Indian communities violated the Law of Nations, a set of principles derivable from reason and therefore universally binding. At first it might sound contradictory that the Indians’ supposed violation of the natural law did not justify conquest but their violation of the Law of Nations, itself derived from natural law, did. Victoria emphasizes that the Law of Nations is binding because “there exists clearly enough a consensus of the greater part of the whole world” (391) and because the principles benefit “the common good of all.” This distinction seems to rely on the assumption that other principles usually associated with natural law (such as the prohibitions on adultery and idolatry) only affect those who consent to the practices, whereas violations of the Law of Nations (e.g. prohibitions on peaceful travel and trade) have consequences for those who do not consent. Ultimately, Victoria’s understanding of the Law of Nations led him to defend the practice of Spanish colonialism, even though he emphasized that warfare should be limited to the measures required to attain the legitimate objectives of peaceful trade and missionary work. Within Victoria’s critique of the legality and morality of Spanish colonialism was a rationalization for conquest, albeit a restrictive one.

3. Liberalism and Empire

The legitimacy of colonialism was also a topic of debate among French, German, and British philosophers in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. Enlightenment thinkers such as Kant, Smith and Diderot were critical of the barbarity of colonialism and challenged the idea that Europeans had the obligation to “civilize” the rest of the world. The colonial system of slavery, land theft, and feudal labor was antithetical to the principles of freedom and self-government. The rise of anti-colonial political theory, however, required more than a universalistic ethic that recognized the shared humanity of all people. Given the powerful economic interests in the control of Indigenous land and the exploitation of Indigenous labor, universalism proved to be a relatively weak basis for criticizing colonialism.

One of the key issues that distinguished critics from proponents of colonialism and imperialism was their view of the relationship between culture, history and progress. Many of the influential philosophers writing in France and England in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries had assimilated some version of the developmental approach to history that was associated with the Scottish Enlightenment. According to the stadial theory of historical development, all societies naturally moved from hunting, to herding, to farming, to commerce, a developmental process that simultaneously tracked a cultural arc from “savagery,” through “barbarism,” to “civilization.” “Civilization” was not just a marker of material improvement, but also a normative judgment about the moral progress of society. (Kohn and O’Neill 2006)

The language of civilization, savagery, and barbarism is pervasive in writers as diverse of Edmund Burke, Karl Marx, and John Stuart Mill. It would therefore be incorrect to conclude that a developmental theory of history is distinctive of the liberal tradition; nevertheless, given that figures of the Scottish Enlightenment such as Ferguson and Smith were among its leading expositors, it is strongly associated with liberalism. Smith himself opposed imperialism for economic reasons. He felt that relations of dependence between metropole and periphery distorted self-regulating market mechanisms and worried that the cost of military domination would be burdensome for taxpayers (Pitts 2005). The idea that civilization is the culmination of a process of historical development, however, proved useful in justifying imperialism. According to Uday Mehta, liberal imperialism was the product of the interaction between universalism and developmental history (1999). A core doctrine of liberalism holds that all individuals share a capacity for reason and self-government. The theory of developmental history, however, modifies this universalism with the notion that these capacities only emerge at a certain stage of civilization (McCarthy 2009). For example, according to John Stuart Mill (hereafter Mill), savages do not have the capacity for self-government because of their excessive love of freedom. Serfs, slaves, and peasants in barbarous societies, on the other hand, may be so schooled in obedience that their capacity for rationality is stifled. Only commercial society produces the material and cultural conditions that enable individuals to realize their potential for freedom and self-government. According to this logic, civilized societies like Great Britain are acting in the interest of less-developed peoples by governing them. Imperialism, from this perspective, is not primarily a form of political domination and economic exploitation but rather a paternalistic practice of government that exports “civilization” (e.g. modernization) in order to foster the improvement of native peoples. Despotic government (and Mill doesn’t hesitate to use this term) is a means to the end of improvement and ultimately self-government.

Mill, a life-long employee of the British East India Company, recognized that despotic government by a foreign people could lead to injustice and economic exploitation. These abuses, if unchecked, could undermine the legitimacy and efficacy of the imperial project. In Considerations on Representative Government (1861), Mill identifies four reasons why foreign (e.g. European) peoples are not suited to governing colonies. First, foreign politicians are unlikely to have the knowledge of local conditions that is necessary to solve problems of public policy effectively. Second, given cultural, linguistic, and often religious differences between colonizers and colonized, the colonizers are unlikely to sympathize with the native peoples and are likely to act tyrannically. Third, even if the colonizers really try to treat the native peoples fairly, their natural tendency to sympathize with those similar to themselves (other foreign colonists or merchants) would likely lead to distorted judgment in cases of conflict. Finally, according to Mill, colonists and merchants go abroad in order to acquire wealth with little effort or risk, which means that their economic activity often exploits the colonized country rather than developing it. These arguments echo points made in Edmund Burke’s voluminous writings assailing the misgovernment in India, most notably Burke’s famous Speech on Fox’s East India Bill (1783). Recent scholarship, however, has challenged the view of Burke as an opponent of imperialism. Daniel O’Neill has argued that Burke was a staunch supporter of the British Empire in the eighteenth century (2016). According to O’Neill, Burke’s defense of empire was ideologically consistent with his conservative opposition to the French Revolution.

Mill’s solution to the problem of imperial misgovernment was to eschew parliamentary oversight in favor of a specialized administrative corps. Members of this specialized body would have the training to acquire relevant knowledge of local conditions. Paid by the government, they would not personally benefit from economic exploitation and could fairly arbitrate conflicts between colonists and indigenous people. Mill, however, was not able to explain how to ensure good government where those wielding political power were not accountable to the population. In this sense, Mill’s writing is emblematic of the failure of liberal imperial thought.

Nineteenth century liberal thinkers held a range of views on the legitimacy of foreign domination and conquest. Alexis de Tocqueville, for example, made a case for colonialism that did not rely on the idea of a “civilizing mission.” Tocqueville recognized that colonialism probably did not bring good government to the native peoples, but this did not lead him to oppose colonialism since his support rested entirely on the way it benefited France. Tocqueville insisted that French colonies in Algeria would increase France’s stature vis-à-vis rivals like England. Colonies would provide an outlet for excess population that caused disorder in France. Tocqueville also suggested that imperial endeavors would incite a feeling of patriotism that would counterbalance the modern centrifugal forces of materialism and class conflict.

Tocqueville was actively engaged in advancing the project of French colonization of Algeria. Tocqueville’s first analysis of French colonialism was published during his 1837 electoral campaign for a seat in the Chamber of Deputies. As a member of the Chamber of Deputies, Tocqueville argued in favor of expanding the French presence in Algeria. He traveled to Algeria in 1841 composing an “Essay on Algeria” that served as the basis for two parliamentary reports on the topic (Tocqueville 1841). Unlike the more naïve proponents of the “civilizing mission,” Tocqueville admitted that the brutal military occupation did little to introduce good government or advance civilization. In an apparent reversal of the four-stages theory of the Scottish Enlightenment, he acknowledged that “we are now fighting far more barbarously than the Arabs themselves” and “it is on their side that one meets with civilization.” (Tocqueville 1841: 70) This realization, however, did not imply a critique of French brutality. Instead, Tocqueville defended controversial tactics such as the destruction of crops, confiscation of land, and seizure of unarmed civilians. His texts, however, provide little in the way of philosophical justification and he dismisses the entire just war tradition by stating, “I believe that the right of war authorizes us to ravage the country.” (Tocqueville 1841: 70). In Tocqueville’s writings on Algeria, the French national interest is paramount and moral considerations are explicitly subordinate to political goals.

Tocqueville’s analysis of Algeria reflects little anxiety about its legitimacy and much concern about the pragmatics of effective colonial governance. The stability of the regime, he felt, depended on the ability of the colonial administration to provide good government to the French settlers. Tocqueville emphasized that the excessive centralization of decision-making in Paris combined with the arbitrary practices of the local military leadership meant that French colonists had no security of property, let alone the political and civil rights that they were accustomed to France. Tocqueville was untroubled by the use of martial law against indigenous peoples, but felt that it was counterproductive when applied to the French. For Tocqueville, the success of the French endeavor in Algeria depended entirely on attracting large numbers of permanent French settlers. Given that it was proving impossible to win the allegiance of the indigenous people, France could not hold Algeria without creating a stable community of colonists. The natives were to be ruled through military domination and the French were to be enticed to settle through the promise of economic gain in an environment that reproduced, as much as possible, the cultural and political life of France. After a brief period of optimism about “amalgamation” of the races in his “Second Letter on Algeria” (Tocqueville 1837: 25), Tocqueville understood the colonial world in terms of the permanent opposition of settler and native, an opposition structured to ensure the economic benefit of the former.

4. Marxism and Leninism

In recent years, scholars have devoted less attention to the debates on colonialism within the Marxist tradition. This reflects the waning influence of Marxism in the academy and in political practice. Marxism, however, has influenced both post-colonial theory and anti-colonial independence movements around the world. Marxists have drawn attention to the material basis of European political expansion and developed concepts that help explain the persistence of economic exploitation after the end of direct political rule.

Although Marx never developed a theory of colonialism, his analysis of capitalism emphasized its inherent tendency to expand in search of new markets. In his classic works such as The Communist Manifesto, Grundrisse, and Capital, Marx predicted that the bourgeoisie would continue to create a global market and undermine both local and national barriers to its own expansion. Expansion is a necessary product of the core dynamic of capitalism: overproduction. Competition among producers drives them to cut wages, which in turn leads to a crisis of under-consumption. The only way to prevent economic collapse is to find new markets to absorb excess consumer goods. From a Marxist perspective, some form of imperialism is inevitable. By exporting population to resource rich foreign territories, a nation creates a market for industrial goods and a reliable source of natural resources. Alternately, weaker countries can face the choice of either voluntarily admitting foreign products that will undermine domestic industry or submitting to political domination, which will accomplish the same end.

In a series of newspaper articles published in the 1850s in the New York Daily Tribune, Marx specifically discussed the impact of British colonialism in India. His analysis was consistent with his general theory of political and economic change. He described India as an essentially feudal society experiencing the painful process of modernization. According to Marx, however, Indian “feudalism” was a distinctive form of economic organization. He reached this conclusion because he believed (incorrectly) that agricultural land in India was owned communally. Marx used the concept of “Oriental despotism” to describe a specific type of class domination that used the state’s power of taxation in order to extract resources from the peasantry. According to Marx, oriental despotism emerged in India because agricultural productivity depended on large-scale public works such as irrigation that could only be financed by the state. This meant that the state could not be easily replaced by a more decentralized system of authority. In Western Europe, feudal property could be transformed gradually into privately owned, alienable property in land. In India, communal land ownership made this impossible, thereby blocking the development of commercial agriculture and free markets. Since “Oriental despotism” inhibited the indigenous development of economic modernization, British domination became the agent of economic modernization.

Marx’s analysis of colonialism as a progressive force bringing modernization to a backward feudal society sounds like a transparent rationalization for foreign domination. His account of British domination, however, reflects the same ambivalence that he shows towards capitalism in Europe. In both cases, Marx recognizes the immense suffering brought about during the transition from feudal to bourgeois society while insisting that the transition is both necessary and ultimately progressive. He argues that the penetration of foreign commerce will cause a social revolution in India. For Marx, this upheaval has both positive and negative consequences. When peasants lose their traditional livelihoods, there is a great deal of human suffering, but he also points out that traditional village communities are hardly idyllic; they are sites of caste oppression, slavery, misery, and cruelty. The first stage of the modernization process is entirely negative, because poor people pay heavy taxation to support British rule and endure the economic upheaval that results from the glut of cheaply produced English cotton. Eventually, however, British merchants begin to realize that Indians cannot pay for imported cloth or British administration if they don’t efficiently produce goods to trade, which provides an incentive for British investment in production and infrastructure. Even though Marx believed that British rule was motivated by greed and exercised through cruelty, he felt it was still the agent of progress. Thus, Marx’s discussion of British rule in India has three dimensions: an account of the progressive character of foreign rule, a critique of the human suffering involved, and a concluding argument that British rule must be temporary if the progressive potential is to be realized.

Lenin developed his analysis of Western economic and political domination in his pamphlet Imperialism: The Highest Stage of Capitalism (1917) (see Other Internet Resources). Lenin took a more explicitly critical view of imperialism. He noted that imperialism was a technique which allowed European countries to put off the inevitable domestic revolutionary crisis by exporting their own economic burdens onto weaker states. Lenin argued that late-nineteenth century imperialism was driven by the economic logic of late-capitalism. The falling rate of profit caused an economic crisis that could only be resolved through territorial expansion. Capitalist conglomerates were compelled to expand beyond their national borders in pursuit of new markets and resources. In a sense, this analysis is fully consistent with Marx, who saw European colonialism as continuous with the process of internal expansion within states and across Europe. Both Marx and Lenin thought that colonialism and imperialism resulted from the same logic that drove the economic development and modernization of peripheral areas in Europe. But there was one distinctive element of Lenin’s analysis. Since late capitalism was organized around national monopolies, the competition for markets took the form of military competition between states over territories that could be dominated for their exclusive economic benefit.

Marxist theorists including Rosa Luxemburg, Karl Kautsky, and Nikolai Bukharin also explored the issue of imperialism. Kautsky’s position is especially important because his analysis introduced concepts that continue to play a prominent role in contemporary world systems theory and post-colonial studies. Kautsky challenges the assumption that imperialism would lead to the development of the areas subjected to economic exploitation. He suggests that imperialism is a relatively permanent relationship structuring the interactions between two types of countries. (Young 2001) Although imperialism initially took the form of military competition between capitalist countries, it would result in collusion between capitalist interests to maintain a stable system of exploitation of the non-developed world. The most influential contemporary proponent of this view is Immanuel Wallerstein, who is known for world-systems theory. According to this theory, the world-system is a relatively stable set of relations between core and peripheral states. This international division of labor is structured to benefit the core states (Wallerstein 1974–1989) and transfers resources from the periphery to the core.

5. Theories of Decolonization and Post-colonial Theory

Frantz Fanon was one of the leading theorists of the struggle for decolonization. His two most influential works focused on anti-black racism and the impact of colonial violence. Black Skin, White Masks (2008 [1952]) describes racialized subjectivity and the structural conditions that sustain racial domination. Drawing on existentialism, psychoanalysis, and literary theory, Fanon demonstrates the constitutive effects of European colonialism on identity. It details the traumatic consequences of immersion in a cultural framework that pathologizes blackness, thereby dividing the racialized subject. Wretched of the Earth (1961) was the most influential philosophical account of the anti-colonial struggle and the challenges of post-colonial governance. The book provides a complex account of the relationship between violence and liberation. Violence is the foundation of the colonial regime, and therefore inevitably plays a role in its overthrow, but Fanon also explores its psychological dimension. Revolutionary violence can be a productive redirection of the internalized violence characteristic of the experience of oppression because it can bring about structural change. It is also a praxis that generates political agency, group cohesion and national identity. Wretched of the Earth also includes incisive reflections on the way that colonial states continue to exert economic power after independence. According to Fanon, the economic exploitation typical of colonialism can be secured in a new way through the leadership of the comprador bourgeoisie, a segment of the indigenous managerial class that is allied with foreign economic interests. He also suggests that collective identity based on ethnicity or national consciousness can have harmful effects, when it functions ideologically to mask class differences in service of elite economic interests. Fanon’s Marxist-influenced approach to anti-colonial critique is part of a black radical traditional that includes other Caribbean thinkers such as Eric Williams, whose book Capitalism and Slavery (1994) demonstrated that the wealth extracted from sugar plantations bankrolled the industrial revolution and C.L.R James’s The Black Jacobins (1989), which retold the story of the Haitian Revolution from the perspective of the victorious revolutionaries. These books were foundational for theories of racial capitalism, a position that holds that racialized exploitation and capital accumulation are mutually reinforcing. (Robinson 2000)

Another seminal critic of colonialism is Mahatma Gandhi. He is remembered for his leadership of the Indian independence movement, his critique of British colonialism, and his theory of political resistance. Among his theoretical innovations is the concept of satyagraha. While the literal meaning is closer to “holding on to truth,” the term is often used to describe non-violent resistance or civil disobedience. According to Gandhi, it is through the practice of non-cooperation with oppression that the force of truth is animated. The central place of non-violence in Gandhi’s theory and practice reflects the influence of the Hindu concept ahimsa, or avoiding harm, but this principle was transformed in the context of anti-colonial struggle. Gandhi was a prolific writer who was deeply engaged in theoretical and political debates. Among his influential writings was the book Hind Swaraj (1997), published in 1909. It takes the form of a dialogue between a Reader and an Editor. The text provides an account of British domination in India, an analysis of the meaning of swaraj (self-rule), a discussion of political strategy, and a critique of Western civilization. Gandhi denaturalizes “Western civilization” by showing that the underlying materialism is not normatively justified and the alleged benefits of colonialism (modern medicine, technology) are actually harmful to the human condition. He also shows that the colonists fail in their own terms, pointing out that the European colonists claimed to bring civilization but cemented their rule by engaging in brutal violence.

Contemporary literary theorists have also drawn attention to practices of representation that reproduce a logic of subordination that endures even after former colonies gain independence. The field of postcolonial studies was influenced by Edward Said’s path-breaking book Orientalism. In Orientalism Said applied Michel Foucault’s technique of discourse analysis to the production of knowledge about the Middle East. The term orientalism described a structured set of concepts, assumptions, and discursive practices that were used to produce, interpret, and evaluate knowledge about non-European peoples. Said’s analysis made it possible for scholars to deconstruct literary and historical texts in order to understand how they reflected and reinforced the imperialist project. Unlike previous studies that focused on the economic or political logics of colonialism, Said drew attention to the relationship between knowledge and power. By foregrounding the cultural and epistemological work of imperialism, Said was able to undermine the ideological assumption of value-free knowledge and show that “knowing the Orient” was part of the project of dominating it. Orientalism can be seen as an attempt to extend the geographical and historical terrain of the poststructuralist critique of Western epistemology.

Said uses the term orientalism in several different ways. First, orientalism is a specific field of academic study about the Middle East and Asia, albeit one that Said conceives quite expansively to encompass history, sociology, literature, anthropology and especially philology. He also identifies it as a practice that helps define Europe by creating a stable depiction of its other, its constitutive outside. Orientalism is a way of characterizing Europe by drawing a contrasting image or idea, based on a series of binary oppositions (rational/irrational, mind/body, order/chaos) that manage and displace European anxieties. Finally, Said emphasizes that it is also a mode of exercising authority by organizing and classifying knowledge about the Orient. This discursive approach is distinct both from the materialist view that knowledge is simply a reflection of economic or political interests and from the idealist view that scholarship is disinterested and neutral. Following Foucault, Said describes discourse as a form of knowledge that is not used instrumentally in service of power but rather is itself a form of power.

The second quasi-canonical contribution to the field of post-colonial theory is Gayatri Spivak’s “Can the Subaltern Speak?” (1988). Spivak works within Said’s problematic of representation but extends it to the contemporary academy. Spivak questions the idea of transparent subaltern speech. When well-meaning scholars want to let the subaltern “speak for themselves” they hope that removing the intermediary (the expert, the judge, the imperial administrator, the local elite) will enable some authentic truth based on experience to emerge. But experience itself is constituted through representation; therefore denying the problem of representation does not make it go away but only makes it harder to recognize. The central claim of the essay is that “representation has not withered away.” Since power is everywhere, even in language itself, transparency and authenticity are impossible; this means that the messy and controversial work of interpretation is necessary.

Aijaz Ahmad has argued that, despite Spivak’s claims to be working within the Marxist tradition, her essays exhibit contempt for materialism, rationalism, and progress, the core features of Marxism (Ahmad 1997). According to Ahmad, Spivak is concerned with narratives of capitalism rather than the institutional structures and material effects of capitalism as a mode of production. Spivak’s sharp criticism of movements that essentialize subaltern subjects casts doubt on the basic premise of Marxist politics, which privileges the proletariat as a group with shared, true interests that are produced by the capitalist system.

Vivek Chibber (2013) and Dipesh Chakrabarty (2007) have taken up these issues. In his influential book Provincializing Europe, Chakrabarty argues that distinctively European concepts such as disenchanted space, secular time, and sovereignty inform the social sciences. When these standards are treated as universal, the third world is seen as incomplete or lacking. Chibber challenges the position. Chibber advances a critique of Subaltern Studies and defends universal categories such as capitalism, class, rationality, and objectivity. He argues that these categories need not be reductionist or Eurocentric and that they are useful in illuminating the motivation of political actors and the structural constraints faced by leaders in countries such as India.

This debate reflects a tension that runs through the field of postcolonial studies. Although some thinkers draw on both Marxism and poststructuralism, the two theories have different goals, methods, and assumptions. In the humanities, postcolonial theory tends to reflect the influence of poststructuralist thought, while theorists of decolonization focus on social history, economics, and political institutions. Whereas postcolonial theory is associated with the issues of hybridity, diaspora, representation, narrative, and knowledge/power, theories of decolonization are concerned with revolution, economic inequality, violence, and political identity.

Some scholars have begun to question the usefulness of the concept post-colonial theory. Like the idea of the Scottish four-stages theory, a theory with which it would appear to have little in common, the very concept of post-colonialism seems to rely on a progressive understanding of history (McClintock 1992). It suggests, perhaps unwittingly, that the core concepts of hybridity, alterity, particularity, and multiplicity may lead to a kind of methodological dogmatism or developmental logic. Moreover, the term “colonial” as a marker of this domain of inquiry is also problematic in so far as it suggests historically implausible commonalities across territories that experienced very different techniques of domination. Thus, the critical impulse behind post-colonial theory has turned on itself, drawing attention to the way that it may itself be marked by the utopian desire to transcend the trauma of colonialism (Gandhi 1998).

6. Recognition and Revolt in Settler-Colonial States

Indigenous scholars have articulated a critique of post-colonialism, noting that the concept obscures the continued existence of settler colonialism. Decolonization within setter states is framed through an ethics of reconciliation, which recognizes the historical and ongoing effects of colonization and aims at establishing a mutually respectful framework for a sustainable nation to nation relationship between settler and Indigenous peoples. The theoretical literature on settler colonialism includes a diverse range of positions that offer different assessments of approaches focused on reconciliation and resurgence. A point of controversy in contemporary Indigenous political theory literature is the extent to which it is desirable to participate in colonial and political institutions in order to transform them. A central tension that underlies this controversy is whether institutional accommodation aimed toward reconciliation advanced an idea of self-determination that is defined through Indigenous interests, cosmologies, and ethics or further reproduces the conditions of domination that only perpetuate the historical settler-colonial relationship.

Scholars such as Dale Turner suggests that it is possible to achieve successful reconciliation through Western practices of democratic deliberation and procedures. In This is Not a Peace Pipe: Toward a Critical Indigenous Philosophy (2006), Turner emphasizes that the way to undermine the power dynamics that perpetuate the conditions of colonialism is through participation within the legal and political institutions of the state. He argues that “word warriors,” who mediate between Indigenous communities and legal and political institutions, should ensure the preservation and expansion of Indigenous rights within the larger community. Turner further suggests that an effective relationship between settler states and Indigenous peoples will only emerge from a dialogue grounded in democratic presumptions of equality and respect. This dialogue entails that Indigenous peoples, in order to establish claims of cultural distinctiveness, must learn how to engage within settler states’ legal and political discourses in more effective ways (2006:5).

In their essay “Decolonization is Not a Metaphor” (2012) Eve Tuck and Wayne Yang criticize settler worldviews for failing to acknowledge the distinct, totalizing effect of settler colonialism. They emphasize that settler colonialism operates through the exploitation and expropriation of Indigenous worlds by privileging colonial economies while simultaneously involving the use of particularized modes of control, such as schools and policing, to ensure and legitimize progress and development in accordance with settler epistemologies and ontologies. In this sense, settler-colonialism is a structure rather than an event (Wolfe 1999) that reinforces the total appropriation of Indigenous life and land. Tuck and Yang describe contemporary approaches to reconciliation as “moves to innocence” that reconcile settler guilt while securing the future of settler colonialism.

A prominent idea that is brought up in the struggle for Indigenous self-determination is the Doctrine of Discovery. Settlers claimed discovery from the normative political and legal view of terra nullius, which translates to “empty land.” Scholars of Indigenous resurgence argue that doctrines of discovery and terra nullius persist in the present period within recognition-based methods of reconciliation, and they stifle movements of self-determination. Theorists of Indigenous resurgence advance an understanding of decolonization that refuses contemporary settler-colonial methods of institutional and cultural accommodation while reviving Indigenous legal and political institutions and ways of being. Leanne Betasamosake Simpson points out that rebuilding needs to start from within, and Indigenous people require not only the re-establishment of pre-colonial history and languages but also the introduction of Indigenous custom and forms of governance that re-center a grounded normativity, which is a norm guided by ancestral land-based relationships and practices. This can build on the oral tradition of storytelling, which is a framework that informs social experience. Most recently, in Short History of Blockades (2021) Simpson argues that practices of blockading represent both a negation of settler colonial states and the affirmation or amplification of Indigenous futurity that directly addresses the implications of continual dispossession and domination by rebuilding relations of self-determination.

In Red Skin, White Masks: Rejecting the Colonial Politics of Recognition (2014), Glen Coulthard deepens the theoretical framework of resurgence and refusal by arguing that the current framework of reconciliation tends to dehistoricize and neutralize acts of dispossession, violence, and displacement of Indigenous peoples from their lands and culture. For Coulthard, settler colonialism is an ongoing process emergent in settler institutions and structures of recognition, not merely the legacy of past injustices. This is evident in unsettled land claims, the dispossession of land, the limitations placed on Indigenous governments, and the displacement of Indigenous ways of life that are tied to access to traditional territories. Rather than relying on recognition from within the colonial-settler relationship, Coulthard calls for an Indigenous sovereignty informed by an intellectual, social, political, and artistic movement that embodies a “self-reflective revitalization” of traditional values, principles, and cultural practices.

The title of Coulthard’s book alludes to Black Skin, White Masks (2008), the path breaking work by Frantz Fanon. Writing in 1950s, Fanon challenged the abstract universalism of Western philosophy, showing how universalism serves to structure a hierarchical relationship between settler and colonized. Fanon’s critical theory challenges the assumption that European notions of progress truly advance justice and secure mutual benefit. In Black Skin, White Masks, Fanon focuses on the development of Black consciousness by exploring the psychological alienation and displacement caused by colonial domination. He describes a divided self who identifies with French culture even while experiencing exclusion from the ideals of universalism, equality, and reason. Coulthard’s reading of Fanon informs his view that cultural recognition by the colonial state is not a solution. Following Fanon, he concludes the paternalist recognition serves to legitimize the colonial state and further divide Indigenous subjects.

While international recognition-based models have gained momentum since the 2007 United Nations Declaration of Rights of Indigenous Peoples (UNDRIP), their potential to establish Indigenous sovereignty and self-determination remains contested. Scholars such as Sheryl Lightfoot (2016) highlight the revolutionary potential of international movements to enable a collective voice where local struggles may strategically coalesce on a global platform. Others are critical of UNDRIP as it remains formulated within a Westphalian system that fails to universally recognize the sovereignty of Indigenous law and practices in cases where it conflicts with settler law or territorial sovereignty (see Hayden King).

In her book Restructuring Relations: Indigenous Self-Determination, Governance, and Gender (2019) Rauna Kuokkanen is skeptical of the ability of human rights frameworks, such as UNDRIP, to inform and express Indigenous self-determination. Drawing from Indigenous and feminist political and legal theory, Kuokkanen highlights the way human rights frameworks and current models of Indigenous self-government are limited in their ability to adequately address violence against women because of their focus on civil and political rights. As an alternative, Kuokkanen proposes a relational theory of self-determination that recognizes that social and political orders as interconnected and interdependent, which she contrasts with a rights-based framework that fosters values of autonomy. Kuokkanen positions self-determination as a core value and traces the way certain ideas and rights of self-determination both structure social and political experience and how this value could be transformed if informed and developed through Indigenous ontologies based on the idea of integrity of both the land and the body alongside a freedom from bodily harm and violence.

Resurgence scholars aim to unsettle settler perspectives of civilization through the revitalisation of Indigenous practices of responsibility and relations with the natural world. Theorists within this field reject all stadial theories of human development and the idea that history’s direction is irreversible. Similar to Gandhi, some Indigenous thinkers critique modern civilization as a profound sickness destroying what is meaningful in human life, characterizing modern civilization as ailing and on the threshold of self-destruction (Henderson, 2017). These thinkers challenge the idea of a single authoritative account of politics guided by the ideas of Enlightenment rationality. Instead, they make a case for a new way of doing politics that provides an alternative to the materialism and consumerism of modern Western societies that develops through a close study of the values destroyed through colonialism. John Borrows (2008), for example, challenges settler understandings that shape human relationships and obligations to the earth by re-telling the idea of seven generations that exists in many Indigenous legal and political traditions. According to this approach, when making judgments in the present, we have duties of obligation to seven generations in the past and seven generations in the future.

Along the lines of colonial and post-colonial thinkers, like Gandhi, Aimé Césaire, Fanon, Indigenous political theorists do not necessarily advocate for a reversion to historical or traditional ways of living. Rather, Indigenous thinkers describe a new humanism within the context of settler colonialism that requires politics guided by a practice of truth-seeking from various perspectives. In their work Resurgence and Reconciliation: Indigenous-Settler Relations and Earth Teachings (2019), Michael Ash, John Borrows, and James Tully compile a collection of work that brings forward a theoretical framework of reconciliation that is empowered by practices of resurgence. Decolonization in this sense is likened to the activity of the ancient sweetgrass braiders, which brings various independent strands of branches, roots, filaments and fibre together in a strong braid. This act of weaving – a predominantly female apprenticeship – necessitates a deep understanding of community life and its history, with a knowledge of patterns, impressions, and conventions in both the natural and human world (2019:10).

Indigenous political theory has developed into a robust scholarship that calls for the radical responsibility of Indigenous nations for their own self-determination. This scholarship advocates for the emergence of a new set of values that develops not through privileging a European conception of universalism but by sketching a conception of universalism that emerges from the co-existence of many particulars. This emergent universalism assembles different worlds and ideas of civilization by addressing issues surrounding land rights and cultural distinctiveness.


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Other Internet Resources


A paragraph in the July 2011 update to this entry was taken from the author’s essay, Kohn 2010, first published by Oxford University Press.

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