First published Fri Feb 10, 2006; substantive revision Mon Jan 23, 2023

The concept of coercion has two different faces, corresponding to the two parties involved in its most ordinary cases. On one face, it picks out a technique agents (coercers) can use to get other agents to do or not do something. On the other face, it picks out a kind of reason for why agents (coercees) sometimes do or refrain from doing something. Coercion is typically thought to carry with it several important implications, including that it diminishes the targeted agent’s freedom and responsibility, and that it is a (pro tanto) wrong and/or violation of right. Nonetheless, few believe that it is always unjustified, since it seems that no society could function without some authorized uses of coercion. It helps keep the bloody minded and recalcitrant from harming others, and seems also to be an indispensable technique in the rearing of children. A state’s legitimacy and sovereignty is sometimes thought to depend on its ability to use coercion effectively and to monopolize its use within its territory against competitors, both internal and external.

Because of its usefulness and its sometimes devastating effects, coercion is a matter of longstanding political and ethical concern. Nonetheless, there has been little sustained scholarly attention to its nature until recently; historically, many seem to have been willing to accept the concept of coercion as a primitive. Since the 1970s, however, the nature and function of coercion has come in for significant philosophical discussion. Though the pace of study has slowed somewhat since 1990, the nature of coercion and its effects remains a matter of dispute.

Sometimes the term “coercion” is used in popular speech with a quite broad sense. For instance, one hears “coercion” used to describe social pressures (e.g., the need to conform to peer expectations or to placate one’s parents); or the constraining or manipulative effects of advertising, one’s upbringing, or the structuring of society more generally (e.g., the necessity of participating in a capitalist economy). It is also sometimes treated as a quite general concept encompassing almost any sort of interpersonal infringement on one’s rights. Such uses are not wholly foreign to philosophical discussions (see, e.g., Ripstein 2004). Nonetheless, the following discussion will focus on a narrower sense of the term more in line with its use by major historical philosophical writers and contemporary theorists alike. This usage will rule out, by stipulation, such things as mere disapproval, emotional manipulation, or wheedling. (What is “ruled in” is subject to dispute, as is discussed below.) This minimal setting of boundaries still leaves considerable room for disagreement over how best to understand coercion’s workings, its preconditions, and its effects.

1. History

Historically, the use of coercion by powerful actors has been of great concern to philosophers and legal theorists. Detailed attention to understanding the concept coercion, however, is a relatively recent phenomenon. One effect of this discrepant attention is that it is sometimes difficult to determine what precise meaning earlier writers intended in their discussions of “coercion,” as well as to decide whether “coercion” captures something different from or related to other frequently used terms, such as violence, compulsion, punishment, force, or interference. A brief survey of a few notable thinkers suggests that coercion has commonly been understood as a use of a certain kind of power for the purpose of gaining advantages over others (including self-protection), punishing non-compliance with demands, and imposing one’s will on the will of other agents. The kind of power needed for these functions is the sort that states and other forceful or violent agents possess. One of the clearest, most important uses of coercion has been understood to be the state’s enforcement of law, either through direct uses of force or through punishments meted out to lawbreakers. The state’s use of coercion is thought to be licensed in particular for the sake of preventing private acts of violence or coercion, as well as for punishing the failure to keep agreements. These public uses of coercion are thought justified because they make possible private cooperation and peaceable coexistence among people not linked by ties of affection or blood.

1.2 Aquinas

Although one could start earlier, Aquinas offers a picture of what might be regarded as the traditional, canonical understanding of coercion, its importance, and consequences. Discussion of coercion (sometimes also described as “compulsion”) recurs in the Summa Theologica under several headings. In a discussion of necessity and the will, he notes that when we speak of necessity, we mean “that which must be” (Aquinas, ST, I.II Q6 A6). There are various ways something may be necessary. Coercion, he says, is a kind of necessity in which the activities of one agent — the coercer — make something necessary for another agent. The “necessity of coercion” is that in which “a thing must be, when someone is forced by some agent, so that he is not able to do the contrary” (ibid.). Such necessity is “altogether repugnant to the will,” (ibid.) meaning that what is done because of coercion is not done voluntarily. To say that something is voluntary, for Aquinas, implies that it follows from or is in accord with one’s inclinations; in contrast, coercion is linked with the notions of violence and the involuntary.

For we call that violent which is against the inclination of a thing. … [A] thing is called voluntary because it is according to the inclination of the will. Therefore, just as it is impossible for a thing to be at the same time violent and natural, so it is impossible for a thing to be absolutely coerced or violent, and voluntary (Aquinas, ST, I Q82 A1).

For Aquinas, the law and the government bear a special relationship to the use of coercion/compulsion. In a discussion of the nature of (human) law, Aquinas claims that “the notion of law contains two things: first, that it is a rule of human acts; secondly, that it has coercive power” (Aquinas, ST, I.II Q96 A5). This power is identified with the ability of rulers to use force and violence against their subjects: “the governor of a city has perfect coercive power: wherefore he can inflict irreparable punishments such as death and mutilation” (Aquinas ST, II.II Q65 A2). The law, Aquinas suggests, must use “force and fear” in order to restrain those who are “found to be depraved, and prone to vice, and not easily amenable to words,” so that they will “desist from evil-doing, and leave others in peace,” as well as become “habituated in this way,” and “virtuous” (Aquinas, ST, I.II Q95 A1). This power is not available for anyone to use: Aquinas argues that the coercive function should be “vested in the whole people or in some public personage,” and not allowed to private parties (Aquinas, ST, I.II Q90 A3). He does allow, however, that some parties, such as the head of a household (“an imperfect community”), must be able to use an “imperfect coercive power, which is exercised by inflicting lesser punishments, for instance by blows, which do not inflict irreparable harm” (ibid.).

Aquinas also supports the common view that at least some coercion affects the coercee’s responsibility or blameworthiness for what he does as a result of coercion. He holds that one is not to be blamed for things done non-voluntarily. Insofar as violence undercuts the voluntariness of one’s doings, as suggested above, one is not to be blamed for them. Violence appears able to coerce in two ways: when used directly against one’s body (“a man may be dragged by force: but it is contrary to the very notion of violence, that he be dragged of his own will” (Aquinas, ST, I.II Q6 A4)); and when used in a way that disables one’s will (“the will can suffer violence, in so far as violence can prevent the exterior members from executing the will’s command” (Aquinas, ST, I.II Q6 A4)). Interestingly, however, the threat[1] of violence that causes one to act from fear, or to avoid that violence, does not make an act involuntary, on Aquinas’ understanding. So only some uses of violence to hinder another’s actions have the effect of exempting the person targeted from blame for things done as a result of violence.[2]

1.2 Hobbes, Locke, Kant

These three modern-era thinkers, though they differ in many ways, hold surprisingly similar views of the nature of coercion and its role in the function of justice and the state. Hobbes’s fame as a political theorist derives at least in part from the central role he gives to coercion as a necessary part of a state’s function. Noticing that many contracts require one party to perform one’s obligations before the other party acts, Hobbes suggests that such first performance would be irrational if one had no means to secure the subsequent performance of one’s bargaining partner.

For he that performs first has no assurance the other will perform after; because the bonds of words are too weak to bridle men’s ambition, avarice, anger, and other Passions, without the fear of some coercive Power. … But in a civil estate, where there is a Power set up to constrain those that would otherwise violate their faith, that fear is no more reasonable; and for that cause, he which by the Covenant is to perform first, is obliged so to do (Hobbes 1651, Ch.14).

Interestingly, Hobbes seems to share Aquinas’ view that acting from fear does not undercut the voluntariness of one’s acts, as he famously asserts that “covenants extorted by fear are valid” (Hobbes 1651, Ch. 14).

More generally, the very possibility of establishing justice and injustice depends on the possibility of coercing subjects to abide by their covenants.

[W]here there is no coercive Power erected, that is, where there is no Commonwealth, there is no Propriety; all men having Right to all things: Therefore where there is no Commonwealth, there nothing is Unjust. So that the nature of Justice, consists in keeping of valid Covenants: but the Validity of Covenants begins not but with the Constitution of a Civil Power, sufficient to compel men to keep them: And then it is also that Propriety begins (Hobbes 1651, Ch. 15).

Hobbes thus holds that coercion is essential to both the justification of and function of the state or commonwealth. In fact, it is a law of nature that we seek the protection of the Leviathan’s coercive powers in order to exit the perilous conditions of the state of nature.

Locke very rarely uses the term “coercion” or its variants,[3] but he believes like Hobbes that the function of the state is intimately tied to its role in securing individuals against those who would kill, injure or rob them.

Political power, then, I take to be a right of making laws, with penalties of death, and consequently all less penalties for the regulating and preserving of property, and of employing the force of the community in the execution of such laws, and in the defence of the commonwealth from foreign injury, and all this only for the public good (Locke 1823 [1689], Sec. 3).

Locke, more so than Hobbes, is wary of the power of the sovereign, but is less anxious about conditions in the state of nature. One reason for this reversal of concern, he suggests, is that sovereigns are more potent oppressors than ordinary inhabitants of the state of nature, due to the ability of sovereigns to organize force and violence (Locke 1823 [1689], Sec. 137).

Because individuals cannot reasonably give up power to an unchecked sovereign, Locke also holds that an agent’s ability to possess and use that power effectively depends in many ways on the rightness of that agent’s use of power. In particular, Locke seems to suggest that a system of property rights cannot be enforced by the state if it renders others unable to secure their own economic survival. One is entitled to the protection of what one has labored to create so long as, with respect to land and other natural resources, “there is enough, and as good, left in common for others” (Locke 1823 [1689], Sec. 27). This “Lockean proviso,” as Nozick called it (Nozick 1974, p. 175 ff), creates a sort of baseline condition against which the acceptability of any set of coercive arrangements can be judged. So for Locke, more than for Hobbes, the power of the sovereign rests on the consent of those governed — not only for its justification, but also for its stability against revolution, about which Locke was clearly more sanguine than Hobbes.

Kant also gives considerable attention to the importance of coercion for guaranteeing rights of citizens, though he says little that would explain what he means by his use of the term. Kant’s only prominent discussion of coercion occurs in his Doctrine of Right,[4] a treatise on the nature of law. Kant thinks there are two sorts of “incentives” to follow the law: ethical and juridical. The ethical (i.e., rational) incentive to follow the law is the motive of duty. But since the wills of some people are determined pathologically — that is, by inclinations and aversions, rather than by duty — there needs also to be a way to get such persons to follow the law as well, through such means as aversion to punishment (Kant 1996 [1797], 20 [AK 6, 219]). Coercion is then a tool the law uses to get the lawless to respect the rights of others whether they want to or not. He associates it with the executive authority of the state’s ruler, and the ruler’s use of punishment in conformity with the law. Kant makes clear that coercion counts as a hindrance to freedom, in which respect it is similar to all violations of a person’s rights. But coercion can be used to prevent other rights violations, and thus may be justified on the grounds that it counts as a hindrance to a hindrance to freedom. “Right and authorization to use coercion therefore mean one and the same thing” (Kant 1996 [1797], 26 [AK 6, 232]).

Kant’s views on the necessity of coercion for the existence of right differ from those of Hobbes and Locke, but he is in general sympathetic to the idea that states require the ability to use coercion in defense of the equal freedom of their subjects. Without such coercive abilities, one can have “private right,” but that is no more than the rights one has in the state of nature, which are by no means secure.

It is true that the state of nature need not, just because it is natural, be a state of injustice, of dealing with one another only in terms of the degree of force each has. But it would still be a state devoid of justice … in which when rights are in dispute there would be no judge competent to render a verdict having rightful force. Hence each may impel the other by force to leave this state and enter into a rightful condition; … [the] acquisition [of right] is still only provisional as long as it does not yet have the sanction of public law, since it is not determined by public (distributive) justice and secured by an authority putting this right into effect (Kant 1996 [1797], 90 [AK 6, 312]).

So Kant, like Hobbes and Locke, sees it as a necessity for people to establish a state with coercive powers in order to achieve justice.

1.3 John Stuart Mill

With respect to his thinking about coercion, Mill is most famous for his views, in On Liberty, about what coercion is not fit to do: namely, be used to regulate people’s behavior for their own good. Like his predecessors and mentor Jeremy Bentham, Mill associates coercion with the state’s powers to punish lawbreakers. But Mill seems in general to take a more expansive view of what coercion amounts to than did those surveyed above, appearing to treat the terms “coercion” and “interference” as much the same thing in On Liberty. In stating the thesis of that work, Mill writes,

The object of this Essay is to assert one very simple principle, as entitled to govern absolutely the dealings of society with the individual in the way of compulsion and control, whether the means used be physical force in the form of legal penalties, or the moral coercion of public opinion. That principle is, that the sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number, is self-protection. … [An individual] cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him to do so, because it will make him happier, because, in the opinions of others, to do so would be wise, or even right. These are good reasons for remonstrating with him, or reasoning with him, or persuading him, or entreating him, but not for compelling him, or visiting him with any evil in case he do otherwise (Mill 1909–14 [1859], Ch.1).

In treating coercion expansively, Mill apparently intended to capture a number of different ways in which powerful agents could exercise constraining power on others besides the use of force, violence, and threats thereof. So, for instance, Mill suggests that the potency of legal penalties often resides more in the stigma they attach than the actual punishments they apply. Concerning laws against unpopular views, Mill writes,

[T]he chief mischief of the legal penalties is that they strengthen the social stigma. It is that stigma which is really effective… [Except for people who are] independent of the good will of other people, opinion, on this subject, is as efficacious as law; men might as well be imprisoned, as excluded from the means of earning their bread.… Our merely social intolerance kills no one, roots out no opinions, but induces men to disguise them, or to abstain from any active effort for their diffusion (Mill 1909–14 [1859], Ch. 2).

Thus Mill decries “the despotism of custom,” as a force seemingly more potent than that of governments, in that it is able to hold back whole civilizations for centuries (Mill 1909–14 [1859], Ch. 2).

By contrast with Hobbes, Locke, or Kant, Mill recognizes that the power of civil institutions is frequently on a par with the power of the state, and treats the potential for coercion by these other institutions as similarly a matter of concern. For instance, in thinking about the institution of marriage, Mill writes,

When the law makes everything which the wife acquires, the property of the husband, while by compelling her to live with him it forces her to submit to almost any amount of moral and even physical tyranny which he may choose to inflict, there is some ground for regarding every act done by her as done under coercion (Mill 1909 [1848], Bk.V, ch. XI).

And in looking at the circumstances of child labor in his day, he noted,

Labouring for too many hours in the day, or on work beyond their strength, should not be permitted to [children], for if permitted it may always be compelled. Freedom of contract, in the case of children, is but another word for freedom of coercion (Mill 1909 [1848], Bk. V. ch. XI).

Thus Mill’s understanding of coercion appears to treat a wider array of powers as potential means of coercion than did earlier thinkers.

1.4 20th Century views to 1969

With the advent of analytic approaches to philosophy and law in the 20th Century, philosophers and legal theorists began to give more explicit elaboration to what “coercion” means, and how it relates to other concepts. In the period prior to 1969, there were of course some differences among theorists, but there seems to be a mainstream view of coercion that is more or less continuous with the view found in Aquinas and Hobbes/Locke/Kant (and some of the views of Bentham and Mill). This view identifies coercion with the use of force or violence, as well as to threats of the same. For instance, Hans Kelsen explains the nature of law by saying,

As a coercive order, the law is distinguished from other social orders. The decisive criterion is the element of force — that means that the act prescribed by the order as a consequence of socially detrimental facts ought to be executed even against the will of the individual and, if he resists, by physical force (Kelsen 1967 [1934], 34).

Kelsen goes on to count as coercive acts such things as detaining those suspected of crimes, detaining for protective custody, detaining of the insane, detaining in internment camps potential enemies of the state, and the confiscation or destruction of property (Kelsen 1967 [1934], 40–41).

J. R. Lucas puts a slightly different cast on a similar thought, emphasizing the importance of a technique by which one agent (e.g., the state) can assure that its decisions are implemented.

[W]e are concerned with the enforcement of decisions: we are considering the conditions under which decisions will be carried out regardless of the recalcitrance of the bloody minded. We therefore define force in terms of bloody-mindedness, of what happens irrespective of how recalcitrant a man is, of what happens to him willy-nilly. Force, then, we say, is being used against a man, if in his private experience or in his environment either something is being done which he does not want to be done but which he is unable to prevent in spite of all his efforts, or he is being prevented, in spite of all his efforts, from doing something which he wants to do, and which he otherwise could have done by himself alone. A man is being coerced when either force is being used against him or his behaviour is being determined by the threat of force (Lucas 1966, 57; emphasis in the original).

[I]mprisonment is the paradigm form of coercion.… Even if it were not regarded as a penalty, it would still be effective in frustrating the efforts of the recalcitrant to prevent a judicial decision being implemented (Lucas 1966, 60).

If there is a single, continuous thread that runs through the various thoughts about coercion surveyed above, I believe it could be identified as Lucas suggests with a concern for the ability of some agents to implement and enforce decisions about the activities of others. With the possible exception of Mill, who allows for a greater range of coercive methods than the others surveyed, this general idea seems to capture what one might have said was essential in the concept of coercion as pre-modern and modern political theorists employed it, by name or (in the case of Locke) by function.

2. Contemporary philosophical accounts of coercion

2.1 Nozick and a new approach to coercion

Beginning in 1969, a spate of short articles was published on coercion. The earliest of significance was Robert Nozick’s “Coercion.” It was followed shortly by a collection of essays by political philosophers published in a volume of the Nomos series, focused on coercion (Pennock and Chapman 1972). These articles were in turn followed by an outpouring of responses and original discussions of coercion that continued throughout the 1970s and 80s. The influence of these early discussions of coercion remains strong. So it is useful to begin thinking about contemporary treatments of coercion by looking at how these early articles framed the topic.

Nozick’s essay was by far the most influential of these early works. Besides being first, his essay established a framework for thinking about coercion which provided an intuitively compelling picture of how coercion works. Nozick analyzed coercion by offering a list of necessary and sufficient conditions for judging the truth of the claim that P coerces Q. Somewhat simplified, he argued that P coerces Q if and only if:

  1. P aims to keep Q from choosing to perform action A;
  2. P communicates a claim to Q;
  3. P’s claim indicates that if Q performs A, then P will bring about some consequence that would make Q’s A-ing less desirable to Q than Q’s not A-ing;
  4. P’s claim is credible to Q;
  5. Q does not do A;
  6. Part of Q’s reason for not doing A is to lessen the likelihood that P will bring about the consequence announced in (3) (Nozick 1969, 441–445).[5]

Many theorists adopted this framework explicitly or implicitly, and it has influenced almost all subsequent analytic philosophical discussions of the topic. Subsequent sections will address the aspects of Nozick’s analysis which have received the most attention and debate. The remainder of this section sketches some of the less remarked ways in which Nozick’s analysis differs from the more traditional understanding of coercion, exhibited in the historical survey above. Specifically, (1) it associates coercion only with proposals (e.g., conditional threats[6]), and excludes direct uses of force or violence[7]; (2) it insists that coercion takes place only when the coercee acquiesces to it; and (3) it makes coercion explicitly dependent on the coercee’s choice to take or not take a specific action A, and mandates that a judgment about coercion must refer to facts about the coercee’s psychology, such as her assessment of the consequences A-ing in light of the coercer’s proposal. The overall effect of these differences is to focus the analysis of coercion on how the coercee is affected by it, rather than on what the coercer does, and what is required for him to do it successfully. (See Anderson 2008b.)

2.1.1 Coercion via threats, and (not) via force

One significant departure from the traditional approach is that Nozick limits his discussion of coercion to techniques that influence or alter the will of the coercee, by altering the intentions or dispositions of the coercee. Such coercion usually takes the form of a conditional threat (or sometimes a conditional offer). Though a few subsequent writers, like Michael Bayles (Bayles 1972; and Gunderson 1979, following Bayles) and Grant Lamond (Lamond 1996 and 2000), have accepted direct force as equally a means of coercion,[8] Nozick’s restriction of the topic to the use of threats — that is, coercion that operates through the will of the coercee — has been the much more frequently accepted view, whether explicitly or implicitly.

However, some theorists argue that there are good reasons to treat coercion via the will and direct force or constraint applied to the body as two methods of a single kind of activity. First, though direct force is usually unsuited to get an agent to perform a specific action, both are well suited to preventing an agent from taking a variety of actions, with direct force or constraint often being more decisive. Second, the two techniques are often used hand-in-hand. For instance, police officers will shackle and manhandle someone in custody who refuses to cooperate when given instructions to move or stay still. Also, prison inmates are coerced into remaining there by a combination of penalties for attempting escape along with physical obstacles that limit the feasibility of doing so. So using both techniques is often part of one and the same activity aimed at affecting or constraining what an agent will do (sometimes by affecting what she can do) (Anderson 2008a and 2010). Of course, under direct force, it will usually be true that the coercee does not act, but rather is acted upon, as H. J. McCloskey puts it (McCloskey 1980). However, from the coercer’s perspective, it may be just as well, in enforcing his decisions, to prevent the coercee from acting at all as it would be to induce her to choose not to act.

2.1.2 (No) unsuccessful coercion

Nozick’s framing indicates that coercion is necessarily successful: if the coercee does not act as demanded, then there is no instance of coercion. At most, it seems, there is an instance of attempted coercion. One might say that Nozick builds a “success condition” into his analysis of coercion. Others have disagreed with the success condition, though Nozick’s is apparently a majority view. (Those who agree include McCloskey 1980; Gorr 1986; Murray and Dudrick 1995; Berman 2002; Garnett 2018; one who disagrees is Carr 1988). The disagreement seems to be over whether to identify instances of coercion with one or the other of the two faces mentioned at the outset: that is, to identify it with a kind of behavior by the coercer (which may or may not be successful), or to identify it with specific events in the life of the coercee (namely, those that alter or constrain her activities). Several authors, picking up on the disagreement, have suggested that we might distinguish coercion from coerciveness, associating the former with completed, successful attempts, and the latter with qualities of the attempt itself (Lamond, 2000).

Of course, if the coercee defies the coercer, there is no coerced action to investigate, nor any question to answer about responsibility for such an action. There is also reason to doubt that what the coercer did in such cases rises to meet the bar at which we should consider it coercive. (If a threat is trivial, we would likely resist saying that an agent was coerced by it even if she acts to prevent its execution.) On the other hand, it may be unwise to make a categorical distinction between cases in which coercion succeeds and cases where it fails: the difference between them on some occasions may be nothing more than what mood the coercee happened to be in at the time. Since the coercer has the final and definitive say over whether he will engage in coercive activity (and who will be engaged by it), it may make more sense to identify our phenomenon of interest with a certain form of activity by the coercer, admitting that such activity may or may not result in any further noticeable consequences. (The would-be coercer may of course be bluffing, and the prospective coercee may call the bluff; this would not, by itself, give reason to deny that we have here an instance of the technique under study.)

2.1.3 Is coercion conceptually limited to specific coerced acts?

Finally, Nozick frames his analysis with respect to some particular action A taken or not taken by the coercee. The connection of coercion to a specific action taken or foregone has seemed natural to almost all subsequent commentators, even though it raises some problems of which at least Nozick himself seems to have been aware. In the short detour that is the second section of his essay, Nozick poses questions of the following sort: If P coerces Q into doing A, and B and C are the only ways to do A, does P coerce Q into doing B (assuming that is the means Q chose)? Similarly, if P coerces Q into not doing A, and A is a necessary precursor to B, does P coerce Q into not doing B? Does it matter whether Q was already aiming/hoping/expecting to do B? More generally, if as a result of prior acts of coercion by P, an act A is no longer possible for Q (perhaps Q doesn’t think about it at all), has P coerced Q into not A-ing? Nozick broaches questions of these sorts, but leaves them aside without much mention of their significance (See Nozick 1969, 445–47). Taken seriously, however, they would force some significant revisions to the way theorists have analyzed coercion. They show that there may be difficulties in identifying coercion strictly with actions taken or foregone, since it may be impossible to determine just what actions this description includes.

More generally, Nozick’s analysis emphasizes the alteration in the coercee’s choice of actions which results from the way the coercer’s proposal affects her reasons for acting. While this is certainly a plausible approach for distinguishing coerced from uncoerced acts, it puts the focus on how the coercee perceives her situation; it is only via this reflection that it takes into account how the coercer is able to create this perception. That is, it leaves the standard sorts of means (force, violence, perhaps even economic deprivation) that coercers use out of the account, and instead treats all kinds of alterations to the coercee’s costs and benefits to acting as possible indications of coercion. While this more ecumenical approach to coercion may succeed in encompassing ways of coercing that the traditional theories would leave out, it creates a difficult challenge for the theory to distinguish coercive from non-coercive proposals. It is not surprising, therefore, that these are the issues that have been the focus of most subsequent theorizing on the subject.

2.2 Threats and Baselines

Since Nozick’s essay, theorists have frequently treated the making of a conditional threat as an essential factor in coercion. The largest single effort expended in analyzing coercion has been devoted to making sense of such threats, and determining their relationship to coercion. Some, however, have questioned the linking of coercion with threats, and suggested that conditional offers too can be coercive. Both conditional threats and conditional offers can be said to be proposals, where the distinction between them is their relationship to some baseline representing the coercee’s situation prior to the proposal: compared to the baseline, threats worsen the coercee’s situation, while offers do not. In this and the next two sections, we’ll examine some of the issues involved here. In Section 2.5 we’ll consider some approaches to coercion that attempt to escape from a “baseline” analysis of threats and offers.

Most will recognize the connection of coercion with threats as a matter of common sense: armed robbers, mafias, the parents of young children, and the state all make conditional threats with the intention of reducing the eligibility of some actions, making other actions more attractive by comparison. Note, however, that offers may also be made with the same general intention as coercive threats: that is, to make some actions more attractive, others less so. Consider the basic structure of a conditional threat by P that attaches undesirable consequences C to some action A by Q:

P claims that (P will bring about consequences C if and only if Q does A).

This proposition has the same structure as an ordinary offer by P to do something Q desires if Q agrees to pay for it, but not otherwise. Conversely, any ordinary offer has the same structure as a threat. This suggests that any proposal whatever may be read as a threat or an offer, depending on the relationship between the proposal and some specifiable external factors. (“Your money or your life” might equally be proposed by a back-alley robber or a pharmaceutical company; in one case it’s a robbery, in the other case it may be a life-saving offer.) The idea that threats coerce while offers don’t is frequently thought to be connected to the fact that threats propose to make their recipient worse off than she would have been otherwise. If so, we are required to specify how we should pick out and assess the relata in this comparison, which is trickier than it may at first appear. Consider first the question of what aspect of the proposal is relevant for this comparison; and then second what relevant comparison case (usually called the “baseline”) should be used.

Any bi-conditional proposal can be analyzed into a conjunction of two component simple conditionals, both of which must be true if the bi-conditional itself is true. However, only one of the two conditionals will have its antecedent satisfied (depending on what Q chooses to do), and will thus govern what comes about as a consequence. If the proposal is to have a motivational effect on its recipient, it will be because the recipient prefers that one of the two possible consequents be realized — either that P brings about C, or that P does not bring about C — so we may suppose that it is the difference in Q’s valuation of these consequents that motivates (if anything does) Q to act in response to P’s proposal. (If the agent is indifferent between the two states, we may consider the proposal to be an offer, but too unattractive an offer to tempt one to accept it.) So we look to the conditional containing the less-preferred consequent, and compare it to the baseline in order to see whether P’s proposal makes Q worse off than she would be in the relevant alternative state of affairs. (The following analysis slightly modifies the analysis in Gorr 1986, 391–397; and Berman 2002, 55–59.[9])

So, for instance, an armed robber issues a proposal to a passerby that amounts to the following conditionals:

(a) If she keeps her valuables, he will harm her;

(b) if she hands them over, he will not.

The passerby prefers the consequent in (b), so we compare the conditional (a) to the baseline. Normally, one faces no harm if one keeps one’s valuables. So the first conditional makes the passerby worse off than she would normally be, thus turning the robber’s proposal into a threat.

By contrast, consider the offer of a salesman who proposes to a customer the following:

(c) If the customer pays X, he will provide her a vacation package;

(d) if she does not pay X, he provides no vacation package.

Assuming the customer would prefer having the vacation package to not having the vacation package, the second conditional contains the less preferred consequent. But receiving no free vacation is quite normal, so one is no worse off when the second conditional is operative than under normal circumstances. Hence the salesman is making only an offer, not a threat.

(Some have discussed “throffers,” which are proposals that make one better off than normal under one conditional, worse off than normal under the alternative conditional. On the above analysis, throffers will be included among the threats because the conditional containing the less-preferred consequent makes one worse off than one normally would be.)

This analysis works well enough for most purposes. Since we quite often know what’s normal and what’s not, threats and offers are usually easily distinguished. Difficulties arise, however, when this is not the case.

2.3 Moralized vs. non-moralized baselines

Nozick explains the idea of the baseline by calling it the “normal or natural or expected course of events” (Nozick 1969, 447). But all of these terms are ambiguous, in that they have normative (or “moral”) and non-normative (e.g., “predictive”) uses. Frequently, the normative and predictive uses will point to the same state of affairs as the course of events that is indicated. However, the extensions of the normative and non-normative uses will sometimes differ, thus requiring a theorist to choose one or the other in order to determine whether a particular communication counts as a threat or an offer, and is therefore coercive or not.

Nozick offers two of the best known cases in which the normative and non-normative baselines would appear to diverge. Here’s one of them (Nozick 1969, 450–51):[10]

The slave case:
P is a slave owner who regularly beats his slave Q. One day P proposes to spare Q his regular beating if and only if Q now does A.

Q prefers not to be beaten, so we look to the conditional

(e) If Q does not do A, P will beat Q.

Since P beats Q regularly, this conditional’s becoming operative makes Q no worse off than what Q finds normal or expected (statistically speaking). So P’s proposal amounts to an offer, not a threat, on this way of understanding of what’s normal. Yet we would reasonably hold that if Q elects to escape a beating by doing A, Q’s choice is made in response to a threat of a beating, and is thus coerced.

The slave case demonstrates an ambiguity in our thought about “what is normal” (or “what is expected”). Although the slave is typically beaten and predicts he’ll be beaten based on past history, we expect on moral grounds that people are not beaten for no reason. Given the moral sense of what is normal, the slave owner’s proposition amounts to a threat, thus validating our sense that the slave is coerced into doing A. Especially in contexts of entrenched injustice, the “moral” and “predictive” baselines may diverge, forcing us to choose between them.

Actually, any number of different possible baselines might be constructed for judging whether a proposal makes one better or worse off than the baseline. There are different ways of making a prediction; there are different “moral” standards; there are also ways of taking into consideration what the recipient of the proposal would want. So divergences among the many possible baselines may be more common than we might at first suspect. This requires us to find a way to choose among the possibly diverging baselines. Nozick, for instance, proposes that when the “predictive” and the “moral” baselines diverge, we turn to the preferences of the recipient of the proposal, and use the baseline he prefers. In the slave case above, Nozick reasonably supposes that the slave would prefer that “normal” meant “moral”; in which case the slave would not be beaten even if he did not do A. By comparison to this baseline, the slave-owner’s proposal is a threat, not an offer.

Some theorists have noticed that what the proposal recipient wants to happen may differ from both the moral and predictive baselines. Michael Gorr, for instance, argues that if preferences are important when the baselines diverge, “it is unclear why they should be less so in cases where the two baselines coincide.” Hence he favors an account that “makes the subject’s preferences a controlling factor in all cases” (Gorr 1986, 398–399; see also Rhodes 2000). The difficulty with this suggestion, however, is that it’s very difficult to craft constraints on what preferences will count for how things go; people can want others to do or omit doing almost anything. Suppose we agree it is normal in both the moral and predictive senses for workers who shirk to be fired, and for customers who refuse to pay utility bills to have their electricity cut off. Of course, workers and customers would likely prefer to get paid for nothing, and to get their electricity for free. Compared to these baselines, proposing to fire or to cut off electricity to someone amounts to going out of one’s way to attach undesirable consequences to some (non‑)action A. On Gorr’s criteria, it would appear, both of these threats count as coercive threats, yet both seem to be parts of ordinary, non-coercive commerce based on offers and acceptances.[11] At any rate, it is difficult to see how a fully preference-based baseline account can avoid seeing coercion in a vast array of situations where our pre-theoretic views would deny it.

Those who opt for a moralized baseline approach seem to offer a more plausible approach. The most prominent of these theorists has been Alan Wertheimer, whose book Coercion sets the current standard and starting point for continued scholarship in this area.[12] Since only threats coerce, but not all threats do, he provides a two-pronged test for whether a proposal constitutes a coercive threat (Wertheimer 1987, especially chs. 2, 12, and 14). The proposal constitutes a threat if the proposer indicates that, if his demand is denied, he will make the recipient worse off than the recipient ought to be. (In particular, Wertheimer believes that this is frequently best understood as a question of whether the proposer proposes to violate the recipient’s rights (Wertheimer 1987, 217).)[13] Yet the mere fact that something threatens one is not sufficient to ground a claim that it coerces anyone; the threat may be wrongful but also trivial. So Wertheimer requires that the choice forced upon the coercee be such that she has no reasonable choice but to succumb. This too requires a contextually specific, moralized judgment, Wertheimer thinks. One might, for instance, be supported in a claim that a threatened beating left one “no choice” but to sign a contract; the same might not be said about a choice to commit murder.

Wertheimer’s approach is developed and defended by surveying legal reasoning in the U.S. and its common-law tradition with respect to such matters as contracts, criminal responsibility, plea bargains, blackmail, and consent to searches and medical procedures. His work has been influential among many who have tried to determine what the law should say about various coercive phenomena, and Wertheimer himself has offered further applications of his theories in subsequent work, including a book on consent to sexual relations (Wertheimer 2004). Wertheimer’s moralized account and moralized theories of coercion more generally raise some difficulties for understanding how there could be “justified coercion,” such as law enforcement, in that they tend to associate uses of coercion with immoral action. Some of these difficulties are considered in Section 3.4 below.

2.4 Coercive Offers?

While the dominant strand in recent theory has associated coercion with threats, and denied that offers can be used to coerce, this sharp differentiation of these two sorts of proposals has come in for some criticism. The parallel structure of conditional threats and conditional offers has led some to deny that there is a deep distinction to be made between them. Others have focused on the role of both in the broader political and economic context, and found that these broader conditions make coercive offers a live possibility. Dealings in capitalist markets are often highly exploitative; governments often condition the provision of ordinary benefits on the satisfaction of unrelated demands (such as making highway funding conditional on states’ passing particular laws). Given the potency such offers possess, one might suspect that there are many offers that one cannot reasonably refuse, possibly reflecting great imbalances in power or prior historical injustices between the bargaining parties. (See, for instance, O’Neill 1991; and Berman 2001.)

Of those who have argued that threats and offers can both be used coercively, David Zimmerman has been most prominent (Zimmerman 1981; others who have argued offers can coerce include Frankfurt 1988 [1973]; Held 1972; Lyons 1975; Van De Veer 1979; Benditt 1979; Feinberg 1986; Stevens 1988; Rocha 2011; for criticism of Zimmerman, Held, and Stevens, see Alexander 1981; Bayles 1974; and Swanton 1989, respectively). Retaining the baseline-approach to coercion found in Nozick, Zimmerman urges that in setting a baseline for judging a proposal, we should take into account the possibility that the proposal maker is actively hindering the coercee from obtaining a situation for herself that would be better than the situation the coercer proposes. So, for instance, if a person is destitute on an island, and someone proposes to employ this person for a life-sustaining pittance, this proposal may count as an offer, since it is an improvement over the “pre-proposal” situation. But if the person is destitute and unable to obtain better conditions only because the employer actively prevents the person from leaving the island (say, by preventing the building of boats), Zimmerman suggests the offer should be regarded as coercive. That’s because the appropriate baseline for evaluating the proposal is the state of affairs that the recipient would face in the absence of special interference by the proposal maker. (In the present case, this might be the situation the island inhabitant would face were she able to build a boat and return to the mainland.) If relative to this baseline the offer is less favored, then it should count as coercive, Zimmerman thinks.

Do such offers coerce? The dispute between those who say offers can coerce, such as Zimmerman, and those who insist only threats coerce may be more verbal than substantive. While Zimmerman, for instance, would label the offer itself coercive, what appears to do the coercing here is whatever means were or are being used to keep the recipient of the offer from reaching a better bargaining state. If the offering party here has created the conditions that make even very unattractive offers still the best available, then the coercion, if there is any, seems to be vested in the offerer’s actions that prevent the recipient from improving her situation or finding better offers elsewhere.

Zimmerman grants that even if the offering party does not cause the recipient to be in the position she’s in, we may still want to criticize such offers. In these cases, the offer-maker may be guilty of engaging in exploitation, though not coercion. When one party is in a much stronger bargaining position than another, the stronger party sometimes uses its advantage to keep for itself most or all of the gains to be had from cooperative interaction between the parties. So employers who are in a stronger bargaining position than their employees may exploit them by paying them a small fraction of the value their labor contributes to the production of goods for the employer. This is especially feasible when one party has a relative monopoly position with respect to some valuable good (say, employment opportunities). So, reconfiguring Zimmerman’s results somewhat, we might retain the exclusive connection between threats and coercion by saying that offers made from a position of superior bargaining strength are very likely to be exploitative; and that sometimes coercion is used to create or maintain one’s bargaining advantages.

Not all, however, would accept that the coerciveness of a large differential in bargaining power depends upon its causal origins. Joan McGregor, for example, gives an analysis of such offers in an account that eschews the baseline approach. She argues, “the ‘better off’/‘worse off’ distinction ignores the power relationships that occur when there are radically disparate bargaining strengths” (McGregor 1988–89, 24). To assess the coerciveness of something like an economic transaction, one must instead attend to the relative strengths of the bargaining positions between parties involved. “[C]oercion involves exercising power over another; in the market, it involves exercising superior bargaining power” (McGregor 1988–89, 25). At least two of the conditions for having bargaining power sufficient to coerce another are that the weaker party is dependent in some way on the stronger party (e.g., there are no other options or potential exchange partners), and the stronger party has influence over whether some significant evil occurs to the weaker party (such as loss of life, health, security) (McGregor 1988–89, 34). If in addition the stronger party decides to take advantage of these conditions, then this is not just exploitation but coercion. While the details of her account of bargaining strength may raise difficulties, her attempt to incorporate a measure of the coercer’s power into the account of coercion seems a useful if relatively under-explored approach. Arguably, a consideration such as this motivates Serena Olsaretti in her argument that markets might preserve freedom while also undermining voluntariness in a fashion similar to that of coercive threats (Olsaretti 2004, ch. 6).

2.5 Non-baseline approaches

The need to establish a baseline is generated by a need to distinguish threats from offers as a central criterion of coercion. Threats and offers are both proposals put to the coercee, aiming to influence her behavior, and distinguished with respect to how they affect what is normal for the coercee. There are two main ways in which some theorists have diverged from the baseline-style account that Nozick proposed, each of these ways admitting of both moralized and non-moralized versions. Instead of distinguishing threats and offers from what’s normal for the agent, we might instead see threats as applying a special sort or degree of pressure on the coercee’s will. Or, we might move away from focusing on the coercee’s will as the locus of coercion, and instead look at the powers, intentions, and activities of coercers. A “coercer-focused” account seeks to determine what is special about coercive actions, rather than trying to distinguish coerced from non-coerced actions.

One way to identify coercive threats is by looking for a distinctive way that pressure can affect a coercee’s will. Sometimes, a use of threats conditioned on the agent’s activities may affect not just the coercee’s choice but also her ability to choose at all. Under severe psychological pressure, faced with grave dangers or significant evils, people sometimes react in ways that diverge from (or at least do not follow from) their more rational, considered desires. Harry Frankfurt seems to make this effect a requirement for something to count as coercive, saying “A coercive threat arouses in its victim a desire — i.e. to avoid the penalty — so powerful that it will move him to perform the required action whether he wants to perform it or considers that it would be reasonable for him to do so” (Frankfurt 1988 [1973], 78). Frankfurt has several reasons for insisting on this strong requirement, but perhaps most central is his view that coercion must have such an overbearing effect if it is to override the coercee’s moral responsibility for acting (Frankfurt 1988 [1973], 75–76). However, if one treats such overburdening as a sufficient condition for coercion, then this again lends support to the view that some offers — irresistible ones — will also turn out to be coercive. Though the fact that Q’s will was overborne would seem compatible with the claim that Q has been coerced, few besides Frankfurt have taken such overburdening to be a necessary condition for coercion to take place.[14]

Short of generating psychological compulsion, one might hold that coercion involves the imposition of an option which no one could reasonably refuse to take. Several have tried to characterize such situations in a way that neither reduces to a form of psychological determinism, nor implicitly invokes baseline comparisons. For instance, Mark Fowler argues that “coercion generally involves the prima facie immoral imposition of practical imperatives by use of threats” (Fowler 1982, 330). While this approach must be supplemented with further details (including, perhaps, a resort to a baseline to distinguish threats from offers), its principal contribution is its reliance on “practical imperatives.” Fowler suggests that we need to see coercion in relation to our understanding of how practical reason works. When we say that the coercer leaves the coercee “no choice,” we don’t necessarily mean that the coercee is literally unable to choose, but that for the coercee to choose otherwise than the coercer demands would be contrary to practical reason (Fowler 1982, 331).

The normative approach Fowler favors links this criterion to a Kantian account of autonomy, and suggests that the test of a coercive threat is that it violates the coercee’s autonomy. This would appear to produce a mismatch between our pre-theoretic understanding of coercion and the cases that will satisfy Fowler’s conditions — for instance, giving someone a false “warning” arguably violates her autonomy, but this seems different than coercion. Yet if there is a way to make sense of the notion of imposing a practical imperative, this seems a useful element of an account of coercion.

Joel Feinberg identifies coercion with a special degree or kind of pressure imposed on the coercee’s will, but avoids connecting pressure to a normative judgment. His account is tailored to cases where the coercer seeks to obtain a token of “consent” to some harmful or dangerous activity from the coercee, but it could easily be generalized to cover other sorts of coerced activities. His account starts by offering a helpful description of the role of the coercer, stipulating that the coercer:

threatens to “cause or fail to prevent some consequences that [the coercee] finds unwelcome”; and

“gives some evidence of the credibility of the threat”; and

“has actively intervened in [the coercee’s] option-network, to acquire control of the relevant option-switches; in particular he can close tight the conjunctive option that consists of [the coercee’s] noncompliance with the demand and [the coercee’s] avoidance of the threatened unwelcome consequences” (Feinberg 1986, 198). [15]

These stipulations are useful supplements to the Nozickian-style account, in that they require the coercer to demonstrate his power, and to actively use it to create the situation facing the coercee, in particular by preventing the coercee from finding ways to avoid the forced choice.[16]

The bulk of Feinberg’s account focuses instead, however, on how coercive proposals can generate pressure on the coercee’s will that, if not irresistible, is sufficiently strong to make the coercee’s choice unfree. This account avoids a reliance on baselines because it makes the coercee’s judgment of the frightfulness, unwelcomeness and pressure involved in the threat the key criterion for determining whether it coerces. Feinberg goes on to give a detailed discussion of how one might compare the pressures involved when coercers issue various sorts of demands coupled with various sorts of threats, suggesting ways of calculating the “total coercive burden” a threat creates for a coercee.

Feinberg’s account generates a number of apparently troubling results. For one thing, it will allow that extremely tempting offers are coercive if they create pressure similar to that associated with coercive threats; the only thing that seems to count is how much pressure one feels to act. It will also treat people with non-standard preferences or fears (say, a dire fear of being patted on the back) as having been “coerced” by threats to do what are, objectively speaking, trivial things (Feinberg 1986, 212).

A different way of understanding coercion moves away from focusing on its impact on the coercee. Some approaches, like McGregor’s noted above, look for coercion in the coercer’s taking advantage of certain sorts of power differentials between coercer and coercee. Others identify coercion with the making of threats, but seek to distinguish threats from offers in ways that avoid reference to a baseline, and instead look at the qualities of the coercer and his activities. Mitchell Berman, following Vinit Haksar, has argued for an approach the crux of which holds that immoral coercive threats propose to do something that would be immoral to do if carried out. (See Berman 2002; Haksar 1976.) (Berman does not, it appears, offer a definition of coercion per se, but only of wrongful coercion.) Grant Lamond focuses instead on the coercer’s intentional attempt to use pressure to alter the activities of the coercee, where that pressure comes from an intention to deliberately set back the interests of the coercee. (See Lamond 1996 and 2000.) Because McGregor’s, Berman’s and Lamond’s ways of capturing coercion attend to the coercer’s actions and intentions, they avoid the need to distinguish coercive from other proposals based on specific effects on the coercee. (For that reason, they could also reject the “success” condition on coercion found in Nozick’s and most subsequent accounts of coercion.)

Scott Anderson, drawing upon some remarks of J. R. Lucas (1966), takes a different tack, and associates coercion with the use of an ability some agents have to enforce their decisions about what another will or will not do, “where the sense of enforceability here is exemplified by the use of force, violence and the threats thereof to constrain, disable, harm or undermine an agent’s ability to act” (Anderson 2010, 6). Anderson thus rejects Nozick’s innovations in this area (see above Section 2.1) by refocusing the analysis on the powers and acts of the coercer (rather than on the will or actions of the coercee), by allowing that direct force (and not just threats) can be used to coerce, and denying that coercion is coextensive with particular acts taken or avoided by the coercee. Anderson requires that the coercer engage in activity either to create a power differential between himself and the coercee (say, by taking up arms), or else draw upon some existing differential between agents of the sorts to which coercer and coercee belong (say, policeman and citizen, respectively). This “enforcement approach” suggests that uses of these sorts of powers are distinctive, and thus can be used to pick out long-standing threats (such as the criminal law) as coercive, even if it is difficult to identify specific actions that they alter.

3. Uses for thought about coercion

Although some writings on coercion might appear to aim principally for conceptual clarification, theorists of coercion more often aim to answer questions that have practical import for ethics, judicial decisions, political or legal theory, and social policy. Some of the most common implications of claims about coercion are explored below. The four subsections here (on the ethics of coercion, responsibility under coercion, its effect on freedom, and its legal and political implications) overlap in various ways, so while these subsections have distinct foci, the discussions should not be taken to be fully independent of one another.

3.1 The ethics of coercion

In section 3.3, we’ll consider how coercion is thought to impinge upon freedom, something that raises obvious ethical implications in its own right. So consideration of these sorts of ethical issues will be postponed until there. The present section looks at certain more basic questions about whether and why employing coercion is necessarily or contingently wrongful, as well as whether its wrongfulness is intrinsic to it or derivative, and what else might be wrong with it besides its effect on freedom or autonomy.

There has been considerable debate over the question of whether employing coercion is necessarily or contingently wrongful. There seem to be three categories in which answers to this question might fall: coercion is necessarily wrongful; it is prima facie or pro tanto wrongful, though it may be justified by further facts; and it is intrinsically morally neutral, though some uses of it may be wrongful because of specific facts about them. Differences in understanding what is wrongful about it may account for these different positions. Further, in cases where coercion is wrongful, we might distinguish two different ways of explaining the nature of its wrongfulness. It might be a basic wrong, in that being coercive is sufficient to justify the judgment that it is wrongful; or, otherwise, we can explain its wrongfulness as deriving from some component activity that is wrongful, so that coercion’s wrongfulness is derivative, rather than basic.[17]

One route to finding coercion is necessarily wrongful is to define coercion as constitutively involving a violation or threatened violation of the coercee’s rights, or a proposal to violate one’s normative obligations. For instance, Cheyney Ryan argues for such a normative conception of coercion. (See Ryan 1980.) Tying coercion closely to immoral action captures a number of intuitions we have about coercion, reflecting also a lot of ordinary language. People often associate uses of coercion with injustices done to themselves or others. This tie also provides a sharper division between coercive and non-coercive activity than might otherwise be found: if an activity is morally unobjectionable, then it is ipso facto not coercive.

If coercion is not necessarily wrongful, it might still involve moral judgment by being defined as requiring some prima facie or pro tanto immoral element; this is probably the most commonly held view. There have been a variety of different attempts, especially in the 21st century, to find and describe the immoral factor in coercion that will then suffice to explain its wrongfulness when not rebutted, while avoiding the miscategorization of cases.

One suggestion holds that what is distinctive about coercion and gives it its moral character is that it involves an instrumental making of a threat to do something wrongful. Following Niko Kolodny we might call this the “inheritance” view (Kolodny 2017). For instance, Mitchell Berman has argued that when a coercer threatens to do something, the rightness or wrongness of the use of such a threat to coerce depends on whether it would be rightful or wrongful for that agent to carry through with that threat (Berman 2002; see also Haksar 1976; Wertheimer 1987, ch. 12). Berman’s account of wrongful coercion thus apparently relies on a principle of inference that holds that if it is wrong to do A, then it is wrong to threaten to do A, and vice versa. Japa Pallikkathayil sketches a similar view, holding that if the coercer’s proposal has motivational force only because it proposes to do something that the recipient should have a right to veto, then such a proposal (in at least paradigmatic cases of coercion) wrongfully constrains the recipient, and wrongfully impinges on their normative powers. Here too, the wrongfulness of the proposal depends on the wrongfulness of the thing the coercer proposes to do (Pallikkathayil 2011). Benjamin Sachs suggests a claim that might bolster Berman’s position, namely, that the very making of the threat has the tendency to increase the likelihood that the threatener will carry out the wrongful act threatened, which he describes as “self-incitement” (Sachs 2013). The “inheritance” view is similarly defended by James Shaw (2012), in his account of the immorality of blackmail.

The inheritance view does not seem to correctly categorize or explain the morality of all cases that are intuitively regarded as coercive. At least sometimes it appears appropriate to threaten to do something which would be wrong to carry out (nuclear deterrence is sometimes thought to be like this; see Section 4.1 below). And sometimes it may be wrongful to threaten what it would be right to carry out (some instances of blackmail and extortion seem to fit this description). The inheritance view also does not explain why making a conditional threat may be more ethically problematic than a plain, unconditional threat.[18] Unfortunately, the complexities due particularly to the conditionality of coercive threats have been little explored to date by those more centrally interested in coercion.[19]

A second suggestion holds that there’s something special about the coercer’s intention vis-à-vis the coercee that makes coercion frequently problematic. Grant Lamond suggests that the wrongness of wrongful coercion derives from the fact that it involves a “proposal deliberately to impose a disadvantage on another” (Lamond 2000, 49). “The distinctive wrong involved in [coercive conditional] threats is to propose to take an action because it is unwelcome to the recipient, i.e., because he does not want it done” (Lamond 1996, 228). It is thus the coercer’s intention to harm or disadvantage the coercee (or to propose to do so) that creates coercion’s special burden of justification (though Lamond does not suppose such justifications are particularly difficult to find). But it isn’t clear either that when one proposes to harm another that one thereby intends to bring about any harm (one could be bluffing).[20] More importantly, it’s also unclear that all intentions to impose disadvantages are even prima facie in need of justification. Unless we accept that all activities are prima facie unjustified absent specific justifications, it requires an argument to show that disadvantaging another person is itself something that always must clear a hurdle to count as justified. Certainly some kinds of disadvantage require special justification, but some may not. One might, for instance, intend to disadvantage one’s social rival by arranging to have him seated between two dreary bores at a dinner party. While perhaps not nice, it seems to require no special moral justification for this action (or the threat of this action) to be ethically permissible. We might say that so long as one respects the rights of others (a set as rich as one likes), one needs no special justification to act towards them as one likes. And surely no one has the right that no one else will ever act for the sake of disadvantaging one. If this is the case, then the mere intention to disadvantage someone, perhaps conditionally, does not suffice to violate her rights.

Stephen White takes notice of the fact that sometimes we find coercion problematic even if the coercer’s threat involves something that it would not be wrongful for the coercer to do (White 2017). Cases of blackmail, both conventional and “emotional blackmail,” often have this form: the threatener threatens to do something they may well have legal and moral right to do considered by itself, but something that would not otherwise be tied to the actions of the threat’s recipient. White argues that what coercers do in making conditional threats is to make the coercee responsible for the coercer’s execution of their threat, a responsibility that in many cases they should not have to bear. This seems most clear in cases where the coercer threatens to do something independently wrongful, since they are obligated not to carry out such a threat, so transferring that responsibility to the coercee is clearly wrongful. But even if the act threatened, such as self-harm, is not independently wrongful, forcing another to regard this outcome as their responsibility to prevent generates an unfair burden. This analysis is argued to help explain some other intuitions we have regarding the threat of wrongful coercion to autonomy and its deforming of the coercee’s choice situation.

Beyond wronging the target of coercion, there are arguably other ethical implications of coercion. While acknowledging that the concept of coercion is often invoked to play a role in “deontic” judgments, identifying interpersonal wrongs, Michael Garnett aims to expand the scope of our ethical concern with coercion by distinguishing this deontic role from a principally eudaimonistic role for a concept of coercion. Garnett argues that coercion is bad for the individual insofar as it amounts to one’s will being subjected to a foreign will—that of the coercer—independently of whether the coercion is wrongful (Garnett 2018; similar concerns with coercion are raised in Julius 2013 and Kolodny 2017). Similarly, Elinor Mason holds that coercion is a kind of violation of agent integrity, by virtue of being subjected to the domination of the coercer. She claims, “The coercer makes a proposal to the coercee, and provides substantial reasons for the coercee to do what the coercer desires. The coercer is attempting to dominate the coercee: the coercer is not treating the coercee as an agent, but as an object to be manipulated. The coercee finds the proposal credible, and accepts the reasons provided as substantial. As a result of the proposal, the coercee is dominated: she is alienated from her action” (Mason 2012, 201). In a similar vein, Ambrose Y. K. Lee argues that legal coercion used to incentivize people to do what they have otherwise good reason to do already fails to respect people as “reasons-responsive agents” (Lee 2014, 853). And Jan-Willem van der Rijt suggests that it is a criterion of coercion that the coercee feels subjectively wronged by it, thus making such felt wrongness part of its essential meaning (van der Rijt 2011).

There are some situations in which the coerciveness of an action appears obvious even though it may be difficult or impossible to ascertain its rightfulness or wrongfulness. Thus some (e.g., Zimmerman 2002; Anderson 2010) have argued against making judgments of coercion depend on prior moral judgments. For accounts of coercion that do not invoke moral judgments to define it, the ethical implications of coercion may be more contextual and determined by the particular uses to which it is put. If one holds the common view that coercion is rightly employed for purposes such as self-defense, defense of innocent others, and the enforcement of just laws, such views may encourage one to evaluate its use based on factors such as why and how it is used, who uses it, against whom, in what circumstances, and what other means were possible instead. Coercion is no ordinary means, but if it can be defined in non-moralized terms, it’s unclear why we should suppose that it is intrinsically (even prima facie or pro tanto) immoral, instead of simply noting that it is a very potent means, prone to abuse, and something that deserves ethical scrutiny whenever it is used.

3.2 The effect of coercion on coercee responsibility

There is no single, widely agreed upon theory that explains when an agent is or is not responsible for something that happens in the world. Judgments of responsibility are normative, and may depend on other normative facts specific to the particular sort of action or practice in question. For instance, facts that might limit one’s responsibility for signing or violating a contract might fail to limit one’s responsibility for killing someone. So the effect of coercion or its kin (duress, extortion) may differ depending upon the sort of action for which one seeks to limit one’s responsibility, or upon the moral context in which one acted. Nonetheless, a few central cases and some general tendencies can be given with some confidence.

There are two traditional sorts of grounds on which an agent’s responsibility might be truncated or attenuated because he was coerced. The first is by virtue of being excused for his action; the second is by virtue of his action’s being justified. The exact understanding of this distinction is under continuing dispute, but here is one way of understanding its most salient points. One may be excused, in whole or in part, for an action performed under coercion if that action (or its consequences) was beyond one’s control or willpower to prevent, or if that action (or its consequences) was unintentional. This latter condition might obtain if, for instance, one acquiesces under coercion to do something intentionally (like driving a car), but in so doing one does something else unintentionally (like helping a murderer escape). One is justified in acquiescing to coercion if one’s action (or its consequences) is morally required, or is morally permissible under the circumstances even if the action will foreseeably result in harm to others. (One obvious category of actions that carry such justifications are those taken to disable an attacker in self-defense or the defense of others.) However, the predominant recent accounts of coercion seem to need additional filling in when queried for guidance to determine whether the target of coercion may be excused or justified for actions taken or forgone due to coercion.

Most questions about coercion’s effect on responsibility arise in cases of coercion via conditional threats. When an agent is confronted by a threat, one ground on which her acquiescence may be excused is if the threat causes a total breakdown in her will. Like other incapacities, this can affect her responsibility for actions taken because she was truly unable to do otherwise. (This excuse may lead to questions about how the agent became vulnerable to suffering such a breakdown in agency; but in such cases she may be responsible for her weakness of character, though perhaps not for her action.) Excuse may also be invoked when the coerced person acts in ignorance or if the harm she causes is unintentional (excuses which are available regardless of whether one is coerced). But many people are able to react deliberately and rationally in response to coercive threats. So it seems that most cases of diminished responsibility under coercion will appeal to justification rather than excuse.

Some accounts of coercion apply a moralized test to the coercee’s situation, holding that one may avoid responsibility for an act taken under coercion if the coercer’s proposal is such that one “is entitled to yield to [the coercer’s] proposal and then be released from the normal moral and legal consequences of [one’s] act” (Wertheimer 1987, 267). Similarly, Pallikkathayil argues that individuals have a right to a “moral veto” over proposals that impermissibly restrain their options for action. When someone makes a coercive proposal that violates this moral right of veto, this undermines the normative power of the coercee’s will to consent to the terms of the proposal, and thus renders supposed consent ineffective, and thus undercuts their responsibility (Pallikkathayil 2011). Such moralized theories thus shift the explanatory burden from a theory of coercion to the background moral or normative theory they call upon to explain the effect of coercion on moral responsibility. Although there are some specific moralized or normative tests one might use to decide responsibility for action under coercion, it is unclear that any of them is robust enough to handle more than a fraction of the cases.[21]

One test of responsibility that might be proposed would limit the responsibility of someone acting under coercion if she acts in a way that minimizes the total amount of harm (invoking the “lesser-evil principle”). So, for instance, we might deny that a person is responsible for choosing to injure another to avoid being killed, but hold her responsible if she chooses to kill someone to avoid being injured herself. Though this principle is intuitively plausible, we clearly do not accept it in other, non-coercive contexts. For instance, we do not permit one to snatch a spare kidney from one individual to save the life of another. Although we might add conditions to this test to make the limitation of one’s responsibility harder to obtain, and therefore more in line with our intuitions, it remains unclear that there is any widely-accepted moral principle of this sort that would cover all cases equally well.

Instead of a moral test, one might propose a psychological test, on which acquiescing to a coercer’s demands in a way that harms others is justified if the net value of doing so is sufficiently great to the coercee. Roughly speaking, this is Feinberg’s approach, taken up by Murray and Dudrick as well. (See Feinberg 1986; and Murray and Dudrick 1995.) The point of such a standard is to recognize that some pressures on the will are too much to bear, without implying that in such cases it is literally impossible for the coercee to make choices because of an overborne will. The difficulty with this approach is that it lets the degree of inducement alone justify one’s yielding to it. A number of causes other than coercion can create extreme inducements to do harm to others; consider what some have done for fame, wealth, or love. Because most would be reluctant to accept that even extraordinarily tempting offers limit one’s responsibility for yielding to them, the magnitude of the inducement by itself seems not to suffice to explain our judgments of responsibility. Although we might add other conditions to restrict the limiting effect on responsibility exclusively to threats and not offers, if the justification lies in the pressure on the will, then it would seem one might have the same justification for yielding to temptation that one has for acquiescing to a mortal threat. (Note that some tempting offers have life or death riding on them.)

Law is sometimes required to make judgments about actions performed under necessity due to exigent circumstances. Sometimes persons harm the interests of others in order to save themselves or others from death or serious injury from causes beyond their control.[22] Coercion, however, presents a more complicated set of issues for making judgments of responsibility than do cases of natural necessity. Coercion involves a strategic and dynamic interaction between two agents — coercer and coercee — and the standard used to judge the coercee’s responsibility for acting under coercion can affect that strategic situation. The principles by which we judge a coercee’s responsibility for acquiescing to coercion may affect whether it is rational or productive for a would-be coercer to attempt coercion in the first place. (By comparison, in cases of bad luck and natural disaster, the situation is simpler because the behavior of the weather, unlike the behavior of coercers, is unaffected by the incentives facing those who might be pressured into acting under its power.) If we are permissive in limiting the responsibility of coercees, this will make acquiescing to coercion a more reasonable option; if instead we are stingy in limiting responsibility for harms caused under coercion, coercees may be much less likely to acquiesce to a coercer’s threats. But if a (would-be) coercer knows that a potential victim will be unyielding to his threats, then coercion becomes a less productive or reasonable means to use. So in choosing a principle that justifies coercees in acquiescing under coercion, we need to take into account that this principle may alter the dynamic between coercer and coercee in ways that may in turn affect the rationality and fruitfulness of using coercion.

There are, however, some cases in which coercion may alter an agent’s responsibility for what happens as a result of coercion that don’t raise the difficulties with justifications noted above. If, like some older ideas about coercion, we count uses of direct physical interference among the means of coercion — through restraint, incapacitation, or denial of essential means to achieve a purpose — then in some cases it is comparatively easy to see how coercion can provide an individual an excuse for things done or not done because of coercion (See Anderson 2010). Relying on the principle of “ought implies can,” when one cannot do something, this provides a good excuse for why one is not responsible for failing to do it. Related questions may arise about how one came to be incapacitated; for instance, if one fails to care for one’s children, and seeks to be excused for this neglect because one was incarcerated, we may want to know why one was incarcerated before crediting the excuse. Nonetheless, there will be some cases where the answers to these questions will show that the coercee played no role in his own incapacitation, and is therefore not to be held responsible for things the coercer caused him to do or not do.

Similarly, it is worth noting that there are some cases in which coercees may be justified, and not just excused, for acquiescing to threats, even if they do so calmly and deliberately. This sort of justification can be granted when the coercer has structured a coercee’s situation in such a way that the coercee’s will becomes essentially redundant to the outcome. If, for instance, a bouncer is able to remove a patron from the bar whether she likes it or not, then if the bouncer threatens to do so, her walking out of the bar in response to such a threat may be regarded as no more voluntary than her being carried out by force. When a coercer has the power to enforce his decision regardless of what the coercee chooses to do, this may provide the coercee a justification for failing to engage in an exercise in futility.[23] Generalizing this situation somewhat, Stephen Galoob and Erin Sheley argue that in contexts where a coercer has “coercive control” over a someone, such as in a long-term violent and abusive relationship, if such a coercer directs the coercee to act unlawfully, the criminal law should allow a legal defense for actions under the influence of such control. “A defendant should be entitled to a coercion-based defense when the coercer has usurped the target’s decisional authority—that is, when the coercer has usurped control over the target’s decision about what to do” (Galoob and Sheley 2021, 314).

An additional wrinkle with respect to responsibility under coercion arises in cases sometimes referred to as involving “third-party coercion”: where X coerces Y to consent to something that Z does to Y. For instance, a patient might consent to a medical procedure under pressure from family members (assuming such pressure rises to a level that qualifies as coercion), or a person might consent to have sex with someone due to threats of harm from an third party unconnected to the person who receives her consent. While it is generally agreed that a coercer’s threats invalidate any consent that the coercee might give to subsequent actions by the coercer, in third-party cases the consent is given to action by a bystander with respect to the coercion. Issues here may involve the extent to which the third-party is aware (or should be aware) of the coercee’s situation, the question of what action by the third-party would most benefit the coercee, and whether the third party seeks to take advantage of the coercee’s situation. Such cases have only recently received focused attention by philosophers, such as Joseph Millum and Mollie Gerver, though issues of this sort have been identified in applied ethics and in the context of international and humanitarian aid for some time (Millum 2014, Gerver 2021).

3.3 Coercion, freedom, and voluntariness

Some choices are said to be made freely, others unfreely, or involuntarily. More generally, people may be said to live more freely or less freely, depending on facts such as the range and quality of choices open to them, the extent to which they are immune to interference from outside powerful parties, or the extent to which they can pursue options of deep significance to them. Autonomy seems to be a special type of freedom which, insofar as it differs from the above types, is used to refer to an inner state of orderly self-directedness. Coercion has been thought to be inimical to at least some of these types of freedom, perhaps all, and also to have deleterious impacts on the special type we call autonomy.

If coercion includes uses of direct force against a person’s body, it is clear enough how it can constrain most kinds of freedom (though not necessarily how it can affect autonomy). But as Aquinas long ago noted, it’s unclear why coercion in the form of threats should be thought to be in tension with freedom. As Craig Carr puts the worry, “if at least some instances of coercion involve making choices, and if being able to make one’s own choices is part of what it means to be free, in what sense (if any) is coercion antithetical to freedom?” (Carr 1988, 59). Certainly many instances of coercion make one’s choices less appealing than they would be otherwise, or reduce the quality of the compossible options one has available. But it does sound somewhat odd to say that one is less free just because one’s choices have become less appealing, or some options for action have fallen off the menu of choices. Is there a sense we can give to the claim that one is less free because of coercion?

Let us consider first a type of freedom associated with the range and quality of actions open to a person. One gets an intuitive idea of this sort of freedom in comparing the situation of a prison inmate to that of someone outside prison. Someone confined to a cell around the clock has less freedom than does someone who is able to move about as she wills, interact with others in a variety of ways, and choose from a broad variety of activities (at least if she has available sufficient means to pursue them). We might be tempted to say that the unincarcerated person has more and better choices of actions. But several difficulties get in the way of making such a comparison precise. We lack a precise way to enumerate actions, which seems necessary if we are to count them or compare their number. The incarcerated and unincarcerated both have indeterminately many different things they can do, each can do only perform some small range of those actions at any one time. (It’s even likely that the incarcerated person can do some things the unincarcerated person can’t.[24]) So it is probably more helpful to focus on the greater quality and desirability of the actions open to the unincarcerated person. Being confined to a jail cell takes away one’s freedom at least in part because it denies one the necessary means to pursue many other activities that would ordinarily be desirable. But we also have no good means for reckoning the value of different actions interpersonally. So even this comparison is hard to make in a robust, defensible fashion.[25]

With some threats, it seems an interpersonal comparison is unnecessary. When the gunman demands one’s money or one’s life, one goes from being able to have both to being unable to have both. What were compossible goods have now become incompossible, and a valuable option (e.g., keeping one’s money) has become essentially foreclosed. So freedom is decreased (Day 1977, 259).

Focusing locally on the coercee’s situation, such analysis seems reasonable enough. However, it is possible that some general threats, made against a group of people, may make the individuals in the group more rather than less free. Consider the threats that are part of laws against stealing. The state may threaten to jail those who steal, which (let us assume) makes it incompossible both to steal and to retain one’s freedom. The possibility of a stable system of private property, however, would seem to depend on the existence of such laws which prohibit the wanton expropriation of the goods of others. If such a regime is in fact valuable, then the threat to incarcerate thieves may both reduce people’s freedom with respect to one sort of action (by making stealing incompossible with remaining unincarcerated), while enhancing it with respect to others (by making it possible to accumulate, use, and trade private property). For another example, notice that the ability to make enforceable contracts with others greatly enhances one’s abilities to gain through cooperation, but that it relies precisely on the fact that contracting parties give up certain seemingly compossible benefits (say, gaining the goods of another while failing to fulfill one’s half of the bargain).

Craig Carr suggests that we can grapple with the complexities here by noticing that many social interactions are regulated by conventions that arise from particular sorts of interpersonal relationships. So, for instance, a sports team is managed by a coach, who may “threaten” to pull a player out of the game unless he sticks to the game plan. But this threat does not, we may agree, lessen the player’s freedom in any interesting sense (Carr 1988, 62). Given the nature of sports, the roles of players and coaches, and the necessity of organization in making the team and sport possible, Carr suggests that when such threats are licensed by the appropriate conventions, then there is no reason to suppose that they impinge on freedom. It may be difficult in many cases to decide just what conventions are appropriate and controlling in a situation, but it seems reasonable to suppose that something like Carr’s analysis is helpful in understanding the relationship between threats and freedom in conventional contexts.

Serena Olsaretti argues for the importance of a distinction between acting freely and acting voluntarily, and holds that while (successful) coercion may not in fact affect a coercee’s freedom (if, say, a coercer is bluffing), it always affects their potential to act voluntarily. On her analysis, the extent of a person’s freedom is determined by their actual possibilities for action, while whether they act voluntarily depends on whether the agent’s actual action is acceptable to the agent. “A choice is voluntary if and only if it is not made because there is no acceptable alternative to it. Conversely, a claim that a person was forced to do x (she did x non-voluntarily) means that she did x because she had no acceptable alternative to it” (Olsaretti 2004, 139). Because credible threats make alternatives to the coercer’s desired activity unacceptable to the coercee, they vitiate the voluntariness of the coercee’s acquiescence, and amount to “forcing” the coercee to act as they do. Seeing such choices as forced whether or not unfree, Olsaretti argues, shows important similarities between coerced choices and other situations in which people’s choices are forced, such as in certain market conditions.

There’s a different way of thinking about freedom that is political in nature. This is the way of thinking that some (e.g., Pettit 1996) have associated with civic republicanism, in which freedom amounts to being undominated by another agent. One is dominated by another if it is continually possible for another party to step in and impose his will on one’s choices (even if the dominant party rarely finds it useful to do so). Freedom from domination differs from the previous sort in that one who is subject to the domination of another may in fact have a wide variety of valuable choices open to her. The sense in which she is unfree is that her choices must always be made with an eye towards retaining the favor of those in a position to interfere with her choices. Conversely, one may be undominated by anyone else, yet lack (for various reasons) many of the different valuable options that might be available to some who are highly subject to the power of others (e.g., adolescent children of wealthy parents, or prisoners in minimum-security facilities).

Garnett’s “eudaimonistic” understanding of coercion follows this line, holding that “what matters fundamentally for coercion is whether, in acting, one’s will is subject to, determined by, or under the control of the will of another, and not whether one’s prospective actions are blocked by the actions of another” (Garnett 2018, 554). He contrasts this understanding of “freedom-as-nonsubjection” to “freedom-as-nonprevention,” holding that there is a distinct good that involves not being subjected to interference by others, independently of whether this amounts to domination. Notably, Garnett holds that such subjection can be found in some cases of offers, where the offeror takes advantage of the offeree’s lack of an acceptable alternative.

Coercion is one method by which a powerful agent can exercise and maintain his dominance over another. When one has the power needed to credibly threaten another, one can use that power to impose one’s will on her regarding many choices (Anderson 2010). This power may give one the ability to dominate another in Pettit’s sense, since it can be used arbitrarily to alter or constrain another’s activities, even if it is in fact used only rarely. If one’s threats are sufficiently credible, and if meeting one’s demands is not devastating in itself, one may be able to leverage one’s powers to influence many of the activities of others, while only rarely being required to expend one’s powers in enforcement. Malignant governments and mafias are frequently able to maintain control over sizeable populations through threats and intimidation, though they may only infrequently interfere directly in the activities of others. If one’s powers and wishes are well enough known through past demonstrations, one may even be able to avoid making many overt threats while still getting one’s way.

This raises a question about whether the use of coercion requires or implies that the coercer is in a position of dominance over the coercee. While most would likely accept that one can coerce without having such dominance, this may be a rarer and more curious scenario than it at first appears. It is true that virtually anyone can state a claim that has the form of a threat against another, and it is also true that many agents can issue credible threats that are nonetheless bluffs — that is, can threaten without possessing the power that is advertised. Nonetheless, the possibility and usefulness of issuing threats depends in general on the likelihood that such threats can be executed successfully, without the coercer suffering a cost comparable to that of the coercee. Also, it would seem that for coercion to be possible, one must be in a position to do more than trivial damage to the coercee’s interests; otherwise, one might be said to use coercion when one threatens, e.g., to quit one’s minimum-wage fast-food job if one’s employer doesn’t raise one’s wage to match what one could make at the restaurant across the street. Moreover, coercers frequently need to craft and adapt their threats to the specific vulnerabilities of the coercee. Gideon Yaffe has nicely expressed this aspect of the relationship between the coercer’s power and their ability to affect one’s freedom:

The key to the explanation for the freedom-undermining force of coercion is that, as a general rule, coercers don’t merely produce, but also track, the compliance of their victims. … [T]he coercer is rarely attached to the particular nasty consequence that he threatens; with some limits, he is ready to bring about whatever consequences would serve to bring the victim around to compliance (Yaffe 2003).

If a coercer lacks the power needed to do these things, it may be irrational for the coercer to execute his threat if defied, and hence frequently irrational for the coercee to accede to it. So unless the coercer or coercee is irrational (and the other perceives him as such), or unless one is deceived about the other’s relative power (or rationality), coercion requires some significant differential in power between coercer and coercee for it, in general, to be a rational, useful technique. So even if a just state does not dominate its citizens in Pettit’s sense of exercising its power over them arbitrarily, it still must be capable of such dominance if it is to be able to keep order against those who would otherwise defy its commands. (For related arguments and an analysis of domination as the “impositional power” to impose one’s will arbitrarily on another, see McCammon 2015.)

3.4 Political/legal theory and coercion

As the historical section of this entry suggests, the relationship between states, law, and coercion has been a subject of vast discussion throughout Western philosophical history. Many of the most pressing issues belong to a discussion of states and law rather than to a discussion of coercion.[26] However, some theorists have attempted to draw some fairly revisionist lessons about politics and law from their theoretical discussions of coercion. This work is worth consideration here, since their conclusions may impact how we understand the nature of coercion, and its place in law and politics.

3.4.1 The coerciveness of law

As noted above, there are a number of accounts of coercion that insist that coercion is a violation of right, or otherwise normatively defective, of which Alan Wertheimer’s Coercion is the most prominent. But if coercion is necessarily immoral action, then it is hard to explain how an act of coercion could count as justified.[27] Among other implications, this view is in apparent contradiction with the traditional approach to coercion which treats states as paradigmatically, even necessarily users of coercion. As William Edmundson has pointed out (and as Nozick 1969, had noticed), if the state is justified in punishing wrongdoers, then when it threatens to do so, it does not threaten to make them worse off than they ought to be (Edmundson 1995 and 1998, chs. 4–6). Hence on an approach to coercion that insists it is immoral activity, the state’s use of police powers to enforce the law is not coercive.

Could this be right? It hinges, first, on whether one accepts a moralized analysis of coercion; if one can give a non-moralized account of coercion, then the grounds for the claim are much more tenuous. It would also seem to depend on whether the moral evaluation of the coercer’s action is an “all things considered” judgment, or merely a pro tanto one. While the government’s use of coercion may be all-things-considered morally benign, the threat of jailing someone may count as pro tanto wrong in a way that, say, paying a reward is not. If so, then even on a moralized account we may suppose that government coercion requires special justification before it can be accepted. Wertheimer, Haksar, Lamond, and Oberdiek, for instance, seem to find no problem accepting that there is “justified coercion” — that is, acts which are coercive on a moralized theory of coercion (baseline or otherwise), yet which are ultimately justified by other considerations (Oberdiek 1976; Haksar 1976; Wertheimer 1987; and Lamond 2000 and 2001). Edmundson, however, argues that such a view is unmotivated and not required by a moralized theory, properly understood. If he is right, then the uses of what are normally thought of as coercive techniques do not call for special scrutiny if they are constrained to the support of just, procedurally sound law.

Edmundson’s criticism of the canonical view of the state as coercive reveals a deeper root to some disagreements over coercion. In effect, Edmundson provides a reason to question how special or important coercion really is. Coercion may make some actions necessary, but human beings in any natural world will be constrained by necessities of many sorts: the physical limits of our bodies in our environments, and our needs for things such as nourishment, shelter, protection, and even perhaps community, recognition, and love. To be coerced adds to or alters in some ways what it is necessary for one to do. But being subject to a coercive set of laws might also provide one greater opportunities or freedom from necessity, as arguably the criminal law does, at least if well-drafted and enforced.[28] If just laws provide us protection from wrong-doers while leaving us at liberty to take any morally justifiable act (assuming here that the criminal law prohibits only unjust acts), then the law’s threatened use of force against lawbreakers may not merit any special scrutiny. We might instead regard it as a shifting, regularization, and rationalization of the necessities to which human beings are anyways subject. Edmundson and those he disputes with can all agree that coercion used for illicit ends is a matter of moral significance and a cause for special scrutiny and opposition. What Edmundson shows is that moralized approaches to coercion make it hard to see why the technique itself and the agents who can use it are especially worthy of our attention.

One might thus object to moralized accounts on the grounds that we have reason to track and scrutinize uses of this technique whether performed well or badly, justly or unjustly. This is because when an agent has the power to coerce willy nilly, as the state does, it is up to such an agent to decide what purposes it will use its powers for. Natural necessities are typically predictable, stable requirements on our actions, persisting without regard to us as individuals. By contrast, powerful agents are not necessarily predictable, stable, or indifferent to us as individuals. Rather, they can target and direct their powers to suit their purposes. Of course we hope that they are constrained by justice, but even mostly just governments are likely to enact bad laws or have rogue elements within them. Hence there is value in having a concept to pick out the sort of technique used in law enforcement, forced migrations, mafia protection rackets, back-alley robbery, and the training of some recalcitrant children, since one and the same state might use the same tools and techniques to engage any or all of these sorts of activities, with only the whim of the leader or parliament to decide which it shall be.

A slightly less radical, though still revisionist claim about the coerciveness of law, holds that the coerciveness of law resides in its claim to a right to use (or authorize the use of) enforcement power. Drawing a distinction between the state and its apparatuses on the one hand, and the law on the other, Grant Lamond argues that the coerciveness of law should not be thought to depend on the fact that the state has such things as police departments and prisons as its enforcement mechanisms. Rather, he argues that the coerciveness of law resides in its claim to a “right to authorize the enforcement of [its subjects duties, responsibilities, etc.]… It is not that legal duties are sanction-based, nor that every law must ultimately be linked to coercive measures, but that law claims the right to back up its directives with force” (Lamond 2001, 55). He later clarifies this view to point out that the law claims indeterminate authority to enforce its dictates.

Lamond’s aim in making this distinction is to clarify what he sees to be several possible confusions. First, he argues that the law’s coerciveness need not depend directly on the state’s own enforcement apparatus; the state might use vigilantes, private contractors, or other private means for this function.[29] Moreover, he aims to limit law’s responsibility for coercive acts to just those that it in fact authorizes: extra-legal uses of coercion by the state should not be chalked up to law’s coerciveness. He also argues that some of the coercive enforcements that law uses are not themselves uses of force; instead, one might confiscate bank accounts or take away rights in non-tangible property (such as intellectual property protections) as means to pressure subjects to comply with the law. Lamond holds that if such interventions exert sufficient pressure on the will of those considering a particular option, such that they change course, then they may be counted as coercive, even if they do not involve the threat or imposition of sanctions conditioned on the activities of the people governed (Lamond 2000, 56–57). Lastly, like Edmundson, he aims to downplay the supposed role that coercion plays in our appreciation of the law, holding that many of law’s functions do not depend specifically on its function of authorizing (or not authorizing) enforcements on the subjects. “It is easy to exaggerate the role of coercion in maintaining the efficacy of the legal system, and to overestimate its capacity to sustain efficacy” (Lamond 2001, 57).

Lamond’s claim about law’s coerciveness stems from a number of considerations, but undoubtedly one is his understanding of the nature of coercion itself, which was discussed in Section 2.5 above. Whether or not his account of coercion is tenable, what Lamond says about why law is coercive generates independent difficulties. Even if the law claims to authorize the enforcement of its subjects’ duties, it is not clear why the mere claiming of such authorization would suffice to make the claiming coercive. The laws of a state may well provide for and instruct agencies or mechanisms to serve as its enforcers (e.g., police, vigilantes, or robots); but if these enforcers quit, or are bought/killed/shut off, the coerciveness of the law will quickly evaporate. If, for instance, the army decides to side with the protestors rather than the government, the law loses its force in a hurry, no matter how legitimate. Moreover, were a private association or other institution to “lay claim” to use such indeterminately bounded enforcement powers, what would determine whether in fact they ended up being coercive is whether in fact they managed to engage in enforcement activities through agencies or mechanisms similar to those that states regularly use, or so Lucas points out. (Lucas 1966, 61–2) A church, for instance, might even leverage its threats with claims about the final disposition of one’s mortal soul. But this sort of claim to reward and punish does not give the church the ability to coerce, at least as this concept is usually understood in political contexts.

Some have argued directly that law does not require coercive backing in order to count as law (e.g., Raz 1975), holding that what is instead important is that law is made by the appropriate authority (see also Oberdiek 1976). Going further than this, Robert Hughes argues that there can be laws a state is entitled to make but not entitled to enforce. “Whether a government is entitled to enforce any given legal restriction coercively depends on concrete empirical facts, not only on abstract truisms about human nature, and on moral features of the restriction in question” (Hughes 2013, 184). Such empirical factors on Hughes’ account include whether compliance can be obtained through non-coercive means, and what the costs of using coercion to secure compliance would be. Responding to Joseph Raz, Edmundson, and Lamonde, inter alia, Ekow Yankah defends the traditional view connecting law and coercion, contending that “Legal norms must be ultimately enforceable by coercion to be included in the core concept of the law” (Yankah 2008, 1198). After developing his own non-moralized conception of coercion, Yankah argues that law requires not only authority but the ability to compel obedience. There are, after all, many different possible normative systems, for example religious ones, that claim to have moral authority to command obedience, but law is distinctive among them because it has the possibility to compel compliance with the edicts of justified authorities. Countering Raz’s view that coercion might be merely instrumentally needed, Yankah asserts, “the inability of any structure to even theoretically compel [a lawbreaker] to obey would cast serious doubt on the system’s claim to be the law” (Yankah, 2008, 1236; for others on this side of the dispute see Himma 2016 and Woodbury-Smith 2020).

3.4.2 The coerciveness of states

Moving from the question of how law relates to coercion to the broader question of how states and politics more generally relate to coercion, there are a number of ways that political theory addresses the role of coercion as a tool of statecraft, and offers arguments about how coercion conditions the scope and legitimacy of political action. Max Weber famously defined the state in terms of its legitimate monopolization of physical coercive force within a territory:

A political organisation will be called a “ruling organisation” to the extent that its existence and the validity of its orders can be continually guaranteed within a given geographical area by the application and threat of physical coercion by an administrative staff. An institutionally organised political enterprise (Anstaltsbetrieb) will be called a state if, and to the extent that, its administrative staff can lay claim to a monopoly of legitimate physical force in the execution of its orders (Weber 2019 [1921], §17, 135–136; See also Weber 1946 [1921]).

Liberals, broadly construed, have been impressed with the power of the state and its potential both for misuse as well as partisan domination over and sectarian interference with dissenters, and thus have identified its employment of coercion as generating a distinctive set of political concerns. For instance, G. E. M. Anscombe argues that if states are to be distinguished from mafias, it is only because they may, if well ordered, earn authority over their subjects, which she understands as “a right to be obeyed” (Anscombe 1981, 132). Judith Shklar, in her “Liberalism of Fear,” draws attention to the distinctiveness and historical rarity of the modern liberal state as one in which the power of the government is constrained by foreswearing the use of cruelty and fear as tools of statecraft (Shklar 1989). Others, such as Charles Larmore and Gerald Gaus, take coercion to be a distinctively problematic interpersonal imposition. Hence, because states are understood to be the preeminently coercive agents, the justification of the state depends in significant part on whether there is sufficient justification for its use of coercion to secure compliance with its decisions (see Larmore 1996, ch. 6; Gaus 2003).

Echoing Weber, in A Theory of Justice, Rawls distinguishes the “legal system” of a state by “its comprehensive scope and its regulative powers with respect to other associations. The constitutional agencies that it defines generally have the exclusive legal right to at least the more extreme forms of coercion. The kinds of duress that private associations can employ are strictly limited” (Rawls 1999 [1971], 207), and “By enforcing a public system of penalties government removes the grounds for thinking that others are not complying with the rules. For this reason alone, a coercive sovereign is presumably always necessary, even though in a well-ordered society sanctions are not severe and may never need to be imposed” (Rawls 1999 [1971], 211). In his later Justice as Fairness: A Restatement, he regards coercion as an intrinsic feature of state political activity: “Political power is always coercive power applied by the state and its apparatus of enforcement” (Rawls 2001, 40). He goes so far as to suggest that if people in a society could attain their goods harmoniously, without resorting to private coercion or relying on public coercion to resolve conflicts, it would be “a society in a certain sense beyond justice. It has eliminated the occasions when the appeal to the principles of right and justice is necessary” (Rawls 1999 [1971], 249). Rawls goes on to argue for the importance of justice as the primary regulative virtue of the basic structure and institutions that determine the distribution of benefits and burdens to members of society (Rawls 1999 [1971], 4).

Although Rawls does not offer a detailed explication or defense of his understanding of coercion, due to the outsized influence of his political theory, his thinking about the place of coercion in politics has set the terms for several debates in this area. One issue that bears the distinctive mark of his thinking is whether and why the principal object of justice is the basic structure of a society, and how that structure should be delimited. Expressed in terms somewhat less specific to Rawls, we may query whether the state is distinctly a user of coercion, and what difference this might make to the question of its activities should be regulated. Another area for inquiry considers whether there are special limits to a state’s use of coercion, and/or whether it needs to meet some special condition for its justification (for this way of structuring the concerns here, see Kolodny 2017 and 2018). Some, following Rawls, argue that some form of public justification that speaks to all reasonable members of society is required to justify the state’s use of coercion; others reject this requirement, while supporting other grounds of justification instead. And still others hold that the state’s use of coercion does not require distinctive justification or need to be limited to only a specific range of purposes. A third line of inquiry asks whether there are implications from the state’s use of coercive power for determining the scope of the obligations of justice. Some, again following Rawls, hold that because members of a single polity are mutually subject to the power of coercion that they materially facilitate, they have distinctive obligations of distributive justice to one another that do not apply to those not similarly part of the same polity. Others object to this argument on a number of grounds.

3.4.3 Are states distinctively coercive?

The first set of inquiries here concerns whether the state’s coercive activities are distinctively coercive, compared to other social institutions and practices. One reason Rawls offers for applying his principles of justice to the “basic structure” of society (which includes such things as the political constitution, the major social institutions and practices that structure human relationships, such as the family) is “because its effects are so profound and present from the start” (Rawls 1999 [1971], 7). While it appears clear that the state, via its coercive determination of law and institutions like the economic system, constitutes much of the “basic structure,” it is hardly the only source of profound constraining effects on the lives of its subjects. This point is pressed by G. A. Cohen, who argues regarding Rawls’s principles of justice that their application should not be limited to just those parts of the “basic structure” of society that are the outgrowth of the state’s coercive institutions. Cohen then argues that a social institution such as the structure of the family is something that is largely determined by conventional social practices rather than by the coercively-backed laws of the state. Yet few aspects of a society’s structure will have more profound effects on the life prospects and possibilities for action than the way family structures are organized. Since these are not defined by the state’s coercive apparatus (or so Cohen suggests), there’s no reason why the principles of justice should be limited to regulating just the parts of the social structure that owes its existence to the state’s coercive impetus (Cohen 1997). Whether or not one holds that the social structures one is born into, such as a particular set of family arrangements, count as coercive, their structure is largely outside the bounds of the state coercive enforcement, even though they constrain choice and possibility in a way little different from state coercive decisions.

While accepting that the family, in some of its aspects, should be counted within the “basic structure” and thus is accountable to principles of justice, Blain Neufeld argues that there is good reason to restrict concern with social justice to just those social institutions that are “organized and maintained through the collective exercise of coercive power” (Neufeld 2009, p. 37). The state’s use of power is distinctive in two ways: it is an activity of the whole collective body, so requires justification to all of those who are part of that body. And the whole of that society is subject to it; it is normally very difficult or impossible for individuals to exempt themselves from a state’s coercive jurisdiction. The use of coercion here is not arbitrary, since the functioning of these public institutions depends on their being able to provide assurance to society’s members that everyone will be subject to the same terms and obligations, and that their contributions and cooperation will be reciprocated by others (Neufeld 2009, 43). While other social institutions in a well-ordered society, such as religions or cultural institutions, may have profound effects of many members of a society, it remains possible for individual to reject their authority and jurisdiction. Hence they are “voluntary” associations in a way that the state is not (Neufeld 2009, 42).

Neufeld, following Susan Moller Okin (See Okin 1994 and 2005), argues that in Rawls’ later writings he treats the structure of the family in particular as more like one of these voluntary associations, rather than properly part of the basic structure, and so does not fall within the scope of principles of justice. However, Neufeld points out that in contemporary liberal states there are a wide range of coercive laws and state-organized facilities that regulate family structure and the possibilities for association there, thus making it much more an effect of state coercive power than are religions, cultural associations, and many other forms of private association. Thus the state is more directly implicated in the structure of the family than Rawls or Cohen seem to register. (See here also Brake 2012 for the ways in which state power constitutes legal marriage.)

3.4.4 Does state coercion need special justification?

A different aspect of Rawls’ approach holds that coercion is itself a distinctive political activity, and distinctively in need of justification to the members of a polity. Rawls here accepts what seems to be a broadly held view that coercion is an especially problematic way for one party or entity to treat another party, which, if right, makes the issue of how to justify its use by the state pressing. One might ground this view in the concern Kant expresses in the “formula of humanity”: “So act that you use humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means” (Kant 1997 [1787], AK 4:429). To coerce someone appears to be a paradigmatic way of overriding their own decision about what they should do, and directing their will to serve one’s own purposes, rather than purposes of their own, thus treating them solely as a means rather than as an end themselves. As Charles Larmore puts the point, “the distinctive feature of persons is that they are beings capable of thinking and acting on the basis of reasons. If we try to bring about conformity to a political principle simply by threat, we will be treating people solely as means, as objects of coercion. We will not also be treating them as ends, engaging directly their distinctive capacity as persons” (Larmore 1996, 137; see also Pallikkathayil 2016, 174).

For this reason, many liberals hold that state coercion must be subjected to some further constraint or justification that that explains how at least some exercises of coercion are consistent with treating those who are coerced as ends in themselves, and not merely means. Perhaps the dominant approach is one Gerald Gaus and Christopher J. Eberle have called “justificatory liberalism” (which Eberle associates also with the work of liberals such as Rawls, Larmore, and Robert Audi) which makes the justification of coercion its central mission. “The claim that respect requires public justification provides a basis for the central component of the justificatory liberal’s ethic of citizenship: the norm of respect imposes an obligation on each citizen to discipline herself in such a way that she resolutely refrains from supporting any coercive law for which she cannot provide the requisite public justification” (Eberle 2002, 12, emphasis omitted; see also Gaus 2010).

There is now a very large literature, arising out of Rawls-interpretive scholarship, attempting and criticizing this justificatory task, which extends well beyond the issues raised by state coercion; this entry is not suited to address it in any detail. (See instead the Stanford Encyclopedia entries on “Public Reason,” “Public Justification,” “Liberalism” and “Political Legitimacy.”) But relevant here are some rebuttal arguments that reject or qualify the claim that the state’s use of coercion is especially in need of such justification. Several authors have argued that state uses of coercion are not necessarily problematic in a way that encumbers them with a special justificatory burden, or at least not a burden that is owed to those subjected to state coercion.

In response to the presumption against state coercion that motivates the liberal justificatory projects, Andrew Lister raises a number of objections to such a presumption (Lister 2010). While Lister acknowledges that paternalistic uses of coercion—aimed at the well-being of those coerced—would be hard to justify against those whose choices are overridden for their own good, he argues that other exercises of state coercion may be more defensible than the “reasonable rejectability” test would seem to allow. He argues that although there may be disagreements based in publicly acceptable reasons about whether a particular use of coercion may be warranted or desirable, a polity’s citizens might reasonably agree to accept, say, authorizing a government to enact a set of coercive policies (which may include some that some individuals would reject), rather than requiring that each individual policy be tested for reasonable rejectability, which might result in all of them being rejected by someone or another. That is, it may be reasonably unrejectable to adopt as a compromise a process that enacts some coercive state policies that are, as a package, preferred by everyone in comparison to a situation in which nearly all uses of coercion are disabled by one or another party’s specific reasonable objection to it. This solution is one Joseph Chan, developing the idea from Thomas Nagel, calls the “principle of higher-order unanimity”: if people can and should unanimously agree that a state must use coercion out of practical necessity, then this principle can be adopted as reasonably unrejectable, and then used to justify specific coercive policies even if some citizens might subsequently have reasonable objections to those particular policies (Chan 2000, Nagel 1995).

Lister defends this proposal against objections from Gaus’s liberal neutrality (Gaus 2003) that hold state coercion to be distinctively problematic, and so demand that every coercive state action be individually vetted for reasonable rejectability. For one thing, Lister points out that policies that invoke state coercion may differ in their acceptability depending on what other policies are in place. He offers as an illustration that it may be reasonable to favor stronger property rights against the state in a society with broadly egalitarian distribution of wealth, whereas it may be more justifiable to allow eminent domain to override property owners’ rights where there is broad inequality of ownership and little redistributive taxation (Lister 2010, 158). Moreover, state coercion is often used to combat private coercion, or other harms of a similarly disruptive character; it is not obvious that we should prefer a state that allows private coercion to one that uses coercion itself against private coercion. Furthermore, Lister argues, it is also unclear how to measure the extent of coercion as an output of a state’s policy choices, which is another obstacle to a presumption against state coercion for the sake of avoiding coercion more generally.

Colin Bird also argues against the view that being coerced by the state is a distinctive ground necessitating that coercers justify their actions to the coercees. He argues that other ways in which a majority might exclude equal protection to minorities not involving coercion would be similarly problematic, suggesting that the problem with state coercion is not specifically due to the effect of coercion on those coerced. For instance, if a state organized a voluntary cash lottery to fund some sectarian mission, making it independent of the use of taxation, he argues that this would raise similar problems of reasonable rejectability by those whose interests are ignored by this program. Moreover, he notes that objections to coercion need not be due to its effect on those coerced: people might even reasonably object to a coercive policies even if they are immune to that coercion, as a male might reasonably object to laws forbidding abortion even if he is not liable to suffer its enforcement (Bird 2014, 198). Bird instead thinks that because the state acts on behalf of all of its citizens, the requirement of public justification attaches to its decision because they speak on behalf of everyone, and so should be justifiable to all as co-authors of those decisions. But this then severs the need for public justification from the coercive quality of some of those decisions.

In a similar vein, Niko Kolodny and Christopher Morris contest the significance of the state’s use of coercion to the question of whether state power can be legitimate by liberalism’s lights. Kolodny registers the concerns of civic republicans that it’s the state’s superior power to coerce that makes it suspect. However, he thinks that this is based in a misdiagnosis of the concern about the state; our worry about the state would be justified even if the state maintained its supremacy without the use of coercion, but rather just had widespread public assent to its decisions. Ultimately, he holds that concern with coercion stems more from how the power of the state seems to impugn the equality and self-sovereignty of the members of society, and not from any special threat it poses to the freedom of its subjects (Kolodny 2016, 2017 and 2018). Morris argues coercion is just one tool that states use to gain compliance with their decisions. Possessing “authority” is sufficient to gain compliance in many decisions from at least many people, and so is similarly in need of justification if coercion is. “One does not understand law and, more generally, states if one does not see coercion and force as supplementary to authority. Coercion and force are needed when the state’s claimed authority is unappreciated, defective, or absent. Unjust states, recognized widely as such, will need to rely heavily on force; just states presumably need much less force” (Morris 2012, 40 (Morris’ emphasis)). On these views, then, even if state coercion requires justification, it isn’t a distinctively important factor in need of special justification.

Lastly, Pallikkathayil argues that the question of how state coercion can be justified to those coerced is wrongly posed. Developing a Kantian approach (similar to that elaborated at greater length by Arthur Ripstein in Ripstein 2009), Pallikkathayil argues that states are instituted to allow people to live their lives in association with others in a way that allows all to be mutually independent through a system of rights that prevent unjust interference in one another’s choices. States are required in order to specify those rights, adjudicate claims in the breach, and enforce those judgments so people may rely on them. With this story as background, Pallikkathayil asks:

[W]hat I am doing when I coerce someone by subjecting her to liberal political institutions and laws. I am actually trying to treat her as independent by putting her in the only circumstances in which she can be free to live her life as she sees fit consistently with everyone else doing so as well. And this remains the case even if she reasonably disagrees with me about the justification for the state just given. So, on this view, what is distinctive about permissible coercion is that it is consistent with—and in the case of the state’s use of coercion, needed for—mutual independence, rather than that it makes contact with the viewpoints of others in a particular way. (Pallikkathayil 2016, 177)

Pallikkathayil then argues that this account of the function of a state, with coercion being an essential tool for it to carry out this function, has the advantage of restricting uses of state power to those that facilitate or at least are compatible with this aim of mutual independence, while providing a justification for necessary coercion that doesn’t depend on the particular values of the society’s members. “[A]n advantage of the Kantian’s account of permissible coercion is that it looks to capture what is intuitively most problematic about impermissible coercion. Impermissible coercion involves trying to make a decision for another that one is not entitled to make. The possibility that we might disagree about what decision to make is orthogonal to this concern” (Pallikkathayil 2016, 183). Hence, similar to the way the Nagel/Lister appeal to a principle of higher-order unanimity short-cuts the need to justify specific policies involving coercion, Pallikkathayil’s Kantian approach justifies the coerciveness of the state more generally, with justification of specific coercive policies coming in at a subsidiary step where the use of coercion is already pre-cleared, in a sense.

3.4.5 Does state coercion generate special obligations for its citizens?

The third topic arising from Rawls’ framework is the issue of whether participation in a society governed by a coercive state generates distinctive obligations to co-nationals, because of that mutual susceptibility to coercion, or whether political obligations are unaffected by this mutual susceptibility. Rawls famously limited the applicability of the principles of justice to the boundaries of a single polity, “a closed system isolated from other societies” (Rawls 1999 [1971], 7; see also Rawls 1993); relations between different polities and people across borders were taken to be governed according to other principles. For Rawls, the subject of justice is “the major social institutions [that] distribute fundamental rights and duties and determine the division of advantages from social cooperation,” (Rawls 1999 [1971], 6), the principles of justice apply only to those united in a society that forms the basis of such social cooperation.

While this limitation has been contested, Michael Blake and Mathias Risse argue that it can be supported by consideration of the coercive nature of the state. The necessity of state coercion puts citizens of a single state in a kind of relationship to one another that differs from their relationship to those outside their state. Blake holds that a duty to promote economic equality as a matter of justice “is a plausible interpretation of liberal principles only when those principles are applied to individuals who share liability to the coercive network of state governance” (Blake, 2002, 258). Risse similarly accepts that states (though not just states) may bear special obligations to those they govern due to their use of coercion over those under their authority (Risse 2006). Risse however stresses that it is the immediacy of the sort of legal and political coercion states exercise over their subjects that gives those subjects special claim to just treatment from their states and fellow citizens.

Thomas Nagel reasons likewise to a similar conclusion, and extends it to justify the exclusion of immigrants from a state. “Immigration policies are simply enforced against the nationals of other states; the laws are not imposed in their name, nor are they asked to accept and uphold those laws. Since no acceptance is demanded of them, no justification is required that explains why they should accept such discriminatory policies, or why their interests have been given equal consideration. It is sufficient justification to claim that the policies do not violate their prepolitical human rights” (Nagel 2005, 129–30). Against this view, the use of coercion to exclude non-citizens from a state has been argued to violate basic rights (Huemer 2010) and principles of democratic theory (Abizadeh 2008; for objections and replies, see Miller 2009 and 2010; and Abizadeh 2010). As the next section will further explore, coercion across state borders is also a contentious issue.

In response to positions like that of Blake, Risse, and Nagel, Andrea Sangiovanni argues that people do not accrue special obligations to their fellow citizens just because they are mutually and non-voluntarily liable to being coerced for the sake of their common well-being (Sangiovanni 2012). While justice may constrain what sort or extent of coercive “will-bending” can be justified, Sangiovanni argues that being mutually subjected to coercion does not change what obligations one has to others similarly situated. While not ruling out that there may be obligations arising from being members of the same society, if such members have more demanding obligations to share the wealth with fellow members than with outsiders, this can’t be explained just by their common subjection to coercion. (For a reply to Sangiovanni friendly to Blake’s position, see MacKay 2016.)

For a discussion of the sub-legal and super-legal uses of coercion in domestic and international settings, see the supplementary document:

Applications for Theories of Coercion


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Other Internet Resources


I am indebted to Thomas Pogge for numerous helpful suggestions and clarifications to this entry. Jerry Tsui provided research assistance and the Social Sciences and Humanities Research Council (SSHRC) of Canada provided financial support that contributed to the 2022 update.

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