Robert Desgabets

First published Fri Mar 23, 2001; substantive revision Mon May 22, 2023

Dom Robert Desgabets (1610–1678) was an early defender and teacher of the Cartesian philosophy at St. Maur in the region of Lorraine, France. He was born in Ancemont and in 1636 became a monk in the Benedictine order. He taught theology at Saint-Evre at Toul between 1635–1655 and served as Procurer General of Mihiel to Paris during 1648–49. Although he is little-known today, he played an important role in the development and transmission of the Cartesian philosophy, especially in Paris and Toulouse. He is best known for his part in the theological controversy over the Cartesian explication of the Eucharist (Desgabets, 1671), and for his defense of Nicolas Malebranche against the skeptic Simon Foucher (Desgabets, 1675). His major philosophical writings were not published until 1983.[1] His contributions in natural philosophy include pioneering work in the study of blood transfusion and mechanics. His unusual marriage of Cartesianism and empiricism challenges many standard views of Descartes and the Cartesian philosophy.

1. Life and Writings

Although Robert Desgabets (1610–1678) is perhaps the most original of the Cartesian thinkers, even lauded by his most famous student, Pierre-Sylvain Régis, as “one of the greatest metaphysicians of our century” (Regis, 1704, 328), only one book and two small works were published anonymously during his lifetime.[2] His correspondence indicates that he was interested in mechanics before 1644, prior to his acquaintance with the writings of Descartes. For a metaphysical thinker like Desgabets, it was Descartes, not Galileo or Bacon, who offered a new and complete philosophic system. In Desgabets’s estimation, the only legitimate rival system to Descartes’s was the one developed by Pierre Gassendi, but in the final analysis, the “new scientific discoveries” weighed decisively in Descartes’s favor.

In 1658 Desgabets participated in the Cartesian conferences held at M. de Montmort’s where he reportedly participated in discussions with Rohault, Clerselier, and Cordemoy. Desgabets delivered a lecture which outlined his invention of an apparatus and procedure for blood transfusion, but he seems to have abandoned its study shortly thereafter. In 1667, after a controversy erupted between the English and the French over who first invented the procedure, a French physician by the name of Jean Denis was spurred to publish the written version of Desgabets’s lecture. This appeared in 1668, four years after the physicians Clark and Henshaw of England had attempted the operation on animals without success (Desgabets, 1668). Prior to this research, in 1656, Christopher Wren successfully injected medications directly into the veins of animals, after which in 1665, another Englishman and physician, Richard Lower, a teacher and friend of John Locke, successfully injected blood into animals using this same method. Genevieve Rodis-Lewis has sorted out many of the details of this history and shows that the two procedures created by Lower and Desgabets are so different as to confirm the independence of their inventions (Rodis-Lewis, 1974). But whether and when Desgabets experimented with his procedure has not been firmly established. What is evident, however, is that Desgabets, like Wren, was inspired by Harvey’s discovery of the circulation of blood. Once Harvey had shown how the circulation of blood is best understood as a mechanistic process operating according to lawful movements, he opened the way for blood transfusion to be understood along similar lines, as a species of the communication of movement. Where evidence of Desgabets’s actual experimentation with blood transfusion is lacking, his descriptions of it show that he was aware of the possibility of shock if the quantities transferred were too great for the subject (Rodis-Lewis, 1974).

Throughout his lifetime Desgabets engaged in many theological and philosophical controversies with distinguished seventeenth-century thinkers such as Mabillon, Rapin, Foucher, Malebranche, Cordemoy, Arnauld and Poisson. One of his more famous interlocutors was the Cartesian Gérauld de Cordemoy (1626–1684). Despite his admiration for Cordemoy, Desgabets was dismayed by the atomism in the Discernement du corps et de l’âme (1666), a copy of which had been sent to him by Clerselier. Desgabets subsequently wrote to Clerselier, opposing Cordemoy’s arguments for the existence of the void and against the infinite divisibility of extension. In an unpublished letter to Clerselier, Desgabets comments that the marriage of Cartesian and anti-Cartesian elements in this work formed an irreconcilable schism in the Cartesian philosophy. (Prost, 1907, 158) Although Desgabets himself was not one to adopt Cartesianism in its entirety, in his view his criticisms perfected and maintained the integrity of the Cartesian principles, while Cordemoy’s adoption of atoms and the void was a direct affront to the Cartesian metaphysics.[3]

Another, much more scandalous exchange took place between Desgabets and Thomas Le Géant between 1671–1672 over Desgabets’s thoughts on the Eucharist. Desgabets published his views anonymously in Considérations sur l’état présent de la controverse touchant le T. S. Sacrement de l’autel (1671). Lemaire credited this work with having been the primary cause of the persecution of Cartesianism in France, since it brought to light the incompatibility of the Cartesian philosophy with the official Church doctrine on the mystery of the Eucharist (Lemaire, 1901, 124). Desgabets had entered the on-going debate regarding Christ’s real presence in the host in 1654 at Clerselier’s request. Desgabets set out to defend the Cartesian doctrine of material substance against the Peripatetic doctrine of substantial forms in his explication of real presence and transubstantiation. Clerselier and Rohault had defended Descartes’s ideas on the subject along similar lines, but no one had been willing, either privately or publicly, to argue as Desgabets eventually did, that the body of Christ is extended in the host. In addition, Desgabets’s persistence and perhaps even imprudence, pushed the issue into the open. For, it was shortly after the publication of the anonymous Considérations that Desgabets sent additional writings on the topic to Abbey Le Roi, who communicated them to Nicole and Arnauld. The latter found Desgabets’s views dangerous and completely against tradition. It was through his acquaintance with Nicole and Arnauld, that the non-Cartesian Le Géant learned of the document and the identity of its author. Le Géant alerted the Procurer General of the Congregation of Benedictines, who ordered Desgabets to report to his superiors concerning the matter. This led to an interrogation and the subsequent issuance of an order on the 15th of December 1672, which demanded that Desgabets renounce his views on the Eucharist (Armogathe, 1977, 104–105; Lemaire, 1901, 51; 127–128). Desgabets obeyed and retreated to a monastery at Breuil. Fortunately this did not end his philosophical productivity. The controversy attracted the attention of Cardinal de Retz, who was known for his radical spirit of reform among conservative ecclesiastics in France. Cardinal de Retz, who was a partisan of the new Cartesian philosophy, provided protection for Desgabets and invited him to the Cartesian conferences held at Chateau de Commercy. It was here that Desgabets criticized and corrected what he saw as the errors of Descartes, and completed his “indefectibility thesis,” which he had started in 1653–1654.

Desgabets’s last published work, Critique de la critique de la Recherche de la vérité (1675), was intended as a defense of Malebranche against the skeptic Simon Foucher. The controversy began with the publication of Malebranche’s Recherche de la Verité (1674), followed by Foucher’s critique, Critique de La Recherche de la Verité (1675), and Desgabets’s rejoinder, Critique de la Critique de La Recherche de la Verité (1675). Foucher presses Malebranche on a number of issues he sees as errors of dogmatism, centering on how ideas can be said to represent external objects to us. Foucher argues that ideas fail to represent if ideas share no likeness or similitude to their objects. Desgabets replies that ideas have an intentional or representational resemblance not a strict resemblance in the sense in which a painting pictures its subject. Desgabets’s response on behalf of Malebranche did not settle the controversy, nor was it appreciated by Malebranche himself. Malebranche wrote that although he was pleased with the person, he was not pleased with the contents of his book; he further lamented that Desgabets ought to have better understood his ideas before taking on a defense. Desgabets himself was never to see Malebranche’s scolding assessment which was published in the “Advertissement” of the third edition of the Search After Truth (Malebranche, 1958–84, v2, 500–503). Desgabets died at Breuil on March 13, 1678, just fourteen days before it appeared.

Desgabets’s most important philosophical text, Supplément à la philosophie de M. Descartes (1675), was intended as a supplement to Descartes’s Meditationes de prima philosophia (1641). In this work, Desgabets examines many of Descartes’s important doctrines and arguments. Desgabets defends the Cartesian doctrines of sensible qualities, matter as extended substance and mind as thinking substance, mind-body dualism, mind-body union and interaction in man, while criticizing Descartes’s argument for the cogito as the first principle of knowledge, as well as Descartes’s arguments for pure intellection, innate ideas, and ideas having objective reality (pure possibility). What is particularly interesting is the central importance that Desgabets gives to the role of sensation in knowledge, and his development of Descartes’s treatment of truth as both eternal and immutable but in some sense (one much contested in the literature) contingent. Desgabets more than once remarks in this work that “M. Descartes is not always a good Cartesian,” which typifies his conviction that Cartesianism is more than the sum of the particulars set down by Descartes himself.

Viewing Desgabets’s work as a whole, there is no doubt that what he viewed as a revision or perfection of the Cartesian philosophy others have viewed as a fundamental departure. In his favor, he never strayed from the Cartesian metaphysics, i.e., its substance dualism of mind and matter, substance-mode ontology, mind-body union and interaction, and the view that extension is the essence of matter and thought the essence of mind; and he remained loyal to the Cartesian physics against the atomists. However, heretically to some, he strongly rejected several key rationalist doctrines which often dominate in Descartes and argued that Descartes’s own principles favor a sensory foundation for knowledge.

2. Metaphysics

Desgabets has been variously described as an “orthodox Cartesian” for the fidelity with which he defended Descartes against his critics (Watson, 1966; 1987), and a “radical Cartesian” for the originality of his ideas in the development of the Cartesian philosophy (Schmaltz, 2002; Adriaenssen, 2015). On the side of orthodoxy, we can see Desgabets’s adoption of the new Cartesian philosophy in his adherence to the core Cartesian metaphysics of dualism, mechanism, and union, and his various critiques of Scholastic doctrines. On the side of radicalism, Desgabets took up arguments and ideas that would be difficult if not impossible to reconcile with Descartes’s published philosophy. There is Desgabets’s argument that the body is essential for all operations of the human mind making innate ideas impossible, his defense of the intentionality principle, and his controversial doctrine of indefectibility especially with respect to matter, and his unorthodox defense of the “Creation Doctrine.” Notably, as Malfara and Lennon have argued, there is Desgabets’s development of the metaphysics of matter in the Eucharist controversy, which serves as a fascinating philosophical and theological litmus test for Desgabets’s Radical Cartesianism (Malfara & Lennon, 2023)

Desgabets subscribed completely to the Cartesian doctrine of matter as a substance extended in length, width, and breadth. It was posited against the prevailing Peripatetic view that posits prime matter and substantial forms in order to explain the permanence underlying the continuous change matter undergoes. On Descartes’s view, the essence of matter is its extension in three dimensions, and all of its changing attributes, properties and modes, such as movement, rest, figure, situation and composition of parts, are completely dependent upon and follow from this unified extension (OPD 2, 27). Matter, or corporeal substance, is clearly known when it is viewed as the geometrical object of mathematicians, as a magnitude extended in length, width and breadth. Likewise, corporeal bodies are best viewed as the movements, rest, figures, arrangements and sizes of which corporeal substance is capable, and which, in its various configurations and assemblages, “… now pass for the form of all particular bodies of which the world is composed” (OPD 1, 3). And, in all of this, “… there is nothing which is not governed by the laws of mechanics” (OPD 2, 4).

Furthermore, Desgabets viewed bodies as portions or divisions of matter, which in the case of animals are highly delicate and organized machines composed of an infinite number of parts capable of an infinite diversity of movements. He held this view against that of the Peripatetics who believed that there must be an internal principle of thought in beasts because of the intricacy and apparent human-like intelligence of their movements. According to Desgabets, the kind of thinking that attributes such an internal principle to beasts is the same kind of thinking that results in the attribution of intelligence to clocks, “However, the same affront to reason and philosophy is committed by the Americans and the Barbarians of the Orient who not being able to understand the mechanical reasons for the movement of clocks, or the true causes of natural effects, attribute souls and intelligence to machines, and likewise to fire, lakes etc., and in doing so expose themselves to the mockery of Europeans” (OPD 4, 132–133). In other words, no appeal to internal principles, or final causes is required to explain the movements of beasts, any more than it is needed to explain the movements of clocks. The complexity of movements, whether involved in the operations of clocks or those of animate bodies, is explicable in purely mechanistic terms.

Likewise, all motions communicated within or between material bodies are effected by physical contact and proceed according to the laws of local motion. Desgabets was careful to emphasize that the ultimate source of movement is not matter but God, who imparted motion to the universe in its creation. For Desgabets, it is this fact that grounds the laws of nature: “It is the constant and uniform manner of the action of God which founds these laws, by means of which He forms and maintains this beautiful harmony in the world which is one of the greatest objects of our sciences” (OPD 1, 13). As Desgabets saw it, the operation of these laws of nature and the rules of the communication of movement were the true and unique foundations of the new physics.

Desgabets also subscribed to the Cartesian conception of mind as an immaterial substance whose essence is thought. The distinction between mind and matter is thus a real and substantial one, impossible not to perceive: “Never has an infant asked for lies or truths for breakfast, nor has he imagined that the stones encountered along his path were the gross thoughts of some countryman” (OPD 5, 197). Minds, or immaterial substances, are of three kinds: uncreated, which is God; mind detached from body, which is an angel; and mind united to organized body, which is a reasonable soul. The second of these, angels, are the only pure minds in the created universe and they have no corporeal extension, no local presence or correspondence to time—they are simple and indivisible minds. Such minds or spirits cannot be perfected by any substantial union since their specific spiritual being does not require anything corporeal to carry out its functions. However, they are capable of participating in the movements of the visible world, though in doing so, they must undergo a kind of degradation and punishment in order to receive pain. The third of these spiritual beings is man, who consists of a cross between purely intellectual and purely corporeal things. In this Desgabets appears to have strayed slightly from the official Cartesian doctrine of dual substances, since he claimed that outside of God there are three sorts of simple created substances, matter or body, angel, and one which is composed of body and soul, which is man. However, this tripartite division of substances is supported by a more fundamental bipartite division of material and spiritual substances, so that strictly speaking, individual bodies and individual persons are best understood as modal beings not substances. This is not unlike Descartes’s account of man as a “composite entity” possessing two principal attributes, namely extension and thought, a being which itself is not a simple substance. Nonetheless, in Desgabets as in Descartes, how to interpret the human soul as a substance (Miller, 2008), or as a modal being (Lennon, 1994), is a matter of continued debate.

It was an important point for Desgabets that man, unlike angels, is a being composed of body and soul, who continually experiences the union of the two substances by the endless impressions he finds in himself. The relation of mind and body in man is an essential one which must not be regarded as a penal state of the soul, but as the accomplishment of its natural perfection. Human thought has duration, succession, a beginning and an end—qualities that depend on the movements of the corporeal organs and which follow the rules of local movement. Although Descartes and Malebranche after him claimed that the human mind is capable of detachment from the body, Desgabets rejected this, since the human mind is not like an angel’s but requires continual commerce with the body and its senses for all its operations.

One further issue concerning Descartes’s general account of the nature of the mind-body union, which Desgabets raised in order to dispel, concerns the common complaint that the Cartesian view fails to account for the interaction of material and immaterial substances. Desgabets did not regard this as a true problem because he thought that the question demanded the impossible—an explanation of how the organized body and reasonable soul, which are in fact made for each other, can exercise a mutual commerce. He likened this to asking an artisan to explain how the convex surface of a peg can possibly fill that of a concave hole. It is akin to asking why extension is the essence of body, or why thought is the essence of mind. It’s just the way God made the world.

What could be explained, according to Desgabets, is the way in which the mind and body are in fact united and dependent upon one another. He found an analogue in the nature of the body-body relation: two bodies are united when their superficies touch and their movements take on a mutual dependence. Similarly, two minds are united when their thoughts and wills agree and depend on one another. The union of mind and body is not by touch, nor by agreement of thoughts, but by the dependence that exists between certain thoughts and certain movements such that one in fact follows from the other. The union of the mind and body in man is so strict that it founds a species of communication for their commerce, in virtue of which our thoughts are said to have duration, succession, etc., without themselves being corporeal. The union and its interaction cannot be further reduced in explanation. In short, the essence of man, who is composed of mind and body, is the union of mind and body, and the only legitimate questions which concern this union relate to how, given the union, the mind determines the body and the body determines the mind, which is an empirical question, known through experience not reason.

Desgabets’s thesis concerning the indefectibility of created substances, which underlies his metaphysics, is perhaps his most original if not radical philosophical contribution (Schmaltz, 2002; Easton, 2005; Gatto, 2017). Gatto argues that this thesis is the key to understanding Desgabets’s peculiar development of Descartes’s philosophy (Gatto, 2017). In a letter from Desgabets to Malebranche, we learn that he had begun the Treatise on the Indefectibility of Substances, as early as 1649 (Letter from Desgabets, Sept. 1674, Malebranche, 1958–84, vol. II: 85). It was Desgabets’s view that substances, in their essence and existence, are eternal, indivisible, immutable, and indestructible, which is to say, indefectible. While the modes of substance can undergo change, the essence of substance and its existence cannot. According to Desgabets, the indestructibility, eternality, and indivisibility of substances follow from the fact that God created substances by a free and indifferent will. Once the world was created, it could not be uncreated. Thus, the key to understanding Desgabets’s indefectibility thesis lies not only in his analysis of the Cartesian doctrine of substance, but in his interpretation of Descartes’s notoriously opaque doctrine of the free creation of the eternal truths, discussed in a later section, under “Truth.”

As we have seen, Desgabets’s adoption of the new Cartesian philosophy came with radical revisions that Descartes himself likely would not have sanctioned. As Desgabets himself puts it in Preface to the Supplement, Descartes made the true philosophy possible:

I will again affirm that we need only look at the works of Descartes to speak thoroughly of these four great subjects I have just proposed. He raised them all with the purpose of treating them and had views so extensive concerning them that we cannot fail to profit notably from his work, if we take the trouble to examine his ideas. Nonetheless, I must show in what follows that after delivering us from infinite error, he himself was caught in imperceptible prejudices concerning fundamental things, which deprived the world of the greatest fruits of his work. I will take the occasion of his own inventions to mark the places where he failed and to extend them as far as he should have. I will uncover the contrarieties that are found among the things he advanced and how sometimes he himself ceased to be a good Cartesian, by abandoning his finest discoveries to embrace popular opinions. I will show that it is almost by his own doctrine that the errors are corrected and that it is he who gives the remedy for the ill he produced. I will establish his reputation upon eternal foundations by giving his philosophy its expected reputation. For, it has to be known that his philosophy, once purged of certain errors and having received the vast scope possible to it, must pass for the masterpiece of the human spirit, and for what is the greatest of its kind in the world (OPD 5, 152).

3. Epistemology

There is a long tradition of interpreting Desgabets as an empiricist from Victor Cousin (1852), and Francisque Bouillier (1868), to Genevieve Rodis-Lewis (1981, 1993), Patricia Easton and Thomas Lennon (1992), Tad Schmaltz (2002a; 2002b) and Sean Allen-Hermenson (2008). Monte Cook (2008) has raised an important challenge to the empiricist reading, questioning whether the senses provide any real content to our ideas. A discussion of some of the interpretive complexities around sensible qualities, the nature of ideas, the intentionality principle, and the method of truth follows below. Nonetheless, there is consensus that Desgabets rejected hyperbolic doubt, pure intellection and innate ideas, and insisted on the necessary role of the senses in the formation of all ideas. Moreover, it is agreed that these positions lean away from Descartes in varying degrees and constitute a major if not radical revision of the Cartesian philosophy.

In Desgabets’s estimation, Descartes’s truly great discovery was his identification of the true nature of sensible qualities (OPD 5, 164). The importance of this ‘discovery’ in Desgabets’s development of the Cartesian philosophy is paramount, since he believed that because of it, the way had been opened at last to lay the foundations of a true philosophy. Desgabets drew out six important consequences (OPD 5, 165ff.), which he admits shows that “Descartes is mistaken in what is the most fundamental in his method” (OPD 5, 164). The six consequences are: (1) sensible qualities “… are nothing else in objects but the local dispositions of the small parts from which result the sensations that we call heat, sound, light, etc.” (OPD 2, 17); (2) sensible qualities are sentiments in the human soul that have no resemblance to modes of matter, such as shape, size, and motion; (3) external objects have the power to excite innumerable perceptions in us that we call sensations and ideas; (4) simple conceptions arise in us from objects outside us and are known truly, as they really exist; (5) knowing the true nature of sensible qualities as perceptions of the mind caused by bodies makes possible the true physics; and, (6) by distinguishing the true nature of the body from the sensible qualities it causes in us, we can unite physics with the infallible sciences, for the solid of the geometer is the same as the object of the physicist (extended matter). Each of these consequences will be examined in more detail to investigate what was at the heart of Desgabets’s adoption and revision of the Cartesian philosophy.

(1, 2, 3) Sensible qualities are states or modes of the human mind having only a causal relation to the specific local movements of our sensory organs, which in turn, are the effects of the local movements produced by the corporeal qualities of matter. According to both Descartes and Desgabets, sensible qualities are nothing but “various dispositions” in objects to cause ideas in us. Since Descartes clearly held that sensible qualities are not the forms of material things but rather modes of the mind, the only sense in which sensible qualities could be “in” the various dispositions of objects is in the causal sense, that is, as their effects. While the status and nature of these dispositions in Descartes’s account has been a subject of much debate, he undeniably distinguishes between on the one hand, light, color, smell, taste, sound and touch (the so-called secondary qualities), and on the other hand, size, shape, and motion (the so-called primary qualities). Sensible qualities belong to the mind as modes of perception, and primary qualities belong to body as modes of matter. Desgabets follows suit by adopting the Cartesian distinction between minds and bodies, thereby attributing size, shape, and local motions to body as modes of matter and sensible qualities such as heat, color, smells, sounds, pains and pleasures, and tangible qualities as modes of thinking things. Thus, sensible qualities qua modes of the mind have no resemblance or similarity to the modes belonging to matter: “the sun is not luminous, the snow is not white, the fire has no heat in the sense that we imagined previously.” (OPD 5, 165) However, Desgabets maintains that sensible qualities qua modes of mind do represent the soul and its relation to corporeal things, just as our ideas of body and its modes when clearly perceived as shape, size, and local motion, truly represent their object. How this is so brings us to the fourth consequence, that our simple conceptions arise in us from objects outside us and are known as they actually exist.

(4) Eclipsing the cogito as the first principle of knowledge in Desgabets’s system is what has come to be known as the “intentionality principle” (Schmaltz, 2002; Hill, 2011; Adriaenssen, 2015). According to Desgabets by reflecting on the true nature of sensible qualities we are able to grasp the most general principle underlying all truths: that simple conception or the first operation of the mind is always true and conforms to its object. As Desgabets describes this foundational principle: “... that every idea has a real object; that nothing cannot be thought; that simple conception always conforms to its object; that to think and to think of something are inseparable things, and as the natural order would have it, we begin to philosophize by the exposition and development of this great principle ...” (OPD5. 178). If such a principle could be established, as Desgabets claims that it can, it would mean that simple conception conforms to its object, it preserves the truth, and hence provides the foundation for human knowledge. Most of Desgabets’s discussion of the intentionality principle treats it as self-evidently true. If we reflect on the nature of human thought itself—as by its nature presupposing an object—then we see the absurdity of there being a thought with no object. If we reflect on the existence of human knowledge itself then we see that it presupposes knowable things—for what is knowledge unless there are prior knowable things? The intuition Desgabets seems to be working with is that given there is human thought and knowledge, there must be objects of thought and objects known to make it possible.

Although Desgabets gives a new meaning to the doctrine of simple conception, he and Descartes agree that simple conception is always true and conforms to its object, while error is a product of precipitous judgment. This is a theme found in Descartes that depends on the Cartesian distinction between the scope of the two basic operations of the mind—that of the intellect and that of the will. The functions of assenting and dissenting are performed by the will, while those of perception and conception are performed by the senses and intellect. Desgabets challenges Descartes’s “pretension” that he could detach himself from all commerce with the senses, which sets the rationalist tone of the Meditations. Of course, Descartes saw this detachment as desirable because he thought it was in virtue of it that he could avoid error and defend the certainty of human knowledge. Descartes also argues that the soul is known more clearly than the body because we, as thinking things, are intimately tied to the immaterial, thinking substance, which is our soul. The body, on the other hand, is part of material not immaterial substance, and so is not known immediately. It is because of this that Descartes took the cogito to be the foundation of certainty in human knowledge, and our knowledge of body to be less clear and less immediate. However, according to Desgabets, this is where Descartes goes terribly astray. Had Descartes reflected more deeply on the nature of the mind-body union, he would have seen that our ideas of body and mind are equally clear, and equally evident. For, the soul of man is not an immaterial substance, but is a result of the union of mind and body, and all our ideas, even of the soul, equally depend upon the operation of the senses. From here, it can be seen that there is a principle more fundamental than the cogito, namely the principle of intentionality, that to think is to think of something. Clarity and distinctness, according to Desgabets, tells us when we have grasped something truthfully, but the intentionality of thought grounds the truth of clarity and distinctness.

But how, according to Desgabets, are we to distinguish a simple conception from a precipitous judgment? In his Supplément (OPD 6, 222) he offers the example of the heat of fire to illustrate the distinction: when someone approaches fire and has the sensation of heat he may be persuaded that the heat he feels is in the fire just as he perceives it, since this sensation is known to him clearly. But, he has erred because of a tacit judgment. The judgment that the heat is in the fire entails that the heat as we perceive it resembles what is in the fire, which is false. For, as Descartes discovered, the sensation of heat is a mode of the mind, not a mode of the fire (body). The fire we feel “... is the object of simple conception only when we do not conceive this heat as in the fire, rather as something that makes us have this feeling when we approach the fire. But if one says the heat of the fire resembles the sentiment that is our heat, a judgment is added to simple perception and falls in error because the judgment extends beyond the perception” (OPD 6, 222). Likewise, when we judge that a stick is straight or bent when half-submerged in water we judge precipitously—what is known is that it is equally real and conceivable that a stick (as a material body) is straight or curbed (is shaped) (Desgabets, 1675, 67–68). Thus, simple conception grasps its object clearly and represents the thing perceived as it really is. When we perceive the heat of the fire simpliciter, we perceive the sensation of heat as a sensation of the mind; when we perceive the fire simpliciter, we perceive it as a corporeal body having extension and local configurations and motions. Simple conceptions are the mind’s grasp of things as they are in themselves, which is to say, in relation to their essence and modes as extended substances, or as thinking minds: “We therefore have only to think of extended substance which is matter, of its movements, of its figures, of the situations of its parts, of angels, of souls, of men and their operations, to be very sure that all this exists. For whether thought represents to us substance or accident, body or spirit, it is equally necessary that all of these exist outside of thought, unless one thinks without thinking of anything, and the first operation of the mind ceases to conform to its object” (Desgabets, 1675, 124). A related error made by Descartes, according to Desgabets, is to allow chimeras and other such beings of reason among the number of objects of simple conception. Such a mistake obscured Descartes from discovering the true foundation of human certainty, the basic truth that the first operation of the mind has only real things for its object. By including chimerical beings among the objects of simple conception, Descartes opened the door to the possibility of thoughts without true objects. But, judgment or the extension of the will beyond the domain of what is conceived is the true source of chimerical beings of reason and hence of all error (OPD 4, 103).

(5 & 6) Desgabets drew two more final consequences from Descartes’s discovery of the true nature of sensible qualities. In order to make physics a true science, Desgabets must accomplish two things: first, show that the senses are necessary for the knowledge of physical objects and; secondly, show that physics is founded in infallible sciences (mathematics and geometry). The fifth consequence thus aims to establish that perceptions of the mind are caused by bodies and makes possible the true physics. In Part 1, chapter three of the Supplément, Desgabets explicitly examines Descartes’s rejection of the empiricist motto, that all knowledge comes from the senses. While Desgabets rejects the Scholastic rendering of the motto, he is equally critical of Descartes’s precipitous rejection of it. According to Desgabets, the proper sense of the empiricist motto is that all thoughts originate by the senses [a sensu] rather than in the senses [in sensu], and what reaches the intellect is not what is found in the senses. As Lennon nicely puts it, “For him things are directly perceived and an idea is the means by which, and not in which, a thing is perceived” (Lennon, 1998, 353). The soul must always be in commerce with the senses by the nature of the mind-body union, and although our thoughts depend on the corporeal traces in the brain for their source or origin, it does not follow that our ideas must be corporeal, or even similar to corporeal things. The very fact that all of our thoughts have a beginning, duration, cessation, and succession proves that they depend on motion, and motion is only communicated through the senses. This is why he modifies the empiricist motto from: nihil est in intellectu quin prius fuerit in sensu, to a sensu.

While this formulation of the empiricist motto goes against the notion of pure intellection, it leaves open the question of whether the senses play more than an occasional role in the occurrence of all thoughts, including about body. According to Desgabets, it is undeniable that man is a being who reasons, draws consequences, does not see things indivisibly, who has thoughts in succession which begin, continue, and finish, and who often experiences doubt and conjecture. Such doubting, discursive reasoning and succession of thought prove that all thought is tied to the body since duration and successive extension are nothing but the local movements of the body (OPD 7, 299). A pure thought, the kind that Descartes (and Malebranche after him) envisioned for metaphysical reasoning, would have no beginning, duration, end, or succession. In short, such a thought would be indivisible, and hence unthinkable by the human mind. Both Descartes and Malebranche rejected the empiricist thesis because they erroneously thought that it would commit them to the materialist thesis that thoughts and the soul are material. This led them to adopt the intellectualist thesis regarding the mind’s perception of metaphysical essences. However, Desgabets saw a third option, one which is founded on the mind-body union and the sensory basis of all knowledge, and one which founds the full and proper sense of the empiricist motto, that all ideas originate by the senses. Since movement is a mode belonging to body, many tended to conclude that if minds depend on movement, then minds must have something corporeal in them. How could it be that our thoughts, which have something corporeal in them, namely, movement, are not themselves corporeal? And yet, this is exactly what Desgabets argued. He believed that thoughts have something corporeal in their being without themselves being corporeal—in the same way that every object in our thought has a beginning, continuation, and end without these objects having duration in themselves. While things really have duration, it is only extrinsically and by thought, “the same way a pole is divided into ten feet when one imagines the ten feet” (OPD 7: 299).

At first glance, Desgabets’s analogy between attributing a corporeal nature to thoughts and attributing a duration or division to things serves more to confuse than clarify. But if we draw on his account of the true nature of individual bodies, we can make some sense of it. Individual bodies are real in that they result from actual divisions of matter, assemblages of local dispositions of parts of matter. Bodies then act upon our sensory organs which in turn are received as ideas in the mind. But the individuation of perception into sensible ideas of bodies is essentially an operation performed by the mind, even though it has its foundation in the local dispositions of matter itself. For example, our perception of a ten-foot pole is the effect of a specific assemblage of local dispositions of matter acting upon our sensory organs at a certain time and the mind’s division of that sensible body into ten feet. The local disposition itself is not intrinsically a pole, or ten feet long, but it is so extrinsically, that is, by thought. Similarly, thoughts themselves are not intrinsically extended or subject to movement, but they are so extrinsically, that is, as an effect of the operations of the sensory organs of the body. In other words, just as the local movements of matter individuate thought extrinsically giving the mind individual thoughts, the thought of immaterial substance individuates matter extrinsically thereby giving it perceptions of individual bodies. The mind-body union, and the essential intentionality which results from it, create the mutual dependence of the operations of mind and matter without requiring that mind be material or matter be immaterial.

This does not mean that the senses cannot access the true nature of things. In fact, for Desgabets, since all knowledge comes from the senses, the function of knowing the essences of things is a necessary role served by the senses. Recall that the true nature of particular objects consists in the local dispositions of parts of matter which produce the course of the movements we experience. Think of these sensible objects as akin to Humean bundles of perceptions except that for Desgabets there is a causal relation to the object of our idea that ensures a conformity of the perceived object and the object. These movements are the first and sole contact we have with the material world, and so the senses present, in some form, not only the existence of a given object, but also the value of that object in relation to our survival. We only reach knowledge of the true nature of material objects by considering their being in relation to their substance. In order to achieve this, we must abstract from all relations of time, and only then see it as it is in itself. What the senses provide us is knowledge of matter in its various divisions, shapes, sizes, etc., that is, as matter in its parts as it exists at a certain time and place. Thus, what Desgabets seemed to have assumed was that the reason we so often err with regard to the true nature of these bodies and their movements is that we judge precipitously, or too quickly, before the mind has had a chance to conceive of material substance as it is in itself, independent of any temporal or spatial ties. Thus, it seems that Desgabets holds that the senses provide us with the materials necessary not just for the occasioning of thoughts of bodies but also for the knowledge of their essence.

The sixth consequence bears directly on our ability to see the right path to a true and certain physics. The true physics is one that recognizes that “everything that happens in matter by the different movements and modes of its parts, belongs to mathematics and mechanics, which have all of this for their object” (OPD 5, 166). The object of the true physics is not the substantial forms of the Scholastics, but rather, matter whose essence is extension, and its modes which are nothing else but various divisions and movements of its parts. As Desgabets puts this, the natural object of the physicists is the same as the solid of the mathematician. The solid of mathematicians, according to Desgabets, consists in a magnitude that has three dimensions, i.e., length, width, and breadth while the natural body of the physicist consists in a substance extended in three dimensions. This is the crowning statement of Desgabets’s metaphysical view that the physical world is really a single object or substance whose parts, under various divisions, shapes and arrangements, form all the appearances in the “grand theater of nature” (OPD 5, 166). Once physics is united with the infallible sciences of mathematics and mechanics, the path to the true science of physics is secure.

Having surveyed the six consequences of the true nature of sensible qualities we can see the heart of Desgabets’s revision of Cartesianism: that in order to use reason properly we must recognize that all our ideas or simple conceptions have a real object outside of it, which is in itself what is represented by thought, and which actually contains the degree of being that one sees there. The work of the search after truth is to avoid precipitous judgment and keep to the simple conception of things. If body is extended in three dimensions capable of modes of size, shape and motion, and individual bodies are modal beings in the sense claimed by Desgabets, then there is no cleavage between object and object known because they are one and the same thing. Corporeal things cause sensible ideas in us that represent modes of the mind and cause ideas of bodies, shapes, sizes, and motions that represent matter. What is represented to our thought through simple conception is the real object of knowledge, namely, material and spiritual substance. What we sense directly are these substances as they exist in time, or in other words, as they exist at a given time by thought in virtue of the particular local dispositions of matter.

4. Truth

According to Desgabets, Descartes’s fine doctrine concerning the creation of the eternal truths, is the foundation of the true (Cartesian) philosophy. He claimed that had Descartes attended consistently to this doctrine, he would have avoided all error. Due to its importance and opaqueness in Desgabets’s writings, the “Creation Doctrine” has generated a great deal of examination and debate, most recently stimulated by Beaude’s and Rodis-Lewis’s publication of Desgabets’s philosophical writings (Desgabets, 1981). Rodis Lewis (1981) and Lennon (1998) set the stage for the dialectic of the debates in the period. Schmaltz (2002), Cook (2005), Faye (2005), and Easton (2009) variously argue for the importance of the doctrine in Desgabets’s development of the Cartesian philosophy, and its philosophical significance. Gatto (2017) presents a nice synthesis of the literature and sorts out the complicated reception and role of Descartes’s doctrine, particularly for Desgabets. Despite the controversies surrounding the interpretation and significance of this doctrine, there are some points of agreement. As Desgabets understood it, the Creation Doctrine requires that God be equally the author of all created things, in their being and their essence. It requires that there be no essence without existence, which is to say, that there can be no purely possible beings either in the human mind as Descartes allowed, or in God’s mind, as Malebranche argued. The notion that such truths are in some way prior to God’s creation of the world, existing as purely possible essences separate from actual existence, involves a separation of essence from existence, and supposes that essence is something actually separable and conceivable without existence.

Truth, which exists only by the relation of conformity of thought to its object, is contingent in that it depends on God’s will in his free creation of the universe. Truth is eternal in its independence from time or temporal variations, and it is immutable in that once God wills the world, things never change in respect to their substance but only in respect to their modes of being. Although we must wait to know what things God actually created, we are guaranteed of the truth of our ideas since it is the object itself that determines what we perceive. Truth is necessary in that God gives all objects He creates an irrevocable being, but it is contingent in relation to His absolute and unlimited power. God is the equal author of the essence and the existence of things He created, He “… gave them their essence and their existence which are equally contingent, and which once received, are nevertheless possessed by them irrevocably” (OPD 6, 249). Desgabets’s voluntarism, then, is a qualified one, for though the eternal truths depend upon God for their existence as their primary cause, they are no less indefectible, that is, they are unchangeable in their substantial being. Moreover, eternal truths discovered by us are true and necessary since God chose to create things in such a way that once created his will could not be undone.

The tenets that Desgabets drew from the Creation Doctrine show us where Desgabets parts ways with Descartes on many points. For example, Descartes erroneously concludes in Meditation V that essences, such as the true and immutable nature of a triangle, can exist separately from material existence as a purely possible being. According to Desgabets’s strict adherence to the Creation Doctrine, “… objects precede truth in the order of nature,” such that, “… it is impossible that there be a triangle separate from its existence, or that the whole be greater than its part if there is no whole or parts, which is to say in a word, that our principle is found yet more true, and it is impossible to think of nothing” (OPD 6, 232). The Creation Doctrine also grounds Desgabets’s treatment of the senses as the foundation of all knowledge, and his view that the substances are indefectible. Although at times elusive, the unity of Desgabets’s thought can be seen in his defense of the Creation Doctrine.

To conclude, when we view Desgabets’s work as a whole, there is no doubt that what he viewed as a revision or perfection of the Cartesian philosophy others have viewed as a fundamental departure. In his favor, he never strayed from the Cartesian metaphysics of substance dualism, substance-mode ontology, mind-body union and interaction, and the view that extension is the essence of matter and thought the essence of mind. He remained loyal to the Cartesian physics against the atomists. Moreover, and perhaps heretically to some, he strongly rejected the rationalist epistemology which often dominates in Descartes, and argued that Descartes’s own principles favor a sensory foundation for knowledge. By Desgabets’s own lights, he remained loyal to the Cartesian principles: “I will establish his reputation upon eternal foundations by giving his philosophy its expected reputation. For, it has to be known that his philosophy, once purged of certain errors and having received the vast scope possible to it, must pass for the masterpiece of the human spirit, and for what is the greatest of its kind in the world” (OPD 5, 152).


Primary Texts

  • Cordemoy, Gérauld de, 1968, Oeuvres philosophiques, eds. Pierre Clair & François Girbal, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France. [This work includes letter written by Desgabets (1666) in which he argued against the atomist thesis of Cordemoy.]
  • –––, 1666, Discernement du corps et de l’âme, Paris.
  • Descartes, René, Meditationes de prima philosophia, 1641. Paris.
  • Desgabets, Robert, 1668, “Discourse de la communication ou transfusion du sang,” published with, “Lettre ècrite à M. Sorbière,” by J. B. Denis, Paris. [This is a scientific piece in which Desgabets described an apparatus and procedure for blood transfusion of his own invention.]
  • –––, 1671, Considérations sur l’état présent de la controverse touchant le Très Saint-Sacrement de l’autel, published anonymously, Holland. [This is the work that stirred a great deal of controversy for Cartesians, which is not surprising given the theologically sensitive nature of the thesis that the body of Christ is actually present (extended) in the host.]
  • –––, 1675, Critique de la Critique de la Recherche de la vérité, Paris.
  • –––, 1983, Oeuvres philosophiques inédites, Analecta Cartesiana 2, ed., J. Beaude with introduction by G. Rodis-Lewis, Amsterdam: Quadratures.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, 1958–84, Œuvres complètes de Malebranche, A. Robinet (ed.), 20 vols. Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Régis, Pierre-Sylvain, 1704, L’usage de la raison et de la foi, Paris.

Selected Studies and Critical Discussions

  • Allen-Hermanson, S., 2008, “Desgabets: Rationalist or Cartesian Empiricist?,” in Topics in Early Modern Philosophy, Jon Miller (ed.), Studies in the History of Philosophy of Mind, 9: 57–85.
  • Andriaenssen, Han Thomas, 2015, “The Radical Cartesianism of Robert Desgabets and The Scholastic Heritage,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 23(1): 46–68.
  • Armogathe, J.-R., 1977, Theologia Cartesiana: L’Explication physique de l’Euchariste chez Descartes et dom Desgabets, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Beaude, Joseph, 1974, “Desgabets et son oeuvre,” Revue de sythèse, 95: 7–17.
  • –––, 1979, “Cartésianisme et anticartésianisme de Desgabets,” Studia Cartesiana 1, Amsterdam: Quadratures, pp. 1–24.
  • –––, 1980, “Le Guide de la raison naturelle dans l’oeuvre de Desgabets,” Recherches sur le XVIIe siècle IV, Paris: Centre National de la Recherche scientifique.
  • Bouillier, Francisque, 1868, L’Histoire de la philosophie cartésienne, Paris, 3rd ed.
  • Cook, Monte, 2008, “Desgabets As a Cartesian Empiricist,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 46(4): 501–516.
  • –––, 2005, “Desgabets on the Creation of Eternal Truths,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 43(1): 21–36.
  • –––, 2002, “Robert Desgabets’s Representation Principle,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 40(2): 189–200.
  • Cousin, Victor, 1852, Fragments de philosophie cartésienne, Paris: Didier; reprinted 1970, Geneva: Slatkine Reprints. [Volume III includes selections from unpublished manuscripts which contain discussions by Retz, Malebranche, and Corbinelli of Desgabets’s revision and extension of Descartes’s philosophy.]
  • Dilucia, Niall, 2022, “Robert Desgabets’ eucharistic thought and the theological revision of Cartesianism,” Intellectual History Review, 32(4): 669–690, doi:10.1080/17496977.2021.1913350
  • Easton, Patricia, 2005, “Desgabets’s Indefectibility Thesis — a Step Too Far?”, in Receptions of Descartes, Tad M. Schmaltz (ed.), 27–41, London: Routledge.
  • Faye, Emmanuel, 2005, “The Cartesianism of Desgabets and Arnauld and the Problem of the Eternal Truths”, in Daniel Garber (ed.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy (Volume II), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 193–209.
  • Gatto, Alfred, 2017, “La Puissance Épuisée. Robert Desgabets et les Vérités Éternelles,” in Recherches Philosophiques, Toulouse: Revue de la Faculté de Philosophie de l’institute Catholique, 129–152.
  • Hill, Jonathan, 2011, “Berkeley’s Missing Argument: The Sceptical Attack on Intentionality,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 19(1): 47–77.
  • Lemaire, Paul, 1901, Le Cartésianisme chez les Bénédictins: Dom Robert Desgabets son système, son influence et son école, Paris: Alcan.
  • Lennon, Thomas M, and Easton, Patricia A, 1992, The Cartesian Empiricism of François Bayle, New York: Garland.
  • –––, 1998, “The Cartesian Dialectic of Creation,” in M. Ayers and D. Garber (eds.), The Cambridge History of Seventeenth Century Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1994, “The Problem of Individuation among the Cartesians” in K. F. Barber, & J. J. E. Gracia (eds.), Individuation and Identity in Early Modern Philosophy, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Malfara, Fabio and Thomas Lennon, 2023, “Transubstantiation As A Test Case For Desgabets’s Cartesianism,” The Review of Metaphysics, 76(3): 447–472.
  • Miller, Timothy, 2008, “Desgabets on Cartesian Minds,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 16(4): 723–745.
  • Prost, Jean, 1907, Essai sur l’atomisme et l’occasionalisme dans la philosophie cartésienne, Paris. [This work includes useful material on Desgabets’s critique of Cordemoy’s atomism, and his rejection of occasionalism.]
  • Robinet, André, 1974, “Dom Robert Desgabets, le conflit philosophique avec Malebranche et son l’oeuvre métaphysique,” Journée Desgabets, Revue de synthèse, 95: 65–83. (“Dom Robert Desgabets, his Philosophical Conflict with Malebranche and His Metaphysical Work.”) (This article examines Desgabets’s influence on Malebranche which is found in Malebranche’s views on occasionalism, the non-materiality of thoughts, and the nature of the eternal truths.)
  • Rodis-Lewis, Géneviève, 1993, “Der Cartesianismus in Frankreich,” Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie, Die Philosophie des 17. Jahrhunderts, Band II, Basel/Struttgart, 398–445.
  • –––, 1981, “Polémiques sur la création des possibles et sur l’impossible dans l’école cartésienne.” Studia Cartesiana 2, Amsterdam: Quadratures, 105–123.
  • –––, 1974, “L’écrit de Desgabets sur la transfusion du sang et sa place dans les polémiques contemporaines,” Journée de Desgabets Revue de synthèse, 95: 31–64.
  • Schmaltz, Tad M., 2017, Early Modern Cartesianisms: Dutch and French Constructions, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2002a, Radical Cartesianism: The French Reception of Descartes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002b, “The Cartesian Refutation of Idealism”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 10(4): 513–540.
  • –––, 1999, “What Has Cartesianism To Do with Jansenism?”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 60(1): 37–56.
  • Scribano, Emanuela, 2003, “Foucher and the Dilemmas of Representation: A ‘Modern’ Problem?” in Gianni Paganini (ed.), The Return of Scepticism from Hobbes and Descartes to Bayle, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 197–212.
  • Watson, Richard A., 1982, “Transubstantiation among the Cartesians,” in T. M. Lennon, J. M. Nicholas, and J. W. Davis (eds.), Problems of Cartesianism, Kingston and Montreal: McGill-Queens University Press, 127–148.
  • –––, 1987, The Breakdown of Cartesian Metaphysics, Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.
  • –––, 1966, The Downfall of Cartesianism 1673–1712, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

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