First published Fri Aug 19, 2011; substantive revision Tue Dec 22, 2020

The life of Dharmakīrti, a profound and rigorous philosopher of Indian Buddhism, is a subject of hagiography with little solid data upon which we can confidently rely.[1] If we go by Tibetan sources, he seems to have been born in South India and then to have moved to the great monastic university of Nālandā (in present day Bihar state) where he was supposedly in contact with other Buddhist luminaries, such as Dharmapāla (530–561 C.E.). Tibetan sources describe his life in very colorful terms. Indeed some make him out as initially a Mīmāṃsaka who then broke with that non-Buddhist school; others depict him as extraordinarily skilled in debate and hint at a difficult and arrogant personality. Judging by the opening verses in his most famous (and by far his longest) work, the Pramāṇavārttika (Commentary on Epistemology), Dharmakīrti himself thought that his philosophy would not be understood by his contemporaries because of their small-minded vanity. At the end of the Pramāṇavārttika, he went further and prophesied that his work of unrivalled depth would never receive its proper recognition, but would age in obscurity locked away in itself.[2]

He was wrong about that, fortunately for us. His philosophy certainly did find recognition, at least it did in many parts of Asia. He, and his predecessor Dignāga (c. 480–c. 540 C.E.), were responsible for a school of Buddhist thought that actually had no name in Sanskrit, although in Tibetan it was known as “those who follow reasoning” (rigs pa rjes su ‘brang ba); in modern literature it is sometimes known by the convenient Sanskrit misnomer pramāṇavāda, or more simply, “the Epistemological School.” In any case, it is the Buddhist school that provoked the most sophisticated and most important philosophical debates with non-Buddhist rivals. It represented Buddhism in the pan-Indian debates on problems of universals, philosophies of logic and language, and issues of justification, and had an enormous influence on Mahāyāna Buddhism in Central Asia, especially in Tibet. Finally, although its influence was relatively limited in medieval China (only a few of the works of Dignāga were translated into Chinese, none of the works of Dharmakīrti were translated), it has nonetheless become increasingly important in modern Japan in supplying the epistemology for Buddhist thought.

It is still debated in the modern community of researchers on Dharmakīrti whether one should place this philosopher in the seventh century C.E. or in the sixth. Part of the reason for this indecision is that a significant time seems to have elapsed before Dharmakīrti achieved notoriety in India, although it is unclear how much. Erich Frauwallner came out strongly for 600–660 C.E. as Dharmakīrti’s dates, using an argumentum ex silentio that is short of conclusive—hardly more than one piece in the puzzle.[3] One problem is that there may indeed be some counterevidence that would place Dharmakīrti a half-century earlier, inter alia his possible connections with Dharmapāla, a sixth-century idealist philosopher who, according to Tibetan historians, was the monk that ordained Dharmakīrti. Some have thought that there is even a reference to Dharmakīrti in Dharmapāla’s commentary to Dignāga’s Ālambanaparīkṣā (“Analysis of the object [of perception]”). However, because this commentary is only available to us at this time in Chinese in an unreliable translation by Yijing, it is not clear that the passage in question does in fact refer to Dharmakīrti. Caution or even agnosticism on the matter of Dharmakīrti’s dates still seems to be warranted, although the scales are tipping towards an earlier date. Krasser (2012) relies heavily on connections between Dharmakīrti, Bhāviveka and Kumārila to push the dates of Dharmakīrti’s activity back to the mid sixth century C.E. [4] Balcerowicz (2016) argues that Dharmakīrti directly influenced the Jaina writer Samantabhadra. He proposes 530-590 as the dates for the latter and 550-610 as the dates for Dharmakīrti.

Leaving aside the question of dates, Frauwallner (1954) did most likely pin down the order in which Dharmakīrti composed five of his seven works, namely, and in this order, the Pramāṇavārttika, Pramāṇaviniścaya (“Ascertainment of Epistemology”), Nyāyabindu (“Drop of Reasoning”), Hetubindu (“Drop of Logical Reasons”), and Vādanyāya (“Logic of Argumentation”). The two minor works, the Sambandhaparīkṣā (“Analysis of Relations”) and Saṃtānāntarasiddhi (“Proof of Other Minds”), are more difficult to place in the sequence. There is also an autocommentary to the Pramāṇavārttika, the Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti. However, the hypothesis of Frauwallner that there was a proto-text that later became the Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti is still speculative.

In what follows, most of our discussion will center around the Pramāṇavārttika, as it is by far the largest and most important of Dharmakīrti’s works. It is an unfinished, highly philosophical, commentary on the Pramāṇasamuccaya (“Compendium of Epistemology”) of Dignāga. At various key places in the text we see that Dharmakīrti seems to have formulated some basic ideas as a reaction to now lost commentaries by Dignāga’s students, the most important being the commentary on the Pramāṇasamuccaya by Īśvarasena. A notable reaction to Īśvarasena is Dharmakīrti’s emphasis on certainty (niścaya) (see sections 1.4 and 3.1). There are also innovations that, as far as we know, were not provoked by earlier commentators. Whether in metaphysics, epistemology or philosophy of language, causal theories carry considerable philosophical weight. These theories are probably to quite a degree original, not found in Dignāga’s own writings. In what follows, we will examine what we consider to be the most salient features of Dharmakīrti’s philosophy, bringing out inter alia the importance of this causal stance. It is however impossible to discuss all the major themes that were traditionally commented upon by Buddhist scholastic writers on Dharmakīrti. Choices and exclusions had to be made. For readers who seek a comprehensive treatment of the historical development of Dharmakīrti’s positions in his seven works, the best reference to date is Eltschinger (2010). Quite detailed summaries of Dharmakīrti’s works are found in Potter (2017).

1. Metaphysics

The Dignāga-Dharmakīrti school—contrary to certain globally anti-realist Buddhist schools like the Madhyamaka—recognizes that there are, indeed must be, some entities that are fully real. It is, however, a school that is thoroughly nominalist. What is real for them is only the particular (svalakṣaṇa). By contrast, anything that is a universal (sāmānyalakṣaṇa) is unreal; at most it is a customarily recognized fiction needed for thought and language. What demarcates the real from the fictional is that the former has causal powers and exists in a purely punctual way, a new entity each moment. Both Dignāga and Dharmakīrti were, in their final positions, followers of the Yogācāra idealism, although they clearly went to great effort to make their positions largely acceptable to proponents of external objects and to idealists alike. Indeed in Dharmakīrti’s case, most of his philosophy is presented from a point of view in which external objects (bāhyārtha) are (provisionally at least) accepted as real. Idealism only enters the picture after verse 194 of the third chapter of Pramāṇavārttika. He certainly does have sophisticated arguments to prove idealism, that is, the view for him that there are no external objects, that “everything cognizable is internal” (antarjñeyavāda), “only mere data” (vijñaptimātra), [5] and that subject (grāhaka) and object (grāhya) are not two distinct entities. Nonetheless, it is striking that the main thrust of Dharmakīrti’s metaphysics—his nominalism, his proofs of impermanence and his causal theories of properties—is largely unaffected by the choice of external realism or idealism. Similarly for his epistemology, philosophy of language and logic, with a few adjustments here and there. Even on matters of solipsism and other minds, the choice of idealism makes little difference for Dharmakīrti. In the Saṃtānāntarasiddhi, for example, he goes to great length to show that the Yogācāra idealist can use the same arguments for other minds–i.e., the argument from analogy—as the Sautrāntika realist, and just as the realist can avoid solipsism so the idealist supposedly can too.[6] For our purposes, essentially for simplicity and conciseness, we shall treat of Dharmakīrti’s philosophy as accepting external objects, with the proviso that most of the same ideas can be reinterpreted to conform to idealism. Another way to put it is that we’ll read the Pramāṇavārttika along the broad lines of what Tibetan siddhānta (grub mtha’) literature terms the “position common to Sautrāntika [external realism] and Cittamātra [idealism]” (mdo sde pa dang sems tsam pa thun mong ba’i lugs).

1.1. Nominalism

It [i.e., the universal present in one instance] does not go [to another], it was not there [before the instances], nor is it there after [them], nor does it have parts. [And even when in other places] it does not leave the previous locus. Oh my! It’s just one disaster after another. (Pramāṇavārttika I.152)[7]

No doubt the fundamental intuition in Buddhist nominalism, just as in other nominalisms, is that universals are occult pseudo-entities that should not be taken seriously by a responsible thinker concerned with ontology. As the above quotation from Pramāṇavārttika shows, Dharmakīrti lists a series of anomalies: they don’t go anywhere, don’t exist before or after their instances, they are partless, are in several places at one time, and so and so on. Such bogusness of pseudo-entities becomes a recurrent theme in Buddhist Epistemology. A later Indian Buddhist writer, Paṇḍit Aśoka, inspired by Dharmakīrti and Dignāga, ridiculed real universals as follows in his Sāmānyadūṣaṇa (“Refutation of Universals”):

One can clearly see five fingers in one’s own hand. One who commits himself to a sixth general entity fingerhood, side by side with the five fingers, might as well postulate horns on top of his head.[8]

The collection of intuitive anomalies and appeal to seriousness may very well be the most powerful strategies nominalists East and West have, even though their realist adversaries will predictably maintain that they are untouched because universals are not the kind of things that need to be in one place at one time, etc. However, there are other considerations for Dharmakīrti besides the intuitive ones. There are metaphysical arguments and even an underlying political stance behind his nominalism (see section 4). The recurring Buddhist metaphysical argument against the reality of universals is that they would be subject to an intractable “one-many” problem: the universal, which would be one thing, would have to be somehow present in and share the nature of several different particulars. The problem for Dharmakīrti would then be that because the universal would share the multiple natures of the various particulars it, too, would itself have to be many different things.[9] The alternative whereby the universal would be a radically separate entity (arthāntara) from the particulars and remain unitary in nature is dismissed as irreconcilable with the obvious fact that we say that several things possess the same property. Buddhists, not surprisingly, have to consecrate considerable attention to the Nyāya idea that universals are indeed such radically separate entities but linked to particulars via an inherence (samāvāya) relation. The counter-arguments in Pramāṇavārttika and Sambandhaparīkṣā become technical, turning in part on the unreality of relations, but again the intuitive Buddhist stance is clearly that inherence, like universals, is an occult entity, posited ad hoc and without any discernible effects in the world.

1.2. Reality and momentariness

What figures again and again in Dharmakīrti’s philosophical arguments against universals and other pseudo-entities—and is a major innovation upon Dignāga—is the principle that what is real must actually affect things and bring about a change. More exactly, the criterion for something being real is that it must have “causal powers” (arthakriyāsamartha) and “perform causal roles” (arthakriyākāritva).[10] And crucially, particulars have such powers and perform such roles while universals and other pseudo-entities do not. Pramāṇavārttika III.3 (with Manorathanandin’s additions in brackets) summarizes his idea:

Whatever has causal powers (arthakriyāsamartha), that really exists (paramārthasat) in this context [i.e., when we examine reality]. Anything else is declared to be [just] customarily existent (saṃvṛtisat) [because it is practically accepted through mere conceptual fictions]. These two [i.e., the real and the customary] are [respectively] particulars and universals.[11]

Things, properties, powers, whatever they may be, if real and causally efficient, must occupy just one location in time (kāla) and space (deśa) and have only a singular nature (svabhāva), by which Dharmakīrti means that nothing real can span, or be present in, several distinct objects over different times and places, and possess the many natures of the various particulars.[12] This not only rules out “horizontal universals” (tiryaglakṣaṇa), like blueness, which would have to be present in several blue particulars at one time, but it also rules out “vertical universals” (ūrdhvatālakṣaṇa), or substances persisting throughout time, the numerically identical individual that would be present in each time-slice of a thing.[13] It is only series of qualitatively similar moments that constitute what we customarily take to be enduring objects, but there is actually nothing that remains numerically the same for more than one instant.

1.3 Two arguments for momentariness

Dharmakīrti has two arguments for the momentariness (kṣaṇikatva) of all that exists, one quite obscure and unconvincing, which he inherited from previous writers like Vasubandhu (5 century C.E.), and the other more promising.[14] The first argument, which nowadays is commonly known as the vināśitvānumāna, or “the inference of things perishing [spontaneously],” turns on the long-attested Buddhist idea that perishing must be of the intrinsic nature of any object. Perishing due to its intrinsic nature, something will always perish as soon it exists.[15] The point is that such moment by moment destruction is spontaneous (ākasmika) and is the uncaused real nature of things, because it cannot be an effect of any cause. The effect of such a cause, i.e., the absence of the entity, would have to be a type of non-being (abhāva), and non-being is unreal.

A key underlying principle of the vināśitvānumāna is that negative facts, such as absences, are not part of the ultimate furniture of the world but are just fictional conceptual constructions, as they are devoid of causal powers. Equally, a fiction lacking causal powers is not the effect of something else. While it is obviously impossible to deny that hammers smash pots, the absence (abhāva) of the pot, i.e., the non-existent pot, is not an effect, just as other non-existent things (abhāva), like horns of rabbits, are not effects of anything either. Hammers and the like are thus not actually causes of the pot’s absence but of it turning into potsherds. That idea is perhaps defensible, in that arguably the mere absence of something—a purely negative fact—might be less real and less efficacious than the presence of other things.[16] Nonetheless, the rest of the argument looks to consist in a number of non-sequiturs going from that difference in efficacy and reality between absences and presences to the idea that perishing is somehow the real nature of things, that it must be intrinsic to them, and that therefore things must perish spontaneously moment after moment. Let’s grant the Buddhist view that the perishing of x is the real property of changing into a new thing, and not just x becoming absent. If it is accepted that hammer blows do change pots into potsherds, then why couldn’t someone skeptical about the Buddhist’s arguments just take that as the model of how things perish when they do? It does not follow from that model of perishing that a pot could not endure for quite a while.

There is, fortunately, a much better argument for intrinsic momentariness than the problematic vināśitvānumāna. This argument is known as “the inference [of things’ momentariness] from the [mere] fact of [them] existing” (sattvānumāna), and seems to be largely Dharmakīrti’s own invention, first developed in the second chapter of his Pramāṇaviniścaya. If anything exists and is a specific thing rather than another, it is because of its causal efficacy (arthakriyā), or powers to produce such and such effects. Thus, the sattvānumāna reasoning, concisely formulated, is that things are impermanent, i.e., are new things moment after moment, because they are always causally efficient in some way. (Although not stated, it seems to be presupposed that real things are every moment causing some or another different effect. The differences between effects would be subtle ones that often escape our perception.) The key step in the argument is that nothing causes new effects while itself remaining the same. Dharmakīrti, in the opening passages of the Vādanyāya, argues that if something were permanent (nitya), it would be causally inert as it would neither produce its effects all at once (yaugapadyena) nor serially (kramena). Of course, it is the second hypothesis that is the most attractive possibility for an espouser of permanently enduring things: he would hold that a permanent unchanging cause would produce a series of different effects, not because the cause changes in any way, but simply because of the presence of new and different surrounding circumstances.

Suppose it said that a permanent thing has successive concomitant circumstances in dependence upon which it brings about a collection of effects serially.[17]

To this objection, Dharmakīrti, and especially the later commentators like Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla, reply that if a would-be cause remained unchanged over time and if it was only the concomitant circumstances that changed, then it would have to be the new circumstances that were the actual cause of the new effects. After all, the permanent thing would be present unchanged both when the new effects are present and when they are absent. This failure of the co-presence and co-absence (anvayavyatireka) conditions for determining cause and effect would show, for Dharmakīrti, that the ever-present thing is not the actual cause of the new developments, but that something else is. This is not unreasonable. If an epidemiologist, for example, found that certain factors had been constant for quite some time before the outbreak of an infectious disease and remained unchanged at the time of the outbreak, he would tend to discount them as being responsible for the epidemic. And if he found that some new powerful factors immediately preceded the outbreak, he most likely would pin the causality on them rather than on what had remained constant all along. The logic in these arguments against permanence can be generalized to various would-be entities, including notably the non-Buddhist idea of the permanent creator God (īśvara) who remains the same throughout time while supposedly producing a series of effects.

1.4 A causal theory of properties

We seem to have in Dharmakīrti what would nowadays be termed a type of “causal theory of properties.”[18] Particulars have causal properties, that is, powers (śakti) or “fitness” (yogyatā) to produce such and such results, in that they will produce those results when the right “complete collections” (sāmagrī) of circumstances and other properties are united. And what makes any property what it is consists in the contribution it makes to the potential causal behaviour of what has it.

The question then arises in what way particulars have properties or powers. It is important to emphasize that for Dharmakīrti and many other Buddhists particulars are not separate entities that own or have separately existing properties/powers. Much of the argument here in Buddhist Epistemology (and in other schools of Buddhism) is essentially an appeal to perceptual evidence and common sense: particulars are real and must be objects of perception; nobody perceives a particular without its properties, and indeed nobody can see a difference between the bearer of the properties and the properties themselves; hence any such distinction is unreal. These reasons are also fleshed out into a fundamental position, initially strongly advocated by Dignāga, that subject-predicate differences in language do not mirror a corresponding difference between substances and properties in reality (see section 2.2). Bare particulars that somehow have properties, or in which properties are instantiated, would thus be ruled out.[19]

Are the powers themselves particulars or universals? It can be argued that Dharmakīrti and his fellow Buddhists are best understood as trope theorists: the powers/properties that make up particulars are themselves particular entities, differing according to each location in space and time (see section 2.2.2). Charles Goodman and others have made a persuasive case that properties (dharma) for Ābhidharmika Buddhists are indeed tropes, i.e., properties that are particular—a blueness, a heat, or a hardness specific to one place-time and not common to several. The Epistemologists’ version of dharmas would be no exception in that respect of being particulars rather than universals.[20] The causal theory, however, does make for some significant differences from Ābhidharmikas. Many important Ābhidharmikas, i.e., those of the Sarvāstivāda school, regarded dharmas from a complex double perspective: a) their intrinsic natures (svabhāva), i.e., what they are, and b) their present causal activity (kāritra) along with their capabilities (sāmarthya) to lead to effects when the appropriate circumstances obtain. The intrinsic natures of dharmas are given in terms of categorical properties—being blue, being square, being hard, etc—and are treated like quiddities, what dharmas simply are in themselves. The activities and capabilities, on the other hand, are presented in causal terms, e.g., giving rise to perceptions of blue and square, producing subsequent similar things, etc. Not surprisingly, there are involved Abhidharma debates on the relationship between the intrinsic natures and causal activities/capabilities, a rather typically evasive Sarvāstivādin response (i.e., that of Saṅghabhadra) being that they are neither the same nor different.[21] The most radical way out of this problem of the relationship between the intrinsic and the causal is to say, as do Nāgārjuna and his Mādhyamika followers, that there cannot really be any intrinsic natures at all: if anything had a quiddity intrinsically, as Ābhidharmikas and others hold, it would absurdly need to have it completely acausally—nothing could ever cause a thing to be what it is intrinsically. A less radical strategy is a causal theory that makes no separation at all between what something is and what it does. That is the strategy that Dharmakīrti ably pursued.[22]

Let us grant that for Dharmakīrti particulars are somehow identified with appropriate causal powers. Is it then an essential or an accidental feature of a thing x that it will produce y under the appropriate conditions, and is it essential or accidental to y that it is caused by x? In a causal theory of properties these features are generally taken to be essential. To what degree does Dharmakīrti subscribe to that? The point needs analysis. On the one hand, Dharmakīrti does very strongly advocate a type of connection that seems to be more than an accidental feature of things. This is the so-called “connection by essential natures” (svabhāva­pratibandha) [23] between cause and effect, and this connection will guarantee that there is a “nexus where [the effect] will not be without [the cause]” (avinābhāvaniyama). Arguments invoking this nexus can, for example, be seen in the Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti’s discussion of I.34–47. He begins by introducing verse 34 as follows:

Well, if observation and non-observation were no basis for knowing the co-presence and co-absence [of smoke and fire], how then does one know that smoke does not deviate (na vyabhicarati) from fire?[24]

Dharmakīrti then argues that whatever is smoke must have originated from fire in order for it to be smoke—otherwise it’s just a smoke-like thing, a pseudo-smoke. And he also says that if something like a “termite tower” (śakramūrdhan) did actually have the causal properties of fire—i.e., the fitness (yogyatā) to produce real smoke—then it indeed would be on fire (see Dunne 2004, 335–338).

That said, on the other hand, there certainly is no development of a modal logic of necessity and possibility and talk of possible worlds in Dharmakīrti, nor in Indian philosophy generally for that matter.[25] Although Buddhist Epistemologists do often talk of non-existent things, like rabbit’s horns (śaśaviṣāṇa), it is far from clear that they would predicate positive properties (say, sharpness) of them in such and such possible situations or “worlds.” What then is the force of the “must” in the smoke-fire cases, and more generally when terms have a “nexus” so that one will not be without the other? Words that are typically used in these kind of Dharmakīrtian discussions are niścaya (certainty) and avyabhicāra (not-deviating). Many modern interpreters have used the term “necessity” in interpreting these and related terms (See e.g., Dunne 2004, ch. 3; Iwata 2004); this might lead one to think that when F and G have a nexus, it is a necessary truth (i.e., true in all possible worlds) that for all x, if x is F then x is G. A more likely interpretation, however, is that Dharmakīrti is dealing with the actual world and that these key terms are to be interpreted epistemically in terms of justification: given such and such natural connections between F and G, we can be sure that for all x, if x is F then x is G. Taking niścaya in this way, his point would not be about metaphysical necessity throughout worlds but more about justified very strong confidence that a universally quantified material implication holds without exception in the actual world because of natures in this world.[26]

1.5 Humean and Dharmakīrtian causality

A comparison with Hume may bring the tensions in Dharmakīrti’s position into better focus. Hume had famously said in Section 7 of his Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding: “We may define a cause to be an object followed by another, and where all the objects, similar to the first, are followed by objects similar to the second.” Causal connections are said to consist in contingent regularities established by observation. What the above-cited passage from the Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti suggests, however, is that for Dharmakīrti such mere regularities are somehow not enough and that something stronger is at stake: there are features “in” the causal relata themselves. Indeed his causal theory of properties allows him to assert that fire, being what it is, must cause smoke under the right conditions and that smoke, being smoke, must be caused by fire. That being said, there are also very important passages in Dharmakīrti’s works where he does speak of establishing causality because one observes an effect when there is a particular cause and does not observe it when that cause is absent. As in the case of Hume, this too is an observation of regularities and would seem to be fallible, subject to exceptions. It is the Indian method of observing successive co-presence (anvaya) and co-absence (vyatireka) and is a type of induction used throughout Indian philosophy to establish connections between two types of things. Dharmakīrti relies on a multi-step procedure that is sometimes explained in terms of a threefold combination of observations (upalabdhi) and non-observations (anupalabdhi) and sometimes in terms of five. Thus we have the so-called “triple” or “fivefold examination” (trikapañcakacintā) of causality that is developed by later Buddhist writers, such as Dharmottara, Jñānaśrīmitra and Mokṣākaragupta.[27] Other provisos are also added in an attempt to rule out certain bogus circumstances that would vitiate the procedure (see e.g., Lasic 1999). The details and problems cannot be taken up here. This method of anvaya and vyatireka has been profitably compared with J.S. Mill’s “Method of Agreement and Difference” to establish causation (see Matilal 1998,17; cf. Tillemans 2004, 265–269).

So how are these passages in Dharmakīrti and the commentarial literature to be taken? How do his two positions hang together? One interpretation might be to say that Dharmakīrti, somewhat naïvely, thought he could arrive at a thoroughly infallible inductive procedure by ever more adroit qualifications of the observations and non-observations. Gillon (1991) is an attempt to show that Dharmakīrti’s philosophy, in attempting to come up with such a watertight procedure, ran up against a problem of induction that wouldn’t go away. A more charitable exegesis is to say that his philosophy recognizes that the way we find out through a posteriori methods whether or not x and y are causally related is a quite different matter from what causality is—the latter, as we had remarked, involves causal properties of things that make them what they are. Thus we might have to discover empirically that fire will burn fuel under such and such conditions, but nonetheless that property is not one that it could do without and still be fire. The more sophisticated interpretation of Dharmakīrti would then be that causality between things is a more-than-contingent connection due to the constitutive properties of things in this world, but nonetheless one that is established a posteriori. To take a modern analogy in a Kripkean vein, while water must be H2O and whales must be mammals, we discover those facts, which in some sense could not be otherwise, through empirical methods and fallibly .

2. Epistemology and philosophy of language

Here is the basic epistemological stance that Dharmakīrti inherited from Dignāga’s Pramāṇasamuccaya. Just as there are only two kinds of objects of knowledge, real particulars and fictional universals, there are only two types of knowledge, or more exactly “sources of knowledge” (pramāṇa), viz., “perception” (pratyakṣa) and “inference” (anumāṇa). Perception is always purely non-conceptual and non-linguistic whereas inference is conceptual, linguistic thinking[28] that proceeds on the basis of good reasons. Particulars are the objects of perception and universals are the objects of inference—one sees specific shapes, colors, but when one thinks “red is a color” the subject and predicate terms range over several things. Perception has the special status of giving direct access to the real, whereas conceptual thought is, in an important way, distorted (bhrānta) because it “superimposes” universals that aren’t actually there in the particulars themselves.

For Dignāga (and his successors) this split between perception and conceptual thought was part and parcel of a type of foundationalism. Perception is directly causally bound to particulars and “fixed” (niyata) by them: its internal representation (ākāra) of the object is causally determined by, and corresponds to, the particular itself. It is for that reason that perception is the fundamental “contact” with the world upon which the superstructure of conceptual cognition rests; conceptual cognition, on the other hand, is not fixed in this way by particulars and can to a large degree think what it will about whatever it chooses. The separation between perception and conceptual thinking in Pramāṇasamuccaya is thus radical indeed and yields what seems to be a counterintuitive consequence. For Dignāga it would seem that one and the same object could never be both perceived and thought about. Non-Buddhist thinkers, such as Naiyāyikas and Mīmāṃsakas, did not have this problem. They could cheerfully allow that when one person sees a vase and another thinks about it, the type of understanding may be different but the object is the same in that the conceptual thought grasps a real universal vaseness that inheres in the same particular vase that is perceived. But Dignāga could not go that route as a nominalist. For him if the object of thought is vaseness, that object is unreal and thus quite different from the real particular vases that one sees.

Two problems loom large in Dignāga’s account: (1) What are the necessary and sufficient conditions of a source of knowledge (pramāṇa) and when are we justified in thinking that these conditions are met? (2) Given that only perception has direct access to the real and is causally bound to it, how is it that conceptual thought could ever be about real particulars at all and be considered a genuine source of knowledge? We’ll take up the questions one by one.

2.1 Pramāṇas and justification

Dignāga had left the problem of the nature of pramāṇas largely open, as he did with the issue of justification. These matters were left to Dharmakīrti, who defines a “source of knowledge” in Pramāṇavārttika II.1 as a “reliable (avisaṃvādin) cognition (jñāna),” by which he means that the cognition is right and reliable as a basis for action.[29] Some commentators, such as Dharmottara, have unpacked “reliability” as meaning that the cognition leads to one obtaining (prāpaka) the object one desires, a position which, along with passages concerning arthakriyā, might seem to reinforce the view of some modern scholars that Dharmakīrti was a pragmatist (see e.g., Powers 1994; Cabezon 2000; Katsura 1984). [30] Tillemans (1999, 6–12) examines this would-be pragmatism, seeing the theory of truth in Dharmakīrti as a weak form of correspondence. The pragmatism is better taken as a pragmatic theory of justification rather than truth. We can justifiably affirm that a cognition is correct if we can “confirm causal efficacy” (arthakriyāsthiti), by which it is meant that we come to understand that the object does in fact have the causal powers we expected. We can justifiably conclude, for example, that we saw a vase and not some vase-like illusion because after the initial perception we then confirmed that what we saw does really hold water, as we expected and wished (iṣṭa). Note that while most sense perceptions are to be confirmed by subsequent perceptions or inferences, there is no infinite regress here: some perceptions—e.g., those of very familiar objects or of the capacity of such objects to produce effects—need no subsequent confirmation. Logical inference too needs no ulterior confirmation. These are said to be “intrinsically sources of knowledge” (svataḥ prāmāṇya) and are prima facie reliable in that they will be trusted as knowledge unless it is shown that some cause of error is present.[31]

It is important to emphasize, against a simplistic pragmatic interpretation of Dharmakīrti’s position, that a reliable cognition is not one that just happens to be right and works to enable one to obtain what one seeks. It must also be a cognition that came about via a reliable route, i.e., an appropriate causal pathway or a set of good reasons. Tibetan scholars will emphasize that to conceptually know P the knower must herself ascertain P (Tib. nges pa = Skt. niścaya, niścita) with a pramāṇa, and that this ascertainment must itself involve antecedent reliable cognitions (i.e., perceptual or conceptual pramāṇas) in order to be genuine. Thus, for example, one ascertains P on the basis of good reasons Q, R, etc., whose characteristics one has ascertained earlier. If, however, one rightly thinks P is the case, but did “not [first] ascertain with a pramāṇa” (tshad mas ma nges pa) the characteristics of Q, R, this is deemed to be, in Geluk (dge lugs) texts, a “true presumption where the [character of the] reason was not determined” (Tib. rgyu mtshan gtan la ma phab pa’i yid dpyod), or following the Sakya (sa skya) thinkers, a mere “doubt that is in accord with the real” (Tib. the tshom don mthun). For both these Tibetan schools, such an understanding of P is not itself a pramāṇa. This is a credible account of what Dharmakīrti held. In short, pramāṇas do work out as we wish, but only because they are cognitions that have followed the requisite reliable route.

But does this talk of ascertainment then mean that the Buddhist Epistemologist adopts an internalist account of epistemic justification? Is the Buddhist saying that when you genuinely know something, you need to know that you know it, i.e., be able to establish to yourself and others that you have the requisite justification? [32] It is not at all clear that Dharmakīrti or his Tibetan interpreters were internalists about epistemic justification. Nothing in his own talk of “ascertainment” clinches an internalist interpretation that the person who infers must also himself access the reason and ascertain with a pramāṇa that it does justify the inference. When the debater ascertains the characteristics of the reason, all this may mean is that a person making an inference must only in fact have followed a number of reliable procedures to initially determine the characteristics of the reason. It need not mean that when one knows something inferentially one must also be aware of the justification basis, i.e., the reason, and know that it does indeed justify the inference.

It might be retorted that Dharmakīrti’s idea of all awareness being “reflexive awareness” (svasaṃvedana) shows his internalism. But “reflexive awareness”—often termed “self-awareness” (even though for Buddhists it is emphatically not an awareness of a self and its states)—will not get us all the way to internalism about justification either. Following Williams (1998), Kellner (2010) and Arnold (2010), there seem to be to be two basic themes in the positions from Dignāga and Dharmakīrti to Śāntarakṣita that all consciousness is non-conceptually reflexive: (1) that the mind perceives such and such objects as well as how it experiences those objects; it is thus non-conceptually aware of the objective and subjective aspects (ākāra), or appearances (ābhāsa), of all its states; (2) that reflexive awareness is a condition of sentience: an experience is not just a material process (like, say, digestion), but can lead to subsequent memory and conceptualization because it is non-conceptually “auto-illuminated.”[33] On both versions, however, while someone could be aware that she is now inferring P in reliance upon a reason Q, it is hard to see that her simple awareness of processes “going on in her head” would also mean that she herself would know that or why the inference was justified. Reflexive awareness is aware of whatever conscious processes are occurring, be they delusions or reliable. So, while a person would be aware of the brute fact that thoughts were occurring, their credentials are another matter.

2.2 Aboutness: the theory of apoha

At the heart of Dignāga’s and Dharmakīrti’s philosophies is the principle that particulars, i.e., what is real, are only properly grasped by perception; the way they are in themselves is thus said to be “ineffable” (avyapadeśya; Tib. bstan bya min), “not an object of words” (śabdasyāviṣaya).[34] Now, obviously, we do in some way manage to talk about particulars—otherwise language would be useless in daily life. But why then say that language and thought fail to capture them? The answer is twofold. First of all, grammatical elements, like subject and predicate, qualifier and qualificand, agent and action, etc., have no corresponding ontological features, as particulars are unities admitting no distinctions between possessors of properties (dharmin) and properties (dharma). Dharmakīrti puts the point as follows in Pramāṇavārttika I.61:

In all cases words expressing substances and their properties just make this [conceptual] distinction. Thus there is no difference whatsoever in the [object] to which they refer.[35]

Secondly, and perhaps more decisively, the kinds or universals that we think and talk about are not features of the particulars themselves but are merely fictions. Of course, the fact that we do use terms like “cow” non-arbitrarily may easily lead us to think that the term must have corresponding real “grounds for its application” (pravttinimitta), and that cow particulars themselves are grouped in a natural kind due to their common essential properties. But the clear upshot of the Buddhist’s nominalist position about universals is that there are no such natural kinds, and that the usage of terms is not explicable by matching up terms with them.

Ineffability thus unpacks as a thorough mismatch between representations due to thought and language on the one hand and what there is on the other. For Buddhist Epistemologists this mismatch means that they cannot adopt unnuanced the predominant Brahmanical approach of vyākaraṇa, a grammatically oriented metaphysics in which genuine ontological features would be revealed by the features of Sanskrit grammar (such as case and gender accord between adjectives and nouns, connections between substantives via the genitive case, etc. Much of Dignāga’s philosophy of language is indeed an attempt to account for such Sanskrit grammatical phenomena, but without the realist baggage.) However, it also leads to a larger matter. The problem is that if the real world is composed only of particulars that are ineffable, it becomes difficult to see how language could nonetheless somehow refer to real things or ever be about entities in the world. The Buddhist Epistemologists are, in effect, to borrow an idea of Donald Davidson (1984), subscribers to a rigid separation between a conceptual scheme and a perceptual content free from the scheme’s additions and distortions, and their problem then becomes how to bridge that very scheme-content gap so that thought and language are still somehow about reality. To solve this problem of “aboutness” Dignāga had devised the theory of concepts, i.e., apoha (“exclusions”). Dharmakīrti reinterpreted this theory, once again, in terms of causal relations. Here are the broad outlines.[36]

2.2.1 Dignāga’s apoha

Let us speak about two Buddhist approaches to bridge the scheme-content gap, “top-down”, or descriptive, approaches and “bottom-up”, or causal, approaches. By “top-down” we shall mean an account which maintains that it is because of some specific (and perhaps ingenious) features of the fictional proxy, or concept, that it pertains to particular things. Even though it does not have the ontological baggage of a real universal, the fictional proxy determines the reference of the words because the descriptive content it provides does in some way have its counterpart in the objects. Thus on a top-down approach, the fictional stand-in for a universal like “blueness” would behave like a property, a sense or a meaning, that belongs to the conceptual scheme but would nonetheless qualify and serve to pick out the real blue particulars in the world. This can be accomplished, according to Buddhist Epistemologists, because the fictional proxies are, or can be analyzed to be, “exclusions of what is other” (anyāpoha), a type of double negation which applies to particular patches of blue in the sense that each such patch is non-non-blue.[37] As Dignāga had put it in his Sāmānyaparīkṣā (“Analysis of Universals”):

A word talks about entities only as they are qualified by the negation of other things.[38]

In fact, Dignāga applied his analysis both to things and to the words that express them: non-non-blue is the universal-qua-object (arthasāmānya) signified by the term “blue”, and non-non-“blue” is the universal-qua-word (śabdasāmānya) that applies to particular articulations of the word “blue”. For Dignāga, the signified-signifier (vācyavācaka) relation holds between these two quasi-universals.[39]

Why are they “quasi” and not full-fledged universals? The reasoning is not explicit in Dignāga. However, it can be plausibly reconstructed. Buddhist Epistemologists generally subscribed to the principle that mere absences of properties are of a lesser ontological status than positive things. They would stress that negative facts, like x not being blue, heavy, etc., are constituted by our mere interests (i.e., we seek a blue thing at such and such a location and come away empty-handed), and are less real than the fact that x causes perceptions of blue, a fact which is what it is objectively and independently of interests. It seems that it is this general Buddhist intuition of the unreality of absences upon which Dignāga relied. As the “exclusion of what is other” is itself only a negative property/absence of something rather than a presence, we are spared commitment to there being real universals in addition to real particulars.

Dignāga’s approach in the fifth chapter of Pramāṇasamuccaya is indeed top-down in that he relies upon the descriptive content of the apoha to pick out the appropriate particulars. And top-down is also how the “exclusion theory” (apohavāda) is presented in the works of non-Buddhist opponents of Dignāga, as well as in modern works treating of the subject. Bimal K. Matilal interpreted the theory in this fashion (see Matilal 1971, 41), as did Hans Herzberger. Herzberger (1975), developed an ingenious logical strategy, using some possibilities offered by Emil Post’s theory of twofold propositions, to come up with what he termed a “resourceful nominalism,” one that would explain how predicates applied non-arbitrarily to individual things, that would account for our naïve semantic intuitions, and that would nonetheless avoid ontological commitment to universals. Every proposition would be analyzable as an ordered pair of content and commitment—“apohist double negation” would affirm content but deny ontological commitment. In what seems to be at least partially a top-down approach, Mark Siderits has taken the relevant double negation as involving two different types of negation, choice and exclusion, so that it is the combination of the two that picks out a class of individuals, all the while staying nominalistically unengaged to universals (Siderits 1995; 2005). Finally, perhaps the most striking modern use of a comparable double negation—i.e., difference from others— is the view in the Cours de linguistique générale of Ferdinand de Saussure that word-types and phonemes are only characterized by their differences from other ones in a system, although this 19th–20th century Swiss structuralist was neither aware of possible 6th century parallels in Indian philosophy nor motivated primarily by nominalist ontological worries (see D’Ottavi 2010).

It remains far from clear, however, how genuine nominalist mileage is to be gained on a top-down approach, ingenious as it may be. The usual charge against it by non-Buddhist critics, like Kumārila and Uddyotakara, is circularity: if an understanding of blue is to be analyzed as an understanding of non-non-blue and any negation presupposes understanding the negandum, then understanding what non-non-blue is would depend on understanding blue—we go round in circles. Hugon (2011) gives Dharmakīrti’s response to that charge, which consists essentially of a tu quoque argument—one needs to understand what a term excludes as much as what it applies to. Hale (2011) reformulates the difficulty as being that the Buddhist seems to run counter to the compositionality of language; he argues that the non-Buddhist criticism will thus remain. The problem is discussed intensely by Indo-Tibetan thinkers, like Śāntarakṣita (for further discussion, see the entry on Śāntarakṣita) and Sa skya Paṇḍita (see Hugon 2008, 479–485, 205–210). What is striking is that while it can certainly be argued—as these thinkers do—that a meaningful term presents both a class of things to which it applies and another to which it does not apply, it is difficult to see how the latter would or should occupy a privileged place. Why would we understand words first and foremost by the via negativa?

2.2.2 Dharmakīrti’s causal version of apoha

On a bottom-up approach, on the other hand, the double exclusion plays a comparatively minor role, and thus some of the Kumārila-Uddyotakara criticisms may be less telling. Causal chains and error are what serve to bridge the scheme-content gap, rather than the descriptive content of the apoha. It is notable that such reliance on causality seems to be entirely absent in Dignāga: it is Dharmakīrti’s major contribution to the theory. The way words link to things is thus primarily explained through the existence of a causal chain from particular things to perceptions to thoughts and to the utterances of words—in short we have a type of causal theory of reference.[40] While modern day causal theories of reference—such as that of Saul Kripke—are typically used to explain how proper names can refer without descriptive content, the theory can be extended in various ways to kind terms. Such is the move of Hilary Putnam who emphasized that descriptive content, or at its simplest just “what is in one’s head,” is not enough to distinguish between seemingly similar kinds. Dharmakīrti’s causal theory too is not restricted to the reference of proper names, but also seeks to explain causally reference to kinds of things. The causal connection is needed to guarantee “contact” with the world, i.e., that language ultimately must rest upon perception, which is non-abitrary in that it is “fixed” by things. Dharmakīrti thus explains how an individual (to be called “Jones”) can think about and refer to such and such an object in the world through a complex and long causal chain from the particular objects to the mental invention of a quasi-universal and the use of a word on a specific occasion. Thoughts and talk of blue are thus about blue things because only blue things play the appropriate causal role in leading to the thought and finally the word.[41]

Here are the bare bones of the causal account as we find it in the Pramāṇavārttika: Jones sees particular blue things and they cause perceptual images (ākāra) in his mind; these images (and often other factors, like longstanding habits) cause him to make the “same judgment” (ekapratyavamarśa), “This is blue,” a judgment to which appears an apoha, i.e., a generic representation of non-non-blue. Because the particular perceptual images all have the same effect in leading to the same judgment “This is blue”, they all therefore share a key causal power and are grouped together. The judgments and resulting use of words are about blue things, and not red things, precisely because there is a causal chain from blue particulars and there isn’t one from red particulars.[42]

So much for causal connections replacing real universals to group entities. How then do words refer to grouped entities via a causal chain? And how does the causal chain get passed on over time in a community of speakers? It looks like we have something much like the two-fold process of reference-fixing and reference-borrowing that figure in causal theories of reference.[43]

The initial reference-fixing is done “at the time of [establishing] the linguistic convention” (saṃketakāle)[44] by dubbing a sample case with the words, “This is blue”. This dubbing is a purely causal event not dependent on any descriptive content. It is an arbitrary choice, or speech-intention (vivakṣā), of the dubber to designate a blue sample with the term “blue” rather than another.[45] Other things will then also be grouped together under “blue” by the combination of perception and judgment described above. This initial reference-fixing is then preserved in a commonly respected convention that transmits the original intention and dubbing from speaker to speaker.[46] Subsequently “at the time of using [language] conventions” (vyavahārakāle) other speakers will rely on their previous habits, or “imprints” (vāsanā), and the earlier reference-fixing that is now a well-established convention in the community. Although speakers could in principle use the word “blue” to refer to, say, the colour of chocolate, practical considerations generally mean that they won’t: if someone wishes to tap into the causal chain transmitted from the initial dubbing, she will use “blue” for blue things exclusively.

Dharmakīrti’s version of the apoha theory is developed in long sections in several chapters of Pramāṇavārttika. No doubt, many questions need a fuller treatment. Here are two of the main ones. (1) Given that this is a causal rather than descriptive account of aboutness, what role remains for the apoha, i.e., the double negations upon which Dignāga had placed so much emphasis? (2) Wouldn’t having the same powers to produce such and such a judgment depend on having some common universals, or even itself be a common universal, and thus force us to reinstate realism?

Dharmakīrti and his commentators constantly account for the mental content of thought in terms of generic representations that are “exclusions of what is other” (anyāpoha), this from the “time of [establishing] the linguistic convention” (saṃketakāla) to the “time when one uses the convention” (vyavahārakāla). But if aboutness is indeed assured causally, what is the theoretical interest of anyāpoha? Either Dharmakīrti’s theory of reference is not purely causal, but is a hybrid theory involving both causal and descriptive elements,[47] or anyāpoha is not there in Dharmakīrti’s theory to assure aboutness/reference but is his response to another type of concern. Although there certainly are modern hybrid theories of reference combining the causal and the descriptive, it is not clear how (or if) Dharmakīrti proposes to do that. What seems more likely following Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti ad 68–75 and ad 128 (see Dunne 2004, 134–136 and 339–352) is that anyāpoha is there in the theory essentially to answer metaphysical worries. Granted that we think that the mental content, i.e., the generic representation, has a distribution (anvaya) over several instances, is it genuinely distinct from or the same as the instances? In the former case, it would not apply to them; in the latter case it would itself be a particular and unable to apply to other particulars. The postulate of anyāpoha is designed to avoid that dilemma of a quasi-universal being the same or different—it is neither as it unreal. As Dunne (2004, 136) puts it: “…by relegating distribution to a negation, Dharmakīrti blocks any attempt at raising distribution (or a distributed entity) to the level of ultimate reality.”
That multiple particulars all have the same power to produce the same judgment is not, for Dharmakīrti, itself based on any underlying same intrinsic features that would explain why this is so. In Pramāṇavārttika III.73–74 he cites a famous example of different plants that all have the capacity to alleviate fever, but where one cannot point out any features in common that would account for the fact that all the various plants work as febrifuges. Similarly for particulars all causing the same judgment: there is no common property that would explain why this happens.[48] But can’t one say that all of them having that capacity just is possession of a common universal, i.e. having the power to produce the same judgment? Lacking that common universal-feature, how could we judge that the particulars have the same power? This argument should seem déjà vu for the nominalist. We’ve come full circle back to realist’s basic worry: how could we group things without there being some real universal in common? Dharmakīrti’s response is to say that in fact particulars don’t really possess a common power, if one means by that a power that would itself be a universal. The powers themselves are all particulars and differ from each other—the way one plant works is not the way the other works to cure fever and the way one blue particular causes the judgment “This is blue” differs from the way another does. These multiple ways exhibit no intrinsic properties in common that would explain why they all work to produce a desired common effect. At most there is just the negative grouping of being distinct from everything which lacks the power, and that, as we know by now, is an apoha and not a real property.

3. Logic and Philosophy of logic

The way the Dignāga-Dharmakīrti school represent the mental process of reasoning is that one thinks: “A is B because of being C, like D.” More specifically, one invokes a logical reason C to prove the truth of the conclusion A is B; the example D, which is actually sometimes omitted, is a commonly acknowledged case of B-ness and C-ness that permits an individual to understand that all Cs are indeed Bs. The latter generalization is known as “pervasion” (vyāpti; Tibetan khyab pa) of C by B—a universally generalized material implication, for all x: if x is C then x is B, with the interesting feature that the quantification ranges over both actual and non-actual items. (The indispensability or dispensability of the example for one to ascertain/establish the pervasion becomes a hotly debated topic amongst later theoreticians.[49])

There is also an important variant where the truth of “A is B” is not being established, but only the fact that it would follow from an acceptance (abhyupagama) of A being C. Thus a debater can present an opponent with a prasaṅga (consequence) of the sort: “It would follow absurdly that A would be B, because of being C.” Such a consequence will constitute the key step in a proof by reductio ad absurdum, a proof that will culminate in a type of contraposition, turning on modus tollens. When the pervasion in the consequence holds and the opponent understands that A is not in fact B, the opponent will then be led by a “contraposition of the consequence” (prasaṅgaviparyaya, literally “reversing the consequence”) to understand that A is not in fact C because of not being B. Both these structures, i.e., proofs by logical reasons and consequences, are to be found in Indian and Tibetan writing on a variety of subjects.

3.1 Good reasons and the triple criterion

Since T. Stcherbatsky’s two volume study and translation of Dharmakīrti’s Nyāyabindu, entitled Buddhist Logic (i.e., Stcherbatsky 1930/32), one often sees the Buddhist theory of reasons/indices designated as “logic,” a term that sometimes has the unwanted effect of leading readers to think that good reasons for Buddhists are simply those that are formally valid. In fact, the notion of formal validity (i.e., the conclusion’s being guaranteed true, provided the premises are true) is not itself explicitly discussed by Buddhist theoreticians; it is in any case not distinguished from other, more informal, considerations. Instead of formally valid reasons, Buddhist theoreticians developed the notion of a good reason (saddhetu, Tibetan rtags yang dag), i.e., one which satisfies a triple criterion (trairūpya). These three criteria for “goodness” are given in the following fashion from Dharmakīrti on:

  • pakṣadharmatva (the logical reason’s being a property of the subject): the subject A is ascertained (niścita) as having the property C;
  • anvayavyāpti (pervasion [that is formulated] as co-presence ): C is ascertained as present in only instances that are similar (sapakṣa) to A insofar as they possess B;
  • vyatirekavyāpti (pervasion [formulated] as co-absence): C is ascertained as wholly absent from instances dissimilar (vipakṣa) to A insofar as they do not possess B.[50]

True, in texts like the Hetucakra of Dignāga (which was taken up in detail by Dharmakīrti in Pramāṇavārttika IV and Pramāṇaviniścaya III), a version of the triple criterion (trairūpya) for good reasons and the operators “partial presence,” “complete presence,” and “complete absence” were correlated to yield a series of nine types of reasons, types that are abstracted from content and subject matter. Not inappropriately, the great historian of logic, Innocentius Bocheński, in the chapter on Indian Logic in his History of Formal Logic, stated that the Hetucakra thus suggested an awareness of formal considerations. R.S.Y. Chi, in his Buddhist Formal Logic (Chi 1984), went several steps further and attempted to show that the Hetucakra, taken in its formal aspects, might present a number of interesting features to a modern logician. That being said, there is certainly much more to “good reasons” satisfying Dharmakīrti’s triple criterion than simple formal validity. The term “ascertained” (niścita), when unpacked by Dharmakīrti and his commentators, demands that good reasons must be sound (i.e., the premises must in fact be true and the conclusion must follow from them), that their three characteristics must be ascertained, and that the opponent have the appropriate “desire to know” (jijñāsā) something new that he does not already know. This latter demand leads to a host of other requirements: in order to be convinced of something new the opponent must have the requisite doubt, understand the terms and accept the subject of debate. In short, good reasons involve formal considerations (what follows from what?); factual considerations (what is so? what is true?); epistemic considerations (what needs to be known in order for people to genuinely know something else? when is doubt possible?); and what can be termed “rhetorical considerations” (what is newly convincing to whom? when does the debate have a point and when does it fall flat?). The weighting of these aspects in the theory of the “triple criterion” changes over history in complex fashions. At certain points what were factual matters become epistemic matters, and this even leads to interesting reorientations of the triple criterion.[51]

3.2 Inference-for-others

Later theoretical elaborations by Dignāga, Dharmakīrti, et al. about how to present publicly (i.e., verbally) a good reason (saddhetu) to an adversary in a debate prescribe the use of complex verbal forms known as prayoga (formal reasonings). Thus, for example, the standard formal reasoning that Dharmakīrti and his Indo-Tibetan successors prescribed was a two-membered form, known as an “inference-for-others” (parārthānumāna):

All Cs are Bs, like D.

A is C.

Commentators make an explicit correlation with the triple criterion (trairūpya). Thus the first statement perspicuously expresses the pervasion (i.e., the anvayavyāpti and vyatirekavyāpti) and the second expresses the fact of the reason being a property of the subject (pakṣadharmatva). The statement of the conclusion, A is B, is omitted. Indeed it is explicitly ruled out in later prescriptive accounts of how Buddhists should argue. Dharmakīrti’s own position on this hardens over time to arrive, in the Vādanyāya, at the view that stating the conclusion is actually a “point of defeat” (nigrahasthāna). The irrelevance of the conclusion is supposedly because the only function of an inference-for-others is to show “provers” (sādhana), and a conclusion cannot prove itself. Although A is B, i.e., “what is to be proved” (sādhya), can be understood indirectly, it should not be stated. While the inference-for-others has often been thought to somehow formally resemble a syllogism in Aristotelian logic, it is apparent that the presence and absence of conclusions in syllogisms and inferences-for-others respectively as well as the idea of what constitutes a “prover” for Buddhists, means that parārthānumāna and Aristotelian syllogisms are accounted for in terms of considerably different philosophies of logic (see Tillemans 1999, 69–87).

3.3 Opaque contexts

While provers (sādhana), i.e., logical reasons and examples, can of course be expressed in words, as in a “public” inference-for-others, they are not themselves words. Although Dharmakīrti et al. speak in terms of one state of affairs, or one entity (artha), proving another, in fact the picture has all the complex features of the scheme-content gap and its bridges: logical reasoning is a mental process that directly treats of fictional proxies, i.e., concepts, which are in turn connected in apoha-fashion to real particular entities. Not surprisingly, the idea that provers are apoha-properties rather than words has its philosophical complexities. When do we have the same property and when do they differ? When a pervasion is bidirectional, or "equal" (samavyāpti), as in the case of being impermanent (anityatva) and being produced (kṛtakatva), it’s quite easy to see that the impermanent particulars will be identical with the produced particulars. Given that the bidirectional pervasion analyzes as “for all x, x is produced if and only if x is impermanent”, the extension of the two concepts (i.e., the set of impermanent particulars and the set of produced particulars) is the same for Buddhists. Nonetheless, substitutivity of one term for the other would seem to lead to an invalid inference where the premises are true but the conclusion is not. To bring out the problem, take the following tempting, but invalid, inference:

Being a product is a good reason for proving that sound is impermanent.
Being a product is coextensive with being impermanent (i.e., for all x: x is a product if and only if x is impermanent).
Therefore, being impermanent is a good reason for proving that sound is impermanent.

We go from two true premises to a false conclusion, for it is clear that for a Buddhist (as for most people) arguing that something is so simply because it is so is not giving a good reason. And yet it might also be thought that the move from premises to conclusion is an acceptable application of the principle of substitutivity of identicals for identicals salva veritate. What went wrong?

Dharmakīrti, in Pramāṇavārttika I verse 40 et sq. and Svavṛtti, diagnosed the problem as one of bidirectional pervasions (i.e., coextensive concepts) seeming to force us to accept pratijñārthaikadeśahetu “reasons that are one part of the thesis” (e.g., when one says “sound is impermanent because it is impermanent,” then the reason “being impermanent” is also a part of the thesis that is being proved). He saw this undesirable consequence as one of the main challenges to logical thought, i.e., “inference,” being a source of knowledge (pramāṇa), for unless one can somehow rule out the problematic substitutions in what I have called the “tempting inference,” we would be saddled with having to accept as good a huge number of singularly uninformative reasons.

The problem is recognizably the familiar one of substitutivity in referentially opaque contexts, such as propositional attitudes and modal contexts.[52] Talk of good reasons being ones where the debater has a desire to know P but not an equivalent Q is indeed an opaque context. To analyse what goes wrong in the tempting inference, Dharmakīrti, in effect, made a recognizable move by distinguishing between types of identities: “being impermanent” and “being produced” are extensionally identical, but somehow not intensionally so—what he terms being the same concept, i.e., exclusion (apoha; vyāvṛtti). And in the opaque context substitution should only be made between conceptually identical terms.

In fact, though, it could be said that the usual idea of an intensional identity (one that is understood to hold between properties F and G when the biconditional for all x: x is F if and only if x is G is true in all possible worlds) will not get us very far out of the woods, as being impermanent and being produced are arguably identical in that way, and it would thus seem that if that is what conceptual identity is about for a Buddhist Epistemologist it should be possible to make the substitution in the opaque contexts under discussion. Dharmakīrti’s idea of concepts F and G being identical thus demands a much stronger criterion than the necessary truth of the biconditional for all x: x is F iff x is G. In his Svavṛtti ad verse 40 and in considerable detail in the Tibetan Geluk (dge lugs) “Collected Topics” (bsdus grwa) literature and commentaries on Pramāṇavārttika, we find the makings of an idea of “conceptual identity/difference” (Tibetan ldog pa gcig/tha dad) such that to each meaningful subject or predicate term in a language there is a different concept—synonyms, for example, will express different concepts. Interestingly enough, although this individuation of exclusions/concepts might seem to lead to an undesirable proliferation of strange ultra-intensional entities, at least certain Epistemologists—e.g., Śāntarakṣita, Kamalaśīla and very clearly the twelfth-thirteenth century Tibetan Sa skya Paṇḍita (in the first chapter of his Tshad ma rigs gter)—emphasized that concepts were just fictions, façons de parler for different states of mind, and even that concepts were not to be reified as any kind of object (viṣaya; Tibetan yul) at all. The states of mind could be individuated unproblematically, and so derivatively we could somehow perhaps individuate the concepts too without committing ourselves to a plethora of occult objects, one for each word. It remains to be seen, however, whether shifting the burden to states of mind gets us out of the woods or still leaves us with “subsistent” entities that should make ontologically scrupulous nominalists cringe in horror.

4. Religion and ethics

Finally, what of the Buddhist religion? While Dharmakīrti has sometimes been depicted as a dry practitioner of an essentially secular philosophy, this seems hardly defensible. Technical logical and epistemological discussions on sources of knowledge were not just pursued for their own sake. They were also used to establish Buddhist religious doctrines, like the Four Noble Truths, the proofs of the Buddha being an authoritative/reliable person (pramāṇapuruṣa, Tibetan tshad ma’i skyes bu), the law of retribution of acts (karman), reincarnation, compassion, omniscience, the innate Buddha-nature, absence of real personal identity, etc.[53] All these topics are treated in extenso in the second chapter of Pramāṇavārttika, and some form the subject of independent treatises by later Epistemologists. There is also a concern with direct perception of religious truths and the methods leading to that extraordinary type of knowledge. In the third chapter of Pramāṇavārttika and in the perception chapters of the Nyāyabindu and Pramāṇaviniścaya, for example, Dharmakīrti seeks to explain and rationalize the perception of a yogin (yogipratyakṣa). He advocates a quite remarkable method of meditation—more literally “cultivation” (bhāvanā; abhyāsa)—in which philosophical analysis plays an indispensable role (see e.g., Taber 2009; see Tillemans 2016, chapter 10, on Dharmakīrti-style meditation, its epistemological challenges and the contrast with Chan Buddhist approaches).

The whys and wherefores of Dharmakīrti’s philosophy of religion are no doubt partly explained by the historical context in which he lived, one in which Buddhist institutions and power were confronted with forceful challenges of a reinvigorated Brahmanism.[54] Indeed, not just on matters of Buddhist doctrine but also on many metaphysical issues was there a religious dimension to his arguments. In the latter half of the first chapter of Pramāṇavārttika, Dharmakīrti proceeds to a detailed attack on the authority of the Vedas, the Brahmins that expound them, the Brahmanical ideas about the efficacy of mantras, and the system of caste (see Eltschinger 2000). It is noteworthy that a frequent Sanskrit term for “universal”, “kind”, i.e., jāti, is also the term for “caste.” As Eltschinger (2000) shows, the discussions on the unreality of universals and the unreality of caste were related for Dharmakīrti and were explicitly taken to be related by commentators like Śākyabuddhi and Karṇakagomin. Castes were natural kinds explainable through universals for non-Buddhists, and they were not arbitrary or man-made customary distinctions. An obvious pay-off of Dharmakīrti’s nominalism, then, was that Buddhists could further distance themselves from Brahmanical principles of social organization and ethics by attacking the metaphysical foundations of caste.

The debate with Brahmanical schools on specific doctrinal questions naturally moved to long and involved discussions on issues of scriptural authority, such as the Mīmāṃsaka school’s justification of the Vedas as being eternal, uncreated by humans (apauruṣeya) and hence authoritative because free from any human influence. (The Buddhist retort is essentially that if per impossibile scriptures were uncreated, they would be incomprehensible, for there would be no speakers’ intentions to mean one thing rather than another in using a specific word.) On the role of scripture Dharmakīrti actually had a nuanced position. In Pramāṇavārttika I.213–217 et sq. and in IV.48–108 he maintains that scripture shouldn’t be used on factual or rationally decidable matters; perception and logical reasoning trump the scriptures of one’s own school; one is not to be faulted for rejecting one’s school’s scriptures when reason dictates it; on rationally undecidable matters, however, that is on so-called “radically inaccessible things” (atyantaparokṣa), like the specific details of the law of karman (exactly what actions in past lives lead to what results in the future?), scriptural accounts need to be relied upon because of the absence of any other means (agatyā) (I.216). Scripture, if it passes certain conditions, can be designated as being an inferential source of knowledge, but is always fallible and not to be considered a full-fledged source of knowledge, as “it has no claim to certainty” (nāto niścayaḥ), unlike bona fide inferences (Svavṛtti ad I.318). The eighth century commentator Śākyabuddhi summarizes things interestingly in his commentary to I.216: scripture is simply needed by (indeed, indispensable to) those who wish to set out upon the spiritual path (pravṛttikāma), but it is not grounded in any objective facts (vastutas) (Tillemans 1999, ch. 2).

This is a surprisingly fallibilist and pragmatic position for a deeply religious thinker. Taken further, it would have major consequences for Buddhist ethics. The use of appeals to “radically inaccessible” facts to justify ethical positions was recognized by Dharmakīrti to be flawed in public debate. Indeed he seems to have been quite aware that invoking such purely scriptural positions would fall flat outside the context of convinced Buddhists.[55] The lesson could have been that Buddhists should genuinely privilege rational considerations debatable by all, rather than heavily weighting “proofs” that were for the faithful. Unfortunately, however, over history the later Indo-Tibetan Buddhist scholastic apologists transformed the Dharmakīrtian view on scripture, indeed all of his religious philosophy, into an increasingly rigid edifice.[56] Dharmakīrti became the defender of the Buddhist faith—the “lord of reasoning” (Tib. rigs pa’i dbang phyug). It is regrettable that much of the thought of this highly inquisitive and subtle philosopher often became, in later Indian and Tibetan Buddhism, a series of unquestioned formulae to secure Buddhist fundamentalism.

5. Editions and translations of the Pramāṇavārttika

An ongoing bibliography of editions and translations of Dharmakīrti’s seven works and those of other major Buddhist authors on epistemology and logic is presented on the site Epistemology and Argumentation in South Asia and Tibet (www.east.ikga.oeaw.ac.at). Here are what we consider to be principal editions and translations of Dharmakīrti’s main work, the Pramāṇavārttika.

The Sanskrit and Tibetan texts of the verses of Pramāṇavārttika are edited in Miyasaka (1971/72). The Sanskrit of the autocommentary (Svavṛtti) is edited in Gnoli (1960). Partial editions are also found in several of the translations. Chapter I and autocommentary are partially translated in several publications: I.1–10 plus autocommentary is translated into English in Gillon and Hayes (1991); I.1–51 plus autocommentary are translated into English in Mookerjee and Nagasaki (1964). For a German translation of Chapter I.40–185 plus autocommentary, see Frauwallner (1932; 1933). Steinkellner (2013) is a German translation of various parts of Chapter I and the autocommentary that pertain to the theory of logical reasons. Eltschinger (2007) gives a French translation of I.213–268. Eltschinger, Krasser, and Taber (2012) contains an English translation of I.312-340 and the autocommentary. Eltschinger, Taber, Much, and Ratié (2018) is an English translation of I.40–91 and the autocommentary. Dunne (2004) gives English translations of I.34–37, 68–75, 137–142, 214–223 and autocommentary. Chapter II.1-6 along with selections from the commentaries of Devendrabuddhi and Śākyabuddhi are translated in Dunne (2004): II.1-7 are translated in van Bijlert (1989); II.34-72 along with the commentary of Prajñākaragupta are translated into English in Franco (1997); Vetter (1990) gives a German translation of II.131cd-285. Pecchia (2015) contains an English translation of II.190–216 and the commentary of Manorathanandin. Jackson (1993) contains an English translation of Chapter II and rGyal tshab’s Tibetan commentary. Chapter III is translated into Japanese in Tosaki (1979; 1985); Dunne (2004) translated III.1–10, 194–224 into English along with selections from the commentaries of Devendrabuddhi and Śākyabuddhi; Franco and Notake (2014) translated III.1-63 into English. Chapter IV.1–148 is translated into English in Tillemans (2000). For other partial translations of Pramāṇavārttika and passages from its Indian commentaries, see also the table in Dunne (2004), p. 333–334. For an earlier, but still important, bibliography on the research on Buddhist epistemology and logic, see Steinkellner and Much (1995).


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Tom Tillemans <Tom.Tillemans@unil.ch>

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