First published Mon Jan 20, 2003; substantive revision Mon Feb 12, 2024

Reference is a relation that obtains between a variety of representational tokens and objects or properties. For instance, when I assert that “Barack Obama is a Democrat,” I use a particular sort of representational token—i.e. the name ‘Barack Obama’—which refers to a particular individual—i.e. Barack Obama. While names and other referential terms are hardly the only type of representational token capable of referring (consider, for instance, concepts, mental maps, and pictures), linguistic tokens like these have long stood at the center of philosophical inquiries into the nature of reference. Accordingly, and to keep things to a reasonable length, this entry will focus primarily on linguistic reference.[1]

Assuming that at least some token linguistic expressions really do refer, a number of interesting questions arise. How, for example, does linguistic reference relate to the act of referring—something that we as speakers do with referential terms? How exactly do referential terms come to refer? That is, in virtue of what do they refer to what they do? Is there a single answer to this question, a single mechanism of reference, or different answers depending on the sort of term in question—or even the circumstances in which a single term is used? And what exactly is the relationship between reference and meaning? Answers to these various questions will turn out to be closely related, and the task of this entry will be to trace out some of the main clusters of answers.

1. Introduction

We use language to talk about the world. Much of what we say about the world appears to be meaningful; some of it is presumably even true. For instance, I seem to be saying something true when, in the appropriate sort of setting, I utter:

  1. Barack Obama is a Democrat.

How do we manage to do such things? How, for instance, do I manage to talk about Barack Obama and thereby say meaningful and true things about him? In a word: how do I refer to Barack Obama by means of the name ‘Barack Obama’? Metaphorically, we seem to be capable of using language to talk about the world because some of our words are themselves capable of ‘hooking onto’ things in the world, things like Barack Obama. Proper names—that is, expressions like ‘Barack Obama’ and ‘Mount Kilimanjaro’—are widely regarded as paradigmatic referring expressions. Although it may seem implausible to suppose that all words refer, that all words somehow ‘hook onto’ bits of reality, certain types of words are widely presumed to be of the referring sort. These include: proper names, pronouns, indexicals, demonstratives, plurals, natural kind terms, and various other sorts of property terms. Definite descriptions are another, though highly controversial, candidate. Here, we’ll focus on just a subset of these—namely, what are often called ‘singular’ referential terms. These are terms that, supposing they refer, refer to particular objects and individuals as opposed to groups or properties. Since singular referential terms have been subjected to intensive philosophical scrutiny over the past hundred years, this will still leave us with plenty to discuss.

This article will focus on five closely related questions regarding reference: (i) How does the reference relation that obtains between token uses of terms and objects relate to the act of reference? In other words, do terms refer to what they do in virtue of our using them to do so, or do we use them to refer in virtue of their already doing so? (ii) What are the meanings of referential terms? Are they just referents, or rather something more? (iii) What is the mechanism of reference? In other words, in virtue of what does a token use of a referential term attach to a particular object/individual? (iv) Is there a single mechanism of reference common to all referring terms, or do different sorts of terms hook onto their referents in virtue of different sorts of things? And (v) to what extent, if at all, can reference depend on relatively private features of the speaker, such as their intentions or other mental states?

Our goal here will be to map out how answers to these various questions cluster together to generate several distinct pictures of the nature and function of reference. To get there, we’ll start in Section 2 by looking at two of the main approaches to proper names. Then, in Section 3, we will turn to indexicals and demonstratives, which put pressure on the thought that these two approaches represent an exhaustive set of options. Section 4 will focus on definite descriptions, which will serve to highlight some potential deficiencies in the models of linguistic reference introduced in Sections 2 and 3. Section 5 will step back to outline the main clusters of positions we will have developed by that point. Finally, Section 6 wraps up by canvassing some more radical positions, like nihilism and pluralism about reference.

For the sake of both clarity and brevity, this entry will refrain from venturing too deeply into the detailed debates regarding the meaning, syntactic form, and function of the various terms we will be looking at. Rather, we will focus instead on what, if anything, can be said about the nature of linguistic reference in general. For a more detailed look at the idiosyncrasies of these various terms, please see the entries on names, descriptions, and indexicals. See also the related entry on natural kinds.

2. Proper Names

Proper names have long taken center stage in debates about linguistic reference. For present purposes, we’ll treat these as roughly co-extensive with what ordinary (non-philosophically trained) speakers standardly call ‘names’. So expressions like ‘Barack Obama’, ‘Kyoto’, and ‘Mount Kilimanjaro’ will all count as proper names for our purposes. What do these expressions have in common? In virtue of what do they constitute a genuine class of linguistic expressions? At least at first glance, these would appear to be syntactically simple expressions that refer, or at least purport to refer, to particular objects or individuals. Thus, ‘Barack Obama’ refers to a specific man, ‘Kyoto’ refers to a specific city, and ‘Mount Kilimanjaro’ refers to a specific mountain. And, even though it is questionable whether expressions such as ‘Santa Claus’ and ‘Sherlock Holmes’ actually refer to anything, there can be no doubt that they at least purport to refer: to Santa Claus and Sherlock Holmes, respectively. They are thus to be counted as proper names as well for present purposes.

With respect to the reference of proper names, there are two basic orientations that have long captured philosophers’ attention: one that views names on the model of tags, and another that views them on the model of descriptions. We’ll briefly survey these two views, along with some complications that arise for each. Then we’ll turn to a problem that arises for both sorts of view: explaining how reference works for names with more than one bearer.

2.1 Descriptivist Theories

According to descriptivist theories of proper names, a particular use of a proper name refers when the descriptive content somehow associated with that use suffices to pick out a specific object or individual. On one standard way of working out this sort of view, one associated with both Gottlob Frege (1892) and Bertrand Russell (1911), the particular descriptive content associated with a given use of a name is so associated because the speaker associates this content with the name in question. For the use of the name to refer, this descriptive content must uniquely determine the name’s referent. So when a speaker uses the name ‘N’ and, in so doing, successfully refers to a particular object or individual x, this sort of descriptivist claims (i) that the speaker must be thinking of N as the (unique) F and (ii) that x must in fact be the (unique) F. In other words, this sort of ‘classical’ descriptivist posits that referential success hinges on speakers attaching to each name in their repertoire some descriptive content F which uniquely singles out a specific object in the world. Conversely, when speakers fail to associate a sufficiently precise description with a name, this sort of descriptivist predicts that reference fails.

Classical descriptivists, like Frege and Russell, were perfectly willing to acknowledge that the descriptive content in question might vary, sometimes quite markedly, from one speaker to the next. Indeed, according to Russell, such contents may vary across time for one and the same speaker. Thus, while I might associate the name ‘David Cameron’ with the descriptive content the U.K. Prime Minister who called for a referendum on Brexit, Samantha Cameron might associate the same name with the descriptive content my husband. Had Cameron ultimately chosen not to call a referendum on Brexit, my identifying content associated with ‘David Cameron’ would presumably have been different. If David and Samantha were to divorce, then Samantha’s identifying description would no doubt change as well, perhaps to something like my ex-husband. In all of these cases, the individual referred to by means of the name is determined (or, as it is often put, is ‘picked out’ or ‘fixed’) by the descriptive content the speaker associates with that name. Because the descriptive content in question is typically characterized by means of a definite description (an expression of the form the F), such theories are often known as ‘descriptivist theories’ of proper names.[2]

To get the intuitive appeal of descriptivism more clearly in view, consider a case where we know two individuals named ‘Boris’, one of whom is a mutual friend who has never held any elected office and the other of whom is the former Prime Minister of the United Kingdom. Suppose now that I utter:

  1. Boris likes to party.

If for some reason you are confused about who I am talking about, the natural thing for you to do is to ask me “Which Boris do you mean?” I might then respond “The former Prime Minister of the U.K.,” and this seems to be dispositive of the facts here. That is, supposing that this is the description I had in mind, then it would seem that my utterance of (2) is genuinely about Boris the former Prime Minister and not our mutual friend, the non-politician Boris. Likewise, the truth or falsity of (2) would seem to hinge on how things are with the former Prime Minister and not on how things are with our mutual friend of the same name.

Some other appealing aspects of descriptivism become evident when we pair the thesis considered above, a thesis about what determines reference, with a natural companion thesis to the effect that the descriptive contents associated with uses of names also provide their token meanings. In other words, proper names may well refer, but they only do so via their meanings—which are more like definite descriptions. By adopting this further thesis, the descriptivist can now explain a range of philosophically interesting cases. So, consider:

  1. Hesperus is Phosphorus.
  2. Santa Claus lives at the North Pole.
  3. Fred believes that Cicero, but not Tully, was Roman.

(3) is true, but it is not knowable apriori. That is, knowledge of (3) cannot be justified independent of experience. If the meanings of these two names is just whatever they refer to, however, then this looks puzzling. For then (3) would mean Venus is Venus, which is just an instance of the law of self-identity. In other words, simply understanding the meaning of (3) would be enough to know that it is true. According to meaning descriptivism, in contrast, what (3) means is that two distinct descriptions are satisfied by the same object. Given what the relevant descriptions are likely to be here, this should only be knowable aposteriori, or on the basis of experience. Similarly, in (4) the meaning descriptivist can explain the meaningfulnes of the sentence without appeal to reference, by associating the name ‘Santa Claus’ with a description like the bearded, grandpa-like figure who runs a dodgy elf labor camp in the far north. And, finally, the potential truth of (5) can be explained by noting that Fred might well associate different descriptions with ‘Cicero’ and ‘Tully’, despite the fact that these names actually co-refer.

The central challenge to the descriptivist theory is that there is reason to suspect that proper names are not semantically equivalent to definite descriptions. Saul Kripke (1972), in particular, argues that names pick out the same object even when embedded under modal terms like ‘might’, whereas definite descriptions typically don’t do this. Returning to our earlier example of ‘David Cameron’ and supposing that the description I associate with Cameron is the U.K. Prime Minister who called for a referendum on Brexit, it seems that I can still truly assert:

  1. David Cameron might not have called for a referendum on Brexit.

If descriptivism is right about both meaning and reference, however, then (6) should be equivalent to:

  1. It might have been the case that: the U.K. Prime Minister who called for a referendum on Brexit did not call for a referendum on Brexit.

Granted, (7) is not really a claim of ordinary English. Still, holding fixed that we are talking about metaphysical rather than epistemic possibility here, it should be clear enough that (7) is false: if there is someone who satisfies the description ‘the U.K. Prime Minister who was called for a referendum on Brexit’ in whatever possible situation we are considering, then that individual called for a referendum on Brexit in that same possible situation.

In more ordinary English, there is a way of hearing something along the lines of (7) as true: assuming that we are talking about the Prime Minister who actually called for a referendum on Brexit, of course they might not have. But that is not how definite descriptions are typically assumed to function; rather, they are typically understood to be flexible, or non-rigid across the space of possibility, picking out whatever happens to satisfy them in whatever possible situation we are considering. So, if the descriptivist is to avail themself of this sort of defensive maneuver, as some have been tempted to, then they will have to motivate the claim that names are semantically equivalent not to definite descriptions per se, but rather to ‘actualized’ or ‘rigidified’ versions thereof.[3]

This challenge can be avoided by a descriptivist who is willing to give up on the claim that the meaning of a proper name, on a given occasion, is equivalent to a definite description. In that case, an associated description will fix reference relative to the actual world, and then that referent is what is relevant to determining the truth of modal statements. This response, however, requires giving up on the nice explanations of (3)–(5) that the meaning descriptivist was able to provide. What’s more, even this more minimal version of descriptivism runs into a different problem also raised by Kripke, what is often called the ‘semantic’ objection to descriptivism.

This objection runs as follows: often, we don’t associate enough information with a name to pick out any particular individual. Nonetheless, we seem to be capable of using that name to refer to a specific individual. Kripke offers as an example the name ‘Feynman’. Ordinary folks, Kripke claims, might know that Feynman was a physicist, but they will not know anything besides the name that would serve to differentiate Feynman from any other physicist they have heard of. An indefinite description like a physicist will not suffice, however, to pick out any particular individual in the world. Even a physicist named ‘Feynman’ won’t do, at least in a world where two physicists bear this name. At best, this sort of description will pick out an arbitrary member of a class of individuals, not the right one consistently. And yet, as Kripke points out, it seems perfectly coherent for someone who knows nothing about Feynman, who has only overheard someone else using the name, to say to themself “I wonder who Feynman is,” or to ask their friend “Who is Feynman?” In each of these cases, the natural thing to say is that the speaker is using the name ‘Feynman’ to wonder or ask about Feynman. How they manage to do so, however, looks to be something that is going to be very difficult for the descriptivist to explain—assuming (i) that they want to maintain the link between associated descriptions and the information available to individual speakers, and (ii) that they are unwilling to rely on descriptions like whoever the person I overheard this name from was using it to talk about.

Before moving on, it is worth briefly noting that some descriptivists have indeed been tempted to defend the theory by giving up on the link mentioned in (i). P.F. Strawson (1959), for instance, suggests that speakers may rely on others to provide the relevant descriptive content, the content that serves to hook a given use of a name onto an object or individual in the world. In fact, Strawson allows that groups can effectively use names to refer so long as there is at least one expert among them for whom for whom the following holds: when we pool expert opinion, a plurality of the descriptions they associate with the relevant name are true of a single object. This will effectively deal with Kripke’s Feynman case, but at an intuitive cost. For now the descriptivist has not only forfeited their ability to explain (3)–(5), they have also risked making it the case that speakers will have no special access to who or what they are talking about when using a name. If speakers regularly lack sufficient information to identify the referent of their use of a proper name, then it is highly unclear why we would be justified in relying on them to answer questions like “Which N were you talking about?” Some may be tempted to pay this price. Others may be tempted to try to integrate bits and pieces of descriptivism into theories which are otherwise anti-descriptivist. In fact, this latter option has proven a popular one, and much of what follows can be viewed as a study in how this strategy has played out with respect to different sorts of referential terms.

2.2 Millian Heirs

The primary alternative to the descriptivist theory of names has typically gone by the name of ‘Millianism’. According to this view, which dates back to John Stuart Mill (1867), a name’s meaning is simply its referent. In its modern form, the view was introduced by Ruth Barcan Marcus (1961), who proposed that we ought to conceive of proper names as ‘tags’. To say that proper names are tags is, for Marcus, to say that they have no linguistic meaning beyond their reference. Proper names do not, on this sort of view, refer by way of the descriptions they allegedly stand for. Rather, they refer directly, as it is sometimes put, to their bearers. Important consequences of this theory include, as Marcus notes, the necessity of identity statements between co-referring proper names—something which, though highly intuitive, is not guaranteed by most descriptivist theories of proper names.[4] Other important consequences include the dissolution of puzzles involving substitutivity in modal contexts (Marcus 1993).

Of course, saying that names function as tags—or that they are ‘directly referential’—is not to provide a full theory of names. That requires, in addition, an explanation of what makes a name the particular tag that it is. In other words, we need to specify what it is, if not an associated description, that fixes the reference of a name in a context. Put slightly differently, the claim that names function as tags effectively furnishes us with a semantics for names. What remains, is to provide a metasemantics for names, a theory that tells us which semantic value should be associated with each name, or each name on a given occasion of use, and why.

The most popular option has been to pair a Millian semantics with a metasemantic picture adumbrated at roughly the same time by Peter Geach (1969), Keith Donnellan (1970), and the aforementioned Kripke (1972). Typically called the ‘causal theory of reference’, the central idea developed in these works is that (the use of) a name refers to whatever is linked to it in the appropriate way—a way that does not require speakers to associate any identifying descriptive content whatsoever with the name. The causal theory is generally presented as having two components: one dealing with reference fixing, the other dealing with reference borrowing. Reference, on this sort of view, is fixed by a dubbing. In other words, a language user gives a name to an object by saying something like “You are to be called N.” The paradigm case is one where the dubber is occurrently perceiving the target object when they utter this. After this initial act of reference-fixing, the name gets passed on from speaker to speaker through communicative exchanges. Speakers succeed in referring to something by means of its name, on this sort of view, because underlying their uses of the name are links in a causal chain stretching back to the initial dubbing of the object with that name. Subsequent speakers thus effectively ‘borrow’ their reference from speakers earlier in the chain, though borrowers needn’t be able to identify any of the lenders they are in fact relying on. All that is required is that borrowers are appropriately linked to their lenders through chains of communication.

As Kripke points out, complications arise due to the fact that we can apparently re-use names. So, I may have come across the name ‘Napoleon’ via a chain of use leading back to the most famous of French generals. Having heard the name, I may now decide to call the hedgehog who lives in my front garden, and who likes to imperiously survey her domain, ‘Napoleon’. When I use the name in this way, Kripke claims, that I have introduced a new name, or at least a new use of the name. This, Kripke claims, is due to my intentions—specifically, my intention to dub this hedgehog with the name ‘Napoleon’ as opposed to using that name as I always have before. Still, there is obviously a real sense in which I inherited the name from a historical tradition that traces back to 18th century France. So not every sort of causal connection to previous use suffices to preserve a chain of reference borrowing, according to the causal theorist. Some connections will suffice to pass on reference, whereas others are irrelevant. Providing a convincing account of the details here has proven to be a non-trivial task.[5]

2.3 Names with Multiple Bearers

So far, we have generally proceeded as though names were univocal. But that hardly seems right. As we already saw, a name like ‘Boris’ can refer equally well to the former British Prime Minister and to anyone else whose parents decided to call them this, regardless of their politics. Likewise, once I’ve named the hedgehog in my garden ‘Napoleon’, it would seem that the name ‘Napoleon’ can be used equally well to talk about either the greatest of French generals or, alternatively, this particular hedgehog. Classical descriptivists have no real trouble accounting for this, since each time a name is used, its reference is essentially fixed anew by whatever description the speaker happens to have in mind. In other words, according to this sort of descriptivist, it is really only a matter of happenstance that uses of names ever co-refer. That might seem a rather large bullet to bite. On the other hand, once we move away from classical descriptivism, explaining how names can refer to different individuals in different circumstances becomes significantly more challenging.

Consider a descriptivist in the Strawsonian mold, one for whom an utterance of the name ‘N’ refers in accord with the plurality of the beliefs of the relevant experts. What are we to do with a name like ‘Boris’ then, which can refer to either the former British Prime Minister or to our mutual friend? We cannot simply aggregate all the relevant beliefs associated with this name, considered as an orthographic or phonological form, and then see who or what the plurality of those beliefs picks out. For that would leave us only ever able to use the name to refer to one or the other of these Borises, and that hardly seems like the right thing to say. It seems, therefore, that a descriptivist of this sort will have to think about names in some more fine-grained manner. Yet this will not prove easy. They cannot simply go back to appealing to the information the speaker happens to have to do the job, for we can easily imagine someone who seems capable of refering to either Boris and yet lacks sufficient information to distinguish the one from the other.

Similar issues arise for the Millian. Here, however, some concrete proposals have been floated. For instance, David Kaplan (1990) has argued that, against all appearances, names really do have only one referent apiece. In fact, Kaplan suggests that we should think of names as individuated, in part, by their referents. In other words, on Kaplan’s view, one cannot simply ‘read off’ which name has been used from its overt phonological or orthographic form. Rather, Kaplan posits that there are any number of names all written and pronounced ‘Boris’, or even ‘Boris Johnson’. While each of these names is written and pronounced identically, each refers to a different person. The question now becomes: what determines which name a speaker has used in a given context? Kaplan suggests that the answer to this question has to do with the speaker’s mental states, and in particular with the speaker’s intention to talk about one or another individual. In effect, Kaplan takes it that hearing a name leaves us with a mental trace, a mental analogue of a linguistic name, that directly refers to some particular individual. By looking to see which trace shows up in the speaker’s intentions, we come to know the referential properties of the utterance or inscription being used to express this mental trace.

Kaplan’s theory has some rather odd consequences, however. For instance, it turns out that no two people actually ever share a name—for names come complete with their referential features.[6] Kaplan suggests that what people share are not names but rather some common aspects of how their names tend to be externalized. In other words, for Kaplan, what it is to share a name with someone else is for both of your names to belong to the same class of phonological and/or orthographic forms. Kaplan calls these ‘generic names’, as opposed to the ‘common currency names’ which, for him, are the bearers of semantic properties like reference.

Finding themselves dissatisfied with Kaplan’s proposal here, other direct reference theorists have opted for different responses to the problem of names with multiple bearers. For instance, both Francois Recanati (1997) and Michael Pelczar and Joe Rainsbury (1998) have suggested that names ought to be treated on the model of indexicals, a sort of term that we will consider in more detail shortly. Briefly though, the suggestion runs: there is one and only one name ‘Boris’, but context makes clear to which individual a particular utterance of this name refers. In effect, the proposal preserves something of the causal theory—by allowing that baptisms and passings-on of names are the right sort of thing to determine the set of possible referents associated with a name at any given time—while appealing to some further feature of the context to do the work of selecting an individual from this set. In contrast to the pure indexicals like ‘I’ or ‘here’, however, there is no obvious candidate for which aspect of the context serves to make this selection. Things get worse still once we consider contexts in which multiple people bearing the same name are all present and being talked about in the course of a single utterance (e.g. “I never would have expected Boris and Boris to get on so well.”).[7] Alternatively, one might posit that names somehow function more like the true demonstratives ‘this’ and ‘that’, though obviously the details of such a suggestion would need to be worked out.

To better understand these last two proposals, we first need to get clearer on how reference works for in the case of indexicals and demonstratives. In the next section, we will work to fill in this gap.

3. Indexicals

We have now seen two basic models of how words refer to things. On the descriptivist model, words refer by being associated, somehow, with a description that serves to isolate a particular object as the referent. By varying how we associate the relevant descriptions with particular uses of words, we derive different versions of descriptivism. On the causal-perceptual model, in contrast, words are associated with chains of use leading back to some original act of dubbing. That act itself then serves to bridge the gap between word and world. While both these models were developed with names in mind, we should ask ourselves “Can either serve to explain linguistic reference in general? That is, can either model plausibly extend to other sorts of referential terms, beyond just names?”

To answer this question, and ultimately to introduce a third distinct model of linguistic reference, we turn now to the indexicals: words like ‘I’, ‘you’, ‘here’, ‘now’, ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘this’, and ‘that’. As we will soon see, it is hardly clear that all indexicals refer in the same way. In particular, a distinction has often been drawn between what are called ‘pure’ and ‘impure’ indexicals, with rather different theories of reference being offered for each. The challenges that arise in trying to offer accounts of the impure indexicals will bring us back to one of the questions with which we began: namely, do words refer because we use them to do so, or rather do we use them to do so because they already refer?

3.1 Pure Indexicals

What are pure indexicals? Roughly, these are expressions the reference of which appears to co-vary with certain very regular aspects of the contexts in which they are used. Here, ‘context’ should be understood as including, inter alia, a speaker, hearer, time, and place. In contrast, the reference of ‘impure’ indexicals is supposed to be more difficult to characterize in terms of picking out some distinct, repeatable feature of a context. Both the existence and the significance of this distinction are controversial (see the entry on indexicals for further discussion). That said, assuming that there is such a distinction, it is widely held that ‘I’, ‘here’, ‘now’ are pure indexicals, whereas ‘this’, ‘that’, ‘he’, ‘she’, and ‘it’ are impure. ‘You’ is perhaps the most active locus of dispute (see Radulescu (2018)).

The traditional approach to indexicals, dating back once more to Frege and Russell, has it that the reference of such expressions is fixed by some sort of descriptive content associated by the speaker with the expression. This reference-fixing description is the meaning of a given utterance of the expression. The motivation for such a view is largely intuitive. Indexicals must mean something, and their meanings presumably have something to do with how these expressions refer. So it is not too much of a stretch to think that ‘I’ might mean something like the speaker of this utterance and refer to that individual. Similarly, ‘now’ might mean the time of this utterance and refer to that time. And so on.

One obvious objection to this view is that what the term ‘I’ refers to does not appear to be sensitive to whatever sort of descriptive content a speaker happens to associate with that term. For instance, the fact that I might happen to associate the description the 44th President of the United States with the term ‘I’ does not mean that I can somehow succeed in using the term ‘I’ to refer to Barack Obama. Another problem with this view, discussed extensively in Kaplan (1989b), is that taking these reference-determining descriptions to be a part of what we assert when we use indexicals can lead to our making some rather odd predictions. Consider an assertive utterance of:

  1. I like to ride my bicycle.

Suppose, first, that I am the speaker. I utter (8). Now, suppose that you are the speaker. You utter (8). While there may be a loose sense in which we ‘said the same thing’ with our utterances, there is another, stricter sense in which we clearly did not. I said something about myself, whereas you said something about yourself. Yet, according to the classical descriptivist, we’ve both said the very same thing. Namely, we’ve both asserted that the speaker likes to ride their bicycle. All that differs is the context in which we asserted this.

Now, to be clear, there are ways of tinkering with the view to avoid both these objections. Some, like Hans Reichenbach (1947) or more recently Manuel García-Carpintero (1998) and John Perry (2001), have argued that indexicals are ‘token reflexives’, meaning that the descriptions that should be associated with them will need to involve explicit reference to the utterance of that very token use of the term. So, for instance, the description for ‘I’ might be: the speaker of this very token of ‘I’. Since different tokens will be involved when each of us utters (8), we’ll no longer be asserting the very same thing. If we add that, for token indexicals at least, the relevant descriptions aren’t under the speaker’s control, but are rather associated with particular terms via the rules of language, then we can avoid our earlier objection as well.

A different sort of approach was developed by Reichenbach’s student, the aforementioned David Kaplan. Kaplan (1989b) took many of the same elements that Reichenbach was working with, but put them into a framework where the meaning of an indexical in context—that is, its contribution to what is said or asserted—is just an object. According to Kaplan, we need to distinguish between two types of meaning, which he called ‘character’ and ‘content’. Content is basically what we have been calling meaning to this point; it is what the utterance of an individual term contributes to what is said or asserted by an utterance of the complete sentence of which it is a part. Character, on the other hand, is more akin to a rule of use; a character tells us, for any given context, what the content of a given expression is. Names, on Kaplan’s way of thinking about them, have constant characters: in any two arbitrary contexts, uses of the same name will be mapped to the same referent (recall that Kaplan thinks of names in a fine-grained way, such that they are never shared). The rule for any name ‘N’ thus turns out to be: in any context whatsoever, return N as the referent. Not so for terms like ‘I’ or ‘here’, which Kaplan takes to be associated with rules like return the speaker and return the location of the utterance. So in a context where I am speaking in Foyle’s, my utterances of ‘I’ and ‘here’ will refer to me and to Foyle’s, respectively. When Nat is speaking at the American Bar, his utterances of ‘I’ and ‘here’ will refer to Nat and to the American Bar.

Importantly, the characters of the pure indexicals are supposed to be insensitive to speakers’ mental states. That rules out any possibility of my using the term ‘I’ to refer to Barack Obama. Nor are your and my utterances of (8) predicted to say the same thing. What’s more, as Kaplan points out, the view allows us to productively distinguish between ‘metaphysical’ necessity and what Kaplan calls ‘logical’ necessity. The sentence “I am here now,” Kaplan claims, represents a logical necessity: in virtue of what the indexicals ‘I’, ‘here’, and ‘now’ all mean, this sentence cannot be uttered falsely. Yet clearly it is not metaphysically necessary that a particular speaker be wherever they happen to be at the time of utterance; they could just as easily have been somewhere else.[8]

Now we have three basic models of reference on the table: the descriptivist model, the causal-perceptual model, and the character model. With the last of these in view, we can clarify an important aspect of the indexical theory of names that was discussed at the end of the last section. Essentially, that theory proposed to hybridize our second and third models. Instead of names having constant characters, as Kaplan would have it, the proposal is to assign them more interesting ones. For instance, we might try stipulating that the context, in addition to containing a speaker, place, time, etc., must also include a most salient individual bearing a given name. Names, the idea runs, always refer to their most salient bearer at a context. Since names no longer have constant characters, they are more like indexicals than we might initially have thought. On the other hand, we can preserve a good deal of the causal theory by re-characterizing it as a theory about who counts as a name-bearer in a given context.[9]

This way of developing the indexical theory is not without its downsides, however. For instance, it hardly seems to be true that we always use names to refer to the most salient bearer of that name in a context, particularly once we consider utterances of names prefixed with phrases like ‘the other’ (e.g. “The other David is not here yet, though I can hear him down the hall.”). What’s more, there is reason to worry that embracing this sort of indexical theory entails giving up on one of the purported advantages of the causal theory: its ability to explain how it is that we can pass on the capacity to think about objects merely by passing on names for those objects. Since names are causally anchored to the objects they name, according to the causal theory, acquiring a new name should suffice to put us in causal contact with the object named. On the indexical theory of names, on the other hand, we do not pass on names for things; rather, we use names to refer to the most salient bearer of those names in a given context. Perhaps this suffices to pass on a use of a name—loaded, as it were, with a referent—where the listener doesn’t already have that use in their repertoire. But if the listener fails to have this use in their repertoire, then it becomes hard to see how the referent of that use could count as the most salient bearer of the relevant name in the context.

3.2 Impure Indexicals

In contrast to the pure indexicals, the reference of deictic uses of pronouns like ‘he’, ‘she’, and ‘it’ and true demonstratives like ‘this’ and ‘that’ looks to be far less amenable to an analysis in terms of character. After all, what regular feature of a speech context might any of these terms serve to pick out? One option would be to say that tokens of each of these simply refer to the demonstratum of the context. But not only does that threaten to force us to say that all of these terms effectively mean the same thing—something which seems rather counterintuitive—now we also need to know what exactly serves to make something the demonstratum in a context. And what are we to do when multiple such terms, or multiple instances of the same term, are used within the span of a single utterance? Are we really to believe that contexts involve not just a demonstratum role, but also a first demonstratum role, a second demonstratum role, etc.?

A number of possible responses arise at this point. First, following Kaplan (1978) and Colin McGinn (1981), we might try to take advantage of the fact that uses of these terms are often accompanied by ostensive gestures. The picture this suggests is: the reference of a use of a demonstrative (and, presumably, the other impure indexicals as well) is determined by the accompanying ostensive gesture. Formally, we might treat these gestures as determining the first demonstratum, second demonstratum, etc. But we might equally well choose not to. Unfortunately, this approach faces two rather obvious objections: first, even fairly directed pointing gestures can usually be disambiguated in a number of different ways; and, second, many perfectly good uses of demonstratives simply aren’t accompanied by any sort of ostensive gesture. The first of these problems invites a simple solution: appeal to the speaker’s intentions to disambiguate the gesture. That move, in turn, invites the question: why not just appeal directly to these ‘directing intentions’ and leave the physical aspect of the gesture to the side? We will return to that option shortly.

The latter objection invites a rather different response: perhaps it is not the ostensive gesture itself that makes an object the demonstratum, but rather what that gesture does. Gestures, we might take it, serve to make objects salient in a context. This leads us to a second sort of view about what makes an object the demonstratum of a particular utterance of an impure indexical: whatever object is the most salient in the context at the time of utterance, that is the demonstratum. Howard Wettstein (1984) and Allyson Mount (2008) have each developed views along these lines, the basic idea being that an utterance of a term like ‘she’ refers to whoever counts as the most salient woman in the context and with similar rules applying to the other impure indexicals. More problematic are bare uses of ‘this’ and ‘that’, which don’t seem to contain any substantive information about the relevant sortal. This means that we need to posit that contexts in which these terms refer contain not just a most salient woman, but a most salient object full stop. What might serve to make an object maximally salient simpliciter? The natural suggestion would seem to be: our mutual interests and perspective.

Dialectically, this suggestion is problematic. For, as Eliot Michaelson and Ethan Nowak (2022) point out, the interests and perspective of the speaker and listener can easily diverge. One option here would be to claim that, in cases of divergence, one of these perspectives (i.e. the speaker’s or listener’s) systematically trumps the other. Opting for either of these, however, invites the question of whether we can dispense with the notion of salience entirely and make do instead with how the privileged agent construes the relevant term, regardless of whatever happens to be salient to them at the moment. In essence, the worry is that the view might well collapse into either a speaker intention-type view or a listener-construal type one. The natural way of trying to avoid such a collapse would be to claim that reference simply fails when no one object is mutually maximally salient. This is the route that Mount advocates taking. As she notes, this way of going entails that a great many seemingly meaningful and felicitous uses of ‘this’ and ‘that’ fail to refer. For instance, the view entails that reference fails whenever the speaker uses the term ‘this’ but the listener can’t hear them, is distracted, etc. While Mount is prepared to accept this result, few others have been enthusiastic about this prospect.

For those not so inclined, a third possible response presents itself. According to Kaplan (1989a), token uses of the impure indexicals, like demonstratives and deictic uses of pronouns, refer to whomever or whatever the speaker intends for them to refer to—at least for ‘perceptual’ uses of such terms, or uses where the speaker is occurrently perceiving their target. Let us leave this hedge aside, however, and allow that such intentions might be grounded in memory traces, the conversational record, or what have you. With perceptually-grounded uses of demonstratives, this directing intention might well be thought of as the internal analogue of an externalized pointing. But the move inside makes this picture more durable: no explicit gesture is necessary for reference to succeed, and no longer are we limited to using the impure indexicals just to refer to objects in our physical and temporal vicinity. Since we do indeed use impure indexicals to refer to physically and temporally distant objects, this looks like a significant advantage for a generalized ‘intentionalist’ approach to demonstrative reference.

None of this is to say that Kaplan’s view has been universally embraced. On the contrary, the view is generally thought to face a rather serious problem. We noted above that terms like the bare demonstratives ‘this’ and ‘that’ look to be rather flexible in their application. Yet even these terms are presumably not infinitely flexible. For instance, you presumably cannot point directly and deliberately at a picture of Boris Johnson, utter (9), and succeed in using the term ‘that’ to refer to the picture of David Kaplan that you have tucked away in your desk drawer for just such occasions:

  1. That is a picture of one of the most Hawaiian shirt-loving philosophers of the twentieth century.

This is an instance of what has sometimes been called the ‘Humpty Dumpty Problem’.[10] Basically, any time we might be tempted to suggest that what token uses of some particular term mean or refer to depends on the speaker’s intentions, the following sort of problem inevitably arises: unless we impose some constraints on what those intentions can look like and still prove effective, we end up having to say that speakers with sufficiently-bent intentions can mean or refer to some highly unexpected things by means of their utterances, things that, intuitively, it does not seem possible to mean or refer to with utterances of the relevant terms.

A closely related case, oddly enough from an earlier time-slice of Kaplan (i.e. Kaplan 1978) and used there to help motivate the ostention theory, can be used to help bring out the issue here. Imagine a scenario where the speaker is sitting at their desk and their prized picture of Rudolf Carnap, which typically hangs on the wall behind them, has been switched for a picture of Spiro Agnew. Having failed to notice the switch, and intending to use the term ‘that’ to refer to their picture of Carnap, the speaker points behind themself, directly at the picture of Agnew, and utters (10):

  1. That is a picture of one of the greatest philosophers of the twentieth century.

According to Kaplan, (10) is false not in virtue of the utterance of ‘that’ failing to refer, but rather because the speaker has asserted something false about the actual picture hanging behind them, the picture of Agnew.[11] Note that this case differs from (9) in an important respect: in (10), it doesn’t seem altogether implausible that the speaker here might also have intended for their use of ‘that’ to refer to whatever picture is hanging behind them. After all, they are somehow confused about which picture that is. This confusion would seem to offer the intentionalist additional room to maneuver.

In fact, intentionalists have gone several different ways here: Alex Radulescu (2019) has embraced the claim that the token uses of ‘that’ in (9) and (10) do refer to the pictures of Kaplan and Carnap, respectively. Most intentionalists, however, have not been so bold. Instead, they have either tried to restrict the range of intentions that serve to fix reference, or else they have tried to limit when speakers’ intentions in fact determine reference. This first strategy has generally proceeded by appealing to certain considerations drawn from Paul Grice’s (1957) theory of meaning. The second, in contrast, has tended to try to derive the relevant constraints from the standing meanings of, or rules of use for, the impure indexicals and demonstratives. More recently, a few philosophers have also tried combining these two approaches.

The Gricean approach to reference was first clearly articulated by Gail Stine (1978), though it had been alluded to by both Grice himself and Keith Donnellan (1968).[12] The basic idea is that the relevant sorts of intentions for fixing the reference of impure indexicals are, properly speaking, intentions aimed at getting the listener to identify a particular object as the referent. In keeping with Grice’s broader theory of meaning, these intentions are posited to be even more complex than this: not only are they aimed at getting the listener to identify some object as the referent, they are also meant to be fulfilled in part on the basis of the listener’s recognizing the speaker’s intention for them to do so.

Having followed the Gricean line this far, now we must ask: can the Gricean thesis regarding the complexity of referential intentions somehow cut off the threat of a collapse into Humpty Dumpty-ism? The answer, according to the Gricean, is “Yes.” Griceans are likely to claim that the speaker lacks a genuinely referential intention in a case like (9), since they should have no expectation that their listener will be in a position to recover their intended referent. In a case like (10), however, it looks like the speaker does have an intention for their listener to recover the picture of Carnap as the referent. What then is the Gricean to do? Kent Bach (1992) helpfully suggests the following refinement to the view: while genuinely referential, the speaker’s intention to refer to the picture of Carnap runs via an intention to refer to whatever picture happens to be behind them. That latter intention is meant to be recognized directly, whereas the former can be recognized only indirectly, via the recognition of both this latter intention and (in the good case) the fact that the picture behind the speaker actually is the picture of Carnap. A better way of formulating the Gricean thesis with regards to referential intentions, Bach claims, reflects this sort of asymmetry: when there is a conflict between a direct and an indirect referential intention, and both are genuinely referential, it is the direct intention that serves to fix reference.[13]

So far, so good for the Gricean. But just how general is their solution to the Humpty Dumpty Problem? Can they, for instance, account for a speaker who appears to be fully competent in a language like English, but who mistakenly believes that everyone else can simply read off their referential intentions, directly? In other words, consider a speaker who believes that the listener can read their mind regarding their referential intentions, though nothing else, and only when they utter a demonstrative. Unless we regard such a speaker as incompetent with the English language, it would seem that they can now succeed, according to the Gricean, in making a token of ‘this’ or ‘that’ refer to whatever they like, on any occasion whatsoever. For this speaker can coherently intend for their listener to recover that object as the referent of their use of the demonstrative, partly in virtue of directly recognizing this very intention, regardless of what that object is. In other words, given some sufficiently strange background beliefs, the Gricean predicts that a speaker really can make a use of ‘that’ in an utterance like (9) refer to their picture of David Kaplan—regardless of whether anyone short of a real clairvoyant would be capable of recovering this referent. So the Gricean strategy for blocking intentionalism’s collapse into Humpty Dumpty-ism doesn’t fully generalize.

Partly in response to worries like these, we might think that the right sort of response to the Humpty Dumpty Problem is not to up the complexity of referential intentions themselves, but rather to impose limits on how particular sorts of terms—even the true demonstratives—can be used to refer. Marga Reimer (1991, 1992) offers a suggestion along just these lines: when uses of the demonstratives ‘this’ and ‘that’ are accompanied by ostensive gestures, then the referent itself must lie in the general direction indicated by that gesture.[14] When there is no gesture, then there is no such constraint. In other words, Reimer re-emphasizes the apparently special connection between demonstratives and gestures that earlier theorists tried to leverage into a full theory of demonstrative-reference. This time, however, Reimer suggests that we use this connection not to generate a complete theory of demonstrative reference, but rather to impose some constraints on the intentionalist theory. Those constraints, in turn, are what allows Reimer to make the intuitively correct predictions regarding (9) and (10): with respect to (9), she will say that one cannot succeed at pointing to one picture and referring to another picture, unless perhaps the first is a photograph of the second; with respect to (10), she will say that the speaker intends both to refer to the picture behind herself and to that of Carnap, but only one of these satisfies the constraint associated with the gesture. Thus, only one of these intentions is in a position to determine reference.

To be clear, Reimer’s position is by no means incompatible with the Gricean theory of referential intentions. One might, in fact, accept both that there are substantive constraints on reference that derive from the meanings of the impure indexicals themselves, and also that referential intentions are as the Gricean describes them to be. Bach (2017) has recently embraced such a view, for instance. That said, one should demand an independent reason for adopting the Gricean thesis. For the Gricean thesis has often been advertized as a response to the Humpty Dumpty Problem, but Reimer-esque constraints allow the intentionalist to avoid such a collapse independent of adopting the Gricean thesis and, as we have seen, the Gricean thesis alone is not sufficient. What’s more, as Michaelson (2022) has argued, the Gricean picture of referential intentions comes at a cost: it makes it difficult, if not impossible, to explain how speakers can obfuscate with referential terms. That is, it makes it difficult to explain how speakers can seemingly refer to one thing with the use of a referential term while simultaneously intending for their listener to misinterpret their utterance. Still, given the enduring appeal of Gricean theories of meaning, it is undoubtedly too soon to write off the Gricean theory of reference.

The fourth and final view of demonstrative reference that we will consider starts with the contention that we took a wrong turn at the outset by giving up on the idea that what a demonstrative refers to is just the demonstratum of the context. According to Una Stojnić, Matthew Stone, and Ernie Lepore (2013, 2017), demonstratives refer to whatever is at the ‘center of attention’ in the discourse. This might sound a bit like the salience theories we considered above, but for Stojnić et al., what is at the center of attention is determined purely linguistically. Sometimes this determination is due to earlier discourse and, in particular, the sorts of discourse relations that these authors take to be grammatically encoded in our utterances. At other times, the object at the center of attention will be determined by a gesture, which Stojnić et al. take to have a logical form of their own. As Nowak and Michaelson (2020) point out, however, this latter claim leaves Stojnić et al. needing to somehow disambiguate pointing gestures, just as the ostention theorist did.

What’s more, the view faces a different sort of challenge as well. Consider a discourse-initial, gestureless use of demonstratives like:

  1. That was unexpected.

If I utter (11) to Clayton, sitting in stunned silence the morning after the election of Donald Trump, it seems plausible that I will have both said something true about the election result and managed to communicate this to Clayton. Yet since the utterance is discourse-initial, there is nothing in the prior conversation to set the center of attention. Likewise, since there is no gesture, that cannot be what determines the center of attention here. Instead, Stojnić et al. propose to treat utterances like (11) as, essentially, complex quantified statements; what (11) says is something like there is some pair of events such that the one summarizes the other and has something unexpected as its center. In effect, Stojnić et al. propose a theory on which most uses of demonstratives succeed in referring as a matter of grammar, but discourse-initial, gestureless uses of demonstratives simply do not refer at all. And likewise for the other impure indexicals.

4. Definite Descriptions

In contrast to the sorts of terms we have considered so far, the primary question regarding definite descriptions—complex expressions like ‘the biscuit’ or ‘the off-license’—is not how they refer, but whether they refer at all.

Both Alexius Meinong (1904) and Frege (1892) thought that they did. That left them with a problem, however, since the overt descriptive material found in definite descriptions is typically insufficient to identify a single object as the referent. For Frege, at least, there was a fairly obvious solution: treat that overt descriptive material as just a part of the sense of the definite description, allowing more material to be added by whatever fuller description the speaker happens to have in mind. Faced with this same set of issues, Russell (1905) took the opposite tack: he posited that descriptions simply do not refer. Rather, what he offered was a translation procedure for sentences of the form ‘The A is B’, which he posited to mean: there is one and only one A, and that A is also B.[15]

This dispute becomes even more interesting when one considers that both Russell and Frege agreed that names were to be understood as, in some sense, akin to definite descriptions. Now we are in a better position to see the deep differences between them in spite of this superficial agreement. For Frege, that claim in no way prevented names from being genuine devices of reference. For Russell, it did. For Frege, a name’s contribution to the truth or falsity of a sentence was, intensional contexts to the side, its referent. For Russell, it was the associated description.

Why suppose that definite descriptions do not function to refer? After all, we certainly seem to use them to talk about particular objects. When I say “I want the sloop to the right of that one,” I seem to be expressing a desire to possess a particular sloop, not just a desire to be relieved from slooplessness in some complex fashion. What’s more, we can substitute definite descriptions for names and indexicals in most linguistic contexts while preserving truth. Naively then, it might seem reasonable to posit that, if names and indexicals refer, then so too do definite descriptions. Russell, however, did not lack for motivation in his claim that definite descriptions do not function to refer. Consider assertive utterances of the following sentences:

  1. The King of France is bald.
  2. The author of Middlemarch was the third child of Robert and Christiana Evans.

(12) is meaningful, but certainly not true. Russell takes it to be plainly false, though that is controversial (see Strawson (1950) and, more recently, Von Fintel (2004)). Regardless, if one thinks that definite descriptions are devices of reference, then it’s unclear how one will be justified in claiming that sentences like (12) are meaningful if the description fails to refer. With (13), the problem facing the referentialist is different: since both these descriptions should refer to the same individual, Mary Ann Evans (or ‘George Eliot’), it becomes highly unclear why (13) shouldn’t be knowable apriori. As with identity statements involving co-referring names, this looks to be merely an instance of the law of self-identity. And, presumably, any instance of that law is knowable apriori.

Note that Russell’s theory, in contrast, has no difficulty explaining any of this. (12) just makes a claim about there being a unique king of France, a claim which is both perfectly meaningful and straightforwardly false. (13), on the other hand, makes a claim about the unique satisfier of one set of properties also uniquely satisfying another set of properties. That should hardly ever count as knowable apriori.

Still, there are also reasons to question Russell’s claim that definite descriptions don’t function to refer. For instance, as Strawson (1950) points out, many assertive utterances involving definite descriptions will seem true even when the relevant description fails to have a unique satisfier. So, consider:

  1. The table is covered with books.

Assertively uttered in a context where there is a single table stacked high with books, (14) would seem to be true. Yet Russell predicts the opposite, so long as there is at least one additional table somewhere or other in the universe.

Strawson’s alternative was to claim that there are genuinely referential uses of definite descriptions. Used in this way, definite descriptions will, like names and indexicals, contribute an object or individual to the content asserted by the utterance—so long as that object satisfies the relevant descriptive material. If it doesn’t, or if there is no such object, these token uses won’t refer and, according to Strawson, the utterances of which they are a part will fail to be either true or false. Still, they will count as meaningful so long as the description in question is associated with a coherent rule of use. Meaningfulness, according to Strawson, hinges on its being clear what a given expression can be used to do; reference, on the other hand, requires being in the right kind of situation, a situation where the relevant rule of use is satisfied. Strawson doesn’t seem to object to there being attributive uses of definite descriptions, which function more or less as Russell suggested, in addition to referential ones. He just doesn’t focus on those. Indeed, Strawson seems to countenance there being a number of different distinct uses of definite descriptions, including a kind or generic use (e.g. “The whale is a mammal”) which has only come in for serious philosophical scrutiny much more recently.

Keith Donnellan (1966) goes even further than Strawson, claiming that definite descriptions can be used to refer even when the putative referent fails to satisfy the explicit descriptive material. In what is probably his most famous example, Donnellan asks us to consider an utterance of the following:

  1. Who is the man drinking the martini?

Suppose that we are both looking at a man who appears to be drinking a martini, but who is in fact drinking water, when you utter (15). On Donnellan’s telling, this is irrelevant; your utterance of the description ‘the man drinking the martini’ can refer to this man regardless of whether he is in fact drinking a martini. What matters, according to Donnellan, is just that you have this man ‘in mind’ when using the relevant description, that you use the description with this man as your intended target.

One might worry, as does Alfred MacKay (1968), that this leaves Donnellan open to the charge of offering a Humpty Dumpty view of definite descriptions—a view on which there are no substantive constraints on what token descriptions can be used to refer to. Interestingly, Donnellan (1968)’s response is to appeal to the Gricean theory of meaning, thus raising the possibility what he means by ‘having in mind’ is something akin to the Gricean’s notion of having a referential intention. As we saw above, however, there is reason to think that even this sort of move won’t suffice to head off the collapse of intentionalism into Humpty Dumpty-ism in a fully general sense. So there may still be reason to think that Donnellan’s willingness to jettison the explicit descriptive material as a constraint on referential success is perhaps a bridge too far.

But what of the intuitions behind Donnellan’s example? For, even if we reject his claim that a description like ‘the F’ can be used to refer to something that isn’t an F, it still seems as though communication is possible in a case like (15). That is, I should be able to tell who you’re asking about regardless of whether this man is in fact drinking water rather than a martini. Kripke (1977) suggests that the way to deal with cases like this one is to view the sort of reference involved as merely pragmatic, as having to do with communicative efficacy rather than with the sort of strict aboutness relevant to determining truth or falsity in a context. According to Kripke, there is no need to posit that definite descriptions ever refer. Instead, we can explain away their apparent referential properties by noting that, even if they do not refer, speakers will typically still have targets in mind for them to latch onto. So long as we are reasonably good at recovering those targets, we will then be in a position to direct each other’s thought to particular objects and individuals by means of utterances of definite descriptions without needing to posit that token instances of these expressions themselves ever function to lock onto those objects or individuals. In other words, we are free to accept the Russellian theory of descriptions, supplemented with this claim that descriptions are very often used to direct listeners’ attention to the ‘speaker’s referent’, as Kripke calls what he takes to be the referential analogue of Gricean ‘speaker’s meaning’ (or, roughly, whatever the speaker is trying to get across to the listener, literally or otherwise).

Kripke seems to have in mind that genuine linguistic reference—or what he calls ‘semantic reference’—needs to run purely via convention. His paradigm example is names, which he takes to be associated with a convention to the effect that their reference is fixed via an appeal to causal chains. Alternatively, he might have pointed to Kaplan’s character-based approach to the pure indexicals, a view which is equally reliant on conventions to establish reference. As we saw above, however, there are plausibly limits to this sort of approach: a conventionalist approach to the reference of impure indexicals, like demonstratives and pronouns, has proven challenging to offer. Likewise, once we take seriously the problem of names with multiple bearers, it becomes far less clear that the reference of token uses of names can be fixed by anything so simple as pure linguistic convention. Rather, in both cases, it looks like it is going to be rather tempting to appeal to facts about the speaker in order to fix linguistic reference. But if such an appeal is acceptable in that instance, the case for ruling out definite descriptions as non-referring starts to look weaker.

If, unlike Kripke, we start with the idea that linguistic reference is, at root, the result of something that we do rather than just something that words themselves do, then definite descriptions start to look more like the normal case and the true indexicals like the outlier. This is, in fact, an old idea, one that dates back at least to Susan Stebbing (1943) and the later work of Ludwig Wittgenstein (1958), and which we already saw running through the ideas of Grice, Strawson, and Donnellan.[16] The enduring worry, of course, is that without some restrictions on how we can use terms to successfully refer, we will end up divorcing the theory of reference from both our intuitions on cases and from any role in an overall theory of communication. But if we embrace there being limits on referential success—imposed, perhaps, by Gricean reflexivity, conventionalized constraints, or both—these worries can plausibly be avoided. Indeed, with respect to definite descriptions the case for there being a conventionalized constraint on referential success, as Strawson took there to be, can look particularly appealing.

More recently, a rather different sort of challenge has emerged for those claiming that token definite descriptions sometimes refer: namely, the difference in meaning which is standardly assumed to mark definite descriptions off from their indefinite counterparts (that is, descriptions like ‘a philosopher’ as opposed to ‘the philosopher’) has itself been called into question. Two main reasons have been offered for rejecting a difference in meaning between these sorts of phrases. First, pinning down exactly what this distinction is supposed to amount to has proven remarkably difficult; every aspect of Russell’s original analysis (existence, uniqueness, and satisfaction of the relevant descriptive material), for instance, has subsequently been called into question. Second, as Peter Ludlow and Gabriel Segal (2004) point out, a great many languages turn out to lack anything like the definite/indefinite distinction. This raises the possibility of this distinction being far less significant, and less well-defined, than it is usually taken to be.[17]

How would rejecting the definite/indefinite distinction affect debates on whether token uses of definite descriptions can refer? Well, if it were clear that indefinite descriptions could not be used to refer, and if these were indeed semantically equivalent to definite descriptions, then we would have an additional reason to reject the idea that definite descriptions can be used to refer. On the other hand, while it is certainly a minority position, Charles Chastain (1975) and Janet Dean Fodor and Ivan Sag (1982), among others, have argued that indefinite descriptions too can be used to refer. Even if we were to reject this view, advocates of the unitary theory still typically grant that there is some communicative or pragmatic difference between the use of ‘the’ as opposed to ‘a’. So it would be open to the stalwart defender of the view that token definite descriptions can refer to try and argue that such pragmatic markers can play a significant role in regulating the use of descriptions to refer—despite these markers being nowhere reflected in meaning at the level of what is said or asserted. Obviously, none of this will be settled here.

5. Four Models of Linguistic Reference

Our original goal was to lay out some different models of the nature and function of linguistic reference. By looking at how philosophers have attempted to account for the referential features of various different sorts of linguistic terms, we have effectively introduced four distinct ways of understanding how referential terms come to refer to particular objects and individuals. In other words, we have introduced four distinct models for the what is often called the ‘metasemantics’ of referential terms:

1. On the descriptivist model, words refer in virtue of being associated with a specific descriptive contents that serve to identify particular objects or individuals as their referents. This descriptive content might be associated with a given term on a particular occasion in a number of different ways: in virtue of its being something the speaker associates with the term, in virtue of its being what the community associates with the term, that the relevant experts in the community associate with the term, etc.

2. On the causal model, words refer in virtue of being associated with chains of use leading back to an initiating use or ‘baptism’ of the referent. Extending this model beyond names has proven difficult, but one option is to insist that it is really the perceptual connection that underlies most baptismal events that runs the show. In that case, perceptually-grounded uses of demonstratives, deictic pronouns, and definite descriptions can be folded into the picture relatively easily, with anaphoric uses treated as something akin to links in a chain of reference-borrowing.[18]

3. On the character model, words refer in virtue of being associated with regular rules of reference. Paradigm rules of this sort involve only repeatable, publicly-identifiable elements of the context and serve to connect particular terms to particular elements of the context.

4. On the intentionalist model, words refer in virtue of being used, intentionally, to refer to particular objects. In other words, words refer in virtue of their being uttered as part of complex intentional acts which somehow target particular objects or individuals.

As should be clear by now, these four models aren’t strictly exclusive of each other. One might, for instance, conceive of the classical descriptivism—which appeals to the speaker’s mental state in order to associate a particular description with a particular token referential term—as a particular kind of intentionalism. Presumably, speakers will only manifest the right sort of mental state when they are intentionally using a referential term to refer. Likewise, one might view the causal theory as a special case of the character theory: in the case of terms like names, the invariant rule of use associated with a particular name is itself to be explained in terms of a chain of uses leading back to a specific object or individual. In fact, if one is willing to allow the characters of certain sorts of terms, like the demonstratives, to allude to the speaker’s referential intentions, then character theorists can countenance a certain sort of intentionalism within the scope of their theory as well. In doing so, however, it is unclear what remains of the original character model, with its reliance on publicly-identifiable aspects of the context as the primary driver of the rules of reference.

It’s worth noting some clear divisions among these options. First, there is a divide between views according to which referential terms themselves refer, and that we thus use them to refer because they already do so, and views according to which it is us who do the referring, with token linguistic reference following only derivatively. The causal theory and classical, intention-free versions of the character model are paradigm instances of the former sort of view, whereas the intentionalist model is a paradigm instance of the latter. If we extend the character model to include characters that appeal to the speaker’s intentions, then the character model would seem to straddle this divide, with some terms being used in context because of what they refer to, independently of us, and others referring because we use them to.

A second important divide has to do with the extent to which reference is allowed to depend on potentially idiosyncratic and relatively inaccessible aspects of the speaker’s mental state. As we saw above, both classical descriptivists and intentionalists allow for a strong dependence on the speaker’s mental state, and this can lead to some odd predictions regarding reference. Griceans and constraint-type theorists like Reimer have offered ways of trying to minimize these results, but one might also worry that allowing reference to depend on the speaker’s mental state at all undercuts our ability to explain how we use referential terms to coordinate our object-directed thoughts with each other—in other words, to communicate about specific things in the world. On the causal model, for instance, we literally give each other ways of thinking about the same object by passing on a name. That makes explaining communication rather straightforward, supposing, that is, that we are consistently able to recognize which name has been uttered on a given occasion. The problem of names with multiple bearers means that this might turn out to be non-trivial; but the payoff, should we be able to make good on this sort of story, looks significant. Alternatively, on the Kaplanian theory of true indexicals, we can explain our ability to coordinate our thought on particular places, times, and individuals in virtue of the fact that the place, time, and speaker of the utterance are things that are typically public knowledge, equally available to every member of the conversation. The question is whether such an analysis can possibly be extended to include terms like the impure indexicals.

Third, and finally, there is an important divide between models of reference which are expansive as opposed to narrow. Both intentionalism and descriptivism are clearly expansive. They are theories of linguistic reference per se, purporting to apply equally well to any sort of referential term whatsoever. The causal model, as it is traditionally understood, is a narrow model of reference; it only purports to apply to the reference of names. The extended version of the view is more expansive, but even that view has never been applied to the pure indexicals. Once more, the character model proves difficult to place; just how broad or narrow it proves will depend on just how far we are willing to stray in our theorizing from the paradigm case of the true indexicals.

Expansive theories hold out the promise of a substantive account of the reference relation. That is, expansive theorists can claim that the reason that token uses of referential terms play a certain sort of role in explaining the truth or falsity of an utterance is that a certain sort of relation obtains between that token use and some object in the world. Narrow theorists, in contrast, will have to allow that there are different sorts of relations that serve to fix reference for different sorts of referential terms, and even perhaps different uses of the same term. Thus, they will have to say that what unifies referential terms is not that, when they succeed in referring, a particular sort of relation obtains between that token use and some object or individual, but rather that they play some specific functional role in determining the truth conditions of an utterance, its assertive content, or what have you. In other words, standing behind debates over which of these models we should adopt is a much larger, and as yet unresolved, question: just what are our explanatory ambitions in offering a theory of reference in the first place? Are we trying to understand some unified natural kind, which might then, in turn, be used to explain a range of further linguistic phenomena? Or is it rather that there is a range of further linguistic phenomena that we have some grip on, and positing something like reference is merely a convenient, or perhaps even necessary, way of explaining these things? Whichever way we go here is clearly going to have some significant downstream effects on the related question of what, if anything, relates linguistic reference to its apparent analogues in art, cartography, mentation, and so on.

6. Nihilism, Particularism, and Pluralism

So far, this article has mostly taken it for granted that there is a phenomenon of linguistic reference which is worth investigating. But there are some who have doubted that there is any such relation between words and world and others who have doubted that there is just one such relation worthy of investigation.

Concerns of this sort are hardly new. W.V.O. Quine (1960), for instance, famously claims that reference is ‘inscrutable’, or that there is simply no matter of fact what a given referential term refers to. His arguments, however, depend on certain methodological constraints that many would now be inclined to reject. Not so with the related ‘problem of the many’, popularized at roughly the same time by Peter Unger (1980) and Geach (1980). To see the issue, consider someone using an utterance of ‘that’ to refer to a cloud in the sky. What exactly is this cloud? The obvious answer would seem to be: a set of water droplets suspended in the air in such-and-such region. But what about some droplet right on the edge of that region? Should it be counted or not? In fact, there will be innumerable such droplets, and we seem to have no systematic way of answering this question: if we say ‘yes’, we face a continuous march outwards; if we say ‘no’, we face a continuous retreat. Neither option seems even remotely satisfactory, and yet if we cannot provide an answer to the question of what exactly the cloud is then it might well seem that we have equally well failed to answer the question of what the relevant use of ‘that’ refers to.[19]

More recently, pressure on the traditional assumption that referential terms typically refer to particular objects has come from other directions. For instance, Richard Kimberly Heck (2014) has suggested that, once we distinguish what the speaker takes a given term to refer to from what the listener does, there is no further work left for some other, ‘objective’ notion of reference to do. And Mario Gómez-Torrente (2019) has argued that the best response to the sorts of enduring disagreements we see with respect to many complex cases of reference, like Kaplan’s Carnap/Agnew case, is to accept that reference is simply indeterminate in such cases.

Responses to such challenges have been varied. Heck can be read either as a nihilist about linguistic reference, suggesting that there is nothing worthy of the name, or as a limited sort of pluralist, suggesting that there are two reasonable claimants to that title and that neither of them takes priority over the other. Gómez-Torrente, in contrast, suggests that reference is conventional but that the conventions governing many of our referential terms are incomplete. We can, he suggests, sketch a set of sufficient conditions for referential success and failure. But these won’t cover every case, and nor do they offer any guarantee that their outputs will not be in conflict with each other. None of these suggestions does much to address the problem raised by Unger and Geach, though I think it is safe to assume that both Heck and Gómez-Torrente might want to say that this is a problem primarily for either metaphysicians or philosophers of perception, and that philosophers of language should feel free to adopt whatever solutions eventually emanate from those quarters.[20]

A more radical option is mooted in Christopher Gauker (2008), who suggests that there is simply no possibility of offering a systematic theory of demonstrative reference. Rather, on Gauker’s view, the best one can do is point to the sorts of factors that might fit into all things considered judgments about reference. While Gauker stops short of this, a natural extension of his view would apply it to the full panoply of referential terms. In that case, there would turn out to be facts of the matter about reference even in cases where we tend to disagree—though a full explanation of those facts will forever prove evasive. One might even go so far as to suggest that this sort of particularistic approach to linguistic reference can serve to resolve the problem of the many as it applies to linguistic reference: on any occasion of successful reference to an object, there will be an answer to the question of what the material constitution of that object is. It’s just that we will hardly ever, if ever, be in a position to know the answer. Whether we should consider this a satisfying response to that problem is, of course, another matter entirely.

Finally, Nowak and Michaelson (2022) have suggested that some of these issues can be overcome by embracing a pluralistic approach to reference. Like Heck, they take it that sometimes we will be interested in the speaker’s construal or the listener’s construal of the relevant term. But unlike Heck, they argue that there is a robust sense in which both the speaker and listener can be wrong about what a given utterance of a referential term referred to. For instance, consider a version of Kaplan’s Carnap/Agnew case where the speaker is unaware of the switch and the listener, only half paying attention, takes the speaker to be talking about a picture of Boris Johnson that they saw in the paper earlier. Heck’s appraisal of this case will be that the speaker and listener’s construals are enough for us to say that communication has not succeeded. But Nowak and Michaelson contend that there are other things we might be interested in, like: how would we settle a bet if I had wagered that the speaker would say something true and you had wagered that they would say something false? If we do indeed have consistent judgments on these sorts of questions, and if those judgments depend on a sort of reference that isn’t reducible to either the speaker or the listener’s construals, then it looks like a more extensive sort of pluralism about reference might be warranted—one that takes reference to be relative to be both a context and a question we are interested in investigating, rather than just relative to a context. Of course, even a more thoroughgoing pluralism of this sort won’t do anything to address the challenge raised by Unger and Geach.

At this point, it is natural to wonder whether the same sorts of considerations which have motivated the exploration of nihilism, particularism, and pluralism about linguistic reference will carry over to other kinds of reference as well. It is fairly easy to imagine how the issues raised by Unger and Geach might well arise with respect to pictorial or perceptual reference, but harder to see how Heck’s challenge is going to apply in the case of the latter. It might thus turn out that there are reasons to be a pluralist about, say, linguistic reference but not about perceptual reference. Getting clearer on this, however, is likely to require making headway on the question of what (if anything) unifies e.g. linguistic, perceptual, and pictorial reference, what (if anything) makes them species of a single genus. So far at least, that question remains largely unexplored.


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Editor’s note: In 2014, Eliot Michaelson took over responsibility for updating the entry originally written by Marga Reimer. As of the 2024 update, Eliot Michaelson is listed as sole author because no substantive content remains from Reimer’s version.

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