The Problem of Dirty Hands

First published Wed Apr 29, 2009; substantive revision Mon Aug 7, 2023

Should political leaders violate the deepest constraints of morality in order to achieve great goods or avoid disasters for their communities? This question poses what has become known amongst philosophers as the problem of dirty hands. There are many different strands to the philosophical debate about this topic, and they echo many of the complexities in more popular thinking about politics and morality. All, however, involve the idea that correct political action must sometimes conflict with profound moral norms. This entry seeks to unravel these strands and clarify the central normative issues about politics that the cry of ‘dirty hands’ evokes. Beginning with an illustrative passage from a renowned 19th century English novel, the essay traces the dirty hands tradition back to Machiavelli, though its present vogue is owed mostly to the writings of the distinguished American political theorist, Michael Walzer. Walzer’s views are explored in the light of earlier theorists such as Machiavelli and Max Weber and certain vacillations in his intellectual posture are briefly discussed. This leads to the posing of five issues with which the entry is principally concerned. First, is the dirty hands problem simply confused and its formulation the merest contradiction? Second, does the overriding of moral constraints take place within morality or somehow beyond it? Third, can the cry of dirty hands be restricted wholly or principally to politics or does it speak equally to other areas of life, and, where politics is concerned, do only the principal agents get dirty hands or do their citizens share in the taint? This is the problem of scope. Fourth, how are the circumstances that call for dirty hands best described? Fifth, the dirty hands problem has affinities with the problem raised by moral dilemmas, but the question is: should those similarities be allowed to obscure significant differences?

In the course of addressing these issues, the dirty hands challenge is also distinguished from that of political realism, with which it has some affinities, and the resort to role morality to render dirty hands coherent is discussed, as is the issue of the desirability of shaming or punishing dirty hands agents. The relevance of “threshold deontology” is explored, and it is suggested that much of the point of invoking dirty hands comes from an ambiguous attitude to absolute moral prohibitions, combining a rejection of them with a certain wistful attachment to their flavour.

1. Introduction

Anthony Trollope’s novel, The Way We Live Now, is a biting critique of the corruption of late Victorian morals. One of its central characters, the shallow Lady Carbury, at one point voices her conviction that the praiseworthy deeds of the powerful escape the normal categories of morality. Commenting on the character of the novel’s dominant figure, the grand swindler Melmotte, she says to her journalist friend Mr. Booker:

“If a thing can be made great and beneficent, a boon to humanity, simply by creating a belief in it, does not a man become a benefactor to his race by creating that belief?”

“At the expense of veracity?” suggested Mr. Booker.

“At the expense of anything?” rejoined Lady Carbury with energy. “One cannot measure such men by the ordinary rule.”

“You would do evil to produce good?” asked Mr. Booker.

“I do not call it doing evil….You tell me this man may perhaps ruin hundreds, but then again he may create a new world in which millions will be rich and happy.”

“You are an excellent casuist, Lady Carbury.”

“I am an enthusiastic lover of beneficent audacity,” said Lady Carbury…

Contemporary moral and political philosophy suffers from no lack of enthusiastic admirers of “beneficent audacity”. At one end of a spectrum are those consequentialists who are so captivated by the prospect of the new world of “happy millions” that they think it obscurantist to object to any evil means needed to achieve it—indeed, they agree with Lady Carbury in not calling such means evil. At the other end of that spectrum, stand the rather more reluctant advocates of “dirty hands” who think that some very good ends, such as the aversion of catastrophe, require the doing of evil, but unlike Lady Carbury, they insist on calling it evil, though necessary evil. And like Lady Carbury, they rather think that the agents who so dirty their hands cannot be measured “by the ordinary rule.” Even so, like W.H. Auden in his poem “Spain”, they think such agents doing what current circumstances make “necessary” should accept the guilt that their immoral actions earn. As Auden puts it:

“To-day the deliberate increase in the chances of death,
The conscious acceptance of guilt in the necessary murder.”

The dirty hands tradition dates back to Machiavelli, though its present currency is largely owed to the American political theorist Michael Walzer who gave it the title of dirty hands in an influential article “Political Action: the Problem of Dirty Hands”, in which he coined the term “dirty hands” adapting it from Jean Paul Sartre’s play of the same name (Walzer 1973). Later, Walzer used the idea, though not the term, in his book Just and Unjust Wars (1977) in which he argued that an appeal to “supreme emergency” could not only explain but justify the Allied terror bombing of German cities in the early stages of World War II (Walzer 1977a, 267–68). For these early stages, roughly (it seems, for Walzer gives no date) up to the end of 1941, the deliberate massacre of thousands of German non-combatants was required by supreme emergency, even though it was gravely immoral. The prospect and likelihood of a Nazi victory were so dire for the lives and communal values of those facing defeat that the price of severe immorality was worth paying. In the subsequent conduct of the war, Walzer argued, the city bombings were simply immoral (as were the city bombings of Japan, including the atomic attacks on Hiroshima and Nagasaki) and could not be justified by supreme emergency.[1] When Walzer later revisited the topic of supreme emergency, he made it clear that it was a case of dirty hands, indeed he seems to have come to the view that only something like the circumstances of supreme emergency could provide a dirty hands justification. So he says, in the later discussion of supreme emergency, that the doctrine of dirty hands is that “according to which political and military leaders may sometimes find themselves in situations where they cannot avoid acting immorally, even when that means deliberately killing the innocent.” And again: “…dirty hands aren’t permissible (or necessary) when anything less than the ongoingness of the community is at stake, or when the danger that we face is anything less than communal death” (Walzer 2004a, 46).

2. Shifting Interpretations

The first thing to notice about this is that the identification of supreme emergency and dirty hands represents a dramatic shift from Walzer’s view in his original article, and this shift reflects a significant ambiguity in the dirty hands tradition. Walzer’s accounts of supreme emergency vary somewhat in the treatments in Just and Unjust Wars and in the later article, “Emergency Ethics” (and we shall attend to this later) but in both accounts the necessity to override deep moral constraints only arises in conditions approaching catastrophe. In the original 1973 paper, however, the trigger for dirty hands is nowhere near as extreme. One example there, with intriguing contemporary relevance, concerned a political leader’s need to torture a suspected terrorist in the hope of preventing the likely killing of hundreds of innocent people. This falls well short of the criterion of supreme emergency in Walzer’s later writings where the trigger is the devastation of whole peoples and/or their ways of life. Moreover, Walzer’s other example in the original paper was of a good democratic politician bribing a corrupt ward boss to deliver him votes with the promise of improperly delivered school construction contracts. Here not only is the moral violation much less profound than in the former case, but the emergency could hardly be considered “supreme” in any sense even if we allow that the votes are needed to win an important election and that the politician is genuinely motivated to do good when elected. In Walzer’s initial treatment, there is also some ambiguity in the use of the term “dirty hands” since he sometimes uses it for any conspicuous immorality as well as the more interesting and technical sense we are concerned with. So he says “It is easy to get one’s hands dirty in politics and it is often right to do so” (Walzer 1973, 174). The first clause seems to point to the widespread temptation to resort to immorality where the second indicates that it isn’t always right to do so, hence demarcating a positive normative sense of “dirty” from a merely descriptive sense. The use of “often” shows the more concessive attitude to the scope of dirty hands in contrast to Walzer’s later view.

Earlier writers concerned with the need for politicians to dirty their hands with immoral behaviour show some of this vacillation, sometimes stressing the extreme stakes that are involved, but more often appearing to view the political process generally as above morality, or at least operating with a different morality. (“One cannot measure such men by the ordinary rule”). John M. Parrish in an interesting and far-ranging book (Parrish, 2007) shows that there are elements of the concern about the generally challenging nature of politics for morality as early as Plato’s Republic. Parrish’s understanding, however, of what constitutes dirty hands is often so broad as to obscure some of the distinctions, ambiguities and problems arising from current philosophical discussions. to be fair, he is interested in charting a sort of pre-history to the contemporary debate, and admits that “the problem may have changed over time” so that there is “a succession of dirty hands problems” (Parrish, p. 18). Even so, some of the apparently morally troubling examples he discusses from ancient intellectual sources have none of the marks of the contemporary problem. Augustine’s insistence, for example, that even a justly waged war is morally regrettable is accompanied by the untroubled argument that the warrior whose cause and intention is just does not sin at all (i.e., violate any moral obligation) in killing his enemy. Parrish’ emphasis on the idea that political life is pervasively morally problematic, however, does find echoes in early modern treatments that foreshadow the contemporary dirty hands discussion. One such influential treatment is that of Machiavelli. So Machiavelli thinks that the ordinary processes of politics require that the Prince “must learn how not to be good”, though he should maintain the appearance of virtue and indeed behave virtuously when the cost is low (Machiavelli 1513, 52). Max Weber stresses the way that regard for consequences must dominate the thinking of the politician as contrasted with ordinary or religiously inspired ethics. This contrast lies behind the opposition Weber discerns in “Politics as Vocation” between “an ethic of responsibility” and “an ethic of ultimate ends”. Although the terms in which Weber frames the contrast tend to confuse rather than clarify the issues, it is probable that one thing he has in mind for the “ultimate ends” side of the conflict is an ethic involving absolute prohibitions; he sees these as being in tension with an outlook geared to counting consequences. As Weber puts it: “there is an abysmal contrast between conduct that follows the maxim of an ethic of ultimate ends-that is, in religious terms, ‘the Christian does rightly and leaves the results with the Lord’-and conduct that follows the maxim of an ethic of responsibility, in which case one has to give an account of the foreseeable results of one’s action” (Weber 1919, 120). The starkness of this contrast is one source of confusion since, as we shall see later, absolutists are not totally indifferent to consequences — not all their ethic consists of absolute prohibitions-and non-absolutists need not be obsessed only with consequences. But Weber is adamant that it is impossible in politics to adhere generally to any absolutist ethic of ultimate ends, largely because of what he sees as the central role of violence in politics. In spite of Walzer citing him approvingly (up to a point) in his original article, Weber does not seem to hold anything like Walzer’s mature view. He does not think that an ethic of ultimate ends suffices most of the time, but gives way in conditions of supreme emergency; rather his view appears to be that the ultimate ends ethic is quite generally inadequate to politics. In fact, Weber’s belief that violence is central to the operation of politics is exaggerated, though understandable in the circumstances in which he wrote, but if it were true it might give his position more affinity with Walzer’s idea of supreme emergency. The difference would remain that, although violence may well be a factor in establishing supreme emergency, Walzer’s mature understanding of supreme emergency requires more than simply incursions of violence.

This ambiguity about the extent of the need for dirty hands is reflected in much of the literature on the topic. Numerous writers have followed early Walzer (and some elements in both Machiavelli’s and Weber’s treatment of political morality) in regarding politics as a zone in which, to quote Neil Levy, “dirty actions are part and parcel of ordinary political life”. Levy adds: “Politicians must make deals, compromise with interests they abhor, distribute favours and neglect relationships” (Levy 2007, 52–3, endnote 26). A number of these things are no doubt regrettable or distasteful in varying degrees, but whether they are immoral depends on what the deals are, what the favours involve, how deep the compromise runs, and how damaging the neglect is (and to what sort of relationship). Much of what various writers regard as the need for dirty hands in politics is dubiously an issue of immorality at all. In order to maintain power and get important work done, a politician may have to appoint a member of a party in coalition with his own to an important Ministry ahead of a trusted colleague in his own party who has better credentials for the job. This is disappointing and painful to him and his colleague and clearly less than ideal (even though the appointee is, we may suppose, competent enough) but I do not think the act can be seen as immoral. To call it morally disagreeable is to signal the fact that certain valuable relations and ends are put under strain by it, but it is clearly not is the same league as torture, murder, or gross deceit.

Bernard Williams does indeed distinguish levels of gravity in the sinning required of politicians in his exploration of the scope of dirty hands, but he also suggests that the politician’s necessary immoralities are very common and distinctive. He distinguishes between the morally “disagreeable or distasteful” and the morally criminal, the latter being subsumed under a broad category of what he calls “violence” (Williams 1978, 71). Although Williams allows that some political actions that are popularly believed to be morally dubious, may well be morally acceptable when circumstances are properly understood, he casts a pretty wide net for the morally disagreeable. It involves such things as “lying, or at least concealment and the making of misleading statements; breaking promises; special pleading; temporary coalition with the distasteful; sacrifice of the interests of worthy persons to those of unworthy persons; and (at least if in a sufficiently important position) coercion up to blackmail” (Williams 1978, 59). Yet it is unlikely that all of these, as so generally described, are morally wrong in all circumstances. True, some philosophers have held as much for some of these—Augustine, Aquinas and Kant for lying, and Kant for promising—but surely lying is acceptable in extreme circumstances such as the need to protect an innocent person from a murderer, and even coercion (depending on the definition) isn’t always morally wrong, witness the coercive detention of people reasonably suspected of contagious disease that they are unaware of. It seems that most, if not all the things Williams mentions are in the category “normally morally wrong but morally permissible in certain circumstances”. Even blackmail might be in this category since blackmailing a vicious criminal in order to secure the freedom of his victim might (perhaps depending on the kind of blackmail) be morally permissible. Notions like regret or remorse are sometimes invoked to show that what had to be done was nonetheless immoral, but apart from the fact that an act such as the blackmail of a vicious criminal need not even be regrettable, there are many things one can rightly regret having to do that are not immoral, for example, punishing a child by withdrawing privileges. Remorse strikes a stronger, more moralised note, but for that very reason one should be careful not to confuse it with various feelings of discomfort, regret or sorrow for having to do certain things. Further investigation of the nature and appropriate conditions for remorse is interesting and difficult, but beyond the scope of this discussion, and its role as a criterion of dirty hands seems at best inconclusive.

The idea that dirty hands (in contrast to sheer bad behaviour and corrupt activity) are commonplace in politics is highly dubious, but just how extensive the reach of this phenomenon is in politics is difficult to determine, and would be best considered on a case by case, or perhaps category by category, fashion. Clearly, the most obvious, and I think the most interesting category is that described by Williams with the term “violence” (though that has the contentious, and I think unfortunate implication that all violence is immoral). This covers the acts that Walzer’s later argument seeks to capture with his term “supreme emergency”. His terminology and his later practice make the scope of dirty hands pretty restricted, perhaps more so than Williams intended, but I will follow his example and focus on really grave injustices like murder, torture, rape or slavery that are said to be warranted in conditions of extreme emergency.

First, however, it is worth noting that enthusiasm to detect the sway of dirty hands can lead to misdescription of some complex, disturbing moral situations. An interesting example of this has been explored by Jennifer Rubenstein in connection with problems facing International NGOs providing aid in emergency situations such as the refugee camps in the Congo. INGO agents have found that their provision of food and medicine is often exploited by warring factions within refugee camps and elsewhere (see also some of Fiona Terry’s discussion and examples in Terry 2002). This confronts them with often agonising decisions about whether to cease aid and leave the areas of distress because of the harm this exploitation generates, including continuation of violent conflict. If they leave they abandon suffering people, but if they stay, then they contribute unintentionally to great harms that others inflict on innocent people. Such problems are often described with the vocabulary of “dirty hands”, but, as Rubenstein argues, this description is misplaced since, for one thing, the aid agencies do not themselves intentionally do harm to avoid some great evil or achieve some great good. Rubenstein proposes a category of “spattered hands” to describe these situations in order to emphasise that the soiling is contributed by the actions of others (Rubenstein 2014, Chapter 4). We cannot examine the adequacy of her new category here, but she seems right that the examples are misdescribed as dirty hands.

It will be apparent from all this that the dirty hands problem needs initially some conceptual clarification; this should proceed with a view to five issues. First, there is the question whether the dirty hands scenario makes any sense at all; perhaps it is just a muddle. Second, there is the related question whether the overriding that dirty hands involve (or purport to involve) takes place within morality or somehow beyond it. Third, there is the question whether dirty hands are necessitated only or primarily by politics. Fourth, how are the circumstances that call for dirty hands best described? Fifth, there is the issue of the relation of the dirty hands problem to that of moral dilemmas and the requirements of some form of moral absolutism.

3. A Conceptual Confusion?

Let us examine these in turn. The structure of dirty hands is such that it seems to involve a contradiction or paradox. The advocate of dirty hands says in effect that it is sometimes right to do what is wrong, and this seems tantamount to saying that some act is both wrong and not wrong. But the dirty hands theorist is not saying that it is wrong in some respects and right in others, nor that what would normally be wrong is here right. Rather, it is the whole act in context that is both categorically wrong and not wrong. In the dirty hands scenario we are asked to believe that doing X is morally wrong and yet it is palpably right to do it. As Walzer has more recently written of his own position, it is both “provocative and paradoxical” (Walzer 2004a, 33). Kai Nielson has urged the point even more strongly, but something of the sort has puzzled many who contemplate the problem. The category of dirty hands, as described by Walzer and some others is, according to Nielson “a conceptual confusion with unfortunate moral residues” (Nielson 2000, 140). Clearly such a dismissal would come naturally to a utilitarian or most consequentialists who would simply declare the dirty hands decision to be one in which a right act (that producing the best consequences in terms of preference satisfactions, overall increase in happiness or whatever) has been done though it may have been distressing to do it. Nielson disavows utilitarianism and calls himself a “weak consequentialist” but the upshot is much the same. He thinks that dirty hands situations confront an agent with a choice of two evils and the agent should always choose the lesser evil. No doubt, in acting against what in other circumstances is a deep moral constraint, the agent will experience distress; she will “feel guilty” but feeling guilty is not to be confused with being guilty (Nielson 2000, 140).

From the opposite direction the problem can also be resolved by the denial that the hands should become dirty. An insistence on the inviolability of some moral prescriptions makes the paradox disappear as neatly as the Nielson manoeuvre. If we hold to the prohibition on intentionally killing the innocent, for example, in the face of crises like that supposed by Walzer to necessitate the bombing of German cities in the early phase of World War II, then there are no dirty hands to have. Such a position is often called absolutist. Absolutist positions have been explicitly held by many philosophers, notably Augustine, Aquinas, and Kant, and implicitly perhaps by many more. The position involves complexities that we will examine later.

Both these responses agree in holding that moral reasons rightly dominate all others. Another way of defusing the strong appearance of contradiction is to hold that morality is not the only legitimate determinant of right action and that some other determinant may occasionally properly trump it. This provides one answer to the second point of clarification mentioned earlier. Dirty hands problems do not arise within morality but rather when morality clashes with some other rational necessity of a profound kind that correctly overrules it.[2] The overruling must inspire regret, possibly remorse, but it is nonetheless clear that the overruling is in order, indeed required. Here, it is important to acknowledge that the overruling in question is not merely a description of what often happens. It is common knowledge that the demands of morality are often enough overridden by other persuasive demands, such as imperatives of self-interest, careerism, political advantage and friendship. It may even be that politics is an arena in which such overpowering happens more commonly than elsewhere, so that participation in it is fraught with moral hazard that requires an exceptional moral character to overcome. Nonetheless, the importance and challenge of the dirty hands scenario is not that hands get dirty from time to time, but that it is right that they do so.

If we allow that non-moral “oughts” can sometimes trump moral ones then the dirty hands position may be restated as holding that, in circumstances of extremity, reasons of “necessity” (or whatever) defeat important moral reasons. This seems to be one plausible construal of Machiavelli when he talks of the necessity that rulers must learn how not to be good. Of course, he has the model of Christian morality in mind when he calls for its overriding and so may be understood as opposing one form of morality to another, but a good deal of his discussion can be treated as elevating “reasons of state” above morality. This is a rejection of the idea that moral reasons dominate all other reasons.

It may be useful here to distinguish between dominance and comprehensiveness. Most moral theorists hold that morality is both comprehensive and dominant, that is, it relevant to all decisions and where relevant it defeats all other reasons. One could however hold that morality is comprehensive but not dominant, or dominant but not comprehensive, or indeed neither dominant nor comprehensive. Our present inquiry is concerned with the first two options. The ideas of dominance and comprehensiveness express somewhat different pictures of the status of morality, though an exalted understanding of morality often draws on both. Morality’s dominance would consist in its trumping all other considerations whenever it is relevant to them, whereas morality’s comprehensiveness consists in its being universally relevant whether it trumps other considerations or not. On the present interpretation, dirty hands theorists accept morality’s comprehensiveness (at least with respect to the domains they are concerned with) but reluctantly reject its dominance for one class of decisions.

We might usefully contrast this with the position of the school of thinkers called “political realists” whose outlook has some affinity with the dirty hands theorists to the point that the two are sometimes confused. Realists are often viewed (and often present themselves) as rejecting the comprehensive relevance of morality by reference to something special about politics or international relations. So we find E.H. Carr stating as “the realist view” that “no ethical standards are applicable to relations between states…” (Carr 1962, 153). Other realists come close to this, though their views are clouded by uncertainties about morality’s provenance (as indeed are Carr’s). Arthur Schlesinger Jr., for instance, claims: “The raw material of foreign affairs is, most of the time, morally neutral or ambiguous. In consequence, for the great majority of foreign-policy transactions, moral principles cannot be decisive” (Schlesinger 1971, 73).The influential American realist, Hans Morgenthau, is anxious to separate politics from morality by maintaining “the autonomy of the political sphere.” He recognises the autonomy of other spheres such as economics, law and morality, but insists that the political realist must “subordinate these other standards to those of politics” (Morgenthau 2006, 13). Here, he echoes the position of the German conservative thinker Carl Schmitt by whom he was clearly influenced. Schmitt became embroiled with the Nazi Party in the 1930s and enjoyed (if that is the word) some fame for a time as a theoretician for the Nazi cause. These quotations all suggest the idea that politics, or some significant area of it, such as international relations, falls quite outside the provenance of morality, thus denying morality comprehensiveness, though the reference to morality’s failure to be “decisive” hints at a denial of dominance. There are many obscurities in the stance of political realism, and this is not the place to unravel them, but in spite of the ambiguities in pronouncements of the leading theorists in the school, and in spite of some continuity between their outlook on politics and that of the dirty hands theorists, it is clear that the realist’s attitude to morality usually has quite a different flavour to that of the dirty hands theorists.[3] Part of this is captured by the difference between the denials of comprehensiveness and dominance, and this connects with the fact that when realists reject moral considerations they do so with no deep sense of regret or remorse for having done what is morally wrong.

The denial of dominance preserves a certain coherence for morality since it is not, as it were, at odds with itself; it is at times and in context at odds with something else which, following both Machiavelli and Walzer, might be called “necessity”. But what is this necessity? Clearly, it is not meant to be some form of deterministic necessity, since it would have been possible for the British leadership in World War II to have rejected the policy of city bombing outright, as their declared policy prior to the war had indicated they would do, a policy that their initial bombing practices indeed respected.[4] Yet there is a trace of this deterministic thought in the idea of supreme emergency with its implication of something that overwhelms the normal power of morality. We might recall in this connection Thomas Hobbes’s argument that moral dictates cannot apply when they would lead to self-destruction. Hobbes’s idea is that the rationality of self-preservation, which itself gives rise to morality, makes acting on morality null and void when acting on it would defy self-preservation. As Hobbes puts it: “The laws of nature oblige in foro interno; that is to say, they bind to a desire that they should take place: but in foro externo: this is to the putting of them in act, not always. For he that should be modest, and tractable, and perform all he promises, in such time, and place, where no man else should do so, should but make himself a prey to others, and procure his own certain ruin, contrary to the ground of all laws of nature, which tend to nature’s preservation” (Leviathan, Ch. XV, p. 99).

Hobbes certainly does paint a totally isolated scenario for the person who would obey the moral law—“where no man else should do so”—and one might wonder whether the institution of promising could even exist in so bleakly uncooperative “time and place” as he supposes. But presumably a sufficient number of non-cooperators would serve to make one “a prey to others” and procure “certain ruin”, and it is the necessity of avoiding some such ruin that motivates the supreme emergency story, even though it is collective rather than individual ruin that lies at its heart. Hobbes’s exemption from the need to practice morality (rather than desire its operation) makes most sense on a contractarian view of morality or in connection with those moral obligations that are dependent upon agreement (even if other obligations are not). In a world in which hardly anyone kept their promises or adhered to their contracts, the sense of such commitments would dissipate and entering into what shell remained of them might be folly indeed, and very likely futile as well. But many other areas of morality are not like this, and so even where adherence to moral imperatives may be perilous in the extreme, it may not be the folly that Hobbes’s comments make it seem. One woman who survived Belsen, Hanna Levy-Haas, records in her diary a philosophical debate she had in the camp with a fellow Marxist, Professor K who argued the somewhat Hobbesian case (embellished with Marxist terminology) that morality did not apply in the camps because it was superseded by the survival imperative. She rejected his argument because it required her “simply to compromise with the enemy, to betray one’s principles, to deny spiritual values in the interests of saving one’s skin” (Levy-Haas 1982, 65). These comments indicate at the very least that the idea of “total ruin” is open to interpretations that see the abandonment or degrading of moral integrity as itself a primary ingredient in such ruin.

This excursion into the world of the Leviathan nonetheless helps give some sense to the idea that the practice of morality might be suspended for a time and hence morality itself moved aside by an external necessity. It thus helps show a way that the dirty hands story might be redeemed from incoherence, even if the idea that morality should sometimes be dominated by an external necessity proves unacceptable. The dirty hands position might then be coherent but false. So Hanna Levy-Haas could understand the Professor’s argument, but found reason to reject it.

4. A Conflict Within Morality?

Another route out of paradox would be to hold that the clash depicted by dirty hands theorists occurs within morality. Here, the idea might be that morality itself is not entirely coherent or self-consistent. In certain extreme circumstances, one powerful strand in morality comes into conflict with another. Even more clearly, Weber’s distinction between the ethics of ultimate ends and that of responsibility points in this direction. His idea is expressed somewhat opaquely, but he seems to be claiming that there are two strands in morality, or two types of morality, such that one may be applicable to ordinary life, but must yield to the other in matters political, especially those that involve difficult choices in a context of violence. Several passages in Walzer’s discussion tend in this direction. He holds that a morality of rights and a morality of consequences or utility co-exist in our moral outlook in such a way that although rights trump utility in normal circumstances, a “utilitarianism of extremity” rightly overrides the morality of rights in some rare circumstances. As he puts it: in a situation of supreme emergency, “a certain kind of utilitarianism reimposes itself”, this being “the utilitarianism of extremity” set against “a rights normality” (Walzer 2004a, 40).

This contrast between a rights ethic (or other deontological ethic) and utilitarianism is one way of locating the clash within morality itself. Another way is by having recourse to role morality: within morality itself there are general moral principles, rules etc. and then special moral requirements dictated by significant social roles. These can come into conflict, as when the lawyer’s obligation to provide her client with the best defence and to preserve confidentiality can conflict with the demands of impartial justice. So it might be argued that the political role has obligations and rights special to it that override more general moral obligations and rights. When it comes to the immensely important role of political leadership, we “cannot measure such men by the ordinary rule” as Lady Carbury puts it. This manoeuvre has the advantage of capturing something important in the dirty hands literature (and it is also present in the realist literature), namely, the emphasis on the special moral significance of the role of political leadership. Walzer, for instance, places great weight upon “what political leaders are for.” Talking of political and military leaders, he says, “The effect of the supreme emergency arguments should be to reinforce professional ethics, and to provide an account of when it is permissible (and necessary) to get our hands dirty” (Walzer 2004a, 42). An initial problem with this sort of move is that the special duties and rights of social roles are underpinned by general moral considerations since it is only those roles that can be morally supported by quite general moral considerations that will have a role morality. We may describe the code of the Mafia thug as the morality of his role, but usually it is mores rather morality being described. Even if it is a requirement of his role that a Mafia hit-man must murder anyone who snitches to the police, this is hardly a moral imperative of any sort. And where there are genuine moral duties to a role, and they are endorsed by broader moral considerations, we do not believe that this endorsement cannot itself be overruled by other general moral obligations. The requirements of professional confidentiality, for instance, can be so overridden, as when medical confidentiality regarding a doctor-patient communication stands in the way of saving a life. The famous Tarasof case is instructive in this respect. It concerned a counsellor at the University of California at Berkeley who learned from his client that he planned to kill his ex-girl friend. The counsellor was sufficiently worried that he broke confidentiality to tell the police who investigated but took no further action. The girl friend (Tarasof) was duly murdered by the client, and a court later held that the counsellor should have gone further and notified Tarasof or her family of the danger.[5] Other courts have been less demanding, but there is a general recognition that the professional duty of client confidentiality can be overridden by more pressing moral demands.

Indeed, the structure of the role morality defence of the dirty hands story provides a curious inversion of the role morality logic since that logic requires that emergency situations allow or even demand the overturning of the role duties by the more general demands of a deeper morality. By contrast, the dirty hands scenario requires the role morality to triumph over the deeper moral outlook that gives sense to the morality of role itself. Here we find yet another paradox generated by the dirty hands category. It could only be resolved by the insistence that the political role is unique among roles since in its case its moral power somehow transcends the general morality. (Or, if the dirty hands scenario applies beyond the political, it will be one of a small set of roles that is unique.) In fact, there is a strong strand of this political exceptionism inherent in the dirty hands story. Yet how could the political role have such a status? We might expect such an exaltation of the role from one such as Schmitt, but in fact Walzer himself is drawn to it. Walzer’s position has been cited as treating the dirty hands conflict as involving a clash between a rights ethic and a utilitarianism of extremity, but the following quote puts his position much more in the role morality arena. He says in his later treatment: “No government can put the life of the community and all its members at risk, so long as there are actions available to it, even immoral actions, that would avoid or reduce the risk….That is what political leaders are for; that is their first task” (Walzer 2004a, 42). Furthermore, the significance of this task is cashed out in terms of the supreme value of the specific “moral community” to which the political leader belongs. The leader’s obligations will involve calculations of utility, but, in extremis, his or her ultimate responsibility to that community trumps universalist utilitarian calculations as well as specific deontological constraints. When the “ongoingness” of a community’s way of life is threatened then the prospect is that of “a loss greater than any that can be imagined, except for the destruction of humanity itself” (Walzer 2004a, 43). These claims, if true, would certainly establish a pre-eminent, if not unique, significance for the political role, so they need close examination.

Walzer’s two quotes stress significantly different values that he has a tendency to conflate. The first is that of life itself for all members of the community, the second that of the continuity of a “way of life”. Survival is at issue in both cases but the significance and weight that each survival should have is surely very different. The prospect of universal massacre understandably puts stress upon anything constraining the scope of actions to prevent it, but the prospect of forced alterations, set-backs or radical changes to a way of life must be less threatening. Even a relatively benign foreign occupation may involve extensive and very regrettable changes to the way of life of the occupied community perhaps in the form of restrictions on traditional freedoms, such as those of political speech or religious expression, and a degraded position of citizenship vis-à-vis the occupiers. Yet throughout history modified life styles have evolved for such communities that make for the possibility of at least coping and even some flourishing. It is not at all obvious that slaughtering innocent people is justified in order to avoid such an outcome, or even outcomes notably worse on the same scale.

Even if dirty hands were permitted only to political communities facing extreme situations, it is not at all clear that the exemption should only be available to political communities that have states. Walzer does not exactly say this, but his pro-state bias is evident in his discussion of supreme emergency in Just and Unjust Wars. Early in that discussion, he says, for instance, “Can soldiers and statesmen override the rights of innocent people for the sake of their own political community? I am inclined to answer this question affirmatively, though not without hesitation and worry” (Walzer 1977, 254). Further, in a different essay on terrorism, Walzer rejects arguments on behalf of terrorism by non-state agents that are very similar to those that he accepts as legitimating the bombing of German cities. For example, he claims that the familiar terrorist excuse that they had no alternative in the face of oppression is only “a pretence.” As he puts it: “‘Last resort’ has only a notional finality; the resort to terror is ideologically last, not last in an actual series of actions, just last for the sake of the excuse” (Walzer 2004b, 54). Yet no such scepticism is expressed about the no alternative and last resort justifications offered by governments who use terrorism in supreme emergency.

But political communities other than states may surely face supreme emergencies, even allowing for the difficulties in interpreting the concept, so the way is open in principle for sub-state terrorism to be justified. This is a position that Walzer somewhat reluctantly seems now (in a parenthesis to a later reprinting of the terrorism article) to concede, though it goes somewhat against the grain of the article itself. The parenthetical comments, published in 2004, are: “Would terrorism be justified in a ‘supreme emergency’ as that condition is described [by Walzer in the earlier chapter called ‘Emergency Ethics’]. It might be, but only if the oppression to which the terrorists claimed to be responding was genocidal in character” (Walzer 2004b, 54). There are difficulties in matching the complex meanings of “genocide” to Walzer’s communitarian account of supreme emergency. For one thing, a Nazi victory would probably not have meant genocide for the British community yet, according to Walzer, they were facing supreme emergency. So, the sources of his differential treatment of state and sub-state terrorism remain a puzzle.

He goes on to deny that any actual recent terrorism has been “a means for avoiding disaster” rather than merely a “reaching for political success” (Walzer 2004b, 54). So the supreme emergency/dirty hands exemption seems available, given significant qualifications concerning probability of success, for terrorists aiming to save a communal way of life. In a later paper again, Walzer allows for exceptional cases in which sub-state terrorism might be excusable though not justifiable; he imagines as excusable “a terrorist campaign by Jewish militants against German civilians in the 1940s—if attacks on civilians had been likely (in fact they would have been highly unlikely) to stop the mass murder of the Jews” (Walzer 2006, 7). The shift from justifiable in the earlier quotation to excusable in the later clearly needs more explanation; Walzer seems hesitant, if not confused in his resort to these categories. Nonetheless, on Walzer’s own grounds, there would seem to be a case, given some likelihood of success, for the employment of terrorism by Palestinian groups seeking to salvage what remains of their community’s way of life from the ravages of Israeli occupation, settlement and military attack. It is perhaps pertinent to this prospect that the Palestinians refer to their dispossession and ongoing sufferings at the hands of Israel as “al-Nakba”: the catastrophe. No doubt, their achieving that prospect would involve some sort of “reaching for political success” but this hardly counts against its status as a response to supreme emergency. The point here is not to make any particular claims about the Israeli-Palestinian conflict, but rather to stress the idea, noted earlier, that Walzer’s move to a criterion of genocide is puzzling as the sole interpretation of what a threat to the continuity of a communal way of life could mean.

Walzer’s tendency to run together the categories of excuse and justification needs some comment because it is symptomatic of the tensions inherent in the dirty hands scenario. He realises in the 1973 article that it is important to distinguish them. Citing J.L. Austin, Walzer remarks that “the two can seem to come very close together…but they are conceptually distinct…an excuse is typically an admission of fault; a justification is typically a denial of fault and an assertion of innocence” (Walzer 1973, 170; Walzer 1974, 72). Yet dirty hands acts involve both an admission of fault and a justification. This tends to collapse the distinction since what is justified needs no excuse and the unjustifiable is sometimes excusable. Walzer’s discussion for the most part clearly treats the dirty hands decisions as justified in some sense, whatever is said about its role as excuse. It is notable that at least one commentator, Tamar Meisels, explicitly rejects the account in terms of justification in her discussion of terrorism and torture but she accepts dirty hands as providing grounds for excuse (Meisels 2008a, 213–221). Yet not only is this an unlikely interpretation of the tradition, but it renders the category of dirty hands far less interesting philosophically and ethically.

The discussion of the importance and extent of political community leads naturally to the question whether the need for dirty hands can be restricted to the political sphere. If hands must be dirtied to avoid widespread massacre, on the one hand, or damage to the moral-cum-political continuity of a community’s way of life, then why not to avoid the unjustified killing of individuals or small groups or the drastic disruption of individual or small group’s way of living. Why should the political community and the political role take such dramatic precedence over such significant groups as families and their associated roles? For that matter, why should it take precedence over the individual’s need for survival regardless of role? The answer to this is not entirely clear. In Walzer’s discussion of supreme emergency and the World War II city bombings, he confronts this question but his discussion is marked by what he himself calls “hesitation and worry”. It is also marked by appeals to what people are “likely to feel”, “what is not usually said” and similar phrases. He says: “…it is not usually said of individuals in domestic society that they necessarily will or that they morally can strike out at innocent people, even in the supreme emergency of self-defense. They can only attack their attackers. But communities, in emergencies, seem to have different and larger prerogatives. I am not sure that I can account for the difference, without ascribing to communal life a kind of transcendence that I don’t believe it to have” (Walzer 1977, 254). Nor, he thinks, can it simply be a matter of the numbers. Yet he persists with the superiority of the political community: “We might better say that it is possible to live in a world where individuals are sometimes murdered, but a world where entire peoples are enslaved or massacred is literally unbearable. For the survival and freedom of political communities—whose members share a way of life, developed by their ancestors, to be passed on to their children—are the highest values of international society” (Walzer 1977, 254). Leaving aside the quibble that an individual facing murder won’t find it possible to live on if she is actually murdered when perhaps she refuses to kill the innocent in order to survive, we might question the sensitivity of ignoring the way any murder victim’s close relatives find her death unbearable and the prospect of living on an agonising one. We might also wonder why “we” don’t find it unbearable to slaughter hundreds of thousands of innocent people to preserve the survival and freedom of our political communities. Nor is the reference to “the highest values of international society” particularly compelling. Where “international society” refers to the society of states, as Walzer seems often to mean, then it is not surprising that such states hold their survival as a pre-eminent value, but non-state agents may understandably have different priorities. A mother scrounging for the survival of her children in the desperate conditions of a third-world slum or primitive refugee camp may just as plausibly see herself coming under what Walzer calls, in connection with political communities, “the rule of necessity (and necessity knows no rules)” (Walzer 1977, 254).

5. The Scope of Dirty Hands and Some Significant Distinctions

In his original article on dirty hands, Walzer allows in passing that the phenomenon he is exploring might have a place beyond politics. So, he says: “I don’t want to argue that it is only a political dilemma. No doubt we can get our hands dirty in private life also, and sometimes, no doubt, we should. But the issue is posed most dramatically in politics…” (Walzer 1974, 76). This concession has, however, little influence on his developed position which is focused wholly on extreme emergency in political contexts. (The original article is, after all, called, “Political Action: the Problem of Dirty Hands”.) Other writers have been puzzled by the heavy concentration on politics. Michael Stocker, for one, rejects this restriction (Stocker 2000, 32–3). Stocker also argues that the dirty hands phenomena, though distinctive in various ways, exhibit quite common features of moral conflicts more generally, and partly for this reason he thinks there is no logical incoherence in the dirty hands story. Stocker argues that what he calls double-counting, i.e., giving moral weight to impossible oughts, and allowing for non-action-guiding act evaluations, is a central feature of dirty hands, but is not restricted to them since they occur “across the board” of moral thinking and deciding.

However it should be located, the phenomenon of dirty hands can be easily assimilated to that of moral dilemma, but this is an assimilation that should be resisted. Someone confronted with a supreme emergency is indeed in what is often colloquially called “a moral dilemma” in the sense that she faces a disturbing and difficult choice situation, but that does not make it a moral dilemma in a philosophically interesting sense. In common parlance all sorts of situations that cause initial uncertainty and require hard moral thinking to sort out are called moral dilemmas, as philosophers who teach or consult on business ethics are fully aware. This usage is harmless enough, but the philosophical usage of the term points to a more disturbing situation and one that needs to be distinguished from dirty hands. Both the categories of dirty hands and moral dilemma involve agonising choice in which there will be grave moral loss either way. The most salient difference between the categories is that a moral dilemma arises only when the choice is such that neither horn is decisively supported by morality, indeed morality speaks equally against both. (There is a parallel dilemma for non-moral normative contexts, if there be any, where normative reasons speak equally against doing p or doing not-p.) Whichever way the agent chooses, her action is unjustified and there is no question of one course being more necessary or demanded than the other. By contrast, the dirty hands choice is always dictated as the “necessary” course: in the context of political emergencies, the community defence always wins the day even over innocent lives. This is the special feature that marks off dirty hands from moral dilemmas.

A relatively unexplored question concerns whether anything more informative than a reference to “emergency”, supreme or otherwise, can be provided to illuminate the typical circumstances in which it is claimed that hands must be dirtied. One line of clarification that might be attempted would be to scrutinise more carefully various broad situations in which moral action might be especially under strain in political contexts. A first suggestion might be that politics is essentially a zone of compromise, and it is the pressure of compromise that creates the need for dirty hands. It is certainly true that compromise is a pervasive feature of political life, but compromise is hardly unique to politics, nor is it necessarily a pressure for immoral conduct. Indeed, it is arguable that the capacity to compromise is an essential moral ingredient in all successful cooperative endeavours, since, apart from its instrumental value, it shows respect for other reasonable participants in public action. Nonetheless, compromise clearly has its morally dangerous side as indicated by our use of “compromised” to characterise someone whose principles have been sullied to an extent that makes them untrustworthy. Since a compromise is a sort of bargain where parties sacrifice some good objectives in order to gain others, it raises a question about how far such deals can go, and this brings us into dirty hands territory. Another situation, related to our earlier discussion of Hobbes, is that of moral isolation. As noted there, the fact that general adherence to morality has to a considerable degree broken down, might not give as great a dispensation from moral constraints as Hobbes supposes, but at least it poses starkly the rationale for compliance. A third situation that seems relevant here and needs further exploration is that of extrication. Politicians, and others, often find themselves in situations where they have inherited, or are otherwise constrained by, the decisions and policies of others (or even their previous selves) that they now judge unwise or even gravely immoral. So, for example, they may seek to end an unjust war to which their predecessors have committed the nation, but immediate cessation and withdrawal may not be desirable from several perspectives, including a moral point of view. They may very well think that the best extrication strategy requires a temporary continuation of the war, unjust as it is, with a view to a withdrawal that better secures the rights of innocent people and makes the withdrawal politically possible. Obviously, what such situations might allow in terms of continued immorality needs to be spelled out in more detail than space allows here, but equally, it seems clear that there is a potential for dirty hands discussion that moves fruitfully beyond the often-vague generalities of “emergency” or “extremity”.

Some recent discussions that are relevant to dirty hands problems are concerned with what Cécile Fabre has called “second best” moral justifications. In her book on the ethics of spying she argues that although spying activities can involve acts generally considered as morally wrong, such as blackmail, unwanted covert surveillance, and even treachery or treason, a resort to acts such as these can be morally justified in some contexts of gathering intelligence in a just cause. She qualifies this, however, in various ways including disqualifying such resorts when the cause for which the spying is undertaken is unjust. So, when discussing espionage activities by a nation and its agents to discover important secrets of another nation that they have unjust designs upon, such as waging an immoral war, she firmly denies such a nation the right to use those activities. If, for example, a nation A is planning an unjust war against nation B it would be morally unjustified in spying on a suspected cyber facility of B’s with a view to destroying it, even if the facility is likely to be used against A (either as a pre-emption or in a later retaliation). Yet even here, A may be “second best” morally justified, indeed even have a moral duty, in undertaking such spying where it might lead to discovering that the facility is a civilian one and morally should not be targeted. That A’s spying reveals the facility to be civilian and thus A refrains from attacking it is a sort of moral plus in its overall dark moral position in the matter. Fabre insists, therefore, that this second best moral justification allows A to proceed but leaves a “moral taint” on A’s action since it shouldn’t be undertaking spying on Green at all in pursuit of an unjust intervention. This moral taint is a clear echo of the dirty hands story.

Another discussion with such an echo occurs in Tadros 2020, which endorses participating in a war that you know to be unjust in order to ensure that the war is fought with greater restraint (p. 55). Tadros makes no mention of “moral taint” and may see the choice as morally straightforward if unusual. It seems possible, however, to see it as involving dirty hands and the “moral taint” of participating in an unjust war, even for achieving some amelioration of the injustice. Either way, a difficulty with the position is that it’s hard to see how an individual enlisting in such a war could seriously imagine that they could have such an effect in a way that is remotely proportional to the extensive moral violations their involvement requires them to commit or condone, especially given the highly authoritarian structures of armed forces. Those structures mean that the individual would be under regular extreme pressure to kill enemy soldiers he has no moral right to harm, as well as the highly likely possibility of similar pressure to kill enemy civilians either directly or indirectly. Of course, the story might be different if the individual were conscripted to fight in an unjust war and made the second best of it by doing what they could to minimise the harms they, and others, did. This could also come under the heading of extrication morality if they also aimed to extricate themselves by, for instance, seeking opportunities to desert.

The discussion of extrication raises another point about dirty hands that is seldom addressed. Dirty Hands scenarios are often constructed very specifically as giving the agent narrow choices restricted by external circumstances over which she has no present control. The specific scenario is often then generalised as though those external circumstances, or ones very like them, are immutable for an agent with that sort of background (e.g., a politician). This is, however,, too static and inflexible a view of moral contexts, roles and agent capacities. In the extrication story discussed earlier, the politician’s “necessary immorality” is forced upon her by the circumstances she has created or inherited, but the point of invoking extrication morality within the dirty hands problematic is to insist on possibilities of temporary involvement in evil and the need to change the circumstances that require such involvement. The ruler bent on extrication must persist in waging an unjust war only because at that time there is no other way that she can end the war by changing the context. But this restriction should be seen here and in other dirty hands situations as creating a moral imperative for the agent or others to change the background against which the moral crisis has arisen so that similar situations are unlikely to recur. In the unjust war example, the politician might use eventual success in ending the war to change colonial or neo-colonial policies that fed the resort to war, to remove over-belligerent personnel from the defence establishment, rethink alliances that played a part in promoting the unjust war, and so on. Courage, imagination and luck may be needed to realise the relevant possibilities, but without making efforts at relevant changes, the agent’s appeal to necessity when invoking the dirty hands plea should ring hollow.

6. The Dirty Hands of Citizens

Most of the discussion of dirty hands concentrates upon the situation of the individual political leader who must dirty his or her hands, but another interesting question concerns the dirt on the hands of citizens themselves when their leaders act thus on their behalf. This is particularly acute for democratic citizens to whom representative theory applies more plausibly than to citizens of an autocracy. In Walzer’s original discussion, he insists that part of the tension, even agony, of the dirty hands problem arises from the fact that we, the governed, want our leaders to be virtuous, but also want them to have the sort of character that can act against deep moral principle when the supreme emergency arises. Of the politician who dirties his hands in a good cause but realises he is acting immorally, Walzer writes: “Because he has scruples of this sort we know him to be a good man. But we…hope that he will overcome his scruples…We know he is doing right when he makes the deal because he knows he is doing wrong” (Walzer 1973, 166; 1974, 68). But if so, our endorsement would seem to have some implication for our own hands. This is not an implication that Walzer fully explores, though he does say in the last sentence of his original article when discussing the need to penalise dirty hands that we can’t punish the dirty hands of the principal agents “without getting our own hands dirty, and then we must find some way of paying the price ourselves” (Walzer 1973, 180; 1974, 82).

Various other writers have however explored the implication, either directly or as part of the discussion of the supposed need to “punish” dirty hands (for this topic see below). Most recently David Archard complains that “…there has been little discussion of the putative complicity, and thus also dirtying of hands, of a democratic public that authorizes politicians to act in its name” (Archard 2013, 777). Here he echoes an earlier position taken by Martin Hollis and also similar claims made by Dennis Thompson. As Hollis puts it: “Political actors, duly appointed within a legitimate state, have an authority deriving finally from the People. Currently that means from you and me.… When their hands get dirty, so do ours” (Hollis 1996, 146–7). Like Walzer they assume that somehow the ruled require the rulers to dirty their hands, and this opens the way to distribute some degree of responsibility or “dirt” to them.

Taking Walzer’s claim first, it is not at all obvious that “we” want or hope that our leaders will violate deep moral prohibitions where they judge it necessary to achieve important political ends or avoid very bad outcomes, even if they remain conscious of their wrongdoing. No doubt some of us do and some of us don’t, but the issue is not really one of counting the preponderance of desire in the community; it is rather whether there is something inherent in the relation of the democratic citizenry to its leadership that authorizes the leaders to dirty their hands in the relevant way. Archard explicitly argues for such an authorization, claiming that it is this authorization that gives the citizens a share in the taint of dirty hands. Hollis, Dennis Thompson, Neil Levy and Janna Thompson rely upon some similar link.

But what exactly is this the nature of this authorization? It must be more than simply giving certain people the authority to govern on our behalf since that seems compatible with implicit or explicit restrictions upon what they can or cannot do. Clearly, Archard needs some strengthening of what the authorization allows; he tries to achieve this by using the idea of a division of labor. Specifically, he argues that there is a both a political and a moral division of labor (Archard 2013, 782). The political is relatively uncontroversial: it is the thesis that efficiency is best served by the legitimate, multiple tasks required in a community being divided and the task of governing is one of them. This makes no further normative claims about restrictions or entitlements related to the exercise of those tasks, and is compatible with most forms of government. The moral division asserts that the different roles in society carry with them different moral prerogatives and duties appropriate to the different roles. But whatever the merits of such role morality, it is not clear that it permits rulers to do anything at all that they believe will fulfill the purposes of their role. Combining the idea of role with that of authorization cannot show that the authorized role player is entitled to use whatever means he or she judges the only effective way of achieving the role’s purposes. If it did, then authorizing a debt collector would seem to imply that the agent may torture the debtor if that is the only way to collect a significant debt.

It might be conceded that this is ludicrous in the debt-collecting example, but that the political role is different because of the very high stakes, not only for the politicians, but for the democratic citizens. Yet we have already seen that it is hard to contain the dirty hands story within the realm of the political, and very few political decisions are momentous enough to give politics a status sufficiently privileged to exempt its practitioners, through that role, from those deep moral constraints that restrict the debt-collector or other agents in non-political life. Indeed, consciousness of these facts helps explain why Walzer has progressively tightened the conditions in which dirty hands apply. So the question about authorization must focus on whether “we” can plausibly be said to have authorized violations of deep moral principle in supreme emergency situations. Dennis Thompson insists we do when he says that the dirty hands politician acts “not only for us, but with our consent—not only in our name but on our principles” (Thompson 1987, 18).

This confident answer to the question is not however supported by argument or even survey, and seems to assume unanimity amongst the “we” of a pluralistic, democratic community that is unlikely to obtain. Dennis Thompson relies upon the legitimacy of the democratic process and citizens’ assent to its outcomes, but, aside from any general problems with consent theory, the ruler’s dirty hands acts are often enough illegal or unconstitutional, as in the case of torture, or in violation of declared policies that got the ruler elected. Moreover, what we want of our political leaders will presumably depend upon who “we” are and what moral and political principles “we” hold. Suppose a dirty hands decision has been made by the leaders to torture an innocent child in order to extract information from the child’s radical parent about a “ticking bomb” (and suppose that this is a genuine dirty hands decision and not one flawed by lack of knowledge or ignoring of preferable alternatives) then it is plausible to hold that those citizens who think that the moral politician should violate his (and their) deep moral objections to torture in such circumstances must share in the guilt or shame that should attach to the politician. But there will surely be many citizens who either think that the moral violation should not have occurred, even in these circumstances, or who think that the prohibition is not as deep as commonly supposed and hence that the politician’s decision is right but not immoral. It is implausible to hold that both these groups are implicated in dirty hands in the way Archard and others suggest that all democratic citizens, merely by being citizens, are.

Moreover there is a further question underlying the question of consent or authorization or expectation, namely that concerning what we ought to want, expect or authorize and what principles we ought to have. This is the question whether politicians ought to get their hands dirty, in any sense of “ought” that carries ultimate weight. If the politicians are right (in certain, presumably extreme, circumstances) to dirty their hands and they are right to do it on our behalf, then at least those of us who agree that it is right are involved in what they do and have some responsibility for it. Indeed, we are more than tainted, we are complicit.

Emphasizing the shared guilt of citizens has implications for a further issue, concerned with how the dirty hands perpetrator should be treated after the event. Walzer argues that the politician’s genuine guilt means that she should suffer a penalty or a shaming for having done what “we” want her to do (Walzer 1973, 177–8; 1974 79–80). Others have taken a similar line though the position has been criticized by, for example, Tamar Meisels and Neil Levy (Meisels 2008a, 227 and Levy 2007 throughout). There are serious problems about moral responsibility in claiming that a dirty hands agent who does what is morally wrong because he must should be punished or publicly disgraced. After all, if the freedom to act is a precondition of moral responsibility and therefore blame, then the dirty hand agent who does what is (all-things-considered) necessary and somehow right seems immune to the criticism involved in blame. (For further elaboration of this and related objections see Levy 2007; also Meisels 2008a, 226–27.) The point here, however, is that, even if it is proper to blame and shame for dirty hands, then, on the supposition that all citizens share in the taint, selecting only one to shame seems distinctly unjust, indeed massively hypocritical. While the rest of us rejoice and celebrate the happy consequences of our agent’s necessary misdeed, she is shunned or worse. As already noticed, Walzer does think that punishing the dirty hands conduct of the principal agents makes our own hands dirty (though he doesn’t seem to think that our original authorization of the conduct does this). He doesn’t elaborate the point, but it opens up intriguing prospects since presumably we dirty “our” hands in punishing these agents precisely because, in some sense, they are “innocent” or at least do not deserve punishment because they have acted “rightly”. This opens up bizarre possibilities of regress since “we” now should have to pay a further price for inflicting a price on ourselves when we have done the right (but immoral) thing in punishing ourselves, and so on and on. It seems the spreading of responsibility for dirty hands to the governed community merely adds to worries about the coherence of the concept.

Claims of shared guilt or taint raise further questions about the responsibility that democratic citizens as well as their leadership have for remedying the evil done to the victims of the dirty hands decision. Stephen de Wijze (de Wijze, 2018) argues that not only must the leadership try to justify their decision to their constituents, but they and all their democratic citizens are liable to make restitution to victims for the “necessary” harm done by the dirty hands decision. Admittedly, he thinks that that although the citizens are complicit their “moral pollution” is generally less than the leadership. Even so, they are obliged to make amends to the victims of the decision. All citizens, he argues, even those dissenting from the decision, must “share in the moral burden, and contribute to the appropriate restitution” (de Wijze, 2018, 144). So they must pay “some penalty” perhaps in the form to increased taxation to effect reparations.

The claim that all democratic citizens are so obliged needs some unpacking since there is clearly a difference in liability for those who enthusiastically supported or were indifferent to the dirty hands tactic and those who opposed it. There is some plausibility in the claim that even strongly dissenting democratic citizens incur some restorative and other moral obligations as a result of their leaders’ dirty hands behaviour, but support for this claim need not resort to dubious extensions of the idea of collective guilt or moral taint. Membership in a democratic political community (or even in some non-democratic ones) creates a set of relationships that involve forms of identification such that a degree of pride can be taken in good decisions by the leadership and by fellow citizens and a degree of shame or alienation at bad ones. None of this means that the dissenting citizen is in any way morally responsible for those decisions, but what it may mean is that the dissenting citizen has some special moral responsibility to criticise those decisions, including the dirty hands ones that she rejects, and to do what is possible, in spite of her lack of pollution or guilt, to repair the bad effects. Responsibility for bad acts should be distinguished from responsibility to remedy or compensate for them, though it is a complex matter how to sketch the lineaments of this distinction.

7. The Issue of Absolutism

Both dirty hands and moral dilemmas challenge the idea that some moral prohibitions or negative duties are “absolute” though they do so in different ways. If we deny that there are moral rules or prohibitions that stand whatever the context, then it will not be surprising that deep moral prohibitions may be legitimately overridden in some circumstances. Indeed, many contemporary moral theories, other than utilitarianism, insist that such overruling remains a permanent possibility. The intuitionism of W.D. Ross and his followers, for instance, insists that all duties and obligations are prima facie. It is always possible that the prima facie duty not to kill the innocent will clash with some other prima facie duty, such as the duty to promote wellbeing or the ruler’s duty to preserve the state or protect the community, and then one’s actual duty will be the outcome of weighing the respective force of the clashing prima facie duties. One might thus see the dirty hands story as merely a version of this outlook, a version that insists that only a very great weighting on the other side of the balance can tip the scales against some very significant prima facie obligations. Using terminology of Thomas Nagel’s, dirty hands would instantiate “threshold deontology” with a very high threshold for certain action types. To make this assimilation would be to take much of the sting out of the dirty hands story, both because dirty hands would be part of a more commonplace moral perspective rather than a quite special ethic for emergencies, and because there seems to be no room in threshold deontology, or what has been called “balanced exceptionism” (Coady 2004, 778–9; Coady 2008, 285–7, 299). for the idea that one has done wrong in doing what is nonetheless right. There may be a sense of regret that one cannot avoid doing something that was prima facie wrong—it would be more comfortable if one’s prima facie duties did not conflict and therefore need resolution—but no wrong can be attributed to you if you have done the balancing conscientiously.[6] The balanced exceptionist can of course acknowledge that some prima facie duties are stronger than others, and hence some presumptive wrongs carry more heft than others. Indeed, the balancing story commits its supporters to this acknowledgement since there would be no point to the talk of balancing as a procedure for decision unless there were such differences of weight. But the fact remains that the granting of exemption from the prohibition on intentionally killing the innocent is part of a normal, even routine, business of balancing presumptive obligations in order to find what is finally obligatory or prohibited. If the scales tell you that it is morally permitted or even morally obligatory intentionally to kill the innocent, then in these circumstances it cannot be wrong to do so.[7]

In fact, there is an interesting comparison here with utilitarianism. As we have seen, it is common to contrast balanced exceptionism or threshold deontology with utilitarianism and to establish dirty hands as a form of deontology (or intrinsicalism) that yields to the utilitarianism of extremity. But there may be room for a utilitarian version of the threshold story, even possibly the dirty hands story. Surely a sophisticated version of utilitarianism, such as rule or indirect utilitarianism, can have room for the idea that duties, virtues etc. cannot be overridden by ordinary calculations of utility since to allow this would be to risk too much overall disutility. It is only in situations of dire or “supreme” emergency that the disutility of abiding by the prohibitions or rules would be great enough to override the utilitarian value of keeping to the rule.[8] So, depending upon the empirical facts and calculations, a utilitarian can admit a role for thresholds, supreme emergencies, and even dirty hands. But while this might give us a utilitarian version of threshold deontology, it will not do as a version of dirty hands, since the utilitarian overriding at the supreme emergency stage will involve a decision that is simply right, and not in any sense right but still wrong. The only sense in which it remains wrong is that weak sense, akin to that attributed to Ross in endnote 35, in which it would have been wrong but for the supreme emergency. For the utilitarian, (as indeed for Ross) there is no real moral remainder, though there may be some room for psychological discomfort.

The moral remainder and the remorse it generates signals the tribute that dirty hands pays to moral absolutism. While actually rejecting moral absolutes, the dirty hands theorist remains entranced by the significance they give to certain moral constraints. But how do we decide whether moral absolutism should be rejected? It is difficult in the nature of the case to see what could resolve a dispute between absolutists and non-absolutists. Absolutists do not typically regard all moral prohibitions as absolute; they restrict their claim to a few such prohibitions, such as those against intentional killing of the innocent, rape and (for some theorists) torture. Their opponents claim that, even for these cases, emergency scenarios can be imagined in which “our” intuitions accept the legitimacy of such acts. Where absolutists don’t reject the scenarios as merely fantastic (as some certainly are), they simply have different intuitions about the force of the examples. Moreover, they can point out that most moral theorists, including their opponents, are absolutists about some moral issues. Utilitarians allow no exceptions “whatever the circumstances” to their basic rule of maximising satisfactory outcomes, Rawlsian contractualism gives an absolute priority to certain principles of liberty, and similar points apply to other theories normally opposed to absolutism. It might be replied that the level at which absolutism applies is different, and this is true since the absolutist endorses specific moral prohibitions such as that on murder or torture whereas the other theories are usually absolute at a more abstract level. Yet it is unclear why this is an important difference, or why, if it is, it should count against the absolutist. After all, it is surely plausible that our conviction that murder or torture is always wrong has more authority than any conviction that we should always maximise the greatest happiness of the greatest number or always maximise preference satisfaction. Moreover, some specific moral prohibitions seem proof against even fantastic counter-examples, e.g., the principle that it is wrong to torture an innocent child for fun. But, even here, it may be hazardous to underestimate the ingenuity of philosophers in constructing bizarre counter-examples. Clearly, more remains to be said about the nature of a defensible (or objectionable) absolutism, but our discussion at least serves to indicate the significance of absolute prohibitions for the framing of dirty hands scenarios.

A further interesting issue about absolutism is its common association with some versions of religious ethics, especially the Judeo-Christian. Certainly, there seems to be a strong element of it in traditional Catholic moral theology, and Elizabeth Anscombe, who was a committed Catholic of a theologically conservative cast of mind, wrote an influential article (1958) which was, inter alia, an early contemporary defence of absolutism against the balanced exceptionism of much (she thought all) of the then current moral philosophy. Anscombe tied the notion of moral obligation in the use of “ought” and “ought not” to the concept of Divine Law the increased unfashionability of appeal to the commands of which in connection with obligation having palpably diminished outside religious circles (Anscombe 1958). Even within those circles, however, there are problems with a Divine Command ethic as an endorsement of absolutism. One can be illustrated through the Biblical story of Abraham’s response to God’s command that he should kill and sacrifice to God his son Isaac. In the Akedah, as the tale is often named, Abraham complies until a messenger from God stays his hand at the last moment. Since the intentional killing of an innocent child is a prime example of the absolutely forbidden for Anscombe and others there is an obvious incompatibility between a divine command ethic in general and this particular command from God that Abraham is so ready to obey. Exegetes have had various explanations of Abraham’s situation and this is not the place to explore them, other than to point to the primary difficulty of God’s commanding Abraham to to form and begin to put into action the intention to murder his child.

It is noteworthy that at least one Catholic scholar Evan Sandsmark has argued forcefully that the rejection of dirty hands, implicit and explicit the Catholic theological absolutist moral tradition is mistaken, and moreover acceptance of the dirty hands category is consistent with absolutism, and even requires it, thereby reinforcing the relevance of my earlier point about the tribute that dirty hands pays to absolutism. His argument is that the moral taint that is essential to the dirty hands act of necessity is best explained by its involving a guilty violation of an absolute prohibition. Since the prohibition remains absolute though the violator has by hypothesis done the right thing then the agent must be remorseful and seek penance and appropriate recompense for the offence. Sandsmark’s ingenious argument strains the sense of the term “absolute” since some sort of “necessity” makes the prohibition no longer absolutely binding, bringing it nearer to Igor Primoratz’s “almost absolute” category in connection with the prohibition of terrorist acts of intentionally killing the innocent (Primoratz, 2013, 110–113). It also seems to inherit the problem discussed earlier in this entry about separating the overwhelming dirty hands necessity from morality only at the possible cost of achieving coherence at the cost of falsity.

Walzer’s attitude to absolutism is (as it has to be) one of respectful rejection. He says: “I don’t believe that terrorism can ever be justified. But I also don’t want to defend an absolute ban. ‘Do justice though the heavens fall’ has never seemed to me a plausible moral position” (Walzer 2006, 7). Elsewhere, he says, after claiming that absolutism is “very old, perhaps older than anything else in our moral understanding”, that at the point of disaster or supreme emergency “absolutism represents, it seems to me, a refusal to think about what it means for the heavens to fall” (Walzer 2004a). Such a refusal can indeed be represented as obtuse, but when we come to cash out contemporary thinking about falling heavens we might think about the issue of torture, an issue that was one of Walzer’s earliest examples generating dirty hands. The easy acceptance since September 11, 2001, amongst some intellectuals of the recourse to torture in situations of emergency, frequently it would seem far short of “supreme”, has raised questions of the relevance of absolutism even on the part of those who had previously endorsed dirty hands or exceptionism of some sort. So, Henry Shue, for instance, always a strong opponent of torture, had nonetheless allowed in his original treatment of the issue that torture might be morally permissible in certain “extreme” circumstances (Shue 1977–78). But in a later, Shue criticises his own admission and the widespread intellectual acceptance of torture in extremis as a resort to “dreamland” (Shue 2006). By this he means that the philosophers’ stories about “ticking bomb” scenarios are basically fantasies that distract from the reality of moral assessment in the real world. Shue’s opposition is now, as a matter of practice, resolute and absolute. Others have also expressed a commitment to a sort of absolutism in connection with torture. Bob Brecher, for example, provides a criticism of the ticking bomb scenario (which is basically the scenario Walzer uses in his original paper on dirty hands) and from a purely consequentialist perspective endorses the need for an absolute condemnation of torture (Brecker 2007). As mentioned earlier, Igor Primoratz somewhat similarly recognises the pull of absolutism about some moral imperatives and argues for “almost absolute.” So the debate about torture largely engendered by the “war on terror” has revived interest in the credentials of moral absolutism, although much about the nature and types of absolutism remain in need of clarification. In any event, there is clearly reason to approach the topic of dirty hands with a degree of suspicion regarding Lady Carbury’s enthusiasm for “beneficent audacity” and her contempt for measuring exceptional people by the “ordinary rule” appropriate to the rest of us.


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