Political Realism in International Relations

First published Mon Jul 26, 2010; substantive revision Mon Oct 9, 2023

In the discipline of international relations there are contending general theories or theoretical perspectives. Realism, also known as political realism, is a view of international politics that stresses its competitive and conflictual side. It is usually contrasted with idealism or liberalism, which tends to emphasize cooperation. Realists consider the principal actors in the international arena to be states, which are concerned with their own security, act in pursuit of their own national interests, and struggle for power. The negative side of the realists’ emphasis on power and self-interest is often their skepticism regarding the relevance of ethical norms to relations among states. National politics is the realm of authority and law, whereas international politics, they sometimes claim, is a sphere without justice, characterized by active or potential conflict among states, where ethical standards do not apply.

Not all realists, however, deny the presence of prescriptive ethics in international relations. The distinction should be drawn between classical realism—represented by such twentieth-century theorists as Reinhold Niebuhr and Hans Morgenthau—and radical or extreme realism. While classical realism emphasizes the concept of national interest, it is not the Machiavellian doctrine “that anything is justified by reason of state” (Bull 1995, 189). Nor does it involve the glorification of war or conflict. The classical realists do not reject the possibility of moral judgment in international politics. Rather, they are critical of moralism—abstract moral discourse that does not take into account political realities. They assign ethical value to successful political action based on prudence: the ability to judge the rightness of a given action from among possible alternatives on the basis of its likely political consequences.

Realism encompasses a variety of approaches and claims a long theoretical tradition. Among its founding fathers, Thucydides, Machiavelli and Hobbes are the names most usually mentioned. Twentieth-century classical realism has today been largely replaced by neorealism, which is an attempt to construct a more scientific approach to the study of international relations. Both classical realism and neorealism have been subjected to criticism from IR theorists representing liberal, critical, and post-modern perspectives. The growing tensions among superpowers have revived the realist-idealist debate in the twenty-first century and have led to a resurgence of interest in the realist tradition.

1. The Roots of the Realist Tradition

1.1 Thucydides and the Importance of Power

Like other classical political theorists, Thucydides (c. 460–c. 400 B.C.E.) saw politics as involving moral questions. Most importantly, he asks whether relations among states to which power is crucial can also be guided by the norms of justice. His History of the Peloponnesian War is in fact neither a work of political philosophy nor a sustained theory of international relations. Much of this work, which presents a partial account of the armed conflict between Athens and Sparta that took place from 431 to 404 B.C.E., consists of paired speeches by personages who argue opposing sides of an issue. Nevertheless, if the History is described as the only acknowledged classical text in international relations, and if it inspires theorists from Hobbes to contemporary international relations scholars, this is because it is more than a chronicle of events, and a theoretical position can be extrapolated from it. Realism is expressed in the very first speech of the Athenians recorded in the History—a speech given at the debate that took place in Sparta just before the war. Moreover, a realist perspective is implied in the way Thucydides explains the cause of the Peloponnesian War, and also in the famous “Melian Dialogue,” in the statements made by the Athenian envoys.

1.1.1 General Features of Realism in International Relations

International relations realists emphasize the constraints imposed on politics by the nature of human beings, whom they consider egoistic, and by the absence of international government. Together these factors contribute to a conflict-based paradigm of international relations, in which the key actors are states, in which power and security become the main issues, and in which there is little place for ethical norms. The set of premises concerning state actors, egoism, anarchy, power, security, and ethics that define the realist tradition are all present in Thucydides.

(1) Human nature is a starting point for classical political realism. Realists view human beings as inherently egoistic and self-interested to the extent that self-interest overcomes moral principles. At the debate in Sparta, described in Book I of Thucydides’ History, the Athenians affirm the priority of self-interest over morality. They say that considerations of right and wrong have “never turned people aside from the opportunities of aggrandizement offered by superior strength” (chap. 1 par. 76).

(2) Realists, and especially today’s neorealists, consider the absence of government, literally anarchy, to be the primary determinant of international political outcomes. The lack of a common rule-making and enforcing authority means, they argue, that the international arena is essentially a self-help system. Each state is responsible for its own survival and is free to define its own interests and to pursue power. Anarchy thus leads to a situation in which power has the overriding role in shaping interstate relations. In the words of the Athenian envoys at Melos, without any common authority that can enforce order, “the independent states survive [only] when they are powerful” (5.97).

(3) Insofar as realists envision the world of states as anarchic, they likewise view security as a central issue. To attain security, states try to increase their power and engage in power-balancing for the purpose of deterring potential aggressors. Wars are fought to prevent competing nations from becoming militarily stronger. Thucydides, while distinguishing between the immediate and underlying causes of the Peloponnesian War, does not see its real cause in any of the particular events that immediately preceded its outbreak. He instead locates the cause of the war in the changing distribution of power between the two blocs of Greek city-states: the Delian League, under the leadership of Athens, and the Peloponnesian League, under the leadership of Sparta. According to him, the growth of Athenian power made the Spartans afraid for their security, and thus propelled them into war (1.23). Referring to this situation, Graham Allison has popularized the expression “Thucydides trap” to describe the danger which occurs when a rising power rivals an established one (2017).

(4) Realists are generally skeptical about the relevance of ethics to international politics. This can lead them to claim that there is no place for morality in the prescriptive sense in international relations, or that there is a tension between demands of morality and requirements of successful political action, or that states have their own morality that is different from customary morality, or that morality, if employed at all, is merely used instrumentally to justify states’ conduct. A clear case of the rejection of ethical norms in relations among states can be found in the “Melian Dialogue” (5.85–113). This dialogue relates to the events of 416 B.C.E., when Athens invaded the island of Melos. The Athenian envoys presented the Melians with a choice, destruction or surrender, and from the outset asked them not to appeal to justice, but to think only about their survival. In the envoys’ words, “We both know that the decisions about justice are made in human discussions only when both sides are under equal compulsion, but when one side is stronger, it gets as much as it can, and the weak must accept that” (5.89). To be “under equal compulsion” means to be under the force of law, and thus to be subjected to a common lawgiving authority (Korab-Karpowicz 2006, 234). Since such an authority above states does not exist, the Athenians argue that in this lawless condition of international anarchy, the only right is the right of the stronger to dominate the weaker. They explicitly equate right with might, and exclude considerations of justice from foreign affairs.

1.1.2 The “Melian Dialogue”—The First Realist-Idealist Debate

We can thus find strong support for a realist perspective in the statements of the Athenians. The question remains, however, to what extent their realism coincides with Thucydides’ own viewpoint. Although substantial passages of the “Melian Dialogue,” as well as other parts of the History support a realistic reading, Thucydides’ position cannot be deduced from such selected fragments, but rather must be assessed on the basis of the wider context of his book. In fact, even the “Melian Dialogue” itself provides us with a number of contending views.

Political realism is usually contrasted by IR scholars with idealism or liberalism, a theoretical perspective that emphasizes international norms, interdependence among states, and international cooperation. The “Melian Dialogue,” which is one of the most frequently commented-upon parts of Thucydides’ History, presents the classic debate between the idealist and realist views: Can international politics be based on a moral order derived from the principles of justice, or will it forever remain the arena of conflicting national interests and power?

For the Melians, who employ idealistic arguments, the choice is between war and subjection (5.86). They are courageous and love their country. They do not wish to lose their freedom, and in spite of the fact that they are militarily weaker than the Athenians, they are prepared to defend themselves (5.100; 5.112). They base their arguments on an appeal to justice, which they associate with fairness, and regard the Athenians as unjust (5.90; 5.104). They are pious, believing that gods will support their just cause and compensate for their weakness, and trust in alliances, thinking that their allies, the Spartans, who are also related to them, will help them (5.104; 5.112). Hence, one can identify in the speech of the Melians elements of the idealistic or liberal world view: the belief that nations have the right to exercise political independence, that they have mutual obligations to one another and will carry out such obligations, and that a war of aggression is unjust. What the Melians nevertheless lack are resources and foresight. In their decision to defend themselves, they are guided more by their hopes than by the evidence at hand or by prudent calculations.

The Athenian argument is based on key realist concepts such as security and power, and is informed not by what the world should be, but by what it is. The Athenians disregard any moral talk and urge the Melians to look at the facts—that is, to recognize their military inferiority, to consider the potential consequences of their decision, and to think about their own survival (5.87; 5.101). There appears to be a powerful realist logic behind the Athenian arguments. Their position, based on security concerns and self-interest, seemingly involves reliance on rationality, intelligence, and foresight. However, upon close examination, their logic proves to be seriously flawed. Melos, a relatively weak state, does not pose any real security threat to them. The eventual destruction of Melos does not change the course of the Peloponnesian War, which Athens will lose a few years later.

In the History, Thucydides shows that power, if it is unrestrained by moderation and a sense of justice, brings about the uncontrolled desire for more power. There are no logical limits to the size of an empire. Drunk with the prospect of glory and gain, after conquering Melos, the Athenians engage in a war against Sicily. They pay no attention to the Melian argument that considerations of justice are useful to all in the longer run (5.90). And, as the Athenians overestimate their strength and in the end lose the war, their self-interested logic proves to be very shortsighted indeed.

It is utopian to ignore the reality of power in international relations, but it is equally blind to rely on power alone. Thucydides appears to support neither the naive idealism of the Melians nor the cynicism of their Athenian opponents. He teaches us to be on guard “against naïve-dreaming on international politics,” on the one hand, and “against the other pernicious extreme: unrestrained cynicism,” on the other (Donnelly 2000, 193). If he can be regarded as a political realist, his realism nonetheless prefigures neither realpolitik, in which prescriptive ethics is rejected, nor today’s scientific neorealism, in which moral questions are largely ignored. Thucydides’ realism, neither immoral nor amoral, can rather be compared to that of Hans Morgenthau, Raymond Aron, and other twentieth-century classical realists, who, although sensible to the demands of national interest, would not deny that political actors on the international scene are subject to moral judgment.

1.2 Machiavelli’s Critique of the Moral Tradition

Idealism in international relations, like realism, can lay claim to a long tradition. Unsatisfied with the world as they have found it, idealists have always tried to answer the question of “what ought to be” in politics. Plato, Aristotle, and Cicero were all political idealists who believed that there were some universal moral values on which political life could be based. Building on the work of his predecessors, Cicero developed the idea of a natural moral law that was applicable to both domestic and international politics. His ideas concerning righteousness in war were carried further in the writings of the Christian thinkers St. Augustine and St. Thomas Aquinas. In the late fifteenth century, when Niccolò Machiavelli was born, the idea that politics, including the relations among states, should be virtuous, and that the methods of warfare should remain subordinated to ethical standards, still predominated in political literature.

Machiavelli (1469–1527) challenged this well-established moral tradition, thus positioning himself as a political innovator. The novelty of his approach lies in his critique of classical Western political thought as unrealistic, aiming too high, and in his separation of politics from ethics. He thereby lays the foundations for modern politics focussed on self-interest. In chapter XV of The Prince, Machiavelli announces that in departing from the teachings of earlier thinkers, he seeks “the effectual truth of the matter rather than the imagined one.” The “effectual truth” is for him the only truth worth seeking. It represents the sum of the practical conditions that he believes are required to make both the individual and the country prosperous and strong. Machiavelli replaces the ancient virtue (a moral quality of the individual, such as justice or self-restraint) with virtù, ability or vigor. As a prophet of virtù, he promises to lead both nations and individuals to earthly glory and power.

Machiavellianism is a radical type of political realism that is applied to both domestic and international affairs. It is sometimes called realpolitik, and is a doctrine which denies the relevance of ethics in politics, and claims that all means (moral and immoral) are justified to achieve certain political ends. Although Machiavelli never uses the phrase ragione di stato or its French equivalent, raison d’état, what ultimately counts for him is precisely that: whatever is good for the state, rather than ethical scruples or norms

Machiavelli justified immoral actions in politics, but never refused to admit that they are evil. He operated within the single framework of traditional morality. It became a specific task of his nineteenth-century followers to develop the doctrine of a double ethics: one public and one private, to push Machiavellian realism to even further extremes, and to apply it to international relations. By asserting that “the state has no higher duty than of maintaining itself,” Hegel gave an ethical sanction to the state’s promotion of its own interest and advantage against other states (Meinecke 357). Thus he overturned the traditional beliefs about morality. The good of the state was perversely interpreted by him as the highest moral value, with the extension of national power regarded as a nation’s right and duty. Then, referring to Machiavelli, Heinrich von Treitschke declared that the state was power, precisely in order to assert itself as against other equally independent powers, and that the supreme moral duty of the state was to foster this power. He considered international agreements to be binding only insofar as it was expedient for the state. The idea of an autonomous ethics of state behavior and the concept of realpolitik were thus introduced. Traditional, customary ethics was denied and power politics was associated with a “higher” type of morality. These concepts, along with the belief in the superiority of Germanic culture, served as weapons with which German statesmen, from the eighteenth century to the end of the Second World War, justified their policies of conquest and extermination.

Machiavelli is often praised for his prudential advice to leaders (which has caused him to be regarded as a founding master of modern political strategy) and for his defense of the republican form of government. There are certainly many aspects of his thought that merit such praise. Nevertheless, it is also possible to see him as the thinker who bears foremost responsibility for the de-moralization of Europe. The argument of the Athenian envoys presented in Thucydides’ “Melian Dialogue,” that of Thrasymachus in Plato’s Republic, or that of Carneades, to whom Cicero refers—all of these challenge the ancient and Christian views of the unity of politics and ethics. However, before Machiavelli, this amoral or immoral mode of thinking had never prevailed in the mainstream of Western political thought. It was the force and timeliness of his justification of resorting to evil as a legitimate means of achieving political ends that persuaded so many of the thinkers and political practitioners who followed him. The effects of Machiavellian ideas, such as the notion that the employment of all possible means was permissible in war, would be seen on the battlefields of modern Europe, as mass citizen armies fought against each other to the bitter end without regard for the rules of justice. The tension between expediency and morality lost its validity in the sphere of politics. The concept of a double ethics that created a further damage to traditional morality, was invented. The doctrine of raison d’état ultimately led to the politics of Lebensraum, two world wars, and the Holocaust.

Perhaps the greatest problem with realism in international relations is that it has a tendency to slip into its extreme version, which accepts any policy that can benefit the state at the expense of other states, no matter how morally problematic the policy is. Even if they do not explicitly raise ethical questions, in the works of Waltz and of many other of today’s neorealists, a double ethics, public and private, is presupposed, and words such realpolitik no longer have the negative connotations that they had for classical realists, such as Hans Morgenthau.

1.3 Hobbes’s Anarchic State of Nature

Thomas Hobbes (1588–1683) was part of an intellectual movement whose goal was to free the emerging modern science from the constraints of the classical and scholastic heritage. According to classical political philosophy, on which the idealist perspective is based, human beings can control their desires through reason and can work for the benefit of others, even at the expense of their own benefit. They are thus both rational and moral agents, capable of distinguishing between right and wrong, and of making moral choices. They are also naturally social. With great skill Hobbes attacks these views. His human beings, extremely individualistic rather than moral or social, are subject to “a perpetual and restless desire of power after power, that ceases only in death” (Leviathan XI 2). They therefore inevitably struggle for power. In setting out such ideas, Hobbes contributes to some of the basic conceptions fundamental to the realist tradition in international relations, and especially to neorealism. These include the characterization of human nature as egoistic, the concept of international anarchy, and the view that politics, rooted in the struggle for power, can be rationalized and studied scientifically.

One of the most widely known Hobbesian concepts is that of the anarchic state of nature, seen as entailing a state of war—and “such a war as is of every man against every man” (XII 8). He derives his notion of the state of war from his views of both human nature and the condition in which individuals exist. Since in the state of nature there is no government and everyone enjoys equal status, every individual has a right to everything; that is, there are no constraints on an individual’s behavior. Anyone may at any time use force, and all must constantly be ready to counter such force with force. Hence, driven by acquisitiveness, having no moral restraints, and motivated to compete for scarce goods, individuals are apt to “invade” one another for gain. Being suspicious of one another and driven by fear, they are also likely to engage in preemptive actions and invade one another to ensure their own safety. Finally, individuals are also driven by pride and a desire for glory. Whether for gain, safety, or reputation, power-seeking individuals will thus “endeavor to destroy or subdue one another” (XIII 3). In such uncertain conditions where everyone is a potential aggressor, making war on others is a more advantageous strategy than peaceable behavior, and one needs to learn that domination over others is necessary for one’s own continued survival.

Hobbes is primarily concerned with the relationship between individuals and the state, and his comments about relations among states are scarce. Nevertheless, what he says about the lives of individuals in the state of nature can also be interpreted as a description of how states exist in relation to one another. Once states are established, the individual drive for power becomes the basis for the states’ behavior, which often manifests itself in their efforts to dominate other states and peoples. States, “for their own security,” writes Hobbes, “enlarge their dominions upon all pretences of danger and fear of invasion or assistance that may be given to invaders, [and] endeavour as much as they can, to subdue and weaken their neighbors” (XIX 4). Accordingly, the quest and struggle for power lies at the core of the Hobbesian vision of relations among states. The same would later be true of the model of international relations developed by Hans Morgenthau, who was deeply influenced by Hobbes and adopted the same view of human nature. Similarly, the neorealist Kenneth Waltz would follow Hobbes’ lead regarding international anarchy (the fact that sovereign states are not subject to any higher common sovereign) as the essential element of international relations.

By subjecting themselves to a sovereign, individuals escape the war of all against all which Hobbes associates with the state of nature; however, this war continues to dominate relations among states. This does not mean that states are always fighting, but rather that they have a disposition to fight (XIII 8). With each state deciding for itself whether or not to use force, war may break out at any time. The achievement of domestic security through the creation of a state is then paralleled by a condition of inter-state insecurity. One can argue that if Hobbes were fully consistent, he would agree with the notion that, to escape this condition, states should also enter into a contract and submit themselves to a world sovereign. Although the idea of a world state would find support among some of today’s realists, this is not a position taken by Hobbes himself. He does not propose that a social contract among nations be implemented to bring international anarchy to an end. This is because the condition of insecurity in which states are placed does not necessarily lead to insecurity for their citizens. As long as an armed conflict or other type of hostility between states does not actually break out, individuals within a state can feel relatively secure.

The denial of the existence of universal moral principles and norms in the relations among states brings Hobbes close to the Machiavellians and the followers of the doctrine of raison d’état. His theory of international relations, which assumes that independent states, like independent individuals, are enemies by nature, asocial and selfish, and that there is no moral limitation on their behavior, is a great challenge to the idealist political vision based on human sociability and to the concept of the international jurisprudence that is built on this vision. However, what separates Hobbes from Machiavelli and associates him more with classical realism is his insistence on the defensive character of foreign policy. His political theory does not put forward the invitation to do whatever may be advantageous for the state. His approach to international relations is prudential and pacific: sovereign states, like individuals, should be disposed towards peace which is commended by reason.

What Waltz and other neorealist readers of Hobbes’s works sometimes overlook is that he does not perceive international anarchy as an environment without any rules. By suggesting that certain dictates of reason apply even in the state of nature, he affirms that more peaceful and cooperative international relations are possible. Neither does he deny the existence of international law. Sovereign states can sign treaties with one another to provide a legal basis for their relations. At the same time, however, Hobbes seems aware that international rules will often prove ineffective in restraining the struggle for power. States will interpret them to their own advantage, and so international law will be obeyed or ignored according to the interests of the states affected. Hence, international relations will always tend to be a precarious affair. This grim view of global politics lies at the core of Hobbes’s realism.

2. Twentieth Century Classical Realism

Twentieth-century realism was born in response to the idealist perspective that dominated international relations scholarship in the aftermath of the First World War. The idealists of the 1920s and 1930s (also called liberal internationalists or utopians) had the goal of building peace in order to prevent another world conflict. They saw the solution to inter-state problems as being the creation of a respected system of international law, backed by international organizations. This interwar idealism resulted in the founding of the League of Nations in 1920 and in the Kellogg-Briand Pact of 1928 outlawing war and providing for the peaceful settlements of disputes. U.S. President Woodrow Wilson, scholars such as Norman Angell, Alfred Zimmern, and Raymond B. Fosdick, and other prominent idealists of the era, gave their intellectual support to the League of Nations. Instead of focusing on what some might see as the inevitability of conflict between states and peoples, they chose to emphasize the common interests that could unite humanity, and attempted to appeal to rationality and morality. For them, war did not originate in an egoistic human nature, but rather in imperfect social conditions and political arrangements, which could be improved. Yet their ideas were already being criticized in the early 1930s by Reinhold Niebuhr and within a few years by E. H. Carr. The League of Nations, which the United States never joined, and from which Japan and Germany withdrew, could not prevent the outbreak of the Second World War. This fact, perhaps more than any theoretical argument, contributed to the development of the realist theory. Although the United Nations, founded in 1945, can still be regarded as a product of idealist political thinking, the discipline of international relations was profoundly influenced in the initial years of the post-war period by the works of “classical” realists such as John H. Herz, Hans Morgenthau, George Kennan, and Raymond Aron. Then, during the 1950s and 1960s, classical realism came under challenge of scholars who tried to introduce a more scientific approach to the study of international politics. During the 1980s it gave way to another trend in international relations theory—neorealism.

Since it is impossible within the scope of this article to introduce all of the thinkers who contributed to the development of twentieth-century classical realism, E. H. Carr and Hans Morgenthau, as perhaps the most influential among them, have been selected for discussion here.

2.1 E. H. Carr’s Challenge to Utopian Idealism

In his main work on international relations, The Twenty Years’ Crisis, first published in July 1939, Edward Hallett Carr (1892–1982) attacks the idealist position, which he describes as “utopianism.” He characterizes this position as encompassing faith in reason, confidence in progress, a sense of moral rectitude, and a belief in an underlying harmony of interests. According to the idealists, war is an aberration in the course of normal life and the way to prevent it is to educate people for peace, and to build systems of collective security such as the League of Nations or today’s United Nations. Carr challenges idealism by questioning its claim to moral universalism and its idea of the harmony of interests. He declares that “morality can only be relative, not universal” (19), and states that the doctrine of the harmony of interests is invoked by privileged groups “to justify and maintain their dominant position” (75).

Carr uses the concept of the relativity of thought, which he traces to Marx and other modern theorists, to show that standards by which policies are judged are the products of circumstances and interests. His central idea is that the interests of a given party always determine what this party regards as moral principles, and hence, these principles are not universal. Carr observes that politicians, for example, often use the language of justice to cloak the particular interests of their own countries, or to create negative images of other people to justify acts of aggression. The existence of such instances of morally discrediting a potential enemy or morally justifying one’s own position shows, he argues, that moral ideas are derived from actual policies. Policies are not, as the idealists would have it, based on some universal norms, independent of interests of the parties involved.

If specific ethical standards are de facto founded on interests, Carr’s argument goes, there are also interests underlying what are regarded as absolute principles or universal moral values. While the idealists tend to regard such values, such as peace or justice, as universal and claim that upholding them is in the interest of all, Carr argues against this view. According to him, there are neither universal values nor universal interests. He claims that those who refer to universal interests are in fact acting in their own interests (71). They think that what is best for them is best for everyone, and identify their own interests with the universal interest of the world at large.

The idealist concept of the harmony of interests is based on the notion that human beings can rationally recognize that they have some interests in common, and that cooperation is therefore possible. Carr contrasts this idea with the reality of conflict of interests. According to him, the world is torn apart by the particular interests of different individuals and groups. In such a conflictual environment, order is based on power, not on morality. Further, morality itself is the product of power (61). Like Hobbes, Carr regards morality as constructed by the particular legal system that is enforced by a coercive power. International ethical norms are imposed on other countries by dominant nations or groups of nations that present themselves as the international community as a whole. They are invented to perpetuate those nations’ dominance.

Values that idealists view as good for all, such as peace, social justice, prosperity, and international order, are regarded by Carr as mere status quo notions. The powers that are satisfied with the status quo regard the arrangement in place as just and therefore preach peace. They try to rally everyone around their idea of what is good. “Just as the ruling class in a community prays for domestic peace, which guarantees its own security and predominance, … so international peace becomes a special vested interest of predominant powers” (76). On the other hand, the unsatisfied powers consider the same arrangement as unjust, and so prepare for war. Hence, the way to obtain peace, if it cannot be simply enforced, is to satisfy the unsatisfied powers. “Those who profit most by [international] order can in the longer run only hope to maintain it by making sufficient concessions to make it tolerable to those who profit by it least” (152). The logical conclusion to be drawn by the reader of Carr’s book is the policy of appeasement.

Carr was a sophisticated thinker. He recognized himself that the logic of “pure realism can offer nothing but a naked struggle for power which makes any kind of international society impossible” (87). Although he demolishes what he calls “the current utopia” of idealism, he at the same time attempts to build “a new utopia,” a realist world order (ibid.). Thus, he acknowledges that human beings need certain fundamental principles or beliefs that are shared across different cultures, and contradicts his own earlier argument by which he tries to deny universality to any norms or values. To make further objections to his position, the fact, as he claims, that the language of universal values can be misused in politics for the benefit of one party or another, and that such values can only be imperfectly implemented in political institutions, does not mean that such values do not exist. There is a deep yearning in many human beings, both privileged and unprivileged, for peace, order, prosperity, and justice. The legitimacy of idealism consists in the constant attempt to reflect upon and uphold these values. Idealists fail if in their attempt they do not pay enough attention to the reality of power. On the other hand, in the world of “pure realism,” in which all values are made relative to interests, life turns into nothing more than a power game and is unbearable.

The Twenty Years’ Crisis touches on a number of universal ideas, but it also reflects the spirit of its time. While we can fault the interwar idealists for their inability to construct international institutions strong enough to prevent the outbreak of the Second World War, this book indicates that interwar realists were likewise unprepared to meet the challenge. Carr frequently refers to Germany under Nazi rule as if it were a country like any other. He says that should Germany cease to be an unsatisfied power and “become supreme in Europe,” it would adopt a language of international solidarity similar to that of other Western powers (79). The inability of Carr and other realists to recognize the perilous nature of Nazism, and their belief that Germany could be satisfied by territorial concessions, helped to foster a political environment in which the latter was to grow in power, annex Czechoslovakia at will, and be militarily opposed in September 1939 by Poland alone.

A theory of international relations is not just an intellectual enterprise; it has practical consequences. It influences our thinking and political practice. On the practical side, the realists of the 1930s, to whom Carr gave intellectual support, were people opposed to the system of collective security embodied in the League of Nations. Working within the foreign policy establishments of the day, they contributed to its weakness. Once they had weakened the League, they pursued a policy of appeasement and accommodation with Germany as an alternative to collective security (Ashworth 46). After the annexation of Czechoslovakia, when the failure of the anti-League realist conservatives gathered around Neville Chamberlain and of this policy became clear, they tried to rebuild the very security system they had earlier demolished. Those who supported collective security were labeled idealists.

2.2 Hans Morgenthau’s Realist Principles

Hans J. Morgenthau (1904–1980) developed realism into a comprehensive international relations theory. Influenced by the Protestant theologian and political writer Reinhold Niebuhr, as well as by Hobbes, he places selfishness and power-lust at the center of his picture of human existence. The insatiable human lust for power, timeless and universal, which he identifies with animus dominandi, the desire to dominate, is for him the main cause of conflict. As he asserts in his main work, Politics among Nations: The Struggle for Power and Peace, first published in 1948, “international politics, like all politics, is a struggle for power” (25).

Morgenthau systematizes realism in international relations on the basis of six principles that he includes in the second edition of Politics among Nations. As a traditionalist, he opposes the so-called scientists (the scholars who, especially in the 1950s, tried to reduce the discipline of international relations to a branch of behavioral science). Nevertheless, in the first principle he states that realism is based on objective laws that have their roots in unchanging human nature (4). He wants to develop realism into both a theory of international politics and a political art, a useful tool of foreign policy.

The keystone of Morgenthau’s realist theory is the concept of power or “of interest defined in terms of power,” which informs his second principle: the assumption that political leaders “think and act in terms of interest defined as power” (5). This concept defines the autonomy of politics, and allows for the analysis of foreign policy regardless of the different motives, preferences, and intellectual and moral qualities of individual politicians. Furthermore, it is the foundation of a rational picture of politics.

Although, as Morgenthau explains in the third principle, interest defined as power is a universally valid category, and indeed an essential element of politics, various things can be associated with interest or power at different times and in different circumstances. Its content and the manner of its use are determined by the political and cultural environment.

In the fourth principle, Morgenthau considers the relationship between realism and ethics. He says that while realists are aware of the moral significance of political action, they are also aware of the tension between morality and the requirements of successful political action. “Universal moral principles,” he asserts, “cannot be applied to the actions of states in their abstract universal formulation, but …they must be filtered through the concrete circumstances of time and place” (9). These principles must be accompanied by prudence for as he cautions “there can be no political morality without prudence; that is, without consideration of the political consequences of seemingly moral action” (ibid.).

Prudence, the ability to judge the rightness of a given action from among possible alternatives on the basis of its likely political consequences, and not conviction of one’s own moral or ideological superiority, should guide political decisions. This is stressed in the fifth principle, where Morgenthau again emphasizes the idea that all state actors, including our own, must be looked at solely as political entities pursuing their respective interests defined in terms of power. By taking this point of view vis-à-vis its counterparts and thus avoiding ideological confrontation, a state would then be able to pursue policies that respected the interests of other states, while protecting and promoting its own.

Insofar as power, or interest defined as power, is the concept that defines politics, politics is an autonomous sphere, as Morgenthau says in his sixth principle of realism. It cannot be subordinated to ethics. However, ethics does still play a role in politics. “A man who was nothing but ‘political man’ would be a beast, for he would be completely lacking in moral restraints. A man who was nothing but ‘moral man’ would be a fool, for he would be completely lacking in prudence” (12). Political art requires that these two dimensions of human life, power and morality, be taken into consideration.

While Morgenthau’s six principles of realism contain repetitions and inconsistencies, we can nonetheless obtain from them the following picture: Power or interest is the central concept that makes politics into an autonomous discipline. Rational state actors pursue their national interests. Therefore, a rational theory of international politics can be constructed. Such a theory is not concerned with the morality, religious beliefs, motives or ideological preferences of individual political leaders. It also indicates that in order to avoid conflicts, states should avoid moral crusades or ideological confrontations, and look for compromise based solely on satisfaction of their mutual interests.

Although he defines politics as an autonomous sphere, Morgenthau does not separate ethics from politics. The act of protecting one’s country has for him a deep moral significance. Ultimately directed toward the objective of national survival, it involves prudence that is related to choosing the best course of action. The effective protection of citizens’ lives from harm in case of an international armed conflict is not merely a forceful physical action; it also has prudential and moral dimensions.

Morgenthau regards realism as a way of thinking about international relations and a useful tool for devising policies. However, some of the basic conceptions of his theory, and especially the idea of conflict as stemming from human nature, as well as the concept of power itself, have provoked criticism.

International politics, like all politics, is for Morgenthau a struggle for power because of the basic human lust for power. But regarding every individual as being engaged in a perpetual quest for power—the view that he shares with Hobbes—is a questionable premise. Human nature cannot be revealed by observation and experiment. It cannot be proved by any empirical research, but only disclosed by philosophy, imposed on us as a matter of belief, and inculcated by education.

Morgenthau himself reinforces the belief in the human drive for power by introducing a normative aspect of his theory, which is rationality. A rational foreign policy is considered “to be a good foreign policy” (7). But he defines rationality as a process of calculating the costs and benefits of all alternative policies in order to determine their relative utility, i.e. their ability to maximize power. Statesmen “think and act in terms of interest defined as power” (5). Only intellectual weakness of policy makers can result in foreign policies that deviate from a rational course aimed at minimizing risks and maximizing benefits. Hence, rather than presenting an actual portrait of human affairs, Morgenthau emphasizes the pursuit of power and the rationality of this pursuit, and sets it up as a norm.

As Raymond Aron and other scholars have noticed, power, the fundamental concept of Morgenthau’s realism, is ambiguous. It can be either a means or an end in politics. But if power is only a means for gaining something else, it does not define the nature of international politics in the way Morgenthau claims. It does not allow us to understand the actions of states independently from the motives and ideological preferences of their political leaders. It cannot serve as the basis for defining politics as an autonomous sphere. Morgenthau’s principles of realism are thus open to doubt. “Is this true,” Aron asks, “that states, whatever their regime, pursue the same kind of foreign policy” (597) and that the foreign policies of Napoleon or Stalin are essentially identical to those of Hitler, Louis XVI or Nicholas II, amounting to no more than the struggle for power? “If one answers yes, then the proposition is incontestable, but not very instructive” (598). Accordingly, it is useless to define actions of states by exclusive reference to power, security or national interest. International politics cannot be studied independently of the wider historical and cultural context.

Carr and Morgenthau concentrate primarily on international relations. However, their political realism can also be applied to domestic politics. To be a classical realist is in general to perceive politics as a conflict of interests and a struggle for power, and to seek peace by recognizing common interests and trying to satisfy them, rather than by moralizing. Bernard Williams and Raymond Geuss, influential representatives of the new political realism, a movement in contemporary political theory, criticize what they describe as “political moralism” and stress the autonomy of politics against ethics. However, political theory realism and international relations realism seem like two separate research programs. As noted by several scholars (William Scheuerman, Alison McQueen, Terry Nardin. Duncan Bell), those who contribute to realism in political theory give little attention to those who work on realism in international politics.

3. Neorealism

In spite of its ambiguities and weaknesses, Morgenthau’s Politics among Nations became a standard textbook and influenced thinking about international politics for a generation or so. At the same time, there was an attempt to develop a more methodologically rigorous approach to theorizing about international affairs. In the 1950s and 1960s a large influx of scientists from different fields entered the discipline of International Relations and attempted to replace the “wisdom literature” of classical realists with scientific concepts and reasoning (Brown 35). This in turn provoked a counterattack by Morgenthau and scholars associated with the so-called English School, especially Hedley Bull, who defended a traditional approach (Bull 1966).

As a result, the discipline of international relations has been divided into two main strands: traditional or non-positivist and scientific or positivist (neo-positivist). At a later stage the third strand: post-positivism has been added. The traditionalists raise normative questions and engage with history, philosophy and law. The scientists or positivists stress a descriptive and explanatory form of inquiry, rather than a normative one. They have established a strong presence in the field. Already by the mid-1960s, the majority of American students in international relations were trained in quantitative research, game theory, and other new research techniques of the social sciences. This, along with the changing international environment, had a significant effect on the discipline.

Notwithstanding their methodological differences, realists’ assumption is that the state is the key actor in international politics, and that competitive and conflictual relations among states are the core of actual international relations. However, with the receding of the Cold War during the 1970s, one could witness the growing importance of other actors: international and non-governmental organizations, as well as of multinational corporations. This development led to a revival of idealist thinking, which became known as neoliberalism or pluralism. While accepting some basic assumptions of realism, the leading pluralists, Robert Keohane and Joseph Nye, have proposed the concept of complex interdependence to describe this more sophisticated picture of global politics. They would argue that states could effectively cooperate with each other for mutual benefit and there can be progress in international relations, and that the future does not need to look like the past.

3.1 Kenneth Waltz’s International System

The realist retort came most prominently from Kenneth N. Waltz, who reformulated realism in international relations in a new and distinctive way. In his book Theory of International Politics, first published in 1979, he responded to the liberal challenge and attempted to cure the defects of the classical realism of Hans Morgenthau with his more scientific approach, which has become known as structural realism or neorealism. Whereas Morgenthau rooted his theory in the struggle for power, which he related to human nature, Waltz made an effort to avoid any philosophical discussion of human nature, and set out instead to build a theory of international politics using microeconomics as a model. In his works, he argues that states in the international system are like firms in a domestic economy and have the same fundamental interest: to survive. “Internationally, the environment of states’ actions, or the structure of their system, is set by the fact that some states prefer survival over other ends obtainable in the short run and act with relative efficiency to achieve that end” (93).

Waltz maintains that by paying attention to the individual state, and to ideological, moral and economic issues, both traditional liberals and classical realists make the same mistake. They fail to develop a serious account of the international system—one that can be abstracted from the wider socio-political domain. Waltz acknowledges that such an abstraction distorts reality and omits many of the factors that were important for classical realism. It does not allow for the analysis of the development of specific foreign policies. However, it also has utility. Notably, it assists in understanding the primary determinants of international politics. To be sure, Waltz’s neorealist theory cannot be applied to domestic politics. It cannot serve to develop policies of states concerning their international or domestic affairs. His theory helps only to explain why states behave in similar ways despite their different forms of government and diverse political ideologies, and why, despite their growing interdependence, the overall picture of international relations is unlikely to change.

According to Waltz, the uniform behavior of states over centuries can be explained by the constraints on their behavior that are imposed by the structure of the international system. A system’s structure is defined first by the principle by which it is organized, then by the differentiation of its units, and finally by the distribution of capabilities (power) across units. Anarchy, or the absence of central authority, is for Waltz the ordering principle of the international system. The units of the international system are states. Waltz recognizes the existence of non-state actors, but dismisses them as relatively unimportant. Since all states want to survive, and anarchy presupposes a self-help system in which each state has to take care of itself, there is no division of labor or functional differentiation among them. While functionally similar, they are nonetheless distinguished by their relative capabilities (the power each of them represents) to perform the same function.

Consequently, Waltz sees power and state behavior in a different way from the classical realists. For Morgenthau power was both a means and an end, and rational state behavior was understood as simply the course of action that would accumulate the most power. In contrast, neorealists assume that the fundamental interest of each state is security and would therefore concentrate on the distribution of power. What also sets neorealism apart from classical realism is methodological rigor and scientific self-conception (Guzinni 1998, 127–128). Waltz insists on empirical testability of knowledge and on falsificationism as a methodological ideal, which, as he himself admits, can have only a limited application in international relations.

The distribution of capabilities among states can vary; however, anarchy, the ordering principle of international relations, remains unchanged. This has a lasting effect on the behavior of states that become socialized into the logic of self-help. Trying to refute neoliberal ideas concerning the effects of interdependence, Waltz identifies two reasons why the anarchic international system limits cooperation: insecurity and unequal gains. In the context of anarchy, each state is uncertain about the intentions of others and is afraid that the possible gains resulting from cooperation may favor other states more than itself, and thus lead it to dependence on others. “States do not willingly place themselves in situations of increased dependence. In a self-help system, considerations of security subordinate economic gain to political interest.” (Waltz 1979, 107).

Because of its theoretical elegance and methodological rigor, neorealism has become very influential within the discipline of international relations. In the eyes of many scholars, Morgenthau’s realism has come to be seen as anachronistic—“an interesting and important episode in the history of thinking about the subject, no doubt, but one scarcely to be seen as a serious contribution of the rigorously scientific theory” (Williams 2007, 1). However, while initially gaining more acceptance than classical realism, neorealism has also provoked strong critiques on a number of fronts.

3.2 Objections to Neorealism

In 1979 Waltz wrote that in the nuclear age the international bipolar system, based on two superpowers—the United States and the Soviet Union—was not only stable but likely to persist (176–7). With the fall of the Berlin Wall and the subsequent disintegration of the USSR this prediction was proven wrong. The bipolar world turned out to have been more precarious than most realist analysts had supposed. Its end opened new possibilities and challenges related to globalization. This has led many critics to argue that neorealism, like classical realism, cannot adequately account for changes in world politics.

The new debate between international (neo)realists and (neo)liberals is no longer concerned with the questions of morality and human nature, but with the extent to which state behavior is influenced by the anarchic structure of the international system rather than by institutions, learning and other factors that are conductive to cooperation. In his 1989 book International Institutions and State Power, Robert Keohane accepts Waltz’s emphasis on system-level theory and his general assumption that states are self-interested actors that rationally pursue their goals. However, by employing game theory he shows that states can widen the perception of their self-interest through economic cooperation and involvement in international institutions. Patterns of interdependence can thus affect world politics. Keohane calls for systemic theories that would be able to deal better with factors affecting state interaction, and with change.

Critical theorists, such as Robert W. Cox, also focus on the alleged inability of neorealism to deal with change. In their view, neorealists take a particular, historically determined state-based structure of international relations and assume it to be universally valid. In contrast, critical theorists believe that by analyzing the interplay of ideas, material factors, and social forces, one can understand how this structure has come about, and how it may eventually change (Cox 1986). They contend that neorealism ignores both the historical process during which identities and interests are formed, and the diverse methodological possibilities. It legitimates the existing status quo of strategic relations among states and considers the scientific method as the only way of obtaining knowledge. It represents an exclusionary practice, an interest in domination and control.

While realists are concerned with relations among states and national security, the focus for critical theorists is human security and social emancipation. They focus on social, economic and environmental security for the individual and the group. Despite their differences, critical theory, postmodernism and feminism all take issue with the notion of state sovereignty and envision new political communities that would be less exclusionary vis-à-vis marginal and disenfranchised groups. Critical theory argues against state-based exclusion and denies that the interests of a country’s citizens take precedence over those of outsiders. It insists that politicians should give as much weight to the interests of foreigners as they give to those of their compatriots and envisions political structures beyond the “fortress” nation-state. Postmodernism questions the state’s claim to be a legitimate focus of human loyalties and its right to impose social and political boundaries. It supports cultural diversity and stresses the interests of minorities. Feminism argues that the realist theory exhibits a masculine bias and advocates the inclusion of woman and alternative values into public life.

Since critical theories and other alternative theoretical perspectives question the existing status quo, make knowledge dependent on power, and emphasize identity formation and social change, they are not traditional or non-positivist. They are sometimes called “reflectivist” or “post-positivist” (Weaver 165) and represent a radical departure from the neorealist and neoliberal “rationalist” or “positivist” international relation theories. For critical security theorists, security is not an objective phenomenon. It is essentially social, socially constructed and serves a political agenda. It legitimizes and imposes a political program on society that serves the dominant group. According to the critical securitization theory, the securitizing actor, who could be a politician or the governing party, “encodes a subject or a group as an existential threat to the reference object” (Ari 147). The object could be a state or a non-state group. Such a discursive practice defines threat and danger.

Constructivists, such as Alexander Wendt, try to build a bridge between these two approaches, positivist and post-positivist, by on the one hand, taking the present state system and anarchy seriously, and on the other hand, by focusing on the formation of identities and interests. Countering neorealist ideas, Wendt argues that self-help does not follow logically or casually from the principle of anarchy. It is socially constructed. Wendt’s idea that states’ identities and interests are socially constructed has earned his position the label “constructivism”. Consequently, in his view,“self-help and power politics are institutions, and not essential features of anarchy. Anarchy is what states make of it” (Wendt 1987 395). There is no single logic of anarchy but rather several, depending on the roles with which states identify themselves and each other. Power and interests are constituted by ideas and norms. Wendt claims that neorealism cannot account for change in world politics, but his norm-based constructivism can.

A similar conclusion, although derived in a traditional way, comes from the non-positivist theorists of the English school (International Society approach) who emphasize both systemic and normative constraints on the behavior of states. Referring to the classical view of the human being as an individual that is basically social and rational, capable of cooperating and learning from past experiences, these theorists emphasize that states, like individuals, have legitimate interests that others can recognize and respect, and that they can recognize the general advantages of observing a principle of reciprocity in their mutual relations (Jackson and Sørensen 167). Therefore, states can bind themselves to other states by treaties and develop some common values with other states. Hence, the structure of the international system is not unchangeable as the neorealists claim. It is not a permanent Hobbesian anarchy, permeated by the danger of war. An anarchic international system based on pure power relations among actors can evolve into a more cooperative and peaceful international society, in which state behavior is shaped by commonly shared values and norms. A practical expression of international society are international organizations that uphold the rule of law in international relations, especially the UN.

4. Conclusion: The Cautionary and Changing Character of Realism

An unintended and unfortunate consequence of the debate about neorealism is that neorealism and a large part of its critique (with the notable exception of the English School) has been expressed in abstract scientific and philosophical terms. This has made the theory of international politics almost inaccessible to a layperson and has divided the discipline of international relations into incompatible parts. Whereas classical realism was a theory aimed at supporting diplomatic practice and providing a guide to be followed by those seeking to understand and deal with potential threats, today’s theories, concerned with various grand pictures and projects, are ill-suited to perform this task. This is perhaps the main reason why there has been a renewed interest in classical realism, and particularly in the ideas of Morgenthau. Rather than being seen as an obsolete form of pre-scientific realist thought, superseded by neorealist theory, his thinking is now considered to be more complex and of greater contemporary relevance than was earlier recognized (Williams 2007, 1–9). It fits uneasily in the orthodox picture of realism he is usually associated with.

In recent years, scholars have questioned prevailing narratives about clear theoretical traditions in the discipline of international relations. Thucydides, Machiavelli, Hobbes and other thinkers have become subject to re-examination as a means of challenging prevailing uses of their legacies in the discipline and exploring other lineages and orientations. Morgenthau has undergone a similar process of reinterpretation. A number of scholars (Hartmut Behr, Muriel Cozette, Amelia Heath, Sean Molloy) have endorsed the importance of his thought as a source of change for the standard interpretation of realism. Murielle Cozette stresses Morgenthau’s critical dimension of realism expressed in his commitment to “speak truth to power” and to “unmask power’s claims to truth and morality,” and in his tendency to assert different claims at different times (Cozette 10–12). She writes: “The protection of human life and freedom are given central importance by Morgenthau, and constitute a ‘transcendent standard of ethics’ which should always animate scientific enquiries” (19). This shows the flexibility of his classical realism and reveals his normative assumptions based on the promotion of universal moral values. While Morgenthau assumes that states are power-oriented actors, he at the same time acknowledges that international politics would be more pernicious than it actually is were it not for moral restraints and the work of international law(Behr and Heath 333).

Another avenue for the development of a realist theory of international relations is offered by Robert Gilpin’s seminal work War and Change in World Politics. If this work were to gain greater prominence in IR scholarship, instead of engaging in fruitless theoretical debates, we would be better prepared today “for rapid power shifts and geopolitical change ”(Wohlforth, 2011 505). We would be able to explain the causes of great wars and long periods of peace, and the creation and waning of international orders. Still another avenue is provided by the application of the new scientific discoveries to social sciences. The evidence for this is, for example, the recent work of Alexander Wendt, Quantum Mind and Social Science. A new realist approach to international politics could be based on the organic and holistic world view emerging from quantum theory, the idea of human evolution, and the growing awareness of the role of human beings in the evolutionary process (Korab-Karpowicz 2017).

Realism is thus more than a static, amoral theory, and cannot be accommodated solely within a positivist interpretation of international relations. It is a practical and evolving theory that depends on the actual historical and political conditions, and is ultimately judged by its ethical standards and by its relevance in making prudent political decisions (Morgenthau 1962). In place of the twentieth-century Cold War ideological rivalry, the main competition in the twenty-first-century is between the ideologies justifying the expansion of the US-dominated unipolar world and those supporting the reestablishment of a multipolar one (Müllerson 2017). Consequently, the growing tensions among superpowers have contributed to the revival of the idealist-realist debate and have caused a resurgence of interest in realism. John Mearsheimer is an important thinker in this respect, known for his pessimistic concept of offensive realism, which assumes that powerful states, such as the United States, would aim at the maximization of power and domination over others (Mearsheimer 2001). His late work, The Liberal Delusion (Mearsheimer 2019), in which he presents realist arguments against a liberal position, can already be considered a classic of the theory of international relations.

As the current revival of interest proves, realism is a theory for difficult times, when security becomes a real issue. This happens when countries face the danger of an armed conflict. In such situations, realism performs a useful cautionary role. It warns us against progressivism, moralism, legalism and other orientations that lose touch with the reality of self-interest and power. It is a necessary corrective to an overoptimistic liberal belief in international cooperation and change resulting from interdependence, as well as to a critical theory claim that our insecurity is merely a result of securitization.

Nevertheless, when it becomes a dogmatic enterprise, by focusing on conflict alone, realism fails to perform its proper function as a theory of international relations. By remaining stuck in a state-centric and excessively simplified “paradigm” such as neorealism and by denying the possibility of any progress in interstate relations, it turns into an ideology. Its emphasis on power politics and national interest can be misused to justify aggression. It has therefore to be supplanted by theories that take better account of the dramatically changing picture of global politics. To its merely negative, cautionary function, positive norms must be added. These norms extend from the rationality and prudence stressed by classical realists; through the vision of multilateralism, international law, and an international society emphasized by liberals and members of the English School; to the cosmopolitanism and global solidarity advocated by many of today’s writers.


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