Liberal Feminism

First published Thu Oct 18, 2007; substantive revision Thu Dec 31, 2020

Liberalism is a family of doctrines that emphasize the value of freedom and hold that the just state ensures freedom for individuals. Liberal feminists embrace this value and this role for the state and insist on freedom for women. A disagreement concerning how freedom should be understood divides liberalism into two different sorts; this disagreement also divides liberal feminism.

Some liberals understand freedom as freedom from coercive interference. The convention in the literature is to call such folks “classical liberals”. This is fitting since the view they embrace is historically prior. (Some call it “old liberalism” (Gaus, Courtland, & Schmidts 2018; Paul, Miller, & Paul 2007).) However, as readers will see, there are contemporary classical liberals, and among them contemporary classical liberal feminists.

Other liberals understand freedom as personal autonomy—living a life of one’s own choosing—and political autonomy—being co-author of the conditions under which one lives. While some historians call such folks “new liberals” (Rosenblatt 2018), the convention in the contemporary philosophical literature is to simply call them “liberals”. To avoid using the same term for both genus and species, this article calls the second sort of liberals “egalitarian liberals” and the second sort of liberal feminism “egalitarian-liberal feminism”.

Classical-liberal feminism and egalitarian-liberal feminism are, themselves, families of doctrines with significant internal differences, many of which this article seeks to describe. Nonetheless, the difference between classical and egalitarian-liberal feminist thinking about freedom has significant consequences for how each frames the problem feminism aims to address, how each specifies the content of a liberal feminist agenda, and what role is assigned to the state.

Egalitarian-liberal feminists hold that much can and should be done to support the personal and political autonomy of women and to achieve parity in the processes of democratic self-governance in liberal societies like the United States. They tend to see the state as a potential ally in the pursuit of these ends and endorse measures like anti-discrimination law, affirmative action, and welfare state programs, as well as measures to change the culture and secure parity in participation in democratic self-governance. These features put egalitarian-liberal feminism squarely on the left side of the political spectrum.

Classical-liberal feminists, by contrast, tend to hold that feminism’s political task is limited to opposing laws that treat women differently from men, a task which they hold has been largely accomplished in societies like the United States. They tend to endorse the outcomes of largely unfettered economic and associational arrangements and oppose, for example, anti-discrimination law, affirmative action, and welfare state programs. These features place classical-liberalism on the right side of the political spectrum. However, some classical-liberal feminists hold that the task of liberalizing the culture remains on the liberal feminist agenda, although they consider this a non-political task and reject uses of state power to this end. Such classical-liberal feminists are on the left culturally. Other classical-liberal feminists reject the project of liberalizing the culture and are on the right culturally.

This article presents an overview of work in both contemporary classical-liberal feminism and contemporary egalitarian-liberal feminism. The first section explores egalitarian-liberal feminist works by academic philosophers; it focuses on the value of personal and political autonomy, the role of the state in securing women’s autonomy, and how egalitarian-liberal feminist claims may be justified; and it concludes with discussion of criticisms of egalitarian-liberal feminism. The second section takes up classical-liberal feminist writing, much of which is oriented toward public policy and popular, rather than academic, audiences; it explores classical-liberal feminism’s core idea of women’s rights, the role this suggests for the state, and how classical-liberal feminist claims may be justified; and it concludes with discussion of criticisms of classical-liberal feminism.

1. Egalitarian-Liberal Feminism

Egalitarian-liberal feminism conceives of freedom as personal autonomy (living a life of one’s own choosing) and political autonomy (being co-author of the conditions under which one lives). Egalitarian-liberal feminists hold that the exercise of personal autonomy depends on certain enabling conditions that are insufficiently present in women’s lives or that social and institutional arrangements often fail to respect women’s personal autonomy and other elements of women’s flourishing. They hold also that women’s needs and interests are insufficiently reflected in the basic conditions under which they live and that basic arrangements that perpetuate those conditions lack legitimacy because women are inadequately represented in the processes of democratic self-determination. Egalitarian-liberal feminists link autonomy deficits like these to the “gender system” (Okin 1989: 89), that is, inherited patriarchal traditions and institutions, and they hold that the women’s movement should work to identify and remedy them. As the protection and promotion of citizens’ autonomy is an appropriate role of the state on the egalitarian-liberal view, egalitarian-liberal feminists hold that the state can and should be the women’s movement’s ally in promoting women’s autonomy. There is disagreement among egalitarian-liberal feminists, however, about the role of personal autonomy in the good life, the appropriate role of the state, and how egalitarian-liberal feminism is to be justified.

Egalitarian-liberal feminists draw from the broad tradition of feminist theorizing for insight concerning the gender system. For example, some draw on radical feminist insights into the nature of violence against women (Nussbaum 1999a) and the nature of gender hierarchy (Watson 2019); some draw on psychoanalytic feminist theory (Meyers 2002, Cornell 2003); some draw on feminist work on caregiving (Bhandary 2019); and some draw on socialist feminist thinking about the exploitation of women’s work in the home (Gheaus 2008). Contemporary egalitarian-liberal feminism may be understood as a contribution to the larger scholarly philosophical conversation concerning egalitarian-liberalism. Since John Rawls’s work (1971, 1993, 2001) has played a very large role in that conversation over the past 50 years, it figures centrally in much egalitarian-liberal feminist philosophy.

1.1 Personal Autonomy

1.1.1 Procedural Accounts of Personal Autonomy

Egalitarian-liberal feminists hold that women should enjoy personal autonomy. That is, they hold that women should live lives of their own choosing. Some offer “procedural” accounts of personal autonomy (Mackenzie & Stoljar discuss these, 2000a: 13–19). These accounts suggest that to say women should enjoy personal autonomy means they are entitled to a broad range of autonomy-enabling conditions. On this view, the women’s movement should work to identify and promote these conditions. Identifying these enabling conditions requires careful attention to the particular ways in which autonomy deficits are produced in diverse women’s lives. Procedural accounts avoid judging directly the substance of women’s choices or the arrangements that ensue. The following list of enabling conditions is representative.

Being free of violence and the threat of violence: Violence and the threat of violence violate women’s dignity; they make women do what others want or reduce women’s sphere of activity to avoiding harm. In some cases violence fractures the self and takes from women their sense of self-respect (Brison 1997). The feminist literature on violence against women documents the particular role that violence and the threat of violence play in unfairly disempowering and limiting women (Cudd 2006: 85–118).

Having access to options: On the egalitarian-liberal feminist view, women are entitled to access to options (Alstott 2004: 52). Women’s access to options is frequently and unfairly restricted due to economic deprivation, in particular due to the “feminization of poverty” (Pearce 1978; see also Cudd 2006: 119–154). Other sources of unfairly reduced options for women are stereotyping and sex discrimination in education and employment (Smith 2004; Rhode 1997). Such stereotyping and discrimination affect some racial, ethnic and cultural groups in particularly pernicious ways. Egalitarian-liberal feminists also point to the way cultural homogeneity unfairly limits women’s options (Cudd 2006: 234), for example when culture assigns identities and social roles according to sex (Okin 1989: 170ff; Alstott 2004; Meyers 2004; Cornell 1998: x; Chambers 2008).

Being free of the limits set by patriarchal paternalistic and moralistic laws and policies: Patriarchal paternalistic laws and policies restrict women’s options on the grounds that such limits are in women’s interest. Think for example of laws that limit women’s employment options on the grounds that taking certain jobs is not in women’s interest (Smith 2004). Patriarchal moralistic laws and policies restrict women’s options on the grounds that certain options should not be available to women because morality forbids women’s choosing them. Think for example of laws that prohibit abortion, or laws that favor certain kinds of sexual expression or family forms (Cornell 1998; Brake 2004). Welfare state programs that distinguish between the supposedly “deserving” and “undeserving” poor are moralistic responses to poverty among women (Folbre 1984). Together, patriarchal paternalistic and moralistic laws and policies steer women into socially preferred ways of life. These are unfair restrictions on women’s choices, on the egalitarian-liberal feminist view, because women’s choices should be guided by their own sense of their self-interest and by their own values. (But see Chambers [2008: 203–231] for egalitarian-liberal feminist uses of paternalism.)

Some emphasize the importance of internal, psychological enabling conditions as well, for example the ability to assess one’s own preferences and imagine life otherwise (Meyers 2002: 168; Cudd 2006: 234–235; Mackenzie 2000). Without the ability to assess the preferences on the basis of which one makes choices and to imagine life otherwise, one can’t meaningfully be said to have options other than affirming the status quo (see also Chambers 2008: 263–4). These internal enabling conditions are related to the external ones. Violence and the threat of violence, stereotyping and discrimination, material deprivation, and cultural homogeneity all can have the effect of closing down reflection and imagination.

On this view, the women’s movement should work to identify and promote autonomy-enabling conditions. Identifying these conditions requires careful attention to the particular ways in which autonomy deficits are produced in particular women’s lives. On the egalitarian-liberal feminist view, the state has an important role to play in promoting these conditions (see §1.1.4, §1.2.1, and §1.2.2). Some egalitarian-liberal feminists emphasize that there is much that cannot be done by the state (Cudd 2006: 223). For example, while the state can refrain from blocking such endeavors, women themselves must develop new “alternative emancipatory imagery” (Meyers 2002: 168), and fashion new ways of being a woman and new kinds of relationships through experiments in living (Cudd 2006: 234; Cornell 1998).

Some critics argue that freedom is of limited value because, even when enabling conditions like these are in place, women may choose limiting and disadvantaging social arrangements. Some point to the phenomenon of deformed preferences: when attractive options are limited or arrangements unfair, people may develop preferences for those limits or for less than their fair share (Nussbaum 1999a: 33, 50; Cudd 2006: 152). This phenomenon makes changing preferences through increased freedom problematic and leads some feminists to reject theories that prioritize free choice (Yuracko 2003). Advocates of procedural accounts of autonomy concede that the enabling conditions do not rule out that a woman could choose, for example, to undergo clitorectomy (Meyers 2004: 213) or become a pornographic model (Cudd 2004: 58). As Ann Cudd explains, possibilities like these must be accepted because liberal feminism values freedom and thus cannot advocate direct “preference education” (Cudd 2004: 57). Liberal feminism must offer only a

gradualist approach. Individuals and groups will make various experiments in living that we cannot now precisely imagine. They … will sometimes go on a mistaken path. (2004: 57)

But they must be freed up to find their own way. As Diana Meyers explains, the moral imagination of feminist theorists and activists is limited (as is everyone’s); they cannot know with certainty what substantive choices are compatible with personal autonomy (Meyers 2004: 213). Moreover, one should expect autonomous lives to take diverse forms in diverse cultural contexts. On this view, “a morally defensible and politically viable conception of autonomy for an era of global feminism” must be agnostic about the content of women’s choices as long as they do not close off autonomy (2004: 205).

1.1.2 Fairness in Personal Relationships

Some egalitarian-liberal feminists hold that the social arrangements of personal life should not only be freely chosen but should be characterized by fairness or justice. Jean Hampton draws on the contractualist tradition in moral and political philosophy to describe one way in which heterosexual intimate relationships often fail to be fair or just (Hampton 1993). (For extended discussion of Hampton’s feminism, see Abbey 2011: 120–151. For more on feminist uses of contractualism, see §1.2.1.)

On Hampton’s view, a personal relationship is fair only if both parties to it could

reasonably accept the distribution of costs and benefits (that is, the costs and benefits that are not themselves side effects of any affective or duty-based tie between us) if it were the subject of an informed, unforced agreement in which we think of ourselves as motivated solely by self-interest. (Hampton 1993: 240)

Of course, many women choose to enter or remain in relationships in part because of affective benefits; for example women often get satisfaction from satisfying others or fulfilling a duty. Why set aside these affective benefits, as Hampton recommends, when evaluating the fairness of a relationship? Hampton does not set them aside out of a conviction that a woman’s affective nature is not part of her essential self. Nor does she set them aside out of a conviction that this aspect of a woman’s nature is not valuable. (For criticism of Hampton, see Sample 2002.) Her test sets them aside because affective benefits of relationships are not received from the other; they are benefits that flow from one’s own nature (Radzik 2005: 51). Thus while they may, and probably should, figure in a woman’s overall decision about whether to enter or remain in a particular relationship, Hampton believes they should not figure in the evaluation of a relationship’s fairness. As Linda Radzik explains in her defense of Hampton, a relationship is fair or just if the benefits that flow from each to the other are on par, that is, if each gives as much as she gets (2005: 51). When one party gets from the other significantly more than he gives, he is denying the other her legitimate entitlement to reciprocation.

This test formalizes an important insight of the women’s movement: personal relationships, in particular traditional heterosexual relationships, are often unfair to women, indeed often exploit women’s tendency to care about others. Injustice of this sort is not uncommon. Thus Hampton’s test invites criticism of a wide swath of human social life (Sample 2002: 271). But Hampton does not call on women to cease valuing others’ satisfaction or the fulfillment of duty (Hampton 1993: 227). Instead, she calls on the women’s movement to cultivate in women and men a sensitivity and an aversion to this kind of injustice and to develop remedies. (For an early feminist articulation of this idea, see Alex Kates Shulman’s “A Marriage Agreement” (1970) in Shulman 2012.)

Procedural accounts of personal autonomy (see §1.1.1) do not require that relationships be just in the way Hampton recommends. According to procedural accounts, it is possible that a choice to enter or remain in a personal relationship in which one gives more than she gets from the other can be autonomous. Therefore, the focus should be on ensuring that women are not pressured into or unable to exit them.

To be sure, Hampton’s account of justice in personal relationships can be a resource to women and men reflecting on their own preferences. It invites reflection on how one’s own preferences affect the distribution of benefits and burdens within a relationship. Also, moral criticism of relationships that exploit women’s preferences reminds us that relationships can be otherwise (because ought implies can). This reminder enhances personal autonomy by broadening the imagination. Thus procedural accounts of personal autonomy can include Hampton’s test, not as definitive of the acceptability of social arrangements, but as a contribution to the kind of reflection about the good life on which the personal autonomy of individuals depends.

1.1.3 Personal Autonomy and Human Flourishing

Martha Nussbaum proposes an account of the good life that has

at its heart, a profoundly liberal idea … the idea of the citizen as a free and dignified human being, a maker of choices. (Nussbaum 1999a: 46)

Echoing procedural accounts of personal autonomy (§1.1.1), Nussbaum explains:

if one cares about people’s powers to choose a conception of the good, then one must care about the rest of the form of life that supports those powers. (1999a: 45)

But for Nussbaum personal autonomy is merely one of the “major human functionings” (1999a: 43) which define “a good human life” (1999a: 42). These functionings include, among other things, bodily health and integrity, affiliation, and political participation (1999a: 41–42). To be sure, personal autonomy, or in Nussbaum’s words “practical reason”, is a good that “suffuses all the other functions” (1999a: 44). But personal autonomy is not prioritized. A good life is one in which one is able to enjoy all of the major human functionings, that is, to flourish.

Nussbaum’s approach takes on the problem of deformed preferences (see §1.1.1) directly. To be sure, some may choose lives that do not include the actual exercise of some of the functionings—an ascetic may choose to compromise bodily health, for example. But, Nussbaum explains, one must be able to function in each of these ways. Social arrangements are to be criticized if they render their participants unable to function in the valued ways regardless of their preferences (1999a: 50). The women’s movement should sensitize women and men to the injustice of denying women the ability to function in these valued ways, identify arrangements that are unjust to women by paying careful attention to diverse women’s lives, and recommend remedies. Nussbaum holds that her account is compatible with global moral pluralism and thus may function as a foundation for a global feminism (Nussbaum 1999a: 40).

Nussbaum’s “capabilities approach” may be compared with procedural accounts of autonomy (see §1.1.1). Procedural accounts suggest that the women’s movement should work to protect and promote women’s ability to live lives of their own choosing by identifying particular autonomy deficits in women’s lives and promoting the conditions that enable autonomy. These approaches avoid directly judging the substance of the choices women make or the arrangements that result. They leave it to individuals and groups to fashion new, diverse, non-oppressive ways of life. The list of enabling conditions for personal autonomy is not unlike Nussbaum’s list of human functionings. But advocates of procedural approaches may worry that the goal of the women’s movement, according to the capabilities approach, is to bring to women a particular way of life, namely one in which women can function in these ways, instead of freeing women up to find their own way (Cudd 2004: 50). As Drucilla Cornell, an advocate of a procedural approach explains, “social equality [should be] redefined so as to serve freedom” (Cornell 1998: xii) because “there is nothing more fundamental for a human being” (1998: 17; see also Cudd 2004: 51–52). Procedural accounts of autonomy can include Nussbaum’s approach, not as definitive of the kinds of lives women should live, but as an important contribution to the kind of reflection on the good life on which personal autonomy depends. (There is a large literature on Nussbaum’s liberal feminism; see for example Abbey 2011: 152–205; and Robeyns 2007.)

1.1.4 Personal Autonomy and the State

There is substantial agreement among egalitarian-liberal feminists that the gender system—that is, inherited patriarchal traditions and institutions—plays an important role in perpetuating morally objectionable deficits in personal autonomy in women’s lives and that the state can and should take action to remedy them. There is also substantial agreement concerning what the state should do. There is disagreement about some hard cases, however, that pit liberal values against one another.

Egalitarian-liberal feminists agree that the state must effectively protect women from violence, regardless of where that violence takes place (Cudd 2006: 85–118, 209; Rhode 1997: 1193–95). They also hold that sexist paternalistic and moralistic laws and policies are an unjust use of state power. Such laws place control over women’s lives in the hands of others and steer women into preferred ways of life. Laws restricting access to birth control and abortion are of particular import in this context because they take an extremely momentous choice away from women and, together with the cultural assignment of caregiving duties to women, steer women into the social role of mother. Women must have a legal right, and meaningful access, to birth control and abortion services. In addition, egalitarian-liberal feminists hold that the state must not grant preferential treatment to particular family forms (Brake 2004: 293; Lloyd 1995: 1328; McClain 2006: 60) which means giving gay and lesbian partnerships the same recognition currently available to heterosexuals (Brake 2012; Hartley & Watson 2010; McClain 2006: 6). Others argue for removing marriage’s privileged legal status altogether or treating it legally more like other associations (Case 2006; Chambers 2017; Metz 2010).

Egalitarian-liberal feminists also support laws against sex discrimination in education, employment, and public accommodations. According to egalitarian-liberal feminists, the refusal to hire or promote a woman or do business with her because she is a woman is a morally objectionable limit on her options. So are workplaces that are hostile to women. Liberal feminists argue that laws prohibiting sexual harassment and requiring affirmative action and comparable worth policies are often called for to remedy past and ongoing sex discrimination (Williams 2000: 253).

Egalitarian-liberal feminists agree also that a significant source of women’s reduced options is the structure of the workplace which assumes that workers are free of caregiving responsibilities (Okin 1989: 176; Williams 2000). Women, and increasingly men, do not fit this model. The effect of not fitting the model is dramatic. As Anne L. Alstott explains: “Caretakers at every income level have fewer options than noncaretakers at the same income level” (Alstott 2004: 97). She continues: “I am worried that child-rearing too dramatically contracts the options among which mothers can choose” (2004: 23). Alstott and others argue that the state must ensure that the socially essential work of providing care to dependents does not unreasonably interfere with the personal autonomy of caregivers. Policies proposed to ensure sufficient personal autonomy for caregivers include parental leave, state subsidized, high quality day care, and flexible work schedules (Cudd 2006: 228; Eichner 2021; Okin 1989: 175). Joan Williams has argued for legal recognition of the right to not be discriminated against in employment on the basis of one’s caregiving responsibilities. Williams recommends, if necessary, legal action alleging failure to recognize this right as an incentive to employers to accommodate caregivers (Williams 2000: 274). (See §1.2.1 for discussion of caregiving and distributive justice.)

The egalitarian-liberal feminist literature concerned with women’s personal autonomy emphasizes the role the state should play in protecting women from violence and discrimination; the importance of ridding the law and policy of patriarchal paternalism and moralism; and the role the state can play in restructuring the workplace, including ensuring access to childcare. Note, however, that egalitarian-liberal feminists are egalitarian-liberals and, as such, hold that among the proper uses of state power is to ensure that all individuals can enjoy a decent standard of living, including access to adequate income, education and healthcare (Eichner 2010; on a guaranteed minimum income, see Cudd 2006: 154; see also Stark 2021). Egalitarian-liberals also tend to support the right to collective bargaining to secure decent wages and working conditions (Cornell 1998: 57; Cudd 2006: 211). (For more on distributive justice, see §1.2.1.)

There is disagreement among egalitarian-liberal feminists about some hard cases that pit liberal values against one another. Several hard cases concern autonomy and the body. Consider pornography. Egalitarian-liberal feminists tend to reject legal limits on pornography (Cornell 1998: 57–58). But some hold that arguments for restricting violent pornography are not unreasonable (Laden 2003: 148–149; Watson 2019 and 2007: 469; for what such a not unreasonable argument might look like, see Eaton 2007) and that the best arguments for freedom of expression fail to show that it should not be limited (Brison 1998). Indeed some argue that violent pornography can undermine the autonomy of viewers (Scoccia 1996) and the status of women as equal citizens (Spaulding 1988–89; see also Watson 2015). Prostitution is a similar case. Egalitarian-liberal feminists tend to reject laws prohibiting prostitution and advocate, instead, the legal regulation of the sex trade prioritizing women’s safety and women’s control over their own working conditions (Cornell 1998: 57; Nussbaum 1999a, 295). But some egalitarian-liberal feminists suggest that liberal values can support an argument for criminalizing the purchase of sex (Watson & Hartley 2018: 163–188). Surrogate motherhood is another case around which there is egalitarian-liberal feminist disagreement with some arguing that women have a right to sell procreative bodily services (see for example Church 1997) and others raising serious concerns (see for example Anderson 1990 and Satz 2010).

Some hard cases concern the role of the state in family life. Family life has dramatic effects on the personal autonomy of its adult members. Assuming the role of caregiver, for example, can dramatically contract options. On an egalitarian-liberal feminist view, the state has an interest in ensuring that family life does not undermine women’s personal autonomy. Some hold that the state should promote justice in the family—for example, the sharing of paid and unpaid labor by its adult members (Okin 1989: 171). Others hold that the state may not be guided by a substantive ideal of family life (Alstott 2004: 114; see also Nussbaum 2000a: 279–280; and Wolf-Devine 2004). In response to the disadvantage and vulnerability to which full-time care-givers in the home are commonly exposed, some egalitarian-liberal feminists suggest guaranteeing a non-wage-earning spouse one half of her wage-earning spouse’s paycheck (Okin 1989: 181). Others propose financial support for caregivers, for example state-funded care-giver allowances (Alstott 2004: 75ff; Baehr 2021; compare Eichner 2010: 77–80). Some warn against care-giver allowances however because, if women took disproportionate advantage of them—which is not unlikely—the gendered division of labor might be reinforced (Schouten 2021; see also Gheaus 2008 and Gheaus & Robeyns 2011). (See §1.2.1 for more discussion of this issue.)

Girls’ participation in families is, especially in the early years, nonvoluntary. The family affects the development of girls’ sense of self-worth as well as their preferences and the capacities, like the capacity for reflection and imagination, on which their ability to live lives of their own choosing depends (Okin 1989: 97). Egalitarian-liberal feminists hold that the state must protect and promote the development of autonomy capacities in children, especially girls. For example they hold that child-marriage should be legally prohibited (McClain 2006: 79); girls should have access to abortion without parental consent or notification (Rhode 1994: 1204); girls must receive a formal education free of sexist stereotyping, including instruction in the legal equality of women (McClain 2006: 81; Lloyd 1995: 1332), including autonomy-promoting sex education (McClain 2006: 57–58), and ensuring that girls are prepared to be economically independent (Lloyd 1995: 1332). Beyond this, some hold that girls’ interest in developing autonomy capacities requires that families be internally just, that is, that there be an equal division of paid and unpaid labor between adults so that families are not characterized by “dependence and domination” (Okin 1989: 99–100; see also Follesdal 2005). Others are not convinced that there is a necessary connection between this kind of justice in families and the development of girls’ autonomy capacities (Lloyd 1995: 1335–1343) and hold that the state may not be guided by a substantive ideal of family life (Alstott 2004: 114; see also Nussbaum 2000a: 279–280; and Wolf-Devine 2004). (See §1.2.1 for more discussion of this issue).

1.2 Political Autonomy

Some egalitarian-liberal feminists emphasize the importance of political autonomy, that is, being co-author of the conditions under which one lives. Some use contractualist political theory to argue that the state should ensure that the basic structure of society satisfies principles of justice that women, as well as men, could endorse (see §1.2.1). And some argue that the democratic legitimacy of the basic conditions under which citizens live depends on the inclusion of women in the processes of public deliberation and electoral politics (see §1.2.2).

1.2.1 Distributive Justice

Some egalitarian-liberal feminists, inspired by John Rawls’ contractualist liberal theory of justice (Rawls 1971; 1993; 2001), argue that the state should ensure that the basic structure of society distributes the benefits and burdens of social cooperation fairly, that is, in a manner that women as well as men could endorse (for example Alstott 2004; Baehr 2021; Bhandary 2019; Bojer 2002; Lloyd 1998; McClain 2006; Okin 1989; Thompson 1993; for an overview of feminist responses to Rawls, see Abbey 2013a). They argue that the basic structure currently distributes benefits and burdens unfairly, in part due to the gender system, that is, inherited patriarchal traditions and institutions.

As Rawls puts it, the basic structure of society is

the way in which the major social institutions distribute fundamental rights and duties and determine the division of advantages from social cooperation. By major institutions I understand the political constitution and the principal economic and social arrangements.… Competitive markets and the monogamous family [are] examples of major social institutions.… The basic structure is the primary subject of justice because its effects are so profound and present from the start. The intuitive notion here is that this structure contains various social positions and that men born into different positions have different expectations of life determined, in part, by the political system as well as by economic and social circumstances. In this way the institutions of society favor certain starting places over others. (Rawls 1971: 6–7)

Rawls argues that the fairness of the basic structure of society may be assessed by asking what principles representatives of citizens (parties) would choose to determine the distribution of primary goods in society if they were behind a “veil of ignorance” (Rawls 1971: 12). The veil of ignorance blocks from the parties knowledge of their place in society: for example their socio-economic status, religion, and sex. (Rawls does not include sex in A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971), but adds it in “Fairness to Goodness” (Rawls 1975: 537).) Susan Okin proposes we

take seriously both the notion that those behind the veil of ignorance do not know what sex they are and the requirement that the family and the gender system, as basic social institutions, are to be subject to scrutiny. (Okin 1989: 101)

Rawls argues that parties behind a veil of ignorance would choose two principles: a liberty principle providing for the “most extensive total system of equal basic liberties compatible with a similar system of liberty for all” and a principle of equality requiring equality of opportunity and permitting inequalities in wealth and income only if they are to the benefit of the least well off (Rawls 1971: 302–303).

Okin argues that the gender system violates both the liberty and equality of opportunity principles because by effectively assigning roles to citizens according to sex it circumvents citizens’ “free choice of occupation” (Okin 1989: 103). On Okin’s view, this means that in a just society “gender could no longer form a legitimate part of the social structure, whether inside or outside the family” (1989: 103). None of the institutions of the basic structure, including the family, could assign roles according to sex. It is common to argue that the state, educational institutions and workplaces should not assign roles according to sex. But Okin argues that this applies to the family as well. Gender blindness must play the same role in the family that it plays in these institutions. In Okin’s words, there must be “congruence” between the principles that govern these institutions and those that govern family life (1989: 21). That is, families must be just.

Okin offers a second argument to support the claim that families must be just. Rawls explains that a society satisfying his two principles of justice can be stable because within it citizens develop a sense of justice (Rawls 1971: 453ff). For our purposes consider that citizens must develop the conviction that citizens generally are due the rights of equal citizenship. Okin argues that when children are raised within unjust families, families that lack “equality and reciprocity” and are sites of “dependence and domination”, they are not likely to develop the requisite sense of justice (Okin 1989: 99–100; see also McClain 2006: 73–84). Instead, girls and boys may grow to believe that women are not entitled to equal citizenship. Therefore, if the society governed by Rawls’ two principles of justice is to be stable, families must be just.

So, Okin’s view is that the state may and should promote a particular ideal of family life. She tells us that the state should

encourage and facilitate the equal sharing by men and women of paid and unpaid work, or productive and reproductive labor. (1989: 171)

Okin discusses several measures that might contribute to ensuring that gender no longer forms “part of the social structure, whether inside or outside the family” (Okin 1989: 103), including state subsidized daycare, a legal entitlement to parental leave and flextime (1989: 176, 186), as well as autonomy-promoting public education for children (1989: 177). She also recommends protecting from vulnerability those women who do choose traditional roles by making them legally entitled to half of their spouse’s paycheck (1989: 181). While Okin argues that what is desired is a “future in which all will be likely to choose this mode of life” (1989: 171, my emphasis), the fact that many people currently don’t choose egalitarian family life is not, for Okin, a reason for the state to not take measures to promote it (1989: 172). At the same time, Okin does not endorse simply any and all state involvement; for example, while she thinks justice requires the 50-50 sharing of domestic work, she doesn’t recommend that the state enforce it (1989: 171) (on this issue, see Neufeld & van Schoelandt 2014: and Baehr 2017: 18–19). (There is a substantial literature on Okin’s use of Rawls’ theory of justice. See for example Abbey 2011; Reich & Satz 2009.)

Since Okin published these arguments (1989), a substantial literature has developed by other egalitarian-liberal feminists—more or less in the Rawlsian tradition—which argues that women’s shouldering a disproportionate share of the costs of social reproduction is unjust. (See for example: Alstott 2004; Baehr 2021; Barclay 2013; Bhandary 2019; Brighouse & Wright 2008; Eichner 2010; Engster 2001, 2010; Gheaus 2009, 2012; Gheaus & Robeyns 2011; Gornick & Meyers 2008; Lloyd 1995, 1998; Nussbaum 2006: 96–223; Robeyns 2007; Reiheld 2015; Schouten 2017, 2019; Stark 2021; Watson & Hartley 2018; and Wright 2008.) Okin’s claim that the state should promote a particular, substantive ideal of family life is a central matter for discussion in this literature. So, for example, while Lloyd and Alstott endorse many of Okin’s policy proposals (Lloyd 1995: 1332; 1998: 218; Alstott 2004), they reject her claim that the state should promote a particular substantive ideal of family life (Lloyd 1995: 1340–1341; Lloyd 1998: 218; McClain 2006: 78). Alstott writes:

The egalitarian family is, even in principle, a troubling ideal. Strictly equal sharing seems unduly constraining, not merely because families today deviate from the ideal, but because free people might want to organize their lives differently. (Alstott 2004: 113)

Other egalitarian-liberal feminists have voiced similar concerns. Ann Cudd worries that state action intended to promote gender fairness and foster women’s autonomy could impose a homogenizing conception of the good life and stifle the very reinventions of self and experiments in living that women’s liberation requires (Cudd 2006: 209, 223; see also Wolf-Devine 2004). Elizabeth Anderson writes:

The plurality of conceptions of the good that are likely to survive in a world in which the state has done all it can be reasonably and justly expected to do will include a host of unreasonable conceptions of the good, some of which may well be patriarchal. In the face of such injustices, liberals counsel feminists to redirect their claims from the state to those promulgating such unreasonable conceptions of the good, and to redirect their activism from a focus on state action to other domains, including civil society, churches, and the family. I think this counsel is wise, which is why I am a liberal feminist. (Anderson 2009: 131; see also 141–144)

Recent work by egalitarian-liberal feminists Lori Watson and Christie Hartley (2018) and Gina Schouten (2019), however, may be understood as responding to these concerns as it aims to establish that some state action to undermine the gendered division of labor and promote egalitarian family life is both reasonable and just.

The gendered division of labor allocates to women the work of providing care for individuals who cannot care for themselves or who require help doing so. A full accounting of justice in caregiving focuses not only on the fairness of the distribution of caregiving work but also on the needs of individuals who receive care. Some egalitarian-liberal feminist work includes this dual focus. Asha Bhandary argues that the whole “system of practices” through which care is given and received must be subject to liberal evaluation with an eye to both those who provide and those who receive care (Bhandary 2019: 71, quoting Rawls 1958: 169). Elizabeth Brake argues that doing so requires recognizing “the social bases of caring relationships [as] primary goods” (2012: 175). And Martha Nussbaum argues that liberal political theory must begin with a “political conception of the person [that] holds that human beings are vulnerable temporal creatures, both capable and needy” (Nussbaum 2006: 221). (See also the essays in Bhandary and Baehr (2021) on caregiving and liberalism).

Rawlsian political philosophy provides the framework for the bulk of egalitarian-liberal feminist writing on distributive justice. The focus of much of that writing has been to explore Rawlsian resources for criticizing the role gender has and continues to play in the basic structure of societies like the United States and to lay out what a gender just society might look like. However, as Nancy Holmstrom writes (in a rather different context),

a feminism concerned only with ending the oppression women based on gender would be a very limited version, far from the emancipatory vision at its core. (Holmstrom 2011: 137)

Thus we should note that although egalitarian-liberal feminists are egalitarian-liberals, and as such hold that the state should ensure that all individuals enjoy a decent standard of living, poverty has not been a major focus of much egalitarian-liberal feminist work (but see Bhandary 2019; Cudd 2006; Eichner 2010; Stark 2021; Watson & Hartley 2018: 167–168, 228–9). Nor has much egalitarian-liberal feminist work attended directly to the role race has played and continues to play in the basic structure of societies like the United States (but see Bhandary 2019; and Mills 2017).

1.2.2 Public Deliberation and Electoral Politics

Some egalitarian-liberal feminists who emphasize the importance of political autonomy—that women be co-authors of the conditions under which they live—focus in particular on participation in the processes of democratic self-determination. These processes include both political deliberation in the many arenas of public political discourse and electoral politics. Some egalitarian-liberal feminists hold that the conditions under which women live lack legitimacy because women are inadequately represented in these processes. They hold that this political autonomy deficit is, in large part, due to the “gender system” (Okin 1989: 89), that is, inherited patriarchal traditions and institutions, and that the women’s movement should work to identify and remedy it.

Attempts to increase women’s participation in public deliberation and electoral politics confront a vicious circle of women’s exclusion. The gender system leads to women’s being underrepresented in influential forums of public deliberation, including in elected law-making bodies. For example women have less free time to engage in public deliberation because of the double-burden of paid and unpaid labor; sex stereotyping leads many to think that women (especially women from particular ethnic and cultural groups) are less capable of leadership than men; the behavior called for in agonistic public deliberation and electoral politics is understood to be masculine; issues of particular interest to women are seen as personal and not political issues; and women lack power in the many institutions (like churches, universities, and think tanks) that influence political debate. But when women are underrepresented in these forums and law-making bodies, it is unlikely that the justice of the gender system will become the subject of public conversation or its dismantling a target of legislative action.

Some egalitarian-liberal feminists explore ways to escape this vicious circle. Because women are excluded from important forums of public deliberation and electoral politics in complex ways, remedies must address a variety of problems. Justice in the distribution of benefits and burdens in society would go some way towards enabling women to access forums of public debate on equal terms with men (Okin 1989: 104). But cultural change is necessary as well if stereotypes about women’s abilities are not to interfere with their participation, if women’s needs and interests are to be understood as legitimate claims on democratic power, and if men’s dominance in institutions of influence is to be overcome. Seyla Benhabib argues that the women’s movement, along with other new social movements like the gay and lesbian liberation movement, has begun this work (Benhabib 1992). While much of this change is cultural, the state has a role to play. Linda McClain argues that all children must receive civic education—to equip them for democratic citizenship—including instruction in women’s equality (McClain 2006: 81). She also argues that the state may use its persuasive power to put traditionally excluded issues, like violence against women or the dilemma of balancing work and family, on the agenda for public deliberation (2006: 78).

Others take on the vicious circle of women’s exclusion by recommending legal mechanisms for the inclusion of women in electoral politics (see Rhode 1994: 1205–1208; Phillips 1991). Some suggest that legal mechanisms for including those who have been systematically excluded may be justified as remedies for the unjust disproportionate political power enjoyed by others (Phillips 2004: 6–10). Suggested mechanisms include targets or quotas for women and other underrepresented groups on party slates, or proportional representation in elected bodies. Karen Green, for example, argues for “guaranteed equal representation of both sexes in parliament” (Green 2006). There is diversity of opinion, however, among egalitarian-liberal feminists about the justice and efficacy of such mechanisms (Rhode 1994: 1205; and Mansbridge 1997).

1.3 Justification

John Rawls distinguishes between what he calls comprehensive and political liberal doctrines (Rawls 1993). This distinction has been of interest to egalitarian-liberal feminist philosophers. (For explicit discussion of the distinction in liberal feminism, see for example Abbey 2007; 2011: 72–82, 226–247; Baehr 2008; 2013; Chambers 2008: 159–201; Enslin 2003; Lloyd 1998; Neufeld 2009; Neufeld & Schoelandt 2014; Nussbaum 1999b: 108; 2000b: 76 fn38; Okin 1994; 1999: 129–130; Watson & Hartley 2018.)

Comprehensive egalitarian-liberal feminisms are grounded in particular moral doctrines. As we have seen, egalitarian-liberal feminists typically claim that some social and institutional arrangements are unjust and that such arrangements should be remedied; some claim that state power is an appropriate tool for such remediation. For example, and as we have seen, egalitarian-liberal feminists argue that families should foster women’s and girls’ personal autonomy and that domestic associations should distribute benefits and burdens fairly; and, as we have seen, some argue that state power may and should be used to these ends. Comprehensive egalitarian-liberal feminisms ground such claims in particular moral doctrines.

Among comprehensive liberal feminists we may count Jean Hampton, Carol Hay, Drucilla Cornell, Ann Cudd, Susan Okin, and Clare Chambers. Kantian moral theory serves as a foundation for Hampton’s feminist contractualist account of justice in personal relationships (Hampton 1993: 241; see Abbey 2011: 120–151) (see §1.1.2) and for Hay’s liberal feminist theory of oppression (Hay 2013), as well as for Cornell’s psychoanalytically informed liberal feminism that focuses on the right to intimate and sexual self-determination (Cornell 1998: 17–18; 2003; see also Thurschwell 1999: 771–772). Cudd explains that her liberal feminist account of oppression as harm is grounded in a “background moral theory”, namely

a liberal contractarian view of the sort developed by John Rawls in A Theory of Justice, or the more libertarian version of David Gauthier in Morals by Agreement. (Cudd 2006: 231)

Okin’s liberal feminism draws on Rawls’ A Theory of Justice, which Rawls himself claims is a comprehensive liberalism (Okin 1999: 129; Rawls 1993: xvii). (But note that Okin claims hers is “in between” comprehensive and political liberalism (Okin 1999: 129–130).) Chambers’ liberal feminism—which explores the relationship between social construction and choice—may also be counted among comprehensive liberal feminisms as it is grounded in personal autonomy as a moral value (Chambers 2008).

Political liberal feminisms are accounts of how state power may and should be used to feminist ends that are grounded in public political values. Public political values are not the particular values of any one moral doctrine; they are values that are shared by the many reasonable comprehensive moral doctrines citizens hold (Rawls 1993: 227–230). Advocates of political liberal feminism hold that state power is used justly when supported by values that are endorsable by all reasonable citizens.

Among political liberal feminists we may count S.A. Lloyd, Linda McClain, Martha Nussbaum, Gina Schouten, Christie Hartley, Lori Watson, and Amy Baehr. Lloyd constructs an argument based on public political values to the conclusion that “women’s disproportionate burden in social reproduction [must] be eliminated” (Lloyd 1998: 214). McClain argues that sex equality is a public and constitutional value (2006: 60; see also 22–23, 60–62, and 76) which requires state opposition to relations of subordination and domination in the family (2006: 62); state support for autonomy in intimate matters (2006: 22); and support for the development of autonomy capacities in children, especially girls (2006: 109). Nussbaum (see §1.1.3) also presents her “capabilities approach” as a political, and not a comprehensive, liberalism. The capabilities list, Nussbaum argues, can be shared by citizens holding a wide variety of comprehensive conceptions of the good life, and thus should be able to function as a foundation for a political liberalism (Nussbaum 2000b: 76 fn38). Schouten argues that the political liberal value of reciprocity undergirds state measures to alleviate the gendered division of labor (Schouten 2019). And Watson and Hartley argue that public deliberation based on shared values is incompatible with “pervasive social hierarchies” (Hartley & Watson 2010: 8; see also Watson & Hartley 2018). As Watson puts it,

a central task of public reason arguments, in the context of social hierarchy and inequality, is to expose the ways in which background conditions (inequalities) undermine the necessary conditions for reasonable deliberations among citizens to occur. (Watson 2007: 470)

Political liberal feminists suggest some advantages of political liberal over comprehensive liberal feminism. According to S.A. Lloyd,

it’s true that confining the argument to talk of socially recognized values requires operating with one hand tied behind one’s back, so to speak. Conclusions that would be quite easy to reach from stronger feminist principles, or other comprehensive principles, are much harder to reach using the sparse … toolbox [of public reason]. (Lloyd 1998: 210)

But if we can reach feminist conclusions on these sparse grounds, they will be much more difficult to reject. Amy Baehr suggests that arguments to feminist ends from public political values can move the political community toward a more reasonable understanding of those values (Baehr 2013; see also Rawls 1993: 227). Comprehensive liberal feminists, in turn, worry that the public political values on which feminist political liberalism must rely render the latter insufficiently critical of precisely those hierarchies and forms of disadvantage egalitarian liberal feminism aims to criticize and undermine (Abbey 2007; Baehr 1996; Chambers 2008: 12, 159–201; Enslin 2003; Hay 2013: 34–39; Okin 1994; see also Munoz-Darde 1998: 347).

1.4 Criticism

Egalitarian-liberal feminism has been subject to a variety of criticisms. Addressing some of these criticisms is a focus of some egalitarian-liberal feminist work.

Some reject egalitarian-liberal feminism because, they argue, feminist theory must rely on a much more robust feminist ideal of the good life than egalitarian-liberal feminism is able to provide (Yuracko 2003; Jaggar 1983). Some argue that liberalism’s focus on the individual renders it unable to adequately conceptualize injustice to groups (I. Young 1990: 18). Some argue that liberalism’s focus on distribution neglects relations of power (I. Young 1990: 37) and the eroticization of domination and subordination (MacKinnon 1987; 1989) which are the true linchpins of the gender system. Lori Watson and Christie Hartley’s recent feminist political liberal work may be profitably read as a response to worries like these as it aims to show how feminist political liberalism can conceptualize injustice to groups as a matter of relations of domination and subordination (Watson & Hartley 2018).

Critics have focused on the role played by ideals in liberal political philosophy, especially in Rawlsian liberalism. For example, Lisa Schwartzman argues that Rawls’ ideal of the fully just society obscures race and sex as “social markers of inequality” (Schwartzman 2006: 59). Charles Mills argues that a focus on dismantling an “existing unjust basic structure” requires a shift from

ideal theory [which] asks what justice demands in a perfectly just society…[to] non-ideal theory [which] asks what justice demands in a society with a history of injustice. (Mills 2017: 34; see also Pateman & Mills 2007; but compare Mills 2017: 201–215)

Egalitarian liberal feminist Asha Bhandary addresses these concerns by developing what she calls a “two-level contract theory” which is attentive to non-ideal contexts (Bhandary 2019).

Some are concerned that egalitarian-liberal feminist embrace of the ideal of the egalitarian family effectively elevates one particular comprehensive conception of the good life over the many others found in multicultural societies and across the globe (Shachar 2009; for discussion see Okin 1999 and Khader 2011). As we have seen (§1.2.1) some egalitarian-liberal feminists eschew the ideal of the egalitarian family and thus avoid this criticism. Some argue that an egalitarian-liberal feminism that holds that women’s independence and self-sufficiency are central feminist ideals fails to recognize many relational goods on which many women depend for their well-being, and thus a women’s movement guided by such an ideal may harm many of the very women it aims to benefit (Khader 2018). Care ethicists also raise a concern about an egalitarian-liberal feminism for which independence and self-sufficiency are central ideals. They argue that centering such ideals obscures the fact that human beings come into the world dependent upon others and that many are dependent on others throughout their lives; this, in turn, obscures the value of being cared for and the role that caregiving plays in a good society (Held 1987, 2006b; Kittay 1999). Conceptualizing personal autonomy as relational, and thus downplaying independence and self-sufficiency, has been a focus of some recent egalitarian liberal feminist work (see the end of §1.1.1; see also the essays in Bhandary and Baehr (2021).)

Egalitarian-liberal feminism has been subject to socialist feminist critique. Nancy Fraser, for example, has issued a “provocation” by “contending that feminism has entered a dangerous liaison with neoliberalism”, that is, with political forces that promote largely unfettered capitalism (Fraser 2013: 14, see also 209–226). Arruzza, Bhattacharya and Fraser argue that a non-elite feminism, a “feminism for the 99%”, must eschew such a liaison (Arruzza, Bhattacharya, & Fraser 2019; see also Holmstrom 2011). Egalitarian-liberal feminists have not focused a great deal of attention on capitalism. But as some egalitarian-liberals embrace “liberal socialism”, it is not clear that egalitarian-liberal feminism couldn’t do the same (Rawls 2001: 138; see also Edmundson 2017; Baehr 2017: 10–12; Robeyns 2012; and Stark 2021).

Conservative critics of egalitarian-liberal feminism argue that reformers can do more harm than good when they undermine the institutions and norms which, while surely offending in many ways, also serve as the foundation for many people’s well-being (Muller 1997a; see also Fox-Genovese 1996). Such conservatives worry about the radical implications of egalitarian-liberal feminism, its willingness to put women’s autonomy ahead of institutions and norms on which, they believe, many people rely for their well-being. While Ann Cudd suggests that the expansion of opportunity and equality promised by liberal feminism “makes us all better off” (Cudd 2006: 237), conservatives encourage us to consider also the loss that is in liberation.

Classical-liberal critics of egalitarian-liberal feminism argue that

the very arguments that rightly led to the legal reforms affecting the status of women during the 19th century militate against the demands for reform from the late 20th century women’s movement. (Epstein 2002: 30; see also Tomasi 2009)

That is, they hold that the defense of equal rights and independence for women promulgated by these early feminists is incompatible with the tendency of the contemporary women’s movement to call on the state to improve the lives of women (see §2).

2. Classical-Liberal Feminism

In this article the term classical-liberal feminism is used for a family of doctrines that range from libertarian feminist doctrines that endorse very little (if any) state power to doctrines that endorse more, yet still limited state power, largely unfettered markets, and an expansive understanding of individual rights. The doctrines in this family share the following. They conceive of freedom as freedom from coercive interference; they hold that women, as well as men, have a right to freedom from coercive interference due to their status as self-owners; and they hold that coercive state power is justified only to the extent necessary to protect the right to freedom from coercive interference. Equity feminists are classical-liberal feminists who hold that, in societies like the United States, the only morally significant source of oppression of women is the state. They hold that feminism’s political role is to bring an end to laws that limit women’s freedom in particular, but also to laws that grant special privileges to women. Some equity feminists see a nonpolitical role for feminism, helping women to benefit from their freedom by developing beneficial character traits or strategies for success, or navigating among their increasing options. Other equity feminists are socially conservative and argue that, while the state should not enforce them, traditional values function as bulwarks against state power and produce independent and self-restraining citizens. Cultural libertarian feminists are classical-liberal feminists who hold that the culture of societies like the United States is patriarchal and a significant source of oppression of women. They hold that the patriarchal culture and the state are complementary systems of oppression. Cultural libertarian feminists hold that much of the oppression women suffer today is noncoercive, however, and thus should not be met with state remedies but with a nonviolent movement for feminist social change.

Classical-liberal feminists understand themselves as heirs to the first generation of feminist political philosophers, for example Mary Wollstonecraft, Harriet Taylor Mill, and John Stuart Mill (Taylor 1992: 25–39); the first generation of feminist political reformers in the United States, for example the abolitionist feminists Elizabeth Cady Stanton and Sarah Grimke (McElroy 2002a: 6–7)); and the tradition of 19th century anarchist feminism which includes figures such as Voltairine de Cleyre (McElroy 2002a: 8; Presley 2000; Presley & Sartwell 2005). Equity feminists (see §2.2.1) stress the extent to which these early thinkers and activists identify women’s liberation with equal respect for women’s right against coercive interference (Stolba & Furchtgott-Roth 2001: 1–2). Cultural libertarian feminists (see §2.3) emphasize the extent to which these thinkers and activists challenged both coercive state power and the patriarchal culture (Presley 2000; Long & Johnson 2005—see Other Internet Resources).

2.1 Self-Ownership and Women’s Rights

Classical liberalism holds that women and men are self-owners capable of acquiring property rights over things. As such women and men, equally, have the right to freedom from coercive interference with their person and property. This right to freedom from coercive interference consists in, at least, rights to freedom of conscience and expression, freedom to control what happens to one’s body, freedom of association, freedom to acquire, control and transfer property, freedom of contract, as well as the right to compensation when rights are violated. The state’s role is, exclusively, to protect citizens from coercive interference by protecting their rights. Some reject even a limited state, however, holding that nongovernmental means of protecting rights are to be preferred.

Classical-liberal feminists hold that the right to freedom from coercive interference has powerful implications for women’s lives. It implies that women have the right to freedom in intimate, sexual and reproductive matters. This includes sexual autonomy (the right to engage in sexual activity of one’s choosing including the buying and selling of sex (Almodovar 2002; Lehrman 1997: 23), and the right to defend oneself against sexual aggression, including the use of firearms (Stevens, Teufel, & Biscan 2002)); freedom of expression (the right to appear in, publish, and consume pornography free of censorship (McElroy 1995; Strossen 2000)); freedom of intimate association (the right to partner or enter into a private marriage contract (McElroy 1991a: 20)); and reproductive freedom (the right to use birth control, have an abortion (on the minority of pro-life libertarians see Tabarrok 2002: 157), and buy and sell bodily reproductive services, for example as in surrogate motherhood (Lehrman 1997: 22; McElroy 2002c; Paul 2002)). Freedom from interference with person and property also means that women have the right to engage in economic activity, entering contracts, and acquiring, controlling and transferring property free of sexist state limits (Epstein 2002; Kirp, Yudof, & Franks 1986: 204).

One way to characterize the wrong involved when states fail to recognize these rights of women is as a failure to respect women’s right to be treated as men’s equal, or the right to equal treatment under the law. To be sure, classical-liberal feminists hold that the law should not treat women and men differently. But this is because they believe everyone has the same rights, not because they believe women have a right to be treated the same as men. This is clear when we note that, for classical-liberal feminism, equal treatment under unjust law is not justice (McElroy 1991a: 3).

Same treatment under the law does not guarantee same outcomes. Classical-liberal feminists hold that women’s rights are not violated when citizens exercise their rights in ways that create unequal outcomes (Epstein 2002: 30). A woman’s rights are violated only when she is interfered with coercively, that is, when there is, or is a threat of, forced loss of freedom, property or life (which does not serve as just restraint or compensation).

2.2 Equity Feminism

Equity feminism is a form of classical-liberal feminism that holds that feminism’s political role is simply to ensure that everyone’s, including women’s, right against coercive interference is respected (Sommers 1994: 22). Wendy McElroy, an equity feminist writes:

I’ve always maintained that the only reason I call myself a feminist is because of [the] gov[ernment]. By which I mean, if the government (or an anarchist defense assoc[iation]) acknowledged the full equal rights of women without paternalistic protection or oppression, I would stop writing about women’s issues. (McElroy 1998c—see Other Internet Resources)

Feminism’s political role involves assuring that women’s right against coercive interference by private individuals is recognized and protected by the state (for example women’s right against groping on the street or rape within marriage (McElroy 1991b)), and that women’s right against coercive interference by the state itself is respected. The latter means feminists should object to laws that restrict women’s liberty in particular (for example laws that limit women’s employment options (Taylor 1992: 228)), and laws that protect women in particular (for example laws granting preferential treatment to women (Paul 1989)). Equity feminists suggest that this has been largely accomplished in countries like the United States. Joan Kennedy Taylor explains: feminism’s “goal of equal political liberty for women has been pretty much reached in the United States” (Taylor 2001; see also Sommers 1994: 274).

2.2.1 Equity Feminism on the Oppression of Women

On the equity feminist view, the feminist slogan “the personal is political” is accurate when the state fails to recognize women’s right against coercive interference, especially in women’s personal lives. So, for example, in some countries husbands have legal control over their wives’ persons and property. (Some equity feminists argue that the women’s movement in Western countries should not hesitate to criticize countries in which this occurs (Sommers 2007).) But in countries like the United States, where the right of women against this sort of coercive interference is recognized and protected by law, equity feminists hold that “the personal is no longer political” (Lehrman 1997: 5; see also 21).

If an individual or group of individuals suffers sustained and systematic denial of their rights, on the equity feminist view, we may call them oppressed. Women were oppressed in the United States during most of its first two centuries; people of African descent were oppressed before the dismantling of Jim Crow laws. While the culture of the United States supported this denial of rights, equity feminists hold that the oppressor was the state (McElroy 1998cc—see Other Internet Resources), which refused to recognize and protect the right of women and people of African descent to treatment as self-owners. When the state recognizes and protects this right of women and Americans of African descent, they are no longer oppressed, even if the culture disadvantages them. So, for example, in a discussion of whether Muslim women are oppressed, Cathy Young focuses on whether women’s conformity with a religious tradition that subordinates them is enforced by law. If it is, then women are oppressed (C. Young 2006).

If women are to be described as currently oppressed in societies like the United States, on the equity feminist view, one must show that the state fails to protect women, as a group, from sustained and systematic rights violations. Some feminists have argued that violence against women is pervasive in societies like the United States so that, even though the law recognizes women’s right against it, that right is insufficiently protected and thus women endure sustained and systematic denial of their right to bodily integrity (Dworkin 1991). Equity feminists endeavor to refute this claim by showing that the prevalence of violence against women has been exaggerated. For example Rita Simon contests the claim that as many as 154 out of 1,000 women have been raped. On her accounting, the number is closer to 19 per 1,000; and “rape is less common than other violent crimes” (Simon 2002: 235). In addition, she claims, “the criminal justice system does not ignore or make light of crimes against females” (2002: 236). Katie Roiphe argues that date rape is not a significant threat to women (Roiphe 1994). Concurring with Roiphe, Cathy Young writes:

women have sex after initial reluctance for a number of reasons.… [F]ear of being beaten up by their dates is rarely reported as one of them. (C. Young 1992)

Women have also been said to be oppressed because their right to be treated the same as men by employers, educational institutions, and associations has been violated in a sustained and systematic way. That is, some argue, women have been regularly denied the right to equal access to opportunities because they are women. Equity feminists generally hold that no rights are violated when employers, educational institutions, public accommodations or associations discriminate against women. Nonetheless, equity feminists argue that discrimination against women is not a serious problem. Diana Furchtgott-Roth and Christine Stolba argue that “complaints about systematic economic discrimination against women simply do not square with the evidence” (Stolba & Furchtgott-Roth 1999: xi; see also 2001). They argue that “women’s wages and education levels are closing the gap with those of men” (1999: xii). In addition, Stolba and Furchtgott-Roth claim that women have “surpassed men in education” (23; see also 23–43). Christina Hoff Sommers concurs, arguing that, rather than failing to provide girls with an education equal to that of boys, our current educational system disproportionately benefits girls (Sommers 2000: 20–23, 178).

Equity feminists argue that the differences in outcomes between women and men can be explained, not by violence against women and sex discrimination, but by differences in the preferences of women and men (Epstein 2002: 33; Stolba & Furchtgott-Roth 1999: xii). “In many cases where women remain behind men, personal choices explain outcomes more readily than does overt discrimination” (Stolba & Furchtgott-Roth 1999: xii). To be sure, classical-liberal feminists hold that women and men are sufficiently the same that they have the “same political interests”, in particular the interest in being treated as a self-owner (McElroy 2002a: 14–15). But, for some equity feminists, biological differences between the sexes largely explain the sex segregation in the workplace and in family roles still common in countries like the United States (Epstein 2002; Lehrman 1997: 5, 31).

Other equity feminists think biological sex differences alone do not explain this phenomenon (C. Young 2004). Women’s preferences may reflect the effects of socialization or incentives: for example women may be socialized to prefer stereotypically female roles, or the rewards associated with such roles for women may provide motivation for women to take them up. But equity feminists hold that, because women are not legally required, or actually forced in some other way, to choose traditional roles, their choices are not coerced and thus state remedies are inappropriate. On the equity feminist view, a law prohibiting women from becoming surgeons is coercive because it constitutes a threat of loss of liberty or property. But if one is socialized to prefer stay-at-home motherhood, or one discovers that one prefers to stay home with children given the other real options, one may still choose to become a surgeon without risking loss of liberty or property. As Stolba and Furchtgott-Roth put it (using the word “prevents” in a very strong sense): “Nothing prevents women from choosing the surgical specialty” (Stolba & Furchtgott-Roth 1999: 60; my emphasis).

2.2.2 Feminism’s Nonpolitical Role

While equity feminists hold that feminism’s political task—securing for women the right to freedom from coercive interference—is nearly completed, some equity feminists believe that feminism has a nonpolitical role to play in women’s personal lives. In its nonpolitical role, feminism can help women to develop character traits and strategies that will help them benefit from their freedom; and it can help women to navigate personally among their increasing options.

Karen Lehrman writes:

Men have typically held title to quite a few traits that women can now put to good use. In addition to ambition, assertiveness, and independence, there’s also decisiveness. (Lehrman 1997: 33; see also 62)

Other character traits emphasized by equity feminists include “self-confidence” (Stevens et al. 2002: 255), being able to think and argue independently (McElroy 1998a), and taking responsibility for oneself (Taylor 1992: 86). Some equity feminists suggest that feminism offers individual women and men the opportunity for freedom from conformity with sex roles (Lehrman 1997: 6; Taylor 1992: 23–24).

Equity feminists recommend strategies for success for women in education and employment as alternatives to state regulation. In male dominated fields, for example, equity feminists recommend that women mentor one another or organize supportive associations, making use of the techniques of 1960’s feminism like consciousness-raising (Taylor 1992: 100–101). Some recommend that, instead of being ambivalent about work outside of the home, women should “lean in” to it (Sandberg 2013). In What You Can Do About Sexual Harassment When You Don’t Want to Call the Cops, Joan Kennedy Taylor argues that women can avoid sexual harassment or lessen its impact if they learn to diffuse conflicts with men and understand the role of sexual banter in male culture (Taylor 1999). Equity feminists also recommend that women make full use of their right to contract by turning their preferences—for example the preference for being paid and/or promoted on the basis of one’s job performance and not on the basis of sexual favors—into rights through contract (Epstein 2002: 40; Taylor 1992: 169).

Some equity feminists stress that women need not give up their gender difference to benefit from their freedom (Lehrman 1997: 198). As Karen Lehrman writes, “completing the feminist revolution…primarily involves [women] completing their own personal evolutions” (1997: 35). Lehrman quotes Elizabeth Cady Stanton:

the strongest reason for giving woman … a complete emancipation from all forms of bondage of custom, dependence, superstition … is the solitude and personal responsibility of her own individual life. (1997: 201, quoting “The Solitude of Self” [1892])

An important part of this individual life, on Lehrman’s view, is navigating among sexual difference and sameness in the personal construction of a satisfying life.

2.2.3 Socially Conservative Equity Feminism

Some equity feminists are socially conservative (Morse 2001; Sommers 2000). To be sure, equity feminism as described here is a form of classical-liberalism. As such it involves the claim that traditional values should not be imposed on citizens by the state. For example, the state should not tax citizens to support institutions that promote traditional values; nor should the criminal or civil law create incentives for adherence to such values. But some equity feminists hold that it is best when citizens voluntarily adhere to traditional values. They hold that widespread voluntary adherence to traditional values is conducive to well-being in society because traditional values make possible the reproduction of independent and “self-restraining citizens” who are “the basis of free institutions, both economic and political” (Morse 2001: 161).

Socially conservative equity feminists do not take the classical liberal theory of the limits of state power to imply endorsement of a libertine cultural ethos. So, for example, while socially conservative equity feminists hold that the state should not force citizens to accept traditional family forms (because individuals have a right against such coercive interference), they hold that society should strongly discourage disfavored ways of life and encourage favored ones through noncoercive, nonstate means. Socially conservative equity feminists hold that when feminism strays from its political role of assuring equal rights and ventures into women’s personal lives it tends to discourage in women the kinds of delayed gratification and self-sacrifice on which vital social institutions, like the family, depend (Morse 2001: 133).

To be sure, there are political conservatives who take equity feminism’s claim that women and men should be treated the same by the law as a rule of thumb. Elizabeth Fox-Genovese is an example of such a political conservative (Fox-Genovese 1991; 1996). The difference between political conservatives who embrace the equity feminist account of women’s equality and socially conservative equity feminists is that the former endorse the use of state power to promote traditional values while the latter do not. Also, socially conservative equity feminists hold that individuals’ political rights derive from their status as self-owners (Morse 2001: 57) while political conservatives hold that citizens’ political rights derive from their status as members of communities (Fox-Genovese 1991: 9). In contemporary popular political discourse it is often hard to distinguish these two, as they are in political coalition. To appeal to both classical liberal and socially conservative constituencies, on occasion theorists help themselves to a bit of both traditions. For example, Jennifer Roback Morse identifies herself as a libertarian: “When the topic is the proper relationship between the individual and the state, libertarianism is pretty much the right path” (Morse 2001: 4). But she also makes the un-libertarian and politically conservative recommendation that the state should intervene in personal relationships by making it “costly to divorce” (2001: 164, see also 104, 111).

2.3 Cultural Libertarian Feminism

Cultural libertarianism is a form of classical liberalism that is

concerned about constraints on individual freedom from government as well as from traditionalist familial, religious, and community institutions—the same civil institutions that conservatives see as necessary for ordered liberty to thrive. (C. Young 2007)

Cultural libertarian feminism holds that these institutions reflect the patriarchal nature of society and oppress women. Thus cultural libertarian feminism recognizes sources of women’s oppression other than the state (Presley 2000; Long & Johnson 2005—see Other Internet Resources). As Charles Johnson and Roderick Long put it, patriarchal culture and the state are “interlocking systems of oppression” (Long & Johnson 2005—see Other Internet Resources), both of which should be opposed by feminists. They explain:

There is nothing inconsistent or un-libertarian in holding that women’s choices under patriarchal social structures can be sufficiently “voluntary,” in the libertarian sense, to be entitled to immunity from coercive legislative interference, while at the same time being sufficiently “involuntary,” in a broader sense, to be recognized as morally problematic and as a legitimate target of social activism. (Long & Johnson 2005—see Other Internet Resources).

Calling this view “anarchist feminism”, Sharon Presley writes: “What the anarchist feminists are calling for is a radical restructuring of society, both in its public and private institutions” (Presley 2000). Such feminists hold that much of the oppression women currently suffer is noncoercive, however. Laws against prostitution are coercive—the state can put a violator in jail or force her to pay a fine. But on the cultural libertarian feminist view much of the pressure to conform to gender roles is not coercive. Noncoercive oppression can be resisted, although it is often not easy to do so. Cultural libertarian feminists hold that noncoercive oppression should not be remedied by the state (see also Tomasi 2009). As Presley and Kinsky explain, on the cultural libertarian view, to try to remedy the noncoercive oppression of women with coercive state action “just changes the sort of oppression, not the fact” (Presley & Kinsky 1991: 78). This oppression should be opposed by a nonviolent movement for feminist social change.

Cultural libertarian feminists target the patriarchal culture by, for example, developing in individuals (especially women) the ability to be independent. This involves enabling individuals to resist authority and think for themselves (Presley 2001). Cultural libertarian feminists also recommend the development of more deeply consensual relationships and institutions (Heckert 2004—see Other Internet Resources), relationships and institutions in which there is an equality of authority (Long 2001—see Other Internet Resources). While some equity feminists (see §1.2) would applaud this work, they would call it “personal”, reserving the term “political” for the work of securing for women their right against coercive interference. Equity feminist Wendy McElroy writes:

I understand that there is a cultural form of feminism and many women would still fight for improved prestige or status, and I wouldn’t criticis[e] them for doing so. It just wouldn’t grip me. Guess I’m a political animal after all. (McElroy 1998c—see Other Internet Resources)

But cultural libertarian feminists consider this work to be an integral part of a larger political struggle for women’s freedom.

2.4 Anti-Discrimination Law and Preferential Treatment

Classical-liberal feminism requires same treatment of women and men under just law. This means that sex discrimination by the state, for example when the state functions as an employer, is impermissible (Block 1991: 102; Epstein 2002: 34; Warnick 2003: 1608). But classical-liberal feminists oppose laws that prohibit discrimination against women by nonstate actors, for example in employment, education, public accommodations, or associations (McElroy 1991b: 22–23; Epstein 2002). They hold that the interaction of citizens should be subject to state control only to the extent necessary to protect citizens’ right against coercive interference. Businesses violate citizens’ right against coercive interference if they steal from their customers or employees; associations violate it if they extort their members; colleges violate it if they kidnap students. But businesses do not violate this right if they refuse to do business with women, pay women less for the same work, or create a working environment that is hostile to them because of their sex. Private educational institutions do not violate this right if they refuse to educate girls or women, offer them an inferior education, or create a learning environment that is hostile to them because of their sex. Business and professional associations do not violate this right if they refuse to admit women as members or make them feel unwelcome because of their sex.

Classical-liberal feminism, as described here, clearly implies rejection of the legal prohibition against private discrimination in employment, education, public accommodations, and associations. But in the literature one finds a range of views. Some categorically reject any legal protection against private discrimination (Taylor 1992: 62). Others accept basic protections such as those afforded in U.S. law by the Equal Pay Act of 1963, Title VII of the Civil Rights Act of 1964, and Title IX of the Educational Amendments of 1972; but reject more robust protections, such as non-remedial affirmative action or comparable worth (Stolba & Furchtgott-Roth 2001: 179; see also 107–108).

Classical-liberal feminism holds that private businesses, educational institutions, and associations are free to give or withhold preferential treatment to women. But the state may not treat women preferentially because the state must treat citizens the same regardless of sex. Nor may the state require that private businesses, educational institutions, or associations treat women preferentially. This is because, on the classical-liberal feminist view, failure to treat women preferentially is not a violation of anyone’s right against coercive interference. Examples of preferential treatment under the law, which classical-liberal feminists oppose, include affirmative action in employment and education (Lehrman 1997: 25), comparable worth (Paul 1989) and advantages for women in the legal treatment of custody and domestic violence (Simon 2002).

While classical-liberal feminists resist state remedies for private discrimination against women, they also hold that such discrimination is not currently a serious problem in countries like the United States. In addition, they argue,

even where discrimination may exist, we find little, if any, evidence that expanded government intervention would serve any useful purpose. (Stolba & Furchtgott-Roth 1999: xii)

and speculate that freer markets would make whatever discrimination currently takes place even more rare (McElroy 2002b, 187).

2.5 Justification

Much of the classical-liberal feminist literature, especially the equity feminist literature, is written for public policy and popular audiences, so emphasis is on policy implications rather than philosophical justifications. Nonetheless, we find in the literature a variety of justifications, some consequentialist and some non-consequentialist.

The most common justification offered in the classical-liberal feminist literature is consequentialist. This argument says that the political arrangements recommended by classical-liberalism, as compared with the alternatives, will provide women with more of what is good for them: for example safety, income and wealth, and options. Liberalizing guns laws will make women safer (Stevens, et al. 2002); legalizing prostitution and pornography will improve the lives of women in those trades (Almodovar 2002; Strossen 2000) and open opportunities for others; freer markets will root out discrimination against women and stimulate the proliferation of amenities essential to working women, like daycare centers (Epstein 2002: 33; Paul 2002: 208–209; Stolba & Furchtgott-Roth 2001: 124, 180; Conway 1998). Indeed, some argue that liberalizing the market will release such an “explosion of prosperity” that women will not need help from a welfare state (Long 1997—see Other Internet Resources).

A variety of non-consequentialist arguments are offered as well. Kirp, Yudof, and Franks, for example, refer to Kant’s categorical imperative and claim that treating individuals as self-owners is what is meant by treating individuals as ends in themselves ((Kirp, et al. 1986: 13–14). Wendy McElroy grounds her thought in the natural law tradition (McElroy 1998b). Some imply a perfectionist justification according to which the perfection of the human being requires being treated as a self-owner (Presley 2001).

2.6 Criticism

Some criticism of classical-liberal feminism addresses the consequentialist argument offered in support of classical-liberal feminism. The consequentialist argument says that the political arrangements recommended by classical-liberalism, as compared with the alternatives, will provide women with more of what is good for them (see §2.5). Following Ashlie Warnick, we can distinguish the claim that particular liberty-restricting policies are bad for women (and that some liberty-enhancing policies are good for women) from the claim that all liberty-restricting policies harm women, or that a minimal state (or no state) would be better for women overall (Warnick 2003). It is surely possible to cite liberty-restricting policies that are bad for women—laws limiting women’s employment options—and thus to cite liberty-enhancing policies that are good for women—not having such laws. But it is also possible to cite liberty-restricting policies that are good for women—for example the legal prohibition against sex discrimination in employment, education, and public accommodations (which classical-liberal feminists recommend dismantling (see §2.4)). Of course, if sex discrimination is rare, as some classical-liberal feminists contend (see §2.2.1), laws prohibiting it will not produce much benefit. But, as egalitarian-liberal feminists Deborah Rhode and Ann Cudd argue, sex discrimination remains a significant problem (Rhode 1997: 156; Cudd 2006: 140–142). Think also of the classical-liberal feminist recommendation that women and men be treated exactly the same by the state (see §2.1 and §2.4). While different treatment can stigmatize and entrench stereotypes, same treatment can disadvantage women if they are not similarly situated to men—which, arguably, is the case (Minow 1990). So the larger case—that all liberty-restricting policies harm women, or that a minimal state (or no state) would be better for women overall—has not been made convincingly (Warnick 2003). Another concern about the larger case is that much of the support offered is speculative, for example Roderick Long’s assertion that “the explosion of prosperity” classical liberal arrangements would bring about ”would go a long way toward providing women with an economic safety net more effective than any government welfare program” (Long 1997—see Other Internet Resources).

Some criticism addresses non-consequentialist arguments for classical-liberal feminism. These arguments say that, regardless of the consequences, women and men should be treated as self-owners with rights to property justly acquired and to freedom from coercive interference because this is what they deserve as ends in themselves, because this is what insight into natural law teaches, or because this is what their perfection requires (see §2.5). Critics contend that even if we concede the relevant classical-liberal premises—that women and men should be treated in ways they deserve as ends in themselves, or as natural law teaches, or in ways their perfection requires—it does not follow that the state should treat individuals merely as self-owners entitled only to property justly acquired and freedom from coercive interference. For example, egalitarian-liberal feminism suggests that treating individuals as ends in themselves requires legal measures to protect women’s personal and political autonomy—measures such as anti-discrimination law, workplace changes to accommodate caregiving responsibilities, and adequate material means (see §1.1.4 and §1.2.1). Since classical-liberal feminism rejects such measures, egalitarian-liberal feminism suggests that it fails to treat women as ends in themselves. Also, that treating individuals as ends in themselves means treating them as entitled merely to protection from coercive interference is plausible only if one ignores the fact of human dependency. By the fact of human dependency is meant the fact that all human beings are utterly dependent on the caregiving of others for many years at the start of life, that many come to need the caregiving of others due to temporary or permanent disability later in life, and that many require caregiving when they become infirm at the end of life; and also, that those who provide caregiving for those who cannot care for themselves become dependent on others for support (Kittay 1995: 10). If human beings are dependent in these ways, then treating them as ends in themselves will, at least for some of the time, mean something other than merely leaving them alone. Failure to recognize this suggests that classical-liberal feminism assumes that there is a nonpolitical “realm of private life in which the reproductive and nurturant needs of human beings are taken care of” (Okin 1989: 75). Such an assumption makes it impossible to evaluate the justice of the arrangements under which caregiving is given and received and removes from our consideration the nature of obligations to, and entitlements of, members of society who require caregiving to survive and thrive. Some worry that one form of classical liberalism—libertarianism—seriously misunderstands the political relevance of caregiving because it construes one key caregiving arrangement, the parent-child relationship, as one of ownership (see Okin 1989: 80–85; see also Nozick 1974; Andersson 2007; and Jeske 1996). As Jennifer Roback Morse, herself a libertarian puts it: ”I think it is well to admit… that our inattention to family life and community responsibility has left libertarians open to the charge that we do not care very much about these matters” (Morse 2001: 28).


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