First published Thu Sep 5, 2002; substantive revision Mon Aug 7, 2023

Libertarianism is a family of views in political philosophy. Libertarians take individual freedom as the paramount political value and understand coercion to be the antithesis of that freedom. While people can justifiably be forced to do certain things—most obviously, to refrain from infringing the liberty of others—they cannot be coerced to serve the good of other members of society, nor even their own personal good.

Within philosophical debates over justice, libertarian positions are most controversial in the realm of distributive justice. In this context, libertarians typically endorse something like a free-market economy—an economic order based on private property rights, freedom of contract, and voluntary cooperation. Libertarians usually regard contemporary democratic states’ redistribution of wealth as an unjustified use of coercion that violates the rights of individuals. The same is true of many forms of economic regulation. Just as people have strong rights to individual freedom in their personal and social affairs, libertarians argue, they also have strong rights to freedom in their economic affairs. Thus, rights of freedom of contract and exchange, freedom of occupation, and private property are taken as seriously as rights to choose who to be friends with, what kind of clothes to wear, and which religion to follow, and so forth.

In respect to justice, libertarian theory inherits a political morality from the classical (or proto-) liberal tradition, embodied by John Locke, David Hume, Adam Smith, and Immanuel Kant. These authors regard the moral function of the state to be the enforcement of a system of rights that facilitate socioeconomic cooperation, and little else. Moreover, it inherits a political sociology from the radical—individualist anarchist—side of the liberal tradition associated with Benjamin Tucker, Thomas Hodgskin, and Lysander Spooner. On their view, state action even when seemingly well-intentioned, is largely an outcome of, or heavily conditioned by, the dynamics of class. In its strongest form, this view takes the state to be the vehicle by which a dominant class uses coercion to plunder the rest of society (an idea that was heavily drawn upon, and altered, by Karl Marx).

Those engaged in marrying the contemporary libertarian approaches to rights and justice with radical critique of the class-state dynamics refer to themselves as “left-libertarians1” to contrast themselves with a libertarian mainstream or “right-libertarianism1” that they take to be more comfortable with actually-existing economic inequality as it exists under most capitalist systems, taking it to be an approximation of that which would occur in a truly free market. This is to be distinguished from another school of thought known as “left-libertarianism2” that occupies a position narrowly within the contemporary debate over distributive justice. Left-libertarianism2 endorse similar rights over the person but differ with respect to how much people can appropriate in terms of unowned natural resources (land, air, water, minerals, etc.). Right-libertarianism2 holds that such resources may be appropriated, for example, by the first person who discovers them, mixes her labor with them, or merely claims them—regardless of the pattern of distribution of property across society this might generate. Left-libertarianism2, by contrast, holds that unappropriated natural resources belong to everyone in some egalitarian manner. It can, for example, require those who claim rights over natural resources to make a payment to others for the value of those rights. This can provide the basis for a kind of egalitarian redistribution.

It is popular to label libertarianism as a “right-wing” doctrine. But this is mistaken. For one, on social—rather than economic—issues, libertarianism tends to be “left-wing” in advocating for radical social liberty in the form of freedom of association, of cultural and religious expression, and sexual liberation. On foreign policy it is also aligned more with the left in opposing border restrictions and war. Its historical entanglement with both radicalism and reaction, as well as its approach to rights being used to endorse distributive egalitarianism, means that it cannot be easily placed on a contemporary left-right partisan spectrum. In a sense, the left-right spectrum is itself reiterated within libertarianism, given its internal diversity.

Libertarianism is typically taken to be a variety of liberal political theory, though some do contest this (Freeman 2001). The word “libertarian” was first used in the 18th century to refer to a metaphysical view regarding freedom of the will, and it was first used as a political term in 19th century France to refer to communist anarchists (for example, in the journal Le Libertaire: Journal du Mouvement Social, edited by Joseph Déjacque), and in the late 19th century it would be used by individualist anarchists (for example, in the journal Liberty, edited by Benjamin Tucker). In the mid-20th century, the label was adopted by liberals who wanted to resist certain political developments in many Western states following World War 2. After the war, many of the worlds affluent democracies adopted greater amounts of state involvement in the economy. The sexual revolution had generated significant support for social liberalism, but those who came to be known as classical liberals and libertarians were concerned to safeguard economic liberalism from a state engaging in more and more central planning of the economy (see Hayek 1944). Whilst many who called themselves liberals were in favour of the state taking a bigger role in the economy, those who opposed it called themselves classical liberals or libertarians to distance themselves from these former liberals, and perhaps to emphasize that they regarded their position as a purer form of liberalism.

The first and most important text that self-consciously defended classical liberalism in this sense was F. A. Hayek’s three volume work Law, Legislation, and Liberty, with the first volume being published in 1973 just after the publication of John Rawls’s defence of post-war, interventionist liberalism, A Theory of Justice (1971). Hayek is often referred to as a classical liberal as opposed to a libertarian. The latter label is often associated particularly with the philosophical framework of natural rights, whereas Hayek focusses on concepts of political economy and jurisprudence, with an implicitly rule-consequentialist normative overtone.

Nonetheless, libertarian political philosophy has a great deal to do with Hayek in its concern with addressing an audience that it takes to already be convinced of social liberalism, that economic liberalism logically and normatively follows. Libertarianism, broadly speaking, is concerned with proving that just as freedom of association and expression is the social and cultural order of a free people, so the free market is the economic order of a free people.

Hayek was a leading figure of the Austrian School of economics, within which Murray Rothbard, a generation younger than Hayek, was also educated. Rothbard was the major voice of libertarianism in the United States during and after his lifetime. He co-founded the libertarian think-tank The Cato Institute, the Centre for Libertarian Studies, and the Ludwig von Mises Institute. He would also become a significant influence on Robert Nozick when they met in New York City, who would then bring that very libertarianism into academic philosophy.

The content of libertarian political philosophy, broadly speaking, is a claim that the initiation of interpersonal force is unjust. This is combined with an understanding of property rights as an essential component of personal liberty, as well as an analysis of law, that renders all state-made law on a moral par with any other threat of force. On this basis, libertarians usually argue that almost all state action is unjust, and that state interventions in the economy are as morally problematic as state interventions in our personal choices regarding our bodies and social lives.

There are a variety of moral foundations that libertarians draw upon for their central normative claims. Within the discipline of philosophy, libertarianism is most famously deontological (Rothbard 1978, 1982, Nozick 1974, Mack 1981, 1989, 1990, 1998, 1999, 2010, 2018, Steiner 1994), taking a cue from both John Locke and Immanuel Kant. However, others are Aristotelian eudaimonists (Rasmussen and Den Uyl 1991, 2005, 2016, 2020), contractualists of various kinds (Narveson 2011, Lomasky 1987, 2016, Gaus 2009, 2010, 2012), or rule-consequentialists (Epstein, 1995, 1998, 2015, Barnett 1998b). Many are implicitly rule-consequentialist, depending primarily on economic arguments rather than moral philosophical ones (Friedman 1997, Pennington 2011, Tebble 2016). Note that whilst it is very common for libertarians of all stripes to articulate their political philosophy in terms of rights, they will not all ground those rights deontologically. For example, for Aristotelian eudaimonists, rights are the metaethical framework that makes self-directed virtue possible in a social context; for contractualists, sets of rights might be the output of a contractarian procedure; for economists, rights might be an efficient legal framework, etc.

1. Self-Ownership and Economic Justice

The publication of Robert Nozick’s book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974) was the first time mainstream academic philosophy was forced to pay attention to libertarian ideas. Within philosophy, therefore, libertarianism revolved heavily around this book’s reception. G. A. Cohen was one of the most important of Nozick’s critics, but he nonetheless sympathized with what he took to be the core commitment of justice in Nozick’s theory – self-ownership. He therefore made the connection between self-ownership and libertarian views regarding economic justice the central area of problematization, and the literature developed for some decades in that way.

Self-ownership is the idea that all individuals have ownership rights over themselves, and therefore may do whatever they choose with themselves so long as they do not violate the self-ownership of others. Nozick believed, following Locke, that natural property rights over our own person could ground natural private property rights beyond the person, and therefore indicate that a market-based economic system is just. Cohen, however, took it that self-ownership explained the unjustly exploitative nature of capitalism. Following Karl Marx, Cohen supposed that capitalists expropriate the fruits of worker’s labour—something that naturally belongs to the worker herself. Despite Nozick only mentioning self-ownership once, and developing a large number of arguments against redistributive conceptions of economic justice which do not explicitly invoke or rely on the idea of self-ownership throughout part II of Anarchy, State, and Utopia, self-ownership became synonymous with libertarianism.

Self-ownership means that individuals have a very stringent (perhaps the most stringent possible) set of rights over their persons, giving them the kind of control over themselves that one has over possessions one holds as private property. This includes (1) control rights over the use of the entity: both a liberty-right to use it and a claim-right that others not use it without one’s consent, (2) rights to transfer these rights to others (by sale, rental, gift, or loan), (3) immunities to the non-consensual loss of these rights, (4) rights to compensation if someone uses the entity without one’s permission, and (5) enforcement rights (including rights of prior restraint if someone is about to violate these rights). Central to this idea of self-ownership is the right to control ourselves, and to exclude others from making use of us. Self-ownership, in other words, offers protections against others doing things to us against our will (unless it is our will to violate someone else’s self-ownership, of course).

The idea of self-ownership is attractive for many reasons. We recognize people as self-owners when we recognize that there are things that may not be done to a person without their consent, but which may be done with consent. As such, it is a way of explaining the so-called “moral magic of consent” (cf. Barnett 1986a, Alexander 1996, Hurd 1996). Thus, we consider rape wrong because it involves a body being used against the will of the person to whom it belongs, but not because there’s something inherently wrong with sexual intercourse. We consider assault wrong for similar reasons, but allow voluntary boxing matches. We consider slavery wrong, but allow consensual employment. There are also more theoretical reasons for self-ownership’s attraction. The principle is a strong endorsement of the moral importance and sovereignty of the individual, and it expresses the refusal to treat people as mere things to use or trade off against each other. It expresses the liberal notion (asserted by John Rawls against utilitarianism) of the moral “separateness of persons” (Zwolinski 2008).

In many contexts, self-ownership may be intuitively very attractive. It offers, for instance, a straightforward and unequivocal condemnation of chattel slavery. It grounds the defense of women’s rights over their bodies, including the right to terminate unwanted pregnancies (Thomson 1971, Long 1993) It explains why it is wrong to sacrifice the rights and freedoms of minorities (even a minority of one) for the sake of protecting the interests of the majority. It offers a principled objection to paternalism. And so on.

Self-ownership does, however, crowd out other moral considerations, including ones that are often thought relevant to justice. For example, it rules out the view that individuals have an enforceable duty to come to the assistance of others, if when they are in serious or urgent need (accept as a result of prior wrongdoing). For persons to have such an enforceable duty would be for it to be, in principle, justified for A to threaten B with force in order to get her to assist C (C being in need of assistance). However, this threat of force would involve a violation of B’s self-ownership by A, since B’s self-ownership includes a right to exclude others from taking control of her body and her actions without her consent. Any inclusion of enforceable, positive duties will remove much of the protective content of self-ownership (see Flanigan 2018).

An implication of this is that taxation for the purposes of giving assistance to other members of society is ruled out. Nozick argued that since taxation siphons off part of people’s earnings, which represent people’s labor, and people initially have the right not to be forced to work for certain ends. Therefore, Nozick argued, redistributive taxation is morally on a par with forced labor (1974, ch. 7). Self-ownership does not say that is something wrong with coming to the assistance of others, nor even necessarily with relations of dependence. But it does say there is something very wrong with using force to get people to provide such assistance or to enter into such relations.

Nozick’s point was that theories of economic justice face a choice. One can (a) respect people as the primary controllers of their lives, labor, and bodies. This means working for whomever they want, on the terms they consent to, and deciding for themselves what is to be done with the fruits of their labour. Recognizing this leaves no room for a conception of economic justice that requires a particular pattern of distribution. The composition of each individual’s personal choices as to how to contract with others will undo any given pattern of distribution the state seeks, and the state would have to deny people their respective choices that lead to interruptions to the pattern. Or one can (b) endorse the enforcement of certain distributions. But in that case, the theory must endorse taking what people innocently produce through their own labor, redirecting their work to purposes they did not freely choose. This latter option is unacceptable to anyone endorsing the idea of self-ownership. As Nozick wrote, it involves claiming a kind of control over the lives of others that is similar to a claim of ownership in them (1974, p. 172).

Nozick was also pointing to an incoherence within theories of distributive justice. The point of distributing things to people is so that they can enjoy the benefits of owning those things. Most importantly, so they can, through their choices, use those things to improve their lives. Invariably this will involve using them in economic transactions. If a theory of distributive justice does not permit people to actually do the things they choose with what they have, then it undermines the point in them having them at all. (Long 2002, also see Schmidtz 2011)

Self-ownership is a key libertarian idea not just conceptually, but rhetorically. It demonstrates the central libertarian preoccupation with showing that a commitment to personal or social liberty directly entails economic liberty in the form of private property and contractual freedom – that economic and social liberty cannot be separated, as post-war liberalism attempted to do.

However, liberal egalitarians following Cohen’s critique of the connection between self-ownership and world-ownership that libertarianism depends upon, were keen to separate the two. Seeking to square self-ownership and natural private property rights with egalitarian distributive justice, Hillel Steiner, followed by Peter Vallentyne and Michael Otsuka, developed a theory that endorsed self-ownership alongside an egalitarian principle of world-ownership. This approach to distributive justice became known as “left-libertarianism” (left-libertarianism2—to be distinguished from left-libertarianism1 that will be discussed below). The traditional approach that did not put a distributive constraint on world-ownership therefore came to be known as “right-libertarianism1”.

Others sought a similar theory of economic justice, but that did not depend upon intuitions regarding the initial egalitarian ownership of the external world. On these views, self-ownership, along with all property rights, can be split into control-rights and income-rights. They argue that these two rights need not be attached; having the right to control the disposition of an object does not presuppose a right to recoup the entire value of the income stream the object’s disposition generates. On this view the intuitive appeal of self-ownership (the control rights) can be endorsed whilst the income rights be subject to social distribution. (Gibbard 1976, Christman 1994) Such views depend upon self-ownership rights and property rights generally to be decomposable (Grey 1980, Attas 2006, also see Honoré 1961) which property essentialists deny (Stern 2017). Whilst right-libertarians2 do not necessarily deny that ownership is a bundle of logically distinct rights, they deny that control rights and income rights can be normatively separated in this way (see Wheeler 1980, Rothbard 1982, Mack 1990, and Long 2012 [Other Internet Resources]) indeed, this is one the central tasks Nozick sets himself.

An internal issue is a debate over whether self-ownership may permit voluntary enslavement. Agents have, on this view, not only the right to control the use of their person, but also the right to transfer that right (e.g., by sale or gift) to others. However, this is controversial among libertarians, some of whom deny that such transfers are possible because others cannot control one’s will. Whilst our rights of self-ownership can be waived they cannot be permanently alienated (Epstein 1973, 1979, Evers 1977, Rothbard 1982; Smith 1997, Barnett 1998a, 1998b, pp. 78–82, Kinsella 1998/1999). Some argue that in order for a right to an object to be transferred, it must be possible for our possession of the object to be de facto surrenderable (Evers 1977, Rothbard 1982). This is not the case with ourselves as we always have privileged, agent-type control over ourselves, through which third parties must act if they wish to control us. Such a view of contractual transfer is compatible with labour contracts in general but not specific-performance contracts in particular.

Theorists who endorse the possibility of voluntary enslavement usually argue that self-ownership is a theory about the moral right to control permissible use (by giving or denying permission), not about the psychological capacity to control (Block 2003). Thus, similarly, the right to exercise one’s autonomy is more fundamental than the protection or promotion of one’s autonomy over time (Vallentyne 1998; Steiner 1994). Others argue that such a transfer would undermine our autonomy (Grunebaum 1987), or reject the permissibility of such a transfer on theological grounds (Locke 1690, Olsthoorn, 2020).

A second internal concern of self-ownership points out its restrictive implications. Full self-ownership might seem to condemn as wrongful even very minor infringements of the personal sphere, such as when innocuous particles of pollution fall upon an unconsenting person. Prohibiting all acts that can lead to such minor infringements poses an unacceptable limit on our right to actually engage in activities—seemingly, to the very liberty self-ownership is supposed to safeguard. But from the point of view of self-ownership, there is no principled difference between minor infringements and major infringements. Whilst they may require different degrees of enforcement and compensation, both are equally morally prohibited. Thus, this objection goes, self-ownership places such strong protections for our liberty, it makes us mutually unable to act on our liberty. Thus, it must be rejected as motivationally incoherent (Railton 2003, Sobel 2012)

This objection, however, presupposes an implausible conception of self-ownership that its defenders need not endorse. Suppose we understand the moral benefits that self-ownership confers along two dimensions: protections from unwanted uses of our bodies, and liberties to use our bodies. As the objection points out, it is not possible to simultaneously maximize the value of both dimensions: our protections restrict our liberties by restricting the possible uses of one’s body, and vice versa. Since maximizing the protection-dimension implausibly restricts the use-dimension, the correct response is not to reject self-ownership, but rather to loosen the protection-dimension somewhat in order to enhance the use-dimension. Doing this would allow minor infringements for the sake of self-ownership. As Eric Mack (2015) puts it, a good theory of self-ownership offers people some “elbow room.” This is enabled by ensuring that our claim-rights (whose purpose is to safeguard the exercise of our liberty-rights) are not made stronger than they need to be.

Moreover, this critique seems to be deploying a notion of self-ownership few if any libertarians in fact endorse. Indeed, in Cohen’s critique of Nozick’s libertarianism, he developed the idea of “full” self-ownership and ascribed this view to Nozick (1985, 1986, 1995). Full self-ownership is simply the logically strongest set of ownership rights over oneself. But there is no need for self-ownership to be as logically strong as is possible, it needs to be strong enough to safeguard the values and principles is expresses, and so-called full self-ownership does not appear to do that, and hence few if any libertarians support it.

It is noteworthy that under the common law understanding of private property and nuisance, minor and insensible physical boundary crossings that do not interfere with normal use and enjoyment of the property in question, are not considered violations of a right of ownership. Given that ordinary private ownership rights do not give us the right to exclude minor physical boundary-crossings in this way, some argue there is no reason self-ownership should either. Moreover, it is not clear why a notion of self-ownership that does not include it should thereby be considered any less “full.” (Christmas 2021c, pp.48–51)

Making modifications to full self-ownership may be necessary to make it a plausible principle and to make it coherent alongside other values. This threatens the status of self-ownership as a foundational principle in libertarian theory. Presumably, foundational principles are not based on underlying values. For many libertarians, this is not much of a concession, however. If few endorse full self-ownership, even fewer endorse it as a foundational principle.

2. Property Rights and Original Acquisition

Libertarians conceive of distributive justice as largely (sometimes exclusively) historical in nature. To ask whether justice obtains in the world is mainly to ask whether people have been justly treated, principally whether their rights to their persons and possessions have been respected. Libertarians generally see people’s rightful possessions as whatever they acquired in legitimate (i.e., rights-respecting) ways. As a result, they reject theories that connect entitlement to outcomes or end-state distributions. In Kantian language, libertarians believe distributive justice is exhausted by commutative justice. As long as no wrongs have been inflicted by one individual upon another at private law, the overall distribution is without moral remainder. There is no way of a distribution to be unjust other than by it resulting from some sort of private law wrong(s).

The most common mode of just acquisition is through voluntary transfer. This is why libertarians generally defend noncoerced (Christmas 2022a), nondeceptive (Ferguson 2018) market relations as just. Nozick’s “entitlement theory” of distributive justice consists entirely of these two modes of acquisition and a principle of rectification for their violation. Redistribution is therefore in principle limited to when it is necessary to correct for wrongful takings (Byas 2022). However, for A’s entitlement to some possession x to be legitimized by B’s voluntary transfer of x to A, B’s prior entitled to x needs to be established. There must, at least in principle, be a starting point; an original acquisition through which objects that are not owned by anyone – that no one in particular has unique entitlement to – come to be owned by some particular person (Christmas 2021c, pp. 3–4).

Libertarians generally accept that individuals can carry out such acts of original acquisition. More precisely, they accept that individuals can acquire unowned goods unilaterally, without there needing to be authorization by some pre-existing political institution nor needing to obtain the consent of other people.

The most famous account of how unilateral original acquisition is possible remains Locke’s labor theory. According to Locke, when people work on previously unowned objects, subject to certain provisos, they turn those objects into their private property. The precise nature of Locke’s argument, the relation between labor and acquisition, as well as the nature of the provisos, is hotly contested. The most famous interpretation, again, seeks to ground property in the (prior) rights of self-ownership. On this view, when people labor they quite literally extend their claims of self-ownership over external objects, thus drawing them into their rights-protected sphere. As Locke (1690, ch. 5) put it, since laboring mixes one’s self-owned labor with something that is unowned, the previously unowned thing becomes owned.

So stated, this argument suffers from well-known problems. For instance, since laboring is an activity, the idea of mixing it with an object seems at best a metaphor for something else (Hume 1739, III.II.IIVI fn., Day 1966, Waldron 1983, 1988, pp. 184–91). But in that case, the argument is incomplete—we still need to know what really grounds property rights. More importantly, it simply is not true that mixing something owned with something unowned is sufficient for appropriation. As Nozick pointed out, if I pour a can of tomato juice that I own into the unowned ocean, I lose my tomato juice—I do not gain an ocean (Nozick 1974, pp. 174–5). Indeed, Locke himself noted that acts of labour cannot acquire ownership of the sea (though, they can acquire ownership of fish caught in the sea) (1690 II.30) Third, when the object with which one mixes one’s labour is already owned by someone else, this is typically regarded as a way of dissipating or donating one’s labour (Thomson 1990, pp. 326–327).

There are two prominent defences of a labour-based account of original acquisition. The first is Hillel Steiner’s physicalistic version (1994, p. 233 fn). On this view we literally mix energy that we own with unowned objects when we labour on them. The idea of mixing activities with objects does not, therefore, need to enter. However, we often expend our energy into all sorts of things that few want to claim we thereby appropriate, often with no intention or volition in doing so. We involuntarily transfer heat into the atmosphere, for example. Moreover, attempts to appropriate things often do not involve transfers of energy into that particular object, but rather our possession of the object is the result of our energy transfers into other objects. For example, in capturing a wild animal. Whilst this rescues the metaphysical idea of labour-mixing as one in which ownership literally “seeps over into the rest” as Nozick puts it (1974, p. 174), it raises serious questions over whether labouring upon things is actually the way to acquire them since it is neither necessary nor sufficient to mixing our energy with them (Christmas 2021c, p. 74).

The second is an indirect account (van der Vossen 2021a, 2021b [Other Internet Resources]). On this view, unilateral acquisition enables us to come to own the fruits of our labour in an economic rather than a physical sense. This approach seeks to tie considerations regarding the material prosperity that systems of private property and contracts bring about into the justification of unilateral acquisition, without making the entire theory a merely rule-consequentialist one.

There is a broad and influential line of consequentialist argument that ties the justification of property to the material prosperity and well-being that it brings about. Rights of private property serve to divide the external world into a number of discrete, individual parts, each exclusively controlled by its particular owner. Organizing the social world in this way is preferable to collective use or ownership because it helps avoid collective action problems. When things remain held in open-access commons, we all have an incentive to use as much as we can, leading to a general pattern of use that ends up depleting the resource, to everyone’s detriment. Rights to private property not only avoid such a “tragedy of the commons,” they also incentivize people to preserve their parts, increase their productivity, and exchange what they own with others on mutually beneficial terms (Schmidtz 1994; Buchanan 1993). The indirect labour-mixing account incorporates these considerations in a non-consequentialist way, as Nozick claimed to be trying to do (1974, p. 177).

Many have offered non-labour-based defenses of unilateral acquisition. On such views, unilateral acquisition is taken to be a requirement of our being project pursuers or purposive agents (Lomasky 1987; Mack 1990, 2010, Wendt 2022). Such accounts often argue for the impossibility of separating our biomass from our tools; acquisition on this view just being an entailment of making objects part of our actions and therefore inseparable from our bodily rights (Wheeler 1980), and therefore presupposes no distinct power to create new property rights. A common critique of approaches to libertarianism grounded in a non-aggression principle (NAP) is that is assumes without argument that property rights violations constitute aggressions against the person, when the connection of property to person is precisely the point of contention (Zwolinski 2016). Connecting external property rights to personal or bodily rights vindicates the NAP-based approaches (Christmas 2018b).

Other justifications depend neither on accepting a prior thesis of self-ownership, nor on the affiliated thesis that self-ownership rights can be extended outwardly through labor. Instead, these arguments point to the moral importance of people having security over external resources. Sometimes this is understood in terms of support for political and civil liberties (Friedman 1962, Gaus 2010). Since these justifications of property do not rest on a prior principle of self-ownership, they are not committed to seeing property rights as absolute as self-self-ownership advocates take those rights to be. They therefore need not be as immune to regulation and taxation. Despite what is sometimes suggested (Freeman 2001), virtually all libertarians that reject self-ownership as a starting point also accept that property rights need specification, can be instantiated in quite different, yet morally acceptable forms, and might be overridden by other moral considerations. Such views do not entail the impossibility of unilateral original appropriation either.

Libertarians and their critics are concerned with the issue of original appropriation primarily because it demarcates a major fault line in political philosophy. The libertarian’s historical conception of justice, and the accompanying insistence that governments refrain from redistributive projects, require that property rights do not depend on the government, positive law, or the consent of others for their moral validity. Such a view is viable if one can establish the possibility of unilateral appropriation, without essential reference to the existence of the state or law.

The strongest objection to this area of libertarian thought comes from neo-Kantian legal and political philosophers who draw up Kant’s arguments that acquisition of property rights in a state of nature is conceptually incoherent at worst, and unjust at best. Neo-Kantians largely agree with libertarians that the primary authorization for the use of coercion in society is to secure freedom for all individuals, and such individual freedom is borne out in large part through contractual freedom and private property rights. However, they disagree with libertarians in that they believing that state authority is ontologically foundational to individual freedom.

Neo-Kantians argue that property rights cannot be unilaterally acquired outside of a state’s authorization for one or more of three reasons: (1) Property rights in a state of nature would be indeterminate; leading not only to the high likelihood of insoluble disputes (over boundaries and the like), but the inevitability of them. Without a state to lay down a judgement over what counts as whose property and enforce it, disputes have no principled answer, and therefore there is no fact of the matter about what rights and duties individuals have in these cases. (2) Unilateral acquisition and determination of property rights constitutes the imposition of one person’s will on all others. Having the authority to create new duties and impose them on all others by one’s discretionary choice is not something one could have among equals. Having the content of one’s duties being subject to another’s arbitrary will is to be unfree and unequal on the Kantian view. (3) In a state of nature, any putative rights are not assured. Without a guarantee of some sort that our person and possessions be secured against violence, we are authorized to take pre-emptive action against potential aggressors, and they against us, meaning that no one is under any duty to abstain from using force against others. According to neo-Kantians, having a state provides a solution to all these problems. Its geographical monopoly on the use of force means it can determinately lay down a scheme of rights and duties under law and credibly enforce it (overcoming problems 1 and 3). Moreover, the state is not just another private actor, on this view, but rather has the capacity to act on behalf of all – it is an omnilateral actor rather than unilateral. Therefore its use of coercion to secure rights does not subject us to any arbitrary will (solving problem 2). In short, property rights can only be created by a public power. (Waldron 1996, 1999 part 2, Flikschuh 1999, 2000 ch. 4, 2008, Varden 2008, 2010; Ripstein 2009 ch. 6, 2012, Stilz 2009, ch. 2; 2011; 2012; Hodgson 2010; Pallikkathayil 2010; Sinclair 2018).

Because of this, some neo-Kantians argue that since the state is ontologically prior to property rights, there are limits to how much work an historical entitlement theory can do in justifying particular holdings. There are no acts of original acquisition that vindicate a chain of transfers leading up to the present, but rather it is state authority vindicates property rights. State redistribution, therefore, cannot be condemned on the basis that it violates property rights – it is the state’s coercion that creates property rights. (Hasan 2018) In a state of nature, individuals can, at best, only acquire “provisional” property rights, meaning that they are at liberty to make use of these objects, but others are not duty-bound to respect your claim, and neither would a state once it is established be obligated to treat it as a fully-fledged property right. (Kant 1797, 6.255, Ripstein 2009 p. 165, Stilz 2009 p.45, 2018, Hasan 2018, Messina 2019)

Libertarian responses to these criticisms have taken the form of arguing that unilateral acquisition is merely the specification of a right we already have rather than the creation of new rights through some arbitrary power. It therefore does not presuppose any superior moral status of the acquirer nor does it problematically subject third parties (van der Vossen 2009, 2015, Sazanov 2022). On this view, original acquisition (when done justly) is a case of duty-activation rather than duty-creation. Similarly, it has been argued that property rights can be made determinate by constitutive social conventions that do not require any state authority, and so long as property rights are determinate, the other problems fall away (Christmas 2021a).

Left-libertarianism2 here can be seen to side-step the objection in virtue of its commitment to an equal distribution of external property. So long as your unilateral acquisition cannot be said to be greater than your equal share, there is no moral remainder (Steiner 2017, 2000, cf. Sage 2012).

3. Other Routes to Libertarianism

As noted above, there are a variety of moral foundations that libertarians draw upon for their central normative claims. Whilst most libertarians will articulate the structure of libertarianism in terms of rights, by no means do all libertarians believe rights to be foundational in a deontological sense, let alone that the most valuable articulation of them is in the form of universal self-ownership. In this section we will briefly discuss other moral and conceptual inputs that yield roughly libertarian outputs in political philosophy.

Some libertarians ground their political philosophy in neo-Aristotelian eudaimonism. On this view, the moral life is fundamentally understood the flourishing of the individual in terms of fulfilling or perfecting their nature or telos, achieving a state of eudaimonia. The unique way in which we each flourish requires a community to flourish within and as a part of, but it also must be, at bottom, a self-directed process due to its uniqueness. Therefore, it is an ethical imperative to both live within a society, and to have one’s potential for individual practical reasoning protected. Douglas Rasmussen and Douglass Den Uyl (1991, 2005, 2016, 2020) argue that individual rights to negative liberty render each person’s flourishing compossible with others’. These rights allow individuals to participate in the community (or a variety of communities) as they deem fit in light of their practical reason, but does not allow anyone to pursue flourishing in a way that morally cannibalizes the flourishing of others. Rasmussen and Den Uyl argue that rights, on this view, are metanormative principles that are necessary for ordinary normativity to operate within a social context. Libertarian justice then is a sort of meta-virtue that enables a diversity of other forms of virtue. Some argue that this approach must converge with a certain kind of deontological approach (Christmas 2018a), but Rasmussen and Den Uyl resist this (2018). Indeed, there is a broader tradition of grounding natural rights in Aristotelian ethics within natural law theory, going back to St. Thomas Aquinas (1947, also see Finnis 2011).

Other libertarians deploy a contractualist or contractarian framework of moral reasoning in order to arrive at libertarian conclusions. For example, Loren Lomasky argues from an egoistic rational choice framework that it is rational for individuals to adopt a framework of individual, negative rights (2016, 1987, also see Narveson 2011). Whilst Gerald Gaus deploys the public reason framework to argue for a state that is constitutionally constrained along libertarian lines (2009, 2010, 2012). What these views share is that whilst libertarian rights may be the most just ideal of rights, they must be discovered or constructed through a rational and social process, rather than derived logically from human nature or abstract reason.

Rule-consequentialist libertarians argue that social welfare is optimized by society adopting libertarian rules. Richard Epstein argues that legal rules that protect individual rights against one another and against the state generate higher amounts of social welfare than legal rules that permit significant amounts of expropriation and coercion (Epstein, 1995, 1998, 2015, also see Barnett 1998b). On this view rights are justified to the extent that they serve this welfare-enhancing role over time as part of a legal system, but have little or no intrinsic value in and of themselves. This view therefore permits state-takings of private property where it is conducive to the general welfare (Epstein 1985). The methodology of law and economics is central to this school of thought. It seeks to use empirical research to investigate the economic efficiency of different legal arrangements. Ronald Coase’s paper “The Problem of Social Cost” (1960) is typically seen as the inaugural work in this vein.

Other libertarians are more implicitly rule-consequentialist and deploy economic arguments for the kinds of political and legal arrangements libertarians favour – specifically, epistemic arguments (Friedman 1997, Pennington 2011, Tebble 2016). They will often argue that institutions of private property and freedom of contract, enforced by a constitutionally constrained state, are the best way of ensuring social knowledge is deployed in pro-social ways, and will point to constraints on how far this knowledge can be centralized by even a presumptively benevolent central planner. These arguments are drawn explicitly from Hayek (cf. Boettke 2018) and the Austrian School of economic thought more broadly (see especially Mises 1935, Hayek 1945, Kirzner 1997).

A subtle approach that does not easily fit into the categories above follows the work of Adam Smith, claiming that libertarian ideas are inherent in our ordinary moral psychology and how it interacts with commercial society (cf. Otteson 2012, Schmidtz 2016, Cowen & Geloso 2021, Cowen 2021). Smith famously considered justice to be strictly negative in nature – something we satisfy simply through abstaining from theft, coercion, and other violations of libertarian rights. Thus, in The Theory of Moral Sentiments, Smith wrote that the rules that “call loudest for vengeance and punishment are the laws which guard the life and person of our neighbour; the next are those which guard his property and possessions; and last of all come those which guard what are called his personal rights, or what is due to him from the promises of others.” (Smith 1976 [1759], p. 84) These are the only acts that are generally disapproved of in a way calling for punishment. (1976 [1759], p. 78) Rule-following of this kind is desirable because it’s conducive to the stability and effectiveness of society. (1976 [1759], p. 86) None of this means that people do not have obligations to assist others. Smith grounds his view in a deeply social view of moral psychology. Thus, benevolence along with justice is a pillar of society. However, we cannot expect or force people to care for distant strangers in the same way as they care for themselves. And trying to organize a society along these lines would lead to disaster. Smith was extremely skeptical about government officials, writing about how they seek fame and power, think themselves morally superior, and are more than willing to serve their own interests and those of well-connected businessmen rather than the public good. (Smith 1976 [1776], pp. 266–7). And, perhaps foreshadowing Hayek, Smith argued that governments are generally incapable of knowing enough to guide large numbers of people. Human beings make their own decisions and respond to circumstances, thus thwarting any systematic plans the government might lay out for them. Thus, as a rule, it is more promising to appeal to people’s self-interest through market exchange than to use state coercion. Libertarian arguments of this kind cast the state as an arbitrator, an impartial agent that makes fair and productive cooperation between citizens possible, much like a referee enables fair play by administering the rules of the game. It is crucial, then, for the state to remain impartial and not choose sides in society or the economy. Once governments begin benefiting one party over another, whether this be certain groups in society or business interests, such involvement is in principle off-limits and likely to backfire as it will favor whoever is politically well-connected or favored at the time. The minimal state, then, is the only state capable of structuring complex and deeply interdependent societies in ways that are mutually beneficial.

4. Libertarianism, Left and Right

There are two active ways in which libertarianism is self-consciously deployed as a left-wing as opposed to a right-wing philosophy. There is a left/right paradigm in the broader history of libertarian thought that hinges on whether or not, broadly speaking, it is deployed as a radical project or a reactionary one. The other is narrowly within the debate over distributive justice, and hinges on principles concerning ownership of external resources that are posited alongside self-ownership.

Within the first paradigm, left-libertarianism1 refers to an approach that takes its cue largely from the American individualist anarchism of figures such as Benjamin Tucker, Thomas Hodgskin, and Lysander Spooner, and to a lesser extent, early radical French liberalism of Jean-Baptiste Say, Charles Comte, and Charles Dunoyer. The chief contemporary advocates of left-libertarianism1 are Gary Chartier and Roderick Long.

Left-libertarianism1 typically maintains the familiar normative and deontological commitment to justice as constituted by strong rights of all individuals to freedom of action, social association, and economic cooperation (understood as rights of property and contract). However, it couples that normative framework with a set of descriptive commitments. Namely, it holds close to a class-based view of political sociology developed by radical liberals such as Say, Comte, and Dunoyer (see Weinburg 1978, Hart 1990) as well as Franz Oppenheimer (1914, also see Rothbard 2009) that places the state within a class-based analysis of human history. Coupled together these commitments generate a radical critique of the state as the chief vehicle of plutocracy, and myriad other forms of domination that make people unfree.

Left-libertarians1 regard the state as inherently unjust in virtue of not being consented to (Tucker 1893, Spooner 1870, 1882, 1886, Long 1995, Chartier 2011b, 2012). The state is also regarded as instrumentally dangerous in that its monopoly on the use of force makes it the play-thing of groups that seek to dominate and exploit other groups (Long 2008c, 2012 [Other Internet Resources], Chartier 2011b). It does not regard the state as a mere epiphenomenon of plutocratic power, but rather as empirically instrumental to plutocratic power.

Modern advocates of left-libertarianism1 regard state coercion as being both constitutively related to broader forms of domination and instrumentally related to them (Christmas 2016). Crucially, left-libertarians1 typically regard the economic conditions of actually-existing capitalism as being largely an effect of state interventions on behalf of incumbent capitalist interests (Chartier & Johnson 2011). Some argue that a market freed of state interference would be one in which there were more, smaller, more cooperatively organised, productive units, and in which inequality of income would be lower. Some argue more strongly that it would be indistinguishable from anarchist socialism. For this reason, most left-libertarians1 describe their position as “anti-capitalist”. They maintain a strong distinction between a free market based political economy and capitalist political economy where the latter involves either state-capital partnership or capitalist domination of society, or both (Chartier 2011a, Long, 2008a). Some argue for these conclusions based on the “cost-principle” of classical political economy that said where there is a lack of monopoly, prices would tend toward cost, making cooperative enterprise the most efficient productive model (Carson 2007, 2008). Others argue for similar conclusions from modern, marginalist economic theory (Long 2008a). Central to both analyses is that monopoly power is responsible for aberrations from a more egalitarian market equilibrium. And that monopoly power is, in turn, enabled by the state – the monopoliser of coercion itself, which is the chief enabler of all other monopolies (Tucker 1888).

Whilst it may have been reasonable for the early American individualist anarchists to believe that market forces were an egalitarian, equilibrating force given the level of development around them, critics of left-libertarianism1 argue that it ignores important developments in economic conditions (see Anderson 2017) since then. Others argue that this view of market forces ignores developments in economic theory since then, in particular, that it is grounded in a fallacious labour theory of value (Rothbard 1965 [2000], Murphy 2006).

Left-libertarians1 also argue that libertarian commitment to justice sit coherently alongside egalitarian commitments outside of the narrow scope of justice. Whilst individual rights to maximal freedom of action, association, and economic cooperation describe the moral limits to the interpersonal use of force, there is much morality of social and political interest that lies beyond justice but which is not entirely separable from justice (Johnson 2008, Christmas 2017). Opposition to sexism (Long & Johnson 2004), racism, nationalism, et al, are often taken to be part of a full package of human emancipation. Whilst these commitments are not logically deduced from a commitment to libertarian justice, they are grounded in similar first-order intuitions regarding egalitarian individualism (Christmas 2019). Critics of this aspect of the view argue that the libertarian view on justice derives part of its value from its transcendence of, and compatibility with, a variety of other views about the good (Block 2010).

This paradigm of left-libertarianism1 is distinguished from a right-libertarianism1, that, whilst radical in a sense of being strongly demanding upon the status quo, regards fewer aspects of the status quo as a normative problem. Right-libertarianism1 takes the structure of actually-existing capitalism to be a closer proxy of what a free market would look like. Right-libertarianism1 may also be taken to be part of a thicker bundle of moral and social commitments, but not ones associated with individual emancipation beyond the narrow scope of libertarian justice. On this view it is allied with social conservatism favouring cultural homogeneity/segregation, patriarchy, and inequality (so long as these things can be sustained voluntarily, and therefore in a way consistent with libertarian rights for all) (Feser 2010, Hoppe 2018).

A figure in whom these dual tendencies of libertarianism can be viewed to play out is Murray Rothbard. An economist who also wrote extensively in history and philosophy, who swung between these radical and reactionary tendencies over his lifetime (see Massimino 2020). For libertarianism to be fully understood it must be taken seriously in both its radical leftist and its reactionary right-wing forms, as well as when it combines aspects of both tendencies (Tomasi & Zwolinski 2023).

Narrowly within the scope of distributive justice, libertarianism is described as being left- or right-wing depending on whether it demands an egalitarian pattern of property rights in external resources. Both left- and right-libertarians2 within this paradigm agree on self-ownership. The question arises over what constraints (if any) exist on what external resources self-owners can appropriate. Left-libertarians2 countenance a principle demanding that external resources be equally distributed among self-owners, whereas right-libertarians2 do not. Though there is variance on the kinds of constraints right-libertarians2 place on acquisition, none of them demand equal holdings.

At one end of the spectrum sits the maximally permissive view of original appropriation. This view holds that that there are no quantitative constraints on the appropriation of unowned and unused resources. (Rothbard 1978, 1982, Narveson 1988, ch. 7, 1999, Feser 2005, Christmas 2020) Whilst there are particular procedures through which one must acquire initially unowned (for example, making ostensive use of the resource in question), there is no limit on how much property this procedure can be used to acquire. The initial non-ownership of the external world drives this view.

Most libertarians accept something like the so-called Lockean proviso. This proviso holds that appropriation is permissible if “enough and as good” be left for others. There’s an extensive debate over how exactly this proviso is to be understood. Nozick interprets the proviso to require that no individual be made worse off by a particular appropriation of a natural resource. But this interpretation is problematic for at least two reasons. First, such a welfare-based constraint on the exercise of people’s natural right to appropriate seems ill-motivated within Nozick’s theory. In general, the exercise of our rights is not usually constrained by a non-worsening requirement. Second, Nozick’s proviso is vulnerable to the objection that, as long as property owners compensate non-owners only slightly over the pre-appropriation baseline (which is likely quite low), non-owners are not wronged (Cohen 1995). This seems to permit what intuitively seems like a problematically unequal outcome in which one person could appropriate all property, so long as they compensate everyone else by a tiny amount. On such a view, private property seems to only function to produce welfare rather than giving each individual a sphere of independence.

Others interpret the Lockean proviso as requiring something like a sufficientarian requirement, such that people must have access to an adequate share of natural resources (Lomasky 1987; Wendt 2017). This view might invoke differing conceptions of adequacy, such as well-being or the ability to be self-governing (Simmons 1992, 1993). Or one might see the proviso as ensuring the ability to exercise one’s rights of self-ownership. (Mack 1995) Or one might see is as grounding the right of necessity that has been a core part of the general natural rights tradition from Thomas Aquinas to Hugo Grotius (Christmas 2021c, pp. 51–54) These views converge closely with the no-proviso view in that they articulate the inherent restrictions within the power of acquisition which is grounded in our original rights. Nozick does not explain how the power of acquisition is grounded in our original rights, and hence posits the proviso as an external principle so that the power of acquisition is not entirely untethered.

At the other end of the spectrum, left-libertarians2 argue that the external world is not initially unowned in the sense presupposed above but is owned in some egalitarian manner. Therefore, any private acquisition of it is strongly constrained in some egalitarian way.

One version of this view leans on the equal freedom principle of Kant and Spencer (see Steiner 1974). The argument is that self-ownership depends upon some amount of world-ownership. If we do not have the right to locate our body at some location in space over time, we have no right to exist and therefore cannot be said to be self-owners (Steiner 2009, p. 241, also see Spencer 1851, ch. 9). The mere conceptual possibility of one person coming to own all the land is incoherent alongside the principle of universal self-ownership. Since we must all equally be self-owners as far as is conceptually possible, and ownership of natural resources is essential to our being self-owners, to truly be self-owners we must all equally own the external world. This does not mean private appropriation cannot take place, but it does mean that all private appropriations are encumbered with a tax liability to compensate all others who may have privately appropriated less than you. Viewed this way, left-libertarianism2 therefore intimately connects a universal basic income to self-ownership and freedom (Steiner 2016).

An alternative version of the argument is leans more closely on the labour-based justification of property found in Locke and others. The argument is that whilst all self-owners own their labor, and are therefore entitled to recoup the full fruits thereof, the external, natural world is not the result of anyone’s labor. Therefore, when we produce objects of value by laboring upon natural resources, we can only claim a portion of the value it has, namely, the portion contributed by our own labor. The only person that can be said to be entitled the natural value found in nature is all of humanity. Therefore, all owners of private property must pay a tax against the value of the natural resources they own to compensate those who are excluded from it, whilst still being able to recoup the value they add. Viewed this way, left-libertarianism2 intimately connects land-value taxation to self-ownership and freedom, and as such continues the legacy of Henry George (1897). This view is, however, subject the critiques of labor-mixing views of property and of the labor theory of value, noted above.

The debates one finds within luck-egalitarian approaches to distributive justice over the nature of luck- and responsibility-sensitivity, the measurement of freedom and of welfare, enter left-libertarian2 debates over the Lockean proviso. For example, Michael Otsuka proposes a welfarist rather than a value-based metric of equality of ownership (2003).

As an exegetical interpretation of Locke’s requirement that appropriators leave “enough and as good”, however, left-libertarian2 views are implausible. In his discussion of appropriation, Locke invokes the idea of distributive shares only three times (sections 31, 37, and 46). All appear in the context of the (quite different) prohibition on letting things spoil. In these cases, and in these cases alone, Locke sees appropriation as taking what belongs to other particular people.

Left-libertarians2 often claim intuitive support for an egalitarian proviso. When multiple people are presented with a previously undivided resource, equal division is the intuitively fair approach. An objection, however, is that such intuitions apply only to circumstances that ignore relevant conditions. For instance, while Otsuka (2018) is correct to claim that if two persons are stranded together on an island, equal division is the intuitive solution, this may not be true if one person arrived earlier and had already cultivated, say, two-thirds of the island, while leaving more than enough for the second person to independently make a living, is willing to cooperate, trade, and so on. In that case, the latecomer insisting that she has a right to half the island is not only counter-intuitive, but probably unjust. The intuition of equal division becomes even less appealing if we imagine more than two parties, capable of production, trade, and cooperation, arriving at different times. It remains true, of course, that such latecomers will be entitled to something like an equally good shot at making use of the world’s resources. What such an equally good shot comes to, however, is much less clear. Others argue that the respective intuitions behind egalitarian ownership of the world and individual self-ownership are strictly incoherent (Risse 2004).

5. Anarchism and the State

Libertarians are highly skeptical of political authority and state legitimacy. Where a state is understood to be an agency with an exclusive right to lay down and enforce laws within a territory, it is not clear how it could do this without either the consent of all people subject to it, or by violating all of the rights of its citizens. Of course, all states fail to satisfy this requirement for most of their subjects (Spooner 1867, Simmons 1976, 1993). Many libertarians embrace, at least philosophical, anarchism, and are thereby deeply suspicious of social contract theory. Philosophical anarchists believe that we have no duty to obey the laws of the state simply because they come from the state. Some laws reflect natural moral precepts like “do not murder or steal,” and so we should obey those laws because they happen to be just, but not because the state has made them just. The implication of this is that the state’s enforcement of the rest of their body of law is illegitimate, and amounts to little more than a large group of armed agents imposing their will on non-consenting third parties.

The strongest version of the libertarian critique of the state’s authority is articulated by Lysander Spooner: the laws of the state either reflect natural justice and are therefore superfluous, or they contravene natural justice, and are illegitimate (1882). Libertarians are not necessarily political anarchists in that they may believe justice is not served by directly attempting to abolish the state (e.g., Simmons 2000, ch. 6), though many are (e.g. Chartier 2012, ch. 6) Libertarian anarchists tend to be optimistic about the possibility of anarchic provision of justice, and of public goods, and offer sophisticated, if radical, accounts of how a just, stateless society could operate (Barnett 1986b, 2014 chs 7–9, Molinari 1849, Rothbard 1978, ch. 12, Friedman 1989, pt. 2, Hoppe 2009, Huemer 2012, chs 10–12, Chartier 2012, chs 3–5, Leeson 2014, Long 2008b, Murphy 2008, Skoble 2008, Tannehill & Tannehill 1970, pt. 2). The right-libertarian1 version of this theory is known as anarcho-capitalism whereas the left-libertarian1 version is known as left market anarchism.

Essential to the libertarian view of the state is the moral parity thesis which says that individual state actors – and therefore, states as composite actors – have the same rights and duties as private citizens (Brennan 2016b, 2019, 2021). Libertarians therefore sharply differ from, for example, neo-Roman republicans and neo-Kantians in rejecting any fundamental distinction between public and private action. For libertarians, only a person’s consent can give you the right to do things to them that would ordinarily be rights-violations. The purportedly special moral status of acting in a public capacity is not something that libertarians can reconcile with natural equality (Long 1995, 2001 [Other Internet Resources], Christmas 2019).

Even though libertarians are generally quite hostile to state authority, this does not mean that the state cannot permissibly undertake certain minimal activities. After all, if all persons are entitled to defend rights, then the state may undertake such actions as well. It has the same permission to enforce individual rights as anyone else. However, it does not have any prima facie right to stop others from doing this too. These activities do not presuppose any special authority since such activities are permissible with or without people’s prior consent (unless, of course, such activities involve the violation of rights themselves). However, no agency that engages in rights-protection could force anyone to pay for its protection, and hence could not legitimately exercise a tax power. Without the right to tax and to hold an exclusive right to use force to protect rights, the state is really just a private agency like any other.

Robert Nozick offered a controversial and subtle argument that a state, with strictly curtailed domain of activity, could exist without anyone’s rights being violated. It is often known as an “invisible hand argument” for the state (1974, pt 1). In a situation in which rights were enforced by a plethora of protective associations, where each association protects the rights of those who voluntarily chose to become members and pay fees, there would be a significant advantage in being a member of that protective association with the most members within your territory. The more people who are in the same protective association as you, the more people you can have peaceful, predictable, low risk social and economic interactions with. For this reason, Nozick believed one protective association would come to dominate the market for protection and would be a de facto monopoly. Those who are not members of the association, if and when they enter a dispute over rights with a member, will have no other choice but to be subjected to the dominant associations procedures for determining wrongdoing. Whilst the dominant association does not claim any exclusive right to administer all disputes, it is, by a matter of fact, the only agency administering disputes (Bader 2021).

When there is a plurality of competing associations, each particular association has an interest in cooperating with others when a dispute arises between its respective members. However, when there is one dominant association, Nozick argues that it serves its members by outlawing new competitors, given that it would introduce alternative and most importantly risky procedures into its system of administering justice. In coercively prohibiting new entrance into the protection market, it enforces its monopoly, and thereby becomes a de jure monopoly and not a merely de facto one.

Moreover, Nozick argues that this association can even charge fees to those who do not voluntarily become members, so long as it provides them with protection that provides protection to their rights that leaves their rights as protected or more protected than if they did not. So, out of anarchy, a state emerges without violating anyone’s rights. Of course, if the state engaged in any further activities, for example, redistributing wealth in a way that was not strictly necessary to the protection if rights, it would be violating rights and would be illegitimate. This state is therefore referred to as the “minimal state”.

There are reasons to think that when it comes to enforcing justice, it is important that there be an agency whose decision is final. This, is a matter of fact, is going to be the one with the greatest capacity for coercion. Some therefore believe states as such can have legitimacy so long as they primarily use their unique capacity for coercion to secure justice (Renzo 2011, Christmas 2022b).

Nozick’s argument is a potentially strong one as it uses anarchist premises to argue that a state could in principle emerge through just steps. Note also that it applies to both right-libertarian2 and left-libertarian2 theories, on the latter the state is just enforcing a different set of rights over external objects.

Whilst the argument is sophisticated, it has come under attack from a variety of angles. Anarchists argue that a de facto monopoly would not be just in using force to prohibit anyone else from forming a new protective association. Therefore any de facto monopoly remains merely de facto and challengers to the state would always be justified in protecting people’s rights in alternative ways so long as they were consistent with justice (Chartier 2011, pp. 257–262). They also argue that a de facto monopoly is less likely to be a faithful guarantor of justice and the possibility of external challenge is necessary to safeguard justice (Long 2008b).

Non-libertarian liberals argue that even if the argument is internally coherent in terms of showing that a de jure monopoly could emerge justly, it does not yield a state that wields public power, but only a form of overwhelming private power, such as the states of feudal Europe (Freeman 2001, Anderson 2017). To be a legitimate government, a state must exercise power over all on behalf of all, and not simply be a nexus of private contracts between individuals.

An additional problem with the argument is that Nozick presents the minimal state as if it were the terminus of the invisible hand processes rather than a moment on a continuum. Whilst he insists that anarchy would not be a stable equilibrium and a minimal state would emerge, he does not attempt to show that a minimal state is a stable equilibrium. Once it has succeeded in having a justified monopoly on rights protection, it may well continue to extent its power, influence, and wealth beyond that which is necessary to secure individuals’ rights.

Relatedly, Nozick argues that taxation is only justified to the extent that it is necessary to fund the protection of rights. This is often taken to mean that the state would be “small” and its taxes “low”. However, there is an important difference between minimalism in terms of the quality justificatory grounds of state power, and minimalism in the actual quantitative size of the state. It is possible that due to empirical circumstances, a state that is limited to only protecting rights, and only taxing so much as to fund such activities, nonetheless requires a vast bureaucratic apparatus. If this turns out to be the case, questions arise as to how such a large organization should be internally organized in order to ensure its efficient functioning. It may require elements of bureaucracy and administrative discretion, as well as democracy and open-access. Therefore, the size and structure of government is not determined a priori by its functions being limited to the protection of rights. Whilst the courts and the police are the morally necessary outputs of the state apparatus, we cannot know a priori what organizational complexities are necessary for their stable and efficient functioning. Whatever they are, they seem to be consistent with the normative foundations of the minimal state (Murphy 2023). Non-ideal libertarian theorizing along these lines converges with neoliberalism, insofar as it recognizes a reasonably strong state as instrumentally essential to the maintenance of a market-based social order (Vallier 2021).

Democratic theorists often argue that state authority holds that states can be legitimate if they are democratic, libertarians tend to be skeptical about this view. A large body of empirical findings has shown that voters tend to be radically uninformed, ignorant, and biased about political issues. And democratic deliberation does little, if anything, to improve this. Indeed, it seems like it is rational for people to remain ignorant about politics. Given that one’s causal influence on the quality of political decisions is negligible, and it is costly in terms of time and effort to become informed, it is rational for people to remain ignorant. Most people thus vote in ways that have more to do with signaling their ideological allegiance or virtues, and less with the merits of the issues (Caplan 2008, Somin 2016, Brennan 2016a, Pincione & Tesón 2011).

In addition to voter ignorance, many libertarians fear the more general dynamics of state power. Public choice theory points out that since the best way to understand the behavior of political agents is along roughly maximizing lines, there is little reason to think that the state will generally behave in the public interest (Tullock & Buchanan 1962). Thus, many government policies impose widely dispersed costs on the populace to confer localized benefits on a few, often politically well-connected elites. Examples include the large-scale bailouts of financial companies and agricultural subsidies.

Where libertarians view of democracy positively it will therefore be instrumental in general, and agonistic in particular. Democracy’s value will be cashed out in terms of its role in limiting the excessing power of the state, rather than in any purported intrinsic value of citizens sharing positive control over government (Levy 2017). Democratic regimes, whilst far from ideal on a libertarian standard, tend to have a far better track record of supporting individual rights to socioeconomic liberty than any other regime. Whilst voters do not turn out to vote for candidates favouring libertarian reforms per se, the overall effect of democratic institutions seems to be a liberalizing force on government and a constraint on state excess, on this view of democracy (Levy 2018).


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The editors note that as of the January 2019 update, no content by the original author, Peter Vallentyne, remains in this entry. So he is no longer listed as an author. We’d also like to thank Nate Angell for noting a number of sentences with typographical errors.

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