# The Frege-Hilbert Controversy

*First published Sun Sep 23, 2007; substantive revision Thu Mar 7, 2024*

In the early years of the twentieth century, Gottlob Frege and David Hilbert, two titans of mathematical logic, engaged in a controversy regarding the correct understanding of the role of axioms in mathematical theories, and the correct way to demonstrate consistency and independence results for such axioms. The controversy touches on a number of difficult questions in logic and the philosophy of logic, and marks an important turning-point in the development of modern logic. This entry gives an overview of that controversy and of its philosophical underpinnings.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Hilbert’s
*Foundations of Geometry* - 3. Frege—Background And Initial Differences
- 4. The Deeper Disagreement
- 5. Lingering Issues
- 6. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

In June 1899, at a ceremony marking the installation of the new
Gauss-Weber monument in Göttingen, David Hilbert delivered a
lecture on the foundations of geometry. Published later that year by
Teubner under the title “*Grundlagen der
Geometrie*” (“Foundations of Geometry”), the
piece stands as a watershed in the development of modern mathematics
and logic. Though the subject-matter of the work is geometry, its
lasting influence concerns more broadly the role of axioms in
mathematical theories, and the systematic treatment of such
metatheoretical questions as consistency and independence. By
presenting a rich trove of consistency and independence
demonstrations, Hilbert displays here the power of the
“structural” approach to axioms, and lays the groundwork
for what soon becomes our own contemporary model-theoretic approach to
formal systems. (For the historical background to Hilbert’s
treatment of axioms, see Hallett 2012 and
Nineteenth Century Geometry;
for the role of Hilbert’s work in the development of model
theory, see
model theory
and Eder & Schiemer 2018.)

Hilbert’s lecture and monograph inspired a sharp reaction from
his contemporary Gottlob Frege, who found both Hilbert’s
understanding of axioms, and his approach to consistency and
independence demonstrations, virtually incomprehensible and at any
rate seriously flawed. Frege’s reaction is first laid out in his
correspondence with Hilbert from December 1899 to September 1900, and
subsequently in two series of essays (both entitled “On the
Foundations of Geometry”) published in 1903 and 1906. Hilbert
was never moved by Frege’s criticisms, and did not respond to
them after 1900. Frege, for his part, was never convinced of the
reliability of Hilbert’s methods, and held until the end that
the latter’s consistency and independence proofs were fatally
flawed.^{[1]}

In this philosophical debate between the two mathematicians, we see a clash between two quite different ways of understanding the nature of mathematical theories and of their justification. The difference of opinion over the success of Hilbert’s consistency and independence proofs is, as detailed below, the result of significant differences of opinion over such fundamental issues as: how to understand the content of a mathematical theory, what a successful axiomatization consists in, what the “truths” of a mathematical theory really are, and finally, what one is really asking when one asks about the consistency of a set of axioms or the independence of a given mathematical statement from others.

In what follows, we look briefly at Hilbert’s technique in
*Foundations of Geometry*, detail Frege’s various
criticisms thereof, and finally outline the overall conceptions of
logic that give rise to the differences.

## 2. Hilbert’s *Foundations of Geometry*

### 2.1 Outline

Hilbert’s work in *Foundations of Geometry* (hereafter
referred to as “FG”) consists primarily of laying out a
clear and precise set of axioms for Euclidean geometry, and of
demonstrating in detail the relations of those axioms to one another
and to some of the fundamental theorems of geometry. In particular,
Hilbert demonstrates the consistency of various sub-groups of the
axioms, the independence of a number of axioms from others, and
various relations of provability and of independence of important
theorems from specific sub-groups of the axioms. Included are new
demonstrations of the consistency of the entire set of axioms for
Euclidean geometry, and of the independence of the axiom of parallels
from the other Euclidean axioms.

The notion of “independence” at issue here is that of
non-provability: to say that a given statement is *independent
of* a collection of statements is to say that it is not provable
from them. Consistency, too, is understood in terms of provability: to
say that a collection of statements is consistent is to say that no
contradiction is provable from it. Hence the two notions, consistency
and independence, are inter-definable: a set of statements is
consistent if an arbitrarily-chosen contradiction is independent of
it, and a statement *S* is independent of a set *C* if
the set \(C \cup {\sim}S\) is consistent.

Hilbert’s consistency demonstrations in FG are all
demonstrations of *relative* consistency, which is to say that
in each case the consistency of a set *AX* of geometric axioms
is reduced to that of a familiar background theory *B*,
demonstrating that *AX* is consistent if *B* is. The
important technique Hilbert employs is the *reinterpretation*
of the geometric terms appearing in *AX* in such a way that, as
reinterpreted, the members of *AX* express theorems of
*B*. For example, Hilbert’s first consistency-proof
interprets the terms “point”, “line”, and
“lies on” as standing respectively for a particular
collection of ordered pairs of real numbers, for a collection of
ratios of real numbers, and for an algebraically-defined relation
between such pairs and ratios; under this reinterpretation, the
geometric sentences in question express theorems of the background
theory of real numbers.

That such a reinterpretation strategy guarantees relative consistency
can be seen via the following reasoning: If the set *AX* were
inconsistent, then there would be a proof of a contradiction from it.
But since this proof would remain a proof (and the contradiction would
remain a contradiction) when the terms “point,”
“line,” etc. are reinterpreted in Hilbert’s way,
this means that a contradiction would be provable from the resulting
set of theorems of B. And hence B itself would be inconsistent.

Independence is demonstrated in exactly the same way. To show that a
statement *I* is independent of a set *AX* of statements
(relative to the consistency of *B*), one interprets the
relevant geometric terms in such a way that the members of
*AX*, as interpreted, express theorems of *B*, while
*I* expresses the negation of a theorem of *B*. That is,
the independence of *I* from *AX* (relative to the
consistency of *B*) is demonstrated by proving the consistency
of \(\textit{AX} \cup \{{\sim}I\}\) relative to that of
*B*.

The general idea of using interpretations to prove consistency was not
novel in FG; similar strategies had been recently applied in various
mathematical schools to show consistency and independence in
arithmetic and in class theory, as well as in
geometry.^{[2]}
The technique also has antecedents in the earlier use of geometric
models to prove the consistency of non-Euclidean geometries.
^{[3]}
Hilbert’s work in FG brings however a significant advance in
terms of the clarity and systematic application of the technique, and
an influential account of the nature of the metatheoretic reasoning
involved in demonstrating consistency and independence via
reinterpretation. Once Hilbert’s technique is applied to the
sentences of a fully formalized language, a development that took
place in stages over the three decades following FG, we obtain
essentially the modern understanding of models, whose use today in
demonstrations of consistency and independence differs only in detail
from that of Hilbert’s
technique.^{[4]}

Hilbert’s central idea, again, is to focus not on particular
geometrical concepts like *point* and *line*, but to pay
attention instead to the logical relations that are said, by the
axioms, to hold between those concepts. The question of the
independence of the parallels axiom from the other Euclidean axioms,
for example, has entirely to do with the logical structure exhibited
by these axioms, and nothing to do with whether it is geometric
*points* and *lines* one is talking about, or some other
subject-matter altogether. As Hilbert says,

[I]t is surely obvious that every theory is only a scaffolding or schema of concepts together with their necessary relations to one another, and that the basic elements can be thought of in any way one likes. If in speaking of my points I think of some system of things, e.g., the system: love, law, chimney-sweep … and then assume all my axioms as relations between these things, then my propositions, e.g., Pythagoras’ theorem, are also valid for these things. In other words: any theory can always be applied to infinitely many systems of basic elements. (Letter to Frege of December 29, 1899, as excerpted by Frege [ellipsis Hilbert’s or Frege’s] in Frege [PMC]: 40)

There are two important ways, then, in which the geometric terms in FG
serve essentially as placeholders. The first is that the axioms and
theorems of FG are understood as reinterpretable sentences, where a
reinterpretation is simply an assignment of new content to the
geometric terms. The second is that a *proof* – a set of
sentences leading logically from premises to conclusion – relies
not at all on the contents of those simple terms, and so retains its
status as a proof through reinterpretation.

When sentences are viewed in this way, as containing a targeted
collection of re-interpretable terms, a set of sentences can be viewed
as providing a *definition* of a certain kind, a kind typically
referred to as “implicit definition.” Specifically: A set
*AX* of sentences containing *n* reinterpretable terms
implicitly defines an *n*-place relation \(R_{\textit{AX}}\)
holding of just those *n*-tuples which, when taken respectively
as the interpretations of *AX*’s reinterpretable terms,
render the members of *AX* true. (For example: if *AX*
is the set {There are at least two *points*; Every
*point* *lies on* at least two *lines*}, then
\(R_{\textit{AX}}\) is the relation that holds of any triple \(\langle
P, \textit{LO}, L\rangle\) such that *P* has at least two
members, *L* has at least two members, and *LO* is a
relation that holds between each member of *P* and at least two
members of *L*.) The defined relation is simply the abstract
structure, or as Hilbert puts it the “scaffolding”, shared
by any such
*n*-tuple.^{[5]}

When a set of sentences provides an implicit definition of a relation,
one can ask whether that relation (and, by extension, the set of
sentences itself) is *satisfiable*. That is, one can ask
whether there is an *n*-tuple which, when serving as the
interpretation of the relevant terms in the sentences, will make each
sentence true. Each of Hilbert’s consistency-demonstrations in
FG provides an *n*-tuple that satisfies the relevant defined
relation, and hence provides a proof of the satisfiability of that
relation. Satisfiability in this sense is sufficient for consistency,
via the reasoning given
above.^{[6]}

We can now redescribe Hilbert’s technique, in a nutshell, as
follows: Given a set *AX* of sentences, Hilbert appeals to a
background theory *B* to construct an interpretation of
*AX*’s geometric terms under which the members of
*AX* express theorems of *B*. This interpretation is,
assuming the consistency of *B*, an *n*-tuple satisfying
the relation \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) defined by *AX*. Its existence
demonstrates the satisfiability of \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) and
consequently the consistency of *AX* relative to that of
*B*. Similarly, an interpretation under which each member of a
set \(\textit{AX} \cup \{{\sim}I\}\) expresses a theorem of *B*
demonstrates that *I* is independent of *AX* if B is
consistent.

### 2.2 The Novelty of the Strategy

Two crucial featues of Hilbert’s strategy, as we’ve seen,
are (i) the understanding of axioms as reinterpretable sentences, and
(ii) the understanding of provability as insensitive to the meanings
of mathematical terms. The novelty of this approach can be seen by a
comparison with mainstream views of mathematics leading up to the
mid-19th century, and specifically with views of the connection
between proof and conceptual analysis. In geometry, investigations of
the provability of Euclid’s parallels postulate from at least
the time of Proclus until the end of the 18th century involved
detailed attempts to analyze the notion of *straight line*,
with the goal of discovering conceptual connections between the
straightness of a pair of lines and the impossibility of asymptotic
approach. Leibniz, for example, proposed a number of strategies for
reducing the concept *straight line* to simpler concepts, as
part of his sophisticated attempts to prove the parallels postulate
(see DeRisi 2016, esp. Chapter 4). We see the importance of this
concept (and the frustration of the centuries-long failure of attempts
to prove the parallels postulate) in D’Alembert’s remark
that “[t]he definition and the properties of the straight line,
and hence of parallel lines, are therefore the pitfall, and one might
say, the scandal of the elements of Geometry” (D’Alembert
1767, pp. 206–7, as quoted by De Risi 2016, 57n). The main point
to notice here, for our purposes, is the role of conceptual analysis
in settling questions of provability. In the kinds of geometric
investigations relevant to Leibniz and his contemporaries, the term
“straight line” is not merely a reintepretable symbol; the
fact that it stands for a specific kind of geometric entity, one with
clear conceptual connections to spatial intuition and to the other
fundamental concepts of geometry, is critical to questions about the
provability of the claims expressed by sentences involving that term.
Similarly for the remainig geometric terms. The core idea is that
logical connections obtain between sentences (or between the claims
expressed by them) not just in virtue of the superficial structure of
the sentences themselves, but also in virtue of conceptual
connections, sometimes revealed by conceptual analysis and expressed
by definitions, between the contents of individual geometric terms.
Outside of geometry, we see a similar pattern in
19^{th}-century developments in set theory and in real
analyiss, where conceptual clarifications of such notions as
*equi-cardinality* and of *continuous function* played a
central role in the proof of foundational theorems. (See the entries
on
the early development of set theory,
continuity and infinitesimals, and
Bernard Bolzano.)
As Frege puts the general point in 1914:

In the development of science it can indeed happen that one has used a word, a sign, an expression, over a long period under the impression that its sense is simple until one succeeds in analysing it into simpler logical constituents. By means of such an analysis, we may hope to reduce the number of axioms; for it may not be possible to prove a truth containing a complex constituent so long as that constituent remains unanalysed; but it may be possible, given an analysis, to prove it from truths in which the elements of the analysis occur. [Logic in Mathematicsmanuscript; Frege [PW] 209]

The new understanding of axioms and of provability exemplified in
Hilbert’s work effectively separates questions of conceptual
analysis from questions of rigorous proof. When Hilbert asks whether a
given geometric sentence S is provable from a collection AX of
geometric axioms, this is not a question that can be informed by
providing a conceptual analysis of concepts expressed by the relevant
geometric terms. It is instead a question about what we might call the
“formal” provability of S from AX, where a *formal*
proof makes no appeal to the contents of geometric (or other
mathematical) terms. This indifference of provability (and hence of
consistency and independence) to the contents of individual terms
results both in the demonstrability of consistency and independence
via re-interpretations, and in an important increase in the precision
of questions about provability, consistency, and independence. The
question of how best to understand and analyze geometrical concepts,
while still important to decisions about how to present a given theory
- i.e. about which terms and sentences to use - now plays no role in
questions of *provability*, strictly speaking.

The new understanding of axioms as re-interpretable sentences that we
see in *FG* is motivated not just by the increase in precision
that this conception allows, but also by a new conception of
mathematical theories that emerged in the work of a number of
mathematicians at the end of the 19^{th} century. (See the
entry
structuralism in mathematics,
and also Dedekind 1888; Peano 1889; Huntington 1902; Veblen 1904;
Awodey and Reck 2002.) Perhaps most clearly expressed in the work of
Richard Dedekind (1888, 1890), the idea is that a mathematical theory
does not describe a particular collection of objects (say, numbers or
lines in space), but instead characterizes an abstract structure that
can be instantiated by different ordered collections. This view of the
content of mathematical theories, now often termed the
“structuralist” view, goes hand in hand with the idea that
the individual terms of a theory are, as outlined above, placeholders
that can take on any syntactically-permissible content. The abstract
structure-type implicitly defined by a collection of axioms so
understood is, on the structuralist view, the subject-matter of the
mathematical theory so axiomatized. Unlike the earlier Leibnizian
view, then, the newer structuralist view makes it natural to
understand the *provability* of a sentence from other sentences
as a matter of the abstract relations expressed by those sentences
when their geometric terms are re-interpretable placeholders. With
provability so understood, relative consistency and independence are
demonstrable straightforwardly via Hilbert’s reinterpretation
strategy.

We can sum up the important innovations found in the work of a number
of authors at the end of the 19^{th} century, but most clearly
exemplified by Hilbert’s *Foundations of Geometry*, as
follows: The first is the understanding of rigorous provability, and
hence of consistency and independence, as independent of the meanings
of targeted (e.g. geometric) terms. This makes it possible to
demonstrate relative consistency and independence via the technique of
reinterpretation. The second is the understanding of mathematical
theories, and their axioms, as characterizing not a particular
collection of objects, but a multiply-instantiable abstract structure.
The latter innovation is not essential to the effectiveness of the
re-interpretation strategy in proving consistency and independence,
but it is a way of understanding mathematical theories that makes the
first innovation, and hence the reinterpretation strategy, especially
natural.

## 3. Frege—Background And Initial Differences

Frege’s view of mathematical theories is in many ways similar to
the older tradition sketched above. A mathematical theory, for Frege,
has a particular subject-matter: number theory is about the natural
numbers; geometry is about figures in space; and so on. Frege takes it
that the *sentences* we use in mathematics are important only
because of the nonlinguistic propositions (or, as he puts it, the
“thoughts”) they express. Mathematicians working in French
and in German are working on the same subject because, as Frege sees
it, their sentences express the same thoughts. Each thought is about a
determinate subject-matter, and says something true or false about
that
subject-matter.^{[7]}
Thoughts are also on this view the things that logically imply or
contradict one another, the things that are true or false, and the
things that together constitute mathematical theories. Hence, in
Frege’s view, thoughts, rather than sentences, are the items
about which the questions of consistency and independence arise.

Because each thought has a determinate subject-matter, it makes no sense to talk about the “reinterpretation” of thoughts. The kind of reinterpretation that Hilbert engages in, i.e., of assigning different meanings to specific words, is something that can apply only to sentences, from the Fregean point of view. Accordingly, the first difficulty Frege notes with Hilbert’s approach is that it is not clear what Hilbert means by “axioms:” if he means the kinds of things for which issues of consistency and independence can arise, then he must be talking about thoughts, while if he means the kinds of things that are susceptible of multiple interpretations, then he must be talking about sentences.

The difficulties multiply from here. When Hilbert provides a specific
reinterpretation of the geometric terms *en route* to proving
the relative consistency of a set *AX* of sentences, Frege
notes that we now have two different sets of thoughts in play: the set
we might call “\(\textit{AX}_{G}\)” of thoughts expressed
when *AX*’s terms take their ordinary geometric meanings
(e.g., on which “point” means *point*) and the set
we might call “\(\textit{AX}_{R}\)” of thoughts expressed
when *AX*’s terms take the meanings assigned by
Hilbert’s re-interpretation (on which, e.g., “point”
means *pair of real numbers*). Hilbert’s reinterpretation
strategy involves, from Frege’s point of view, simply shifting
our attention from the set \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) of thoughts ordinarily
expressed by the sentences *AX* (and in whose consistency we
are interested) to the new set \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) of thoughts
expressed by *AX* under the reinterpretation. And the fact that
the reinterpreted sentences express truths about real numbers has
little to do, from Frege’s perspective, with the consistency and
independence questions that arise for the original thoughts about
points, lines, and planes.

In addition to the confusing (as Frege sees it) practice of shifting back and forth between different sets of thoughts while discussing a given set of sentences, Hilbert’s procedure also involves, as Frege sees it, two further questionable aspects.

The first concerns the need for consistency proofs. On Frege’s view, the axioms of a theory always form a collection of true thoughts; and since truth implies consistency, the consistency of a collection of axioms is never in need of demonstration. For Hilbert on the other hand, the fact that a collection of sentences is taken as axiomatic is no guarantee of truth (or of truth under a given interpretation), and a demonstration of consistency is often a crucial step in establishing the mathematical respectability of that collection of axioms.

Secondly, Hilbert and Frege differ importantly over the connection between consistency and existence. Taking a theory to be axiomatized by a set of multiply-interpretable sentences, Hilbert’s view is that the consistency of such a set suffices for the existence of the (or a) collection of mathematical entities mentioned in the theory. The consistency, for example, of a theory of complex numbers is all that’s needed to justify the mathematical practice of reasoning in terms of such numbers. For Frege on the other hand, consistency can never guarantee existence. His preferred example to make this point is that the consistency (in Hilbert’s sense) of the trio of sentences

*A*is an intelligent being*A*is omnipresent*A*is omnipotent

is insufficient to guarantee their instantiation. (See, e.g., Frege’s letter to Hilbert of 6 January 1900; Frege [PMC]: 47.)

The central difference between Frege and Hilbert over the nature of
axioms, i.e. over the question whether axioms are determinately true
claims about a fixed subject-matter or reinterpretable sentences
expressing multiply-instantiable conditions, is essentially the
difference outlined above, between an older and a newer (ca 1900) way
of thinking of mathematical theories and their
axioms.^{[8]}
This issue
still animates much work in the philosophy of mathematics, not just
with respect to the question of how best to understand specific
mathematical theories (e.g., Euclidean geometry or real analysis), but
also with respect to the question whether the structuralist approach
to mathematical theories requres that there be some foundational
theories – whose subject matter supplies the material for
interpreting the remaining theories – the axioms of which must
be understood in some non-structuralist vein. See the entries on
philosophy of mathematics,
and
set theory.

The second issue that divides Frege and Hilbert, regarding the justifiability of the inference from consistency to existence, is also still alive. While everybody (including presumably Hilbert) would agree with Frege that outside of the mathematical domain we cannot safely infer existence from consistency, the question remains whether we can (or must) do so within mathematics. The Fregean point of view is that the existence of mathematical objects can only be proven (if at all) by appeal to more fundamental principles, while the Hilbertian point of view is that in appropriate purely-mathematical cases, there is nothing more to be demonstrated, in order to establish existence, than the consistency of a theory (see entries on philosophy of mathematics and Platonism in the philosophy of mathematics).

Despite these differences, Frege and Hilbert agree that there are important mathematical questions to be asked regarding consistency and independence, and they agree that, e.g., the classic question of the independence of the parallels postulate from the remainder of Euclidean geometry is a significant one. But they disagree, as noted above, about whether Hilbert’s procedure suffices to settle these questions. We turn next to the issue of Frege’s rationale for rejecting Hilbert’s method for proving consistency and independence.

## 4. The Deeper Disagreement

As noted above, Frege views Hilbert’s reinterpretations as
involving a shift of attention from geometric thoughts (whose
consistency and independence are at issue) to thoughts of a wholly
different kind, those about the background theory B (whose consistency
and independence are not in question). Regarding consistency proofs,
his view is that Hilbert makes an illegitimate inference from the
consistency of a collection \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) of thoughts about real
numbers to the consistency of a collection \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) of
thoughts about geometric points, lines, and planes. Frege acknowledges
that Hilbert’s set *AX* of sentences can be understood as
providing an implicit definition of an abstract relation
\(R_{\textit{AX}}\), one that is satisfied by Hilbert’s
constructed *n*-tuples, and that the consistency (i.e.,
satisfiability) of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) entails the consistency of that
defined relation. But here too, Frege takes it that Hilbert’s
crucial inference, from the consistency of the abstract relataion
\(R_{\textit{AX}}\) to the consistency of the collection
\(\textit{AX}_{G}\)of thoughts, is problematic. As Frege himself puts
it, referring to \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) and \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) as
“special geometries”, and to \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) as the
“general case:”

[G]iven that the axioms in special geometries are all special cases of general axioms, one can conclude from lack of contradiction in a special geometry to lack of contradiction in the general case, but not to lack of contradiction in another special case. (Letter of January 6, 1900 in Frege [PMC]: 48)

Once he has pointed out what he takes to be the questionable inference, Frege takes it that the burden of argument is squarely with Hilbert: if Hilbert thinks that the consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) follows from either the consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) or from the satisfiability of \(R_{\textit{AX}}\), then it is up to Hilbert to show this. Frege does not go out of his way to demonstrate that the crucial inference is invalid, but seems to take his point to have been essentially made once he has pointed out the need for a justification here.

From Hilbert’s point of view, of course, there is no need for
such a justification. The differences that Frege insists on over and
over again between the sets of sentences (*AX*) and the
different sets of thoughts (\(\textit{AX}_{G}\), \(\textit{AX}_{R}\)
etc.) are entirely inconsequential from Hilbert’s standpoint.
Because consistency as Hilbert understands it applies to the
“scaffolding” of concepts and relations defined by
*AX* when its geometric terms are taken as place-holders, the
consistency he has in mind holds (to put it in terms of thoughts) of
\(\textit{AX}_{G}\) iff it holds of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\), since both
sets of thoughts are instantiations of the same
“scaffolding”. The same point can be put in terms of
sentences: Frege insists that the consistency-question that arises for
the sentences under their geometric interpretation is a different
issue from the one that arises for those sentences under their
real-number interpretation; for Hilbert on the other hand, there is
just one question, and it is answered in the affirmative if there is
any interpretation under which the sentences express truths. Hence
while Frege takes it that Hilbert owes an explanation of the inference
from the consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) to that of
\(\textit{AX}_{G}\), for Hilbert there is simply no inference.

Frege’s lack of clarity about his reasons for rejecting
Hilbert’s procedure leaves an interpretive gap, with respect to
which there is room for controversy. We should recall, to begin with,
that Hilbert is clearly right that his own reinterpretation strategy
suffices for the relative consistency and independence results he
claims. If consistency and independence are understood, as above, in
terms of non-provability, and if *proof* is, as Hilbert
assumes, independent of the meanings of geometric terms, then
\(\textit{AX}_{R}\), \(\textit{AX}_{G}\), and even *AX* itself
are all consistent if one of them is. Frege’s rejection of
Hilbert’s technique must involve, then, either some confusion
about what Hilbert has established, or a different understanding of
what is at issue in claims of consistency and independence.

One way to understand Frege’s contribution to the Frege-Hilbert
debate, then, is to recognize the contributions Frege makes in
clarifying Hilbert’s own approach to axioms, but to hold that
Frege’s negative assessment of Hilbert’s technique for
proving consistency and independence is mistaken. On this account,
despite the difference between Frege and Hilbert over the nature of
axioms, nevertheless the satisfiability of \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) does
show the consistency of the collection of axioms in question, whether
one conceives of those axioms in Hilbert’s way as sentences
(i.e., as the collection *AX*) or in Frege’s way as
thoughts (i.e., as the collection \(\textit{AX}_{G}\)). Similarly for
independence. Frege’s mistake, on this view, is to have failed
to notice that the kind of *non-provability* result (i.e.,
consistency or independence) that Hilbert takes his reinterpretations
to demonstrate for geometric sentences entails a corresponding
non-provability (consistency or independence) result for geometric
thoughts (see Resnik 1974, Currie 1982, Dummett 1975).

The second interpretation argues that Frege’s understanding of
consistency and independence is sufficiently different from
Hilbert’s that the entailment in question does not hold: that
the satisfiability of \(R_{\textit{AX}}\), and the consequent
consistency in Hilbert’s sense of *AX*, does not entail
the consistency in Frege’s sense of \(\textit{AX}_{G}\).
Similarly for independence. According to this interpretation, Frege is
right to claim that Hilbert’s demonstrations fail to show
consistency and independence in the sense in which he, Frege,
understands these
terms.^{[9]}

The central idea of the second interpretation is that for Frege, the
question whether a given thought is provable from a collection of
thoughts is sensitive not just to the formal structure of the
sentences used to express those thoughts, but also to the contents of
the simple (e.g., geometric) terms that appear in those sentences. On
this account, Frege’s understanding of provability is similar to
the earlier tradition outlined above, and exemplified in
Leibniz’s work. If Frege does in fact take provability to be
content-sensitive in this way, then we see immediately that the
consistency of \(\textit{AX}_{R}\) does not entail the consistency of
\(\textit{AX}_{G}\), since the question whether a contradiction is
provable from \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) may turn in part on the specifically
geometric parts of the thoughts in question, i.e., on the usual
geometric meanings of *AX*’s geometric terms. To choose
an illustrative example, though not one that Frege himself gives,
consider the pair of sentences

- Point
*B*lies on a line between points*A*and*C*; - Point
*B*does not lie on a line between points*C*and*A*.

This pair of sentences is demonstrably consistent in Hilbert’s sense. But on the interpretation of Frege suggested here, this consistency (in Hilbert’s sense) does not ensure that the thoughts expressed by these sentences under their ordinary interpretation form a consistent collection. If, for example, Frege understands the relation ‘between’ as susceptible to conceptual analysis in such a way that its definition underwrites the proof of a contradiction from (the thoughts expressed by) the pair of sentences, then that pair is, in Frege’s sense, inconsistent.

The idea that Frege takes provability to be sensitive to conceptual
analysis in the way just suggested is taken, on this account, to be
evident in the strategy Frege employs in his life-long attempt to
demonstrate his logicist thesis, the thesis that the truths of
arithmetic are provable from pure logic. In the course of that
project, Frege regularly provides demonstrations that a given thought
τ follows logically from a set *T* of thoughts, in a way
that involves two steps. First, Frege subjects τ and/or the
members of *T* to conceptual analysis, bringing out
previously-unrecognized conceptual complexity in those thoughts.
Secondly, he proves the thus-analyzed version of τ from the
thus-analyzed members of *T*. For example, Frege takes himself
to demonstrate that the thought expressed by

- (i)
- The sum of two multiples of a number is a multiple of that number

follows logically from the thoughts expressed by

- (ii)
- \(\forall m\; \forall n\; \forall p((m+n)+p = m+(n+p))\)

and by

- (iii)
- \(\forall n (n = n+0).\)

The demonstration proceeds by providing a careful analysis of the
notion of “multiple of” in terms of addition, giving us in
place of (i) a more-complex (i′) which is then proven from (ii)
and
(iii).^{[10]}
Similarly, a significant part of Frege’s logicist project
consists of the careful analysis of such arithmetical notions as
*zero* and *successor*, analysis which brings out
previously-unnoticed complexity, and facilitates the proof of
arithmetical truths. (For a discussion of the logicist project, see
entries on
Frege
and
logicism and neologicism.)

As Frege puts it in the early pages of his *Foundations of
Arithmetic*, when we are trying to prove the truths of arithmetic
from the simplest possible starting-points,

… we very soon come to propositions which cannot be proved so long as we do not succeed in analysing concepts which occur in them into simpler concepts or in reducing them to something of greater generality. (Frege 1884: §4)

In short: the components of thoughts can sometimes be analyzed in terms of simpler or more general constituents, in a way that brings to light previously-hidden relations of logical entailment. Hence when we want to know whether a given thought is logically entailed by a set of thoughts, we need to pay attention, from Frege’s point of view, not just to the overall structure exhibited by the sentences expressing those thoughts, but also to the contents of the individual terms that appear in those sentences.

The connection between this aspect of Frege’s work and his views
regarding independence, on the interpretation in question, is as
follows. Because we can sometimes discover that a thought τ is
logically entailed by a set *T* of thoughts only after a
careful analysis of some of the apparently-simple components of those
thoughts, so too we will sometimes be able to discover that a set of
thoughts is inconsistent, i.e., that it logically entails a
contradiction, on the basis of such conceptual analysis. Hence the
consistency of the set of thoughts expressed by a set Σ of
sentences is something which turns not just on the overall structure
of the sentences in Σ, but on the meanings of the terms
appearing in Σ’s sentences.

To clarify this last point, let’s look at a non-mathematical
example, one which neither Hilbert nor Frege explicitly dealt with.
Consider the set of sentences {Jones had a nightmare, Jones
didn’t have a dream}, or equivalently its first-order rendition,
\(\{Nj, {{\sim}Dj}\}\). The set is clearly consistent in the sense
used by Hilbert in FG; it is a straightforward matter to provide
interpretations of “Jones”, “*x* had a
nightmare” and “*x* had a dream” (or of
“*j*”, “*N*”, and
“*D*”) such that the sentences, so interpreted,
express truths. (Consider, for example, an interpretation on which
“*j*” is assigned the number 7,
“*N*” the set of prime numbers, and
“*D*” the set of numbers greater than 12.) But from
the Fregean point of view, the thoughts expressed are arguably
inconsistent, since part of what it is to have a nightmare is to have
a dream. The inconsistency from Frege’s point of view can be
demonstrated by providing an analysis of the thoughts expressed, and
noting that the results of this analysis yield the set {Jones had a
disturbing dream, Jones didn’t have a dream}.

For the same reason, two sets of thoughts that are structurally similar in the sense that they can be expressed, under different interpretations, by the same set of sentences, can differ with respect to Frege-consistency. As applied to the geometric context, the central idea, on this account of Frege’s objection to Hilbert, is that the kinds of re-interpretation in which Hilbert engages can take one from a consistent set of thoughts (e.g., \(\textit{AX}_{R}\)) to an inconsistent one (e.g., \(\textit{AX}_{G}\)) because of the shift in subject-matter, hence invalidating the inference from the consistency of the first to the consistency of the second. Equivalently, the inference from the consistency of the general relation \(R_{\textit{AX}}\) to the consistency of the set of geometric thoughts \(\textit{AX}_{G}\) is, on this understanding of Frege’s conception of consistency, invalid, since the additional geometric content involved in the latter is a potential source of inconsistency. As Frege puts it in a letter to Liebmann,

As far as the lack of contradiction and mutual independence of the axioms is concerned, Hilbert’s investigation of these questions is vitiated by the fact that the sense of the axioms is by no means securely fixed... I have reasons for believing that the mutual independence of the axioms ofEuclideangeometry cannot be proved. Hilbert tries to do it by widening the area so that Euclidean geometry appears as a special case; and in this wider area he can now show lack of contradiction by examples; but only in this wider area; for from lack of contradiction in a more comprehensive area we cannot infer lack of contradiction in a narrower area; for contradictions might enter in just because of the restriction. (Letter to Liebmann 29 July 1900, in Frege [PMC]: 91)

Frege does not claim to demonstrate the existence of such latent contradictions in any specific cases. That is, he does not provide conceptual analyses which reveal inconsistencies where Hilbert claims to have shown consistency, and there is no evidence that he takes any of Hilbert’s specific consistency-claims to be false. That Frege might have had some such analyses in mind is hinted at in a letter to Hilbert in which he claims that in his own unfinished investigations into the foundations of geometry, he was able to “make do with fewer primitive terms”, which presumably means that he takes some of the terms treated as primitive by Hilbert to be susceptible of analysis via others (see the letter to Hilbert of December 27, 1899 in Frege [PMC]: 34). Any such analysis would reveal relations of logical dependence (from Frege’s point of view) where Hilbert would find independence.

Because none of Frege’s work on this topic has survived, we have no details about the specific analyses he might have given. The crucial point in Frege’s criticism of Hilbert, however, on this account, is not a disagreement about particular analyses or the consequent failure of particular consistency and independence claims, but is instead about the general methodology of consistency and independence proofs. Because for Hilbert the consistency of a set of sentences turns entirely on the overall structure they exhibit, while for Frege the consistency of the set of thoughts expressed turns additionally on the contents of the non-logical terms appearing in the sentences, on this account, Hilbert-consistency doesn’t imply Frege-consistency.

## 5. Lingering Issues

We have surveyed two ways of understanding Frege’s objections to Hilbert’s techniques for proving consistency and independence. The first takes Frege to be fundamentally mistaken, with the error located in his failure to appreciate the connection between the satisfiability of a set of reinterpretable sentences and the associated independence/consistency claims. The second takes Frege to be fundamentally correct in the sense that (i) he understands the consistency and independence of thoughts to turn not just on the surface syntax of the sentences that express them but also on the contents of the simple terms used in their expression, and (ii) consistency and independence, so understood, are not demonstrable in Hilbert’s manner.

Neither of these interpretive options is entirely unproblematic. An important difficulty with the first is its attribution to Frege of a severe degree of confusion about the force of Hilbert’s re-interpretations, which is arguably in some tension with the fact that, generally speaking, Frege’s account of Hilbert’s methodological procedure in FG is considerably clearer than is Hilbert’s own. A further source of difficulty is that the understanding of independence attributed on this account to Frege is in tension with the understanding of logical entailment that figures centrally in his logicist work, an understanding on which the contents of mathematical terms can be crucial to questions of logical entailment. The second interpretation, though more charitable to Frege and more in keeping with his general work in logic, arguably suffers from the lack of explicit mention by Frege of the relevance of conceptual analysis to questions of consistency and independence.

A final source of potential difficulty for any account of Frege’s views of independence and consistency is the very interesting Part (iii) of the 1906 “Foundations of Geometry” essay. The importance of that text, and the interpretive difficulties it poses, can be sketched as follows.

The 1906 “Foundations of Geometry” essay is primarily a
re-statement of Frege’s earlier objections (discussed above) to
Hilbert’s treatment of consistency and independence. After a
rehearsal of those objections, Frege turns in Part iii to the problem
of giving a positive method for proving independence. How, he asks,
*might* one prove a given thought independent of a collection
of thoughts? In answer, Frege provides a sketch of a potential method,
and ends the discussion by noting that the method sketched is still
incomplete, and that it faces some difficulties. Despite its obvious
incompleteness, Frege never (as far as we can tell) returns to the
proposal, and would seem in the end to have found it unsatisfactory.
That he thought it unsatisfactory in principle is indicated by his
claim four years later, in a note to Jourdain, that the unprovability
of the parallels axiom cannot be proven (see Frege [PMC]: 183n). That
is, he would seem in 1910 to maintain his earlier view that there is
no systematic method for proving
independence.^{[11]}

The 1906 proposal itself can be outlined as follows. Suppose, says Frege, that we have a collection C of sentences each of which expresses a determinate thought, and a sentence S that similarly expresses a determinate thought. The heart of the proposed method for proving the independence of the S-thought from the C-thoughts is that we employ a mapping μ of terms to terms (and hence also of sentences to sentences) that preserves syntactic type (mapping names to names, one-place predicates to one-place predicates, etc.) and maps ’logical’ terms to themselves. Then: the S-thought is independent of the C-thoughts if μ maps S to a false sentence while mapping all the members of C to true sentences. (For discussion and development of Frege’s proposal, see Antonelli & May 2000, Eder 2016. For discussion of Frege’s reasons for rejecting the proposal, see Ricketts 1997, Eder 2013, Blanchette 2014.)

The first intriguing thing about the proposal is its striking
similarity to Hilbert’s method. Assuming Frege’s language
to be rich enough to include terms for all of the objects, functions
and sets that Hilbert might use in reinterpretations, there will
arguably be a mapping of the kind Frege describes if and only if there
is a reinterpretation of the kind Hilbert uses to show (his version
of) independence: where Hilbert’s reinterpretation provides a
term *t* with new content, Frege’s method would simply
map *t* to a new term with that very content. And this would
mean that, despite all of the objections raised by Frege,
Hilbert’s method would in the end suffice to demonstrate what
Frege regards (in 1906) as the independence of thoughts. If this is
correct, then we have reason to doubt any interpretation of Frege on
which his rejection of Hilbert’s method is justified, and we
have in particular a reason to reject the view that consistency and
independence, for Frege, are sensitive to the contents of mathematical
(e.g. geometric) terms.

The central reasons one might doubt the strong equivalence just suggested between Hilbert’s method and Frege’s proposal are (i) that it is not clear whether the class of terms Frege would count as “logical”, i.e., the class whose members μ must map to themselves, is the same as the class of terms that Hilbert would count as having a fixed interpretation; and most importantly (ii) that it is not clear just what kind of language Frege has in mind. Regarding the first: if Frege’s class of fixed terms is wider than is Hilbert’s, and/or Frege’s language lacks some of the terminology of Hilbert’s, then a demonstration of independence in Hilbert’s sense will not imply the existence of a mapping demonstrating independence in Frege’s sense. Regarding the second: the crucial question is whether terms like “number” or “between”, terms that Frege treats as susceptible to conceptual analysis, will appear in the kind of language that Frege is concerned with (as opposed, say, to requiring the language to contain only “fully-analyzed” terms), and whether such terms will be amongst those that μ maps to arbitrary new terminology. Frege himself notes the importance of the first terminological demarcation problem just raised, i.e., the problem of determining which terms are mapped to themselves, and remarks that this problem is one that would need to be addressed in order to turn his sketch into a workable strategy. Because he never answers the question of the fixed terminology or of the kind of language in question, Frege’s proposal is not sufficiently determinate for a clear comparison with Hilbert’s. We are left, then, with the interpretive issue of making sense of Frege’s proposal of a method and what appears to be his subsequent repudiation of it, while recognizing the incomplete nature of that proposal. (For further discussion of the 1906 text, see: Ricketts 1997, Tappenden 2000, Blanchette 2014.)

## 6. Conclusion

Because claims of consistency and of independence are fundamentally
claims of *non*-entailment or of *un*provability, it is
not obvious, even once we are in possession of strong techniques for
proving mathematical results, how one might go about proving
consistency and independence. What Hilbert offers us, in 1899, is a
systematic and powerful technique that can be used across all
formalized disciplines to do just this: to prove consistency and
independence. In doing so, he lays the groundwork, in concert with
various of his contemporaries, for the emergence of contemporary
model-theoretic techniques. (For further discussion, see Mancosu,
Zach, & Badesa 2009; also see entry on
nineteenth-century geometry.)

What we find through Frege’s rejection and Hilbert’s
defense of that technique is a clarification of the assumptions that
are essential for its success. As we have seen, the crucial feature of
*proof* that must be assumed, in order for a Hilbert-style
reinterpretation to demonstrate an *unprovability* result, is
that provability is insensitive to the contents of those terms that
Hilbert takes to be reinterpretable—in this case, the geometric
terms. The alternative view of consistency and independence, on which
entailment and provability are sensitive to the contents of geometric
terms, is one with respect to which Hilbert-style reinterpretations
cannot demonstrate consistency and independence so understood. As
outlined above, the reading of Frege on which he holds such a view of
consistency and independence provides a rationale for his objections
to Hilbert, and an alternative account of what is at stake in claims
of geometric consistency and independence.

Despite the clear failure of communication between Hilbert and Frege, their debate brings to light a number of important issues, not least of which are (i) the role of schematically-understood sentences in providing implicit definitions, which Frege articulates more clearly on Hilbert’s behalf than Hilbert had yet done, and (ii) the extent to which the logical relations are to be treated as “formal”. On this last issue, the difference between Frege and Hilbert is instructive. Long before the debate with Hilbert, Frege already held that logical rigor requires the use of formal systems of deduction, “formal” in the sense that all thoughts are expressed via precisely-determined sentences, and that all inference-rules and axioms are presented syntactically (see, e.g., Frege 1879). Most important for our purposes is the fact that Frege’s formal systems are entirely modern in the sense that the derivability in such a system of a sentence from a set of sentences turns just on the syntactic form of those sentences. The famous conceptual analyses on which much of Frege’s work turns are all provided prior to proof; it is on the basis of conceptual analyses that one arrives at the appropriate sentences to treat within the formal system, but the analyses themselves play no role within the derivations proper. Hence when it comes to the positive work of demonstrating that a given sentence is derivable from a set of sentences, Frege is just like Hilbert: meanings don’t matter. Indeed, at the time of their correspondence, Frege’s work was considerably more “formal” than Hilbert’s, since Hilbert at this time was not using an explicit syntactically-defined system of deduction.

Nevertheless, Frege’s conception of logic has the result that
there is only a one-way connection between logical implication (or
provability) as this holds between thoughts and formal derivability as
this holds between sentences. Given a good formal system, a sentence
σ is deducible from a set Σ only if the thought expressed
by σ is in fact logically entailed by the thoughts expressed by
the members of Σ. (This simply requires that one’s axioms
and rules of inference are well-chosen.) But the converse is false:
that σ is *not* deducible in such a system from Σ
is no guarantee that the thought expressed by σ is independent
of the set of thoughts expressed by the members of Σ. For it may
well be, as in the cases treated explicitly by Frege’s own
analyses, that further analysis of the thoughts and their components
will yield a more-complex structure. When this happens, the analysis
may return yet-more complex (sets of) sentences σ′ and
Σ′ such that σ′ is, after all, deducible from
Σ′. According to the more-charitable of the two
interpretive options outlined above, this is the explanation of
Frege’s rejection of Hilbert’s treatment of consistency
and independence in geometry. As we might put it, because considerable
logical complexity can lie undiscovered in the thoughts expressed by
relatively-simple sentences, non-derivability is no guarantee of
independence, in the Fregean scheme of things. There is a significant
gap, as one might put it, between the logical and the formal.

For Hilbert on the other hand, at least in the context of axiomatized geometry, the logical relations simply are the formally-describable relations, since they have entirely to do with the structure exhibited by the sentences in question, or equivalently with the “scaffolding” of concepts defined by these sentences. It is because consistency in Hilbert’s sense turns just on this abstract structure, and not on the contents of the terms instantiating the structure, that the reinterpretation strategy is effective.

Hilbert is clearly the winner in this debate, in the sense that roughly his conception of consistency is what one means today by “consistency” in the context of formal theories, and a near relative of his methodology for consistency-proofs is now standard. We now routinely take consistency and independence, as Hilbert does, to hold independently of the meanings of the so-called “non-logical” terms, and hence to be straightforwardly demonstrable in essentially Hilbert’s way. This is not to say that Frege’s objections have been met, but rather that they have essentially been sidestepped via the enshrinement of the formal notion of consistency, and a lack of concern, at least under that title, with what Frege called “consistency”.

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*History and Philosophy of Logic*, 18(4): 201–209. doi:10.1080/01445349708837289

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Sterrett, Susan G., 1994, “Frege and Hilbert on the Foundations of Geometry,” [PDF] (1994 Talk).

### Acknowledgments

Thanks to Edward N. Zalta for helpful suggestions on this entry.