Civic Humanism

First published Tue Mar 19, 2019; substantive revision Tue Jan 2, 2024

Although widely and commonly confused with republicanism, civic humanism forms a separate and distinct phenomenon in the history of Western political thought. Republicanism is a political philosophy that defends a concept of freedom as non-domination, and identifies the institutions that protect it (Pettit 1999). In particular, republicanism stands against two alternative theories of politics. The first is despotism, especially as manifested in any form of one-man rule; a republic is self-governing, and so are its denizens. The second is liberalism, which posits the primacy of the autonomous individual vis-à-vis public order and government; the republican values civic engagement in order to realize a form of liberty achievable only in and through the community. Republican theorists sometimes refer to writings by historically antecedent authors, such as Aristotle or Machiavelli, but their concern is not primarily accurate interpretation. Rather, to the extent that they show an interest in the past, it is as a source of ideas that they find useful.

By contrast, civic humanism is a historiographical construct. As conventionally employed by scholars, the term refers to a group of thinkers who emerged during the period of the Italian Renaissance, especially in Florence, and who were committed to public engagement (in theory as well as practice) and whose values were fundamentally antithetical to the medieval past. The “invention” of civic humanism is primarily associated with Hans Baron (1900–1988), the famed German-American historian (Fubini 1992). Although he first used the phrase in its original German form (Bürgerhumanismus) as early as 1925, its popularity stems from the publication in 1955 of his classic book The Crisis of the Early Italian Renaissance: Civic Humanism and Republican Liberty in an Age of Classicism and Tyranny (revised 1966). In this volume, as well as in later writings that built upon it (many collected in Baron 1968 and 1988), he developed what has come to be called the “Baron thesis” (Witt 1996; Hankins 1995). Baron was not, however, the first scholar to propose that the form of humanism that emerged during the fifteenth century in the Italian cities mainly promoted the civic vita activa rather than the literary and philological pursuits ordinarily ascribed to the humanists. In two books from 1952 and 1954, written and published in Italian, Eugenio Garin defended a position almost identical to that of Baron’s: Renaissance humanism, especially as propounded in Florence, reflects a pronounced shift from the emphasis on contemplation typical of the Middle Ages to the priority of civil action to attain a common good (Garin 1947 [1965]). (If not for purely contingent reasons, the historiographical label for civic humanism might readily have been “the Garin thesis”.) In the present context, it should be noted that some advocates of civic humanism were disposed toward republicanism, but the latter is not entailed by the former.

1. The Baron Thesis

Baron used the term civic humanism to describe the fusion of two distinct currents of Florentine thought: apolitical so-called “Petrarchan” humanism, on the one hand, and the Guelf tradition of patriotic resistance by the Florentine city-state to imperial domination, on the other (Kallendorf 1996). The “rebirth” of ancient letters and wisdom (studia humanitas) marked a revolutionary change in the European mind, but it remained limited to the contemplative pleasure and edification of quietist poets and scholars until the beginning of the fifteenth century. Thereafter, it merged with the assertive defense of the sovereign independence of the increasingly rich, powerful, and confident merchant cities of Italy. The fusion was effected, according to Baron, as a response to a crisis, namely, the reaction of the intellectual and political leadership of Florence to the aggressive expansionism of the despots of Milan. The resulting exaltation of liberty combined patriotic self-defense with the upholding of a republican way of life that departed from medieval ideals by asserting worldly values and embracing the active life in a manner evocative of the republics of antiquity. According to Baron’s thesis, in the face of military danger the patterns of society, economy, and politics came to cohere in a culture, i.e., an ethos infused with an educational vision. The main champions of this were the great chancellors of the Florentine Republic, Coluccio Salutati and, especially, Leonardo Bruni, top civil servants and public intellectuals combined, who restored the practical pertinence of classical learning in the process of establishing the terms of a new civil consensus.

Beyond seeking to identify civic humanism with a particular time and place, Baron studied the political culture of Renaissance Florence as an instance of an exemplary mode of communal existence. Florentine civic humanism represented for him furthermore a decisive turning point in history. For Baron it was an epochal event that, by looking backward to antiquity, pointed forward to modernity—a movement that he embraced wholeheartedly as a liberating, civilizing, progressive process. The advent of civic humanism marked for Baron the victory of secular economic, social, and political ideals versus the asceticism, religious obscurantism, and hierarchy of the Middle Ages (see Yoran 2007). Civic humanism provided the vital vehicle for the translation of the exalted ancient idea of citizenship to the modern age. The humanist defense of republican liberty against monarchical tyranny announced for him the beginnings of modern democratic thought, elevated by an educational ideal of classical inspiration, and accompanied by renewed cultural creativity. Civic humanism was thus the harbinger of the unequivocally positive trends in modern European civilization. The value of such achievements appeared all the more compelling since they were not theoretical postulates derived from abstract speculation, but represented historically realized exempla.

Baron’s reconstruction of civic humanism was not only directed against other-worldly values and notions of medieval deference, but also against different modes of construing modernity in terms of the autonomy of the self. At issue here, beyond the characterization of a historical period, was the definition and evaluation of modernity itself. Baron wished to see the autonomous humanity he perceived emerging in quattrocento Florence integrated within a constitutional frame and anchored by patriotic attachment to the community. Baron advocated a vast scholarly program to establish the Italian humanist tradition as a major source of modernity. The polities he posited as commendable are not conceived as formal frames of individual life goals—in other words, empty liberalism—but textured wholes into which human autonomy is woven. To state it somewhat anachronistically, accepting the nexus of public solidarity embedded in civic humanism, and viewing it as an equivalent of civil society, Baron’s thesis overlaps considerably with today’s communitarianism.

2. Civic Humanism and Republicanism

As previously suggested, both Baron and Garin generally regarded civic humanism as an equivalent to or as a particular variant of republicanism, meaning a conception of politics in which government is in principle the common business of the citizens. The “city” provides the environment—a public space—for human fulfillment. More specifically, they appear to believe that civic humanism derives from classical republicanism of some variety ascribed to Aristotle, Cicero, and Polybius among others (although knowledge of Book VI of the latter’s Histories before the beginning of the sixteenth century is disputed [Nederman 2016; Hankins 2016; Monfasani 2016]). Civic humanism is linked in principle to a classical educational program that goes beyond the formative capacity of participatory citizenship itself and involves the conscious revival of ancient ideals. Republican candor, simplicity of manner, opposition to ostentation, luxury and lucre, are common, though not universal, republican themes. Civic humanists, it is said, promote republican ideals responding to the fragility of the republic and the need to provide against its corruption and decay with the passage of time.

According to Baron, numerous civic humanist theorists emphasized that the republic requires widespread civic virtue, i.e., the active engagement of citizens united by a concern for the common good. The virtues of citizenship are in turn developed and enhanced by being exercised in upholding republican political and legal institutions and making them work by being involved in their operation. Republican life is then thought to be formative of the public spirit on which it rests. Republican freedom depends on constant civic activity. The polity is taken to cohere by means of the common acceptance of standards of justice that are more than procedural rules. The purpose of the commonwealth is the realization of human potentiality, encouraging the flowering of all forms of creativity and ingenuity insofar as they contribute to public welfare. The republic is the necessary medium of self-realization, not merely the condition of possibility of private endeavors. There is a link furthermore between the freedom of the citizen and the independence of the republic. Citizen armies and the right to bear arms are therefore common postulates of republican theory. Adherents to the “Baron thesis” use all of these confluences of civic humanism and republicanism to support their contention that the two positions are inseparable.

One important extension of Baron’s position has been proposed by John Pocock (1975). Pocock takes Renaissance civic humanism to be an estimable manifestation of republican and patriotic collective sentiment. For Pocock as well as Baron, civic humanism must be considered the response to a crisis amounting to what Machiavelli would call an occasione, a moment of disorder that gives scope to the formative activity of a new beginning that nevertheless looks to the past in order to guide its future. The dilemma faced by Florentine civic humanists, according to Pocock, was to fit the idea of an Aristotelian polis within the framework of a Christian understanding of time. One answer to the experience of disorder was the explicitly millenarian exaltation of the leader of Florence’s republic from 1494 to 1498, the Dominican preacher Girolamo Savonarola. In Pocock’s view, civic humanism provided a secular alternative to Savanarola’s prophetic republicanism, in the form of a revived Aristotelian “science of virtue” as the means of overcoming the republic’s temporal finitude. Given doubts that have been raised with regard to the philosophical depth of the supposed Aristotelianism of the Florentine humanists, another recent scholar of civic humanism, Quentin Skinner has, as an alternative, stressed its Roman rather than Hellenic antecedents (Bock, Skinner, & Viroli 1990: 121–141). This is not just a matter of identifying sources. Skinner’s revised position means rather that in his view, civic humanism advocated active citizenship as a means to liberty from foreign and domestic domination, rather than as a self-fulfilling human end. In more recent times, Skinner has shifted his position from an historical claim to an entirely philosophical one, in line with the purely theoretical conception of republicanism discussed above (e.g., Skinner 1998).

Ironically, in Pocock’s adaptation of Baron’s thesis, virtue is opposed to property, and it is the urban, bourgeois entrepreneurs and the chancery of the modernizing state, the very creators of civic humanism in Baron’s mind, that reside on the wrong side of the fence. Baron’s civic humanists advocated a departure from the medieval ideals of contemplation and asceticism to assert an active life that included trade and profit (Jurdjevic 2001: 727–728). In the Pocockean version of republicanism, civic virtue is opposed to a vision of citizenship that embraces the private pursuit of gain. This kind of virtuous polity cannot, however, be Florence—and certainly not Baron’s Florence—the palazzi of which were built with the profits of banking, manufacturing, international trade, and interest on the city’s public debt. Pocock’s rearward glance to Aristotle (and even Skinner’s to Rome) did not take into account the historical realities of the Renaissance Italian cities, Florence in particular.

3. Varieties of Civic Humanism

Baron’s interpretation assumes that civic humanism has a core that holds together all of those with whom is associated. In other words, there is presumed to be a single set of principles to which all civic humanists must subscribe in order to merit that appellation. Pocock attempted to circumvent this problem by treating republicanism in linguistic rather than programmatic terms. As such it was available to be picked up, selectively and thematically, as circumstances dictated or allowed. Taken on its face, Pocock’s conception of republicanism invites us, in turn, say the same about civic humanism, namely, that it need not be equated with a single political position (that is, republicanism). Although Pocock does not acknowledge it, the general discursive ambit of civic humanism licenses Italian thinkers to apply its language to an extensive range of political systems and phenomena.

James Hankins has taken this point a step further by severing Italian Renaissance humanism from political forms entirely. Hankins aims to challenge directly Baron, Pocock and similar advocates of civic humanism who equate it with republican liberty, while also tempering the long-standing alternative view that humanism was primarily an apolitical literary and cultural movement (2019: xii). Hankins argues instead that humanists were driven by what he terms “virtue politics,” by which he means improvement of “the character and wisdom of the ruling class with a view to bringing about a happy and flourishing commonwealth” (2019: 37). The great humanists thus ought to be understood not as advocates for any particular “constitutional form of the polity” or for “the express consent of the governed” (2019: 37). Rather, political legitimacy rested on moral legitimacy. Only with Machiavelli, Hankins contends, was the link to the virtue that humanism propounded decisively broken (2019: 449–475). But pace Hankins (2019: xxi), humanists in fact disputed about which type of government was most desirable, as shall be discussed presently, and certainly did not discount that one system should be preferred over others.

3.1. Leonardo Bruni

For Baron and many others, Leonardo Bruni (1369–1444) was regarded to be the paragon of Italian civic humanism (Hankins 1995: 327; Witt 2003: 392–442), the exemplar of the synthesis of humanistic study and public engagement: he served twice as the Chancellor of Florence and was intermittently employed in administrative posts by the papacy. At the same time, Bruni was a prodigious author and translator, composing a multi-volume history of the Florentine people (based on his access to primary sources), producing Latin versions of works by Aristotle (including the Politics) and other Greek texts, writing biographies of notable Italians for popular consumption, among many additional literary activities.

Most significantly for current purposes, Bruni used his great erudition to defend and promote the cause of republican government, especially as practiced in Florence during his day. His Laudatio (1403–1404 [1978]) are paeans to the city generally (for instance, in terms of architectural and artistic beauty, its cleanliness, its locale, and its plentiful resources) but also specifically to the virtue of its citizens and its institutions. (Recall a central feature of the “Baron thesis” mentioned above derived from the claim that the Milan crisis of 1402 gave birth to civic humanism in both theory and practice, with Bruni as its exemplary exponent.) Like his contemporaries, Bruni believed that Florence had been founded by the Romans during the republican period, rendering its citizens characteristically lovers of freedom who stood also opposed to imperial and tyrannical rule. This heritage from Rome also yielded the source for Florence’s mild and peaceful relations with other Italian cities and their citizens, signaled by its protection of all Italy from the domination threatened by the Milanese. Florence was, in effect, the savior of the Italian people.

Both the Panegyric and the Laudatio explain the greatness of Florence in terms of its self-governing political system. The institutions both foster and are fostered by the public virtue of citizens. Bruni postulates a triad of fundamental republican principles that Florence draws together: liberty (libertas), equality (aequalitas), and just law (ius). The Florentine constitution is so organized that citizens are free because they are equal before the law. These qualities bring us to one of Bruni’s favorite concepts in his political theory: harmonious cooperation and balance among all groups and classes within the city. Other Italian cities, he observes, are rife with class conflict between the great men and mass of the people. The Florentine republic differs because the entire body of its citizens participate, as appropriate, in the government, which, because it is checked in its power, resists the temptation of tyranny, whether by the few or the many. Civic humanism, at least as understood by Baron and scholars working in a similar vein, is perfectly captured in the accounts of Florence in the Panegyric and Laudatio.

3.2 Coluccio Salutati and Aurelio Lippo Brandolini

Yet the fundamental premises of Renaissance civic humanism do not necessarily entail republicanism. Many of the cities of fifteenth-century Italy were in fact governed by individuals who were self-styled princes or by oligarchic dynasties. As Quentin Skinner observed many years ago (1978: 118–128), humanists were not adverse to modification of the virtues associated with civic government to suit conditions of a princely regime (see also Skinner 2002: 118–159). Baron sought to excuse or dismiss such ideas, but his arguments have been challenged.

One of the most notable figures to take up this agenda was Coluccio Salutati (1331–1406) in a treatise entitled De tyranno (On Tyranny; 1400 [1927]. Salutati had been not only Bruni’s instructor but also his immediate predecessor as Chancellor of the Florentine republic. In the view of Salutati, there are valid reasons that one should stand prepared to countenance tyrannical rulers at times. In support of what might seem at first glance an odd position for a humanist to embrace, he introduces a distinction between two types of tyrants: those who rule without valid title (usurpers) and those who possess a legitimate claim to office but use their powers unlawfully and unjustly as a result of their prideful characters. This difference is decisive for Salutati, whose main concern is with the propriety of slaying tyrants in general and with the murder of Julius Caesar in particular.

According to Salutati, the appropriate treatment of a tyrant is wholly dependent upon whether or not he is a usurper. If so, then those subject to him may invoke the Roman law principle that it is “lawful to repel by force the assailant of an individual or a piece of property and if he persists, to kill him” in order to justify resistance to a tyrant (1927: 86). By contrast, Salutati condemns those who argue that wicked princes ought to be killed even when they hold their office by right. He asserts that only the public authority that placed a ruler in office (whether a superior or the community) enjoys the right to remove him from power; private persons, acting in their own right, have no say in the matter.

Salutati rounds off his treatise by applying his argument to the case of Caesar. He purports to prove (in a highly polemical refutation of Cicero) that Caesar was not a usurper, but instead held legitimate office authorized by the Roman people. Indeed, Salutati maintains that if Caesar seemed to behave tyrannically, it was because the tumultuous condition of the times called for such conduct. Caesar is to be praised as the savior of Rome, not condemned as a tyrant. Consequently, it was entirely wrong for private citizens to slay Caesar, since he had not usurped public power. Moreover, to the extent that he was serving the common good, the Romans as a people had no legitimate warrant to remove him from office. Salutati thus approaches, if he does not explicitly endorse, a conception of benevolent despotism that challenges the usual bases for distinguishing between king and tyrant.

Another Florentine humanist—albeit it not of the stature of Bruni and Salutati—went still further in praising monarchy. Aurelio Lippo Brandolini (c.1454–1497) in his De comparatione reipublicae et regni (On the Comparison of Republic and Kingdoms; c. 1490) defends kingship against the charge made by his fellow Italians (especially, Florentines) that it was inferior to republican government. Writing at the court of the Hungarian King Mattias, whose patronage he briefly enjoyed, Brandolini constructed a dialogue between a Florentine merchant, Domenico, and the king himself, in which every conventional rationale for the superiority of republics to other constitutional systems, especially monarchies, is proposed and examined, only to be decimated. Regardless of whether or not Brandolini wrote De comparatione merely as piece of flattery for King Mattias, his arguments for kingship still warrant serious attention.

In the first two books of the dialogue, Domenico’s case in favor of the superiority of republican constitutions is demolished by Mattias. This is hardly what might be expected of a civic humanist, at least if one regards Bruni as the paradigmatic instance thereof. But Brandolini manages to use precisely the tools of his humanist training to dismiss the main values that led humanists to praise the Florentine republican constitution. Of more immediate interest, at the beginning of the third and final book of De comparatione, the discussion turns to the examination and defense of the proposition that the governance of one person is best. Initially, this position is supported by means of a set of analogies to the helmsman, the military commander, and the head of the household. Thereafter, the debate concentrates on how the rule of a single excellent man constitutes a safeguard against the real possibility of destructive factionalism that flows from governance by the many.

By way of proof, Mattias narrates a notably revisionist account of Roman history, according to which the early kings successfully preserved peace and concord. Their replacement by consuls led naturally and inescapably to the decline of the city over time into a series of civil wars in which various men contended for power. In the same passage, Mattias indicates that Lorenzo de’Medici in Florence achieved the same effect as did the Roman monarchs, namely, eliminating from the city the tumults caused by factionalism. A single, defining political will yields unity. Brandolini thereby adopts a position precisely opposed to Bruni, who, as has been seen, claimed that the Florentine republican constitution was the source of harmonization among the classes. Brandolini and Bruni focus on precisely the same problem—how to curb faction leading to class conflict—but they arrive at radically different conclusions. Arguably, nothing about Bruni’s position is inherently more exemplary of civic humanist than Brandolini’s.

3.3. Aeneas Silvius Piccolomini

It would be difficult to find anyone during the fifteenth century better qualified than Aeneas Silvius Piccolomini (1405–1464) to claim the mantle of civic humanism. As was the case with the authors already discussed he was steeped in the studia humanitas from a fine Florentine education. An almost exact contemporary of the great humanists Palmieri, Valla and Patrizi, he enjoyed a sterling reputation for his writings; his letters, in particular, compare favorably in their style as well as their substance with the best of humanist literature. He held positions in the imperial court as a secretary and diplomat, and eventually worked his way up the ladder of ecclesiastical preferment to be elevated to the papal see as Pius II—often called the first “humanist pope”. Yet, in his most famous work of political thought, De ortu et auctoritate imperii Romani (On the Origin and Authority of the Roman Empire; 1446), Piccolomini advanced a defense of a universalist, imperial and even absolutist ideal of government under the banner of the Holy Roman Empire. As with many of the authors previously surveyed, such a position would seem wholly incompatible with civic humanism.

Piccolomini’s argument starts, but does not finish, with kingship. Kings were first authorized in the earliest times of human history in order to shield the rights of weaker men from injury by the stronger. This is a theme common to numerous republican civic humanists, drawn from a position held by Cicero, who was an important source for them. The king is regarded as the personification of justice. His moral character outshines that of his fellows, so he does not require law as the foundation of his rule, since his judgments are so rooted in a sense of justice and equity that they enjoy the force of law. A conventional account of the breakdown of kingship would involve the declining morality of successive kings, leading to tyranny. By contrast, Piccolomini detects a quite different inherent weakness in political arrangements associated with kingship, regardless of the moral qualities of a particular royal incumbent.

In De ortu, he points out that the creation of a king was not a unique or isolated event. Rather, throughout the world there are many kings who rule over a plurality of territories. As these kingdoms defined and expanded their geographical boundaries or spheres of jurisdiction, they inevitably came into conflict. And since there was no means of arbitration amongst such coequal powers, the resolution of disputes between them occurred by means of armed engagements. These ensuing conflicts between royal powers and their peoples are directly the function of an inescapable structural limitation endemic to localized or regional kingship per se. It is not morally corrupt rulers alone who are held responsible for clashes over lands and rights. Instead, any king who is performing his duties properly will, Piccolomini supposes, inevitably enter into contention with another king and will be compelled to turn to warfare.

Consequently, the political model of an independent network of kingships is incompatible with the very purpose which warranted the creation of kings, namely, the maintenance of just and harmonious relations among human beings. The decentralized distribution of royal power ultimately produces an effect which is exactly contrary to that intended. Empowered as the agent of social harmony, kingship proves to be its enemy, confounding rather than reinforcing the justice which the ruler is charged with upholding. Notice here how the problems of conflict and the absence of harmony, addressed by many civic humanists, manifest themselves in Piccolomini’s thought as well. His solution, however, is quite different from his Florentine colleagues. Since the particularity of royal regimes runs afoul of the ordained end of political power, the attainment of justice, and the order that comes with it, can only be achieved by a universality of political rule, that is, a single world empire. In imperial government alone does political power finally attain a form consistent with the aim of its original authorization. Once again, one may plausibly assert that civic humanist principles might move in a direction quite divergent from republicanism (Lee 2018).

3.4 Niccolò Machiavelli

Machiavelli (1469–1527) is doubtless the best known of all the authors discussed here on account of his Il principe (Prince; c. 1513–1514) and (to a lesser extent) Discorsi (Discourses; c. 1514–1519). The former is a somewhat notorious advice-book for rulers who wish to gain and hold power; the latter evaluates the strengths of a republican system of government. Machiavelli was deeply involved in governing the republic of Florence, serving in several important official capacities, until a 1512 coup against the regime engineered by the Medici family cost him his position. Less often recognized is that he wrote prolifically—poetry, plays, histories, military manuals—and left us with a large collection of correspondence and dispatches from his diplomatic activities (Nederman 2023). Scholars from many viewpoints, judge Machiavelli to be the epitome of civic humanist republicanism during the later Italian Renaissance (Najemy 1996). The academic literature on Machiavelli’s thought is immense. Any serious attempt to summarize it is a fool’s errand.

Stated simply, Machiavelli encapsulates the multiple forms of civic humanism that have been examined. On the one hand, the Discorsi is said to epitomize the republican ideals of self-governance and active citizenship commonly associated with the essence of civic humanism. (As mentioned in the Introduction, Machiavelli is one of the primary historical figures to whom contemporary republican philosophers look for ideas and inspiration.) On the other hand, Il principe exemplifies the tendency of some civic humanists who have been considered above to look toward monarchic regimes as the preferable form of rule. A plethora of scholarly effort has been directed toward attempting to reconcile these two evidently very contradictory positions. Some interpreters suggest, for instance, that the Discorsi represents his “real” views, and that Il principe is a satire or an attempt to win back his job in the Florentine government or to reveal to his fellow citizens the “real” inner workings of princely regimes. Others propose that Il principe reflects Machiavelli’s true teachings and that the principles ascribed to the Discorsi are little more than extensions of his earlier tract. And some simply assert that no accord is possible.

It should be obvious, then, that the characteristics of the civic humanist propensities ascribed by scholars to Machiavelli may be understood in a vast number of ways. Given the diversity of interpretations, it is perhaps of greater utility to identify a single central theme shared by Il principe and the Discorsi and various civic humanists already discussed. Specifically, Machiavelli, like prior Florentine humanists, confronted in his writings the quarrels that arose from conflicts between contending sets of interests, whether classes or political entities. All of the authors previously addressed praised their favored form of government (republic, monarchy, empire) on the grounds that it introduced harmony and peace between clashing groups.

In both of his works, Machiavelli acknowledges the existence within every community of two inherently incompatible classes: the grandi (nobles) and the popolo (masses). The nobles seek to dominate those beneath them; the masses desire only to be free from domination. He clearly believes that these two parties can never be brought together in a peaceful fashion. Their interests are simply incommensurable. So, Machiavelli’s dilemma is how to avoid the nobles and the masses from warring against one another. He provides two possibilities. In Il principe, he remarks that a prince who wishes to maintain his power must curb the aspirations of the nobility, to the extent that a ruler may reasonably consider cold-blooded murder as one of his tools. The people, by contrast, should be treated mildly. Indeed, Machiavelli insists that if a prince must choose to side with one or the other class, he should always take up the cause of the masses. Why? First, because their numbers are so much greater than those of the nobles that they are bound to prevail. Second, because the popolo are so distant from the machinery of government headed by the prince that they are unable to observe the sometimes vicious means by which he must rule. Third, because they, being uneducated, are easily led by appearances and are unable to apprehend the truth that the prince seeks to conceal.

The Discorsi treats class conflict in an entirely different way, namely, as a positive or productive feature of a well-developed republican system. Machiavelli’s epitome of an ideal republic is ancient Rome, in which tumult was rife. According to him, by permitting rather than suppressing the collision between these two sets of interests, Rome succeeded in actualizing and maintaining the paramount value of liberty. In a republic of the Roman sort, the nobility (via the Senate) has the main responsibility for governing, but the people check that power by means of countervailing offices (such as the tribunes) and popular dissent. The struggle between them actually generates the liberty of the whole, both in terms of self-government unbeholden to either external forces or to tyranny and by assuring that the people’s desire not to be dominated is achieved.

Machiavelli recognizes that he is adopting an unusual perspective, since customarily the blame for the collapse of the Roman Republic has been assigned to warring factions that eventually ripped it apart. By contrast, he insists that precisely those conflicts generated a “creative tension” that was the source of Roman liberty. Other republican models (such as those adopted by Sparta or Venice) produced weaker political systems, ones that are either stagnant or prone to decay when circumstances change. The ultimate sign of the unique greatness of the Roman Republic is its conquest of huge amounts of territory, as a result of the grandi and the popolo setting aside their ultimately interminable struggles (at least for a time) in order to cooperate in the subjugation and exploitation of vast lands. Class struggle is thus socialized and put to effective use. It has been suggested, and with good reason, that a signal element of Machiavelli’s political project was to promote Florence as the new Rome that will impose its domination over the rest of Italy. It is perhaps not too great a stretch to call him a civic humanist with imperialistic pretensions (Hörnqvist 2004).

4. The Pre-history of Civic Humanism

As previously noted, Baron posited that the birth of civic humanism occurred precisely out of the 1402 crisis in Florence. This position has been challenged on various historical grounds, most notably by Seigel (1966). One problem with Baron’s claim stems from his evident lack of familiarity with the political philosophy of preceding centuries. Long before the beginning of the quattrocento, political authors (some of Florentine origin) had undertaken the defense of the republican system of government generally and of the Roman Republic in particular in terms redolent of civic humanism. Writing c. 1265, a Florentine civil servant exiled to France, Brunetto Latini (1993), argued for the superiority of republics (communes) over other types of constitution and also described in detail the mechanisms of republican governance. Around 1300, another Italian, the Paris-educated scholastic philosopher Ptolemy of Lucca (1997), composed an extensive brief favoring the Roman Republic as the ideal form of government (Blythe 2009; but see also Yun 2008 and Nederman and Sullivan 2012). The size of the list of pro-republican political theorists writing before 1402 could be multiplied many times over.

Why was Baron inattentive to pre-Renaissance European republicanism? The answer may be traced to what civic humanism represented to him: modernity, secularity, rationality; in sum, the “glory” of the Renaissance in contrast with the benighted Middle Ages. Scholars have long since realized that a dividing line drawn between medieval and early modern periods is wholly unwarranted (Nederman 2009). Just as civic humanism as the designation of an intellectual movement within the tradition of Western political theory proves to be quite capacious, so its existence and development should be regarded as more fluid historically than has often been claimed.


Primary Literature

  • Brandolini, Aurelio Lippo [c.1454–1497], c. 1490 [2009], Republics and Kingdoms Compared (De comparatione reipublicae et regni), James Hankins (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Bruni, Leonardo [1369–1444], 1401 [1978], Panegyric to the City of Florence (Laudatio Florentinae Urbis), Benjamin G. Kohl (trans.), in Benjamin G. Kohl and Ronald G. Witt (eds.), The Earthly Republic: Italian Humanists on Government and Society, Manchester: Manchester University Press, pp. 135–176.
  • –––, 1987 The Humanism of Leonardo Bruni: Selected Texts, Gordon Griffiths, James Hankins and David Thompson (eds. and trans.), Binghamton, NY: Medieval & Renaissance Texts & Studies.
  • Latini, Brunetto [d. 1294], 1993, The Book of the Treasure (Li Livres dou Tresor), Paul Barette and Spurgeon Baldwin (trans.), New York: Garland Press.
  • Machiavelli, Niccolò [1469–1527], 1965, The Chief Works and Others, 3 volumes, Alan Gilbert (ed. and trans.), Durham, NC: Duke University Press.
  • Piccolomini, Aeneas Silvius [1405–1464], 1446 [2000], On the Origin and Authority of the Roman Empire (De ortu et auctoritate imperii Romani), in Thomas M. Izbicki and Cary J. Nederman (eds. and trans.), Three Tracts on Empire, Bristol: Thoemmes.
  • Ptolemy of Lucca [c. 1236–1327], 1997, On the Government of Princes: De regimine principum, James M. Blythe (ed. and trans.), Philadelphia, PA: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Salutati, Caluccio [1331–1406], 1400 [1927], De tyranno, in Ephraim Emerton (ed. and trans.), Humanism and Empire, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Secondary Literature

  • Baron, Hans, 1955, The Crisis of the Early Italian Renaissance: Civic Humanism and Republican Liberty in an Age of Classicism and Tyranny, 2 volumes, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press; revised edition, 1966.
  • –––, 1968, From Petrarch to Leonardo Bruni: Studies in Humanistic and Political Literature, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 1988, The Search of Florentine Civic Humanism. Essays on the Transition from Medieval to Modern Thought, 2 volumes, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Bock, Gisela, Quentin Skinner, and Maurizio Viroli (eds.), 1990. Machiavelli and Republicanism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511598463
  • Fubini, Riccardo, 1992, “Renaissance Historian: The Career of Hans Baron”, The Journal of Modern History, 64(3): 541–574. doi:10.1086/244516
  • Blythe, James, 2009, The Worldview and Thought of Tolomeo Fiadoni (Ptolemy of Lucca), Turnhout, Belgium: Brepols.
  • Garin, Eugenio, 1952 [1965], Der italienische Humanismus, Bari: Laterza. L’Umanesimo italiano. Translated as Italian Humanism: Philosophy and the Civic Life in the Renaissance, Peter Munz (trans.), Oxford: Blackwell.
  • –––, 1954, Medioevo e risascimento, Bari: Laterza.
  • Hankins, James, 1995, “The ‘Baron Thesis’ after Forty Years and Some Recent Studies of Leonardo Bruni”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 56(2): 309–338. doi:10.2307/2709840
  • –––, 2016, “Europe’s First Democrat? Cyriac of Ancona and Book 6 of Polybius”, in For the Sake of Learning: Essays in Honor of Anthony Grafton, Ann Blair and Anja-Silvia Goering (eds.), Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2019, Virtue Politics: Soulcraft and Statecraft in Renaissance Italy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––(ed.), 2000, Renaissance Civic Humanism: Reappraisals and Reflections, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511558474
  • Hörnqvist, Mikael, 2004, Machiavelli and Empire, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511490576
  • Jurdjevic, Mark, 2001, “Virtue, Commerce and the Enduring Florentine Republican Moment: Reintegrating Italy into the Atlantic Republican Tradition”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 62(4): 721–744.
  • Kallendorf, Craig, 1996, “The Historical Petrarch”, The American Historical Review, 101(1): 130–141. doi:10.2307/2169228
  • Lee, Alexander, Humanism and Empire: The Imperial Ideal in Fourteenth-Century Italy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Monfasani, John, 2016, “Machiavelli, Polybius, and Janus Lascaris: The Hexter Thesis Revisited”, Italian Studies, 71(1): 39–48.
  • Najemy, John M., 1996, “Baron’s Machiavelli and Renaissance Republicanism”, The American Historical Review, 101(1): 119–129. doi:10.2307/2169227
  • Nederman, Cary J., 2009, Lineages of European Political Thought: Explorations along the Medieval/Modern Divide from John of Salisbury to Hegel, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • –––, 2016, “Polybius as Monarchist? Receptions of Histories VI before Machiavelli, c.1490–c.1515”, History of Political Thought, 37(3): 461–479.
  • –––, 2023, The Rope and the Chains: Machiavelli’s Early Thought and Its Tranformations, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books/Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Nederman, Cary J., and Mary Elizabeth Sullivan, 2012, “The Polybian Moment: The Transformation of Republican Thought from Ptolemy of Lucca to Machiavelli”, The European Legacy: Toward New Paradigms, 17(7): 867–881.
  • Pettit, Phillip, 1999, Republicanism: A Theory of Freedom and Government, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Pocock, J.G.A., 1975, The Machiavellian Moment: Florentine Political Thought and the Atlantic Republican Tradition, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Seigel, Jerrold E., 1966, “‘Civic Humanism’ or Ciceronian Rhetoric? The Culture of Petrarch and Bruni”, Past and Present, 34: 3–48. doi:10.1093/past/34.1.3
  • Skinner, Quentin, 1978, The Foundations of Modern Political Thought, Volume 1: The Renaissance, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511817878
  • –––, 1998, Liberty before Liberalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139197175
  • –––, 2002, Visions of Politics, Volume II: Renaissance Virtues, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511613777
  • Witt, Ronald G., 1996, “The Crisis after Forty Years”, The American Historical Review, 101(1): 110–118. doi:10.2307/2169226
  • –––, 2003, ‘In the Footsteps of the Ancients’: The Origins of Humanism from Lovato to Bruni, Leiden, Brill.
  • Yoran, Hanan. 2007, “Florentine Civic Humanism and the Emergence of Modern Ideology”, History and Theory, 46: 326–344.
  • Yun, Bee, 2008, “Ptolemy of Lucca – A Pioneer of Civic Republicanism? A Reassessment”, History of Political Thought, 29(3): 417–439.

Other Internet Resources


Though the present entry is almost a completely rewritten, new text, the author would like to acknowledge the work of the late Athanasios Moulakis. Section 2 still preserves some material from the previous SEP entry on civic humanism, authored by Moulakis.

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Cary Nederman <>

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