Implicit Bias

First published Thu Feb 26, 2015; substantive revision Wed Jul 31, 2019

Research on “implicit bias” suggests that people can act on the basis of prejudice and stereotypes without intending to do so. While psychologists in the field of “implicit social cognition” study consumer products, self-esteem, food, alcohol, political values, and more, the most striking and well-known research has focused on implicit biases toward members of socially stigmatized groups, such as African-Americans, women, and the LGBTQ community.[1] For example, imagine Frank, who explicitly believes that women and men are equally suited for careers outside the home. Despite his explicitly egalitarian belief, Frank might nevertheless behave in any number of biased ways, from distrusting feedback from female co-workers to hiring equally qualified men over women. Part of the reason for Frank’s discriminatory behavior might be an implicit gender bias. Psychological research on implicit bias has grown steadily (§1), raising metaphysical (§2), epistemological (§3), and ethical questions (§4).[2]

1. Introduction: History and Measures of Implicit Social Cognition

1.1 History of the Field

While Allport’s (1954) The Nature of Prejudice remains a touchstone for psychological research on prejudice, the study of implicit social cognition has two distinct and more recent sets of roots.[3] The first stems from the distinction between “controlled” and “automatic” information processing made by cognitive psychologists in the 1970s (e.g., Shiffrin & Schneider 1977). While controlled processing was thought to be voluntary, attention-demanding, and of limited capacity, automatic processing was thought to unfold without attention, to have nearly unlimited capacity, and to be hard to suppress voluntarily (Payne & Gawronski 2010; see also Bargh 1994). In important early work on implicit cognition, Fazio and colleagues showed that attitudes can be understood as activated by either controlled or automatic processes. In Fazio’s (1995) “sequential priming” task, for example, following exposure to social group labels (e.g., “black”, “women”, etc.), subjects’ reaction times (or “response latencies”) to stereotypic words (e.g., “lazy” or “nurturing”) are measured. People respond more quickly to concepts closely linked together in memory, and most subjects in the sequential priming task are quicker to respond to words like “lazy” following exposure to “black” than “white”. Researchers standardly take this pattern to indicate a prejudiced automatic association between semantic concepts. The broader notion embedded in this research was that subjects’ automatic responses were thought to be “uncontaminated” by controlled or strategic responses (Amodio & Devine 2009).

While this first stream of research focused on automaticity, a second stream focused on (un)consciousness. Many studies demonstrated that awareness of stereotypes can affect social judgment and behavior in relative independence from subjects’ reported attitudes (Devine 1989; Devine & Monteith 1999; Dovidio & Gaertner 2004; Greenwald & Banaji 1995; Banaji et al. 1993). These studies were influenced by theories of implicit memory (e.g., Jacoby & Dallas 1981; Schacter 1987), leading to Greenwald & Banaji’s original definition of “implicit attitudes” as

introspectively unidentified (or inaccurately identified) traces of past experience that mediate favorable or unfavorable feeling, thought, or action toward social objects. (1995: 8)

The guiding idea here, as Dovidio and Gaertner (1986) put it, is that in the modern world prejudice has been “driven underground,” that is, out of conscious awareness. This idea has led to the common view that what makes a bias implicit is that a person is unwilling or unable to report it. Recent findings have challenged this view, however (§3.1)

1.2 Implicit Measures

What a person says is not necessarily a good representation of the whole of what she feels and thinks, nor of how she will behave. Arguably, the central advance of research on implicit social cognition is the ability to assess people’s thoughts, feelings, and behavior without having to ask them directly, “what do you think/feel about X?” or “what would you do in X situation?”

Implicit measures, then, might be thought of as instruments that assess people’s thoughts, feelings, and behavior indirectly, that is, without relying on “self-report.” This is too quick, however. For example, a survey that asks “what do you think of black people” is explicit and direct, in the sense that the subject’s judgment is both explicitly reported and the subject is being directly asked about the topic of interest to the researchers. However, a survey that asks “what do you think about Darnell” (i.e., a person with a stereotypically black name) is explicit and indirect, because the subject’s judgment is explicitly reported but the content of what is being judged (i.e., the subject’s attitudes toward race) is inferred by the researcher. The distinction between direct and indirect measures is also relative rather than absolute. Even in some direct measures, such as personality inventories, subjects may not be completely aware of what is being studied.

In the literature, “implicit” is used to refer to at least four distinct things (Gawronski & Brannon 2017): (1) a distinctive psychological construct, such as an “implicit attitude,” which is assessed by a variety of instruments; (2) a family of instruments, called “implicit measures,” that assess people’s thoughts and feelings in a specific way (e.g., in a way that minimizes subjects’ reliance on introspection and their ability to respond strategically); (3) a set of cognitive and affective processes—“implicit processes”—that affect responses on a variety of measures; and (4) a kind of evaluative behavior—e.g., a categorization judgment—elicited by specific circumstances, such as cognitive load. In this entry, I will use “implicit” in the senses of (2) and (4), unless otherwise noted. One virtue of this approach is that it allows one to remain agnostic about the nature of the phenomena implicit measures assess.[4] Consider Frank again. His implicit gender bias may be assessed by several different instruments, such as sequential priming or the “Implicit Association Test” (IAT; Greenwald et al. 1998). The IAT—the most well-known implicit test—is a reaction time measure. In a standard IAT, the subject attempts to sort words or pictures into categories as fast as possible while making as few errors as possible. In the images below, the correct answers would be left, right, left, right.

[a black box in the center is the word 'Michelle' in white, on the top left are the words 'Female or [in white]  Family [in green]', on the top right are the words 'Male or [in white] Career [in green]']

Image 1

[a black box in the center is the word 'Michelle' in white, on the top left are the words 'Male or [in white]  Family [in green]', on the top right are the words 'Female or [in white] Career [in green]']

Image 2

[a black box in the center is the word 'Business' in green, on the top left are the words 'Male or [in white]  Career [in green]', on the top right are the words 'Female or [in white] Family [in green]']

Image 3

[a black box in the center is the word 'Business' in green, on the top left are the words 'Male or [in white]  Family [in green]', on the top right are the words 'Female or [in white] Career [in green]']

Image 4

All images are copyright of Project Implicit and reproduced here with permission.

An IAT score is computed by comparing speed and error rates on the “blocks” (or trials) in which the pairing of concepts is consistent with common stereotypes (images 1 and 3) to the blocks in which the pairing of the concepts is inconsistent with common stereotypes (images 2 and 4). If he is typical of most subjects, Frank will be faster and make fewer errors on stereotype-consistent trials than stereotype-inconsistent trials. While this “gender-career” IAT pairs concepts (e.g., “male” and “career”), other IATs, such as the “race-evaluation” IAT, pair a concept to an evaluation (e.g., “black” and “bad”). Other IATs assess body image, age, sexual orientation, and so on. As of 2019, approximately 26 million IATs have been taken (although it is unclear if this number represents 26 million unique participants or 26 million tests taken or started; Lai p.c.). One review (Nosek et al. 2007), which tested over 700,000 subjects on the race-evaluation IAT, found that over 70% of white participants more easily associated black faces with negative words (e.g., war, bad) and white faces with positive words (e.g., peace, good). The researchers consider this an implicit preference for white faces over black faces.[5]

Although the IAT remains the most popular implicit measure, it is far from the only one. Other prominent implicit measures, many of which are derivations of sequential priming, are semantic priming (Banaji & Hardin 1996) and the Affect Misattribution Procedure (AMP; Payne et al. 2005). Also, a “second generation” of categorization-based measures (like the IAT) has been developed. For example, the Go/No-go Association Task (GNAT; Nosek & Banaji 2001) presents subjects with one target object rather than two in order to determine whether preferences or aversions are primarily responsible for scores on the standard IAT (i.e., the ease of pairing good words with white faces and bad words with black faces, or the difficulty of pairing good words with black faces and bad words with white faces; Brewer 1999).

A notable advance in the psychometrics of implicit bias has been the advent of multinomial (or formal process) models, which identify distinct processes contributing to performance on implicit measures. For example, elderly people tend to show greater bias on the race-evaluation IAT compared with younger people, but this may be due to their having stronger preferences for whites or having weaker control over their biased responding (Nosek et al. 2011). Multinomial models, like the Quadruple Process Model (Conrey et al. 2005), are used to tease apart these possibilities. The Quad model identifies four distinct processes that contribute to responses: (1) the automatic activation of an association; (2) the subject’s ability to determine a correct response (i.e., a response that reflects one’s subjective assessment of truth); (3) the ability to override automatic associations; and (4) general response biases (e.g., favoring right-handed responses). Multinomial modeling has made clear that implicit measures are not “process pure,” i.e., they do not tap into a single unified psychological process.

While there is not consensus about what implicit measures capture (§2), it is clear that they provide at least three kinds of information (Gawronski & Hahn 2019). The first is information about dissociation with more explicit, direct measures. Correlations between implicit and explicit measures tend to be relatively low (r = .2–.25; Hofmann et al. 2005; Cameron et al. 2012), although these relations are significantly affected by methodological practices, such as comparing non-corresponding implicit and explicit measures (e.g., an implicit measure of gender stereotypes and an explicit “feelings thermometer” toward women). It is important to note the breadth of research in this vein; dissociations between implicit and explicit measures are found in the study of personality (e.g., Vianello et al. 2010), attitudes toward alcohol (e.g., de Houwer et al. 2004), phobias (Teachman & Woody 2003), and more. Second, implicit measures can be used as dependent variables in experiments. Theories about the formation and change of attitudes, for example, have focused on differential effects of manipulations, such as counter-attitudinal information, on implicit and explicit measures (e.g., Gawronski & Bodenhausen 2006; Petty 2006). Third, implicit measures are used to predict behavior. Philosophers have been especially interested in the relationship between implicit bias and discriminatory behavior, particularly when the discriminatory behavior conflicts with a person’s reported beliefs (as in the “Frank” case above). Studies report relationships between implicit bias and behavior in a huge variety of social contexts, from hiring to policing to medicine to teaching and more (for an incomplete list see Table 1 in Jost et al. 2009). There is also voluminous, varied, and on-going discussion about how well implicit measures predict behavior, along with several related critical assessments of the information implicit measures provide (§5).

2. Metaphysics

“Implicit bias” is a term of art, used in a variety of ways. In this entry, the term is used to refer to the family of evaluative judgments and behavior assessed by implicit measures (e.g., categorization judgments on an IAT). These measures mimic some relevant aspects of judgment and decision-making outside the lab (e.g., time pressure). But what do these measures measure? With some blurry boundaries, philosophical and psychological theories can be divided into five groups. Implicit measures might provide information about attitudes (§2.1), implicit processes (§2.2), beliefs (§2.3), traits (§2.4), or situations (§2.5).

2.1 Attitudes

The idea that people’s attitudes are the cause of implicit bias is pervasive. The term “attitudes” tends to be used differently in psychology and philosophy, however. In psychology, attitudes are akin to preferences (i.e., likings and dislikings); the term does not refer to propositional states per se (i.e., mental states that are thought to bear a relationship to a proposition), as it does in philosophy. Most attitudinal theories of implicit bias use the term in the psychologist’s sense, although variations will be noted below.

2.1.1 Dual Attitudes in Psychology

Early and influential theories posited that people hold two distinct attitudes in mind toward the same object, one implicit and the other explicit (Greenwald & Banaji 1995; Wilson et al. 2000). “Explicit attitudes” are commonly identified with verbally reported attitudes, in this vein, while “implicit attitudes” are those that a person is unwilling or unable to report. Evidence for theories of dual attitudes stems largely from two sources. The first are anecdotal reports of surprise and consternation that people sometimes express after being informed of their performance on an implicit measure (e.g., Banaji 2011; Krickel 2018). These experiences suggest that people discover their putative implicit attitudes by taking the relevant tests, just like one learns about one’s cholesterol by taking the relevant tests. The second source of evidence for dual-attitude views are dissociations between implicit and explicit measures (§1.2). These suggest that implicit and explicit measures may be tapping into distinct representations of the same attitude-object (e.g., “the elderly”).

A central challenge for theories of this sort is whether people truly are unaware of their implicit biases, and if so, in what way (e.g., if people are unaware of the source, content, or behavioral effects of their attitudes; §3.1). There may be reasons to posit unconscious representations in the human mind independent of whether people are or are not aware of their implicit biases, of course. But if people are aware of their implicit biases, then implicit measures are most likely not assessing unconscious “dual” attitudes.

2.1.2 Dual Attitudes in Philosophy

Some philosophers have proposed that implicit measures assess a distinct kind of “action-oriented” attitude, which is different from ordinary attitudes, but not necessarily in terms of being unconscious. The core idea here is that implicit attitudes link representations with behavioral impulses.[6] Gendler’s (2008a,b, 2011, 2012) account of “alief,” a sui generis mental state comprised of tightly woven co-activating representational (R), affective (A), and behavioral (B) components, is emblematic of this approach. Gendler argues that the R-A-B components of alief are “bundled” together or “cluster” in such a way that when an implicitly biased person sees a black face in a particular context, for example, the agent’s representation will automatically activate particular feelings and behaviors (i.e., an R–A–B cluster). This is in contrast to the “combinatoric” nature of ordinary beliefs and desires, that is, that any belief could, in principle, be combined with any desire. So while the belief that “that is a black man” is not fixed to any particular feelings or behavior, an alief will have content like, “Black man! Scary! Avoid!”

“To have an alief”, Gendler writes, is

to a reasonable approximation, to have an innate or habitual propensity to respond to an apparent stimulus in a particular way. It is to be in a mental state that is… associative, automatic and arational. As a class, aliefs are states that we share with non-human animals; they are developmentally and conceptually antecedent to other cognitive attitudes that the creature may go on to develop. Typically, they are also affect-laden and action-generating. (2008b: 557, original emphasis; see also 2008a: 641)

According to Gendler, aliefs explain a wide array of otherwise puzzling cases of belief-behavior discordance, including not only implicit bias, but also phobias, fictional emotions, and bad habits (2008b: 554). In fact, Gendler suggests (2008a: 663) that aliefs are causally responsible for much of the “moment-by-moment management” of human behavior, whether that behavior is belief-concordant or not.

Critics have raised a number of concerns about this approach, in particular whether putative aliefs form a unified kind (Egan 2011; Currie & Ichino 2012; Doggett 2012; Nagel 2012; Mandelbaum 2013). Others have proposed alternate conceptions of action-oriented dual attitudes. Brownstein and Madva (2012a,b; see also Madva and Brownstein 2018 and Brownstein 2018), for example, propose that implicit attitudes are comprised of F-T-B-A components: the perception of a salient Feature triggers automatic low-level feelings of affective Tension, which are associated in turn with specific Behavioral responses, which either do or do not Alleviate the agent’s felt tension. This approach shares with Gendler’s the idea that aliefs/implicit attitudes differ in kind from beliefs/explicit attitudes. Moreover, the difference between these putative kinds of states is not necessarily the agent’s introspective access to them. Gendler proposes that while paradigmatic beliefs update when the agent requires new relevant information, paradigmatic aliefs don’t. In contrast, Brownstein and Madva argue that implicit attitudes do update in the face of new information—this is the feed-forward function of “alleviation”—and thus can automatically yet flexibly modify and improve over time. Thus, for Brownstein and Madva, implicit attitudes are implicated not only in bias and prejudice, but also in skillful, intelligent, and even ethical action.[7] But while implicit attitudes aren’t ballistic, information-insensitive reflexes, on Brownstein and Madva’s view, they also don’t update in the same way as ordinary attitudes. Brownstein and Madva draw the distinction in terms of two key features. First, implicit attitudes are paradigmatically insensitive to the logical form in which information is presented. For example, subjects have been shown to form equivalent implicit attitudes on the basis of information and the negation of that information (e.g., Gawronski et al. 2008). Second, implicit attitudes fail to respond to the semantic contents of other mental states in a systematic way; they appear to be “inferentially impoverished.” For example, implicit attitudes are implicated in behaviors for which it is difficult to give an inferential explanation (e.g., Dovidio et al. 1997) and implicit attitudes change in response to irrelevant information (e.g., Gregg et al. 2006; Han et al. 2006). Levy (2012, 2015)—who argues that implicit attitudes are “patchy endorsements”—makes similar claims about the ways in which implicit attitudes do and do not update, although he does not argue that these kinds of states are “action-oriented” in the way that Gendler and Brownstein and Madva do. Debate about these findings is ongoing (§2.3).

2.1.3 Single Attitudes

Some theories posit the existence of a singular representation of attitude-objects. According to MODE (“Motivation and Opportunity as Determinants”; Fazio 1990; Fazio & Towles-Schwen 1999; Olson & Fazio 2009) and the related MCM (“Meta-Cognitive Model”; Petty 2006; Petty et al. 2007), attitudes are associations between objects and “evaluative knowledge” of those objects. MODE posits one singular representation underlying the behavioral effects measured by implicit and explicit tests. Thus, MODE denies the distinction between implicit and explicit attitudes. The difference between implicit and explicit measures, then, reflects a difference in the control that subjects have over the measured behavior. Control is understood in terms of motivation and opportunity to deliberate. When an agent has low motivation or opportunity to engage in deliberative thought, her automatically activated attitudes—which might be thought of as her “true” attitudes—will guide her behavior and judgment. Implicit measures manufacture this situation (of low control due to low motivation and/or opportunity to deliberate). Explicit measures, by contrast, increase non-attitudinal contributions to test performance. MODE therefore provides empirically-testable predictions about the conditions under which a person’s performance on implicit and explicit measures will converge and diverge, as well as predictions about the conditions under which implicit and explicit measures will and will not predict behavior (see Gawronski & Brannon 2017 for review).

2.2 Implicit Processes

Influenced by dual process theories of mind, RIM (“Reflective-Impulsive Model”; Strack & Deutsche 2004) and APE (“Associative-Propositional Evaluation”; Gawronski & Bodenhausen 2006, 2011) suggest that implicit measures assess distinctive cognitive processes. The central distinction at the heart of both RIM and APE is between “associative” and “propositional” processes. Associative processes are said to underlie an impulsive system that functions according to classic associationist principles of similarity and contiguity. Implicit measures are thought of as assessing the momentary accessibility of elements or nodes of a network of associations. This network produces spontaneous evaluative responses to stimuli. Propositional processes, on the other hand, underlie a reflective system that validates the information provided by activated associations. Explicit measures are thought to capture this process of validation, which is said to operate according to agents’ syllogistic reasoning and judgments of logical consistency. In sum, the key distinction between associative and propositional processes according to RIM and APE is that propositional processing alone depends on an agent’s assessment of the truth of a given representation.[8] APE in particular aims to explain the interactions between and mutual influences of associative and propositional processes in judgment and behavior.

RIM and APE bear resemblance to the dual attitudes theories in philosophy discussed above. Indeed, Bodenhausen & Gawronski (2014: 957) write that the “distinction between associative and propositional evaluations is analogous to the distinction between ‘alief’ and belief in recent philosophy of epistemology.” It is important to keep in mind, however, that RIM and APE are not attitudinal theories. APE, for example, posits two distinct kinds of process—associative and propositional processes—that give rise to two kinds of evaluative responses to stimuli—implicit and explicit. It does not posit the existence of two distinct attitudes or two distinct co-existing representations of the same entity. It is also important to note that the distinction between associative and propositional processes can be understood in at least three distinct senses: as applying to the way in which information is learned, stored, or expressed (Gawronski et al. 2017). At present, evidence is mixed for dissociation between associative and propositional processing in the learning and storage of information, while it is stronger for dissociation in the behavioral expression of stored information (Brownstein et al. 2019).

2.3 Beliefs

Some have argued that familiar notions of belief, desire, and pretense can in fact explain what neologisms like “implicit attitudes” are meant to elucidate (Egan 2011; Kwong 2012; Mandelbaum 2013). Most defend some version of what Schwitzgebel (2010) calls Contradictory Belief (Egan 2008, 2011; Huebner 2009; Gertler 2011; Huddleston 2012; Muller & Bashour 2011; Mandelbaum 2013, 2014, forthcoming).[9] Drawing upon theories of the “fragmentation” of the mind (Lewis 1982; Stalnaker 1984), Contradictory Belief holds that implicit and explicit measures both reflect what a person believes, and that these different sets of beliefs may be causally responsible for different behavior in different contexts (Egan 2008). In short, if a person behaves in a manner consistent with the belief that black men are dangerous, it is because they believe that black men are dangerous (notwithstanding what they say they believe).

2.3.1 The Propositional Model of Implicit Attitudes

In the psychological literature, De Houwer and colleagues defend a view that can be thought of as supporting Contradictory Belief (Mitchell et al. 2009; Hughes et al. 2011; De Houwer 2014). On this model, propositions[10] have three defining features: (1) propositions are statements about the world that specify the nature of the relation between concepts (e.g., “I am good” and “I want to be good” are propositions that involve the same two concepts—“me” and “good”—but differ in the way that the concepts are related); (2) propositions can be formed rapidly on the basis of instructions or inferences; and (3) subjects are conscious of propositions (De Houwer 2014). On the basis of data consistent with these criteria—for example, responses on implicit measures are affected by one-shot instruction—De Houwer (2014) argues that implicit measures capture propositional states (i.e., beliefs).[11] This claim represents an application of Mitchell and colleagues’ (2009) broader argument that all learning is propositional (i.e., there is no case in which learning is the result of the automatic associative linking of mental representations). One reason philosophers have been interested in this view is due to its resonance with classic debates in the philosophy of mind between empiricists and rationalists, behaviorists and cognitivists, and so on.

2.3.2 Generic Belief

Another belief-based approach argues that implicit biases should be understood as cognitive “schemas.” Schemas are clusters of culturally shared concepts and beliefs. More precisely, schemas are abstract knowledge structures that specify the defining features and attributes of a target (Fiske & Linville 1980). The term “mother”, for example, invokes a schema that attributes a collection of attributes to the person so labelled (Haslanger 2015). On some accounts, schemas are “coldly” cognitive (Valian 2005), and so in the psychologist’s sense, they are not attitudes. Rather, schemas are tools for social categorization, and while schemas may help to organize and interpret feelings and motivations, they are themselves affectless. One advantage of focusing on schemas is that doing so emphasizes that implicit bias is not a matter of straightforward antipathy toward members of socially stigmatized groups.

A separate version of the generic belief approach stems from recent work in the philosophy of language. This approach focuses on stereotypes that involve generalizing extreme or horrific behavior from a few individuals to groups. Such generalizations, such as “pit bulls maul children” or “Muslims are terrorists”, can be thought of as a particular kind of generic statement, which Leslie (2017) calls a “striking property generic”. This subclass of generics is defined by having predicates that express properties that people typically have a strong interest in avoiding. Building on earlier work on the cognitive structure and semantics of generics (Leslie 2007, 2008), Leslie notes a particularly insidious feature of social stereotyping: even if just a few members of what is perceived to be an essential kind (e.g., pit bulls, Muslims) exhibit a harmful or dangerous property, then a generic that attributes the property to the kind likely will be judged to be true. This is only the case with striking properties, however. As Leslie (2017) points out, it takes far fewer instances of murder for one to be considered a murderer than it does instances of anxiety to be considered a worrier. Striking property generics may thus illuminate some social stereotypes (e.g., “black men are rapists”) better than others (e.g., “black men are athletic”). Beeghly (2014), however, construes generics as expressions of cognitive schemas, which may broaden the scope of explanation by way of generic statements. In all of these cases, generics involve an array of doxastic properties. Generics involve inferences to dispositions, for example (Leslie 2017). That is, generic statements about striking properties will usually be judged true if and only if some members of the kind possess the property and other members of the kind are judged to be disposed to possess it.

2.3.3 Spinozan Belief Fixation

The most explicit defense of Contradictory Belief has been via a theory of “Spinozan Belief Fixation” (SBF; Gilbert 1991; Egan 2008, 2011; Huebner 2009; Mandelbaum 2011, 2013, 2014, 2016). Proponents of SBF are inspired by Spinoza’s rejection of the concept of the will as a cause of free action (Huebner 2009: 68), an idea which is embodied in what they call the theory of “Cartesian Belief Fixation” (CBF). CBF holds that ordinary agents are capable of evaluating the truth of an idea (or representation, or proposition) delivered to the mind (via sensation or imagination) before believing or disbelieving it. Agents can choose to believe or disbelieve P, according to CBF, in other words, via deliberation or judgment. SBF, on the other hand, holds that as soon as an idea is presented to the mind, it is believed. Beliefs on this view are understood to be unconscious propositional attitudes that are formed automatically as soon as an agent registers or tokens their content. For example, one cannot entertain or consider or imagine the proposition that “dogs are made out of paper” without immediately and unavoidably believing that dogs are made out of paper, according to SBF (Mandelbaum 2014). More pointedly, one cannot entertain or imagine the stereotype that “women are bad at math” without believing that women are bad at math. As Mandelbaum (2014) puts it, the automaticity of believing according to SBF explains why people are likely to have many contradictory beliefs; in order to reject P, one must already believe P.[12]

SBF is strongly revisionist with respect to the ordinary concept of belief (but see Helton (forthcoming) for a similarly spirited but less revisionist view).[13] Notwithstanding this, the central line of debate about SBF’s account of implicit bias—as well as about belief-based accounts of implicit social cognition generally—focuses on the fact that people’s performance on implicit measures is sometimes unresponsive to the kinds of reinforcement learning based interventions that ought to affect associative processes and/or states; meanwhile, performance on implicit measures sometimes appears to be responsive to the kinds of logical and persuasion based interventions thought to affect doxastic states (e.g., de Houwer 2009, 2014; Hu et al. 2017; Mann & Ferguson 2017; Van Dessel et al. 2018; for additional discussion see Mandelbaum 2013, 2016; Gawronski et al. 2017; Brownstein et al. 2019). Caution is needed in drawing strong conclusions about cognitive structure from these behavioral data, however (Levy 2015; Madva 2016c; Byrd forthcoming; Brownstein et al 2019). As noted above (§1.2), implicit measures are not process-pure. Modeling technique for disentangling the multiple causal contributions to performance on implicit measures may help to move these debates forward (e.g., Conrey et al. 2005; Hütter & Sweldens 2018).

2.4 Traits

As is the case with terms like “attitude” and “propositional,” psychologists and philosophers tend to use the term “trait” in different ways. In psychology, trait-like constructs are stable over time and across situations. If you have always disliked eating pork, and never eat it no matter the context, then your feelings toward pork are trait-like. If you sometimes decline to eat pork but sometimes indulge, depending on the company or your mood, then your feelings are more “state”-like. In the psychologist’s sense, significant evidence suggests that implicit bias is more state-like than trait-like. Multiple longitudinal studies have found that individuals’ scores on implicit measures vary significantly over days, weeks, and months, much more so than individuals’ scores on corresponding explicit measures (Cooley & Payne 2017; Cunningham et al. 2001; Devine et al. 2012; Gawronski et al. 2017). Of course, the significance of this depends on one’s theory of implicit bias. If implicit measures are theorized to capture spontaneous affective reactions (as APE suggests; §2.2), then contextual and temporal variability in performance should be predicted (because, for example, one’s immediate reactions to images of women leaders will likely be different after watching a documentary about Ruth Bader Ginsburg than after watching Clueless). However, if implicit measures are meant to “diagnose” stable features of individuals like political party affiliation, then far less variation should be expected. Another possibility is that measurement error contributes significantly to the instability of scores on implicit measures. The fact that methodological improvements have in some cases improved the temporal stability of participants’ performance supports this idea (e.g., Cooley and Payne 2017).

In philosophy, “trait” is used more often in the context of anti-representationalist, dispositional theories of mind. While representationalists define concepts like “belief” in terms of internal, representational structures of the mind, dispositionalists define concepts like “belief” in terms of tendencies to behave in certain ways (and perhaps also to feel and think in certain ways). Building upon Ryle (1949/2009), Schwitzgebel (2006/2010, 2010, 2013) advances a dispositional theory of attitudes (in the philosophical sense, that is, a theory that claims that beliefs, desires, hopes, etc. are dispositions). On his view, attitudes have a broad (or “multitrack”) profile, including dispositions to feel, think, and speak in specific ways. The dispositional profile of a given attitude is determined by the folk-psychological stereotype for having that attitude, not by what’s inside the agent’s metaphoric “belief box.” For example, to establish that Jordan believes that women make good philosophers, one would look to what Jordan says about women philosophers, to her judgments about which philosophers are good and which aren’t, to her hiring practices, her gut feelings around men and women philosophers, etc. Agents with implicit biases pose an interesting challenge to dispositionalists, since these agents often match only part of the relevant folk-psychological stereotypes. For example, Jordan might say that she believes that women make good philosophers but fail to read any women philosophers (or, recall Frank; §1). On Schwitzgebel’s “gradualist dispositionalism,” Jordan and Frank would be “in-between believers,” agents who partly match the relevant folk-psychological stereotypes for the attitudes in question.

A related trait-based approach treats the results of indirect measures as reflective of elements of attitudes, rather than as assessing attitudes or biases themselves (Machery 2016, 2017). On Machery’s view, attitudes (in the psychologist’s sense, that is, preferences) are dispositions and are comprised of various bases, including feelings, associations, behavioral impulses, and propositional states like beliefs. (In contrast to Schwitzgebel, Machery holds a representationalist view of belief, but a dispositionalist view of attitudes.) To have a racist attitude, on this picture, is to be disposed to display the relevant mix of these bases, that is, to display the feelings, associations, etc. that together comprise the attitude. Implicit measures, then, are said to capture one of the psychological bases (e.g., her associations between concepts) of the agent’s overall attitude. Explicit questionnaire measures capture another psy­chological basis of the agent’s attitude, behavioral measures yet another basis, and so on. Implicit measures, then, do not assess “implicit attitudes,” and indeed, Machery denies that attitudes divide into implicit and explicit kinds. Rather, implicit measures quantify elements of attitudes. In part, this proposal is meant to explain some of the key psychometric properties of implicit measures, such as their instability over time and the fact that some implicit measures correlate poorly with each other (§5). These findings are consistent with the notion that different implicit measures quantify different psychological bases of attitudes, Machery argues.

One advantage of thinking of implicit biases as traits is that it is consistent with the way in which personality attributions readily admit of vague cases. Just as we might say that Frank is partly agreeable if he extols the virtues of compassion yet sometimes treats strangers rudely, we might say that Frank is partly prejudiced. Dispositional theories capture this intuition. On the other hand, trait-based theories of implicit bias face long-standing challenges to dispositionalism in the philosophy of mind. One such challenge is that traits are explanatory as generalizations, not as token causes of judgment and behavior (Carruthers 2013). Another is the specter of circularity arising from the simultaneous use of an agent’s behavior to both define her disposition and to point to what her disposition predicts (Bandura, 1971; Cervone et al. 2015; Mischel 1968; Payne et al. 2017). In both cases, the question for dispositionalism is whether it truly helps to explain the data, or merely repackages outwardly observed patterns in new terms.

2.5 Situations

The most common way people think and write about implicit biases is as attributes of persons. Another possibility, though, is that implicit biases are attributes of situations. Although psychologists have been debating person-based and situation-based explanations throughout the history of implicit social cognition research (Payne & Gawronski 2010; Murphy & Walton 2013; Murphy et al. 2018), the situationist approach has gained steam due to Payne and colleagues’ (2017) “bias of crowds” model. Borrowing from the concept of the “wisdom of crowds,” this approach suggests that differences between situations explains the variance of scores on implicit measures, rather than differences between individuals. A helpful metaphor used by Payne and colleagues is doing “the wave” at a baseball game. Where a person is sitting in the bleachers, in combination with where the wave is at a given time, is likely to outperform most individual differences (e.g., implicit or explicit feelings about the wave) in predicting whether a person sits or stands. Likewise, what predicts implicit bias are features of people’s situations, not features of their personality. For example, living in a highly residentially segregated neighborhood might be expected to outpredict racial implicit bias compared to individual-level factors, such as beliefs and personality.

The bias of crowds model is aimed at making sense of five features of implicit bias which are otherwise challenging to make sense of together, namely: (1) average group-level scores of implicit bias are very robust and stable; (2) children’s average scores of implicit bias are nearly identical to adults’ average scores; (3) aggregate levels of implicit bias at the population level (e.g., regions, states, and countries) are both highly stable and strongly associated with discriminatory outcomes and group-based disparities; yet, (4) individual differences in implicit bias have small-to-medium zero-order correlations with discriminatory behavior; and (5) individual test-retest reliability is low over weeks and months. (See Payne et al. 2017 for references.) Another advantage of the bias of crowds model is that it coalesces well with calls in philosophy for focusing more on “structural” or “systemic” bias, rather than on the biases in the heads of individuals (§5).

One challenge for the bias of crowds model is explaining how systemic biases interact with and affect the minds of individuals, however. Payne and colleagues appeal to the idea of the “accessibility” of concepts in individuals’ minds, that is, the “likelihood that a thought, evaluation, stereotype, trait, or other piece of information” becomes activated and poised to influence behavior. The lion’s share of evidence, they argue, suggests that the concepts related to implicit bias are activated due to situational causes. This may be, but it does not explain (a) how situations activate concepts in individuals’ minds (Payne and colleagues are explicitly agnostic about the format of cognitive representations that underlie implicit bias); and (b) how situational factors interact with individual factors to give rise to biased actions (Gawronski & Bodenhausen 2017; Brownstein et al. 2019).

3. Epistemology

Philosophical work on the epistemology of implicit bias has focused on three related questions.[14] First, do we have knowledge of our own implicit biases, and if so, how? Second, do the emerging data on implicit bias demand that we become skeptics about our perceptual beliefs or our overall status as epistemic agents? And third, are we faced with a dilemma between our epistemic and ethical values due to the pervasive nature of implicit bias?

3.1 Self-Knowledge

Implicit bias is typically thought of as unconscious (§2.1.1), but what exactly does this mean? There are several possibilities: there might be no phenomenology associated with the relevant mental states or dispositions; agents might be unaware of the content of the representations underlying their performance on implicit measures, or they might be unaware of the source of their implicit biases or the effects those biases have on their behavior; agents might be unaware of the relations between their relevant states (e.g., that their implicit and explicit evaluations of a given target conflict); and agents might have different modes of awareness of their own minds (e.g., “access” vs. “phenomenal” awareness; Block 1995). Gawronski and colleagues (2006) argue that agents typically lack “source” and “impact” awareness of their implicit biases, but typically have “content” awareness.[15] Evidence for content awareness stems from “bogus pipeline” experiments (e.g., Nier 2005) in which participants are led to believe that inaccurate self-reports will be detected by the experimenter. In these experiments, participants’ scores on implicit and explicit measures come to be more closely correlated, suggesting that participants are aware of the content of those judgments detected by implicit measures and shift their reports when they believe that the experimenter will notice discrepancies. Additional evidence for content awareness is found in studies in which experimenters bring implicit measures and self-reports into conceptual alignment (e.g., Banse et al. 2001) and studies in which agents are asked to predict their own implicit biases (Hahn et al. 2014). Indeed, Hahn and colleagues (2014) and Hahn and Gawronski (2019) have found that people are good at predicting their own IAT scores regardless of how the test is described, how much experience they have taking the test, and how much explanation they are given about the test before taking it. Moreover, people have unique insight into how they will do on the test, insight which is not explained by their beliefs about how people in general will perform.

Hahn and colleagues’ data do not determine, however, whether agents come to be aware of the content of their implicit biases through introspection, by drawing inferences from their own behavior, or from some other source (see Berger forthcoming for discussion). This is important for determining whether the awareness agents have of their implicit biases constitutes self-knowledge. If our awareness of the content of our implicit biases derives from inferences we make based on (for example) our behavior, then the question is whether these inferences are justified, assuming knowledge entails justified true belief. Some have suggested that the facts about implicit bias warrant a “global” skepticism toward our capacities as epistemic agents (Saul 2012; see §3.2.2). If this is right, then we ought to worry that our inferences about the content of our implicit biases, from all the ways we behave on a day-to-day basis, are likely to be unjustified. Others, however, have argued that people are typically very good interpreters of their own minds (e.g., Carruthers 2009; Levy 2012), in which case it may be more likely that our inferences about the content of our implicit biases are well-justified. But whether the inferences we make about our own minds are well-justified would be moot if it were shown that we have direct introspective access to our biases.

3.2 Skepticism

One sort of skeptical worry stems from research on the effects of implicit bias on perception (§3.2.1). This leads to a worry about the status of our perceptual beliefs. A second kind of skeptical worry focuses on what implicit bias may tell us about our capacities as epistemic agents in general (§3.2.2).

3.2.1 Perceptual Belief

Compared with participants who were first shown pictures of white faces, those who were primed with black faces in Payne (2001) were faster to identify pictures of guns as guns and were more likely to misidentify pictures of tools as guns. This finding has been directly and conceptually replicated (e.g., Payne et al. 2002; Conrey et al. 2005) and is an instance of a broader set of findings about the effects of attitudes and beliefs on perception (e.g., Barrick et al. 2002; Proffitt 2006). Payne’s findings are chilling particularly in light of police shootings of unarmed black men in recent years, such as Amadou Diallo and Oscar Grant. The findings suggest that agents’ implicit associations between “black men” and “guns” may affect their judgment and behavior by affecting what they see. In addition to the moral implications, this may be cause for a particular kind of epistemic concern. As Siegel (2012, 2017, forthcoming) puts it, the worry is that implicit bias introduces a circular structure into belief formation. If an agent believes that black men are more likely than white men to have or use guns, and this belief causes the agent to more readily see ambiguous objects in the hands of black men as guns, then when the agent relies upon visual perception as evidence to confirm her beliefs, she will have moved in a vicious circle.

Whether implicit biases are cause for this sort of epistemic concern depends on what sort of causal influence social attitudes have on visual perception. Payne’s weapons bias findings would be a case of “cognitive penetration” if the black primes make the images of tools look like images of guns, via an effect on perceptual experience itself (Siegel 2012, 2017, forthcoming). This would certainly introduce a circular structure in belief formation. Other scenarios raise the possibility of illicit belief formation without genuine cognitive penetration. Consider what Siegel calls “perceptual bypass”: the black primes do not cause the tools to look like guns (i.e., the prime does not cause a change in perceptual experience), yet some state in the agent, such as a heightened state of anxiety, is affected by the black prime and causes the agent to make a classification error. This will count as a case of illicit belief formation inasmuch as the agent’s social attitudes cause her to be insensitive to her visual stimuli in a way that confirms her antecedent attitudes (Siegel 2012). Other scenarios might allay the worry about illicit belief formation. For example, what Siegel calls “disowned behavior” proposes the same route to the classification error as “perceptual bypass,” except that the agent antecedently regards her error as an error. Empirical evidence can help to sort through these possibilities, though perhaps not settle between them conclusively (e.g., Correll et al. 2015).

3.2.2 Global Skepticism

A broader worry is that research on implicit bias should cause agents to mistrust their knowledge-seeking faculties in general. “Bias-related doubt” (Saul 2012) is stronger than traditional forms of skepticism (e.g., external world skepticism) in the sense that it suggests that our epistemic judgments are not just possibly but often likely mistaken. Implicit biases are likely to degrade our judgments across many domains, e.g., professors’ judgments about student grades, journal submissions, and job candidates.[16] Moreover, as Fricker (2007) points out, the testimony of members of stigmatized groups is likely to be discounted due to implicit bias, which, Saul suggests, can magnify these epistemic failures as well as create others, such as failing to recognize certain questions as relevant for inquiry (Hookway 2010). The key point about these examples is that our judgments are likely to be affected by implicit biases even when “we think we’re making judgments of scientific or argumentative merit” (Saul 2012: 249; see also Welpinghus forthcoming). Moreover, unlike errors of probabilistic reasoning, these effects generalize across many areas of day-to-day life. We should be worried, Saul argues,

whenever we consider a claim, an argument, a suggestion, a question, etc from a person whose apparent social group we’re in a position to recognize. (Saul 2012: 250).

Bias-related doubt may be diminished if successful interventions can be developed to correct for epistemic errors caused by implicit bias. In some cases, the fix may be simple, such as anonymous review of job candidate dossiers. But other contexts will certainly be more challenging.[17] More generally, Saul’s account of bias-related doubt takes a strongly pessimistic stance toward the normativity of our unreflective habits. “It is difficult to see”, she writes, “how we could ever properly trust [our habits] again once we have reflected on implicit bias” (2012: 254). Others, however, have stressed the ways in which unreflective habits can have epistemic virtues (e.g., Arpaly 2004; Railton 2014; Brownstein & Madva 2012a,b; Nagel 2012; Antony 2016). Squaring the reasons for pessimism about the epistemic status of our habits with these streams of thought will be important in future research.

3.3 Ethical/Epistemic Dilemmas

Gendler (2011) and Egan (2011) argue that implicit bias creates a conflict between our ethical and epistemic aims. Concern about ethical/epistemic dilemmas is at least as old as Pascal, as Egan points out, but is also incarnated in contemporary research on the value of positive illusions (i.e., beliefs like “I am brilliant!” which may promote well-being despite being false; e.g., Taylor & Brown 1988). The dilemma surrounding implicit bias stems from the apparent unavoidability of stereotyping, which Gendler traces to the way in which social categorization is fundamental to our cognitive capacities.[18] For agents who disavow common social stereotypes for ethical reasons, this creates a conflict between what we know and what we value. As Gendler puts it,

if you live in a society structured by racial categories that you disavow, either you must pay the epistemic cost of failing to encode certain sorts of base-rate or background information about cultural categories, or you must expend epistemic energy regulating the inevitable associations to which that information—encoded in ways to guarantee availability—gives rise. (2011: 37)

Gender considers forbidden base rates, for example, which are useful statistical generalizations that utilize problematic social knowledge. People who are asked to set insurance premiums for hypothetical neighborhoods will accept actuarial risk as a justification for setting higher premiums for particular neighborhoods but will not do so if they are told that actuarial risk is correlated with the racial composition of that neighborhood (Tetlock et al. 2000). This “epistemic self-censorship on non-epistemic grounds” makes it putatively impossible for agents to be both rational and equitable (Gendler 2011: 55, 57).

Egan (2011) raises problems for intuitive ways of diffusing this dilemma, settling instead on the idea that making epistemic sacrifices for our ethical values may simply be worth it. Others have been more unwilling to accept that implicit bias does in fact create an unavoidable ethical-epistemic dilemma (Mugg 2013; Beeghly 2014; Madva 2016b; Lassiter & Ballantyne 2017; Puddifoot 2017). One way of diffusing the dilemma, for example, is to suggest that it is not social knowledge per se that has costs, but rather that the accessibility of social knowledge in the wrong circumstances has cognitive costs (Madva 2016b). The solution to the dilemma, then, is not ignorance, but the situation-specific regulation of stereotype accessibility. For example, the accessibility of social knowledge can be regulated by agents’ goals and habits (Moskowitz & Li 2011). Readers interested in ethical-epistemic dilemmas due to implicit bias should also consider related scholarship on “moral encroachment” (e.g., Basu & Schroeder 2018; Gardiner 2018).

4. Ethics

Most philosophical writing on the ethics of implicit bias has focused on two distinct (but related) questions. First, are agents morally responsible for their implicit biases (§4.1)? Second, can agents change their implicit biases or control their effects on their judgments and behavior (§4.2)?

4.1 Moral Responsibility

Researchers working on moral responsibility for implicit bias often make two key distinctions. First, they distinguish responsibility for attitudes from responsibility for judgments and behavior. One can, that is, ask whether agents are responsible for their putative (§2) implicit attitudes as such, or whether agents are responsible for the effects of their implicit attitudes on their judgments and behavior. Most have focused on the latter question, as will I. A second important distinction is between being responsible and holding responsible. This distinction can be glossed in a number of different but related ways. It can be glossed as a distinction between blameworthiness and actual expressions of blame; between backward- and forward-looking responsibility (i.e., responsibility for things one has done in the past versus responsibility for doing certain things in the future); and between responsibility as a form of judgment versus responsibility as a form of sanction. Most have focused on the former of these disjuncts (being responsible, blameworthiness, etc.) via three kinds of approaches: arguments from the importance of awareness or knowledge of one’s implicit biases (§4.1.1); arguments from the importance of control over the impact of one’s implicit biases on one’s judgment and behavior (§4.1.2); and arguments from “attributionist” and “Deep Self” considerations (§4.1.3; see Holroyd et al. 2017 for a more in-depth review of theories of moral responsibility and implicit bias).

4.1.1 Arguments from Awareness

It is plausible that conscious awareness of our implicit biases is a necessary condition for moral responsibility for those biases. Saul articulates the intuitive idea, suggesting that we

abandon the view that all biases against stigmatised groups are blameworthy … [because a] person should not be blamed for an implicit bias that they are completely unaware of, which results solely from the fact that they live in a sexist culture. (2013: 55, emphasis in original)

Saul’s claim appears to be in keeping with folk psychological attitudes about blameworthiness and implicit bias. Cameron and colleagues (2010) found that subjects were considerably more willing to ascribe moral responsibility to “John” when he was described as acting in discriminatory ways against black people despite “thinking that people should be treated equally, regardless of race” compared to when he was described as acting in discriminatory ways despite having a “sub-conscious dislike for African Americans” that he is “unaware of having”.

Recalling the evidence that people often do have awareness of their implicit biases (§3.1), it would seem that typical agents are responsible for those biases on the basis of the argument from awareness. However, if the question is whether agents are blameworthy for behaviors affected by implicit biases (rather than for having biases themselves), then perhaps impact awareness is what matters most (Holroyd 2012). That said, lacking impact awareness of the effects of implicit bias on our behavior may not exculpate agents from responsibility even in principle. One possibility is that implicit biases are analogous to moods in the sense that being in an introspectively unnoticed bad mood can cause one to act badly (Madva 2018). There is debate about whether unnoticed moods are exculpatory (e.g., Korsgaard 1997; Levy 2011). One possibility is that bad moods and implicit biases both diminish blameworthiness, but do not undermine it as such. This claim depends in part on moral responsibility admitting of degrees.

One problem with focusing on impact awareness, however, as Holroyd (2012) points out, is that we may be unaware of the impact of a great many cognitive states on our behavior. The focus on impact awareness may lead to a global skepticism about moral responsibility, in other words. This suggests that impact awareness may not serve as a good criterion for distinguishing responsibility for implicit biases from responsibility for other cognitive states, notwithstanding whether global skepticism about moral responsibility is defensible.

A second way to unpack the argument from awareness is to focus on what agents ought to know about implicit bias, rather than what they do know. This approach indexes moral responsibility to one’s social and epistemic environment. For example, Kelly & Roedder (2008) argue that a “savvy grader” is responsible for adjusting her grades to compensate for her likely biases because she ought to be aware of and compelled by research on implicit bias. In a similar spirit, Washington & Kelly (2016) compare two hypothetical egalitarians with equivalent psychological profiles, the only difference between them being that the “Old School Egalitarian” is evaluating résumés in 1980 and the “New Egalitarian” is doing so in 2014. While neither has heard of implicit bias, Washington & Kelly argue that the New Egalitarian is morally culpable in a way that the Old School Egalitarian isn’t. Only the New Egalitarian could have, and ought to have, known about his likely implicit biases, given the comparative states of art of psychological research in 1980 and 2014. The underlying intuition here is that assessments of responsibility change with changes in an agent’s social and epistemic environment.

A third way of unpacking the argument from awareness is to focus on the way in which an attitude does or does not integrate with a variety of the agent’s other attitudes once it becomes conscious (Levy 2012; see §2.1). On this view, attitudes that cause responsible behavior are available to a broad range of cognitive systems. For example, in cognitive dissonance experiments (e.g., Festinger 1956), agents attribute confabulatory reasons to themselves and then tend to act in accord with those self-attributed reasons. The self-attribution of reasons in this case, according to Levy (2012), has an integrating effect on behavior, and thus can be thought of as underwriting the sort of agency required for moral responsibility. Crucially, it is when the agent becomes conscious of her self-attributed reasons that they have this integrating effect. This provides grounds for claiming that attitudes for which agents are responsible are those that integrate behavior when the agent becomes aware of the content of those attitudes. Implicit attitudes are not like this, according to Levy. What’s morally important is that

awareness of the content of our implicit attitudes fails to integrate them into our person level concerns in the manner required for direct moral responsibility. (Levy 2012: 9).

4.1.2 Arguments from Control

The fact that implicit processes are often defined in contrast to “controlled” cognitive processes (§2.2) implies that they may affect behavior in a way that bypasses a person’s agential capacities. The fact that implicit biases seem to “rebound” in response to intentional efforts to suppress them supports this interpretation (Huebner 2009; Follenfant & Ric 2010). Early research suggesting that implicit biases reflect mere awareness of stereotypes, rather than personal attitudes, also implies that these states reflect processes that “happen to” agents. More recently, however, philosophers have questioned the ramifications of these and other data for the notion of control relevant to moral responsibility.

Perhaps the most familiar way of understanding control in the responsibility literature is in terms of a psychological mechanism that would allow an agent to act differently than she otherwise would act when there is sufficient reason to do so (Fischer & Ravizza 2000). The question facing this sort of reasons-responsiveness view of control is whether automatized behaviors—which unfold in the absence of explicit reasoning—should be thought of as under an agent’s control. Some have argued that automaticity and control are not mutually exclusive. Holroyd & Kelly (2016) advance a notion of “ecological control”, and Suhler and Churchland (2009) offer an account of nonconscious control that underwrites automaticity itself, yet is ostensibly sufficient for underwriting responsibility. Others have distinguished between automaticity and automatisms (e.g., sleepwalking); in this sense, the relevant moral distinction might be drawn in terms of agents’ ability to “pre-program” their automatic actions (but not automatistic actions) via previous controlled choices (e.g., Wigley 2007); it might be drawn in terms of agents’ ability to consciously monitor their automatic actions (e.g., Levy & Bayne, 2004); or it might simply be the case that putative implicit attitudes are not automatic because they are readily changeable (e.g., Buckwalter forthcoming).[19] Others still have distinguished between “indirect” and “direct” control over one’s attitudes or behavior (e.g., Holroyd 2012; Levy & Mandelbaum 2014; Sie & Voorst Vader-Bours 2016). Holroyd (2012) argues that there are many things over which we do not hold direct and immediate control, yet for which we are commonly held responsible, such as learning a skill, speaking a foreign language, and even holding certain beliefs. None of these abilities or states can be had by fiat of will; rather, they take time and effort to obtain. This suggests that we can be held responsible for attitudes or behaviors over which we only have indirect long-range control. The question, then, of course, is whether agents can exercise indirect long-range control over their implicit biases. Mounting evidence suggests that we can (§4.2).

4.1.3 Attributionism and Deep Self Theories

“Attributionist” and Deep Self theories of moral responsibility represent an alternative to arguments from awareness and control. According to these theories, for an agent to be responsible for an action is for that action to “reflect upon” the agent “herself”. A common way of speaking is to say that responsibility-bearing actions are attributable to agents in virtue of reflecting upon the agent’s “deep self”, where the deep self represents the person’s fundamental evaluative stance (Sripada 2016). Although there is much disagreement in the literature about what the deep self really is, as well as what it means for an attitude or action to reflect upon it, attributionists agree that people can be morally responsible for actions that are non-conscious (e.g., “failure to notice” cases), non-voluntary (e.g., actions stemming from strong emotional reactions), or otherwise divergent from an agent’s will (Frankfurt 1971; Watson 1975, 1996; Scanlon 1998; A. Smith 2005, 2008, 2012; Hieronymi 2008; Sher 2009; and H. Smith 2011).

One influential view developed in recent years is that agents are responsible for just those actions or attitudes that stem from, or are susceptible to modification by, the agent’s “evaluative” or “rational” judgments, which are judgments for which it is appropriate (in principle) to ask the agent her reasons (in a justifying sense) for holding (Scanlon 1998; A. Smith 2005, 2008, 2012). A. Smith suggests that implicit biases stem from rational judgments, because

a person’s explicitly avowed beliefs do not settle the question of what she regards as a justifying consideration. (2012: 581–582, fn 10)

An alternative approach sees the source of the “deep self” in an agent’s “cares” rather than in her rational judgments (Shoemaker 2003, 2011; Jaworska 2007; Sripada 2016). Cares have been described in different ways, but in this context are thought of as psychological states with motivational, affective, and evaluative dispositional properties. It is an open question whether implicit biases are reflective of an agent’s cares (Brownstein 2016a, 2018). It is also possible that even in cases in which an implicit bias is not attributable to an agent’s deep self, it may still be appropriate to hold the agent responsible for violating some duty or obligation she holds due to her implicit biases (Zheng 2016). Glasgow (2016) similarly argues for responsibility for implicit biases that may not be attributable to agents. His view unfolds in terms of responsibility for actions from which agents are nevertheless alienated. Glasgow defends this view on the basis of “Content-Sensitive Variantism” and “Harm-Sensitive Variantism”, a pair of views according to which alienation exculpates depending on extra-agential features of an action, such as the content of the action or the kind of harm it creates. These variantist views are fairly strongly revisionist with respect to traditional conceptions of responsibility in the 20th century philosophical literature. Some have argued that research on implicit bias calls for revisionism of this sort (Vargas 2005; Faucher 2016).

4.2 Interventions

Researchers working in applied ethics may be less concerned with questions about in-principle culpability and more concerned with investigating how to change or control our implicit biases. Of course, anyone committed to fighting against prejudice and discrimination will likely share this interest. Policymakers and workplace managers may also be concerned with finding effective interventions, given that they are already directing tremendous public and private resources toward anti-discrimination programs in workplaces, universities, and other domains affected by intergroup conflict. Yet as Paluck and Green (2009) suggest, the effectiveness of many of the strategies commonly used remains unclear. Most studies on prejudice reduction are non-experimental (lacking random assignment), are performed without control groups, focus on self-report surveys, and gather primarily qualitative (rather than quantitative) data.

An emerging body of laboratory-based research suggests that strategies are available for regulating implicit biases, however. One way to class these strategies is in terms of those that purport to change the apparent associations underlying agents’ implicit biases, compared with those that purport to leave implicit associations intact but enable agents to control the effects of their biases on their judgment and behavior (Stewart & Payne 2008; Mendoza et al. 2010; Lai et al. 2013). For example, a “change-based” strategy might reduce individuals’ automatic associations of “white” with “good” while a “control-based” strategy might enable individuals to prevent that association from affecting their behavior. Below, I briefly describe some of these interventions. For comparison of the data on their effectiveness, see Lai and colleagues (2014, 2016), and for discussion of their significance for theories of the metaphysics of implicit bias, including a helpful appendix listing “debiasing” experiments, see Byrd (forthcoming).

4.2.1 Change-based interventions

Intergroup contact (Aberson et al. 2008; Dasgupta & Rivera 2008; Anderson 2010 for discussion): long studied for its effects on explicit prejudice (e.g., Allport 1954; Pettigrew & Tropp 2006), interaction between members of different social groups appears to diminish implicit bias as well, albeit under some moderating conditions (e.g., equal status interaction) and not under others.

Approach training (Kawakami et al. 2007, 2008; Phills et al. 2011): participants repeatedly “negate” stereotypes and “affirm” counter-stereotypes by pressing a button labelled “NO!” when they see stereotype-consistent images (e.g., of a black face paired with the word “athletic”) or “YES!” when they see stereotype-inconsistent images (e.g., of a white face paired with the word “athletic”). Other experimental scenarios have had participants push a joystick away from themselves to “negate” stereotypes and pull the joystick toward themselves to “affirm” counter-stereotypes.

Evaluative conditioning (Olson & Fazio 2006; De Houwer 2011): a widely used technique whereby an attitude object (e.g., a picture of a black face) is paired with another valenced attitude object (e.g., the word “genius”), which shifts the valence of the first object in the direction of the second.

Counter-stereotype exposure (Blair et al. 2001; Dasgupta & Greenwald 2001): increasing individuals’ exposure to images, film clips, or even mental imagery depicting members of stigmatized groups acting in stereotype-discordant ways (e.g., images of female scientists).

4.2.2 Control-based interventions

Implementation intentions (Gollwitzer & Sheeran 2006; Stewart & Payne 2008; Mendoza et al. 2010; Webb et al. 2012): “if-then” plans that specify a goal-directed response that an individual plans to perform on encountering an anticipated cue. For example, in a “Shooter Bias” test, where participants are given the goal to “shoot” all and only those individuals shown holding guns in a computer simulation, participants may be asked to adopt the plan, “if I see a black face, I will think ‘safe!’”[20]

“Cues for control” (Monteith 1993; Monteith et al. 2002): techniques for noticing prejudiced responses, in particular the affective discomfort caused by the inconsistency of those responses with participants’ egalitarian goals.

Priming goals, moods, and motivations (Huntsinger et al. 2010; Moskowitz & Li 2011; Mann & Kawakami 2012): priming egalitarian goals, multicultural ideologies, or particular moods can lower scores of prejudice on implicit measures.

There is some doubt about this way of categorizing interventions, as some control-based interventions may also change agents’ underlying associations and some association-based interventions may also promote control (Stewart & Payne 2008; Mendoza et al. 2010). More significant though are concerns about the efficacy of these interventions over time (Lai et al. 2016), their practical feasibility (Bargh 1999; Schneider 2004), and the possibility that they may distract from broader problems of economic and institutional forms of injustice (Anderson 2010; Dixon et al. 2012; see §5). Of course, most of the research on interventions like these is recent, so it is simply not clear yet which strategies, or combination of strategies (Devine et al. 2012), will or won’t be effective. Some have voiced optimism about the role lab-based interventions like these can play as elements of broader efforts to combat prejudice and discrimination (e.g., Kelly et al. 2010a; Madva 2017).

5. Critical Responses

Research on implicit bias has been criticized in several ways. Below are brief descriptions of, and discussion about, prominent lines of critique.[21] I leave aside critical assessments of specific implicit measures.

5.1 Hype

Research on implicit bias has received a lot of attention, not only in philosophy and psychology, but in politics, journalism, jurisprudence, business, and medicine as well. Some have worried that this attention is excessive, such that the explanatory power of research on implicit bias has been overstated (e.g., Singal 2017; Jussim 2018 (Other Internet Resources); Blanton & Ikizer 2019).

While the difficulty of public science communication is pervasive (i.e., not limited to implicit bias research), and the most egregious cases are found in the popular press, it is true that some researchers have overhyped the importance of implicit bias for explaining social phenomena. Hype can have disastrous consequences, such as creating public distrust in science. One important point to bear in mind, however, is that the challenges facing science communication and the challenges facing a body of research are distinct. That is, one question is whether the science is strong, and it is a separate question whether the strength of the science, such as it is, is accurately communicated to the public. Overhyped research may create incentives for scientists to do flashy but weak work—and this is a problem—but problems with hype are nevertheless distinct from problems with the science itself.

5.2 Implicit vs. Explicit

Some have argued that explicit bias can explain much of what implicit bias purports to explain (e.g., Hermanson 2017a,b, 2018 (Other Internet Resources); Singal 2017; Buckwalter 2018). Jesse Singal (2017), for example, denies that implicit bias is more important than explicit bias, pointing to the United States Department of Justice’s findings about intentional race-based discrimination in Ferguson, MO and to the fact that the United States elected a relatively explicitly racist President in 2016.

Singal and others are surely right that explicit bias and outright prejudice are persistent and, in some places, pervasive. It is, however, unclear who, if anyone, thinks that implicit bias is more important than explicit bias. Philosophers in particular have been interested in implicit bias because, despite the persistence and pervasiveness of explicit bias, there are many people—presumably many of those reading this article—who aim to think and act in unprejudiced ways, and yet are susceptible to the kinds of biased behavior implicit bias researchers have studied. This is not only an important phenomenon in its own right, but also may contribute causally to the mainstream complacence toward the very outrageous instances of bigotry Singal discusses. Implicit bias may also contribute causally to explicit bias, particularly in environments suffused with prejudiced norms (Madva 2019).

A related worry is that there is not agreement in the literature about what “implicit” means. Arguably the most common understanding is that “implicit” means “unconscious.” But whatever is assessed by implicit measures is arguably not unconscious (§3.1).

It is true that there is no widespread agreement about the meaning of “implicit,” and it is also true that no theory of implicit social cognition is consistent with all the current data. To what extent this is a problem depends on background theories about how science progresses. It is also crucial to recognize that implicit measures are not high-fidelity assessments of any one distinct “part” of the mind. They are not process pure (§1.2). This means that they capture a mix of various cognitive and affective processes. Included in this mix are people’s beliefs and explicit attitudes. Indeed, researchers have known for some time that the best way to predict a person’s scores on an implicit measure like the IAT is to ask them their opinions about the IAT’s targets. This does not mean that implicit measures lack “discriminant validity,” however (i.e., that they are redundant with existing measures). By analogy, you are likely to find that people who say that cilantro is disgusting are likely to have aversive reactions to it, but this doesn’t mean that their aversive reactions are an invalid construct. Indeed, one of the leading theories of the dynamics and processes of implicit social cognition since 2006—APE (§2.2)—is based on a set of predictions about this process impurity (i.e., about the interactions of implicit and explicit evaluative processes).

5.3 Predicting Behavior

Several meta-analyses have found that, according to standard conventions, the correlation between implicit measures and behavior is small to medium. Average correlations have ranged from approximately .14 to .37 (Cameron et al. 2012; Greenwald et al. 2009; Oswald et al. 2013; Kurdi et al. 2019). This variety is due to several factors, including the type of measures, type of attitudes measured (e.g., attitudes in general vs. intergroup attitudes in particular), inclusion criteria for meta-analyses, and statistical meta-analytic techniques. From these data, critics have concluded that implicit measures are poor predictors of behavior. Oswald and colleagues write, “the IAT provides little insight into who will discriminate against whom, and provides no more insight than explicit measures of bias” (2013, 18). Focusing on implicit bias research more broadly, Buckwalter suggests that a review of the evidence “casts doubt on the claim that implicit attitudes will be found to be significant causes of behavior” (2018, 11).

Several background questions must be considered in order to assess these claims. Should implicit measures be expected to have small, medium, or large unconditional (or “zero-order”) correlations with behavior? Zero-order correlations are those that obtain between two variables when no additional variable has been controlled for. Since the 1970s, research on self-reported attitudes has largely focused on when—under what conditions—attitudes predict behavior, not whether attitudes predict behavior just as such. For example, attitudes better predict behavior when there is clear correspondence between the attitude object and the behavior in question (Ajzen & Fishbein 1977). While generic attitudes toward the environment do not predict recycling behavior very well, for instance, specific attitudes toward recycling do (Oskamp et al. 1991). In the 1970s and 1980s, a consensus emerged that attitude-behavior relations depend in general on the particular behavior being measured (e.g., political judgments vs. racial judgments), the conditions under which the behavior is performed (e.g., under time pressure or not), and the person who is performing the behavior (e.g., personality; Zanna & Fazio 1982). A wealth of theoretical models of attitude-behavior relations take these facts into account to make principled predictions about when attitudes do and do not predict behavior (e.g., Fazio 1990). Similar work is underway focusing on implicit social cognition (for review see Gawronski & Hahn 2019 and Brownstein et al. ms).

In a related vein, it is also important to keep in mind that large zero-order correlations are rarely found in social science, let alone in attitude research. Large zero-order correlations should not be expected to be found in implicit bias research, either (Gawronski, forthcoming). Indeed, the zero-order correlations between other familiar constructs and outcome measures is comparable to what has been found in meta-analyses of implicit measures: beliefs and stereotypes about outgroups and behavior (r = .12; Talaska et al. 2008); IQ and income (r = .2–.3; Strenze 2007); SAT scores and freshman grades in college (r = .24; Wolfe and Johnson 1995); parents’ and their children’s socioeconomic status (r = .2–.3; Strenze 2007). The fact that no meta-analysis of implicit measures has reported nonsignificant correlations close to zero or negative correlations with behavior further supports the conclusion that the relationship between implicit bias and behavior falls within the “zone” of the relationship between these more familiar constructs and relevant kinds of behavior. Whether this common pattern of findings in social science—of weak to moderate unconditional relations with behavior—is succor for supporters of implicit bias research or cause for concern about the social sciences in general is an important and open question (see, e.g., Greenwald et al. 2015; Oswald et al. 2015; Jost 2019; Gawronski forthcoming).[22] But note that the consistent finding of meta-analyses of implicit measures distinguishes this body of research from those that have been swept up in the social sciences’ ongoing “replication crisis.” That people, on average, display biases on implicit measures is one of the most stable and replicated findings in recent psychological science.[23] The debate described in this section pertains to interpreting the significance of this finding.

5.4 Structuralism

So-called “structuralist” critics (e.g., Banks & Ford 2009; Anderson 2010; Haslanger 2015; Ayala 2016, 2018; Mallon ms) have argued that researchers ought to pay more attention to systemic and institutional causes of injustice—such as poverty, housing segregation, economic inequality, etc.—rather than focusing on the biases inside the minds of individuals. One way to express the structuralist idea is that what happens in the minds of individuals, including their biases, is the product of social inequities rather than an explanation for them. Structuralists then tend to argue that our efforts to combat discrimination and inequity ought to focus on changing social structures themselves, rather than trying to change individual’s biases directly. For example, Ayala argues that “agents’ mental states [are] … not necessary to understand and explain” when considering social injustice (2016, 9). Likewise, in her call to combat segregation in the contemporary United States, Anderson (2010) is critical of what she sees as a distracting focus on the psychology of bias.

A strong version of the structuralist critique—that research on the psychology of prejudice is entirely useless, distracting, or even dangerous—is hard to defend. Large-scale demographic research makes clear that psychological prejudice is a key driver of (for example) economic inequality (e.g., Chetty et al. 2018) and inequities in the criminal justice system (Center for Policing Equity 2016). More broadly, no matter how autonomously certain social structures operate, people must choose to accept or reject those structures, to vote for politicians who speak for or against them, and so on. How people assess these options is at least in part a psychological question.

A weaker version of the structuralist critique calls for needed attention to the ways in which psychological and structural phenomena interact to produce and entrench discrimination and inequity. This “interactionism” seeks to understand how bias operates differently in different contexts. If you wanted to combat housing segregation, for example, you would want to consider not only problematic institutional practices, such as “redlining” certain neighborhoods within which banks will not give mortgage loans, and not only psychological factors, such as the propensity to perceive low-income people as untrustworthy, but the interaction of the two. A low-income person from a redlined neighborhood might not be perceived as untrustworthy when they are interviewing for a job as a nanny, but might be perceived as untrustworthy when they are interviewing for a loan. Adopting the view that bias and structure interact to produce unequal outcomes does not mean that researchers must always account for both. Sometimes it makes sense to emphasize one kind of cause or the other.

An interactionist version of structuralism can incorporate research on prejudice into a wider understanding of inequity, rather than eschew it. One way to do so is to identify ways in which psychological biases (whether implicit or explicit) might be key contributors to social-structural phenomena. For example, structuralists sometimes point to the drug laws and sentencing guidelines that contribute to the mass incarceration of black men in the USA as examples of systemic biases. Sometimes, however, when these laws and policies change, discrimination persists. While arrests have declined for all racial groups in states that have decriminalized marijuana, black people continue to be arrested for marijuana-related offenses at a rate of about 10 times that of white people (Drug Policy Alliance 2018). This suggests that psychological biases (belonging to officers, policy makers, or voters) are an ineliminable part of systemic inequity. Such interactionism is just one approach for blending individual and institutional approaches to intergroup discrimination (see, e.g., Madva 2016a, 2017; Davidson & Kelly forthcoming). Another idea is to incorporate research specifically on implicit bias into a wider understanding of the structural sources of inequity by using implicit measures to assess broad social patterns (rather than to assess the differences between individuals). The “Bias of Crowds” model (§2.5) argues that implicit bias is a feature of cultures and communities. For example, average scores on implicit measures of prejudice and stereotypes, when aggregated at the level of cities within the United States, predict racial disparities of shootings of citizens by police in those cities (Hehman et al. 2017). Thus, while it is certainly true that most of the relevant literature and discussion conceptualizes implicit bias as way of differentiating between individuals, structuralists might utilize the data for differentiating regions, cultures, and so on.

6. Future Research

Nosek and colleagues (2011) suggest that the second generation of research on implicit social cognition will come to be known as the “Age of Mechanism”. Several metaphysical questions fall under this label. One question crucial to the metaphysics of implicit bias is whether the relevant psychological constructs should be thought of as stable, trait-like features of a person’s identity or as momentary, state-like features of their current mindset or situation (§2.4). While current data suggest that implicit biases are more state-like than trait-like, methodological improvements may generate more stable, dispositional results on implicit measures. Ongoing research on additional psychometric properties of implicit measures—such as their discriminant validity and capacity to predict behavior—will also strengthen support for some theories of the metaphysics of implicit bias and weaken support for others. Another open metaphysical question is whether the mechanisms underlying different forms of implicit bias (e.g., implicit racial biases vs. implicit gender biases) are heterogeneous. Some have already begun to carve implicit social attitudes into kinds (Amodio & Devine 2006; Holroyd & Sweetman 2016; Del Pinal et al. 2017; Del Pinal & Spaulding 2018; Madva & Brownstein 2018). Future research on implicit bias in particular domains of social life may also help to illuminate this issue, such as research on implicit bias in legal practices (e.g., Lane et al. 2007; Kang 2009) and in medicine (e.g., Green et al. 2007; Penner et al. 2010), on the development of implicit bias in children (e.g., Dunham et al. 2013b), on implicit intergroup bias toward non-black racial minorities, such as Asians and Latinos (Dasgupta 2004), and cross-cultural research on implicit bias in non-Western countries (e.g., Dunham et al. 2013a).

Future research on epistemology and implicit bias may tackle a number of questions, for example: does the testimony of social and personality psychologists about statistical regularities justify believing that you are biased? What can developments in vision science tell us about illicit belief formation due to implicit bias? In what ways is implicit bias depicted and discussed outside academia (e.g., in stand-up comedy focusing on social attitudes)? Also germane are future methodological questions, such as how research on implicit social cognition may interface with large-scale correlational sociological studies on social attitudes and discrimination (Lee 2016). Another crucial methodological question is whether and how theories of implicit bias—and more generally psychological approaches to understanding social phenomena—can come to be integrated with broader social theories focusing on race, gender, class, disability, etc. Important discussions have begun (e.g., Valian 2005; Kelly & Roedder 2008; Faucher & Machery 2009; Anderson 2010; Machery et al. 2010; Madva 2017), but there is no doubt that more connections must be drawn to relevant work on identity (e.g., Appiah 2005), critical theory (e.g., Delgado & Stefancic 2012), feminist epistemology (Grasswick 2013), and race and political theory (e.g., Mills 1999).

As with all of the above, questions in theoretical ethics about moral responsibility for implicit bias will certainly be influenced by future empirical research. One noteworthy intersection of theoretical ethics with forthcoming empirical research will focus on the interpersonal effects of blaming and judgments about blameworthiness for implicit bias.[24] This research aims to have practical ramifications for mitigating intergroup conflict as well, of course. On this front, arguably the most pressing question, however, is about the durability of psychological interventions once agents leave the lab. How long will shifts in biased responding last? Will individuals inevitably “relearn” their biases (cf. Madva 2017)? Is it possible to leverage the lessons of “situationism” in reverse, such that shifts in individuals’ attitudes create environments that provoke more egalitarian behaviors in others (Sarkissian 2010; Brownstein 2016b)? Moreover, what has (or has not) changed in people’s feelings, judgments, and actions now that research on implicit bias has received considerable public attention (e.g., Charlesworth & Banaji 2019)?


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Other Internet Resources



Many thanks to Yarrow Dunham, Jules Holroyd, Bryce Huebner, Daniel Kelly, Calvin Lai, Carole Lee, Alex Madva, Eric Mandelbaum, Jennifer Saul, and Susanna Siegel for invaluable suggestions and feedback. Thanks also to the Leverhulme Trust for funding the “Implicit Bias and Philosophy” workshops at the University of Sheffield from 2011–2013, and to Jennifer Saul for running the workshops and making them a model of scholarship and collaboration at its best.

Copyright © 2019 by
Michael Brownstein <>

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