Cognitive Science

First published Mon Sep 23, 1996; substantive revision Tue Jan 31, 2023

Cognitive science is the interdisciplinary study of mind and intelligence, embracing philosophy, psychology, artificial intelligence, neuroscience, linguistics, and anthropology. Its intellectual origins are in the mid-1950s when researchers in several fields began to develop theories of mind based on complex representations and computational procedures. Its organizational origins are in the mid-1970s when the Cognitive Science Society was formed and the journal Cognitive Science began. Since then, more than one hundred universities in North America, Europe, Asia, and Australia have established cognitive science programs, and many others have instituted courses in cognitive science.

1. History

Attempts to understand the mind and its operation go back at least to the Ancient Greeks, when philosophers such as Plato and Aristotle tried to explain the nature of human knowledge. The study of mind remained the province of philosophy until the nineteenth century, when experimental psychology developed. Wilhelm Wundt and his students initiated laboratory methods for studying mental operations more systematically. Within a few decades, however, experimental psychology became dominated by behaviorism, a view that virtually denied the existence of mind. According to behaviorists such as J. B. Watson, psychology should restrict itself to examining the relation between observable stimuli and observable behavioral responses. Talk of consciousness and mental representations was banished from respectable scientific discussion. Especially in North America, behaviorism dominated the psychological scene through the 1950s.

Around 1956, the intellectual landscape began to change dramatically. George Miller summarized numerous studies which showed that the capacity of human thinking is limited, with short-term memory, for example, limited to around seven items. He proposed that memory limitations can be overcome by recoding information into chunks, mental representations that require mental procedures for encoding and decoding the information. At this time, primitive computers had been around for only a few years, but pioneers such as John McCarthy, Marvin Minsky, Allen Newell, and Herbert Simon were founding the field of artificial intelligence. In addition, Noam Chomsky rejected behaviorist assumptions about language as a learned habit and proposed instead to explain language comprehension in terms of mental grammars consisting of rules. The six thinkers mentioned in this paragraph can be viewed as the founders of cognitive science.

2. Methods

Cognitive science has unifying theoretical ideas, but we have to appreciate the diversity of outlooks and methods that researchers in different fields bring to the study of mind and intelligence. Although cognitive psychologists today often engage in theorizing and computational modeling, their primary method is experimentation with human participants. People, often undergraduates satisfying course requirements, are brought into the laboratory so that different kinds of thinking can be studied under controlled conditions. For example, psychologists have experimentally examined the kinds of mistakes people make in deductive reasoning, the ways that people form and apply concepts, the speed of people thinking with mental images, and the performance of people solving problems using analogies. Our conclusions about how the mind works must be based on more than “common sense” and introspection, since these can give a misleading picture of mental operations, many of which are not consciously accessible. Increasingly, psychologists draw their experimental participants from Amazon’s Mechanical Turk and from culturally diverse sources. Psychological experiments that carefully approach mental operations from diverse directions are therefore crucial for cognitive science to be scientific. Experimentation is also a methodology employed by experimental philosophy.

Although theory without experiment is empty, experiment without theory is blind. To address the crucial questions about the nature of mind, the psychological experiments need to be interpretable within a theoretical framework that postulates mental representations and procedures. One of the best ways of developing theoretical frameworks is by forming and testing computational models intended to be analogous to mental operations. To complement psychological experiments on deductive reasoning, concept formation, mental imagery, and analogical problem solving, researchers have developed computational models that simulate aspects of human performance. Designing, building, and experimenting with computational models is the central method of artificial intelligence (AI), the branch of computer science concerned with intelligent systems. Ideally in cognitive science, computational models and psychological experimentation go hand in hand, but much important work in AI has examined the power of different approaches to knowledge representation in relative isolation from experimental psychology.

While some linguists do psychological experiments or develop computational models, most currently use different methods. For linguists in the Chomskian tradition, the main theoretical task is to identify grammatical principles that provide the basic structure of human languages. Identification takes place by noticing subtle differences between grammatical and ungrammatical utterances. In English, for example, the sentences “She hit the ball” and “What do you like?” are grammatical, but “She the hit ball” and “What does you like?” are not. A grammar of English will explain why the former are acceptable but not the latter. An alternative approach, cognitive linguistics, puts less emphasis on syntax and more on semantics and concepts.

Like cognitive psychologists, neuroscientists often perform controlled experiments, but their observations are very different, since neuroscientists are concerned directly with the nature of the brain. With nonhuman subjects, researchers can insert electrodes and record the firing of individual neurons. With humans for whom this technique would be too invasive, it is now common to use magnetic and positron scanning devices to observe what is happening in different parts of the brain while people are doing various mental tasks. For example, brain scans have identified the regions of the brain involved in mental imagery and word interpretation. Additional evidence about brain functioning is gathered by observing the performance of people whose brains have been damaged in identifiable ways. A stroke, for example, in a part of the brain dedicated to language can produce deficits such as the inability to utter sentences. Like cognitive psychology, neuroscience is often theoretical as well as experimental, and theory development is frequently aided by developing computational models of the behavior of groups of neurons.

Cognitive anthropology expands the examination of human thinking to consider how thought works in different cultural settings. The study of mind should obviously not be restricted to how English speakers think but should consider possible differences in modes of thinking across cultures. Cognitive science is becoming increasingly aware of the need to view the operations of mind in particular physical and social environments. For cultural anthropologists, the main method is ethnography, which requires living and interacting with members of a culture to a sufficient extent that their social and cognitive systems become apparent. Cognitive anthropologists have investigated, for example, the similarities and differences across cultures in words for colors.

Traditionally, philosophers do not perform systematic empirical observations or construct computational models, although there has been a rise in work in experimental philosophy. But philosophy remains important to cognitive science because it deals with fundamental issues that underlie the experimental and computational approach to mind. Abstract questions such as the nature of representation and computation need not be addressed in the everyday practice of psychology or artificial intelligence, but they inevitably arise when researchers think deeply about what they are doing. Philosophy also deals with general questions such as the relation of mind and body and with methodological questions such as the nature of explanations found in cognitive science. In addition, philosophy concerns itself with normative questions about how people should think as well as with descriptive ones about how they do. Besides the theoretical goal of understanding human thinking, cognitive science can have the practical goal of improving it, which requires normative reflection on what we want thinking to be. Philosophy of mind does not have a distinct method, but should share with the best theoretical work in other fields a concern with empirical results.

In its weakest form, cognitive science is just the sum of the fields mentioned: psychology, artificial intelligence, linguistics, neuroscience, anthropology, and philosophy. Interdisciplinary work becomes much more interesting when there is theoretical and experimental convergence on conclusions about the nature of mind. For example, psychology and artificial intelligence can be combined through computational models of how people behave in experiments. The best way to grasp the complexity of human thinking is to use multiple methods, especially psychological and neurological experiments and computational models. Theoretically, the most fertile approach has been to understand the mind in terms of representation and computation.

3. Representation and Computation

The central hypothesis of cognitive science is that thinking can best be understood in terms of representational structures in the mind and computational procedures that operate on those structures. While there is much disagreement about the nature of the representations and computations that constitute thinking, the central hypothesis is general enough to encompass the current range of thinking in cognitive science, including connectionist theories which model thinking using artificial neural networks.

Most work in cognitive science assumes that the mind has mental representations analogous to computer data structures, and computational procedures similar to computational algorithms. Cognitive theorists have proposed that the mind contains such mental representations as logical propositions, rules, concepts, images, and analogies, and that it uses mental procedures such as deduction, search, matching, rotating, and retrieval. The dominant mind-computer analogy in cognitive science has taken on a novel twist from the use of another analog, the brain.

Connectionists have proposed novel ideas about representation and computation that use neurons and their connections as inspirations for data structures, and neuron firing and spreading activation as inspirations for algorithms. Cognitive science then works with a complex 3-way analogy among the mind, the brain, and computers. Mind, brain, and computation can each be used to suggest new ideas about the others. There is no single computational model of mind, since different kinds of computers and programming approaches suggest different ways in which the mind might work. The computers that most of us work with today are serial processors, performing one instruction at a time, but the brain and some recently developed computers are parallel processors, capable of doing many operations at once.

A major trend in current cognitive science is the integration of neuroscience with many areas of psychology, including cognitive, social, developmental, and clinical. This integration is partly experimental, resulting from an explosion of new instruments for studying the brain, such as functional magnetic resonance imaging, transcranial magnetic stimulation, and optogenetics. The integration is also theoretical, because of advances in understanding how large populations of neurons can perform tasks usually explained with cognitive theories of rules and concepts.

4. Theoretical Approaches

Here is a schematic summary of current theories about the nature of the representations and computations that explain how the mind works.

4.1 Formal logic

Formal logic provides some powerful tools for looking at the nature of representation and computation. Propositional and predicate calculus serve to express many complex kinds of knowledge, and many inferences can be understood in terms of logical deduction with inferences rules such as modus ponens. The explanation schema for the logical approach is:

Explanation target:
  • Why do people make the inferences they do?
Explanatory pattern:
  • People have mental representations similar to sentences in predicate logic.
  • People have deductive and inductive procedures that operate on those sentences.
  • The deductive and inductive procedures, applied to the sentences, produce the inferences.

It is not certain, however, that logic provides the core ideas about representation and computation needed for cognitive science, since more efficient and psychologically natural methods of computation may be needed to explain human thinking. (See the entry on logic and artificial intelligence.)

4.2 Rules

Much of human knowledge is naturally described in terms of rules of the form IF … THEN …, and many kinds of thinking such as planning can be modeled by rule-based systems. The explanation schema used is:

Explanation target:
  • Why do people have a particular kind of intelligent behavior?
Explanatory pattern:
  • People have mental rules.
  • People have procedures for using these rules to search a space of possible solutions, and procedures for generating new rules.
  • Procedures for using and forming rules produce the behavior.

Computational models based on rules have provided detailed simulations of a wide range of psychological experiments, from cryptarithmetic problem solving to skill acquisition to language use. Rule-based systems have also been of practical importance in suggesting how to improve learning and how to develop intelligent machine systems.

4.3 Concepts

Concepts, which partly correspond to the words in spoken and written language, are an important kind of mental representation. There are computational and psychological reasons for abandoning the classical view that concepts have strict definitions. Instead, concepts can be viewed as sets of typical features. Concept application is then a matter of getting an approximate match between concepts and the world. Schemas and scripts are more complex than concepts that correspond to words, but they are similar in that they consist of bundles of features that can be matched and applied to new situations. The explanatory schema used in concept-based systems is:

Explanatory target:
  • Why do people have a particular kind of intelligent behavior?
Explanation pattern:
  • People have a set of concepts, organized via kind and part hierarchies and other associations.
  • People have a set of procedures for concept application, including spreading activation, matching, and inheritance.
  • The procedures applied to the concepts produce the behavior.
  • Concepts can be translated into rules, but they bundle information differently than sets of rules, making possible different computational procedures.
(See the entry on concepts.)

4.4 Analogies

Analogies play an important role in human thinking, in areas as diverse as problem solving, decision making, explanation, and linguistic communication. Computational models simulate how people retrieve and map source analogs in order to apply them to target situations. The explanation schema for analogies is:

Explanation target:
  • Why do people have a particular kind of intelligent behavior?
Explanatory pattern:
  • People have verbal and visual representations of situations that can be used as cases or analogs.
  • People have processes of retrieval, mapping, and adaptation that operate on those analogs.
  • The analogical processes, applied to the representations of analogs, produce the behavior.

The constraints of similarity, structure, and purpose overcome the difficult problem of how previous experiences can be found and used to help with new problems. Not all thinking is analogical, and using inappropriate analogies can hinder thinking, but analogies can be effective in applications such as education and design.

4.5 Images

Visual and other kinds of images play an important role in human thinking. Pictorial representations capture visual and spatial information in a much more usable form than lengthy verbal descriptions. Computational procedures well suited to visual representations include inspecting, finding, zooming, rotating, and transforming. Such operations can be very useful for generating plans and explanations in domains to which pictorial representations apply. The explanatory schema for visual representation is:

Explanation target:
  • Why do people have a particular kind of intelligent behavior?
Explanatory pattern:
  • People have visual images of situations.
  • People have processes such as scanning and rotation that operate on those images.
  • The processes for constructing and manipulating images produce the intelligent behavior.

Imagery can aid learning, and some metaphorical aspects of language may have their roots in imagery. Psychological experiments suggest that visual procedures such as scanning and rotating employ imagery, and neurophysiological results confirm a close physical link between reasoning with mental imagery and perception. Imagery is not just visual, but can also operate with other sensory experiences such as hearing, touch, smell, taste, pain, balance, nausea, fullness, and emotion.

4.6 Connectionism

Connectionist networks consisting of simple nodes and links are very useful for understanding psychological processes that involve parallel constraint satisfaction. Such processes include aspects of vision, decision making, explanation selection, and meaning making in language comprehension. Connectionist models can simulate learning by methods that include Hebbian learning and backpropagation. The explanatory schema for the connectionist approach is:

Explanation target:
  • Why do people have a particular kind of intelligent behavior?
Explanatory pattern:
  • People have representations that involve simple processing units linked to each other by excitatory and inhibitory connections.
  • People have processes that spread activation between the units via their connections, as well as processes for modifying the connections.
  • Applying spreading activation and learning to the units produces the behavior.

Simulations of various psychological experiments have shown the psychological relevance of the connectionist models, which are, however, only very rough approximations to actual neural networks. (For more information, see the entry on connectionism.)

4.7 Theoretical neuroscience

Theoretical neuroscience is the attempt to develop mathematical and computational theories and models of the structures and processes of the brains of humans and other animals. It differs from connectionism in trying to be more biologically accurate by modeling the behavior of large numbers of realistic neurons organized into functionally significant brain areas. Computational models of the brain have become biologically richer, both with respect to employing more realistic neurons such as ones that spike and have chemical pathways, and with respect to simulating the interactions among different areas of the brain such as the hippocampus and the cortex. These models are not strictly an alternative to computational accounts in terms of logic, rules, concepts, analogies, images, and connections, but should mesh with them and show how mental functioning can be performed at the neural level. The explanatory schema for theoretical neuroscience is:

Explanation target:
  • How does the brain carry out functions such as cognitive tasks?
Explanatory pattern:
  • The brain has neurons organized by synaptic connections into populations and brain areas.
  • The neural populations have spiking patterns that are transformed via sensory inputs and the spiking patterns of other neural populations.
  • Interactions of neural populations carry out functions including cognitive tasks.

From the perspective of theoretical neuroscience, mental representations are patterns of neural activity, and inference is transformation of such patterns. (See the entries on neuroscience and the neuroscience of consciousness.)

4.8 Bayesian

Bayesian models are prominent in cognitive science, with applications to such psychological phenomena as learning, vision, motor control, language, and social cognition. They have also had effective applications in robotics. The Bayesian approach assumes that cognition is approximately optimal in accord with probability theory, especially Bayes’ theorem, which says that the probability of a hypothesis given evidence is equal to the result of multiplying the prior probability of the hypothesis by the conditional probability of the evidence given the hypothesis, all divided by the probability of the evidence. The explanatory schema for Bayesian cognition is:

Explanation target:
  • How does the mind carry out functions such as inference?
Explanatory pattern:
  • The mind has representations for statistical correlations and conditional probabilities.
  • The mind has the capacity for probabilistic computations such as applications of Bayes’ theorem.
  • Applying probabilistic computations to statistical representations accomplishes mental tasks such as inference.

Although Bayesian methods have had impressive applications to a wide range of phenomena, their psychological plausibility is debatable because of assumptions about optimality and computations based on probability theory.

4.9 Deep learning

Artificial intelligence has been a central part of cognitive since the 1950s, and the most dramatic recent advances in AI have come from the approach of deep learning, which has produced major breakthroughs in fields that include game playing, object recognition, and translation. Deep learning builds on ideas from connectionism and theoretical neuroscience, but uses neural networks with more layers and improved algorithms, benefitting from faster computers and large data bases of examples. Another important innovation is combining learning from examples with reinforcement learning, resulting by 2016 in the world’s leading Go player, AlphaGo. Ideas from deep learning are spreading back into neuroscience and also beginning to influence research in cognitive psychology. The explanatory schema for deep learning is:

Explanation target:
  • How does the brain carry out functions such as cognitive tasks?
Explanatory pattern:
  • The brain has large numbers of neurons organized into 6–20 layers.
  • The brain has powerful mechanisms for learning from examples and for learning actions that are reinforced by their successes.
  • Applying learning mechanisms to layered neural networks makes them capable of human and sometimes even super-human performance.

Although deep learning has produced dramatic improvements in some AI systems, it is not clear how it can be applied to aspects of human thought that include causal reasoning, imagery, emotion, and analogy. For further discussion, see Section 11 (on deep learning) of the entry on connectionism.

4.10 Predictive processing and active inference

Predictive processing is an approach to theoretical neuroscience that views the brain as constantly generating and updating models of the environment in order to predict the results of perceptions and actions. Active inference is a version of predictive processing that hypothesizes that the brain uses Bayesian calculations to minimize “free energy” consisting of discrepancies between expectations and actual observations. Organisms survive when brains reduce prediction errors by changing their models of the environment or by changing the environment through action.

The explanatory schema for active inference is:

Explanation target:
  • How does the brain function to support perception and action?
Explanatory pattern:
  • The brain is a prediction engine that uses probabilistic models to anticipate perceptions and the results of actions.
  • To reduce prediction error, the brain uses Bayesian updating to change its models and uses actions to change its environment, e.g. by moving.
  • Effective inference, perception, and action result from these reductions in prediction errors.

Active inference is open to numerous challenges. Is brain functioning really Bayesian updating rather than connectionist constraint satisfaction or deep reinforcement learning? Can predictive processing subsume other brain functions that include pattern recognition, explanation, emotional evaluation, memory, and communication? Does active inference explain high-level cognitive operations such as causal reasoning, language, and creativity?

5. Philosophical Relevance

Some philosophy, in particular naturalistic philosophy of mind, is part of cognitive science. But the interdisciplinary field of cognitive science is relevant to philosophy in several ways. First, the psychological, computational, and other results of cognitive science investigations have important potential applications to traditional philosophical problems in epistemology, metaphysics, and ethics. Second, cognitive science can serve as an object of philosophical critique, particularly concerning the central assumption that thinking is representational and computational. Third and more constructively, cognitive science can be taken as an object of investigation in the philosophy of science, generating reflections on the methodology and presuppositions of the enterprise.

5.1 Philosophical Applications

Much philosophical research today is naturalistic, treating philosophical investigations as continuous with empirical work in fields such as psychology. From a naturalistic perspective, philosophy of mind is closely allied with theoretical and experimental work in cognitive science. Metaphysical conclusions about the nature of mind are to be reached, not by a priori speculation, but by informed reflection on scientific developments in fields such as psychology, neuroscience, and computer science. Similarly, epistemology is not a stand-alone conceptual exercise, but depends on and benefits from scientific findings concerning mental structures and learning procedures. Ethics can benefit by using greater understanding of the psychology of moral thinking to bear on ethical questions such as the nature of deliberations concerning right and wrong. Here are some philosophical problems to which ongoing developments in cognitive science are highly relevant. Links are provided to other relevant articles in this Encyclopedia.

  • Innateness. To what extent is knowledge innate or acquired by experience? Is human behavior shaped primarily by nature or nurture?
  • Language of thought. Does the human brain operate with a language-like code or with a more general connectionist architecture? What is the relation between symbolic cognitive models using rules and concepts and sub-symbolic models using neural networks?
  • Mental imagery. Do human minds think with visual and other kinds of imagery, or only with language-like representations?
  • Folk psychology. Does a person’s everyday understanding of other people consist of having a theory of mind, or of merely being able to simulate them?
  • Meaning. How do mental representations acquire meaning or mental content? To what extent does the meaning of a representation depend on its relation to other representations, its relation to the world, and its relation to a community of thinkers?
  • Mind-brain identity. Are mental states brain states? Or can they be multiply realized by other material states? What is the relation between psychology and neuroscience? Is materialism true?
  • Free will. Is human action free or merely caused by brain events?
  • Moral psychology. How do minds/brains make ethical judgments?
  • The meaning of life. How can minds construed naturalistically as brains find value and meaning?
  • Emotions. What are emotions, and what role do they play in thinking?
  • Consciousness. Can conscious experience be scientifically explained, for example by the neuroscience of consciousness?
  • Mental disorder. What are mental disorders, and how are psychological and neural processes relevant to their explanation and treatment?
  • Perception and reality. How do minds/brains form and evaluate representations of the external world?
  • Perception and cognition. How does perception differ from other kinds of cognition with respect to representational format and justification?
  • Realism. Is cognitive science consistent with views that minds grasp the real world? Could minds be computer simulations? Is virtual reality a kind of reality?
  • Information. How does cognitive science illuminate the operations of information and misinformation in minds and societies?
  • Social science. How do explanations of the operations of minds interact with explanations of the operations of groups and societies?

Additional philosophical problems arise from examining the presuppositions of current approaches to cognitive science.

5.2 Critique of Cognitive Science

The claim that human minds work by representation and computation is an empirical conjecture and might be wrong. Although the computational-representational approach to cognitive science has been successful in explaining many aspects of human problem solving, learning, and language use, some philosophical critics have claimed that this approach is fundamentally mistaken. Critics of cognitive science have offered such challenges as:

  1. The emotion challenge: Cognitive science neglects the important role of emotions in human thinking.
  2. The consciousness challenge: Cognitive science ignores the importance of consciousness in human thinking.
  3. The world challenge: Cognitive science disregards the significant role of physical environments in human thinking, which is embedded in and extended into the world.
  4. The body challenge: Cognitive science neglects the contribution of embodiment to human thought and action.
  5. The dynamical systems challenge: The mind is a dynamical system, not a computational system.
  6. The social challenge: Human thought is inherently social in ways that cognitive science ignores.
  7. The mathematics challenge: Mathematical results show that human thinking cannot be computational in the standard sense, so the brain must operate differently, perhaps as a quantum computer.
  8. The interdisciplinarity challenge: Cognitive science has failed to go beyond multidisciplinary interactions by developing a core theory that unifies work in its many disciplines.

The first five challenges are increasingly addressed by advances that explain emotions, consciousness, action, and embodiment in terms of neural mechanisms. The social challenge is being met by the development of computational models of interacting agents. The mathematics challenge is based on misunderstanding of Gödel’s theorem and on exaggeration of the relevance of quantum theory to neural processes. Response to the interdisciplinary challenge must recognize that cognitive science still has many contending theoretical approaches, without the unification that theories of evolution and genetics provide for biology. Nevertheless, interactions among psychology, neuroscience, linguistics, philosophy, anthropology, and computer modeling have contributed to theoretical and empirical progress concerning many aspects of cognition. For example, computational philosophy uses programmed models to address questions in epistemology, ethics, and other areas of philosophy.

5.3 Philosophy of Cognitive Science

Cognitive science raises many interesting methodological questions that are worthy of investigation by philosophers of science. What is the nature of representation? What role do computational models play in the development of cognitive theories? What is the relation among apparently competing accounts of mind involving symbolic processing, neural networks, and dynamical systems? What is the relation among the various fields of cognitive science such as psychology, linguistics, and neuroscience? Are psychological phenomena subject to reductionist explanations via neuroscience? Are levels of explanation best characterized in terms of ontological levels (molecular, neural, psychological, social) or methodological ones (computational, algorithmic, physical)?

The increasing prominence of neural explanations in cognitive, social, developmental, and clinical psychology raises important philosophical questions about explanation and reduction. Anti-reductionism, according to which psychological explanations are completely independent of neurological ones, is becoming increasingly implausible, but it remains controversial to what extent psychology can be reduced to neuroscience and molecular biology. Crucial to answering questions about the nature of reduction are answers to questions about the nature of explanation. Explanations in psychology, neuroscience, and biology in general are plausibly viewed as descriptions of mechanisms, which are combinations of connected parts that interact to produce regular changes. In psychological explanations, the parts are mental representations that interact by computational procedures to produce new representations. In neuroscientific explanations, the parts are neural populations that interact by electrochemical processes to produce new neural activity that leads to actions. If progress in theoretical neuroscience continues, it should become possible to tie psychological to neurological explanations by showing how mental representations such as concepts are constituted by activities in neural populations, and how computational procedures such as spreading activation among concepts are carried out by neural processes.

The increasing integration of cognitive psychology with neuroscience provides evidence for the mind-brain identity theory according to which mental processes are neural, representational, and computational. Other philosophers dispute such identification on the grounds that minds are embodied in biological systems and extended into the world. However, moderate claims about embodiment are consistent with the identity theory because brain representations operate in several modalities (e.g. visual and motor) that enable minds to deal with the world. Another materialist alternative to mind-brain identity comes from recognizing that explanations of mind employ molecular and social mechanisms as well as neural and representational ones.


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