Incompatibilist (Nondeterministic) Theories of Free Will

First published Thu Aug 17, 2000; substantive revision Wed Aug 18, 2021

Incompatibilists hold that free will and determinism are mutually exclusive and, consequently, that we act freely (i.e., with free will) only if determinism is false. However, they disagree amongst themselves about what else, besides indeterminism, is required for free will. One question that divides them concerns which type of indeterminism—uncaused events, nondeterministically caused events, or agent caused events—is required. Another concerns where in the processes leading to action indeterminism must be located in order for an action to be free. Different answers to these questions yield different incompatibilist theories of free will.

This entry examines the main types of incompatibilist theories of free will and considers some of the principal objections to them. It is divided into four sections. The first section focuses on noncausal theories, the second on event-causal theories, and the third on agent-causal theories. The fourth and final section considers whether we have any reason to suppose that the requirements for free will specified by these theories are ever satisfied.

1. Noncausal Theories

Noncausal theories of free will are those according to which free actions need not be caused by anything and also need not have any internal causal structure. Some theories of this sort hold that free actions must be uncaused, while others allow that they may be nondeterministically caused. Carl Ginet (1989, 1990, 1997, 2002, 2007, 2008, 2014, and 2016) and Hugh McCann (1998 and 2012) have set out the most fully developed noncausal theories of free will. Other accounts of this type are advanced by Stewart Goetz (1988, 1997, and 2000), E. J. Lowe (2008: chs. 6–9 and 2013), Storrs McCall (1994: ch. 9), David Palmer (2016, forthcoming), and Thomas Pink (2004: chs. 7–8).

Why might someone find a noncausal theory of free will appealing? An historically important motivation for such views concerns the nature of causation. Once upon a time, all causation was thought to be deterministic. If that were right, then any nondeterministic theory of free will would have to be noncausal. Not until the 20th century did the idea of nondeterministic or probabilistic causation become popular. Once it did, this motivation for noncausal theories of free will was lost. Why, then, do some theorists still insist that free actions must be uncaused?

One argument advanced for that conclusion is an argument from luck. The idea, in brief, is that if an action is caused (even nondeterministically) by prior events, then it cannot have been up to the agent whether that action was performed. If the causation is nondeterministic, it will simply be a matter of luck, a matter of nature’s “role of the dice” (Ginet 2014: 24) whether the action occurs. Such an argument from luck poses a problem for event-causal libertarian theories, and agent-causal libertarian theories face a similar problem. We discuss responses available in defense of these theories below, in sections 2.2, 2.3, and 3.2.

Noncausal theories of free will face two main objections. Both are objections, in the first instance, to noncausal accounts of intentional action. If the theories at issue can’t give an adequate noncausal account of action, then a fortiori they can’t give us an adequate account of free action. Noncausal theories that require free actions to be entirely uncaused face a further objection, in addition to the two just mentioned. We consider each of these objections in turn.

1.1 Control

The first objection to noncausal theories of free will concerns control. Performing an action—even acting unfreely—is often thought to involve active control over what one does, and acting freely is thought to involve an especially valuable variety of such control. An account of free will ought to say what this latter variety of control is or in what its exercise consists. A common objection is that noncausal accounts fail to do that.

Accounts of active control often appeal to causation. Exercising such control when one acts, it is said, consists in causing some event (the action, or an event internal to that action). It is often further held that causation by an agent consists entirely in causation by mental events or states of certain kinds, such as the agent’s desiring, believing, or intending something in particular. Of course, noncausal theories reject any such view, but what alternative have they to offer us?

On Ginet’s view, each basic action is characterized by an actish phenomenal quality, its seeming to the agent as if she is directly making happen the event that is her basic action. Ginet stresses the “as if” nature of this appearance; it does not, he says, literally represent to the agent that she is causing the event in question. And in fact, he holds, it cannot be true that we really are agent-causes of what we do, and it need not be the case that any events involving us cause our actions.

Might the actish feel of some occurrence itself constitute that event’s activeness, the agent’s exercise of active control? Can an event’s seeming to oneself to be one’s performing an action suffice for its being so? This seems doubtful. As Ginet (1990: 9) allows, an event with the indicated intrinsic quality might be brought about by direct stimulation of someone’s brain, in the absence of any relevant desire or intention on the part of that person. An occurrence produced in this way and in these circumstances would hardly seem to be an exercise of the subject’s agency.

McCann (1998: 180) holds that an agent’s exercise of active control has two aspects: any basic action is a spontaneous, creative undertaking on the part of the agent, and it is intrinsically intentional. The intentionality of a basic action is said not to require any internal causal structure or external causal relation, yet it may be doubted that something’s being done intentionally can be altogether divorced in this way from causation. Further, supposing that such intrinsic intentionality is possible, it would seem that here too an event with this feature could be brought about by direct stimulation of someone’s brain, in the absence of any relevant desire or prior intention on the part of that person. But, again, such an occurrence, even if intrinsically something the agent means to be an exercise of her agency, hardly seems to be that.

The other aspect of the control that McCann says is exercised in basic action—the spontaneity or activeness of such an occurrence—thus appears to be the crucial one. This aspect, too, McCann holds, is intrinsic to basic actions, and he maintains that “it has a certain sui generis character that renders it incapable of being reduced to anything else” (1998: 185). Other proponents of noncausal theories of action (e.g., Pink 2004: ch. 8; Palmer forthcoming) likewise take the exercise of active control to be an ontologically fundamental or irreducible thing. Whether it is remains controversial.

1.2 Reason-Explanation

The second challenge facing non-causal theories of free will concerns acting for a reason. Free actions can be (and commonly are) done for reasons. An action performed for a reason is something for which there is a true reason-explanation. It is often objected that noncausal theories of free will cannot provide an adequate account of this phenomenon.

Accounts of acting for a reason and of reason-explanation often appeal to causation. An agent acts for a certain reason, it is said, only if the agent’s recognizing that reason causes, in an appropriate way, the agent’s behavior; and citing a reason contributes to a (true) reason-explanation of an action only if the agent’s recognizing that reason caused the action in an appropriate way. Proponents of noncausal theories generally go for one or another of two alternative accounts, appealing either to the content of an intention that the agent is said to have concurrently with performing the action, or to the intentional content of the action itself.

To examine the first of these strategies, suppose that S wants her glasses, which she has left in her friend T’s room, where he is now sleeping. S also wants to wake T, because she desires his company, but she knows that T needs some sleep, and hence she desires, too, not to wake him. S decides to enter T’s room and does so, believing as she does that her action will contribute to the satisfaction of both the desire to get her glasses and the desire to wake T. (The example is adapted from Ginet 1990: 145.) What further facts about the situation could make it the case that, in entering the room, S acts on her desire to get her glasses, and that citing that desire provides a true reason-explanation of her action, while she does not act on her desire to wake T, and citing this latter desire does not give us a true reason-explanation of what she is doing?

Ginet’s account of reason-explanations that cite antecedent desires (1990: 143) implies that the following conditions suffice for the truth of the explanation that cites S’s desire to get her glasses:

(a) prior to entering the room, S had a desire to get her glasses, and

(b) concurrently with entering the room, S remembers that prior desire and intends of her entering the room that it satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire.

Given the indicated circumstances, citing S’s desire to wake T will fail to give us a true reason-explanation, Ginet holds, just in case S does not intend of her action that it satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire.

Several objections can be raised against this account. Suppose that, although conditions (a) and (b) are fulfilled as S enters the room, her desire to get her glasses plays no role at all in bringing about (causing) her entry, while her desire to wake T, of which she is fully aware when she acts, does play such a role. Causalists (e.g., Mele 1992: ch. 13) will then deny that S really acts on her desire to get her glasses and that citing it truly explains her action. Indeed, even some noncausalists deny that having a concurrent intention of the sort required by Ginet (together with awareness of the antecedent desire) suffices for acting for the reason in question. As McCann (1998: 163) suggests, one might have such an intention but fail to carry it out. An account that requires a concurrent intention of this sort, then, will need to provide for its implementation.

Two further problems attend the concurrent intention that is required. First, the required intention is a second-order attitude, an attitude about (among other things) another of the agent’s own attitudes (a certain desire of hers). But it seems that S might act on her desire to get her glasses even if her only intention when she enters the room is to retrieve her glasses. Second, intention-acquisitions themselves can be explained by citing reasons. Since Ginet’s account of the reason-explanation of an action appeals to an intention, the question arises what can be said about the reason-explanation of the acquisition of that intention. Repeating the same sort of account here would generate a regress.

McCann (1998: ch. 8 and 2012) takes a different approach. On his view, an agent decides for a certain reason, and citing that reason explains the decision, just in case, in cognizance of that reason, and in an intrinsically intentional act of intention formation, the agent forms an intention the content of which reflects the very goals presented in that reason. When S decides to enter T’s room, for example, she decides for the reason of getting her glasses only if the intention that she forms in making that decision is an intention to enter for the sake of getting her glasses. (Ginet [2008] offers a similar account of reasons-explanations of decisions.)

One question about this account is whether what it proposes suffices for acting for a reason. Here again there will be a clash of intuitions between causalists and noncausalists, with the former maintaining that if S’s desire to get her glasses plays no role at all in bringing about her decision, then even if the content of her decision is to enter for the sake of getting her glasses, she does not really decide for that reason and citing it does not truly explain her decision.

Another question about the account concerns whether the required correspondence between the reasons for which one decides and the content of one’s decision is really necessary. Sometimes prior to making a decision, an agent considers a large number and variety of factors. Her decision might then be made for many different reasons. It is implausible that each and every one of the reasons for which she makes her decision must enter into the content of the intention that she forms in making that decision. (For the same objection to a similar account of reason-explanation, see Mele 2003: 42–43.)

1.3 Free Actions with Causes?

A third objection is directed at those noncausal theories of free will according to which free actions must be entirely uncaused. Incompatibilists often contend that determinism precludes the ability and opportunity to do otherwise and/or the ultimate sourcehood that (they allege) is required for free will. But an action’s being nondeterministically caused, it has been argued, is unlike determinism in this respect, as it is consistent with these requirements being satisfied (Capes 2017). If so, then free actions need not be completely uncaused, even if they can be.

2. Event-Causal Theories

Compatibilist accounts of free action are typically event-causal views, invoking event-causal accounts of action. The simplest event-causal incompatibilist theory takes the requirements of a good compatibilist account and adds that certain agent-involving events that cause the action must nondeterministically cause it. When these conditions are satisfied, it is held, the agent exercises in performing her action a certain variety of active control (which is said to consist in the action’s being caused, in an appropriate way, by those agent-involving events), the action is performed for a reason, and there remains, until she acts, a chance of the agent’s not performing that action. (It might be required that there remains, until the action is performed, a chance that the agent will perform a different action instead right then.) It is thus said to be open to the agent to do otherwise, even given that (it is claimed) its being so open is incompatible with the truth of determinism.

One purported problem for such a view is that the indeterminism that it requires is destructive, that it would diminish the control with which an agent acts to the extent that responsibility would be undermined. The most common version of this worry is the problem of luck, which holds that indeterminism reduces control by introducing luck. A second common objection is the problem of enhanced control, which holds that the required indeterminism is superfluous, that it adds nothing of value that could not exist in a deterministic world. We shall examine these objections below. First, let us consider a type of event-causal incompatibilist account that is advocated by writers who accept a qualified version of the first of these objections.

2.1 Deliberative Indeterminism

Some writers accept that indeterminism located in the immediate causation of a decision or other action would diminish the agent’s control but hold that indeterminism confined to earlier stages in the process leading to a decision need not do so. Laura Ekstrom (2000: ch. 4 and 2003) and Alfred Mele (1995: ch. 12, 1996, 1999b, and 2006: 9–14) have advanced the most fully developed accounts of this sort. Such views have also been sketched by Daniel Dennett (1978) and John Martin Fischer (1995).

Overt action is sometimes preceded by a decision, and decision is sometimes preceded by a deliberative process in which the agent considers reasons for and against alternatives and makes an evaluative judgment concerning which alternative is best (or better or good enough). Focusing on decisions that follow such deliberation, Mele advances a view that allows (but does not require) the deterministic causation of the decision by the making of the judgment, and of the overt action by the decision. Indeterminism is required only at an earlier stage of the deliberative process. For example, the account is satisfied when it is undetermined which of a certain subset of the agent’s nonoccurrent beliefs come to mind in the process of deliberation, where their coming to mind combines with other events to bring about the agent’s evaluative judgment. (The subset in question consists of “beliefs whose coming or not coming to mind is not something that one would control even if determinism were true” [1995: 216].)

Mele argues that indeterminism of the sort required here does not diminish (at least not to any significant extent) what he calls “proximal control,” a variety of control constituted by the relatively direct causation of behavior, and one that is compatible with determinism. The required indeterminism nevertheless suffices, he holds, to provide the agent with “ultimate control” over her decision, which an agent has only if at no time prior to the decision is there any causally sufficient condition for the agent’s making that decision that consists entirely of events or states external to the agent.

Ekstrom (2019) has recently criticized her older account and defended a centered view of the sort discussed in the next section. But her previous account is worthy of consideration. Ekstrom’s account emphasized preference rather than evaluative judgment. A preference, as she understands it, is a desire “formed by a process of critical evaluation with respect to one’s conception of the good” (2000: 106). The formation of a preference, she maintained, is an action. She required indeterminism only in the production of these preferences. A decision or other action is free, on her view, just in case it is brought about, in an appropriate way, by an active formation of a preference (favoring that decision or action), which preference-formation is in turn the result of an uncoerced exercise of the agent’s evaluative faculty, the inputs to which nondeterministically cause that preference-formation.

Ekstrom held that an agent is her preferences and acceptances (reflectively held beliefs), together with her faculty of forming these by reflective evaluation. When the formation of a preference is nondeterministically caused and it deterministically causes a decision and subsequent action, then a preference that partly constitutes the agent, one that is generated by an evaluative faculty that partly constitutes the agent, and one that the agent could have prevented (by not forming that preference) causally determines the decision and subsequent action. What the agent does is then, Ekstrom claimed, up to her.

Both Mele’s and Ekstrom’s deliberative theories allow that a decision or other action can be free even if it is causally determined by events none of which is a free action, and to none of which has the agent contributed by performing any prior free action. Indeed, given the basic features of these accounts, both of them must (on pain of regress) allow this. Incompatibilists do not typically allow for such a thing.

If an event is not itself a free action, and if no free action by the agent in question contributed to that event, then, we may say, it is not up to the agent whether that event occurs. Incompatibilists generally hold that if one event determines another, then it is not up to anybody whether if the first event occurs then the second event occurs. And arguments for incompatibilism often employ a principle like the following: if it is not up to a given agent whether a certain event occurs, and it is not up to that agent whether if that event occurs then the agent performs a certain action, then it is not up to the agent whether she performs that action. Given this principle, it will have to be said of certain decisions that deliberative theorists count as free that it is not up to us whether we make those decisions. Deliberative theorists, then, apparently reject this principle; but the rejection raises the question whether their incompatibilism is well motivated.

2.2 Centered Accounts

Event-causal accounts of a more typical sort require that at least some free actions be nondeterministically caused by their immediate causal antecedents. Since these views require indeterminism centered on the production of free actions themselves, we may call them “centered accounts.” The most widely discussed such view is that advanced by Robert Kane (1985, 1989, 1994, 1996a, 1996b, 1999a, 1999b, 2000a, 2000b, 2000c, 2002, 2004, 2005: chs. 11–12, 2007a, 2007b, 2011, 2014a, 2014b, 2016, and 2019). (It should be noted that Kane now rejects the event-causal label, insisting the there is no event-causal reduction of agency; however, it is not clear that he denies that agency is always fully realized in causation by events, and his view focuses on causation by events in exercises of agency.) Other accounts of this type are proposed by Mark Balaguer (1999 and 2004), Laura Ekstrom (2019), Christopher Franklin (2011a, 2011b, 2018), David Hodgson (2012), Alfred Mele (2006: ch. 5), Robert Nozick (1981:294–316), Richard Sorabji (1980: chs. 2 and 14), Peter van Inwagen (1983: 137–50), and David Wiggins (1973). John Searle (2001: ch. 9) endorses a view of this sort as best capturing our experience of acting.

Consider an illustration of a simple centered incompatibilist theory. Suppose that Elena is considering whether to A or to B. She recognizes what she regards as fairly strong reasons to A, and she recognizes what she regards as somewhat weaker reasons to B. At a certain time, t, she decides to A. The account requires that the prior deliberative events (such as Elena’s recognizing the reasons to A and judging them to be stronger) that cause the decision to A nondeterministically cause it, and that until Elena makes that decision, there remains a chance that she not make that decision then. (We may imagine that there remains a chance that, instead, she decides at t to B, in which case prior deliberative events, such as her recognizing the reasons to B, will have nondeterministically caused this alternative decision).

Accounts of this sort are often thought to be vulnerable to the problem of luck. There are a various formulations of the problem of luck. (Versions of it are advanced by Almeida and Bernstein [2003], Ekstrom [2000: 105], Haji [1999a, 1999b, 2000a, 2000b, 2000c, and 2001], Levy [2011: ch. 3], and Strawson [1994]. Mele [1998, 1999a, 1999b, 2005, and 2006: chs 1 and 5] discusses the argument but rejects its conclusion.) Here is one version: suppose an agent decides to steal. If there was a chance, right at the moment of choice, that the agent will instead (at that moment) make a different decision, then there is a possible world that is exactly the same as the actual world up until the time of the decision, but in which the agent makes the alternative decision then. There is, then, nothing about the agent prior to the decision—indeed, there is nothing about the world prior to that time—that accounts for the difference between her making one decision and her making the other. This difference, then, is just a matter of luck. And if the difference between the agent’s making one decision and her instead making another is just a matter of luck, she cannot be responsible for the decision that she makes.

One response to the problem of luck rejects the claim that there is nothing about the agent prior to the decision that accounts for the difference between her making one decision and her making the other. After all, the agent acted for reasons (e.g., a desire for money). If those reasons raised the probability of deciding to steal and non-deterministically caused the decision, that is enough to account for the decision (in a sense that makes it not just a matter of luck). In the world where she decides not to steal, the reasons that increase the probability of that choice (e.g., a desire to act rightly) would then account for the alternative decision. No matter what the agent chooses, we can give a contrastive explanation of her action (this means we can explain why she chose that act rather than the alternative.) Franklin (2018) develops (more complex) replies along these lines.

Another response to the problem of luck is offered by Mele (2006: 117–33). Mele invokes an agent’s influence, by way of her past actions, on which options are currently open to her and what their respective probabilities are. Given her responsibility for those past actions, the agent might be responsible for the current probabilities of her pursuing these alternatives. For example, Elena might be responsible for the present chance that she will decide contrary to her ranking of her reasons, because she is responsible for past actions that led to her now having features—character traits, desires, and so forth—that ground that chance. An agent might, in this fashion, accumulate over the course of her lifetime greater responsibility for what she does, by increasingly shaping the probabilities of her acting in various ways.

Of course, the maneuver raises a question about how the agent could be responsible for her earlier actions, given that the account in question will require that some of these, too, were nondeterministically caused. Ultimately, we must consider how an agent can be responsible, on such a view, for her earliest free decisions.

These earliest free decisions, Mele observes, will be those of a relatively young child. Responsibility comes in degrees, and any responsibility such a child has for what she does will be slight. The argument from luck might seem threatening if we think that full responsibility is in question, but it loses its bite, Mele suggests, when we consider a case in which only a small degree of responsibility is at issue. It is implausible, for example, to say that a young boy who decides not to snatch away his sister’s toy deserves no credit at all for making the right decision, just because there remained until he so decided a chance that he would instead decide to take the toy. Kane (e.g., at 2007b: 174–75) makes a similar appeal to the build-up of responsibility stemming from slight responsibility for one’s earliest free choices.

Centered accounts also face the problem of enhanced control. Note that the simple centered account we are considering differs from typical compatibilist accounts only by requiring that the agent’s mental states nondeterministically cause her decision. How does this difference in the nature of the causal relationship do anything to enhance the agent’s control over her act?

A popular response to this question says that indeterminism enhances control because it is necessary for the agent to possess the ability or opportunity to do otherwise. And having the ability or opportunity to do otherwise increases control. Franklin (2011a and 2018) and Ekstrom (2019) offer responses along these lines. Kane makes a similar point. On the indeterministic picture: an agent exercises dual control, a control that can be exercised in either of two different ways, whereas on the deterministic picture the agent’s control can be exercised in only one way (Kane 1996: 109–11).

Some proponents of centered incompatibilist theories have added to the requirements of the rather simple view we have been considering, with the aim of rebutting the problem of luck. We shall examine here the account advanced by Robert Kane.

2.3 Efforts of Will

Kane holds that a free decision or other free action is one for which the agent is “ultimately responsible” (1996b: 35). Ultimate responsibility for an action requires either that the action not be causally determined or, if the action is causally determined, that any determining cause of it either be or result (at least in part) from some action by that agent that was not causally determined (and for which the agent was ultimately responsible). Thus, on Kane’s view, an agent can be ultimately responsible for a decision that is causally determined by her possessing certain character traits. But somewhere among the events that contributed (however indirectly) to her having those traits, and thus to her decision, there must have been some free actions by her that were not causally determined. Kane calls such “regress-stopping” actions “self-forming actions” (74). All self-forming actions, he argues, are acts of will; they are mental actions. He thus calls them “self-forming willings” (125), or SFWs.

Kane identifies six different types of SFW, giving the most detailed treatment to what he calls moral choices or decisions and prudential choices or decisions. We shall focus here on the former; the two are sufficiently similar that the points made can be easily transferred to the latter.

In a case of moral choice, there is a motivational conflict within the agent. She believes that a certain type of thing morally ought to be done (and she is motivated to do that), but she also has a self-interested desire to perform an action of a type that is, in the circumstances, incompatible with her doing what she believes she ought to do. Given her commitment to her moral belief, she makes an effort of will to resist temptation, an effort “to get [her] ends or purposes sorted out” (1996b: 126). If the choice is to be an SFW, then it is required that the strength of this effort be indeterminate; Kane likens its indeterminacy to that of the position or momentum of a microphysical particle. And the effort’s indeterminacy is held to be the source of the required indeterminism in the causal production of the choice. Again an analogy is drawn with an indeterministic understanding of microphysics. Just as whether a particle will penetrate a barrier might be undetermined because the particle does not have both a determinate position and a determinate momentum, so “[t]he choice one way or the other is undetermined because the process preceding and potentially terminating in it (i.e., the effort of will to overcome temptation) is indeterminate” (128).

Kane further requires that any choice that is an SFW satisfy three plurality conditions. These require that the choice be made for a reason (which Kane takes to consist partly in the choice’s being caused by the agent’s recognizing that reason) and that it not be a result of coercion or compulsion. Each plurality condition also requires that, when the agent makes the choice, she wants more to act on the reason for which she makes that choice than she wants to act on any competing reasons. An agent wants more to act on a certain reason, he holds, when her desire to act on that reason has greater motivational strength than have any desires she has to act on competing reasons, and when it is settled in the agent’s mind that that reason, rather than her reasons for doing otherwise, is the one that she will now and in the future act on. This wanting more to act on a certain reason is, on Kane’s view, brought about by the choice in question. Finally, the plurality conditions require that, whichever choice is made, there must have been at least one alternative choice that the agent was able to make such that, had she made it, it too would have satisfied the previously stated conditions.

In a situation of moral conflict, Kane maintains, the requirements for being an SFW can be satisfied by either choice that is made—the choice to do what one believes one ought to do or the choice to do what one is tempted to do. Where this is so, whichever choice the agent makes, she has chosen for the reason that she wants more to act on, free from coercion and compulsion. If she has chosen to do what she believes she ought to do, then her choice is the result of her effort. If she has chosen to do what she was tempted to do, then she has not allowed her effort to succeed. Whichever choice she has made, she could have made the other. She is then ultimately responsible for the choice she has made.

What, then, of the argument from luck? Kane offers a complex response to this problem. First (1996b: 171–72), he counters that with indeterminate events, exact sameness is not defined. If an agent’s effort of will was indeterminate, then it cannot be that in the actual world and in some other possible world she made exactly the same effort. An objection that assumes that such exact sameness is possible, he holds, does not apply to his view. Kane infers from this point that free will requires a form of indeterminism in which there is chance as well as indeterminacy, with the former stemming from the latter. (He calls worlds with such indeterminism “non-Epicurean.”) The chance in an Epicurean world (an indeterministic world without indeterminacy), he implies, would constitute control-diminishing luck.

Kane’s claim that indeterminacy precludes exact sameness has been contested (see Clarke 1999, 2002, 2003a, and 2003b: 86–87, and O’Connor 1996). Moreover, Ishtiyaque Haji (1999a) and Alfred Mele (1999a and 1999b) contend that the argument from luck is just as effective if we consider an agent in worlds that are as similar as can be until the moment of choice, given the indeterminacy of efforts. Indeed, the argument might be advanced without any appeal at all to other worlds: given that nothing prior to the choice accounts for the difference between the agent’s choosing one way and her choosing another, it may be said, this difference is just a matter of luck.

A further response by Kane to the argument from luck appeals to the active nature of efforts of will. When an agent in a case of moral conflict makes an effort to resist temptation, he says, she is trying to make the choice to do what she believes she ought to do. If the agent then makes that choice, she succeeds, despite the indeterminism, at doing what she was actively trying to do. And Kane points out that typically, when someone so succeeds, indeterminism of this sort will not undermine responsibility (and hence it will not so diminish the agent’s control that there is not enough for responsibility). He describes a case (1999b: 227) in which a man hits a glass tabletop attempting to shatter it. Even if it is undetermined whether his effort will succeed, Kane notes, if the man does succeed, he may well be responsible for breaking the tabletop.

If left here, the reply would fail to address the problem of luck in a case in which the agent chooses to do what she is tempted to do rather than what she believes she ought to do. In response to this shortcoming, Kane (1999a, 1999b, 2000b, 2000c, 2002, 2005: ch. 12, 2007, and 2011) has proposed a “doubling” of effort in cases of moral conflict. In such a case, he holds, the agent makes two, simultaneous efforts of will, both indeterminate in strength. The agent tries to make the moral choice, and at the same time she tries to make the self-interested choice. Whichever choice she makes, then, she succeeds, despite the indeterminism, at doing something that she was actively trying to do.

Although it is common to try to make a choice whether to do something or not—for example, to try to decide whether to A—it is unclear what sense can be made of trying to make some specific choice—e.g., trying to decide to A. Further, supposing that sense can be made of this, it would not seem to be rational to try, at one time, to make each of two obviously incompatible choices.

A more fundamental problem concerns the efficacy of the appeal to the active nature of such efforts. In the case of the man who breaks the tabletop, his breaking the tabletop is free (if it is) not just because it results from an active effort to break the tabletop, but because it results (we are to presume) from a free effort to break the tabletop. A successful effort to make a certain choice can contribute in an analogous way to the choice’s being free, then, only if the effort itself is free. If the appeal to these efforts is to accomplish anything, then, what is needed is an account of the freedom with which the agent acts in making these efforts of will (Clarke 2002, 2003a, and 2003b: 89–92; Mele 2006: 51–52).

In recent work, Kane (e.g., at 2007b: 174–75) accepts that responsibility for choices that are SFWs requires that we be responsible for the efforts of will that produce these choices. We generally are responsible for these efforts, he maintains, because they are influenced by character and motives resulting from our prior free choices, and because we generally endorse the outcome of such an effort when it succeeds—the resulting choice. The second of these observations seems not to the point, since one’s responsibility for an action cannot depend on whether, subsequent to that action, one endorses one of its results. The first observation raises a regress problem: what about an agent’s earliest SFWs, in which case no prior free choices have influenced the efforts of will preceding the SFWs? Kane says that we are responsible for the efforts in these cases as well. But aside from appealing to our endorsement of the resulting choices, he does not explain how this can be so.

Kane’s appeal to indeterminate efforts of will, and the appeal thereby to indeterminism, do not appear to help meet the luck objection. (Neither does it appear that help comes from his requirement that, in making a choice that is an SFW, the agent comes to want more to act on the reason for which she makes that choice. For, on Kane’s view, this wanting more is brought about by the choice. And if an event-causal view is on the right track, the agent’s control over the making of the choice is a matter of the production of the choice, not of what the choice produces.) A simpler centered incompatibilist account, then, may fare just as well against the argument from luck.

3. Agent-Causal Theories

A number of incompatibilists have maintained that a free decision (or some event internal to such a decision) must be caused by the agent, and it must not be the case that either what the agent causes or the agent’s causing that event is causally determined by prior events. On what are called agent-causal views, causation by an agent is held not to consist in causation by events (such as the agent’s recognizing certain reasons). An agent, it is said, is a persisting substance; causation by an agent is causation by such a substance. Since a substance is not the kind of thing that can itself be an effect (though various events involving it can be), on these accounts an agent is in a strict and literal sense an originator of her free decisions, an uncaused cause of them. This combination of indeterminism and origination is thought to capture best the idea that, when we act freely, a plurality of alternatives is open to us and we determine, ourselves, which of these we pursue, and to secure the kind of freedom needed for moral responsibility.

George Berkeley (1710 [1998]) and Thomas Reid (1788 [1969]) held views of this type in the early modern period. In recent years, agent-causal accounts have been advanced by Roderick Chisholm (1966, 1971, 1976a, 1976b, and 1978), Randolph Clarke (1993 and 1996), Alan Donagan (1987), Meghan Griffith (2005, 2007, and 2010), Jonathan Jacobs and Timothy O’Connor (2013), T. J. Mawson (2011), Timothy O’Connor (1995, 1996, 2000a, 2000b, 2002, 2005, 2009a and 2009b), William Rowe (1991, 2000, 2003, and 2006), Helen Steward (2012), Richard Taylor (1966 and 1992), John Thorp (1980), and Michael Zimmerman (1984). Derk Pereboom (2001, 2004, 2007, and 2014) has argued that we can have free will only if we are agent-causes, but that the evidence is against the existence of agent causation.

Setting aside (for the moment) the question of evidence, agent-causal theories face three main objections. One concerns acting freely for a reason and the reason-explanation of free actions; the second is the problem of luck; the last concerns the intelligibility of the notion of agent causation and whether causation by an agent (where this is understood to be causation by a substance) is possible.

3.1 Agent Causation and Reason-Explanation

We saw in section 1.2 that difficulties confront accounts of acting for a reason and of reason-explanation that do not appeal to the causation of action by the agent’s recognizing certain reasons. Standard agent-causal views deny that events such as the agent’s recognizing certain reasons cause any free action (or whatever event the agent directly causes when she acts freely). Such views must, then, offer some alternative account of the phenomenon in question.

The most sophisticated such proposal is that advanced by Timothy O’Connor (2000b: ch. 5). At the core of the proposal is an account of the reason-explanation of free decisions. As O’Connor sees it, agents do not cause free decisions; rather, a free decision is a causally complex event, consisting of the agent’s causing her coming to have a certain intention. (Such a causally complex event is, in turn, a component of any free overt action, such as one’s freely raising one’s arm.) Suppose, then, that someone freely decides to A right now. The decision can be explained by citing an antecedent desire, O’Connor maintains, if

(a) prior to making that decision, the agent had the desire in question and believed that A-ing would satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire; and

(b) the intention to A that the agent comes to have in making the decision is caused by the agent and is an intention to A here and now in order to satisfy the desire in question (adapted from O’Connor 2000b: 86).

One objection to such a view (raised by Feldman and Buckareff [2003]) is that it appeals to something that is not necessary for the truth of the kind of explanation we are considering. One can decide on the basis of a certain desire, and citing that desire can yield a true reason-explanation of one’s decision, even if the intention that one forms in deciding is not a second-order attitude, an attitude that is about (in part) another of one’s attitudes (a certain desire). O’Connor might accept this point and propose that we will have a true reason-explanation as well if the intention that is acquired represents, not the desire in question, but rather the object of that desire. The proposal would then resemble McCann’s account of reason-explanation. However, it might be objected that one can decide on the basis of a desire even if the intention that one forms in making that decision does not represent, in its content, the object of that desire. As we observed in examining McCann’s view, an agent sometimes makes a decision for many reasons, and it is implausible that each and every one of the reasons for which a decision is made must enter into the content of that decision.

A further objection is that O’Connor’s account of reason-explanation commits him to an implausible view of the explanation of causally complex events. As he has it, whether an explanation citing a state of an agent truly explains the agent’s causing her acquisition of a certain intention depends crucially on whether the effect component of this causally complex event has a certain feature, and the truth of the explanation does not require that the agent’s being in the cited state cause either the causally complex event, the cause component of that event, or the effect component of that event. But we do not find this sort of thing to be so in cases of any other kinds of causally complex event.

Consider a case that is in important respects analogous to what we are examining here. Suppose that a flash of lightning has caused a brush fire. A drought, let us say, had left the brush dry, and had this not been so, the lightning flash would not have caused the fire, or at least would have been less likely to do so. Now suppose that the dryness of the brush is cited as an explanation of the flash’s causing the fire. Does the truth of the proffered explanation hinge on whether the fire has a certain feature, and can the explanation be true even if the brush’s being dry did not cause either the flash, the fire, or the flash’s causing the fire? Apparently not.

The difficulty here stems from O’Connor’s requirement, like that imposed by most proponents of agent-causal views, that only the agent cause what is directly agent-caused in a free action. On an alternative account, it is required that a free action be caused by the agent and nondeterministically caused by certain agent-involving events, such as the agent’s recognizing certain reasons and having a certain intention. Such a view, it is said, can provide the same accounts of acting for a reason and of reason-explanation as can event-causal theories of free will. And since the event causation that is posited is required to be nondeterministic, the view secures the openness of alternatives, even on the assumption that this openness is incompatible with determinism. Finally, the required agent causation itself is still held to be distinct from causation by any events, and so this view may be said to secure the origination of free actions that seemed an appealing feature of standard agent-causal accounts (Clarke 1993, 1996, 2003b: ch. 8, and 2011; Mawson [2011: ch. 5] and Steward [2012: 217–219] also allow that events can play a [nondeterministic] causal role in the production of free actions in additional to the causal role played by the agent).

Here is a brief illustration of a freely made decision, as this type of view would have it. Suppose that on some occasion a certain individual, Leo, is deliberating about whether to tell the truth or to lie. He recognizes reasons favoring each alternative and has an intention to make up his mind now. Suppose that there is a nonzero probability that Leo’s recognizing the reasons favoring telling the truth (together with his having the indicated intention) will nondeterministically cause his deciding to tell the truth; and suppose that there is, as well, a nonzero probability that his recognizing the reasons favoring lying (together with his having the intention) will instead nondeterministically cause his deciding to lie. Then, given all prior conditions, it is open to Leo to make the former decision and open to him to make the latter one instead. Now suppose that, as a matter of nomological necessity, in the circumstances, whichever of the open decisions Leo makes, that decision will be made, and it will be caused by his recognizing the reasons that favor it, only if Leo—the agent—causes that decision. Finally, suppose that, in fact, Leo decides to tell the truth. His decision is caused by him, and it is nondeterministically caused by his recognizing reasons favoring the action decided upon (and his having the intention to make up his mind). He would make that decision only if he caused it. On this view, Leo’s exercising control over which decision he makes—his determining which of the open decisions he makes—consists in his decision’s being (appropriately) caused by him and by these mental events involving him.

It is a matter of some dispute whether event causation and agent causation can be combined in this fashion and, if they can be, whether the combination would provide what incompatibilists think necessary for free will. (For discussion of these points, see Clarke 2003b: 144–48 and 2011; Ginet 2002; O’Connor 2000b: 76–70; and O’Connor and Churchill 2004.)

3.2 Luck, Again

While the appeal to agent causation might be thought to solve the problem of luck, the objection has been raised that in fact it does not help at all (Haji 2004; Mele 2005 and 2006: ch. 3; van Inwagen 1983: 145 and 2000). Consider Leo. At a certain moment he agent-causes a decision to tell the truth, and until he does there remains a chance that he will instead, at that moment, agent-cause a decision to lie. There is, then, a possible world that is exactly like the actual world up until the time at which Leo agent-causes his decision but in which, at that moment, Leo agent-causes a decision to lie. Nothing about the world prior to the moment of the agent-causing accounts for the difference between Leo’s causing one decision and his causing the other. This difference, then, is just a matter of luck. And if this difference is just a matter of luck, Leo cannot be responsible for his decision.

If in fact Leo’s causing his decision constitutes his exercising free will, then the difference between his causing a decision to tell the truth and his causing a decision to lie is not just a matter of luck; it is a matter of how Leo exercises his free will. But what can be said to support the claim that an agent’s causing a decision is his exercising free will? Many hold that when an agent exercises free will, it is up to the agent herself whether she does one thing or another. A plurality of alternatives is open to the person, and the person herself determines which alternative she pursues. It is also said that when an agent exercises free will, she is an ultimate source or origin of her action. An agent-causal account may be said to nicely realize these conceptions of free will. On the assumption that incompatibilism is correct, the account’s requirement of indeterminism is needed to secure the openness of alternatives. And its requirement of agent causation may be thought to secure the agent’s determining, herself, which alternative she pursues, as well as her originating her action. (Unlike what we have with any event-causal view, with an agent-causal account, the agent is quite literally an ultimate source or origin of her action.) If the account satisfactorily realizes these conceptions of free will, then it may be credibly claimed that the difference in question between worlds is a matter of Leo’s exercising his free will differently.

3.3 Causation by a Substance

All theorists who accept a causal construal of agents’ control over what they do—and this includes most compatibilists as well as many incompatibilists—can accept that agents cause their free actions (or events internal to these actions). After all, we accept that the sun causes sunburn and that, when water dissolves sugar, it causes the sugar to dissolve. However, it is widely thought that causation by such things is reducible to, or consists wholly in, causation by states of these things or events involving them, and this is precisely what is denied with respect to the agent causation that is invoked by agent-causal theories of free will. The denial raises the question whether any intelligible account of agent causation can be given. Even some proponents of agent-causal views (e.g., Taylor 1992: 53) seem doubtful about this, declaring agent causation to be strange or even mysterious.

Such doubts may be viewed in light of the widely held presumption that, free will (or perhaps, more broadly, purposive agency) aside, causation throughout nature is, fundamentally, causation by events or states. Until recently, even most proponents of agent-causal theories have accepted this view. And with this view granted, an appeal to agent causation in a theory of free will may strike us an implausible claim of metaphysical exceptionalism.

In the last couple of decades, however, a growing number of philosophers have argued that causation by substances is ontologically fundamental. Some (e.g., Jacobs and O’Connor 2013; Lowe 2008: 143–46; O’Connor 2014; and Swinburne 1997 and 2006) hold that, fundamentally, all causation is substance causation. Others (e.g., Alvarez and Hyman 1998; Hyman 2015: 40–42; Mayr 2011: 229–30; and Steward 2012: 207–16) advance causal pluralism, on which entities of a variety of different categories—the list includes substances, events, properties, features, aspects, and facts—cause things, and causation by each of these kinds of thing is equally fundamental. The pluralist picture is not one of competition but of interdependence; as it may be put, events cause things only when the substances in which these events are changes cause those things, and substances cause things only when changes in those substances cause those things. (Hyman [2015: 41] suggests a similar view.)

Often such views are advanced on grounds that are entirely independent of free will or purposive agency, having to do with the nature of causation and causal powers generally. Substance causation that is ontologically fundamental is held to be pervasive, constituting the activity of substances animate and inanimate, macro and micro. Rejection of the view that causation by events or states is uniquely fundamental often stems from a turn away from of a broadly Humean account of causation toward a neo-Aristotelian view, one that takes causal powers to be irreducible features of the world.

In the context of a view of this kind, an appeal to causation by agents that is ontologically fundamental is no claim of metaphysical exceptionalism. Further, on a causal pluralist view, an agent-causal theorist can help herself to an understanding of acting for a reason in terms of causation by one’s recognition of reasons. For it may be said that a free action is caused by the agent and caused by certain states of the agent, with causation by each of these things interdependent and equally fundamental. The verdict on such a view hinges on the tenability of its general account of causation.

At the same time, if the activity of every substance—an electron, an oak tree—consists in fundamental substance causation, the worry arises whether agent causation can provide what free-will theorists who appeal to it have thought it could provide: origination, and the agent’s determining, herself, which of several open alternatives she pursues. After all, on the view in question, an electron, too, may be an undetermined determinant of what it does. Perhaps, in the end, the difference between the electron and the free agent isn’t a matter of the agent being the ultimate source of her behavior, but rather in the purposiveness involved in agent causation.

4. The Evidence

Our discussion of incompatibilist theories of free will has focused so far on whether they provide an adequate account of what free will would be if it exists. However, even if one or another of these views is theoretically satisfactory in this regard, the question remains whether there is any evidence that what the theory says is required for free will actually exists.

Incompatibilist accounts require, first, that determinism be false. But more than this, they require that there be indeterminism of a certain sort (e.g., with some events entirely uncaused, or nondeterministically caused, or caused by agents and not deterministically caused by events) and that this indeterminism be located in specific places (generally, at the time of the occurrence of decisions and other basic actions). What is our evidence that these requirements are satisfied?

The scientific evidence for quantum mechanics is sometimes said to show that determinism is false. Quantum theory is indeed very well confirmed. However, there is nothing approaching a consensus on how to interpret it. Indeterministic as well as deterministic interpretations have been developed, but it is far from clear whether any of the existing interpretations is correct. (For a more in depth discussion of rival interpretations of quantum mechanics see section 4.4 of the Determinism entry.) Perhaps the best that can be said here is that there is currently no good evidence that determinism is true.

The scientific evidence is even less decisive with respect to whether there is the kind of indeterminism located in exactly the places required by typical incompatibilists. Unless there is a complete independence of mental events from physical events, then even for free decisions there has to be indeterminism of a specific sort at specific junctures in certain brain processes. There are some interesting speculations in the works of some incompatibilists about how this might be so (see, e.g., Kane 1996b: 128–30, 137–42, and the sources cited there), but our current understanding of the brain gives us little evidence one way or the other about whether it is in fact so.

Some noncausal theories of free will maintain that for us to act freely our actions must be uncaused. However, we seem to have little evidence that this (alleged) requirement is ever met. We do, however, have evidence that it often isn’t met, as a compelling case can be made that many of our everyday actions have causes (Capes 2017). Consider an ordinary, everyday action: Tony goes to the store to buy some chocolate cake. Why did he do so? In part because his wife asked him to, and the ‘because’ here is arguably causal. That the request is a cause of Tony’s action is suggested by the presence of several causal markers, things that indicate a causal connection between two states or events. For instance, effects often (though not always) counterfactually depend on their causes, and Tony’s action counterfactually depends on his wife’s request; had she not asked him to go to the store and get cake, he wouldn’t have done so. Tony’s action also counterfactually varies with the content of his wife’s request; had she asked for carrot cake instead of chocolate, he would have gotten carrot cake instead. His wife’s request raised the probability (even if it didn’t ensure) that he would go to the store and buy some cake, it helps explain why he went to the store and got what he got, and it was a means to the end of getting Tony to go to the store. The joint presence of these causal markers strongly suggests that Tony’s wife’s request that he go to the store and get some cake is a cause of his doing so. Note, moreover, that Tony’s action isn’t special in this regard. Similar claims can be made about many of our everday behaviors. If so, and if an action must be uncaused in order to be free, then we have reason to suppose that we rarely, if ever, act freely.

What about agent causation? It is sometimes argued that agent causation must be anomic, not subject to any laws of nature, and that on our best evidence this requirement is not met (Pereboom 2001: ch. 3 and 2014: 65–69). However, the claim that free will requires such lawlessness is contested (Clarke 2010).

Some incompatibilists (e.g., Campbell 1957: 168–70 and O’Connor 1995: 196–97) claim that our experience when we make decisions and act constitutes evidence that there is indeterminism of the required sort in the required place. There are various ways to develop this claim. A strong version has it that our experience of our own agency represents our actions as being produced in just the way that one or another incompatibilist account says they must be if we are to have free will. (For an objection to this claim, see Mele 1995: 135–37). A weaker version of the claim is that we experience some of our actions as free (even if that experience doesn’t represent our actions as being uncaused or non-deterministically caused or agent caused) and then infer from this experience, together with the assumption that free will requires indeterminism of the relevant sort, that the right sort of indeterminism obtains. However, both versions of the claim are open to the following objection. If things are to be the way they are said to be by some incompatibilist account, then the laws of nature—laws of physics, chemistry, and biology—must be a certain way. (This is so for overt, bodily actions regardless of the relation between mind and body, and it is so for decisions and other mental actions barring a complete independence of mental events from physical, chemical, and biological events.) And many find it incredible that how things seem to us when we act gives us insight into the laws of nature.

Whether they should, though, is a matter of controversy. Suppose one experiences oneself falling. Surely this imposes some limits on how the laws of nature could be. Perhaps there must be something like a law of gravity in order for this experience to be veridical. Or, more minimally, one can at least infer from the experience of falling that the laws of nature don’t preclude falling. So, there is no general problem with inferring facts about the laws of nature from one’s own experiences. The question, then, is whether there is some special problem with inferring from our experience of our own agency that the incompatibilist requirements are met.

Some incompatibilists (e.g., van Inwagen 1983: 204–13) hold that, although we lack good empirical or experiential evidence that we have free will, we nevertheless have good moral reason to believe that we have it. The claim is that we have good reason to believe that we are sometimes morally responsible for our behavior and that moral responsibility requires free will. Together, these claims give us good reason to suppose that we sometimes have free will. However, absent solid evidence for the indeterminism that incompatibilists say is required for free will, if we justifiably believe that responsibility requires free will and that free will requires indeterminism, it seems to some that, rather than concluding that we have free will, we should instead withhold judgment on whether we are ever morally responsible for anything.

If an incompatibilist theory of free will is correct, it thus appears to be an open question whether the requirements for free will specified by the theory are ever satisfied, and thus an open question as well whether anyone ever has free will.


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