Free Will

First published Mon Jan 7, 2002; substantive revision Thu Nov 3, 2022

The term “free will” has emerged over the past two millennia as the canonical designator for a significant kind of control over one’s actions. Questions concerning the nature and existence of this kind of control (e.g., does it require and do we have the freedom to do otherwise or the power of self-determination?), and what its true significance is (is it necessary for moral responsibility or human dignity?) have been taken up in every period of Western philosophy and by many of the most important philosophical figures, such as Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, Aquinas, Descartes, and Kant. (We cannot undertake here a review of related discussions in other philosophical traditions. For a start, the reader may consult Marchal and Wenzel 2017 and Chakrabarti 2017 for overviews of thought on free will, broadly construed, in Chinese and Indian philosophical traditions, respectively.) In this way, it should be clear that disputes about free will ineluctably involve disputes about metaphysics and ethics. In ferreting out the kind of control at stake in free will, we are forced to consider questions about (among others) causation, laws of nature, time, substance, ontological reduction vs emergence, the relationship of causal and reasons-based explanations, the nature of motivation and more generally of human persons. In assessing the significance of free will, we are forced to consider questions about (among others) rightness and wrongness, good and evil, virtue and vice, blame and praise, reward and punishment, and desert. The topic of free will also gives rise to purely empirical questions that are beginning to be explored in the human sciences: do we have it, and to what degree?

Here is an overview of what follows. In Section 1, we acquaint the reader with some central historical contributions to our understanding of free will. (As nearly every major and minor figure had something to say about it, we cannot begin to cover them all.) As with contributions to many other foundational topics, these ideas are not of ‘merely historical interest’: present-day philosophers continue to find themselves drawn back to certain thinkers as they freshly engage their contemporaries. In Section 2, we map the complex architecture of the contemporary discussion of the nature of free will by dividing it into five subtopics: its relation to moral responsibility; the proper analysis of the freedom to do otherwise; a powerful, recent argument that the freedom to do otherwise (at least in one important sense) is not necessary for moral responsibility; ‘compatibilist’ accounts of sourcehood or self-determination; and ‘incompatibilist’ or ‘libertarian’ accounts of source and self-determination. In Section 3, we consider arguments from experience, a priori reflection, and various scientific findings and theories for and against the thesis that human beings have free will, along with the related question of whether it is reasonable to believe that we have it. Finally, in Section 4, we survey the long-debated questions involving free will that arise in classical theistic metaphysics.

1. Major Historical Contributions

1.1 Ancient and Medieval Period

One finds scholarly debate on the ‘origin’ of the notion of free will in Western philosophy. (See, e.g., Dihle (1982) and, in response Frede (2011), with Dihle finding it in St. Augustine (354–430 CE) and Frede in the Stoic Epictetus (c. 55–c. 135 CE).) But this debate presupposes a fairly particular and highly conceptualized concept of free will, with Dihle’s later ‘origin’ reflecting his having a yet more particular concept in view than Frede. If, instead, we look more generally for philosophical reflection on choice-directed control over one’s own actions, then we find significant discussion in Plato and Aristotle (cf. Irwin 1992). Indeed, on this matter, as with so many other major philosophical issues, Plato and Aristotle give importantly different emphases that inform much subsequent thought.

In Book IV of The Republic, Plato posits rational, spirited, and appetitive aspects to the human soul. The wise person strives for inner ‘justice’, a condition in which each part of the soul plays its proper role—reason as the guide, the spirited nature as the ally of reason, exhorting oneself to do what reason deems proper, and the passions as subjugated to the determinations of reason. In the absence of justice, the individual is enslaved to the passions. Hence, freedom for Plato is a kind of self-mastery, attained by developing the virtues of wisdom, courage, and temperance, resulting in one’s liberation from the tyranny of base desires and acquisition of a more accurate understanding and resolute pursuit of the Good (Hecht 2014).

While Aristotle shares with Plato a concern for cultivating virtues, he gives greater theoretical attention to the role of choice in initiating individual actions which, over time, result in habits, for good or ill. In Book III of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle says that, unlike nonrational agents, we have the power to do or not to do, and much of what we do is voluntary, such that its origin is ‘in us’ and we are ‘aware of the particular circumstances of the action’. Furthermore, mature humans make choices after deliberating about different available means to our ends, drawing on rational principles of action. Choose consistently well (poorly), and a virtuous (vicious) character will form over time, and it is in our power to be either virtuous or vicious.

A question that Aristotle seems to recognize, while not satisfactorily answering, is whether the choice an individual makes on any given occasion is wholly determined by his internal state—perception of his circumstances and his relevant beliefs, desires, and general character dispositions (wherever on the continuum between virtue and vice he may be)—and external circumstances. He says that “the man is the father of his actions as of children”—that is, a person’s character shapes how she acts. One might worry that this seems to entail that the person could not have done otherwise—at the moment of choice, she has no control over what her present character is—and so she is not responsible for choosing as she does. Aristotle responds by contending that her present character is partly a result of previous choices she made. While this claim is plausible enough, it seems to ‘pass the buck’, since ‘the man is the father’ of those earlier choices and actions, too.

We note just a few contributions of the subsequent centuries of the Hellenistic era. (See Bobzien 1998.) This period was dominated by debates between Epicureans, Stoics, and the Academic Skeptics, and as it concerned freedom of the will, the debate centered on the place of determinism or of fate in governing human actions and lives. The Stoics and the Epicureans believed that all ordinary things, human souls included, are corporeal and governed by natural laws or principles. Stoics believed that all human choice and behavior was causally determined, but held that this was compatible with our actions being ‘up to us’. Chrysippus ably defended this position by contending that your actions are ‘up to you’ when they come about ‘through you’—when the determining factors of your action are not external circumstances compelling you to act as you do but are instead your own choices grounded in your perception of the options before you. Hence, for moral responsibility, the issue is not whether one’s choices are determined (they are) but in what manner they are determined. Epicurus and his followers had a more mechanistic conception of bodily action than the Stoics. They held that all things (human soul included) are constituted by atoms, whose law-governed behavior fixes the behavior of everything made of such atoms. But they rejected determinism by supposing that atoms, though law-governed, are susceptible to slight ‘swerves’ or departures from the usual paths. Epicurus has often been understood as seeking to ground the freedom of human willings in such indeterministic swerves, but this is a matter of controversy. If this understanding of his aim is correct, how he thought that this scheme might work in detail is not known. (What little we know about his views in this matter stem chiefly from the account given in his follower Lucretius’s six-book poem, On the Nature of Things. See Bobzien 2000 for discussion.)

A final notable figure of this period was Alexander of Aphrodisias, the most important Peripatetic commentator on Aristotle. In his On Fate, Alexander sharply criticizes the positions of the Stoics. He goes on to resolve the ambiguity in Aristotle on the question of the determining nature of character on individual choices by maintaining that, given all such shaping factors, it remains open to the person when she acts freely to do or not to do what she in fact does. Many scholars see Alexander as the first unambiguously ‘libertarian’ theorist of the will (for more information about such theories see section 2 below).

Augustine (354–430) is the central bridge between the ancient and medieval eras of philosophy. His mature thinking about the will was influenced by his early encounter with late classical Neoplatonist thought, which is then transformed by the theological views he embraces in his adult Christian conversion, famously recounted in his Confessions. In that work and in the earlier On the Free Choice of the Will, Augustine struggles to draw together into a coherent whole the doctrines that creaturely misuse of freedom, not God, is the source of evil in the world and that the human will has been corrupted through the ‘fall’ from grace of the earliest human beings, necessitating a salvation that is attained entirely through the actions of God, even as it requires, constitutively, an individual’s willed response of faith. The details of Augustine’s positive account remain a matter of controversy. He clearly affirms that the will is by its nature a self-determining power—no powers external to it determine its choice—and that this feature is the basis of its freedom. But he does not explicitly rule out the will’s being internally determined by psychological factors, as Chrysippus held, and Augustine had theological reasons that might favor (as well as others that would oppose) the thesis that all things are determined in some manner by God. Scholars divide on whether Augustine was a libertarian or instead a kind of compatibilist with respect to metaphysical freedom. (Macdonald 1999 and Stump 2006 argue the former, Baker 2003 and Couenhoven 2007 the latter.) It is clear, however, that Augustine thought that we are powerfully shaped by wrongly-ordered desires that can make it impossible for us to wholeheartedly will ends contrary to those desires, for a sustained period of time. This condition entails an absence of something more valuable, ‘true freedom’, in which our wills are aligned with the Good, a freedom that can be attained only by a transformative operation of divine grace. This latter, psychological conception of freedom of will clearly echoes Plato’s notion of the soul’s (possible) inner justice.

Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274) attempted to synthesize major strands of Aristotle’s systematic philosophy with Christian theology, and so Aquinas begins his complex discussion of human action and choice by agreeing with Aristotle that creatures such as ourselves who are endowed with both intellect and will are hardwired to will certain general ends ordered to the most general goal of goodness. Will is rational desire: we cannot move towards that which does not appear to us at the time to be good. Freedom enters the picture when we consider various means to these ends and move ourselves to activity in pursuit of certain of them. Our will is free in that it is not fixed by nature on any particular means, and they generally do not appear to us either as unqualifiedly good or as uniquely satisfying the end we wish to fulfill. Furthermore, what appears to us to be good can vary widely—even, over time, intra-personally. So much is consistent with saying that in a given total circumstance (including one’s present beliefs and desires), one is necessitated to will as one does. For this reason, some commentators have taken Aquinas to be a kind of compatibilist concerning freedom and causal or theological determinism. In his most extended defense of the thesis that the will is not ‘compelled’ (DM 6), Aquinas notes three ways that the will might reject an option it sees as attractive: (i) it finds another option more attractive, (ii) it comes to think of some circumstance rendering an alternative more favorable “by some chance circumstance, external or internal”, and (iii) the person is momentarily disposed to find an alternative attractive by virtue of a non-innate state that is subject to the will (e.g., being angry vs being at peace). The first consideration is clearly consistent with compatibilism. The second at best points to a kind of contingency that is not grounded in the activity of the will itself. And one wanting to read Aquinas as a libertarian might worry that his third consideration just passes the buck: even if we do sometimes have an ability to directly modify perception-coloring states such as moods, Aquinas’s account of will as rational desire seems to indicate that we will do so only if it seems to us on balance to be good to do so. Those who read Aquinas as a libertarian point to the following further remark in this text: “Will itself can interfere with the process [of some cause’s moving the will] either by refusing to consider what attracts it to will or by considering its opposite: namely, that there is a bad side to what is being proposed…” (Reply to 15; see also DV 24.2). For discussion, see MacDonald (1998), Stump (2003, ch. 9) and especially Hoffman & Michon (2017), which offers the most comprehensive analysis of relevant texts to date.

John Duns Scotus (1265/66–1308) was the stoutest defender in the medieval era of a strongly libertarian conception of the will, maintaining on introspective grounds that will by its very nature is such that “nothing other than the will is the total cause” of its activity (QAM). Indeed, he held the unusual view that not only up to but at the very instant that one is willing X, it is possible for one to will Y or at least not to will X. (He articulates this view through the puzzling claim that a single instant of time comprises two ‘instants of nature’, at the first but not the second of which alternative possibilities are preserved.) In opposition to Aquinas and other medieval Aristotelians, Scotus maintained that a precondition of our freedom is that there are two fundamentally distinct ways things can seem good to us: as practically advantageous to us or as according with justice. Contrary to some popular accounts, however, Scotus allowed that the scope of available alternatives for a person will be more or less constricted. He grants that we are not capable of willing something in which we see no good whatsoever, nor of positively repudiating something which appears to us as unqualifiedly good. However, in accordance with his uncompromising position that nothing can be the total cause of the will other than itself, he held that where something does appear to us as unqualifiedly good (perfectly suited both to our advantage and justice)—viz., in the ‘beatific vision’ of God in the afterlife—we still can refrain from willing it. For discussion, see John Duns Scotus, §5.2.

1.2 Modern Period and Twentieth Century

The problem of free will was an important topic in the modern period, with all the major figures wading into it (Descartes 1641 [1988], 1644 [1988]; Hobbes 1654 [1999], 1656 [1999]; Spinoza 1677 [1992]; Malebranche 1684 [1993]; Leibniz 1686 [1991]; Locke 1690 [1975]; Hume 1740 [1978], 1748 [1975]; Edwards 1754 [1957]; Kant 1781 [1998], 1785 [1998], 1788 [2015]; Reid 1788 [1969]). After less sustained attention in the 19th Century (most notable were Schopenhauer 1841 [1999] and Nietzsche 1886 [1966]), it was widely discussed again among early twentieth century philosophers (Moore 1912; Hobart 1934; Schlick 1939; Nowell-Smith 1948, 1954; Campbell 1951; Ayer 1954; Smart 1961). The centrality of the problem of free will to the various projects of early modern philosophers can be traced to two widely, though not universally, shared assumptions. The first is that without belief in free will, there would be little reason for us to act morally. More carefully, it was widely assumed that belief in an afterlife in which a just God rewards and punishes us according to our right or wrong use of free will was key to motivating us to be moral (Russell 2008, chs. 16–17). Life before death affords us many examples in which vice is better rewarded than virtue and so without knowledge of a final judgment in the afterlife, we would have little reason to pursue virtue and justice when they depart from self-interest. And without free will there can be no final judgement.

The second widely shared assumption is that free will seems difficult to reconcile with what we know about the world. While this assumption is shared by the majority of early modern philosophers, what specifically it is about the world that seems to conflict with freedom differs from philosopher to philosopher. For some, the worry is primarily theological. How can we make sense of contingency and freedom in a world determined by a God who must choose the best possible world to create? For some, the worry was primarily metaphysical. The principle of sufficient reason—roughly, the idea that every event must have a reason or cause—was a cornerstone of Leibniz’s and Spinoza’s metaphysics. How does contingency and freedom fit into such a world? For some, the worry was primarily scientific (Descartes). Given that a proper understanding of the physical world is one in which all physical objects are governed by deterministic laws of nature, how does contingency and freedom fit into such a world? Of course, for some, all three worries were in play in their work (this is true especially of Leibniz).

Despite many disagreements about how best to solve these worries, there were three claims that were widely, although not universally, agreed upon. The first was that free will has two aspects: the freedom to do otherwise and the power of self-determination. The second is that an adequate account of free will must entail that free agents are morally responsible agents and/or fit subjects for punishment. Ideas about moral responsibility were often a yard stick by which analyses of free will were measured, with critics objecting to an analysis of free will by arguing that agents who satisfied the analysis would not, intuitively, be morally responsible for their actions. The third is that compatibilism—the thesis that free will is compatible with determinism—is true. (Spinoza, Reid, and Kant are the clear exceptions to this, though some also see Descartes as an incompatibilist [Ragland 2006].)

Since a detailed discussion of these philosophers’ accounts of free will would take us too far afield, we want instead to focus on isolating a two-step strategy for defending compatibilism that emerges in the early modern period and continued to exert considerable force into the early twentieth century (and perhaps is still at work today). Advocates of this two-step strategy have come to be known as “classical compatibilists”. The first step was to argue that the contrary of freedom is not determinism but external constraint on doing what one wants to do. For example, Hobbes contends that liberty is “the absence of all the impediments to action that are not contained in the nature and intrinsical quality of the agent” (Hobbes 1654 [1999], 38; cf. Hume 1748 [1975] VIII.1; Edwards 1754 [1957]; Ayer 1954). This idea led many compatibilists, especially the more empiricist-inclined, to develop desire- or preference-based analyses of both the freedom to do otherwise and self-determination. An agent has the freedom to do otherwise than \(\phi\) just in case if she preferred or willed to do otherwise, she would have done otherwise (Hobbes 1654 [1999], 16; Locke 1690 [1975]) II.xx.8; Hume 1748 [1975] VIII.1; Moore 1912; Ayer 1954). The freedom to do otherwise does not require that you are able to act contrary to your strongest motivation but simply that your action be dependent on your strongest motivation in the sense that had you desired something else more strongly, then you would have pursued that alternative end. (We will discuss this analysis in more detail below in section 2.2.) Similarly, an agent self-determines her \(\phi\)-ing just in case \(\phi\) is caused by her strongest desires or preferences at the time of action (Hobbes 1654 [1999]; Locke 1690 [1975]; Edwards 1754 [1957]). (We will discuss this analysis in more detail below in section 2.4.) Given these analyses, determinism seems innocuous to freedom.

The second step was to argue that any attempt to analyze free will in a way that putatively captures a deeper or more robust sense of freedom leads to intractable conundrums. The most important examples of this attempt to capture a deeper sense of freedom in the modern period are Immanuel Kant (1781 [1998], 1785 [1998], 1788 [2015]) and Thomas Reid (1788 [1969]) and in the early twentieth century C. A. Campbell (1951). These philosophers argued that the above compatibilist analyses of the freedom to do otherwise and self-determination are, at best, insufficient for free will, and, at worst, incompatible with it. With respect to the classical compatibilist analysis of the freedom to do otherwise, these critics argued that the freedom to do otherwise requires not just that an agent could have acted differently if he had willed differently, but also that he could have willed differently. Free will requires more than free action. With respect to classical compatibilists’ analysis of self-determination, they argued that self-determination requires that the agent—rather than his desires, preferences, or any other mental state—cause his free choices and actions. Reid explains:

I consider the determination of the will as an effect. This effect must have a cause which had the power to produce it; and the cause must be either the person himself, whose will it is, or some other being…. If the person was the cause of that determination of his own will, he was free in that action, and it is justly imputed to him, whether it be good or bad. But, if another being was the cause of this determination, either producing it immediately, or by means and instruments under his direction, then the determination is the act and deed of that being, and is solely imputed to him. (1788 [1969] IV.i, 265)

Classical compatibilists argued that both claims are incoherent. While it is intelligible to ask whether a man willed to do what he did, it is incoherent to ask whether a man willed to will what he did:

For to ask whether a man is at liberty to will either motion or rest, speaking or silence, which he pleases, is to ask whether a man can will what he wills, or be pleased with what he is pleased with? A question which, I think, needs no answer; and they who make a question of it must suppose one will to determine the acts of another, and another to determine that, and so on in infinitum. (Locke 1690 [1975] II.xx.25; cf. Hobbes 1656 [1999], 72)

In response to libertarians’ claim that self-determination requires that the agent, rather than his motives, cause his actions, it was objected that this removes the agent from the natural causal order, which is clearly unintelligible for human animals (Hobbes 1654 [1999], 38). It is important to recognize that an implication of the second step of the strategy is that free will is not only compatible with determinism but actually requires determinism (cf. Hume 1748 [1975] VIII). This was a widely shared assumption among compatibilists up through the mid-twentieth century.

Spinoza’s Ethics (1677 [1992]) is an important departure from the above dialectic. He endorses a strong form of necessitarianism in which everything is categorically necessary as opposed to the conditional necessity embraced by most compatibilists, and he contends that there is no room in such a world for divine or creaturely free will. Thus, Spinoza is a free will skeptic. Interestingly, Spinoza is also keen to deny that the nonexistence of free will has the dire implications often assumed. As noted above, many in the modern period saw belief in free will and an afterlife in which God rewards the just and punishes the wicked as necessary to motivate us to act morally. According to Spinoza, so far from this being necessary to motivate us to be moral, it actually distorts our pursuit of morality. True moral living, Spinoza thinks, sees virtue as its own reward (Part V, Prop. 42). Moreover, while free will is a chimera, humans are still capable of freedom or self-determination. Such self-determination, which admits of degrees on Spinoza’s view, arises when our emotions are determined by true ideas about the nature of reality. The emotional lives of the free persons are ones in which “we desire nothing but that which must be, nor, in an absolute sense, can we find contentment in anything but truth. And so in so far as we rightly understand these matters, the endeavor of the better part of us is in harmony with the order of the whole of Nature” (Part IV, Appendix). Spinoza is an important forerunner to the many free will skeptics in the twentieth century, a position that continues to attract strong support (see Strawson 1986; Double 1992; Smilansky 2000; Pereboom 2001, 2014; Levy 2011; Waller 2011; Caruso 2012; Vilhauer 2012. For further discussion see the entry skepticism about moral responsibility).

It is worth observing that in many of these disputes about the nature of free will there is an underlying dispute about the nature of moral responsibility. This is seen clearly in Hobbes (1654 [1999]) and early twentieth century philosophers’ defenses of compatibilism. Underlying the belief that free will is incompatible with determinism is the thought that no one would be morally responsible for any actions in a deterministic world in the sense that no one would deserve blame or punishment. Hobbes responded to this charge in part by endorsing broadly consequentialist justifications of blame and punishment: we are justified in blaming or punishing because these practices deter future harmful actions and/or contribute to reforming the offender (1654 [1999], 24–25; cf. Schlick 1939; Nowell-Smith 1948; Smart 1961). While many, perhaps even most, compatibilists have come to reject this consequentialist approach to moral responsibility in the wake of P. F. Strawson’s 1962 landmark essay ‘Freedom and Resentment’ (though see Vargas (2013) and McGeer (2014) for contemporary defenses of compatibilism that appeal to forward-looking considerations) there is still a general lesson to be learned: disputes about free will are often a function of underlying disputes about the nature and value of moral responsibility.

2. The Nature of Free Will

2.1 Free Will and Moral Responsibility

As should be clear from this short discussion of the history of the idea of free will, free will has traditionally been conceived of as a kind of power to control one’s choices and actions. When an agent exercises free will over her choices and actions, her choices and actions are up to her. But up to her in what sense? As should be clear from our historical survey, two common (and compatible) answers are: (i) up to her in the sense that she is able to choose otherwise, or at minimum that she is able not to choose or act as she does, and (ii) up to her in the sense that she is the source of her action. However, there is widespread controversy both over whether each of these conditions is required for free will and if so, how to understand the kind or sense of freedom to do otherwise or sourcehood that is required. While some seek to resolve these controversies in part by careful articulation of our experiences of deliberation, choice, and action (Nozick 1981, ch. 4; van Inwagen 1983, ch. 1), many seek to resolve these controversies by appealing to the nature of moral responsibility. The idea is that the kind of control or sense of up-to-meness involved in free will is the kind of control or sense of up-to-meness relevant to moral responsibility (Double 1992, 12; Ekstrom 2000, 7–8; Smilansky 2000, 16; Widerker and McKenna 2003, 2; Vargas 2007, 128; Nelkin 2011, 151–52; Levy 2011, 1; Pereboom 2014, 1–2). Indeed, some go so far as to define ‘free will’ as ‘the strongest control condition—whatever that turns out to be—necessary for moral responsibility’ (Wolf 1990, 3–4; Fischer 1994, 3; Mele 2006, 17). Given this connection, we can determine whether the freedom to do otherwise and the power of self-determination are constitutive of free will and, if so, in what sense, by considering what it takes to be a morally responsible agent. On these latter characterizations of free will, understanding free will is inextricably linked to, and perhaps even derivative from, understanding moral responsibility. And even those who demur from this claim regarding conceptual priority typically see a close link between these two ideas. Consequently, to appreciate the current debates surrounding the nature of free will, we need to say something about the nature of moral responsibility.

It is now widely accepted that there are different species of moral responsibility. It is common (though not uncontroversial) to distinguish moral responsibility as answerability from moral responsibility as attributability from moral responsibility as accountability (Watson 1996; Fischer and Tognazzini 2011; Shoemaker 2011. See Smith (2012) for a critique of this taxonomy). These different species of moral responsibility differ along three dimensions: (i) the kind of responses licensed toward the responsible agent, (ii) the nature of the licensing relation, and (iii) the necessary and sufficient conditions for licensing the relevant kind of responses toward the agent. For example, some argue that when an agent is morally responsible in the attributability sense, certain judgments about the agent—such as judgments concerning the virtues and vices of the agent—are fitting, and that the fittingness of such judgments does not depend on whether the agent in question possessed the freedom to do otherwise (cf. Watson 1996).

While keeping this controversy about the nature of moral responsibility firmly in mind (see the entry on moral responsibility for a more detailed discussion of these issues), we think it is fair to say that the most commonly assumed understanding of moral responsibility in the historical and contemporary discussion of the problem of free will is moral responsibility as accountability in something like the following sense:

An agent \(S\) is morally accountable for performing an action \(\phi\) \(=_{df.}\) \(S\) deserves praise if \(\phi\) goes beyond what can be reasonably expected of \(S\) and \(S\) deserves blame if \(\phi\) is morally wrong.

The central notions in this definition are praise, blame, and desert. The majority of contemporary philosophers have followed Strawson (1962) in contending that praising and blaming an agent consist in experiencing (or at least being disposed to experience (cf. Wallace 1994, 70–71)) reactive attitudes or emotions directed toward the agent, such as gratitude, approbation, and pride in the case of praise, and resentment, indignation, and guilt in the case of blame. (See Sher (2006) and Scanlon (2008) for important dissents from this trend. See the entry on blame for a more detailed discussion.) These emotions, in turn, dispose us to act in a variety of ways. For example, blame disposes us to respond with some kind of hostility toward the blameworthy agent, such as verbal rebuke or partial withdrawal of good will. But while these kinds of dispositions are essential to our blaming someone, their manifestation is not: it is possible to blame someone with very little change in attitudes or actions toward the agent. Blaming someone might be immediately followed by forgiveness as an end of the matter.

By ‘desert’, we have in mind what Derk Pereboom has called basic desert:

The desert at issue here is basic in the sense that the agent would deserve to be blamed or praised just because she has performed the action, given an understanding of its moral status, and not, for example, merely by virtue of consequentialist or contractualist considerations. (2014, 2)

As we understand desert, if an agent deserves blame, then we have a strong pro tanto reason to blame him simply in virtue of his being accountable for doing wrong. Importantly, these reasons can be outweighed by other considerations. While an agent may deserve blame, it might, all things considered, be best to forgive him unconditionally instead.

When an agent is morally responsible for doing something wrong, he is blameworthy: he deserves hard treatment marked by resentment and indignation and the actions these emotions dispose us toward, such as censure, rebuke, and ostracism. However, it would seem unfair to treat agents in these ways unless their actions were up to them. Thus, we arrive at the core connection between free will and moral responsibility: agents deserve praise or blame only if their actions are up to them—only if they have free will. Consequently, we can assess analyses of free will by their implications for judgments of moral responsibility. We note that some might reject the claim that free will is necessary for moral responsibility (e.g., Frankfurt 1971; Stump 1988), but even for these theorists an adequate analysis of free will must specify a sufficient condition for the kind of control at play in moral responsibility.

In what follows, we focus our attention on the two most commonly cited features of free will: the freedom to do otherwise and sourcehood. While some seem to think that free will consists exclusively in either the freedom to do otherwise (van Inwagen 2008) or in sourcehood (Zagzebski 2000), many philosophers hold that free will involves both conditions—though philosophers often emphasize one condition over the other depending on their dialectical situation or argumentative purposes (cf. Watson 1987). In what follows, we will describe the most common characterizations of these two conditions.

2.2 The Freedom to Do Otherwise

For most newcomers to the problem of free will, it will seem obvious that an action is up to an agent only if she had the freedom to do otherwise. But what does this freedom come to? The freedom to do otherwise is clearly a modal property of agents, but it is controversial just what species of modality is at stake. It must be more than mere possibility: to have the freedom to do otherwise consists in more than the mere possibility of something else’s happening. A more plausible and widely endorsed understanding claims the relevant modality is ability or power (Locke 1690 [1975], II.xx; Reid 1788 [1969], II.i–ii; D. Locke 1973; Clarke 2009; Vihvelin 2013). But abilities themselves seem to come in different varieties (Lewis 1976; Horgan 1979; van Inwagen 1983, ch. 1; Mele 2003; Clarke 2009; Vihvelin 2013, ch. 1; Franklin 2015; Cyr and Swenson 2019; Hofmann 2022; Whittle 2022), so a claim that an agent has ‘the ability to do otherwise’ is potentially ambiguous or indeterminate; in philosophical discussion, the sense of ability appealed to needs to be spelled out. A satisfactory account of the freedom to do otherwise owes us both an account of the kind of ability in terms of which the freedom to do otherwise is analyzed, and an argument for why this kind of ability (as opposed to some other species) is the one constitutive of the freedom to do otherwise. As we will see, philosophers sometimes leave this second debt unpaid.

The contemporary literature takes its cue from classical compatibilism’s recognized failure to deliver a satisfactory analysis of the freedom to do otherwise. As we saw above, classical compatibilists (Hobbes 1654 [1999], 1656 [1999]; Locke 1690 [1975]; Hume 1740 [1978], 1748 [1975]; Edwards 1754 [1957]; Moore 1912; Schlick 1939; Ayer 1954) sought to analyze the freedom to do otherwise in terms of a simple conditional analysis of ability:

Simple Conditional Analysis: An agent \(S\) has the ability to do otherwise if and only if, were \(S\) to choose to do otherwise, then \(S\) would do otherwise.

Part of the attraction of this analysis is that it obviously reconciles the freedom to do otherwise with determinism. While the truth of determinism entails that one’s action is inevitable given the past and laws of nature, there is nothing about determinism that implies that if one had chosen otherwise, then one would not do otherwise.

There are two problems with the Simple Conditional Analysis. The first is that it is, at best, an analysis of free action, not free will (cf. Reid 1788 [1969]; Chisholm 1966; 1976, ch. 2; Lehrer 1968, 1976). It only tells us when an agent has the ability to do otherwise, not when an agent has the ability to choose to do otherwise. One might be tempted to think that there is an easy fix along the following lines:

Simple Conditional Analysis*: An agent \(S\) has the ability to choose otherwise if and only if, were \(S\) to desire or prefer to choose otherwise, then \(S\) would choose otherwise.

The problem is that we often fail to choose to do things we want to choose, even when it appears that we had the ability to choose otherwise (one might think the same problem attends the original analysis). Suppose that, in deciding how to spend my evening, I have a desire to choose to read and a desire to choose to watch a movie. Suppose that I choose to read. By all appearances, I had the ability to choose to watch a movie. And yet, according to the Simple Conditional Analysis*, I lack this freedom, since the conditional ‘if I were to desire to choose to watch a movie, then I would choose to watch a movie’ is false. I do desire to choose to watch a movie and yet I do not choose to watch a movie. It is unclear how to remedy this problem. On the one hand, we might refine the antecedent by replacing ‘desire’ with ‘strongest desire’ (cf. Hobbes 1654 [1999], 1656 [1999]; Edwards 1754 [1957]). The problem is that this assumes, implausibly, that we always choose what we most strongly desire (for criticisms of this view see Reid 1788 [1969]; Campbell 1951; Wallace 1999; Holton 2009). On the other hand, we might refine the consequent by replacing ‘would choose to do otherwise’ with either ‘would probably choose to do otherwise’ or ‘might choose to do otherwise’. But each of these proposals is also problematic. If ‘probably’ means ‘more likely than not’, then this revised conditional still seems too strong: it seems possible to have the ability to choose otherwise even when one’s so choosing is unlikely. If we opt for ‘might’, then the relevant sense of modality needs to be spelled out.

Even if there are fixes to these problems, there is a yet deeper problem with these analyses. There are some agents who clearly lack the freedom to do otherwise and yet satisfy the conditional at the heart of these analyses. That is, although these agents lack the freedom to do otherwise, it is, for example, true of them that if they chose otherwise, they would do otherwise. Picking up on an argument developed by Keith Lehrer (1968; cf. Campbell 1951; Broad 1952; Chisholm 1966), consider an agoraphobic, Luke, who, when faced with the prospect of entering an open space, is subject not merely to an irresistible desire to refrain from intentionally going outside, but an irresistible desire to refrain from even choosing to go outside. Given Luke’s psychology, there is no possible world in which he suffers from his agoraphobia and chooses to go outside. It may well nevertheless be true that if Luke chose to go outside, then he would have gone outside. After all, any possible world in which he chooses to go outside will be a world in which he no longer suffers (to the same degree) from his agoraphobia, and thus we have no reason to doubt that in those worlds he would go outside as a result of his choosing to go outside. The same kind of counterexample applies with equal force to the conditional ‘if \(S\) desired to choose otherwise, then \(S\) would choose otherwise’.

While simple conditional analyses admirably make clear the species of ability to which they appeal, they fail to show that this species of ability is constitutive of the freedom to do otherwise. Agents need a stronger ability to do otherwise than characterized by such simple conditionals. Some argue that the fundamental source of the above problems is the conditional nature of these analyses (Campbell 1951; Austin 1961; Chisholm 1966; Lehrer 1976; van Inwagen 1983, ch. 4). The sense of ability relevant to the freedom to do otherwise is the ‘all-in sense’—that is, holding everything fixed up to the time of the decision or action—and this sense, so it is argued, can only be captured by a categorical analysis of the ability to do otherwise:

Categorical Analysis: An agent \(S\) has the ability to choose or do otherwise than \(\phi\) at time \(t\) if and only if it was possible, holding fixed everything up to \(t\), that \(S\) choose or do otherwise than \(\phi\) at \(t\).

This analysis gets the right verdict in Luke’s case. He lacks the ability to do otherwise than refrain from choosing to go outside, according to this analysis, because there is no possible world in which he suffers from his agoraphobia and yet chooses to go outside. Unlike the above conditional analyses, the Categorical Analysis requires that we hold fixed Luke’s agoraphobia when considering alternative possibilities.

If the Categorical Analysis is correct, then free will is incompatible with determinism. According to the thesis of determinism, all deterministic possible worlds with the same pasts and laws of nature have the same futures (Lewis 1979; van Inwagen 1983, 3). Suppose John is in deterministic world \(W\) and refrains from raising his hand at time \(t\). Since \(W\) is deterministic, it follows that any possible world \(W^*\) that has the same past and laws up to \(t\) must have the same future, including John’s refraining from raising his hand at \(t\). Therefore, John lacked the ability, and thus freedom, to raise his hand.

This argument, carefully articulated in the late 1960s and early 1970s by Carl Ginet (1966, 1990) and Peter van Inwagen (1975, 1983) and refined in important ways by John Martin Fischer (1994), has come to be known as the Consequence Argument. van Inwagen offers the following informal statement of the argument:

If determinism is true, then our acts are the consequences of the laws of nature and events in the remote past. But it is not up to us what went on before we were born [i.e., we do not have the ability to change the past], and neither is it up to us what the laws of nature are [i.e., we do not have the ability to break the laws of nature]. Therefore, the consequences of these things (including our present acts) are not up to us. (van Inwagen 1983, 16; cf. Fischer 1994, ch. 1)

Like the Simple Conditional Analysis, a virtue of the Categorical Analysis is that it spells out clearly the kind of ability appealed to in its analysis of the freedom to do otherwise, but like the Simple Conditional Analysis, critics have argued that the sense of ability it captures is not the sense at the heart of free will. The objection here, though, is not that the analysis is too permissive or weak, but rather that it is too restrictive or strong.

While there have been numerous different replies along these lines (e.g., Lehrer 1980; Slote 1982; Watson 1986. See the entry on arguments for incompatibilism for a more extensive discussion of and bibliography for the Consequence Argument), the most influential of these objections is due to David Lewis (1981). Lewis contended that van Inwagen’s argument equivocated on ‘is able to break a law of nature’. We can distinguish two senses of ‘is able to break a law of nature’:

(Weak Thesis) I am able to do something such that, if I did it, a law of nature would be broken.

(Strong Thesis) I am able to do something such that, if I did it, it would constitute a law of nature’s being broken or would cause a law of nature to be broken.

If we are committed to the Categorical Analysis, then those desiring to defend compatibilism seem to be committed to the sense of ability in ‘is able to break a law of nature’ along the lines of the strong thesis. Lewis agrees with van Inwagen that it is “incredible” to think humans have such an ability (Lewis 1981, 113), but maintains that compatibilists need only appeal to the ability to break a law of nature in the weak sense. While it is absurd to think that humans are able to do something that is a violation of a law of nature or causes a law of nature to be broken, there is nothing incredible, so Lewis claimed, in thinking that humans are able to do something such that if they did it, a law of nature would be broken. In essence, Lewis is arguing that incompatibilists like van Inwagen have failed to adequately motivate the restrictiveness of the Categorical Analysis.

Some incompatibilists have responded to Lewis by contending that even the weak ability is incredible (van Inwagen 2004). But there is a different and often overlooked problem for Lewis: the weak ability seems to be too weak. Returning to the case of John’s refraining from raising his hand, Lewis maintains that the following three propositions are consistent:

John is able to raise his hand.
A necessary condition for John’s raising his hand fails to obtain (i.e., that the laws of nature or past are different than they actually are).
John is not able to do anything that would constitute this necessary condition’s obtaining or cause this necessary condition to obtain (i.e., he is unable to do anything that would constitute or cause a law of nature to be broken or the past to be different).

One might think that (ii) and (iii) are incompatible with (i). Consider again Luke, our agoraphobic. Suppose that his agoraphobia affects him in such a way that he will only intentionally go outside if he chooses to go outside, and yet his agoraphobia makes it impossible for him to make this choice. In this case, a necessary condition for Luke’s intentionally going outside is his choosing to go outside. Moreover, Luke is not able to choose or cause himself to choose to go outside. Intuitively, this would seem to imply that Luke lacks the freedom to go outside. But this implication does not follow for Lewis. From the fact that Luke is able to go outside only if he chooses to go outside and the fact that Luke is not able to choose to go outside, it does not follow, on Lewis’s account, that Luke lacks the ability to go outside. Consequently, Lewis’s account fails to explain why Luke lacks the ability to go outside (cf. Speak 2011). (For other important criticisms of Lewis, see Ginet [1990, ch. 5] and Fischer [1994, ch. 4].)

While Lewis may be right that the Categorical Analysis is too restrictive, his argument, all by itself, doesn’t seem to establish this. His argument is successful only if (a) he can provide an alternative analysis of ability that entails that Luke’s agoraphobia robs him of the ability to go outside and (b) does not entail that determinism robs John of the ability to raise his hand (cf. Pendergraft 2010). Lewis must point out a principled difference between these two cases. As should be clear from the above, the Simple Conditional Analysis is of no help. However, some recent work by Michael Smith (2003), Kadri Vihvelin (2004; 2013), and Michael Fara (2008) have attempted to fill this gap. What unites these theorists—whom Clarke (2009) has called the ‘new dispositionalists’—is their attempt to appeal to recent advances in the metaphysics of dispositions to arrive at a revised conditional analysis of the freedom to do otherwise. The most perspicuous of these accounts is offered by Vihvelin (2004), who argues that an agent’s having the ability to do otherwise is solely a function of the agent’s intrinsic properties. (It is important to note that Vihvelin [2013] has come to reject the view that free will consists exclusively in the kind of ability analyzed below.) Building on Lewis’s work on the metaphysics of dispositions, she arrives at the following analysis of ability:

Revised Conditional Analysis of Ability: \(S\) has the ability at time \(t\) to do \(X\) iff, for some intrinsic property or set of properties \(B\) that \(S\) has at \(t\), for some time \(t'\) after \(t\), if \(S\) chose (decided, intended, or tried) at \(t\) to do \(X\), and \(S\) were to retain \(B\) until \(t'\), \(S\)’s choosing (deciding, intending, or trying) to do \(X\) and \(S\)’s having \(B\) would jointly be an \(S\)-complete cause of \(S\)’s doing \(X\). (Vihvelin 2004, 438)

Lewis defines an ‘\(S\)-complete cause’ as “a cause complete insofar as havings of properties intrinsic to [\(S\)] are concerned, though perhaps omitting some events extrinsic to [\(S\)]” (cf. Lewis 1997, 156). In other words, an \(S\)-complete cause of \(S\)’s doing \(\phi\) requires that \(S\) possess all the intrinsic properties relevant to \(S\)’s causing \(S\)’s doing \(\phi\). This analysis appears to afford Vihvelin the basis for a principled difference between agoraphobics and merely determined agents. We must hold fixed an agent’s phobias since they are intrinsic properties of agents, but we need not hold fixed the laws of nature because these are not intrinsic properties of agents. (It should be noted that the assumption that intrinsic properties are wholly separable from the laws of nature is disputed by ‘dispositional essentialists.’ See the entry on metaphysics of causation.) Vihvelin’s analysis appears to be restrictive enough to exclude phobics from having the freedom to do otherwise, but permissive enough to allow that some agents in deterministic worlds have the freedom to do otherwise.

But appearances can be deceiving. The new dispositionalist claims have received some serious criticism, with the majority of the criticisms maintaining that these analyses are still too permissive (Clarke 2009; Whittle 2010; Franklin 2011b). For example, Randolph Clarke argues that Vihvelin’s analysis fails to overcome the original problem with the Simple Conditional Analysis. He writes, “A phobic agent might, on some occasion, be unable to choose to A and unable to A without so choosing, while retaining all that she would need to implement such a choice, should she make it. Despite lacking the ability to choose to A, the agent might have some set of intrinsic properties B such that, if she chose to A and retained B, then her choosing to A and her having B would jointly be an agent-complete cause of her A-ing” (Clarke 2009, p. 329).

The Categorical Analysis, and thus incompatibilism about free will and determinism, remains an attractive option for many philosophers precisely because it seems that compatibilists have yet to furnish an analysis of the freedom to do otherwise that implies that phobics clearly lack the ability to choose or do otherwise that is relevant to moral responsibility and yet some merely determined agents have this ability.

2.3 Freedom to Do Otherwise vs. Sourcehood Accounts

Some have tried to avoid these lingering problems for compatibilists by arguing that the freedom to do otherwise is not required for free will or moral responsibility. What matters for an agent’s freedom and responsibility, so it is argued, is the source of her action—how her action was brought about. The most prominent strategy for defending this move appeals to ‘Frankfurt-style cases’. In a ground-breaking article, Harry Frankfurt (1969) presented a series of thought experiments intended to show that it is possible that agents are morally responsible for their actions and yet they lack the ability to do otherwise. While Frankfurt (1971) took this to show that moral responsibility and free will come apart—free will requires the ability to do otherwise but moral responsibility does not—if we define ‘free will’ as ‘the strongest control condition required for moral responsibility’ (cf. Wolf 1990, 3–4; Fischer 1994, 3; Mele 2006, 17), then if Frankfurt-style cases show that moral responsibility does not require the ability to do otherwise, then they also show that free will does not require the ability to do otherwise. Let us consider this challenge in more detail.

Here is a representative Frankfurt-style case:

Imagine, if you will, that Black is a quite nifty (and even generally nice) neurosurgeon. But in performing an operation on Jones to remove a brain tumor, Black inserts a mechanism into Jones’s brain which enables Black to monitor and control Jones’s activities. Jones, meanwhile, knows nothing of this. Black exercises this control through a sophisticated computer which he has programmed so that, among other things, it monitors Jones’s voting behavior. If Jones were to show any inclination to vote for Bush, then the computer, through the mechanism in Jones’s brain, intervenes to ensure that he actually decides to vote for Clinton and does so vote. But if Jones decides on his own to vote for Clinton, the computer does nothing but continue to monitor—without affecting—the goings-on in Jones’s head. (Fischer 2006, 38)

Fischer goes on to suppose that Jones “decides to vote for Clinton on his own”, without any interference from Black, and maintains that in such a case Jones is morally responsible for his decision. Fischer draws two interrelated conclusions from this case. The first, negative conclusion, is that the ability to do otherwise is not necessary for moral responsibility. Jones is unable to refrain from deciding to vote for Clinton, and yet, so long as Jones decides to vote for Clinton on his own, his decision is free and one for which he is morally responsible. The second, positive conclusion, is that freedom and responsibility are functions of the actual sequence. What matters for an agent’s freedom and moral responsibility is not what might have happened, but how his action was actually brought about. What matters is not whether the agent had the ability to do otherwise, but whether he was the source of his actions.

The success of Frankfurt-style cases is hotly contested. An early and far-reaching criticism is due to David Widerker (1995), Carl Ginet (1996), and Robert Kane (1996, 142–43). According to this criticism, proponents of Frankfurt-style cases face a dilemma: either these cases assume that the connection between the indicator (in our case, the absence of Jones’s showing any inclination to decide to vote for Bush) and the agent’s decision (here, Jones’s deciding to vote for Clinton) is deterministic or not. If the connection is deterministic, then Frankfurt-style cases cannot be expected to convince incompatibilists that the ability to do otherwise is not necessary for moral responsibility and/or free will, since Jones’s action will be deterministically brought about by factors beyond his control, leading incompatibilists to conclude that Jones is not morally responsible for his decision. But if the connection is nondeterministic, then it is possible even in the absence of showing any inclination to decide to vote for Bush, that Jones decides to vote for Bush, and so he retains the ability to do otherwise. Either way Frankfurt-style cases fail to show that Jones is both morally responsible for his decision and yet is unable to do otherwise.

While some have argued that even Frankfurt-style cases that assume determinism are effective (see, e.g., Fischer 1999, 2010, 2013 and Haji and McKenna 2004 and for criticisms of this approach, see Goetz 2005, Palmer 2005, 2014, Widerker and Goetz 2013, and Cohen 2017), the majority of proponents of Frankfurt-style cases have attempted to revise these cases so that they are explicitly nondeterministic and yet still show that the agent was morally responsible even though he lacked the ability to do otherwise—or, at least that he lacked any ability to do otherwise that could be relevant to grounding the agent’s moral responsibility (see, e.g., Mele and Robb 1998, 2003, Pereboom 2001, 2014, McKenna 2003, Hunt 2005, and for criticisms of these cases see Ginet 2002, Timpe 2006, Widerker 2006, Franklin 2011c, Moya 2011, Palmer 2011, 2013, Robinson 2014, Capes 2016, Capes and Swenson 2017, and Elzein 2017).

Supposing that Frankfurt-style cases are successful, what exactly do they show? In our view, they show neither that free will and moral responsibility do not require an ability to do otherwise in any sense nor that compatibilism is true. Frankfurt-style cases are of clear help to the compatibilists’ position (though see Speak 2007 for a dissenting opinion). The Consequence Argument raises a powerful challenge to the cogency of compatibilism. But if Frankfurt-style cases are successful, agents can act freely in the sense relevant to moral responsibility while lacking the ability to do otherwise in the all-in sense. This allows compatibilists to concede that the all-in ability to do otherwise is incompatible with determinism, and yet insist that it is irrelevant to the question of the compatibility of determinism with moral responsibility (and perhaps even free will, depending on how we define this) (cf. Fischer 1987, 1994. For a challenge to the move from not strictly necessary to irrelevant, see O’Connor [2000, 20–22] and in reply, Fischer [2006, 152–56].). But, of course, showing that an argument for the falsity of compatibilism is irrelevant does not show that compatibilism is true. Indeed, many incompatibilists maintain that Frankfurt-style cases are successful and defend incompatibilism not via the Consequence Argument, but by way of arguments that attempt to show that agents in deterministic worlds cannot be the ‘source’ of their actions in the way that moral responsibility requires (Stump 1999; Zagzebski 2000; Pereboom 2001, 2014). Thus, if successful, Frankfurt-style cases would be at best the first step in defending compatibilism. The second step must offer an analysis of the kind of sourcehood constitutive of free will that entails that free will is compatible with determinism (cf. Fischer 1982).

Furthermore, while proponents of Frankfurt-style cases often maintain that these cases show that no ability to do otherwise is necessary for moral responsibility (“I have employed the Frankfurt-type example to argue that this sense of control [i.e. the one required for moral responsibility] need not involve any alternative possibilities” [Fischer 2006, p. 40; emphasis ours]), we believe that this conclusion overreaches. At best, Frankfurt-style cases show that the ability to do otherwise in the all-in sense—in the sense defined by the Categorical Analysis—is not necessary for free will or moral responsibility (cf. Franklin 2015). To appreciate this, let us assume that in the above Frankfurt-style case Jones lacks the ability to do otherwise in the all-in sense: there is no possible world in which we hold fixed the past and laws and yet Jones does otherwise, since all such worlds include Black and his preparations for preventing Jones from doing otherwise should Jones show any inclination. Even if this is all true, it should take only a little reflection to recognize that in this case Jones is able to do otherwise in certain weaker senses we might attach to that phrase, and compatibilists in fact still think that the ability to do otherwise in some such senses is necessary for free will and moral responsibility. Consequently, even though Frankfurt-style cases have, as a matter of fact, moved many compatibilists away from emphasizing ability to do otherwise to emphasizing sourcehood, we suggest that this move is best seen as a weakening of the ability-to-do-otherwise condition on moral responsibility (but see Cyr 2017 and Kittle 2019 for criticisms of this claim). (A potentially important exception to this claim is Sartorio [2016], who appealing to some controversial ideas in the metaphysics of causation appears to argue that no sense of the ability to do otherwise is necessary for control in the sense at stake for moral responsibility, but instead what matters is whether the agent is the cause of the action. We simply note that Sartorio’s account of causation is a modal one [see especially Sartorio (2016, 94–95, 132–37)] and thus it is far from clear that her account of freedom and responsibility is really an exception.)

2.4 Compatibilist Accounts of Sourcehood

In this section, we will assume that Frankfurt-style cases are successful in order to consider two prominent compatibilist attempts to construct analyses of the sourcehood condition (though see the entry on compatibilism for a more systematic survey of compatibilist theories of free will). The first, and perhaps most popular, compatibilist model is a reasons-responsiveness model. According to this model, an agent’s action \(\phi\) is free just in case the agent or manner in which the action is brought about is responsive to the reasons available to the agent at the time of action. While compatibilists develop this kind of account in different ways, the most detailed proposal is due to John Martin Fischer (1994, 2006, 2010, 2012; Fischer and Ravizza 1998. For similar compatibilist treatments of reasons-responsiveness, see Wolf 1990, Wallace 1994, Haji 1998, Nelkin 2011, McKenna 2013, Vargas 2013, Sartorio 2016). Fischer and Ravizza argue that an agent’s action is free and one for which he is morally responsible only if the mechanism that issued in the action is moderately reasons-responsive (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, ch. 3). By ‘mechanism’, Fischer and Ravizza simply mean “the way the action was brought about” (38). One mechanism they often discuss is practical deliberation. For example, in the case of Jones discussed above, his decision to vote for Clinton on his own was brought about by the process of practical deliberation. What must be true of this process, this mechanism, for it to be moderately reasons-responsive? Fischer and Ravizza maintain that moderate reasons-responsiveness consists in two conditions: reasons-receptivity and reasons-reactivity. A mechanism’s reasons-receptivity depends on the agent’s cognitive capacities, such as being capable of understanding moral reasons and the implications of their actions (69–73). The second condition is more important for us in the present context. A mechanism’s reasons-reactivity depends on how the mechanism would react given different reasons for action. Fischer and Ravizza argue that the kind of reasons-reactivity at stake is weak reasons-reactivity, where this merely requires that there is some possible world in which the laws of nature remain the same, the same mechanism operates, there is a sufficient reason to do otherwise, and the mechanism brings about the alternative action in response to this sufficient reason (73–76). On this analysis, while Jones, due to the activity of Black, lacks the ‘all-in’ sense of the ability to do otherwise, he is nevertheless morally responsible for deciding to vote for Clinton because his action finds its source in Jones’s practical deliberation that is moderately reasons-responsive.

Fischer and Ravizza’s theory of freedom and responsibility has shifted the focus of much recent debate to questions of sourcehood. Moreover, one might argue that this theory is a clear improvement over classical compatibilism with respect to handling cases of phobia. By focusing on mechanisms, Fischer and Ravizza can argue that our agoraphobic Luke is not morally responsible for deciding to refrain from going outside because the mechanism that issues in this action—namely his agoraphobia—is not moderately reasons-responsive. There is no world with the same laws of nature as our own, this mechanism operates, and yet it reacts to a sufficient reason to go outside. No matter what reasons there are for Luke to go outside, when acting on this mechanism, he will always refrain from going outside (cf. Fischer 1987, 74).

Before turning to our second compatibilist model, it is worth noting that it would be a mistake to think that Fischer and Ravizza’s account is a sourcehood account to the exclusion of the ability to do otherwise in any sense. As we have just seen, Fischer and Ravizza place clear modal requirements on mechanisms that issue in actions with respect to which agents are free and morally responsible. Indeed, this should be clear from the very idea of reasons-responsiveness. Whether one is responsive depends not merely on how one does respond, but also on how one would respond. Thus, any account that makes reasons-responsiveness an essential condition of free will is an account that makes the ability to do otherwise, in some sense, necessary for free will (Fischer [2018] concedes this point, though, as noted above, the reader should consider Sartorio [2016] as a potential counterexample to this claim).

The second main compatibilist model of sourcehood is an identification model. Accounts of sourcehood of this kind lay stress on self-determination or autonomy: to be the source of her action the agent must self-determine her action. Like the contemporary discussion of the ability to do otherwise, the contemporary discussion of the power of self-determination begins with the failure of classical compatibilism to produce an acceptable definition. According to classical compatibilists, self-determination simply consists in the agent’s action being determined by her strongest motive. On the assumption that some compulsive agents’ compulsions operate by generating irresistible desires to act in certain ways, the classical compatibilist analysis of self-determination implies that these compulsive actions are self-determined. While Hobbes seems willing to accept this implication (1656 [1999], 78), most contemporary compatibilists concede that this result is unacceptable.

Beginning with the work of Harry Frankfurt (1971) and Gary Watson (1975), many compatibilists have developed identification accounts of self-determination that attempt to draw a distinction between an agent’s desires or motives that are internal to the agent and those that are external. The idea is that while agents are not (or at least may not be) identical to any motivations (or bundle of motivations), they are identified with a subset of their motivations, rendering these motivations internal to the agent in such a way that any actions brought about by these motivations are self-determined. The identification relation is not an identity relation, but something weaker (cf. Bratman 2000, 39n12). What the precise nature of the identification relation is and to which attitudes an agent stands in this relation is hotly disputed. Lippert-Rasmussen (2003) helpfully divides identification accounts into two main types. The first are “authority” accounts, according to which agents are identified with attitudes that are authorized to speak for them (368). The second are authenticity accounts, according to which agents are identified with attitudes that reveal who they truly are (368). (But see Shoemaker 2015 for an ecumenical account of identification that blends these two accounts.) Proposed attitudes to which agents are said to stand in the identification relation include higher-order desires (Frankfurt 1971), cares or loves (Frankfurt 1993, 1994; Shoemaker 2003; Jaworska 2007; Sripada 2016), self-governing policies (Bratman 2000), the desire to make sense of oneself (Velleman 1992, 2009), and perceptions (or judgments) of the good (or best) (Watson 1975; Stump 1988; Ekstrom 1993; Mitchell-Yellin 2015).

The distinction between internal and external motivations allows identification theorists to enrich classical compatibilists’ understanding of constraint, while remaining compatibilists about free will and determinism. According to classical compatibilists, the only kind of constraint is external (e.g., broken cars and broken legs), but addictions and phobias seem just as threatening to free will. Identification theorists have the resources to concede that some constraints are internal. For example, they can argue that our agoraphobic Luke is not free in refraining from going outside even though this decision was caused by his strongest desires because he is not identified with his strongest desires. On compatibilist identification accounts, what matters for self-determination is not whether our actions are determined or undetermined, but whether they are brought about by motives with which the agent is identified: exercises of the power of self-determination consists in an agent’s actions being brought about, in part, by an agent’s motives with which she is identified. (It is important to note that while we have distinguished reasons-responsive accounts from identification accounts, there is nothing preventing one from combing both elements in a complete analysis of free will.)

Even if these reasons-responsive and identification compatibilist accounts of sourcehood might successfully side-step the Consequence Argument, they must come to grips with a second incompatibilist argument: the Manipulation Argument. The general problem raised by this line of argument is that whatever proposed compatibilist conditions for an agent \(S\)’s being free with respect to, and morally responsible for, some action \(\phi\), it will seem that agents can be manipulated into satisfying these conditions with respect to \(\phi\) and, yet, precisely because they are manipulated into satisfying these conditions, their freedom and responsibility seem undermined. The two most influential forms of the Manipulation Argument are Pereboom’s Four-case Argument (2001, ch. 4; 2014, ch. 4) and Mele’s Zygote Argument (2006, ch. 7. See Todd 2010, 2012 for developments of Mele’s argument). As the structure of Mele’s version is simpler, we will focus on it.

Imagine a goddess Diana who creates a zygote \(Z\) in Mary in some deterministic world. Suppose that Diana creates \(Z\) as she does because she wants Jones to be murdered thirty years later. From her knowledge of the laws of nature in her world and her knowledge of the state of the world just prior to her creating \(Z\), she knows that a zygote with precisely \(Z\)’s constitution located in Mary will develop into an agent Ernie who, thirty years later, will murder Jones as a result of his moderately reasons-responsive mechanism and on the basis of motivations with which he is identified (whatever those might be). Suppose Diana succeeds in her plan and Ernie murders Jones as a result of her manipulation.

Many judge that Ernie is not morally responsible for murdering Jones even though he satisfies both the reasons-responsive and identification criteria. There are two possible lines of reply open to compatibilists. On the soft-line reply, compatibilists attempt to show that there is a relevant difference between manipulated agents such as Ernie and agents who satisfy their account (McKenna 2008, 470). For example, Fischer and Ravizza propose a second condition on sourcehood: in addition to a mechanism’s being moderately reasons-responsive, an agent is morally responsible for the output of such a mechanism only if the agent has come to take responsibility for the mechanism, where an agent has taken responsibility for a mechanism \(M\) just in case (i) she believes that she is an agent when acting from \(M\), (ii) she believes that she is an apt target for blame and praise for acting from \(M\), and (iii) her beliefs specified in (i) and (ii) are “based, in an appropriate way, on [her] evidence” (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 238). The problem with this reply is that we can easily imagine Diana creating Ernie so that his murdering Jones is a result not only of a moderately reasons-responsive mechanism, but also a mechanism for which he has taken responsibility. On the hard-line reply, compatibilists concede that, despite initial appearances, the manipulated agent is free and morally responsible and attempt to ameliorate the seeming counterintuitiveness of this concession (McKenna 2008, 470–71). Here compatibilists might point out that the idea of being manipulated is worrisome only so long as the manipulators are interfering with an agent’s development. But if the manipulators simply create a person, and then allow that person’s life to unfold without any further inference, the manipulators’ activity is no threat to freedom (McKenna 2008; Fischer 2011; Sartorio 2016, ch. 5). (For other responses to the Manipulation Argument, see Kearns 2012; Sripada 2012; McKenna 2014.)

2.5 Libertarian Accounts of Sourcehood

Despite these compatibilist replies, to some the idea that the entirety of a free agent’s life can be determined, and in this way controlled, by another agent will seem incredible. Some take the lesson of the Manipulation Argument to be that no compatibilist account of sourcehood or self-determination is satisfactory. True sourcehood—the kind of sourcehood that can actually ground an agent’s freedom and responsibility—requires, so it is argued, that one’s action not be causally determined by factors beyond one’s control.

Libertarians, while united in endorsing this negative condition on sourcehood, are deeply divided concerning which further positive conditions may be required. It is important to note that while libertarians are united in insisting that compatibilist accounts of sourcehood are insufficient, they are not committed to thinking that the conditions of freedom spelled out in terms either of reasons-responsiveness or of identification are not necessary. For example, Stump (1988, 1996, 2010) builds a sophisticated libertarian model of free will out of resources originally developed within Frankfurt’s identification model (see also Ekstrom 1993, 2000; Franklin 2014) and nearly all libertarians agree that exercises of free will require agents to be reasons-responsive (e.g., Kane 1996; Clarke 2003, chs. 8–9; Franklin 2018, ch. 2). Moreover, while this section focuses on libertarian accounts of sourcehood, we remind readers that most (if not all) libertarians think that the freedom to do otherwise is also necessary for free will and moral responsibility.

There are three main libertarian options for understanding sourcehood or self-determination: non-causal libertarianism (Ginet 1990, 2008; McCann 1998; Lowe 2008; Goetz 2009; Pink 2017; Palmer 2021), event-causal libertarianism (Wiggins 1973; Kane 1996, 1999, 2011, 2016; Mele 1995, chs. 11–12; 2006, chs. 4–5; 2017; Ekstrom 2000, 2019; Clarke 2003, chs. 2–6; Franklin 2018), and agent-causal libertarianism (Reid 1788 [1969]; Chisholm 1966, 1976; Taylor 1966; O’Connor 2000; Clarke 1993; 1996; 2003, chs. 8–10; Griffith 2010; Steward 2012). Non-causal libertarians contend that exercises of the power of self-determination need not (or perhaps even cannot) be caused or causally structured. According to this view, we control our volition or choice simply in virtue of its being ours—its occurring in us. We do not exert a special kind of causality in bringing it about; instead, it is an intrinsically active event, intrinsically something we do. While there may be causal influences upon our choice, there need not be, and any such causal influence is wholly irrelevant to understanding why it occurs. Reasons provide an autonomous, non-causal form of explanation. Provided our choice is not wholly determined by prior factors, it is free and under our control simply in virtue of being ours. Non-causal views have failed to garner wide support among libertarians since, for many, self-determination seems to be an essentially causal notion (cf. Mele 2000 and Clarke 2003, ch. 2). This dispute hinges on the necessary conditions on the concept of causal power, and relatedly on whether power simpliciter admits causal and non-causal variants. For discussion, see O’Connor (2021).

Most libertarians endorse an event-causal or agent-causal account of sourcehood. Both these accounts maintain that exercises of the power of self-determination consist partly in the agent’s bringing about her choice or action, but they disagree on how to analyze an agent’s bringing about her choice. While event-causal libertarianism admits of different species, at the heart of this view is the idea that self-determining an action requires, at minimum, that the agent cause the action and that an agent’s causing his action is wholly reducible to mental states and other events involving the agent nondeviantly causing his action. Consider an agent’s raising his hand. According to the event-causal model at its most basic level, an agent’s raising his hand consists in the agent’s causing his hand to rise and his causing his hand to rise consists in apt mental states and events involving the agent—such as the agent’s desire to ask a question and his belief that he can ask a question by raising his hand—nondeviantly causing his hand to rise. (The nondeviance clause is required since it seems possible that an event be brought about by one’s desires and beliefs and yet not be self-determined, or even an action for that matter, due to the unusual causal path leading from the desires and beliefs to action. Imagine a would-be accomplice of an assassin believes that his dropping his cigarette is the signal for the assassin to shoot his intended victim and he desires to drop his cigarette and yet this belief and desire so unnerve him that he accidentally drops his cigarette. While the event of dropping the cigarette is caused by a relevant desire and belief it does not seem to be self-determined and perhaps is not even an action [cf. Davidson 1973].) To fully spell out this account, event-causal libertarians must specify which mental states and events are apt (cf. Brand 1979)—which mental states and events are the springs of self-determined actions—and what nondeviance consists in (cf. Bishop 1989). (We note that this has proven very difficult, enough so that some take the problem to spell doom for event-causal theories of action. Such philosophers [e.g., Taylor 1966 and Sehon 2005] take agential power to be conceptually and/or ontologically primitive and understand reasons explanations of action in irreducibly teleological terms. See Stout 2010 for a brisk survey of discussions of this topic.) For ease, in what follows we will assume that apt mental states are an agent’s reasons that favor the action.

Event-causal libertarians, of course, contend that self-determination requires more than nondeviant causation by agents’ reasons: for it is possible that agents’ actions in deterministic worlds are nondeviantly caused by apt mental states and events. Self-determination requires nondeterministic causation, in a nondeviant way, by an agent’s reasons. While historically many have thought that nondeterministic causation is impossible (Hobbes 1654 [1999], 1656 [1999]; Hume 1740 [1978], 1748 [1975]), with the advent of quantum physics and, from a very different direction, an influential essay by G.E.M. Anscombe (1971), it is now widely assumed that nondeterministic (or probabilistic) causation is possible. There are two importantly different ways to understand nondeterministic causation: as the causation of probability or as the probability of causation. Under the causation of probability model, a nondeterministic cause \(C\) causes (or causally contributes to) the objective probability of the outcome’s occurring rather than the outcome itself. On this account, \(S\)’s reasons do not cause his decision but there being a certain antecedent objective probability of its occurring, and the decision itself is uncaused. On the competing probability of causation model, a nondeterministic cause \(C\) causes the outcome of a nondeterministic process. Given that \(C\) is a nondeterministic cause of the outcome, it was possible given the exact same past and laws of nature that \(C\) not cause the outcome (perhaps because it was possible that some other event cause some other outcome)—the probability of this causal transaction’s occurring was less than \(1\). Given that event-causal libertarians maintain that self-determined actions, and thus free actions, must be caused, they are committed to the probability of causation model of nondeterministic causation (cf. Franklin 2018, 25–26). (We note that Balaguer [2010] is skeptical of the above distinction, and it is thus unclear whether he should best be classified as a non-causal or event-causal libertarian, though see Balaguer [2014] for evidence that it is best to treat him as a non-causalist.) Consequently, according to event-causal libertarians, when an agent \(S\) self-determines his choice \(\phi\), then \(S\)’s reasons \(r_1\) nondeterministically cause (in a nondeviant way) \(\phi\), and it was possible, given the past and laws, that \(r_1\) not have caused \(\phi\), but rather some of \(S\)’s other reasons \(r_2\) nondeterministically caused (in a nondeviant way) a different action \(\psi\).

Agent-causal libertarians contend that the event-causal picture fails to capture self-determination, for it fails to accord the agent with a power to settle what she does. Pereboom offers a forceful statement of this worry:

On an event-causal libertarian picture, the relevant causal conditions antecedent to the decision, i.e., the occurrence of certain agent-involving events, do not settle whether the decision will occur, but only render the occurrence of the decision about \(50\%\) probable. In fact, because no occurrence of antecedent events settles whether the decision will occur, and only antecedent events are causally relevant, nothing settles whether the decision will occur. (Pereboom 2014, 32; cf. Watson 1987, 1996; Clarke 2003 [ch. 8], 2011; Griffith 2010; Shabo 2011, 2013; Steward 2012 [ch. 3]; and Schlosser 2014); and for critical assessment, see Clarke 2019.

On the event-causal picture, the agent’s causal contribution to her actions is exhausted by the causal contribution of her reasons, and yet her reasons leave open which decisions she will make, and this seems insufficient for self-determination.

But what more must be added? Agent-causal libertarians maintain that self-determination requires that the agent herself play a causal role over and above the causal role played by her reasons. Some agent-causal libertarians deny that an agent’s reasons play any direct causal role in bringing about an agent’s self-determined actions (Chisholm 1966; O’Connor 2000, ch. 5), whereas others allow or even require that self-determined actions be caused in part by the agent’s reasons (Clarke 2003, ch. 9; Steward 2012, ch. 3). But all agent-causal libertarians insist that exercises of the power of self-determination do not reduce to nondeterministic causation by apt mental states: agent-causation does not reduce to event-causation.

Agent-causal libertarianism seems to capture an aspect of self-determination that neither the above compatibilists accounts nor event-causal libertarian accounts capture. (Some compatibilists even accept this and try to incorporate agent-causation into a compatibilist understanding of free will. See Markosian 1999, 2012; Nelkin 2011.) These accounts reduce the causal role of the self to states and events to which the agent is not identical (even if he is identified with them). But how can self-determination of my actions wholly reduce to determination of my actions by things other than the self? Richard Taylor nicely expresses this intuition: “If I believe that something not identical to myself was the cause of my behavior—some event wholly external to myself, for instance, or even one internal to myself, such as a nerve impulse, volition, or whatnot—then I cannot regard the behavior as being an act of mine, unless I further believed that I was the cause of that external or internal event” (1974, 55; cf. Franklin 2016).

Despite its powerful intuitive pull for some, many have argued that agent-causal libertarianism is obscure or even incoherent. The stock objection used to be that the very idea of agent-causation—causation by agents that is not reducible to causation by mental states and events involving the agent—is incoherent, but this objection has become less common due to pioneering work by Chisholm (1966, 1976), Taylor (1974), O’Connor (2000, 2011), Clarke (2003), and Steward 2012, ch. 8). More common objections now concern, first, how to understand the relationship between agent-causation and an agent’s reasons (or motivations in general), and, second, the empirical adequacy of agent-causal libertarianism. With respect to the first worry, it is widely assumed that the only (or at least best) way to understand reasons-explanation and motivational influence is within a causal account of reasons, where reasons cause our actions (Davidson 1963; Mele 1992). If agent-causal libertarians accept that self-determined actions, in addition to being agent-caused, must also be caused by agents’ reasons that favored those actions, then agent-causal libertarians need to explain how to integrate these causes (for a detailed attempt to do just this, see Clarke 2003, ch. 8). Given that these two causes seem distinct, is it not possible that the agent cause his decision to \(\phi\) and yet the agent’s reasons simultaneously cause an incompatible decision to \(\psi\)? If agent-causal libertarians side-step this difficult question by denying that reasons cause action, then they must explain how reasons can explain and motivate action without causing it; and this has turned out to be no easy task. (For more general attempts to understand reasons-explanation and motivation within a non-causal framework see Schueler 1995, 2003; Sehon 2005). For further discussion see the entry on incompatibilist (nondeterministic) theories of free will.

Finally, we note that some recent philosophers have questioned the presumed difference between event- and agent-causation by arguing that all causation is object or substance causation. They argue that the dominant tendency to understand ‘garden variety’ causal transactions in the world as relations between events is an unfortunate legacy of David Hume’s rejection of substance and causation as basic metaphysical categories. On the competing metaphysical picture of the world, the event or state of an object’s having some property such as mass is its having a causal power, which in suitable circumstances it exercises to bring about a characteristic effect. Applied to human agents in an account of free will, the account suggests a picture on which an agent’s having desires, beliefs, and intentions are rational powers to will particular courses of action, and where the agent’s willing is not determined in any one direction, she wills freely. An advantage for the agent-causalist who embraces this broader metaphysics is ‘ideological’ parsimony. For different developments and defenses of this approach, see Lowe (2008), Swinburne (2013), and O’Connor (2021); and for reason to doubt that a substance-causal metaphysics helps to allay skepticism concerning free will, see Clarke and Reed (2015).

3. Do We Have Free Will?

Most philosophers theorizing about free will take themselves to be attempting to analyze a near-universal power of mature human beings. But as we’ve noted above, there have been free will skeptics in both ancient and (especially) modern times. (Israel 2001 highlights a number of such skeptics in the early modern period.) In this section, we summarize the main lines of argument both for and against the reality of human freedom of will.

3.1 Arguments Against the Reality of Free Will

There are both a priori and empirical arguments against free will (See the entry on skepticism about moral responsibility). Several of these start with an argument that free will is incompatible with causal determinism, which we will not rehearse here. Instead, we focus on arguments that human beings lack free will, against the background assumption that freedom and causal determinism are incompatible.

The most radical a priori argument is that free will is not merely contingently absent but is impossible. Nietzsche 1886 [1966] argues to this effect, and more recently it has been argued by Galen Strawson (1986, ch. 2; 1994, 2002). Strawson associates free will with being ‘ultimately morally responsible’ for one’s actions. He argues that, because how one acts is a result of, or explained by, “how one is, mentally speaking” (\(M\)), for one to be responsible for that choice one must be responsible for \(M\). To be responsible for \(M\), one must have chosen to be \(M\) itself—and that not blindly, but deliberately, in accordance with some reasons \(r_1\). But for that choice to be a responsible one, one must have chosen to be such as to be moved by \(r_1\), requiring some further reasons \(r_2\) for such a choice. And so on, ad infinitum. Free choice requires an impossible infinite regress of choices to be the way one is in making choices.

There have been numerous replies to Strawson’s argument. Mele (1995, 221ff.) argues that Strawson misconstrues the locus of freedom and responsibility. Freedom is principally a feature of our actions, and only derivatively of our characters from which such actions spring. The task of the theorist is to show how one is in rational, reflective control of the choices one makes, consistent with there being no freedom-negating conditions. While this seems right, when considering those theories that make one’s free control to reside directly in the causal efficacy of one’s reasons (such as compatibilist reasons-responsive accounts or event-causal libertarianism), it is not beside the point to reflect on how one came to be that way in the first place and to worry that such reflection should lead one to conclude that true responsibility (and hence freedom) is undermined, since a complete distal source of any action may be found external to the agent. Clarke (2003, 170–76) argues that an effective reply may be made by indeterminists, and, in particular, by nondeterministic agent-causal theorists. Such theorists contend that (i) aspects of ‘how one is, mentally speaking’, fully explain an agent’s choice without causally determining it and (ii) the agent himself causes the choice that is made (so that the agent’s antecedent state, while grounding an explanation of the action, is not the complete causal source of it). Since the agent’s exercise of this power is causally undetermined, it is not true that there is a sufficient ‘ultimate’ source of it external to the agent. Finally, Mele (2006, 129–34, and 2017, 212–16) and O’Connor (2009b) suggest that freedom and moral responsibility come in degrees and grow over time, reflecting the fact that ‘how one is, mentally speaking’ is increasingly shaped by one’s own past choices. Furthermore, some choices for a given individual may reflect more freedom and responsibility than others, which may be the kernel of truth behind Strawson’s sweeping argument. (For discussion of the ways that nature, nurture, and contingent circumstances shape our behavior and raise deep issues concerning the extent of our freedom and responsibility, see Levy 2011 and Russell 2017, chs. 10–12.)

A second family of arguments against free will contend that, in one way or another, nondeterministic theories of freedom entail either that agents lack control over their choices or that the choices cannot be adequately explained. These arguments are variously called the ‘Mind’, ‘Rollback’, or ‘Luck’ argument, with the latter admitting of several versions. (For statements of such arguments, see van Inwagen 1983, ch. 4; 2000; Haji 2001; Mele 2006; Shabo 2011, 2013, 2020; Coffman 2015). We note that some philosophers advance such arguments not as parts of a general case against free will, but merely as showing the inadequacy of specific accounts of free will [see, e.g., Griffith 2010].) They each describe imagined cases—individual cases, or comparison of intra- or inter-world duplicate antecedent conditions followed by diverging outcomes—designed to elicit the judgment that the occurrence of a choice that had remained unsettled given all prior causal factors can only be a ‘matter of chance’, ‘random’, or ‘a matter of luck’. Such terms have been imported from other contexts and have come to function as quasi-technical, unanalyzed concepts in these debates, and it is perhaps more helpful to avoid such proxies and to conduct the debates directly in terms of the metaphysical notion of control and epistemic notion of explanation. Where the arguments question whether an undetermined agent can exercise appropriate control over the choice he makes, proponents of nondeterministic theories often reply that control is not exercised prior to, but at the time of the choice—in the very act of bringing it about (see, e.g., Clarke 2005 and O’Connor 2007). Where the arguments question whether undetermined choices can be adequately explained, the reply often consists in identifying a form of explanation other than the form demanded by the critic—a ‘noncontrastive’ explanation, perhaps, rather than a ‘contrastive’ explanation, or a species of contrastive explanation consistent with indeterminism (see, e.g., Kane 1999; Clarke, 2003, ch. 8; and Franklin 2011a; 2018, ch. 5).

We now consider empirical arguments against human freedom. Some of these stem from the physical sciences (while making assumptions concerning the way physical phenomena fix psychological phenomena) and others from neuroscience and psychology.

It used to be common for philosophers to argue that there is empirical reason to believe that the world in general is causally determined, and since human beings are parts of the world, they are too. Many took this to be strongly confirmed by the spectacular success of Isaac Newton’s framework for understanding the universe as governed everywhere by fairly simple, exceptionless laws of motion. But the quantum revolution of the early twentieth century has made that ‘clockwork universe’ image at least doubtful at the level of basic physics. While quantum mechanics has proven spectacularly successful as a framework for making precise and accurate predictions of certain observable phenomena, its implications for the causal structure of reality is still not well understood, and there are competing indeterministic and deterministic interpretations. See the entry on quantum mechanics for detailed discussion.) It is possible that indeterminacy on the small-scale, supposing it to be genuine, ‘cancels out’ at the macroscopic scale of birds and buildings and people, so that behavior at this scale is virtually deterministic. But this idea, once common, is now being challenged empirically, even at the level of basic biology. Furthermore, the social, biological, and medical sciences, too, are rife with merely statistical generalizations. Plainly, the jury is out on all these inter-theoretic questions. But that is just a way to say that current science does not decisively support the idea that everything we do is pre-determined by the past, and ultimately by the distant past, wholly out of our control. For discussion, see Balaguer (2009), Koch (2009), Roskies (2014), Ellis (2016).

Maybe, then, we are subject to myriad causal influences, but the sum total of these influences doesn’t determine what we do, they only make it more or less likely that we’ll do this or that. Now some of the a priori no-free-will arguments above center on nondeterministic theories according to which there are objective antecedent probabilities associated with each possible choice outcome. Why objective probabilities of this kind might present special problems beyond those posed by the absence of determinism has been insufficiently explored to date. (For brief discussion, see Vicens 2016 and O’Connor 2016.) But one philosopher who argues that there is reason to hold that our actions, if undetermined, are governed by objective probabilities and that this fact calls into question whether we act freely is Derk Pereboom (2001, ch. 3; 2014, ch. 3). Pereboom notes that our best physical theories indicate that statistical laws govern isolated, small-scale physical events, and he infers from the thesis that human beings are wholly physically composed that such statistical laws will also govern all the physical components of human actions. Finally, Pereboom maintains that agent-causal libertarianism offers the correct analysis of free will. He then invites us to imagine that the antecedent probability of some physical component of an action occurring is \(0.32\). If the action is free while not violating the statistical law, then, in a scenario with a large enough number of instances, this action would have to be freely chosen close to \(32\) percent of the time. This leads to the problem of “wild coincidences”:

if the occurrence of these physical components were settled by the choices of agent-causes, then their actually being chosen close to 32 percent of the time would amount to a coincidence no less wild than the coincidence of possible actions whose physical components have an antecedent probability of about 0.99 being chosen, over large enough number of instances, close to 99 percent of the time. The proposal that agent-caused free choices do not diverge from what the statistical laws predict for the physical components of our actions would run so sharply counter to what we would expect as to make it incredible. (2014, 67)

Clarke (2010) questions the implicit assumption that free agent-causal choices should be expected not to conform to physical statistical laws, while O’Connor (2009a) challenges the more general assumption that freedom requires that agent-causal choices not be governed by statistical laws of any kind, as they plausibly would be if the relevant psychological states/powers are strongly emergent from physical states of the human brain. Finally, Runyan 2018 argues that Pereboom’s case rests on an implausible empirical assumption concerning the evolution of objective probabilities concerning types of behavior over time.

Pereboom’s empirical basis for free will skepticism is very general. Others see support for free will skepticism from specific findings and theories in the human sciences. They point to evidence that we can be unconsciously influenced in the choices we make by a range of factors, including ones that are not motivationally relevant; that we can come to believe that we chose to initiate a behavior that in fact was artificially induced; that people subject to certain neurological disorders will sometimes engage in purposive behavior while sincerely believing that they are not directing them. Finally, a great deal of attention has been given to the work of neuroscientist Benjamin Libet (2002). Libet conducted some simple experiments that seemed to reveal the existence of ‘preparatory’ brain activity (the ‘readiness potential’) shortly before a subject engages in an ostensibly spontaneous action. (Libet interpreted this activity as the brain’s ‘deciding’ what to do before we are consciously settled on a course of action.) Wegner (2002) surveys all of these findings (some of which are due to his own work as a social psychologist) and argues on their basis that the experience of conscious willing is ‘an illusion’. For criticism of such arguments, see Mele (2009); Nahmias (2014); Mudrik et al. (2022); and several contributions to Maoz and Sinnott-Armstrong (2022). Libet’s interpretation of the readiness potential has come in for severe criticism. After extensive subsequent study, neuroscientists are uncertain what it signifies. For thorough review of the evidence, see Schurger et al. (2021).

While Pereboom and others point to these empirical considerations in defense of free will skepticism, other philosophers see them as reasons to favor a more modest free will agnosticism (Kearns 2015) or to promote revisionism about the ‘folk idea of free will’ (Vargas 2013; Nichols 2015).

3.2 Arguments for the Reality of Free Will

If one is a compatibilist, then a case for the reality of free will requires evidence for our being effective agents who for the most part are aware of what we do and why we are doing it. If one is an incompatibilist, then the case requires in addition evidence for causal indeterminism, occurring in the right locations in the process leading from deliberation to action. Many think that we already have third-personal ‘neutral’ scientific evidence for much of human behavior’s satisfying modest compatibilist requirements, such as Fischer and Ravizza’s reasons-responsiveness account. However, given the immaturity of social science and the controversy over whether psychological states ‘reduce’ in some sense to underlying physical states (and what this might entail for the reality of mental causation), this claim is doubtful. A more promising case for our satisfying (at least) compatibilist requirements on freedom is that effective agency is presupposed by all scientific inquiry and so cannot rationally be doubted (which fact is overlooked by some of the more extreme ‘willusionists’ such as Wegner).

However, effective intervention in the world (in scientific practice and elsewhere) does not (obviously) require that our behavior be causally undetermined, so the ‘freedom is rationally presupposed’ argument cannot be launched for such an understanding of freedom. Instead, incompatibilists usually give one of the following two bases for rational belief in freedom (both of which can be given by compatibilists, too).

First, philosophers have long claimed that we have introspective evidence of freedom in our experience of action, or perhaps of consciously attended or deliberated action. Augustine and Scotus, discussed earlier, are two examples among many. In recent years, philosophers have been more carefully scrutinizing the experience of agency and a debate has emerged concerning its contents, and in particular whether it supports an indeterministic theory of human free action. For discussion, see Deery et al. (2013), Guillon (2014), Horgan (2015), and Bayne (2017).

Second, philosophers (e.g., Reid 1788 [1969], Swinburne 2013) sometimes claim that our belief in the reality of free will is epistemically basic, or reasonable without requiring independent evidential support. Most philosophers hold that some beliefs have that status, on pain of our having no justified beliefs whatever. It is controversial, however, just which beliefs do because it is controversial which criteria a belief must satisfy to qualify for that privileged status. It is perhaps necessary that a basic belief be ‘instinctive’ (unreflectively held) for all or most human beings; that it be embedded in regular experience; and that it be central to our understanding of an important aspect of the world. Our belief in free will seems to meet these criteria, but whether they are sufficient is debated. (O’Connor 2019 proposes that free will belief is epistemically basic but defeasible.) Other philosophers defend a variation on this stance, maintaining instead that belief in the reality of moral responsibility is epistemically basic, and that since moral responsibility entails free will, or so it is claimed, we may infer the reality of free will (see, e.g., van Inwagen 1983, 206–13).

4. Theological Wrinkles

4.1 Free Will and God’s Power, Knowledge, and Goodness

A large portion of Western philosophical work on free will has been written within an overarching theological framework, according to which God is the ultimate source, sustainer, and end of all else. Some of these thinkers draw the conclusion that God must be a sufficient, wholly determining cause for everything that happens; all of them suppose that every creaturely act necessarily depends on the explanatorily prior, cooperative activity of God. It is also commonly presumed by philosophical theists that human beings are free and responsible (on pain of attributing evil in the world to God alone, and so impugning His perfect goodness). Hence, those who believe that God is omni-determining typically are compatibilists with respect to freedom and (in this case) theological determinism. Edwards (1754 [1957]) is a good example. But those who suppose that God’s sustaining activity (and special activity of conferring grace) is only a necessary condition on the outcome of human free choices need to tell a more subtle story, on which omnipotent God’s cooperative activity can be (explanatorily) prior to a human choice and yet the outcome of that choice be settled only by the choice itself. For important medieval discussions—the apex of philosophical reflection on theological concerns—see the relevant portions of Al-Ghazali IP, Aquinas BW and Scotus QAM. Three positions (given in order of logical strength) on God’s activity vis-à-vis creaturely activity were variously defended by thinkers of this area: mere conservationism, concurrentism, and occasionalism. These positions turn on subtle distinctions, which have recently been explored by Freddoso (1988), Kvanvig and McCann (1991), Koons (2002), Grant (2016 and 2019), and Judisch (2016).

Many suppose that there is a challenge to human freedom stemming not only from God’s perfect power but also from his perfect knowledge. A standard argument for the incompatibility of free will and causal determinism has a close theological analogue. Recall van Inwagen’s influential formulation of the ‘Consequence Argument’:

If determinism is true, then our acts are the consequences of the laws of nature and events in the remote past. But it is not up to us what went on before we were born, and neither is it up to us what the laws of nature are. Therefore, the consequences of these things (including our present acts) are not up to us. (van Inwagen 1983, 16)

And now consider an argument that turns on God’s comprehensive and infallible knowledge of the future:

If infallible divine foreknowledge is true, then our acts are the (logical) consequences of God’s beliefs in the remote past. (Since God cannot get things wrong, his believing that something will be so entails that it will be so.) But it is not up to us what beliefs God had before we were born, and neither is it up to us that God’s beliefs are necessarily true. Therefore, the consequences of these things (including our present acts) are not up to us.

An excellent discussion of these arguments in tandem and attempts to point to relevant disanalogies between causal determinism and infallible foreknowledge may be found in the introduction to Fischer (1989). See also the entry on foreknowledge and free will.

Another issue concerns how knowledge of God, the ultimate Good, would impact human freedom. Many philosophical theologians, especially the medieval Aristotelians, were drawn to the idea that human beings cannot but will that which they take to be an unqualified good. (As noted above, Duns Scotus is an exception to this consensus, as were Ockham and Suarez subsequently, but their dissent is limited.) Hence, if there is an afterlife, in which humans ‘see God face to face,’ they will inevitably be drawn to Him. Following Pascal, Murray (1993, 2002) argues that a good God would choose to make His existence and character less than certain for human beings, for the sake of preserving their freedom. (He will do so, the argument goes, at least for a period of time in which human beings participate in their own character formation.) If it is a good for human beings that they freely choose to respond in love to God and to act in obedience to His will, then God must maintain an ‘epistemic distance’ from them lest they be overwhelmed by His goodness or power and respond out of necessity, rather than freedom. (See also the other essays in Howard-Snyder and Moser 2002.)

If it is true that God withholds our ability to be certain of his existence for the sake of our freedom, then it is natural to conclude that humans will lack freedom in heaven. And it is anyways common to traditional Jewish, Christian, and Muslim theologies to maintain that humans cannot sin in heaven. Even so, traditional Christian theology at least maintains that human persons in heaven are free. What sort of freedom is in view here, and how does it relate to mundane freedom? Two good recent discussions of these questions are Pawl and Timpe (2009) and Tamburro (2017).

4.2 God’s Freedom

Finally, there is the question of the freedom of God himself. Perfect goodness is an essential, not acquired, attribute of God. God cannot lie or be in any way immoral in His dealings with His creatures (appearances notwithstanding). Unless we take the minority position on which this is a trivial claim, since whatever God does definitionally counts as good, this appears to be a significant, inner constraint on God’s freedom. Did we not contemplate immediately above that human freedom would be curtailed by our having an unmistakable awareness of what is in fact the Good? And yet is it not passing strange to suppose that God should be less than perfectly free?

One suggested solution to this puzzle takes as its point of departure the distinction noted in section 2.3 between the ability to do otherwise and sourcehood, proposing that the core metaphysical feature of freedom is being the ultimate source, or originator, of one’s choices. For human beings or any created persons who owe their existence to factors outside themselves, the only way their acts of will could find their ultimate origin in themselves is for such acts not to be determined by their character and circumstances. For if all my willings were wholly determined, then if we were to trace my causal history back far enough, we would ultimately arrive at external factors that gave rise to me, with my particular genetic dispositions. My motives at the time would not be the ultimate source of my willings, only the most proximate ones. Only by there being less than deterministic connections between external influences and choices, then, is it be possible for me to be an ultimate source of my activity, concerning which I may truly say, “the buck stops here.”

As is generally the case, things are different on this point in the case of God. As Anselm observed, even if God’s character absolutely precludes His performing certain actions in certain contexts, this will not imply that some external factor is in any way a partial origin of His willings and refrainings from willing. Indeed, this would not be so even if he were determined by character to will everything which He wills. God’s nature owes its existence to nothing. Thus, God would be the sole and ultimate source of His will even if He couldn’t will otherwise.

Well, then, might God have willed otherwise in any respect? The majority view in the history of philosophical theology is that He indeed could have. He might have chosen not to create anything at all. And given that He did create, He might have created any number of alternatives to what we observe. But there have been noteworthy thinkers who argued the contrary position, along with others who clearly felt the pull of the contrary position even while resisting it. The most famous such thinker is Leibniz (1710 [1985]), who argued that God, being both perfectly good and perfectly powerful, cannot fail to will the best possible world. Leibniz insisted that this is consistent with saying that God is able to will otherwise, although his defense of this last claim is notoriously difficult to make out satisfactorily. Many read Leibniz, malgré lui, as one whose basic commitments imply that God could not have willed other than He does in any respect.

One might challenge Leibniz’s reasoning on this point by questioning the assumption that there is a uniquely best possible Creation (an option noted by Adams 1987, though he challenges instead Leibniz’s conclusion based on it). One way this could be is if there is no well-ordering of worlds: some pairs of worlds are sufficiently different in kind that they are incommensurate with each other (neither is better than the other, nor are they equal) and no world is better than either of them. Another way this could be is if there is no upper limit on goodness of worlds: for every possible world God might have created, there are others (infinitely many, in fact) which are better. If such is the case, one might argue, it is reasonable for God to arbitrarily choose which world to create from among those worlds exceeding some threshold value of overall goodness.

However, William Rowe (2004) has countered that the thesis that there is no upper limit on goodness of worlds has a very different consequence: it shows that there could not be a morally perfect Creator! For suppose our world has an on-balance moral value of \(n\) and that God chose to create it despite being aware of possibilities having values higher than \(n\) that He was able to create. It seems we can now imagine a morally better Creator: one having the same options who chooses to create a better world. For critical replies to Rowe, see Almeida (2008, ch. 1), Kray (2010), and Zimmerman (2018).

Finally, Norman Kretzmann (1997, 220–25) has argued in the context of Aquinas’s theological system that there is strong pressure to say that God must have created something or other, though it may well have been open to Him to create any of a number of contingent orders. The reason is that there is no plausible account of how an absolutely perfect God might have a resistible motivation—one consideration among other, competing considerations—for creating something rather than nothing. (It obviously cannot have to do with any sort of utility, for example.) The best general understanding of God’s being motivated to create at all—one which in places Aquinas himself comes very close to endorsing—is to see it as reflecting the fact that God’s very being, which is goodness, necessarily diffuses itself. Perfect goodness will naturally communicate itself outwardly; God who is perfect goodness will naturally create, generating a dependent reality that imperfectly reflects that goodness. Wainwright (1996) discusses a somewhat similar line of thought in the Puritan thinker Jonathan Edwards. Alexander Pruss (2016), however, raises substantial grounds for doubt concerning this line of thought; O’Connor (2022) offers a rejoinder.


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