Knowledge How

First published Tue Apr 20, 2021

In introductory classes to epistemology, we are taught to distinguish between three different kinds of knowledge. The first kind is acquaintance knowledge: we know our mothers, our friends, our pets, etc., by being acquainted with them. The second kind is knowledge of facts, propositional knowledge, or knowledge-that: this is the sort of knowledge we acquire when we learn that, say, Ithaca is in New York State or that Turin is located in Italy. It is customary to add to the list a third kind of knowledge that is supposed to be distinct both from acquaintance knowledge and from propositional knowledge. One possesses this knowledge when one can be truly described as knowing how to do something: play the piano, make a pie, walk, speak, create, build, and so on.

The distinction between knowledge-how and knowledge-that was brought to scrutiny in analytic philosophy by Ryle in his seminal The Concept of Mind (1949), where he raised some of the now classical objections to the so-called “intellectualist legend”: the view that knowledge-how amounts to knowledge-that. Ryle instead advocated an “anti-intellectualist” view of knowledge-how according to which knowledge-how and knowledge-that are distinct kinds of knowledge, and manifestations of knowledge-how are not necessarily manifestations of knowledge-that. This anti-intellectualism has been the received view among philosophers for a long time. Even psychologists and neuroscientists have explicitly appealed to Ryle’s classical distinction when discussing their empirical findings (e.g., Cohen & Squire 1980; Anderson 1983). Nevertheless, in the last twenty years, a renewed interest by epistemologists in the nature of knowledge-how has brought new life to the debate, where new versions of intellectualism and anti-intellectualism have been developed and argued for. The debate is partly epistemological: is knowledge-how an altogether distinct kind of knowledge, different from knowledge-that? But it is also about a psychological question: what kind of psychological state is knowledge-how? The goal of this entry is to overview the debate between intellectualists and anti-intellectualists, while highlighting the implications of this debate for related questions concerning intelligence, cognition, language, and skills.

This entry starts by looking at some classical arguments against intellectualism about knowledge-how: the regress argument (section 1), the insufficiency argument (section 2), and the gradability argument (section 3). Then two motivating arguments for intellectualism are considered: the linguistic argument (section 4) and the action theory argument (section 5). Section 6 overviews the recent epistemological debate on whether knowledge-how and propositional knowledge have the same epistemic profile. Section 7 discusses the cognitive science argument against intellectualism. Section 8 surveys what forms anti-intellectualism about knowledge-how has taken in the recent literature. Section 9 looks at the relation between knowledge-how and skills. Section 10 discusses knowledge-how and other related topics.

1. The Regress Argument

Ryle’s most famous objection to intellectualist accounts of skills and knowledge-how is that they lead to a vicious regress:

The consideration of propositions is itself an operation the execution of which can be more or less intelligent, less or more stupid. But if, for any operation to be intelligently executed, a prior theoretical operation had first to be performed and performed intelligently, it would be a logical impossibility for anyone ever to break into the circle. (1949: 19)

Ryle concludes:

“Intelligent” cannot be defined in terms of “intellectual” or “knowing how” in terms of “knowing that”, (1949: 20)

on pain of a vicious regress (see also Ryle 1946: 22). Exactly how to reconstruct Ryle’s argument is a matter of controversy (Stanley & Williamson 2001; Stanley 2011b; Bengson & Moffett 2011a; Cath 2013; Fantl 2011; Kremer 2020). The next sections discuss different possible ways of understanding the regress challenge and possible responses on behalf of intellectualism.

1.1 The Contemplation Argument

The contemplation argument assumes for reductio that for any action to be intelligently executed, a prior theoretical operation of “contemplating” has to be performed first :

Contemplation premise (CP): In order to employ one’s knowledge that p, one must contemplate the proposition p.

Assume in addition the following definition of intellectualism:

Strong intellectualism (SI): For an action Φ, knowing how to Φ consists in knowing some proposition p.

And assume further that in performing an action Φ, one employs one’s knowledge-how to Φ:

Action premise (AP): For an action Φ, if one Φs, then one employs one’s knowledge-how to Φ.

With these premises the regress goes as follows. Suppose that one performs an action Φ:

  1. By AP, one employs one’s knowledge-how to Φ.
  2. By SI, one employs the knowledge that p, for some p.
  3. So, by CP, one contemplates p.
  4. But contemplating p is an action.
  5. So by AP, if one contemplates p, one employs one’s knowledge-how to contemplate p.
  6. By CP, one ought to contemplate another proposition q, for some q.

And so on.

The contemplation argument aims at showing the falsity of SI, by showing that its truth, together with the truth of AP and CP, triggers an infinite regress. If SI were true, then performing any action would require contemplating an infinite number of propositions of ever-increasing complexity. On the assumption that this cannot be done in a finite amount of time, the argument goes, accepting SI would lead to the clearly absurd conclusion that no agent could ever perform an action within a finite time (see Fantl 2011: 122).

The question is whether AP and CP are plausible premises. Following Ginet (1975), Stanley & Williamson (2001) argue that AP is plausible only if the relevant Φ is an intentional action. To use one of Ryle’s (1949: 33) own examples, if a clumsy person inadvertently tumbles, it does not follow that in doing so, they employ their knowledge-how to tumble. By contrast, the clown employs their knowledge-how when they tumble on purpose. Nevertheless, if we restrict AP to intentional actions, then the regress can be stopped by observing that contemplating a proposition might happen non-intentionally. For example, when I employ my knowledge that there is a red light ahead by applying the brakes, I need not intentionally contemplate the proposition that there is a red light ahead. Correspondingly, if contemplating a proposition can be done non-intentionally, such contemplation is not the kind of action that requires us to know how to perform it—therefore, it does not trigger the restricted AP and the regress is blocked altogether. Some object that the contemplation in this example might be intentional but unconscious (as suggested by Noë 2005: 282). But it is unclear what reasons there are for thinking that every time one employs one’s knowledge, one intentionally contemplates the relevant proposition (Cath 2013: 365–366).

The Contemplation Argument also assumes CP—i.e., that in order to employ propositional knowledge when acting, one ought to contemplate the relevant proposition. Against CP, Ginet (1975: 7) observes that one might manifest one’s knowledge that one can get the door open by turning the knob and pushing it (as well as my knowledge that there is a door there) by performing that operation quite automatically as one leaves the room; and one may do this without formulating (in one’s mind or out loud) that proposition or any other relevant proposition. Ginet concludes that Ryle’s original argument does not teach us that intellectualism about knowledge-how is false but only that knowledge can be acted upon and manifested without requiring any contemplation on the part of the agent. Indeed, some scholars think that this last weaker claim was the only goal of Ryle’s original argument (Rosefeldt 2004; Sax 2010).

1.2 The Employment Regress

However, CP is not needed in order to trigger a regress. Perhaps the argument can be salvaged by replacing contemplation with a weaker relation. Consider replacing CP with EP:

The Employment Premise (EP): If one employs knowledge that p, one employs knowledge-how to employ one’s knowledge that p (and one’s state of knowledge that p is distinct from one’s state of knowing how to employ one’s knowledge that p). (Cath 2013: 367–8)

The regress is triggered as before. Suppose one Φs:

  1. By AP, one employs one’s knowledge-how to Φ.
  2. By SI, that amounts to employing one’s knowledge that p, for some p.
  3. By EP, one needs to employ one’s knowledge-how to employ one’s knowledge that p.
  4. But employing one’s knowledge-how is an action.
  5. By AP, one employs one’s knowledge-how about employing our knowledge-how to employ one’s knowledge that p.
  6. By SI, that amounts to employing one’s knowledge of q, for some q.

and so on.

Intellectualists might object to EP in ways similar to how CP was resisted—i.e., that not every action requires for its performance the employment of one’s knowledge-how: only intentional actions do, as the clown example suggests. According to this line of reply, employing one’s propositional knowledge might be more like a reflex in response to stimuli, rather than an action. Further, this version of the regress challenge may be accused of assuming that knowledge-that is “behaviorally inert” and needs to be intentionally selected or employed in order to be manifested. Yet, intellectualists have independent reasons to resist this picture (Stalnaker 2012). On the other hand, if Ryleans insist that employments of knowledge-that are actions of sort, it seems there is no principled reason why employments of knowledge-how would not be subject to the same requirement. Therefore, it looks like any regress generated for the intellectualist is generated for Ryle as well (Stanley 2011b: 14, 26; though see Fantl 2011 for a possible difference between the regress generated for Ryle and the regress generated for intellectualism).

1.3 A Revival of the Regress Argument

A variety of actions—say, remembering to check the car’s blindspot when reversing—can be intelligent even though they are not intentional. Or one might manifest intelligence through processes—e.g., by coming to understand a difficult proposition, without them even being actions. If one accepts that intelligent performances, whether intentional or not, are necessarily guided by knowledge-how, one might try to recast the regress argument by replacing AP with IPP (Weatherson 2017):

Intelligent performance premise (IPP): For a performance Φ, if one Φs intelligently, one manifests one’s knowledge-how to Φ.

Now it seems plausible that one’s manifestation of propositional knowledge can be intelligent in some cases but not in others. For example, one might manifest one’s knowledge intelligently by bringing to bear one maxim that is appropriate instead of any other that is not to the particular situation which the agent faces. By IPP, if one’s manifestation of knowledge-that in a particular situation is intelligent, it requires one’s manifesting one’s knowledge-how. If intellectualism is true, that would in turn require manifesting one’s knowledge-that. If this manifesting of propositional knowledge is intelligent too, though unintentional, it requires knowledge-how. And so on. We get an infinite regress if one accepts that manifesting propositional knowledge can be an intelligent performance, also when it is not an intentional action. (For similar lines of argument, see also Fridland 2013, 2015; Löwenstein 2016: 276–80; Small 2017: 62–3).

Intellectualists might respond by distinguishing two senses in which a performance can be intelligent and two corresponding senses of manifestation, only one of which gives rise to the regress. First, an intelligent action might manifest one’s knowledge-how in the case that it is guided by this knowledge-how. On this reading, the regress is triggered. But there is also another—epistemic—sense in which an intelligent action manifests knowledge-how as long as it provides evidence for that knowledge-how. For example, the rings on a tree provide evidence for the tree’s age (hence manifest its age in the epistemic sense) but the rings on a tree are not guided by its age. Crucially, the regress does not arise on the epistemic sense of manifestation. Checking the blindspot might be intelligent in this epistemic sense of manifesting —providing evidence of—knowledge-how. Yet, this epistemic manifestation itself is not something that qualifies as intelligent or unintelligent.

1.4 Lewis Carroll’s Regress

A less discussed regress that can be found in Ryle (1946: 6–7) is an adaptation of Lewis Carroll’s (1895) regress. Suppose a student understands the premises of an argument and also its conclusion but fails to see that the conclusion follows. In order to help him, the teacher teaches him another proposition P—i.e., if the premises are true, then the conclusion is true. The student understands this and yet fails to see how from the premises and the additional premise P the conclusion follows. A second hypothetical proposition is added to his store, the proposition that if the premises is true, the conclusion is true too. The student still fails to see. And so on. Ryle concludes:

Knowing a rule of inference is not possessing a bit of extra information but being able to perform an intelligent operation. Knowing a rule is knowing how. It is realized in performances which conform to the rule, not in theoretical citations of it. (1946: 7)

One might respond (cf. Stanley 2011b) to this regress challenge that the student does not really understand the premises of an argument by modus ponens (p, if p then q), for that involves grasping the concept of a conditional, and on an inferentialist understanding (Boghossian 1996, 2003), that would dispose one to accept the conclusion of an inference by that rule. Inferentialism about meaning is, however, a controversial doctrine (for several criticisms, see Williamson 2011, 2012). Other replies might be available. Maybe the student does not represent the rule practically (see next section), or she is simply incapable of granting that the rule applies to this case, for that would explain her failure to be appropriately disposed to arrive at the conclusion, given the truth of the premises. (For yet other versions of the regress challenge, see Noë 2005: 285–6 and Hetherington 2006).

2. The Sufficiency Argument

The claim that knowledge-how is a kind of knowledge-that encounters an immediate incredulous stare: how could propositional knowledge be sufficient for knowing how to do something? Ryle (1946: 5) himself poses this challenge as a starting point for his argument:

Obviously there is no truth or set of truths of which we could say “If only the stupid player had been informed of them, he would be a clever player”, or “When once he had been apprised of these truths he would play well”.

Certainly, one might know all the propositions that are relevant to how to perform a task, and yet fail to know how to perform it: knowledge-that does not seem sufficient for knowledge-how (see also Ryle 1940: 38–9).

In order to assess this objection, it is helpful to start with a toy intellectualist theory, on which knowledge-how is a matter of knowing, for some way or method to perform a task w, that w is in fact a way to perform it. In section 4, we will see in more detail a linguistic argument for identifying knowledge-how with this sort of propositional knowledge (Stanley & Williamson 2001; Snowdon 2004). How could, the insufficiency objection goes, one know how to perform a task just in virtue of knowing a proposition about a way to perform it? Consider the following counterexample to intellectualism:

Swimming: Suppose I look at a swimmer’s swimming, and my swimming instructor pointing to the swimmer says to me, “That is a way in which you could swim too”. I believe my instructor and we may suppose that what she said is in fact true. I may thereby come to know a true answer to the question “How could I swim?” However, in the relevant sense, I may not have come to know how to swim. If I took a swimming test, I might still fail it. If thrown in the swimming pool, I might still drown. I do not know how to swim in the relevant sense and yet I do know a true proposition about how to swim.

In response to this sort of counterexample, intellectualists often appeal to “practical modes of presentation”: knowing a proposition observationally or demonstratively is not the same as knowing it practically. Knowledge-how is, at least in part, a matter of representing propositions about tasks and ways of executing tasks in a distinctively practical fashion. For one to know how to swim, in the relevant sense, one must know of a way to swim represented under a distinctive practical mode of presentation, which is essentially different from the observational or demonstrative mode of presentation in Swimming. This kind of practically represented propositional knowledge is what (some) intellectualists call knowledge-how and is what is absent in the example above.

The notion of practical modes of presentation has received several criticisms (Schiffer 2002; Koethe 2002; Noë 2005; Fantl 2011; Glick 2015), on the ground that it seems excessively obscure or even question begging. Koethe (2002: 327) worries that practical modes of presentation smuggle in an antecedent notion of knowledge-how (though see Fantl 2008: 461 for a response). This widespread skepticism about practical modes of presentation has led some intellectualists to explore ways of responding to the insufficiency objection that do not appeal to practical modes of presentation. For example, Stanley (2011b: 126) considers answering the sufficiency challenge in Swimming by appealing to the context-sensitivity of the ability modal “could”. According to Stanley, depending on how the context for the modal is restricted, “That is how you could swim” could mean either that that is how you can swim given your current physical state or that that is how you could swim after training. But coming to know that that is how I could swim after training is clearly not enough for me to come to know how to swim now. Instead, the argument goes, what one needs to know is the former proposition: that that is a way to swim given my current physical state.

Yet, it is unclear that even this response works. Consider a variant of the previous scenario, where Mary is a skilled swimmer who is one day affected by memory loss and so forgets how she is able to swim (Glick 2015). Nothing has changed in Mary’s physical state: she is still able to swim but she just has forgotten how she is able to swim. Suppose she is told, by looking at a recording of her swimming the day before, that that is how she can in fact swim given her current physical state. She might come to know how she is in fact able to swim (just like that!). Yet, she would still fail to know how to swim in the relevant sense and still drown if thrown into the pool.

So, practical modes of representation are hard to escape if intellectualism is to be defended against the sufficiency objection. To assuage concerns about the intelligibility of practical modes of presentation, Pavese (2015b) proposes we think of them along the lines of practical senses, which in turn can be modeled after computer programs. Programs determine an output, just like Fregean senses determine a referent; and they are practical in that they break down a task into the smallest parts that the system can execute (the primitive operations of the system as well as into primitive ways of combining those parts) so they ground the ability to perform a complex task in terms of the ability to perform all of its parts. On this view, if one represents a task practically, one represents all of its parts, and the combination of those parts, through instructions that one has the ability to execute. So representing practically a task entails that one has the ability to perform the corresponding task. (For a critical discussion of practical ways of thinking, see Mosdell 2019. Habgood-Coote 2018c argues that the classical generality problem for reliabilism (Feldman 1985; Conee & Feldman 1998) arises for intellectualism.)

The notion of distinctively practical concepts is motivated by work outside the debate on intellectualism about knowledge-how. Other scholars have discussed concepts that are practical in that they dissociate from semantic and observational concepts and play a central role in explaining behavior. Peacocke (1986: 49–50) talks of “action-based ways of thinking”, Israel, Perry,and Tutiya (1993: 534) of “executable ideas”, and Pacherie (2000, 2006) of “action concepts”. Mylopoulous and Pacherie (2017) suggest that executable action concepts might be needed to overcome the interface problem—the problem of how cognitive representations (intentions) interact with motor representations (Butterfill & Sinigaglia 2014). Pavese (forthcoming-b) advances an empirical-functional case for practical concepts, arguing that they are needed to explain a distinctive sort of productive reasoning. Yet, other intellectualists argue we can dispense with practical modes of presentation altogether and instead appeal to ways of knowing that are distinctively practical or executive (Waights Hickman 2019; Cath 2020).

Levy (2017) argues that a form of intellectualism that only invokes practical ways of thinking and practical concepts might not be able to explain skillful motor behavior, for motor representations of the sort required for skilled action and posited by cognitive psychologists are non-conceptual. Along similar lines, Fridland (2014, 2017) argues motor control and motor representation cannot be countenanced by Stanley & Williamson’s (2001) and Stanley’s (2011b) forms of intellectualism. So, more promising forms of intellectualism might have to invoke, in addition to practical ways of thinking, non-conceptual practical representations (Pavese 2019; Krakauer 2020). Just like perceptual concepts are distinguished from non-conceptual perceptual representations, we might distinguish between practical conceptual representations and practical non-conceptual representations. Motor representations would fall under the latter heading. Nonconceptual motor representations also represent practically, as they break down a task in terms of the most basic operations that a system can perform.

3. The Gradability Argument

Ryle (1949: 46) formulates the argument from gradability thus:

we never speak of a person having partial knowledge of a fact or truth … it is proper and normal to speak of a person knowing in part how to do something. Learning how or improving in ability is not like learning that or acquiring information. Truths can be imparted, procedures can only be inculcated, and while inculcation is a gradual process, imparting is relatively sudden.

As Kremer (2020: 102) points out, here Ryle is making two distinguishable points: (i) ascriptions of knowledge-how are gradable, whereas ascriptions of know-that are not; (ii) the gradability of these ascriptions is explained by the fact that knowledge-how must come in degrees, because learning-how brings improvement in knowledge-how. There is no parallel phenomenon in learning-that, and so no need for degrees of knowledge-that. Others have followed Ryle in thinking that the gradability argument shows intellectualism wrong. For example, Bengson and Moffett (2011b) argue that because knowledge-how is gradable, knowledge-how is more similar to acquaintance knowledge, which also comes in degrees (see also Ryle 1949: 46; Wiggins 2012; Santorio 2016; Kremer 2020: 102).

Pavese (2017) distinguishes between two kinds of gradability of knowledge-how ascriptions: one might know how to do something in part or entirely (quantitative gradability) or one might know how to do something better than somebody else (qualitative gradability). Crucially, these two kinds of gradability are also present more generally in other knowledge-wh (knowledge-when, who, why, where) ascriptions, which do seem to reduce to propositional knowledge. For instance, one might know in part who came to the party (Lahiri 1991, 2000; Roberts 2009) or know a better answer to that question than somebody else (see also Stanley 2011b: 31–5). If parts of an answer are propositions, then knowing an answer might still amount to knowledge of all of its parts. Knowing in part an answer would then amount to knowing at least one of the propositions that is part of that answer. Similarly, knowing a better answer amounts to knowing a proposition that better answers the relevant question. If this is true of other knowledge-wh ascriptions, it is certainly plausible that it is true for knowledge-how. One might know how to Φ in part by knowing only certain (propositional) parts of the answer to “how does one Φ?” and one might know a better answer to that question than someone else.

This response to the first part of the gradability objection inspires a further response to the second part concerning learning-how. Suppose that knowledge-how is a matter of knowing a practical answer, where a practical answer encompasses a practical representation for a task or a way to Φ (section 2). As we have seen, practically representing requires possessing certain practical capacities and entails certain sorts of abilities. On this picture, one might gradually learn how to perform a task by gradually learning a practical answer to that question, for one requires time and practice to master a practical representation of how to perform the task. Thus, gradual learning may be compatible with the intellectualist picture, if it amounts to gradually coming to learn more parts of a practical answer.

4. The Linguistic Argument

Intellectualism has been motivated on the basis of a linguistic argument concerning knowledge-how ascriptions in English (Vendler 1972; Stanley & Williamson 2001; Snowdon 2004; Stanley 2011b, 2011c). Begin by noticing that (1) is remarkably similar to (2)–(3) (“finite knowledge wh ascriptions” as they embed a complement with a finitival verb) and to (4)–(5) (“infinitive knowledge-wh ascriptions” as they embed a complement with an infinitival verb):

Marie knows how to play the piano
Mary knows where her piano is located in the house.
Mary knows who can play her piano.
Mary knows what to do in case of an emergency.
Mary knows where to find an Italian newspaper.

According to the standard syntactic analysis, (2)–(5) have an interrogative as complement—“where is her piano located in the house?”, “who can play the piano?”, “what to do in case of an emergency?” are all interrogatives. Having said this, in broad outline, the linguistic argument for intellectualism has three steps. The first step is to follow the syntactic cues from (1)–(5) and identify the logical form of “S knows how to Φ” with that of “S knows + interrogative Q (= “how to Φ”). Call this premise Logical Form. The second step is to accept the orthodox semantics of knowledge-wh ascriptions, according to which in “S knows + interrogative Q”, Q denotes a question (C. Baker 1968) and according to which “S knows + Q” is true just in case S knows a proposition answering to the question expressed by Q. Call this premise Semantics for Knowledge-Wh (cf., among many others, Hamblin 1958, 1973; Hintikka 1976; Karttunen 1977; Heim 1994; Groenendijk & Stokhof 1982, 1997; and Higginbotham 1996). Finally, the third step is to extend this semantics to knowledge-how ascriptions, such that knowing how to Φ requires knowing a proposition that answers the question “how can one Φ?”

Next section (4.1) looks in some more detail to the intellectualist analysis of the truth conditions for knowledge-how ascriptions. The section after next (4.2) discusses several objections to the linguistic argument.

4.1 The Details of the Intellectualist Proposal

The linguistic argument concludes that Intellectualism is true:

Intellectualism about knowing how S knows how to Φ just in case S knows a proposition answering the question “how to Φ”.

But what is the proposition that one knows by knowing how to Φ?

First, note that the subject of the infinitival construction (“How to Φ”), or PRO, can either be interpreted de se (de se PRO) or generically (generic PRO). According to the first interpretation, that an agent knows how to perform a ski stunt requires their knowing how to perform a ski stunt themselves. According to the latter interpretation, it requires knowing how one (as a generic agent or any other agent) would perform a ski stunt. When it comes to ascriptions of knowledge-how, we care about de se, and not generic, readings of knowing how. If an agent knows how to Φ in the relevant sense, they know how to Φ themselves.

Secondly, infinitival interrogatives such as “how to Φ” and “what to Φ” are ambiguous between a deontic reading (how to Φ = how one should Φ; what to Φ = what one should do) and an ability reading (how to Φ = how one could Φ; what to Φ = what one could do). The deontic reading does not seem relevant when we ascribe knowledge-how. Hence the relevant reading must be an ability reading. Joining these two disambiguations, the truth conditions of knowledge-how ascriptions are (cf. Schroeder 2012):

(Truth conditions) “S knows how to Φ” is true just in case S knows a proposition answering the question “How could they themselves Φ?”

Now, what counts as an answer to the question? Linguists distinguish between different kinds of answers that one might give to a question. An exhaustive answer to “How could S Φ?” would specify all the ways in which S could Φ; a mention-some answer, instead, would specify only one way in which S could Φ. For example, an exhaustive answer to the question “How could S make pasta?” would specify all different recipes for making pasta. A mention-some answer to the same question, instead, would specify (at least) only one recipe. When we ascribe knowledge-how, we don’t expect people to know all the possible ways of performing the relevant task. For example, “Mary knows how to make pasta” can be true, even if Mary only knows one recipe for pasta. This gives us the following truth conditions:

Intellectualism*S knows how to Φ” is true just in case S knows, for some way w of Φ-ing, that w is a way he himself could Φ.

As we have seen in section 2, in addition to knowing that a way to Φ is a way to Φ, one needs to think of that way under a practical mode of presentation. Let Pr be a practical way of thinking of a way and let way of Φ-ing be a way of thinking of the property of being a way of Φ-ing; finally let ⦼ be a way of composing ways of thinking into a proposition. Then <Pr ⦼ way of Φ-ing> is the practical proposition that one comes to know when coming to know how to Φ. On how to implement Fregean senses in the compositional semantics, see Yalcin (2015).

4.2 First Group of Objections

Several philosophers have objected that intellectualists are giving undue weight to linguistic considerations and that other considerations, coming from the cognitive sciences, should be taken into account too, when thinking about the nature of knowledge-how (Noë 2005, 2011; Devitt 2011; Brown 2013; Johnson 2006; Glick 2011; Roth & Cummins 2011). It does not follow from this worry that the linguistic argument ought to be dismissed as lacking any evidential value. Consider an analogy. Arguably, the best theory of beliefs and desires is one on which these are propositional attitudes. This theory is compatible with how we ascribe beliefs and desires (i.e., ascriptions of beliefs are of the form “S believes that p”, where “p” is standardly taken to stand for proposition). But it is also compatible with folk psychology, according to which thinking of beliefs and desires as propositional attitudes helps explain behavior. By parity of reasoning, ideally, the best theory of knowledge-how should presumably be compatible both with our best psychological theory and our best linguistic theory of knowledge-how ascriptions (cf. Stanley 2011a, 2011b, 2011c; Cath 2015a for a defense of the linguistic methodology).

4.3 Second Group of Objections

Among those engaging with the linguistic argument, many have objected that it fails to adequately capture the truth conditions of knowledge-how ascriptions (Roberts 2009; Brogaard 2009, 2011; Michaelis 2011; Bengson & Moffett 2011a; Ginzburg 2011; Abbott 2013; Santorio 2016; Hornsby 2016). Some have argued against the claim that knowledge-wh is a matter of knowing a proposition that answers a question (Semantics for knowledge-wh). For example, Carr (1979, 1981) argues that when you know how to do something, you have an attitude that essentially takes an act as its object. But when you know that something is the case, you have an attitude that essentially takes a proposition as its object. Yet, intellectualists might reply that knowledge-how might be an attitude towards an act in virtue of being an attitude towards a proposition about that act.

Others have questioned whether the complement “which team is winning” in “S knows which team is winning” is, semantically, just like an interrogative (Brogaard 2009, 2011; Ginzburg 1995a, 1995b, 1996, 2011; Ginzburg & Sag 2000). One argument against this assumption is that, if, e.g., “which team is winning” denoted a question, we would expect it to co-refer with “the question of which team is winning”. Yet we cannot substitute such expression-pairs salva veritate. Suppose Jenny knows/discovered/revealed an interesting question and suppose the interesting question discovered by Jenny is “who left yesterday?”. Even so, it does not follow that Jenny knows/discovered/revealed who left yesterday. A response to this objection might be that these examples exploit a subtle equivocation (Stanley 2011b: ch. 2, following King 2002). Consider “Jamaal discovered a new element”. In it, “discovered” denotes a relation between Jamaal and an object, a chemical element. On the other hand, in the sentence “Jamaal discovered who left yesterday”, “discovered” denotes a different relation, one that holds between Jamaal and something of a different sort, namely, the proposition answering the question expressed by “who left yesterday”. It is this second relation which is relevant for the intellectualist. This is supported by the fact that the “[t]he former relation would be expressed in German by ‘kennen’, and the latter by ‘wissen’” (Stanley 2011b: 66). (For more relevant discussion, see Parent 2014.)

Others have questioned Logical form—the claim that in knowledge-how ascriptions, the embedded complement is an interrogative. Objectualists claim that the complement of knowledge-how ascriptions (“how to Φ”) is not an interrogative but an “objectual” complement—one denoting ways to Φ instead of propositions representing these ways (Bengson & Moffett 2011a). Objectualism is motivated by the consideration that “knowing how to Φ” seems to be equivalent to “knowing a way to Φ” in pretty much every context and by the apparent gradability of “knows-how” ascriptions (cf. section 3). An objectual semantics is in a good place to explain the gradability of knowledge-how ascriptions, since objectual knowledge ascriptions also permit degree modifiers—one can have partial knowledge of Paris, or know Paris better than someone else. Along similar lines, Bach (2012) and Abbott (2013) argue that in knowledge-how ascriptions “how to Φ” might work as a free relative. A free relative is a wh-phrase that denotes an individual. So for example, “what I was given for dinner” can be used as an interrogative in “I asked what I was given for dinner” but also as a free relative in “I ate what I was given for dinner”. In the latter ascription, it denotes some food that was given to me for dinner. In that sense, “how to Φ” according to this proposal, in “S knows how to Φ” should be interpreted as a free relative denoting a way to Φ, rather than an answer to the question “how to Φ?”

To this proposal, some respond that knowledge-how ascriptions do not pass the standard tests for detecting free relative complements (Schaffer 2009: 486–91; Habgood-Coote 2018a). Take the coordinated use of knowledge-how and other knowledge-wh ascriptions in “S has always known how to swim and never has wondered how”. This coordination suggests that both kinds of ascriptions have an interrogative as a complement (Bresnan & Grimshaw 1978: 332; M. Baker 1996: 204–7). Further, knowledge-how ascriptions can be extended to embed a multiple interrogative, as in “Mark knows how to do what?” , whereas free relative complements do not tolerate multiple wh-phrases (C. Baker 1968; Bresnan & Grimshaw 1978: 335). Moreover, infinitival wh phrases, such as “what to do”, “how to do”, “who to ask” never allow for free relative reading (Huddleston & Pullum 2002: 1070–3). Finally, a standard test for telling apart free relatives and interrogatives is to see if they embed under “believe”, for “believe” does not take interrogatives as complements but it does tolerate free relatives. (For example, “Mark believed who was charged guilty” cannot mean “Mark believed the answer to the question “Who was charged guilty?””. Rather, it means that Mark believed the person who was charged guilty.) However, interestingly, “believe” can never embed infinitival constructions such as “what to do”, “how to do”, or “who to ask”.

Finally, some have questioned whether Semantics for knowledge-wh applies to ascriptions embedding infinitival complements, like knowledge-how ascriptions. Roberts (2009) argues that, as opposed to other wh complements, the meaning of “how” denotes a property rather than a proposition when embedded in infinitival clauses. Santorio (2016) defends a Gibbardian semantics for knowledge ascriptions embedding infinitive interrogatives, on which these ascriptions ascribe maximal performance plans compatible with an agent’s plans (for more objections to Semantics for knowledge-wh, see also Sgaravatti & Zardini 2008 and George 2013).

4.4 Third Group of Objections

The perhaps most serious objection to the linguistic argument is that it ignores cross-linguistic evidence about how knowledge-how is ascribed in languages other than English (Rumfitt 2003; Roberts 2009; Glick 2012; Wiggins 2012; Abbott 2013; Douskos 2013; Ditter 2016). Rumfitt (2003) argues that the linguistic facts on behalf of intellectualism are overstated. Many languages—e.g., French, Italian, Spanish, and Russian—ascribe knowledge-how not just through ascriptions embedding interrogatives (“S knows how to Φ”) but also through ascriptions embedding bare infinitivals (“S knows + (bare infinitive) to Φ” (= “S knows to Φ”)) as in “Marie sait nager” and “Maria sa nuotare”. Stanley (2011b, 2011c) responds that these ascriptions are to be analyzed as embedding an implicit interrogative—one where the question word “how” is not explicitly articulated. However, Abbott (2013), Hornsby (2016), and Ditter (2016) have observed that this response does not help with yet other languages, such as Russian, in which knowledge-how ascriptions—of the form “S (attitude verb) Vs + (infinitive) to Φ”—feature an embedding verb V (“umetj”) that never licenses an interrogative complement nor a declarative complement (i.e., a that-clause).

In order to assess what this cross-linguistic evidence really establishes, consider a new version of the linguistic argument. Let “S Vs Φ” be an ascription of knowledge-how in an arbitrary language L that is correctly translated in English by “S knows + (interrogative) how (de se) to Φ”. Assuming that translation preserves at least truth conditions, “S Vs Φ” will be true in L just in case “S knows + (interrogative) how (de se) to Φ” is true in English. Call this the Interpretation Premise. By the Disquotational Schema, “S knows how to Φ” is true in English just in case S knows how to Φ; so, we have that “S Vs Φ” is true in L just in case S knows how to Φ. This conclusion, together with the Semantics for knowledge wh, the Logical Form, and the Interpretation Premise, yields that “S Vs Φ” is true in L just in case S bears a knowledge relation towards an answer to the question “How he himself could Φ”. Through this argument, the truth conditions of any knowledge-how ascription, whether in English or in any other language, are reduced to propositional knowledge, whether the relevant knowledge-how ascription has or not the interrogative form.

Proponents of the cross-linguistic argument might challenge Logical Form: the different ways of ascribing knowledge-how (through the infinitival form and through the interrogative form) in these languages indicate that knowledge-how ascriptions in English are ambiguous between two not truth-conditionally equivalent logical forms: an interrogative form and a bare infinitival form (Ambiguity Hypothesis) (Rumfitt 2003; Wiggins 2012; Setiya 2012; Glick 2012; Ditter 2016; Hornsby 2016). The main piece of evidence for the Ambiguity Hypothesis is that in languages employing both the interrogative form and the infinitival form, those different ascriptions can come apart in their truth conditions. For example, it is claimed that the Italian sentence “Mario sa come nuotare” (interrogative form = “Mario knows how to swim”) may be usedly true, while the sentence “Mario sa nuotare” (infinitival form = Mario knows to swim) is false. This would be the case, for example, if Mario lacks (in some sense) the ability to swim (so too for its French and Spanish translations). Similarly, Ditter argues that in Russian, the interrogative construction must ascribe a different state from the “umetj” ascription (+ infinitival), on the ground that one can coherently use in Russian sentences of the following form:


John znaet kak igrat’ na pianino, no on ne umeyet igrat.

John knows + (interrogative) how to play the piano, but he does not know (“umetj”) + (infinitival) to play the piano.

“John knows how to play the piano, but he doesn’t know how to do it”.

According to these authors, this difference between interrogative embedding constructions and infinitival embedding construction shows up also in English locally for the verb learn: “S learnt to swim” differs from “S learnt how to swim” in that the former, but not the latter, is ability-entailing (Rumfitt 2003; Glick 2012).

This argument for the Ambiguity Hypothesis might be in certain ways too quick. The only way to make (6) intelligible in English is to translate it as (7), where the generic interpretation of the first knowledge-how ascription and the de se interpretation of the second ascription are made explicit:

Mary knows how one could play the piano but does not know how to play the piano herself.

However, (6) cannot be interpreted as (8) on pain of contradiction:

Mary knows how she herself could play the piano but does not know how to play the piano herself.

If so, the fact that (6) is acceptable in Russian does not establish that the interrogative form in Russian cannot also have an interpretation (the de se interpretation) on which it is truth conditionally equivalent to the Russian’s infinitival form. Here is a competitive explanation of the available cross-linguistic evidence that does not commit us to the Ambiguity Hypothesis. Just like English’s ascriptions, the interrogative form in Russian is ambiguous between a de se interpretation, on which it is truth conditionally equivalent to the infinitival form, and a generic interpretation of the subject of the infinitival embedded verb, on which it comes apart from the infinitival form. This explains why (6) is felicitous and why it can be translated as (7) but not as (8). On this explanation, this evidence might be compatible with English knowledge-how ascriptions univocally having the same logical form (the interrogative form), even though the embedded interrogative can receive either the generic or the de se interpretation, depending on the subject of the infinitival embedded verb.

5. The Action Theory Argument and the Question of Joint Action

Ryle is often interpreted as claiming that knowledge-how ascriptions are nothing more than ascriptions of an ability or a complex of dispositions to act in a skilled or intelligent manner (though see Hornsby 2011: 82 and Waights Hickman 2019 for dissent). This interpretation is based on passages in the Concept of Mind, such as the following:

When a person is described by one or other of the intelligence epithets such as “shrewd” or “silly”, “prudent” or “imprudent”, the description imputes to him not the knowledge or ignorance of this or that truth, but the ability, or inability, to do certain sorts of things. (Ryle 1949: 27)

Early intellectualists argued that knowledge-how does not entail ability (Ginet 1975; Stanley & Williamson 2001; Snowdon 2004). For example, a pianist who lost their arms in a car accident may have lost her ability to play but still preserve her knowledge-how to play the piano (cf. Snowdon’s 2004: 8 expert omelette maker); or a ski instructor might know how to do a ski stunt and, according to Stanley & Williamson (2001), still fail to have the ability to do it. By contrast, anti-intellectualists argue that it is important to distinguish between knowing how to perform a task, which corresponds to a general ability, and being (actually and circumstantially) able to perform it (Noë 2005; Glick 2012; Setiya 2012). So the pianist might have both general ability as well as knowledge-how, though they lack circumstantial ability. By contrast, the ski instructor does not clearly have knowledge-how to perform the ski stunt themselves, while they know how one, in general, can do it. Recent intellectualist views also take knowledge-how to go together with abilities (understood along Hawley’s 2003 notion of counterfactual success) and argue that rightly construed intellectualism can vindicate this connection (Pavese 2015b; Cath 2020).

Yet, everybody agrees that while knowledge-how might entail ability, ability is not sufficient for knowledge-how, as demonstrated by an example from Hawley (2003):

Annoyance. Susie is attempting to annoy Joe; she thinks smoking will do the trick. Whenever she smokes, she unconsciously and inadvertently taps on her cigarette pack. Unbeknownst to Susie, Joe does not mind cigarette smoke, but finds her tapping obnoxious.

Susie has the ability to annoy Joe, since she has the disposition to annoy Joe whenever she attempts to do so. But, intuitively, she does not know how to annoy him. A natural explanation of this is that she cannot annoy him intentionally (for structurally similar cases, see Carr 1979, 1981 and Bengson, Moffett, & Wright 2009). Pretty much all sides of the dispute agree on the following claim (Ryle 1949; Stanley & Williamson 2001; Hawley 2003; Hornsby 2004, 2011; Stanley 2011b; Setiya 2012):

(Knowledge-how/Intentionality): If S intentionally Φs, S knows how to Φ.

Many also endorse the biconditional (Knowledge-how/Ability Intentional) (Hawley 2003; Setiya 2012):

(Knowledge-how/Ability Intentional): S has the ability to intentionally Φ if and only if S knows how to Φ.

Now, suppose that knowing how to Φ does require the ability to intentionally perform Φ. If so, whether knowledge-how requires a propositional attitude depends on whether or not one can intentionally Φ without having a propositional attitude about how to Φ. But according to many influential views of intentional action, intentionally Φ-ing does require a propositional attitude, namely a belief about how to Φ. In particular, intentionally Φ-ing requires having an action plan, which is characterizable in terms of a belief about how to perform Φ. For example, on Goldman’s (1970) view, one intentionally Φs when one has a plan to Φ, where a plan to Φ is a belief that specifies the means to Φ (see, also, e.g., Harman 1976; Audi 1986; Bratman 1987; Velleman 1989; Ginet 1990; Mele & Moser 1994; Gibbons 2001). From this, we get:

(Intentionality/Belief): If S intentionally Φs, then there are some means \(m_1\), …, \(m_n\) to Φ such that S truly believes that \(m_1\), …, \(m_n\) are means for oneself to Φ.

Some intellectualists have argued on these bases that knowledge-how to Φ requires at least a propositional attitude about the means to Φ (Cath 2015b).

But is propositional knowledge of means to ends required for intentional action, over and above true belief? Gibbons (2001) provides several examples to buttress the necessity of knowledge for intentional action. For example, one cannot plausibly intentionally win a fair lottery , nor can one intentionally defuse a bomb if one unintentionally and fortuitously chooses the correct wire; in both cases, a plausible explanation for the lack of intentionality is that the subjects does not have the relevant propositional knowledge about how to accomplish those tasks. These cases buttress the claim that intentional action requires knowledge of the means to execute it:

(Intentionality/Knowledge): If S intentionally Φs, then there are some means \(m_1\), …, \(m_n\) to Φ such that s knows that \(m_1\), …, \(m_n\) are means for oneself to Φ.

With these assumptions in the background, here is a non-linguistic argument for intellectualism. Start from (Knowledge-how/Intentionality): if S intentionally Φs, S knows how to Φ. Furthermore, suppose that (Intentionality/Knowledge) is true so that the intentionality of an action is to be explained at least in part in terms of propositional knowledge. Then, by these two premises, we get that if one intentionally Φs, one both knows how to Φ and one has propositional knowledge of the means to Φ:

(Knowledge-how, Intentionality, Knowledge): If S intentionally Φs, S both knows how to Φ and for some means \(m_1\), …, \(m_n\), S knows that means \(m_1\) , …, \(m_n\) are means for oneself to Φ.

Now, according to standard formulations of intellectualism, one knows how to Φ only if, for some means m to Φ, one knows that m is a means for one to Φ:

(Intellectualism about Knowledge-How): S knows how to Φ is at least in part of a matter of knowing, for some means m to Φ, S knows that m is a means for oneself to Φ.

So, the argument from intentional action for intellectualism maintains that the intellectualist picture provides the best explanation for why (Knowledge-How, Intentionality, Knowledge) should hold. According to this explanation, (Knowledge-How, Intentionality, Knowledge) is true not just because of a coincidental alignment of propositional knowledge and knowledge-how in intentional action. Rather, its truth is grounded on the very nature of knowledge-how: one knows how to Φ in virtue of knowing, for some means m to Φ, that m is a means for oneself to Φ.

The view that intentional action requires belief has been challenged for the particular case of basic actions. Setiya (2012) observes that one can perform a basic action of clenching one’s fist without even having the belief that one can succeed at doing it. For example, someone might have had a paralyzing injury, fail to believe they have healed, and still form the intention to clench their fist. Intellectualists might reply that, although that subject does not believe that one will succeed, they might have a sufficiently high credence and that credence can amount to knowledge too (Pavese 2020). (For other possible responses to the idea that intentional action requires knowledge or belief, see Elzinga forthcoming).

A further related question is how to think of knowledge-how in the case of joint actions. When two agents act jointly towards a goal, as when they row a boat together, they responsively coordinate and monitor each other’s movements in ways that produce a joint action. What kind of knowledge-how is manifested by successful joint action? It must be possible for the agents to coordinate without each having to know the different ways in which each must act to achieve their common goals: you and I can jointly make risotto even if I do not know how to season it and you do. Correspondingly, Birch (2019) suggests that joint knowledge-how must be accounted for distributively. If this is correct, then the agents can jointly know how to do something without each having a belief about how they jointly do it, but only in virtue of having a collective, or group, belief about how to do it. (For more discussion on group knowledge-how, see Palermos & Tollefsen 2018 and Strachan, Knoblich & Sebanz 2020)

6. The Epistemology of Knowledge-How

6.1 Knowledge-how and Belief

Some have observed that knowledge-how may differ from propositional knowledge in that, whereas the latter plausibly entails belief, knowledge-how does not (Dreyfus 1991, 2005; Wallis 2008; Brownstein & Michaelson 2016). For example, consider Brownstein & Michaelson (2016)’s example. When catching a ball, ball players make anticipatory saccades to shift their gaze ahead of the ball one or more times during the course of its flight towards them. These players know how to catch a ball, and their way of catching a ball requires making anticipatory saccades when watching the ball as it falls. Yet, the players do not believe that making anticipatory saccades is part of how they catch the ball. Rather they believe that they are tracking the ball the whole time. However, from the fact that the subject has false beliefs about how she catches the ball, it does not follow that the subject does not also have correct beliefs about it. So, a natural response is that there is some sense in which the player correctly believes that his manner of tracking the ball has a chance of resulting in success.

Whether this response is compelling might depend on what one takes beliefs to be. On this topic, philosophers widely disagree. On an “intellectualist” account of belief, on which believing that p requires the subject to acknowledge that p, it is implausible that the athletes have the relevant belief. But intellectualists about knowledge-how might advocate replacing this intellectual notion of belief with a less demanding one. According to a prominent functional characterization of belief, to believe that p entails being disposed to act in ways that would tend to satisfy one’s desires, whatever they are, in a world in which p (together with one’s other beliefs) are true” (cf. Stalnaker 1984: 15; Stalnaker 2012). Now, suppose that in game after game, Athena catches the ball using a certain method m, and that whenever she does so, her behavior is intentional. From this it seems to follow that Athena is disposed to perform the actions specified by m. Since, ex hypothesi, m is a way of catching the ball, it follows that in all the worlds where she performs these actions, she satisfies her desire of catching the ball (or at least is sufficiently likely to do so). By the previous functional characterization of belief, it follows that Athena believes that m is a way for her to catch the ball. The lesson of this debate might be, following Stalnaker (2012), that intellectualism about knowledge-how is best construed as a form of anti-intellectualism about knowledge, belief, and the mental.

6.2 Knowledge-How and Gettier

Another way of challenging the intellectualist claim that knowledge-how is a species of knowledge-that is to question whether knowledge-how can be Gettiered. If knowledge-how survives Gettierization, that would be evidence that knowledge-how is not a species of knowledge-that, on the assumption that Gettiered justified true belief cannot constitute propositional knowledge (Gettier 1963). Stanley & Williamson (2001) argue that knowledge-how cannot be Gettiered. However, Cath (2011) responds by proposing the Lucky Light Bulb case, where Charlie wants to learn how to change a lightbulb, but he knows almost nothing about light fixtures or bulbs. Charlie consults The Idiot’s Guide to Everyday Jobs. Inside, he finds an accurate set of instructions describing the shape of a light fixture and bulb, and the way to change a bulb. Charlie grasps these instructions perfectly. And so there is a way such that Charlie now believes truly that that way is a way for him to change a light bulb, namely, the way described in the book. However, unbeknownst to Charlie, he is extremely lucky to have read these instructions, for the disgruntled author of The Idiot’s Guide filled her book with otherwise misleading instructions. Cath (2011) argues that intuitively Charlie still knows how to fix the light bulb, despite his belief being Gettiered (cf. also Poston 2009: 744).

Stanley replies that knowledge-wh in general seems to be Gettierable and that might be explained in terms of features having to do with knowing the answer. For example, consider Hawthorne’s (2000) example of a teacher giving each child in their class a note with the name of a city. “Vienna” is written only on one of the notes. In this context, it seems true that one child knows the correct answer to the question “what is the capital of Austria”, even though the child’s belief is true by luck. (Though see Carter & Pritchard 2015c for a reply that while knowledge-how is similar to knowledge-that and knowledge-wh in that it is incompatible with intervening luck, it differs with these kinds of knowledge in being compatible with environmental luck.) Others still have responded that intuitions are subtle and not all of them favor anti-intellectualism (Marley-Payne 2016; Pavese forthcoming-a). For a recent experimental study with mixed results, see Carter, Pritchard, and Shepherd (2019). Hawley (2003: 28) argues that knowledge-how, like propositional knowledge, requires “warrant” on the ground that success on the basis of a lucky guess does not seem to manifest one’s knowledge-how. A similar theoretical argument for thinking that lucky belief cannot suffice for knowledge-how starts from the thesis that knowledge-how enters in explanations of success and that satisfactory explanations must be “modally robust”. From this, the argument concludes that the sort of belief that robustly explains intentional success must be knowledge, for knowledge has the relevant modal profile (Sosa 1999; Williamson 2000; D. Greco 2016). Another line of argument starts from the observations that knowledge-how to Φ explains the ability to intentionally Φ (see section 4) and that only knowledge can explain intentional action (Gibbons 2001: 589–590). On these bases, some argue that knowledge-how cannot fall short of non-getteriable knowledge (Cath 2015b for objections to this line of argument).

6.3 Knowledge How, Defeasibility, and Testimony

Some object that while knowledge-that can be defeated by misleading evidence, not so knowledge-how (see Carter & Navarro 2017 for this line of argument and Pavese 2021 for a reply). Finally, some object that knowledge-how cannot be knowledge-that because the latter is acquirable by testimony and the former is not. While the following argument (A–C) is valid, the following (i–iii) is not (Poston 2016):

  1. Mark knows that Turin is in Northern Italy.
  2. Mark tells that to John, who believes him.
  3. John comes to know that Turin is in Northern Italy.
  1. Mark knows how John could swim.
  2. Mark tells John.
  3. John comes to know how to swim.

Following Stanley’s (2011b: 126) modal restriction proposal (cf. section 3), Cath (2017, 2019) responds that depending on how the context for the modal is restricted, (i) could mean either that Mark knows how John could swim given his current physical state or how John could swim after training. If only the latter, that is not the sort of proposition that John needs to know in order for (iii) to be true: for that, John ought to know that that is how he could swim under his current physical state. (Though see section 2 for qualms about this intellectualist strategy.) Another avenue for reply to the challenge from testimony may be to insist that not every propositional knowledge is transferable through testimony. A comparison: visual knowledge that Mark murdered Tina differs in content and mode of presentation from the knowledge that of the murder obtained by being told by his prosecutor. The former observational knowledge is not transferable through mere testimony but (exactly because of that!) it is more helpful for the purpose of convicting Mark than second-hand knowledge. That does not mean that observational knowledge is not propositional. Like in the case of perceptual knowledge, the proposition that one knows by knowing how to do something involves distinct modes of presentation of ways of doing things (section 2, section 3). We should not expect propositions under this mode of presentation to be transferable through testimony. (For a response to Poston 2016, see also Peet 2019).

7. The Argument from Cognitive Science

7.1 The Argument

The argument from cognitive science against intellectualism starts by pointing out that cognitive scientists distinguish between different kinds of cognitive systems: It is often held that the declarative system is responsible for encoding propositional knowledge, whereas knowledge-how is encoded in the procedural system. Given empirical evidence that the declarative and procedural systems are separate (about which more below), it would seem to follow that knowledge-how is not reducible to propositional knowledge (Wallis 2008; Devitt 2011; Roth & Cummins 2011):

The Cognitive Science Argument

The procedural system is distinct from the declarative system.
Motor knowledge-how is encoded entirely by the procedural system.
All propositional knowledge is encoded entirely in the declarative system.
Some knowledge-how does not require propositional knowledge. (from C1, C2, C3)

The usual evidence marshaled in favor of C1 relies on amnesiac case studies (Milner 1962; see Cohen & Squire 1980 for discussion). A typical example is HM. After bilateral removal of the hippocampus, parahippocampal gyrus, entorhinal cortex, and most of the amygdala to relieve debilitating symptoms of epilepsy, HM was unable to form new memories of facts or events and he could no longer access memories he acquired in the few years leading up to his surgery. Nevertheless, it was found that over 10 trials, HM tuned his motor skill to trace the outline of a five-pointed star based only on looking at reflection in a mirror. Since he could not store new memories, HM’s declarative knowledge of the means of performing the task did not change from one trial to the next. But his performance improved. So, the reasoning goes, the improvement of motor skills is governed by a distinct cognitive system from that which governs the retention of declarative facts.

Many embrace C2 (e.g., Lewicki, Czyzewska, & Hoffman 1987: 523; Devitt 2011; Wallis 2008). But some object that a closer look at the details of HM’s case (as reported in Milner 1962) supports a different diagnosis, on which knowledge-how is realized by a combination of the procedural and the declarative system (Pavese 2013; Stanley & Krakauer 2013). At the beginning of each trial, prior to being given verbal instructions on how to perform the motor task, HM lacked the ability to intentionally perform it: HM was able to perform the motor task only after being reminded of what the task consisted in. This suggests, against C2, that there was an important declarative component to HM’s ability to perform the motor task (for the role of declarative knowledge in skillful action, see also Christensen, Sutton, & Bicknell 2019).

7.2 Improving the Argument

Here is a possible way to patch up the Argument from Cognitive Science (Fridland 2014, 2017; Levy 2017). Replace C2 with:

Knowledge-how is not exhausted by declarative knowledge.

With C2*, the argument goes on as before. Stanley & Krakauer (2013) seems to accept this conclusion (for more discussion and critiques, see Krakauer 2019; Springle 2019; De Brigard 2019; Schwartz & Drayson 2019). Other intellectualists reply that this argument misses the intellectualist target. Cath (2020) argues that procedural representation might be a prerequisite for knowledge-how rather than a constituent. Pavese (2019) develops an account on which procedural representations, of the sort studied by motor scientists when giving an account of the procedural aspect of skill (Wolpert 1997; Jeannerod 1997), can be understood as practical, albeit nonconceptual, representations—the sort of representations that intellectualism independently requires for knowledge-how (section 2).

7.3 Articulability

According to C3, propositional knowledge corresponds to “declarative” knowledge—to a sort of knowledge that is, at least in principle, verbalizable. Opponents of intellectualism often uses C3 in a novel argument against intellectualism: if propositional knowledge has to be verbalizable, then knowledge-how cannot be propositional knowledge, for often subjects know how to perform tasks even though they cannot explain how they do it (Schiffer 2002; Devitt 2011; Adams 2009; Wallis 2008). On behalf of intellectualism, there do seem to be cases in which you come to know how to do something precisely by consulting a manual and learning some propositions (see, e.g., Snowdon 2004: 12; Bengson and Moffett 2011a: 8; and Katzoff 1984: 65ff). Moreover, it is not clear that the anti-intellectualist demand that propositional knowledge be always verbalizable is motivated. In fact, it seems to conflate knowing how to perform a task with knowing how to explain how the task is performed (cf. Fodor 1968: 634; Stalnaker 2012). Stanley (2011b: 161) points out that there is a sense in which knowledge-how is always verbalizable. A punch-drunk boxer who can at best demonstratively refer to his re-enactment of the way of boxing against southpaws, and says, “This is the way I fight against a southpaw” intuitively knows that this is the way he fights against southpaws. This knowledge has an essential demonstrative or indexical component. But the same goes for much other propositional knowledge like, for example, the knowledge we express by saying, “This is the tool for the job”, or “That is going to be trouble”. This reply assumes that ways to execute tasks are ostensible and as such can be picked up by a demonstrative. This does not need to be so: on any single occasion, one may only act on parts of a way. So, one will not thereby be able to pick up the general way one’s knowledge-how is about. Another reply on behalf of intellectualism is to point out that practical concepts for tasks differ from “semantic” concepts for the same tasks precisely in that, even if propositional, they are not necessarily verbalizable.

7.4 Knowledge-How in Preverbal Children and Nonhuman Animals

A final objection is that intellectualism overintellectualizes knowledge-how in a way that is incompatible with what we know about animals’ cognition (Noë 2005; Hornsby 2007; Dreyfus 2007; Elzinga forthcoming). According to this objection, unsophisticated and non- (or pre-) linguistic agents such as babies and non-human animals can know how to perform certain tasks, while lacking the concepts that are required for propositional knowledge. Some intellectualists respond that ordinary speakers routinely also ascribe propositional knowledge to animals and babies, as we say that Fido knows that its owner is arriving or that a baby knows that their mother is present (Stanley & Williamson 2001). Thus, while propositional knowledge may require concept possession, our ordinary knowledge ascriptions suggest that we regard relatively unsophisticated agents as possessing the relevant concepts. Comparative psychologists do routinely credit many non-human and non-linguistic animals with the possession of concepts. (See Allen & Bekoff 1999 for a comprehensive overview).

This response might be less plausible, though, when it comes to lower animals, or insects. Here too, we might describe ants as knowing how to carry food back to their nest. And yet, there is less evidence from cognitive science that insects are capable of concepts too (though see Gallistel & King 2009). In response, a different line of argument might be more promising (cf. McDowell 2007): it does not follow from the fact that we are disposed to ascribe knowledge-how to lower animals that what explains their goal-directed behavior is the same sort of psychological state that underlies human knowledge-how and human action. For from the fact that their behavior resembles humans’ in some respects (for example, in its goal-directedness) does not entail that it resembles humans’ skilled behavior in all respects that matter (for example, in the susceptibility of the relevant behavior to rational revision).

8. Varieties of Anti-Intellectualism

8.1 Revisionary Intellectualism

According to orthodox intellectualism, knowledge-how is a species of propositional knowledge. Revisionary intellectualism, instead, contends that although knowledge-how is a kind of knowledge-that, the relevant knowledge is sui generis and differs from standard propositional knowledge in some important ways. For example, Brogaard (2009, 2011) argues that, in general, knowledge can have cognitive abilities or practical abilities as its justificatory grounds. In the latter case, agents know in virtue of ability states that are not subject to the usual epistemic constraints that characterize belief states generated by cognitive abilities. Correspondingly, knowledge-how fits the bill for this practically grounded knowledge. Cath (2015b) argues that we should distinguish between theoretical knowledge-that and practical knowledge-that. The former is subject to the usual epistemic constraints, like being sensitive to Gettierization (cf. also Zardini 2013). The latter, instead, is not sensitive to the usual epistemic constraints of theoretical knowledge-that—and can therefore constitute knowledge-that even if Gettierized. Waights Hickman (2019) suggests that knowledge-how is a distinct kind of knowledge-that relation, characterized by knowing something in “the executive way”, which requires

possession of (a) dispositions to attend to features of an action-context on which one’s knowledge (how) bears; and (b) dispositions to adjust one’s use of that knowledge accordingly. (2019: 333).

As we have seen (section 4), Bengson & Moffett (2007, 2011b) defend Non-propositional (or Objectualist) Intellectualism. On this view, knowing how to Φ necessarily involves having objectual knowledge of a way of Φ-ing but having objectual knowledge of a way of Φ-ing is not sufficient to know how to Φ. For example, a tropical swimmer may be acquainted with a way of escaping an avalanche, namely making swimming motions. Yet, if this swimmer had no conception whatsoever of an avalanche or of snow, he would not know how to escape an avalanche. This suggests that there must be some propositional/representational aspect of knowing how to Φ. Hence, according to this view for one to know how to Φ, (i) one must have objectual knowledge of a way of Φ-ing and (ii) one must grasp a correct and complete conception of this way.

8.2 Ability Based Anti-Intellectualism

As we have seen, Ryle is often interpreted as claiming that knowledge-how ascriptions are nothing more than ascriptions of an ability or a complex of dispositions to act in a skilled or intelligent manner (Hornsby 2011). (For a recent defense of knowledge-how as an ability, see Markie 2015.) Anti-intellectualism of this sort has been voiced by Lewis (1990) and has been thought to undercut the so-called “knowledge-argument” in the philosophy of mind (see Jackson 1986 for a classic formulation. For further discussion, see Nemirow 1990 and Alter 2001). However, Cath (2009) argues that similar worries about the argument survive even on some prominent intellectualist views. For a survey of other consequences thought to follow from the various positions in the knowledge-how debate, see Bengson and Moffett (2011b: 44–54).

However, few theorists nowadays identify knowledge-how with bare abilities. Setiya (2012) holds that to have knowledge-how is to have the disposition to act guided by one’s intention; Constantin (2018) argues that knowing how to Φ is to have the disposition to have the ability to Φ. Neo-Rylean views are also developed by Craig (1990), Wiggins (2012), and Löwenstein (2016). Craig suggests that knowledge-how to Φ amounts to the ability to teach others how to Φ. Wiggins argues that genuine knowledge-how stems from a bundle of practical abilities that constitute the ethos of a practice and, while interrelated with propositional knowledge, cannot be reduced to it. In turn, Löwenstein argues that knowledge-how to Φ is the ability to Φ intelligently guided by the understanding of the activity of Φ-ing.

Carter and Pritchard (2015a,b,c) develop an alternative view which does not equate knowledge-how with an ability, but it still gives ability a central theoretical role. In their view, knowing how to Φ is a cognitive achievement, given our abilities to Φ: if one successfully Φs because of one’s ability, then one knows how to Φ. And if one knows how to Φ, then one is positioned to successfully Φ because of one’s ability. Therefore, for them, knowledge-how does not reduce to the mere possession of abilities but it essentially involves the successful enactment of these abilities. Habgood-Coote (2019) defends the view that knowing how to Φ just is the ability to generate the right answers to the question of how to Φ. Although on this view, knowledge-how is a relation an agent bears to a proposition—one that answers the relevant practical question—this relation to a proposition is not understood in epistemic terms but in terms of dispositions (see also Audi 2017 and Farkas 2017).

8.3 Radical Anti-Intellectualism: Practicalism

While the intellectualist holds that knowledge-how must be understood in terms of knowledge-that, radical anti-intellectualism holds that knowledge-that must be understood in terms of knowledge-how or skill. As Hetherington puts it:

Your knowing that p is your having the ability to manifest various accurate representations of p. The knowledge as such is the ability as such. (2011: 42, original emphasis)

An agent knows that, for instance, she is in France whenever she is able to produce the corresponding true belief, to assert that she is indeed in France, provide justification, answer related questions, etc. (see Hartland-Swann 1956; Roland 1958 for classic formulation and Hetherington’s 2006, 2011, 2020 “practicalism” for a more recent form of radical anti-intellectualism).

9. Knowledge-How and Skill

9.1 Skill Across Cultures

The most recent debate on knowledge-how has intertwined with a debate on the nature of skills. While there is no consensus on what counts as a skill, by and large people take skills to manifest in purposeful and goal-directed activities and to be learnable and improvable through practice (Fitts & Posner 1967; Stanley & Krakauer 2013; Willingham 1998; Yarrow, Brown, & Krakauer 2009). Skills are usually contrasted with knacks (or mere talents). Some contrast them with habits (Pear 1926; Ryle 1949) in that these are performed automatically, whereas the exercise of intelligent capacities involves self-control, attention to the conditions, and awareness of the task. Others, instead, argue that understanding skill requires a better understanding of what habits amount to (Gallagher 2017; Hutto & Robertson 2020).

The topic of skill and expertise is central since ancient philosophy through the notion of technē. Although both Plato and Aristotle took technē to be a kind of knowledge, there is significant controversy about their conceptions regarding the nature of this kind of knowledge and its relation to experience (empeiria) on one hand, and scientific knowledge (epistēmē) on the other (Johansen 2017; Lorenz & Morison 2019; Coope 2020). Annas (1995, 2001, 2011) develops an interpretation on which skill and virtue (or phronēsis) are closer in Aristotle’s action theory than usually thought and they are both conceived along a broadly intellectualist model.

In contemporary times, the notion of skill is central to the philosophy of the twentieth-century French phenomenologist Maurice Merleau-Ponty. Merleau-Ponty (1945 [1962]) distinguishes between motor intentionality—the sort of intentionality relevant for motor skills—and cognitive intentionality. While the latter is conceptual and representational, Merleau-Ponty thought that motor intentionality is non-representational and non-conceptual. Central to Merleau-Ponty is the role of motor skills in shaping perceptual experience: in paradigmatic cases of perception, the flow of information taken in by perceivers is inseparable from the way they move through a scene. On this view, even superficially static perceptions engage motor skills, such as seeing the color of a table as uniform when different parts of it are differently illuminated (see Siegel 2020 for an helpful introduction).

This phenomenological tradition inspires Dreyfus’ (1991, 2000, 2002, 2005, 2007) critique of standard action theory. According to Dreyfus, theories on which an action is intentional only if the agent is in a mental state that represents the goal of her action (cf. Searle 1980, 2001) or on which actions are permeated by conceptual rationality (cf. McDowell 2007) are not supported by the phenomenology of purposive activity. Paradigmatic examples of these purposive activities are, for Dreyfus, skillful activities like playing tennis or habitual activity like rolling over in bed or making gestures while speaking. In this sort of skillful coping, Dreyfus thought that the mind does not represent the world as detached from it. Rather, it is fundamentally embedded, absorbed, and embodied (see Gehrman & Schwenkler 2020 for an helpful introduction to Dreyfus on skills).

The notion of skill is central also in Eastern philosophy. Garfield and Priest (2020) examine the various roles that the notion of skill plays in the Indian school of Mahayana Buddhism, in Daoism, and in Chan/Zen thought. In Daoism as well as in Chan/Zen Buddhism, the emphasis on skill is also connected, fundamentally, to concerns about living a good and ethical life. Sarkissan (2020) argues that two prominent types of expertise often encountered in ancient Chinese thought from the sixth to third centuries BCE: The first is expertise at a particular craft, occupation, or dao, as is most famously presented in the Daoist anthology Zhuangzi. The second is ethical expertise in the Ruist (Confucian) and Mohist schools (cf. for more on skill in Buddhism, see also MacKenzie 2020).

9.2 Intellectualism and Anti-Intellectualism About Skill

What is the relation between knowledge-how and skill? For many tasks at least, it is intuitive that one cannot be skilled at it without knowing how to perform it. At first, it also seems as if knowledge-how entails skill: one does not really know how to swim if one does not have the skill to swim; and one cannot know how to tell apart birds without the skills of a bird watcher. One might object to the sufficiency of knowledge-how for skill on the grounds that it is natural to say things such as “John may know how to make risotto, but I would not say he is skilled at it”. However, knowing how to make risotto sufficiently well (relative to contextually determined standards) might entail being skilled at it (relative to the same standards) (Cath 2020).

Ryle (1946, 1949) used “skill” and “knowledge-how” interchangeably in his criticism of the “Intellectualist legend” (for discussion, see Kremer 2020). In fact, Ryle’s view of knowledge-how is stated, literally, as the view that “skill” is a complex of dispositions (Ryle 1949: 33; see also Ryle 1967, 1974, 1976 for his views on how skill as a form of knowledge is distinguished by the forms on how it is taught and learned through training). This discussion brings us to whether intellectualism about knowledge-how and intellectualism about skill stand or fall together. Should intellectualists about knowledge-how identify skill too with propositional knowledge? While Stanley and Williamson (2001) embrace the view that knowledge-how is propositional knowledge, in a recent paper (Stanley & Williamson 2017), they refuse to think of skill as a standing propositional knowledge state. Rather, they argue that skills are dispositions to know. One motivation for this view is that this addresses the novelty challenge raised by Dreyfus (1991, 2005). According to this challenge, propositional knowledge cannot explain the ability to respond intelligently to situations that have not been encountered by the agent before. If skills are dispositions to know, it is no mystery how novel situations can be handled by skillful agents. Stanley & Williamson (2017) claim that the resulting view is still broadly intellectualist in a sense, because on it, skillful action manifests propositional knowledge (for a criticism of this response to the novelty objection, see Pavese 2016 in Other Internet Resources).

Some authors argue that while skills may be related to propositional knowledge, they do not reduce to it. Dickie (2012) suggests that an agent is skilled at Φ whenever her intentions to Φ are non-lucky selectors of non-lucky means to Φ; while, in turn, these means might manifest propositional knowledge. Some argue that control is necessary for skills, and control cannot fully be understood in terms of propositional knowledge (Fridland 2014, 2017a, 2017b). In order to provide a theory of skill that makes room for control, Fridland (2020) develops a “functional” account of skills. In this view, a skill is a function from intentions to action, implemented through certain “control structures”, which include attention and strategic control. Among these control structures, there is also propositional knowledge, which is required for strategic control. In contrast, intellectualists about skills argue that being in control is not intelligible unless it is understood in terms of knowing what one is doing in virtue of knowing how to perform that action. Therefore, they argue that agentive control itself is best understood in terms of the capacity for propositional knowledge.

9.3 Skills in Epistemology

Understanding the nature of skill and its relation with knowledge is of crucial importance for virtue epistemology—the view that knowledge is to be defined in terms of the success of our cognitive skills (Zagzebski 2003, 2008; Sosa 2007, 2009; J. Greco 2003, 2010; Pritchard 2012; Turri 2013, 2016; Beddor & Pavese 2020; Pritchard 2020). Nevertheless, if it turns out that skill must be explained in terms of knowledge, virtue epistemology would be trying to account for knowledge in terms of knowledge and so would be viciously circular (see Millar 2009; Stanley & Williamson 2017 for an argument in this spirit). Some virtue epistemologists have responded by offering an anti-intellectualist account of knowledge-yielding cognitive skills. Sosa and Callahan (2020) describe the relevant skills as dispositions to succeed when one tries—such that knowledge is obtained when agents in the right shape and in the right situation enact these skills appropriately.

9.4 The Nature of Skilled Action

Recent discussions on skill include a renewed debate on the nature of skilled action—i.e., on the sort of processes that are involved in the manifestation of skills. The most recent discussion on skilled action concerns the extent to which they are automatic or under conscious control. A long tradition has taken skilled action to be paradigmatically a matter of “absorbed coping” (Heidegger 1927; Merleau-Ponty 1945 [1962]; Dreyfus 1991)—characterized as immersion in the situation and intuitive response to its demands, with little awareness of the body, tools or even possibly the activity itself. Following Dreyfus and the phenomenological tradition, some enactivists (e.g., Noë 2004) highlight the analogies between skillful behavior and perception; other enactivists (e.g., Gallagher 2017; Hutto & Robertson 2020) argue that in order to understand the automaticity and unreflectiveness of skilled action, we ought to better understand habitual behavior. Even outside the phenomenological tradition, people have emphasized the unreflective aspect of skilled action. For example, Papineau (2013) argues that skilled actions are typically too fast for conscious control. One important argument for the unreflectiveness of skilled action starts from the phenomenon of choking under pressure, where an individual performs significantly worse than would be expected in a high-pressure situation. This phenomenon has been taken to be evidence that skillful action proceeds without conscious attention, because choking episodes are thought to arise from the fact that anxiety leads one to focus and direct one’s mind on the performance, which would proceed smoothly if mindless (Baumeister 1984; Masters 1992; Beilock & Carr 2001; Ford, Hodges, & Williams 2005; Jackson, Ashford, & Norsworthy 2006; Gucciardi & Dimmock 2008). Some argue that unreflectiveness also characterizes skillful joint action (Høffding 2014; Gallagher and Ilundáin-Agurruza 2020).

In recent years, however, some have emphasized the role of attention and consciousness in skillful performance (Montero 2016, 2020; Wu 2016, 2020). Montero argues against the Dreyfusian idea of skillful and mindless coping, by noting that online conscious thought about what one is doing is compatible with expertise and by surveying empirical evidence that suggests revisiting the choking argument. Christensen, Sutton and McIlwain (2016) and Christensen, Sutton, and Bicknell’s (2019) argue for the centrality of cognition in explaining the flexibility of skilled action in complex situations and advance a “mesh theory” of skilled action, according to which skilled action results for a mesh of both automatic and cognitively controlled processes (for a survey of some of these issues, Christensen 2019. See also Sutton 2007 and Fridland 2017b).

10. Knowledge-How and Other Related Topics

Knowledge-how is related to but distinct from practical knowledge (Anscombe 1957). Practical knowledge is occurrent during intentional action: when one intentionally acts, one knows what one is doing while knowing it. While being capable of practical knowledge might require knowledge-how, knowing how to perform an action does not entail performing that action, and so does not entail practical knowledge (Setiya 2008; Schwenkler 2019; Small 2020). Some have argued knowledge-how is the norm of intention (Habgood-Coote 2018b), so that one can properly intend to perform an act only if one knows how to perform it.

An important question is whether knowledge-how is connected to distinctive kinds of epistemic injustice (Fricker 2007; Dotson 2011; Collins 1990, 1998; Medina 2011). Hawley (2011) discusses the phenomena whereby people ascribe less knowledge-how and ability to female musicians (Goldin & Rouse 2000) and whereby standards for judgments of success due to ability rather than luck or “instinct” tend to be higher for women and non-white men (Biernat & Kobrynowicz 1997). In these cases, agents may be transmitting knowledge by being direct sources of information, rather than by testifying to the truth of a proposition. If so, the harms that they suffer might call for a different account than standard cases of epistemic injustices like Fricker’s (2007), which focus on testimonial transmission of knowledge-that.

A final topic of interest is the relation between knowledge-how and faith. While most views on faith focus on its doxastic aspect, Sliwa (2018) argues that faith essentially involves agents acting in the right way with respect to the object of their faith. Having faith in a person, for instance, requires knowing how to interact with them so as to trust them, help them, and ensure their autonomy in general. Religious faith, similarly, requires faithful agents to know how to enact the relevant practices like going to mass, declaring one’s faith, and praying.


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Other Internet Resources


The author would like to acknowledge the contributions of Alejandro Vesga to this entry. He brought to my attention recently published papers on knowledge-how; brainstormed with me about the structure of the entry and the order of the topics to be discussed; provided substantial criticisms of, and suggestions for, drafts of the content; contributed the idea of adding a final section that related knowledge-how to other related topics; and compiled the bibliography once the bulk of the entry was finished.

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Carlotta Pavese <>

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