Latin American Philosophy

First published Wed Aug 14, 2013; substantive revision Mon Apr 2, 2018

In its most expansive sense, Latin American philosophy is philosophy produced in Latin America or philosophy produced by persons of Latin American ancestry who reside outside of Latin America. It is typically taken to exclude philosophy produced in non-Iberian former colonies, with the occasional exception of former French colonies in the Caribbean. Other names have also been used to refer to the whole or part of Latin American philosophy, including Spanish American, Hispanic American, Iberoamerican, and Latino/a philosophy. The first two refer specifically to the philosophy of former Spanish colonies, the third to that of former Iberian colonies, and the fourth to the philosophy produced in the United States by descendants of Latin Americans.

Latin American philosophy is usually taken to have originated around 1550, when Spanish conquerors founded the first schools in Latin America and began to teach and publish philosophical treatises. Recently, there has been an effort on the part of historians to include pre-Columbian thought in Latin American philosophy, although the pre-Columbian texts cited are often fragmentary and religious in tone and intention. In terms of traditions, style, and influence, post-Columbian Latin American philosophy is part of the Western philosophical tradition. Indeed, philosophical discussions in Latin America have and continue to be dominated by European philosophical influences. Even those Latin American philosophers who have endeavored to develop original theories have frequently framed their own contributions in the terms of European thinkers. Partly in response to this phenomenon, there has arisen a large body of literature concerned with the identity, authenticity, and originality of Latin American philosophy.

Latin American philosophy has been both original and derivative. Much of its history involves work that is derivative of European philosophical figures and movements. At the same, time Latin American philosophy has produced important philosophers, original approaches to old philosophical problems, and formulations of new problems not already within the European philosophical tradition. Moreover, virtually all historical European philosophical traditions have been present in Latin America, as are most contemporary movements in the United States and Europe. Finally, there has been a significant interest in social concerns among Latin American philosophers, partly as a reaction to the social and economic circumstances of Latin America. This has led Latin American philosophical work to be comparatively more concerned with social issues than philosophy in, for example, the United States.

The influence of Latin American philosophy outside of Latin America has thus far been relatively small. Although the situation has been improving, very few Latin American philosophers are currently read outside of Latin America. This situation is made worse by the paucity of English-language translations of Latin American philosophical works. Moreover, internal to Latin America, philosophers read and respond to each other with less frequency than one might expect or wish. However, the philosophy of liberation has had some impact both in North America and in developing countries in Africa, and Latinos/as have participated actively in the discussion of a variety of topics, especially those having to do with race, ethnicity, and social identities in the United States. In the past few years, some of these philosophers have occupied positions of leadership in the philosophical establishment and their work has been the subject of discussion by prominent non-Latino/a philosophers.

This article is divided into three main parts: history, the contemporary period, and problems and topics. We begin with a sketch of the history of Latin American philosophy.

1. History

The history of Latin American philosophy is usefully divided into five periods: Pre-Columbian, Colonial, Independentist, Nationalist, and Contemporary (that is, the twentieth century to the present). Most periods are characterized by the dominance of a particular tradition: the Pre-Columbian by Amerindian religious cosmologies, the Colonial by scholasticism, the Independentist by Early Modern philosophy and Enlightenment thought, and the Nationalist by positivism. However, the contemporary situation is more complex and varied. For that reason, it is discussed in a separate and subsequent section, apart from the other historical periods that are the focus of this section.

There is good evidence that in at least the major pre-Columbian civilizations there were attempts to explore questions about the nature of reality, the limits of knowledge, and the basis of right action. Moreover, such work persisted in various forms for some time after the Conquest (Restrepo 2010; Maffie 2014). Whether this body of work is rightly characterized as philosophy or something else is a disputed matter, with scholars disagreeing about how best to characterize it (see Nuccetelli, 2001, ch. 3; Mignolo, 2003). It is clear that the reflective and speculative work of pre-Columbian Amerindian peoples was undertaken without any familiarity with the Western philosophical tradition. Those inquiries were also generally undertaken within the religious frameworks of their places and times and the literary or presentational modes in which such questions were entertained were typically removed from traditional forms of European philosophical production.

Despite these differences with European philosophy, and despite the often fragmentary and frequently second-hand information that survives concerning pre-Columbian thought, extant works have nevertheless supported a variety of intriguing and subtle accounts of those philosophical or proto-philosophical reflections.[1] Still, the conventional view about the pre-Columbian period is that its reflections had little to no impact on the indisputably philosophical intellectual production in the period that immediately followed the Conquest.[2]

European-derived philosophy began in Latin America in the sixteenth century. Among the most notable figures of this period is Bartolomé de Las Casas (1484–1566), whose work on the rights of conquered Amerindians has had a particularly important and long-lasting legacy. Scholasticism, introduced by the Spanish and Portuguese clergy that arrived with the conquistadores, was the dominant philosophical perspective. Most of the work produced during the first two centuries in the colonies was cast in the framework used in the Iberian peninsula. It was particularly indebted to the thought of both sixteenth-century Iberians and their medieval predecessors. Important figures included Francisco Suárez (1548–1617) and Francisco de Vitoria (1492–1546), and earlier medieval philosopher-theologians, such as Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274) and John Duns Scotus (1265/6–1308). Most of these authors were born in the Iberian peninsula, but many of them had settled in the colonies. Among the most important, apart from Las Casas, are Alonso de la Vera Cruz (ca. 1504–84), who composed the first fully philosophical treatises in Latin America, Tomás de Mercado (ca. 1530–1575), and Antonio Rubio (1548–1615). Some of the works of these authors, such as Rubio’s Logica mexicana, were known and used in Europe.

Humanism also had some influence, as is clear from the work of Juan de Zumárraga (ca.1468–1548) and Sor Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651–1695), among others. Sor Juana has the distinction of being the first Latin American thinker to raise questions concerning the status of women in Latin American society. She is also retrospectively regarded as the first Latin American feminist writer and philosopher (see also the section on feminist philosophy, below.)

The eighteenth century, under the influence of modern philosophy and the Enlightenment, helped prepare the way for the revolutionary wars of independence. Philosophical discussions of the time were dominated by political thought. Even so, scholasticism continued to influence the intellectual class and stoked an ongoing interest in traditional metaphysical questions. Authors such as Juan Benito Díaz de Gamarra y Dávalos (1745–1783) and Francisco Javier Clavijero (1731–1787), both from Mexico, were influenced by early modern philosophers such as René Descartes (1596–1650). However, the wave of independentist thought found its greatest inspiration in Enlightenment political philosophy. In particular, liberal political ideals based on the thought of the French philosophes helped to consolidate independentist views throughout Latin America. Among the significant Latin American inheritors of that tradition were Simón Bolívar (1783–1830) in Venezuela and Colombia, Miguel Hidalgo (1753–1811) and José María Morelos (1765–1815) in Mexico, and much later, José Martí (1854–1895) in Cuba.

In the early 19th century, many Latin American countries secured independence from European colonial powers. In the wake of independence, the newly liberated peoples faced the challenge of forming stable, enduring nations out of the remnants of the Spanish and Portuguese empires. The predominant political concerns of that era included the organization and consolidation of the new nations, along with aspirations for social stability, national integration of largely diverse peoples. The overarching ambition in many nations was to achieve the same economic and social progress enjoyed by other nations in Europe and North America.

In this context, the ideology of choice was a version of positivism. The positivist motto, “order and progress,” which graces the Brazilian flag, suggests why positivism was especially appealing in the context of nation building. Positivism’s emphasis on both empirical science and pragmatic solutions appeared to provide a practical foundation for attaining the diverse ends of the new nations. Indeed, positivism became so influential and widely accepted by intellectuals that it became the official state philosophy of several nations. It was even used to justify dictatorial regimes, as in the case of Mexico.

Positivism of the Latin American variety was derived from a peculiar mix of European ideas primarily originating in the thought of Auguste Comte (1798–1857), Herbert Spencer (1820–1903), and Ernst Haeckel (1834–1919). The period of positivist hegemony, in which it was the dominant philosophical perspective in Latin America, extended roughly from the middle of the nineteenth century to the first decade of the twentieth. Among the most famous positivists were Gabino Barreda (1818–1881) and Justo Sierra (1848–1912) in Mexico, José Victorino Lastarria (1817–1888) in Chile, and Domingo Faustino Sarmiento (1811–1888) in Argentina. Andrés Bello (1781–1865), from both Venezuela and Chile, and Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810–1884) and Esteban Echevarría (1805–1851), from Argentina, were transitional figures between independentist liberal thought and positivism. Later, José Ingenieros (1877–1925), from Argentina, and Enrique José Varona (1849–1933), from Cuba, prepared the way for the revolt against positivism, although their thought arose in a positivist context and maintained an alliance with positivist ideas.

2. The Contemporary Period

Contemporary Latin American philosophy begins in the twentieth century, around 1910, coinciding with the decline of positivism. By 1930, the remaining positivists in Latin America were usually regarded as museum pieces rather than proponents of a viable philosophy meriting serious attention. The contemporary, post-positivist period can be divided into three distinct sub-periods. The first—rebellion—is characterized by the backlash against positivism and the subsequent development of foundations for future philosophical movements (ca.1910–1940). The second—normalcy—is characterized by the achievement of a degree of institutionalization and normalization in the philosophical profession (1940–1960). The third period—maturity (ca. 1960 to the present)—is distinguished by the degree of professional and philosophical maturity attained by Latin American philosophers.

2.1 Rebellion and the Generation of Founders (1910–1940)

The anti-positivist rebellion constitutes the first phase of contemporary Latin American thought. It was brought about by a generation of philosophers born around 1910, all of whom were trained as positivists, before breaking with it. The principal members of this generation—called “the generation of founders” by Francisco Romero, and dubbed “the generation of patriarchs” by Francisco Miró Quesada—are well known: Alejandro Korn (1860–1936) in Argentina, Alejandro Octavio Deústua (1849–1945) in Peru, José Vasconcelos (1882–1959) and Antonio Caso (1883–1946) in Mexico, Enrique José Molina (1871–1956) in Chile, Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872–1958) in Uruguay, and Raimundo de Farias Brito (1862–1917) in Brazil.

The adoption of ideas from France, and later from Germany, was instrumental in formulating the basis for rejecting positivism. It began with the influence of Emile Boutroux (1845–1921), Henri Bergson (1859–1941), and French vitalism and intuitionism. It was cemented when the Spaniard José Ortega y Gasset visited Latin America in 1916 and introduced the thought of Max Scheler (1874–1928), Nicolai Hartmann (1882–1950), and other German philosophers. Ortega y Gasset and the German philosophy of the spirit had substantial influence on the generation that followed that of the founders, called by Miró Quesada “the generation of forgers.” Samuel Ramos (1897–1959), from Mexico, Francisco Romero (1891–1962), from Argentina, Alceu Amoroso Lima (1893–1982), from Brazil, and José Carlos Mariátegui (1894–1930), from Peru, among others, followed the founders’ course, attacking positivist ideas and favoring in some instances a rather poetic philosophical style that contrasts with the scientistic emphasis of positivism. They completed the process initiated by the founders and laid the foundations of future developments.

One of the main preoccupations of the founders and the generation that followed them was the absorption of European ideas; they wanted to be philosophically up to date. In contrast with the objectives of the philosophers that preceded them, which were for the most part religious (during the colonial period), political (during the period of independence), or economic (during the nationalist period), the concern of these thinkers was more systematically philosophical in motivation. This was a significant change in Latin American philosophy, insofar as scholasticism, Enlightenment liberalism, and positivism were typically undertaken (at least in Latin American) for purposes frequently disconnected from a conception of philosophy in which the discipline was pursued for its own sake. For scholastics, the primary objective was the apologetic defense of the faith; for liberals, the end was political emancipation; and for positivists, the goal was national integration and economic and social progress. In all three cases, European ideas were typically adopted with pre-established ends in mind. As a consequence, philosophical movements were not obviously the products of philosophical concerns as such.

In contrast to prior generations, the founders and those who followed them did not tend to adopt European ideas with a view to the defense of a body of doctrine, or in order to achieve certain practical ends of political liberation or of national unity and economic and social progress. Their ideas arose from philosophical dissatisfactions with positivism. Thus, we find in the writings of Caso, Deústua, and the other founders who rebelled against positivism, purely philosophical criticisms of that perspective. They were concerned, for example, with freedom and the fact that determinism, which they considered undesirable, was a necessary corollary of positivism. Still, their attitude toward the ideas they adopted was seldom critical. They saw the defects of positivism, but too often they still accepted uncritically the solutions they borrowed from non-positivist European philosophers to fight it.

Although the founders and some of their immediate successors had attained some emancipation in the philosophical enterprise, full maturity remained elusive. Still, the sophistication of some thinkers, such as Korn, was considerable and planted the critical seeds that germinated in the following period.

2.2 Normalcy and the Generation of 1910 (1940–1960)

It is not until the generation born around 1910 reached maturity in the 1940s that a self-critical spirit clearly entered Latin American philosophy. A state of normalcy became established in most countries of Latin America, and what might be called Latin-Americanism grew significantly. The limitations on originality characteristic of previous generations were in part the result of the lack of self-criticism and the practical difficulties involved in pursuing a philosophical career in Latin America. The contribution of those generations was largely restricted to the importation of foreign thought; originality in substantive doctrine was rarely achieved, or even an ambition.

There were exceptions, of course. Romero, for example, in his Theory of Man (1952), developed an original philosophical anthropology. However, philosophers and philosophical practice was not “normalized,” as Romero put it, until the emergence of the subsequent generation philosophers. That group included Risieri Frondizi (1910–1985), Eduardo García Maynez (1908–1993), Miguel Reale (1910–2006), Francisco Miró Quesada (1918–), Leopoldo Zea (1912–2004), and Juan Llambías de Azevedo (1907–1972).

This group was the first generation of Latin American philosophers to benefit from formal education in philosophy. Previous philosophers had been mostly self-taught, typically trained in another profession, but taking up philosophy out of personal interest. The structural changes in the academy introduced by the Founders and the generation that followed made it possible for an entire generation to be trained by philosophers at the university.

Another important general feature of this period of Latin American philosophy was that the incipient Latin-Americanism of the previous generation developed and flourished. This change became evident with the philosophers born around 1910 and those who followed them. Several philosophers of this generation readily traveled throughout Latin America and establishing dialogue with other Latin Americans. This is not to say that Latin-Americanism in philosophy was very robust. Even today, lack of region-wide philosophical dialogue remains more common than not, and communities of discourse tend to be more local or national than international. Still, philosophical communication within Latin America markedly increased during this period.

One of the factors that helped the development of philosophy was the increasing consciousness of a distinctly Latin American philosophical identity, of a sense that there was something different or distinctive about Latin American philosophy. In part, this was a result of growing consciousness of the increasing importance of Latin America in the world and, on the philosophical side, of the introduction in Latin America of Ortega’s perspectivism. By the time of Samuel Ramos and Leopoldo Zea, the Founders’ preoccupation with the existence of an autochthonous Latin American philosophy gave rise to a controversy about whether and how it existed. This debate was one in which practically all important philosophers of the period participated. In turn, this debate provided impetus to the study and dissemination of the philosophical work of Latin American thinkers throughout the region.

Notable work in this vein includes Aníbal Sánchez Reulet’s (1910–1997) groundbreaking work, published in Tierra Firme in 1936 and entitled “Panorama de las ideas filosóficas en Hispanoamérica.” Subsequent work by Zea on positivism in Mexico, written in the early 1940s, as well as Ramos’ historical study of Mexican philosophy took up the thread, as did Ramón Insua Rodríguez’s history of philosophy in Hispanic America and Guillermo Francovich’s account of philosophy in Bolivia. In the eight decades since the publication of Sánchez Reulet’s essay, there has been a remarkable proliferation of work concerned with the identity of Latin American philosophy. In addition, anthologies, specialized works, and critical editions of Latin American philosophical classics have been published. The very controversy concerning the existence and possibility of an autochthonous Latin American philosophy that drew so much attention in the second quarter of the twentieth century (and, for that matter, still continues), has helped to promote and spread the knowledge of Latin American thought and the philosophical dialogue among Latin American philosophers.[3]

A second factor that contributed to philosophical growth and Latin-Americanism was political oppression and the periodic repression of intellectual freedom in Latin America. This was not a phenomenon limited to any one period of Latin American philosophy. The colonial regime was without a doubt paradigmatic of intellectual oppression and control, but the fact of oppression and intellectual constraints became more profound after independence. In the nineteenth century, positivists used philosophy as an instrument for specific political and social agendas, and it was used as a basis for suppressing dissent. In the twentieth century this oppressive pattern was not limited to a specific intellectual orientation; philosophical suppression became institutionalized in regimes of the right and the left. The result has always been the same: intellectual abuse, the violation of rights indispensable for the pursuit of philosophical ideas and their investigation, the lack of freedom of expression, and the manipulation of pedagogic institutions and scientific investigation for political and ideological ends. Latin American intellectuals subject to these pressures have regularly been forced to go into exile, a state of affairs that has become almost customary and is prevalent to this day in some countries. Frondizi’s life is paradigmatic of the situation: his many trips throughout Latin America were the result of the periodic political upheavals and oppression in Argentina. An indirect but unexpectedly beneficial result of this recurring situation was that the philosophical peripatetism of Latin American philosophers contributed to inter-American philosophical dialogue.

Philosophy in Latin America was also transformed by the arrival of Spanish émigrés. Among the most influential were: Joaquin Xirau (1895–1946), Eduardo Nicol (1907–1990), José Ferrater Mora (1912–1991), José Gaos (1900–1969), Luis Recaséns Siches (1903–1977), Juan D. García Bacca (1901–1992), José Medina Echevarría (1903–1977), Maria Zambrano (1904–191), and almost fifty others (see Abellán, 1967). There were diverse effects of the arrival of this group. First, their migrations throughout Latin America helped break down some of the national barriers between philosophical communities in Latin America. The conception of hispanidad that they inherited from Miguel de Unamuno and from Ortega, and the need to establish themselves in Latin America, helped the process; they went from country to country, spreading ideas and contributing to the increase in philosophical dialogue. Second, many of them helped implement changes in university curricula across Latin America, frequently establishing lasting programs in philosophy. The effects of their work became evident when the generation born around 1910 reached maturity. It was at that point that Latin American philosophers began to think and act philosophically in pan-Latin American terms, traveling, exchanging ideas, and cooperating in projects of common interest.

The period that goes from 1940 to 1960 does not reveal drastic changes in philosophical orientation. The generation of the Founders used French vitalism as an instrument to reject positivism, and the following generation, with Ortega’s help, took charge of the process, incorporating German philosophy and the new ideas introduced by phenomenology and existentialism. At this time, Martin Heidegger (1889–1976) and Jean–Paul Sartre (1905–1980) constituted the dominant philosophical force in Latin America. Simultaneously, scholasticism experienced renewed impetus. The number of sympathizers of philosophical analysis and Marxism continued to grow, but Thomism, phenomenology, existentialism, and various versions of nationalist and culturalist philosophy were the dominant approaches throughout Latin America. Those working outside the dominant currents had little institutional power.

2.3 Maturity (1960–present)

By the 1960s, philosophy in Latin America had indisputably reached a level of philosophical maturity. The work had markedly increased in originality and depth, and some of it achieved international visibility. This period of maturity continues to the present. To appreciate the distinctiveness of this new situation, it helps to recall that the period of normalcy was characterized by (1) critical interaction with the philosophical ideas coming from outside Latin America, (2) an increase in dialogue within Latin America, and (3) the institutionalization of philosophy. In the period of maturity, these features became stable and the general caliber of philosophical work continued to improve accordingly.

If one measures philosophical activity by the number of new journals founded, or by the number of important congresses that occur, one might mistakenly conclude that philosophical activity actually diminished after the 1960s. However, many of the journals founded in the preceding twenty years continued publication, so there was actually a net increase in fora for philosophical work. Moreover, more than a dozen important congresses and philosophical meetings took place between 1960 and 1980. In short, the activity related to publications and professional meetings had reached a healthy level of stability.

Four philosophical currents deserve special attention at this period because of their growing influence and the new ideas and approaches they introduced in Latin American philosophy: socialist and Marxist thought (broadly conceived), philosophical analysis, the philosophy of liberation, and the history of philosophy.

Latin America has had a long and notable history of receptivity to socialist thought. Its introduction goes back to the nineteenth century. The impact of the socialist ideas of Claude Henri de Saint-Simon (1790–1825) and Charles Fourier (1772–1873) are clearly visible in the treatise Dogma socialista of Esteban Echevarría (1805–1851). In the twentieth century, Emilio Frugoni (1880–1969) in Uruguay and Mariátegui in Peru, among others, developed Marxist accounts, although frequently in heterodox terms. For example, Mariátegui allowed that there is no essential conflict between religious thought and Marxism, departing from the standard materialist, atheist commitments of orthodox Marxism. He also held that the conception of economic stages in Marx, modeled on Europe, did not apply to Peru. Although bourgeois liberal capitalism had not materialized in Peru, he held that the only way to move forward was to transition to socialism.

Latin American Marxism has been diverse in its philosophical particulars, and is subject to ongoing development. Even so, many forms of Latin American Marxism commitments to the following: (1) an end to imperialism, neo-colonialism and class oppression through socialist democratic change and/or revolution; (2) a form of socialist humanism based on (a) ending the capitalist exploitation of human being by human being, and (b) upholding a model of dignity based on economic and social equality; (3) a conception of philosophy as committed to understanding the world in all its dynamic and interrelated aspects, theorizing the meanings of capitalism and socialism, and shedding light on acting accordingly. Class consciousness of workers, the proletariat, or the people is typically regarded as an important engine of social change. Apart from these shared commitments, Antonio Gramsci’s (1891–1937) influential model of “organic intellectuals”—intellectuals who support social revolution with critical perspectives—also resonated with a range of leftist intellectuals who lent their support to Marxist revolutionary movements in Cuba, Nicaragua, and elsewhere.[4]

Despite a long-standing openness to various strands of socialist thought, it was only after 1960 that Marxism gained notable academic standing throughout Latin America. Indeed, Harold Davis claimed, plausibly enough, that Marxism became the most common ideological conviction among professionals in the decades following the 1960s. Mariátegui continues to loom large in characterizations of a distinctively Latin American form of Marxism. However, other important figures in academic Marxism emerged in the contemporary period, including Adolfo Sánchez Vázquez (1915–2011), of Spanish origin but working in Mexico, and the Brazilian Caio Prado Junior (1907–1990).

The popularity of the Marxism has made possible its widespread institutionalization and its impact on virtually all active philosophical approaches in Latin America. To be sure, it is not without its critics, many of whom charge that a philosophy that aims to change the world is not philosophy at all, or that its scope is entirely too limited for an entire discipline. Nevertheless, it is not much of an exaggeration to say that, broadly speaking, Marxist themes are widely present in Latin American philosophy, even if philosophers pursuing an explicitly Marxist philosophical research program remain in the minority.

Compared to Marxism, analytic philosophy was a late arrival to Latin America. Owing to its technical and academic character, analytic philosophy’s initial influence was small. Its historical connection with Logical Positivism caused many to reject it because of its perceived commonality with nineteenth century positivism. However, in a relatively short period of time, analytic philosophy became one of the most forceful philosophical currents in Latin America. The publication of the journals Crítica in Mexico, Análisis Filosófico in Argentina, and Manuscrito in Brazil, the foundation of the Society of Philosophical Analysis (SADAF) in Argentina, and the growth of publications of an analytic bent in journals of neutral philosophical orientation, testify to the fact that philosophical analysis is now well established in Latin America.[5]

An important dimension of this was the international uptake of some of this work. Some analytic philosophers from Latin America attracted the attention of philosophers in Europe (particularly in England and Germany), the United States, and Canada. In addition, Latin American philosophers who emigrated or made extended visits to these countries produced important work. Three areas of contributions stand out: the philosophy of human rights, legal theory, and logic. Eduardo Rabossi (1930–2005) work on human rights in Latin America attracted the attention of major English and American philosophers. Carlos Nino’s (1943–1993) work in the philosophy of law, such as his consensual theory of punishment, has been widely recognized as an original contribution to philosophy and jurisprudence (see Navarro in Nuccetelli et. al., 2010). Finally, Latin American work in logic has been particularly fecund. Newton C. A. da Costa (b. 1929) has done considerable work on paraconsistent logic that has been the subject of international attention (see da Costa & Bueno 2010). Carlos Eduardo Alchourrón’s (1985) contributions to the AGM model of belief change (named after Alchourrón and his collaborators, Peter Gärdenfors and David Makinson) has also been influential. Although its underpinnings were initially developed from Alchourrón and Makinson’s efforts at modeling changes in legal codes, it is now the dominant formal framework for modeling belief revision.

The growing influence of analytic philosophy in Latin America has not gone without criticism. It is not uncommon to hear that analytic philosophers lack sensitivity to the pressing problems affecting Latin America. Although this concern is hardly unique to analytic philosophy, it is also sometimes merited. However, it is also true that the rigorous argumentation, analysis of language, and use of symbolic logic often constitute obstacles for outsiders to this methodology. Nevertheless, Latin American analytic philosophers have often been involved in socially pertinent issues. Indeed, both Rabossi and Nino were involved in the politics of Argentina, serving in the government of President Raúl Alfonsín. Da Costa and Alchourrón both applied their logical theories to law and a variety of arguably “practical” problems. Moreover, a variety of Latin American analytic philosophers have been centrally preoccupied with ethical and political questions. In the wake of the 1994 Zapatista rebellion, a number of prominent Mexican philosophers (including Fernando Salmerón and Luis Villoro) became involved in public and academic efforts at addressing the concerns of the Zapatistas.

A third contemporary approach that merits special attention is the philosophy of liberation . This autochthonous philosophical perspective started in the early 1970s with a group of Argentinian philosophers, most notably Arturo Andrés Roig (1922–2012), Horacio Cerutti-Guldberg (b. 1950), and Enrique Dussel (b. 1934), with Dussel being primarily responsible for spreading the philosophy of liberation outside of Latin America. This philosophy shares some of its intellectual touchstones with the theology of liberation—in particular, indebtedness to dependency theory, as well as Catholic and Marxist ideas. Some of the most significant features of the various strands of the movement include the aspiration for Latin American intellectual independence, an emphasis on economic autonomy as opposed to economic dependence, an emphasis on political regimes that are responsive to the interest of the poor and indigenous populations, and in general, a concern to put Third World realities at the center of philosophical concerns.

The international visibility of the philosophy of liberation was in part an unanticipated consequence of military repression in 1976–83 in Argentina. The founding figures of the philosophy of liberation went into exile in various countries in Latin America. Although this early diaspora created permanent splits in the movement—Cerutti-Guldberg urges that one speak of “philosophies of liberation”—its ideas spread throughout the region.

The goal of intellectual independence, important to many varieties of the philosophy of liberation, was not new with the philosophy of liberation. Strands of it can be found in the work of Ramos and others in the early parts of the 20th century. Other forerunners include the culturalist and historicist views of Leopoldo Zea, which emphasize the distinctiveness of Latin America and its history. Moreover, Augusto Salazar Bondy’s (1925–1974) concern for intellectual authenticity, informed by dependency theory, paved the way for important developments in the philosophy of liberation. However, the distinctive feature of the philosophy of liberation is the degree to which it has developed the theme of liberation into a far-reaching and systematic critique of European (and later, United States) dominance in intellectual, economic, and social worlds. In particular, philosophers of liberation charge that the intellectual and economic frameworks of Europe and the United States are distinguished (currently and historically) by a disregard for or hostility to the concerns of those outside the systems of power central to Europe and the United States.

The philosophy of liberation has been subject to varied criticisms. There is a rich tradition of disagreements internal to the movement (Cerutti-Guldberg 1983), and even those sympathetic with aspects of it have charged that its proponents have failed to adequately accommodate concerns about gender and sexuality (Schutte 1993), that it is insufficiently attentive to the way identity categories work (Alcoff 2000), and that despite its condemnation of Eurocentrism, it too is Eurocentric (Vargas 2005).

Although analytic philosophers (whether in Latin America or abroad) have generally ignored the philosophy of liberation (or else dismissed it as unrigorous or unphilosophical), this philosophical perspective has arguably had more impact outside of Latin America than any other Latin American philosophical development. In particular, Dussel has been in dialogue with a variety of philosophers in Europe (including Apel, Ricoeur, and Habermas), and with Continental-influenced philosophers in the United States and elsewhere (e.g., Rorty, Taylor, Alcoff, and Mendieta).[6]

The fourth philosophical current in the Latin American contemporary scene worth noting is not properly an orientation but a field of study: the history of philosophy. Philosophical productivity in this area is worthy of note because its impact has been considerably among philosophers of diverse persuasions. Before 1960, both the quantity and the quality of studies on the history of philosophy published in Latin America were often deplorable. Most works amounted to panegyrics, or mere paraphrases of texts not available in Spanish translation. Moreover, complete periods of the history of philosophy remained outside the scope of those studies. Since 1960, the situation has changed substantially. There are now works that deal with practically every period of the history of Western philosophy, and even Eastern philosophy. Moreover, a good proportion of those studies are serious, revealing knowledge of the pertinent languages and primary sources and adding a critical element without which the history of philosophy becomes merely a gloss.

A development that should be noted in this regard is the appearance of journals specializing in the history and thought of some historical periods. For example, the last decade saw the appearance of journals devoted to the study of the Middle Ages. Although not all these journals are strictly speaking philosophical, their publication is important, because it indicates the existence of the technical background doubtlessly necessary for serious historical research. It also reveals the dedication of Latin American intellectual groups to what might be called “pure research”—the search for knowledge for its own sake without consideration of its immediate practical applications.

Collectively, these facts demonstrate a thematic dexterity in handling philosophical ideas and arguments, a fact that led Miró Quesada to characterize the generations of Latin American philosophers in the period of maturity as ‘technical’. Philosophy has become a specialized and professional discipline in Latin America. Indeed, since 1960, Latin American philosophy has achieved a degree of maturity that compares well with the state of the profession in Europe and the United States.

A final recent development in the United States merits mention in connection with Latin American philosophy. There are now several generations of distinguished philosophers of Hispanic or Latin American descent have worked in the United States and Canada, contributing to traditional philosophical fields such as metaphysics, epistemology, and the history of philosophy. Among these are George Santayana (1863–1952), Héctor-Neri Catañeda (1924–1991), Mario Bunge (b. 1919), Ernesto Sosa (b. 1940), Jorge J. E. Gracia (b. 1942), and Linda M. Alcoff, among others.

In the last two or three decades a new sense of Latino/a identity in philosophy has grown among a group of philosophers who have undertaken work in areas related to Hispanic/Latino issues and have identified themselves as Hispanics or Latinos/as. Among senior philosophers who have been more clearly identified with this movement are two from the mentioned group (Alcoff and Gracia), as well as others, such as J. Angelo Corlett, Susana Nuccetelli, Eduardo Mendieta, and Ofelia Schutte. These philosophers have contributed in particular to the discourse on issues of race, ethnicity, nationality, and feminism, particularly through an analysis of ethnic, racial, and gender identity. One striking feature of much of this work is the remarkable degree to which it is explicitly informed by, or engaged with, Latin American philosophy and its history.

3. Problems and Topics

The third section of this entry focuses on topics that have been of particular concern to Latin American and Latino/a philosophers and that have interest today. These topics offer a general picture of the way these philosophers have approached philosophical problems. Nevertheless, the issues canvassed here are, necessarily, an inadequate representation of the diverse issues and approaches taken up in Latin American philosophy.[7]

3.1 The Rights of Amerindians

Perhaps the oldest distinctive philosophical problem of post-Columbian Latin American philosophy concerns the rights of indigenous populations in the Americas, and the duties of those governments that claimed jurisdiction over them. In the mid-sixteenth century, there were serious reservations on the part of a number of philosophers, theologians, and legal theorists concerning the validity of the Spanish wars of conquest. Francisco Vitoria’s developments of just war theory were among the earliest and most lasting philosophical contributions to the topic. One of the most significant issues for sixteenth century thinkers in Spain was whether the indigenous populations were natural slaves or not. Whether the Spanish Crown could “pacify” the indigenous populations through violence—or whether more peaceful means of persuasion and political control were necessary—was perceived to turn on whether the indigenous populations were natural slaves. Relatedly, the outcome of this dispute had implications for the duties of the Spanish Crown to the indigenous population, and correspondingly, the manner in which the indigenous populations ought to be treated (Canteñs 2010).

The issue reached its apex in a debate between Juan Ginés Sepúlveda, who defended the Spanish Crown’s right to forcibly impose its legal and religious practices on the indigenous populations of the Americas, and Bartolomé de Las Casas, a Dominican friar and the first Bishop of Chiapas. Las Casas argued for a nuanced reading of the idea of natural slavery, while insisting on the full rationality of the indigenous populations, the need for peaceful evangelization of those populations, and for strict limits on the means used on behalf of Spanish interest in the Americas. The results of the debate were inclusive—Sepúlveda’s work was suppressed for a time, but Las Casas’ position on the limits of Spanish use of force never became officially adopted by the Spanish Crown. Nevertheless, Las Casas continued to play a prominent role in the Spanish Imperial court, tirelessly arguing on behalf of the native populations.

Between the seventeenth and nineteenth centuries, perhaps the dominant view of Latin American philosophers (a predominantly upper class group, generally of European ancestry) tended to regard indigenous populations as a “problem” that needed to be overcome. By the late nineteenth century, amidst the considerable influence of Huxley and Social Darwinism, several nations had policies of encouraging assimilation and “civilizing” of the indigenous populations, oftentimes in conjunction with encouraging more immigration from Europe. For philosophers and policy-makers alike, concern for preserving indigenous cultural practices, language, and political autonomy was typically negligible.

In the twentieth century, the concerns and nature of indigenous populations received more varied evaluations from philosophers. For example, Mariátegui (1971) argued that indigenous Peruvians were collectivists, “natural” communists whose economic difficulties were due in large part to the ownership, distribution and use of lands in Peru. In the work of José Vasconcelos (Vasconcelos/Gamio, 1926; Vasconcelos, 1997), indigenous populations in the Americas were something to be assimilated along the way towards the formation of a “cosmic” race of mixed-people. That future population, a mixed-race people, would adapt the best cultural practices from around the world. In the work of Enrique Dussel (1995), the encounter with the Amerindian populations are philosophically important for a variety of reasons, including the formation of Europe as an important conceptual category, the creation of modernity, and what the interactions between conquerors and conquered reveal about the difficulty of understanding the interests and concerns of other peoples.

In the decade leading up to 1992 (the quincentenary of the Conquest) intellectual discussion of indigenous peoples and their interests grew considerably. By the 1990s, there was a flourishing of philosophical work, especially but not exclusively in Mexico, on issues of ethnic identity and political representation of indigenous populations. Luis Villoro, Fernando Salmerón, and León Olivé were among the prominent contributors to those discussions.

In the first part of the twenty first century, philosophical work on aspects of a distinctly Latin American problematic concerning race and politics proliferated.[8] For more on some of these matters, see the section below on the Identity of the People.

3.2 The Identity of the People

One of the most enduring challenges that the peoples of Latin America have encountered in their history concerns the definition of their identity as a people. When Iberians arrived at the Americas, Amerindians were scattered throughout an enormous territory, divided by substantially different cultures, including numerous languages. Iberians imposed a colonial unity on them, but the question of their identity became critical, particularly after Africans were brought in to make up a labor deficit in the Caribbean and the East coast of South America. How do all these peoples fit together as a people or a nation, and how are they to be conceived? The question of identity first surfaced in the discussions about the rights of Amerindians, and later of African slaves, but extended to Iberian born versus American born Europeans.

The issue became critical during the period of independence, when those who fought against the Spanish domination in particular faced the task of forming nations of a population that was diverse in race, culture, and origin. Liberators such as Bolívar and Martí understood well the challenge and rejected race in particular as a divide among the different populations from which they sought to forge unified nations (see Aguilar Rivera and Schutte in Gracia, 2011). They proposed notions of national unity based on a mixed population under ideals of political self-determination.

This emphasis changed after independence, in response to the pressing needs for national development and progress. Positivist philosophers, such as Sarmiento, frequently advocated national policies that favored European immigration as a way of undermining the racial and ethnic differences that divided the population (see Burke and Humphrey in Gracia, 2011). These policies were often based on a negative view of both Amerindians and Africans. Moreover, these policies failed to achieve the goals their proponents sought. The failure of positivist ideas to help define the identity of the populations of the various nations gave rise to a reaction, most evident in the Mexican Revolution, to turn back to the Amerindian past as a way to find a unity that would make nations of the diverse population. Notions of both national and Latin American unity were proposed on various grounds at this time. For some, as is the case with Vasconcelos, the unity is racial, a result of the mixing of the various races that constitute the Latin American populations (see von Vacano in Gracia, 2011). For others—such as Zea—the cultural unity of these populations provided the basis of national or Latin American identity (see Oliver in Gracia, 2011).

The efforts to find an effective way to define the identity of Latin Americans has continued unabated in Latin America, and has found fertile ground in the work of Latino/a philosophers working in the United States. Efforts to define the racial, ethnic and national boundaries of the identity of Latin Americans and of Latinos/as in the United States have been pursued by such authors as Alcoff, Corlett, and Gracia (see Millán and Velásquez in Gracia, 2011).

3.3 Philosophical Anthropology

A corner stone of Latin American positivism was a scientific conception of human beings that was cashed out in psychological terms in order to solve the mind-body problem. Antipositivists attacked this conception of personhood, and set out to develop a philosophical anthropology that would provide an appealing alternative to the positivist conception of persons. Practically every established philosopher engaged in this project. Three major approaches emerged: a vitalistic anthropology, an anthropology of the spirit, and various existentialist/Marxist alternatives.

The group of philosophers who adopted some form of vitalism were strongly influenced by Bergson. On early versions of this approach, a positivist anthropology was rejected on grounds that it has no place for freedom. Among the most important early proponents of this view were Vaz Ferreira (Uruguay), Alejandro Deústua (Peru), Antonio Caso (Mexico), Enrique Molina (Chile) and Alejandro Korn (Argentina). In the work of both Caso and Vaconcelos, the distinctive character of human beings is consciousness of a sort that is purportedly at odds with deterministic or mechanistic views of the world.

The work of these authors and the visit of the popular Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset, opened Latin American philosophical anthropology to the influence of a new wave of European philosophers. In particular, Husserl, Dilthey, Scheler, and Hartman gave rise to a different approach within philosophical anthropology: the anthropology of the spirit. Among the most important proponents of this view were Samuel Ramos (Mexico), Francisco Romero Argentina), Risieri Frondizi (Argentina), Francisco Miró Quesada (Peru), and Leopoldo Zea (Mexico). For Ramos, feeling, not reason, is the central feature of humanity. For Romero, the characteristic that identifies humans is duality; for Miró Quesada, the fundamental question is metaphysical, namely, “What is human?” Doubts about the possibility of finding an adequate theory tended to turn the challenge into an epistemic rather than metaphysical matter.

In the 1950s and early 1960s, Existentialism gained a foothold among philosophers in Latin American. Among the most important Latin American existentialists/Marxists are Carlos Astrada (Argentina) and Vicente Ferreira da Silva (Brazil), who were particularly influenced by Heidegger. Both were concerned with whether there is such a thing as a human essence. Astrada argues that there is not: Humans do not have a determinate essence, and that constitutes their fundamental problem. In Mexico, a variety of prominent philosophers--members of the Hyperion Group--briefly took up existentialist themes, abandoning them with a few short years (Sánchez 2016).

3.4 Latin America’s Philosophical Identity

The notion of Latin American philosophy has been a subject of heated controversy for most of the twentieth century. The controversy has several foci. Five of the most hotly debated ones are existence, identity, characteristics, originality, and authenticity. Is there such a thing as Latin American philosophy? In what does its identity consist? Does it have any distinguishing marks? Is it original? And is it authentic?

The disagreements in the answers given to these questions are deep. There are at least four ways of looking at them depending on the approach used: universalist, culturalist, critical, and ethnic. The universalist views philosophy as a universal discipline akin to science. Consequently, the fundamental issue for universalists turns on whether Latin Americans have been able to produce the kind of universal discipline that one expects when one has science as a model. Its problems are common to all humans, its method is also common, and its conclusions are supposed to be true, regardless of particular circumstances. Most universalists, such as Frondizi, see Latin American philosophy as largely a failure in this respect.

The culturalist thinks that truth is always perspectival, dependent on a point of view. The method to acquire truth is always dependent on a cultural context. Philosophy is a historical, non-scientific enterprise concerned with the elaboration of a general point of view from a certain personal or cultural perspective. Accordingly, the culturalist can allow for the existence of Latin American philosophy insofar as Latin Americans have engaged in developing views from their perspective as individuals or as Latin Americans, and using whatever means they have found appropriate to do so. Whether they are original or authentic, or have produced a kind of scientific philosophy, are irrelevant matters. This is Leopoldo Zea’s position (see Zea in Gracia 1988–89).

The critical approach considers philosophy a result of social conditions, and closely related to those conditions. Some conditions are conducive to the production of philosophy, or what is sometimes called authentic philosophy, whereas others are not. Unfortunately, proponents of this position (e.g., Salazar Bondy, 1969) have typically seen Latin American philosophy as a failure in this respect because of the conditions operative in the region. According to them, Latin American philosophy is, and will continue to be, inauthentic and therefore not true philosophy, as long as Latin American philosophers continue to emulate the views of philosophers from the developed world.

The ethnic approach argues that Latin American philosophy needs to be understood as the philosophy produced by the Latin American people. The notion of Latin Americans as a people is the key to understanding both how Latin American philosophy has unity in diversity. It is one because an ethnic group has produced it, but it differs from place to place and across time because different historical circumstances prompt the people that produce it to address different problems and to adopt different perspectives and methods. This approach seeks to understand how Latin American philosophy can be universal, particular, and authentic, (see Gracia, 2008, ch 7).

Questions concerning the notion of Latin American philosophy were first raised in Latin America in the nineteenth century. However, it was not until the end of the first half of the twentieth century that they were seriously explored, in particular, by Zea and Frondizi. Since then, this topic has been a constant source of discussion and controversy. Indeed, it is perhaps the most discussed subject matter within Latin American philosophy.

3.4 Feminist Philosophy

Since at least the 19th century, feminist academic work in Latin America has had a complicated and generally ambivalent relationship with academic and philosophical work more generally (Fornet-Bentacourt, 2009). For example, after Independence, women were granted greater access to education but recognizably feminist concerns tended to be mostly peripheral to academic and philosophical discussion. This history has led some to argue that feminist philosophy should be centered not in philosophy but in a diverse collection of academic fields and (often activist) social practices. For example, Ofelia Schutte (2011) has maintained that feminist philosophy requires a home in a broader Latin American feminist theory and not in the discipline of philosophy in Latin America because “feminism is too new there to be able to effectively transform centuries of masculine intellectual dominance in philosophy” (p. 784).

Despite feminist philosophy’s ongoing ambivalent relationship with academic philosophy in Latin America, there has nevertheless been a recurring strand of academic philosophical work in an identifiable feminist vein since the end of the 19th century (Oliver 2007, p. 32). For example, Uruguayan philosopher Carlos Vaz Ferreria (1871–1958) gave a series of lectures in 1917 on feminism, which were later published in 1935 under the title Sobre feminismo [On Feminism]. Mexican philosopher Graciela Hierro (1928–2003) published extensively on feminist ethics and the role of feminism in public and academic spaces. Moreover, starting in the 1980s there has been considerable growth in the field, with important work by such figures María Pía Lara, María Luisa Femenías, and Ofelia Schutte. A good deal of recent feminist philosophy has been transnational in its sources, explicitly drawing on academic philosophy in the Americas and Continental Europe, but also drawing from the history of feminist activism in Latin America, social science research, and personal narratives.

The diversity of interests and positions of Latin American feminists makes it difficult to provide a simple but accurate characterization of the field. It is sometimes held that, in comparison to U.S. forms of feminist thought, Latin American feminism has had a somewhat greater interest in the critical analysis of families, class, and ethnicity (Schutte and Femenías 2010, p. 407–9). Consistent with the wider Latin American philosophical tradition’s impulse to self-critical reflexiveness about its tradition, it is perhaps fair to say that Latin American feminist philosophy has been particularly reflexive or self-critical about what it means to pursue feminist philosophy in Latin America. For example, feminist philosophers have emphasized the need to recognize that academic philosophers, wherever they live, enjoy a cultural privilege that may put them at some distance from the living conditions of most women in Latin America (Femenías and Oliver, 2007, p. xi). Given such a model of “epistemic privilege” where, as a matter of actual social practices, the experiences and categories of some tend to be valued over others, a number of feminist philosophers have thought feminist philosophers have a special reason to consider the ways in which feminist goals are conceptualized and represented in popular and academic discourse (Schutte 2011, p. 785).

Although the future of feminist philosophy in Latin America remains unclear, it seems rather likely that a range of its prominent concerns—including activist philosophy, concerns for epistemic and cultural privilege, and reliance on interdisciplinary interpretive frameworks will survive in the interests of a range of academic contexts.


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The authors would like to acknowledge the thoughtful advice of an anonymous reviewer, and feedback from Liam Kofi Bright.

Copyright © 2018 by
Jorge Gracia
Manuel Vargas <>

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