First published Sun Nov 16, 2003; substantive revision Mon Dec 16, 2013

Phenomenology is the study of structures of consciousness as experienced from the first-person point of view. The central structure of an experience is its intentionality, its being directed toward something, as it is an experience of or about some object. An experience is directed toward an object by virtue of its content or meaning (which represents the object) together with appropriate enabling conditions.

Phenomenology as a discipline is distinct from but related to other key disciplines in philosophy, such as ontology, epistemology, logic, and ethics. Phenomenology has been practiced in various guises for centuries, but it came into its own in the early 20th century in the works of Husserl, Heidegger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty and others. Phenomenological issues of intentionality, consciousness, qualia, and first-person perspective have been prominent in recent philosophy of mind.

1. What is Phenomenology?

Phenomenology is commonly understood in either of two ways: as a disciplinary field in philosophy, or as a movement in the history of philosophy.

The discipline of phenomenology may be defined initially as the study of structures of experience, or consciousness. Literally, phenomenology is the study of “phenomena”: appearances of things, or things as they appear in our experience, or the ways we experience things, thus the meanings things have in our experience. Phenomenology studies conscious experience as experienced from the subjective or first person point of view. This field of philosophy is then to be distinguished from, and related to, the other main fields of philosophy: ontology (the study of being or what is), epistemology (the study of knowledge), logic (the study of valid reasoning), ethics (the study of right and wrong action), etc.

The historical movement of phenomenology is the philosophical tradition launched in the first half of the 20th century by Edmund Husserl, Martin Heidegger, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Jean-Paul Sartre, et al. In that movement, the discipline of phenomenology was prized as the proper foundation of all philosophy—as opposed, say, to ethics or metaphysics or epistemology. The methods and characterization of the discipline were widely debated by Husserl and his successors, and these debates continue to the present day. (The definition of phenomenology offered above will thus be debatable, for example, by Heideggerians, but it remains the starting point in characterizing the discipline.)

In recent philosophy of mind, the term “phenomenology” is often restricted to the characterization of sensory qualities of seeing, hearing, etc.: what it is like to have sensations of various kinds. However, our experience is normally much richer in content than mere sensation. Accordingly, in the phenomenological tradition, phenomenology is given a much wider range, addressing the meaning things have in our experience, notably, the significance of objects, events, tools, the flow of time, the self, and others, as these things arise and are experienced in our “life-world”.

Phenomenology as a discipline has been central to the tradition of continental European philosophy throughout the 20th century, while philosophy of mind has evolved in the Austro-Anglo-American tradition of analytic philosophy that developed throughout the 20th century. Yet the fundamental character of our mental activity is pursued in overlapping ways within these two traditions. Accordingly, the perspective on phenomenology drawn in this article will accommodate both traditions. The main concern here will be to characterize the discipline of phenomenology, in a contemporary purview, while also highlighting the historical tradition that brought the discipline into its own.

Basically, phenomenology studies the structure of various types of experience ranging from perception, thought, memory, imagination, emotion, desire, and volition to bodily awareness, embodied action, and social activity, including linguistic activity. The structure of these forms of experience typically involves what Husserl called “intentionality”, that is, the directedness of experience toward things in the world, the property of consciousness that it is a consciousness of or about something. According to classical Husserlian phenomenology, our experience is directed toward—represents or “intends”—things only through particular concepts, thoughts, ideas, images, etc. These make up the meaning or content of a given experience, and are distinct from the things they present or mean.

The basic intentional structure of consciousness, we find in reflection or analysis, involves further forms of experience. Thus, phenomenology develops a complex account of temporal awareness (within the stream of consciousness), spatial awareness (notably in perception), attention (distinguishing focal and marginal or “horizonal” awareness), awareness of one’s own experience (self-consciousness, in one sense), self-awareness (awareness-of-oneself), the self in different roles (as thinking, acting, etc.), embodied action (including kinesthetic awareness of one’s movement), purpose or intention in action (more or less explicit), awareness of other persons (in empathy, intersubjectivity, collectivity), linguistic activity (involving meaning, communication, understanding others), social interaction (including collective action), and everyday activity in our surrounding life-world (in a particular culture).

Furthermore, in a different dimension, we find various grounds or enabling conditions—conditions of the possibility—of intentionality, including embodiment, bodily skills, cultural context, language and other social practices, social background, and contextual aspects of intentional activities. Thus, phenomenology leads from conscious experience into conditions that help to give experience its intentionality. Traditional phenomenology has focused on subjective, practical, and social conditions of experience. Recent philosophy of mind, however, has focused especially on the neural substrate of experience, on how conscious experience and mental representation or intentionality are grounded in brain activity. It remains a difficult question how much of these grounds of experience fall within the province of phenomenology as a discipline. Cultural conditions thus seem closer to our experience and to our familiar self-understanding than do the electrochemical workings of our brain, much less our dependence on quantum-mechanical states of physical systems to which we may belong. The cautious thing to say is that phenomenology leads in some ways into at least some background conditions of our experience.

2. The Discipline of Phenomenology

The discipline of phenomenology is defined by its domain of study, its methods, and its main results.

Phenomenology studies structures of conscious experience as experienced from the first-person point of view, along with relevant conditions of experience. The central structure of an experience is its intentionality, the way it is directed through its content or meaning toward a certain object in the world.

We all experience various types of experience including perception, imagination, thought, emotion, desire, volition, and action. Thus, the domain of phenomenology is the range of experiences including these types (among others). Experience includes not only relatively passive experience as in vision or hearing, but also active experience as in walking or hammering a nail or kicking a ball. (The range will be specific to each species of being that enjoys consciousness; our focus is on our own, human, experience. Not all conscious beings will, or will be able to, practice phenomenology, as we do.)

Conscious experiences have a unique feature: we experience them, we live through them or perform them. Other things in the world we may observe and engage. But we do not experience them, in the sense of living through or performing them. This experiential or first-person feature—that of being experienced—is an essential part of the nature or structure of conscious experience: as we say, “I see / think / desire / do …” This feature is both a phenomenological and an ontological feature of each experience: it is part of what it is for the experience to be experienced (phenomenological) and part of what it is for the experience to be (ontological).

How shall we study conscious experience? We reflect on various types of experiences just as we experience them. That is to say, we proceed from the first-person point of view. However, we do not normally characterize an experience at the time we are performing it. In many cases we do not have that capability: a state of intense anger or fear, for example, consumes all of one’s psychic focus at the time. Rather, we acquire a background of having lived through a given type of experience, and we look to our familiarity with that type of experience: hearing a song, seeing a sunset, thinking about love, intending to jump a hurdle. The practice of phenomenology assumes such familiarity with the type of experiences to be characterized. Importantly, also, it is types of experience that phenomenology pursues, rather than a particular fleeting experience—unless its type is what interests us.

Classical phenomenologists practiced some three distinguishable methods. (1) We describe a type of experience just as we find it in our own (past) experience. Thus, Husserl and Merleau-Ponty spoke of pure description of lived experience. (2) We interpret a type of experience by relating it to relevant features of context. In this vein, Heidegger and his followers spoke of hermeneutics, the art of interpretation in context, especially social and linguistic context. (3) We analyze the form of a type of experience. In the end, all the classical phenomenologists practiced analysis of experience, factoring out notable features for further elaboration.

These traditional methods have been ramified in recent decades, expanding the methods available to phenomenology. Thus: (4) In a logico-semantic model of phenomenology, we specify the truth conditions for a type of thinking (say, where I think that dogs chase cats) or the satisfaction conditions for a type of intention (say, where I intend or will to jump that hurdle). (5) In the experimental paradigm of cognitive neuroscience, we design empirical experiments that tend to confirm or refute aspects of experience (say, where a brain scan shows electrochemical activity in a specific region of the brain thought to subserve a type of vision or emotion or motor control). This style of “neurophenomenology” assumes that conscious experience is grounded in neural activity in embodied action in appropriate surroundings—mixing pure phenomenology with biological and physical science in a way that was not wholly congenial to traditional phenomenologists.

What makes an experience conscious is a certain awareness one has of the experience while living through or performing it. This form of inner awareness has been a topic of considerable debate, centuries after the issue arose with Locke’s notion of self-consciousness on the heels of Descartes’ sense of consciousness (conscience, co-knowledge). Does this awareness-of-experience consist in a kind of inner observation of the experience, as if one were doing two things at once? (Brentano argued no.) Is it a higher-order perception of one’s mind’s operation, or is it a higher-order thought about one’s mental activity? (Recent theorists have proposed both.) Or is it a different form of inherent structure? (Sartre took this line, drawing on Brentano and Husserl.) These issues are beyond the scope of this article, but notice that these results of phenomenological analysis shape the characterization of the domain of study and the methodology appropriate to the domain. For awareness-of-experience is a defining trait of conscious experience, the trait that gives experience a first-person, lived character. It is that lived character of experience that allows a first-person perspective on the object of study, namely, experience, and that perspective is characteristic of the methodology of phenomenology.

Conscious experience is the starting point of phenomenology, but experience shades off into less overtly conscious phenomena. As Husserl and others stressed, we are only vaguely aware of things in the margin or periphery of attention, and we are only implicitly aware of the wider horizon of things in the world around us. Moreover, as Heidegger stressed, in practical activities like walking along, or hammering a nail, or speaking our native tongue, we are not explicitly conscious of our habitual patterns of action. Furthermore, as psychoanalysts have stressed, much of our intentional mental activity is not conscious at all, but may become conscious in the process of therapy or interrogation, as we come to realize how we feel or think about something. We should allow, then, that the domain of phenomenology—our own experience—spreads out from conscious experience into semi-conscious and even unconscious mental activity, along with relevant background conditions implicitly invoked in our experience. (These issues are subject to debate; the point here is to open the door to the question of where to draw the boundary of the domain of phenomenology.)

To begin an elementary exercise in phenomenology, consider some typical experiences one might have in everyday life, characterized in the first person:

  • I see that fishing boat off the coast as dusk descends over the Pacific.
  • I hear that helicopter whirring overhead as it approaches the hospital.
  • I am thinking that phenomenology differs from psychology.
  • I wish that warm rain from Mexico were falling like last week.
  • I imagine a fearsome creature like that in my nightmare.
  • I intend to finish my writing by noon.
  • I walk carefully around the broken glass on the sidewalk.
  • I stroke a backhand cross-court with that certain underspin.
  • I am searching for the words to make my point in conversation.

Here are rudimentary characterizations of some familiar types of experience. Each sentence is a simple form of phenomenological description, articulating in everyday English the structure of the type of experience so described. The subject term “I” indicates the first-person structure of the experience: the intentionality proceeds from the subject. The verb indicates the type of intentional activity described: perception, thought, imagination, etc. Of central importance is the way that objects of awareness are presented or intended in our experiences, especially, the way we see or conceive or think about objects. The direct-object expression (“that fishing boat off the coast”) articulates the mode of presentation of the object in the experience: the content or meaning of the experience, the core of what Husserl called noema. In effect, the object-phrase expresses the noema of the act described, that is, to the extent that language has appropriate expressive power. The overall form of the given sentence articulates the basic form of intentionality in the experience: subject-act-content-object.

Rich phenomenological description or interpretation, as in Husserl, Merleau-Ponty et al., will far outrun such simple phenomenological descriptions as above. But such simple descriptions bring out the basic form of intentionality. As we interpret the phenomenological description further, we may assess the relevance of the context of experience. And we may turn to wider conditions of the possibility of that type of experience. In this way, in the practice of phenomenology, we classify, describe, interpret, and analyze structures of experiences in ways that answer to our own experience.

In such interpretive-descriptive analyses of experience, we immediately observe that we are analyzing familiar forms of consciousness, conscious experience of or about this or that. Intentionality is thus the salient structure of our experience, and much of phenomenology proceeds as the study of different aspects of intentionality. Thus, we explore structures of the stream of consciousness, the enduring self, the embodied self, and bodily action. Furthermore, as we reflect on how these phenomena work, we turn to the analysis of relevant conditions that enable our experiences to occur as they do, and to represent or intend as they do. Phenomenology then leads into analyses of conditions of the possibility of intentionality, conditions involving motor skills and habits, background social practices, and often language, with its special place in human affairs.

3. From Phenomena to Phenomenology

The Oxford English Dictionary presents the following definition: “Phenomenology. a. The science of phenomena as distinct from being (ontology). b. That division of any science which describes and classifies its phenomena. From the Greek phainomenon, appearance.” In philosophy, the term is used in the first sense, amid debates of theory and methodology. In physics and philosophy of science, the term is used in the second sense, albeit only occasionally.

In its root meaning, then, phenomenology is the study of phenomena: literally, appearances as opposed to reality. This ancient distinction launched philosophy as we emerged from Plato’s cave. Yet the discipline of phenomenology did not blossom until the 20th century and remains poorly understood in many circles of contemporary philosophy. What is that discipline? How did philosophy move from a root concept of phenomena to the discipline of phenomenology?

Originally, in the 18th century, “phenomenology” meant the theory of appearances fundamental to empirical knowledge, especially sensory appearances. The Latin term “Phenomenologia” was introduced by Christoph Friedrich Oetinger in 1736. Subsequently, the German term “Phänomenologia” was used by Johann Heinrich Lambert, a follower of Christian Wolff. Immanuel Kant used the term occasionally in various writings, as did Johann Gottlieb Fichte. In 1807, G. W. F. Hegel wrote a book titled Phänomenologie des Geistes (usually translated as Phenomenology of Spirit). By 1889 Franz Brentano used the term to characterize what he called “descriptive psychology”. From there Edmund Husserl took up the term for his new science of consciousness, and the rest is history.

Suppose we say phenomenology studies phenomena: what appears to us—and its appearing. How shall we understand phenomena? The term has a rich history in recent centuries, in which we can see traces of the emerging discipline of phenomenology.

In a strict empiricist vein, what appears before the mind are sensory data or qualia: either patterns of one’s own sensations (seeing red here now, feeling this ticklish feeling, hearing that resonant bass tone) or sensible patterns of worldly things, say, the looks and smells of flowers (what John Locke called secondary qualities of things). In a strict rationalist vein, by contrast, what appears before the mind are ideas, rationally formed “clear and distinct ideas” (in René Descartes’ ideal). In Immanuel Kant’s theory of knowledge, fusing rationalist and empiricist aims, what appears to the mind are phenomena defined as things-as-they-appear or things-as-they-are-represented (in a synthesis of sensory and conceptual forms of objects-as-known). In Auguste Comte’s theory of science, phenomena (phenomenes) are the facts (faits, what occurs) that a given science would explain.

In 18th and 19th century epistemology, then, phenomena are the starting points in building knowledge, especially science. Accordingly, in a familiar and still current sense, phenomena are whatever we observe (perceive) and seek to explain.

As the discipline of psychology emerged late in the 19th century, however, phenomena took on a somewhat different guise. In Franz Brentano’s Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint (1874), phenomena are what occur in the mind: mental phenomena are acts of consciousness (or their contents), and physical phenomena are objects of external perception starting with colors and shapes. For Brentano, physical phenomena exist “intentionally” in acts of consciousness. This view revives a Medieval notion Brentano called “intentional in-existence”, but the ontology remains undeveloped (what is it to exist in the mind, and do physical objects exist only in the mind?). More generally, we might say, phenomena are whatever we are conscious of: objects and events around us, other people, ourselves, even (in reflection) our own conscious experiences, as we experience these. In a certain technical sense, phenomena are things as they are given to our consciousness, whether in perception or imagination or thought or volition. This conception of phenomena would soon inform the new discipline of phenomenology.

Brentano distinguished descriptive psychology from genetic psychology. Where genetic psychology seeks the causes of various types of mental phenomena, descriptive psychology defines and classifies the various types of mental phenomena, including perception, judgment, emotion, etc. According to Brentano, every mental phenomenon, or act of consciousness, is directed toward some object, and only mental phenomena are so directed. This thesis of intentional directedness was the hallmark of Brentano’s descriptive psychology. In 1889 Brentano used the term “phenomenology” for descriptive psychology, and the way was paved for Husserl’s new science of phenomenology.

Phenomenology as we know it was launched by Edmund Husserl in his Logical Investigations (1900–01). Two importantly different lines of theory came together in that monumental work: psychological theory, on the heels of Franz Brentano (and also William James, whose Principles of Psychology appeared in 1891 and greatly impressed Husserl); and logical or semantic theory, on the heels of Bernard Bolzano and Husserl’s contemporaries who founded modern logic, including Gottlob Frege. (Interestingly, both lines of research trace back to Aristotle, and both reached importantly new results in Husserl’s day.)

Husserl’s Logical Investigations was inspired by Bolzano’s ideal of logic, while taking up Brentano’s conception of descriptive psychology. In his Theory of Science (1835) Bolzano distinguished between subjective and objective ideas or representations (Vorstellungen). In effect Bolzano criticized Kant and before him the classical empiricists and rationalists for failing to make this sort of distinction, thereby rendering phenomena merely subjective. Logic studies objective ideas, including propositions, which in turn make up objective theories as in the sciences. Psychology would, by contrast, study subjective ideas, the concrete contents (occurrences) of mental activities in particular minds at a given time. Husserl was after both, within a single discipline. So phenomena must be reconceived as objective intentional contents (sometimes called intentional objects) of subjective acts of consciousness. Phenomenology would then study this complex of consciousness and correlated phenomena. In Ideas I (Book One, 1913) Husserl introduced two Greek words to capture his version of the Bolzanoan distinction: noesis and noema, from the Greek verb noéō (νοέω), meaning to perceive, think, intend, whence the noun nous or mind. The intentional process of consciousness is called noesis, while its ideal content is called noema. The noema of an act of consciousness Husserl characterized both as an ideal meaning and as “the object as intended”. Thus the phenomenon, or object-as-it-appears, becomes the noema, or object-as-it-is-intended. The interpretations of Husserl’s theory of noema have been several and amount to different developments of Husserl’s basic theory of intentionality. (Is the noema an aspect of the object intended, or rather a medium of intention?)

For Husserl, then, phenomenology integrates a kind of psychology with a kind of logic. It develops a descriptive or analytic psychology in that it describes and analyzes types of subjective mental activity or experience, in short, acts of consciousness. Yet it develops a kind of logic—a theory of meaning (today we say logical semantics)—in that it describes and analyzes objective contents of consciousness: ideas, concepts, images, propositions, in short, ideal meanings of various types that serve as intentional contents, or noematic meanings, of various types of experience. These contents are shareable by different acts of consciousness, and in that sense they are objective, ideal meanings. Following Bolzano (and to some extent the platonistic logician Hermann Lotze), Husserl opposed any reduction of logic or mathematics or science to mere psychology, to how people happen to think, and in the same spirit he distinguished phenomenology from mere psychology. For Husserl, phenomenology would study consciousness without reducing the objective and shareable meanings that inhabit experience to merely subjective happenstances. Ideal meaning would be the engine of intentionality in acts of consciousness.

A clear conception of phenomenology awaited Husserl’s development of a clear model of intentionality. Indeed, phenomenology and the modern concept of intentionality emerged hand-in-hand in Husserl’s Logical Investigations (1900–01). With theoretical foundations laid in the Investigations, Husserl would then promote the radical new science of phenomenology in Ideas I (1913). And alternative visions of phenomenology would soon follow.

4. The History and Varieties of Phenomenology

Phenomenology came into its own with Husserl, much as epistemology came into its own with Descartes, and ontology or metaphysics came into its own with Aristotle on the heels of Plato. Yet phenomenology has been practiced, with or without the name, for many centuries. When Hindu and Buddhist philosophers reflected on states of consciousness achieved in a variety of meditative states, they were practicing phenomenology. When Descartes, Hume, and Kant characterized states of perception, thought, and imagination, they were practicing phenomenology. When Brentano classified varieties of mental phenomena (defined by the directedness of consciousness), he was practicing phenomenology. When William James appraised kinds of mental activity in the stream of consciousness (including their embodiment and their dependence on habit), he too was practicing phenomenology. And when recent analytic philosophers of mind have addressed issues of consciousness and intentionality, they have often been practicing phenomenology. Still, the discipline of phenomenology, its roots tracing back through the centuries, came to full flower in Husserl.

Husserl’s work was followed by a flurry of phenomenological writing in the first half of the 20th century. The diversity of traditional phenomenology is apparent in the Encyclopedia of Phenomenology (Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997, Dordrecht and Boston), which features separate articles on some seven types of phenomenology. (1) Transcendental constitutive phenomenology studies how objects are constituted in pure or transcendental consciousness, setting aside questions of any relation to the natural world around us. (2) Naturalistic constitutive phenomenology studies how consciousness constitutes or takes things in the world of nature, assuming with the natural attitude that consciousness is part of nature. (3) Existential phenomenology studies concrete human existence, including our experience of free choice or action in concrete situations. (4) Generative historicist phenomenology studies how meaning, as found in our experience, is generated in historical processes of collective experience over time. (5) Genetic phenomenology studies the genesis of meanings of things within one’s own stream of experience. (6) Hermeneutical phenomenology studies interpretive structures of experience, how we understand and engage things around us in our human world, including ourselves and others. (7) Realistic phenomenology studies the structure of consciousness and intentionality, assuming it occurs in a real world that is largely external to consciousness and not somehow brought into being by consciousness.

The most famous of the classical phenomenologists were Husserl, Heidegger, Sartre, and Merleau-Ponty. In these four thinkers we find different conceptions of phenomenology, different methods, and different results. A brief sketch of their differences will capture both a crucial period in the history of phenomenology and a sense of the diversity of the field of phenomenology.

In his Logical Investigations (1900–01) Husserl outlined a complex system of philosophy, moving from logic to philosophy of language, to ontology (theory of universals and parts of wholes), to a phenomenological theory of intentionality, and finally to a phenomenological theory of knowledge. Then in Ideas I (1913) he focused squarely on phenomenology itself. Husserl defined phenomenology as “the science of the essence of consciousness”, centered on the defining trait of intentionality, approached explicitly “in the first person”. (See Husserl, Ideas I, ¤¤33ff.) In this spirit, we may say phenomenology is the study of consciousness—that is, conscious experience of various types—as experienced from the first-person point of view. In this discipline we study different forms of experience just as we experience them, from the perspective of the subject living through or performing them. Thus, we characterize experiences of seeing, hearing, imagining, thinking, feeling (i.e., emotion), wishing, desiring, willing, and also acting, that is, embodied volitional activities of walking, talking, cooking, carpentering, etc. However, not just any characterization of an experience will do. Phenomenological analysis of a given type of experience will feature the ways in which we ourselves would experience that form of conscious activity. And the leading property of our familiar types of experience is their intentionality, their being a consciousness of or about something, something experienced or presented or engaged in a certain way. How I see or conceptualize or understand the object I am dealing with defines the meaning of that object in my current experience. Thus, phenomenology features a study of meaning, in a wide sense that includes more than what is expressed in language.

In Ideas I Husserl presented phenomenology with a transcendental turn. In part this means that Husserl took on the Kantian idiom of “transcendental idealism”, looking for conditions of the possibility of knowledge, or of consciousness generally, and arguably turning away from any reality beyond phenomena. But Husserl’s transcendental turn also involved his discovery of the method of epoché (from the Greek skeptics’ notion of abstaining from belief). We are to practice phenomenology, Husserl proposed, by “bracketing” the question of the existence of the natural world around us. We thereby turn our attention, in reflection, to the structure of our own conscious experience. Our first key result is the observation that each act of consciousness is a consciousness of something, that is, intentional, or directed toward something. Consider my visual experience wherein I see a tree across the square. In phenomenological reflection, we need not concern ourselves with whether the tree exists: my experience is of a tree whether or not such a tree exists. However, we do need to concern ourselves with how the object is meant or intended. I see a Eucalyptus tree, not a Yucca tree; I see that object as a Eucalyptus, with a certain shape, with bark stripping off, etc. Thus, bracketing the tree itself, we turn our attention to my experience of the tree, and specifically to the content or meaning in my experience. This tree-as-perceived Husserl calls the noema or noematic sense of the experience.

Philosophers succeeding Husserl debated the proper characterization of phenomenology, arguing over its results and its methods. Adolf Reinach, an early student of Husserl’s (who died in World War I), argued that phenomenology should remain allied with a realist ontology, as in Husserl’s Logical Investigations. Roman Ingarden, a Polish phenomenologist of the next generation, continued the resistance to Husserl’s turn to transcendental idealism. For such philosophers, phenomenology should not bracket questions of being or ontology, as the method of epoché would suggest. And they were not alone. Martin Heidegger studied Husserl’s early writings, worked as Assistant to Husserl in 1916, and in 1928 succeeded Husserl in the prestigious chair at the University of Freiburg. Heidegger had his own ideas about phenomenology.

In Being and Time (1927) Heidegger unfurled his rendition of phenomenology. For Heidegger, we and our activities are always “in the world”, our being is being-in-the-world, so we do not study our activities by bracketing the world, rather we interpret our activities and the meaning things have for us by looking to our contextual relations to things in the world. Indeed, for Heidegger, phenomenology resolves into what he called “fundamental ontology”. We must distinguish beings from their being, and we begin our investigation of the meaning of being in our own case, examining our own existence in the activity of “Dasein” (that being whose being is in each case my own). Heidegger resisted Husserl’s neo-Cartesian emphasis on consciousness and subjectivity, including how perception presents things around us. By contrast, Heidegger held that our more basic ways of relating to things are in practical activities like hammering, where the phenomenology reveals our situation in a context of equipment and in being-with-others.

In Being and Time Heidegger approached phenomenology, in a quasi-poetic idiom, through the root meanings of “logos” and “phenomena”, so that phenomenology is defined as the art or practice of “letting things show themselves”. In Heidegger’s inimitable linguistic play on the Greek roots, “ ‘phenomenology’ means …—to let that which shows itself be seen from itself in the very way in which it shows itself from itself.” (See Heidegger, Being and Time, 1927, ¦ 7C.) Here Heidegger explicitly parodies Husserl’s call, “To the things themselves!”, or “To the phenomena themselves!” Heidegger went on to emphasize practical forms of comportment or better relating (Verhalten) as in hammering a nail, as opposed to representational forms of intentionality as in seeing or thinking about a hammer. Much of Being and Time develops an existential interpretation of our modes of being including, famously, our being-toward-death.

In a very different style, in clear analytical prose, in the text of a lecture course called The Basic Problems of Phenomenology (1927), Heidegger traced the question of the meaning of being from Aristotle through many other thinkers into the issues of phenomenology. Our understanding of beings and their being comes ultimately through phenomenology. Here the connection with classical issues of ontology is more apparent, and consonant with Husserl’s vision in the Logical Investigations (an early source of inspiration for Heidegger). One of Heidegger’s most innovative ideas was his conception of the “ground” of being, looking to modes of being more fundamental than the things around us (from trees to hammers). Heidegger questioned the contemporary concern with technology, and his writing might suggest that our scientific theories are historical artifacts that we use in technological practice, rather than systems of ideal truth (as Husserl had held). Our deep understanding of being, in our own case, comes rather from phenomenology, Heidegger held.

In the 1930s phenomenology migrated from Austrian and then German philosophy into French philosophy. The way had been paved in Marcel Proust’s In Search of Lost Time, in which the narrator recounts in close detail his vivid recollections of past experiences, including his famous associations with the smell of freshly baked madeleines. This sensibility to experience traces to Descartes’ work, and French phenomenology has been an effort to preserve the central thrust of Descartes’ insights while rejecting mind-body dualism. The experience of one’s own body, or one’s lived or living body, has been an important motif in many French philosophers of the 20th century.

In the novel Nausea (1936) Jean-Paul Sartre described a bizarre course of experience in which the protagonist, writing in the first person, describes how ordinary objects lose their meaning until he encounters pure being at the foot of a chestnut tree, and in that moment recovers his sense of his own freedom. In Being and Nothingness (1943, written partly while a prisoner of war), Sartre developed his conception of phenomenological ontology. Consciousness is a consciousness of objects, as Husserl had stressed. In Sartre’s model of intentionality, the central player in consciousness is a phenomenon, and the occurrence of a phenomenon just is a consciousness-of-an-object. The chestnut tree I see is, for Sartre, such a phenomenon in my consciousness. Indeed, all things in the world, as we normally experience them, are phenomena, beneath or behind which lies their “being-in-itself”. Consciousness, by contrast, has “being-for-itself”, since each consciousness is not only a consciousness-of-its-object but also a pre-reflective consciousness-of-itself (conscience de soi). Yet for Sartre, unlike Husserl, the “I” or self is nothing but a sequence of acts of consciousness, notably including radically free choices (like a Humean bundle of perceptions).

For Sartre, the practice of phenomenology proceeds by a deliberate reflection on the structure of consciousness. Sartre’s method is in effect a literary style of interpretive description of different types of experience in relevant situations—a practice that does not really fit the methodological proposals of either Husserl or Heidegger, but makes use of Sartre’s great literary skill. (Sartre wrote many plays and novels and was awarded the Nobel Prize in Literature.)

Sartre’s phenomenology in Being and Nothingness became the philosophical foundation for his popular philosophy of existentialism, sketched in his famous lecture “Existentialism is a Humanism” (1945). In Being and Nothingness Sartre emphasized the experience of freedom of choice, especially the project of choosing one’s self, the defining pattern of one’s past actions. Through vivid description of the “look” of the Other, Sartre laid groundwork for the contemporary political significance of the concept of the Other (as in other groups or ethnicities). Indeed, in The Second Sex (1949) Simone de Beauvoir, Sartre’s life-long companion, launched contemporary feminism with her nuanced account of the perceived role of women as Other.

In 1940s Paris, Maurice Merleau-Ponty joined with Sartre and Beauvoir in developing phenomenology. In Phenomenology of Perception (1945) Merleau-Ponty developed a rich variety of phenomenology emphasizing the role of the body in human experience. Unlike Husserl, Heidegger, and Sartre, Merleau-Ponty looked to experimental psychology, analyzing the reported experience of amputees who felt sensations in a phantom limb. Merleau-Ponty rejected both associationist psychology, focused on correlations between sensation and stimulus, and intellectualist psychology, focused on rational construction of the world in the mind. (Think of the behaviorist and computationalist models of mind in more recent decades of empirical psychology.) Instead, Merleau-Ponty focused on the “body image”, our experience of our own body and its significance in our activities. Extending Husserl’s account of the lived body (as opposed to the physical body), Merleau-Ponty resisted the traditional Cartesian separation of mind and body. For the body image is neither in the mental realm nor in the mechanical-physical realm. Rather, my body is, as it were, me in my engaged action with things I perceive including other people.

The scope of Phenomenology of Perception is characteristic of the breadth of classical phenomenology, not least because Merleau-Ponty drew (with generosity) on Husserl, Heidegger, and Sartre while fashioning his own innovative vision of phenomenology. His phenomenology addressed the role of attention in the phenomenal field, the experience of the body, the spatiality of the body, the motility of the body, the body in sexual being and in speech, other selves, temporality, and the character of freedom so important in French existentialism. Near the end of a chapter on the cogito (Descartes’ “I think, therefore I am”), Merleau-Ponty succinctly captures his embodied, existential form of phenomenology, writing:

Insofar as, when I reflect on the essence of subjectivity, I find it bound up with that of the body and that of the world, this is because my existence as subjectivity [= consciousness] is merely one with my existence as a body and with the existence of the world, and because the subject that I am, when taken concretely, is inseparable from this body and this world. [408]

In short, consciousness is embodied (in the world), and equally body is infused with consciousness (with cognition of the world).

In the years since Husserl, Heidegger, et al. wrote, phenomenologists have dug into all these classical issues, including intentionality, temporal awareness, intersubjectivity, practical intentionality, and the social and linguistic contexts of human activity. Interpretation of historical texts by Husserl et al. has played a prominent role in this work, both because the texts are rich and difficult and because the historical dimension is itself part of the practice of continental European philosophy. Since the 1960s, philosophers trained in the methods of analytic philosophy have also dug into the foundations of phenomenology, with an eye to 20th century work in philosophy of logic, language, and mind.

Phenomenology was already linked with logical and semantic theory in Husserl’s Logical Investigations. Analytic phenomenology picks up on that connection. In particular, Dagfinn Føllesdal and J. N. Mohanty have explored historical and conceptual relations between Husserl’s phenomenology and Frege’s logical semantics (in Frege’s “On Sense and Reference”, 1892). For Frege, an expression refers to an object by way of a sense: thus, two expressions (say, “the morning star” and “the evening star”) may refer to the same object (Venus) but express different senses with different manners of presentation. For Husserl, similarly, an experience (or act of consciousness) intends or refers to an object by way of a noema or noematic sense: thus, two experiences may refer to the same object but have different noematic senses involving different ways of presenting the object (for example, in seeing the same object from different sides). Indeed, for Husserl, the theory of intentionality is a generalization of the theory of linguistic reference: as linguistic reference is mediated by sense, so intentional reference is mediated by noematic sense.

More recently, analytic philosophers of mind have rediscovered phenomenological issues of mental representation, intentionality, consciousness, sensory experience, intentional content, and context-of-thought. Some of these analytic philosophers of mind hark back to William James and Franz Brentano at the origins of modern psychology, and some look to empirical research in today’s cognitive neuroscience. Some researchers have begun to combine phenomenological issues with issues of neuroscience and behavioral studies and mathematical modeling. Such studies will extend the methods of traditional phenomenology as the Zeitgeist moves on. We address philosophy of mind below.

5. Phenomenology and Ontology, Epistemology, Logic, Ethics

The discipline of phenomenology forms one basic field in philosophy among others. How is phenomenology distinguished from, and related to, other fields in philosophy?

Traditionally, philosophy includes at least four core fields or disciplines: ontology, epistemology, ethics, logic. Suppose phenomenology joins that list. Consider then these elementary definitions of field:

  • Ontology is the study of beings or their being—what is.
  • Epistemology is the study of knowledge—how we know.
  • Logic is the study of valid reasoning—how to reason.
  • Ethics is the study of right and wrong—how we should act.
  • Phenomenology is the study of our experience—how we experience.

The domains of study in these five fields are clearly different, and they seem to call for different methods of study.

Philosophers have sometimes argued that one of these fields is “first philosophy”, the most fundamental discipline, on which all philosophy or all knowledge or wisdom rests. Historically (it may be argued), Socrates and Plato put ethics first, then Aristotle put metaphysics or ontology first, then Descartes put epistemology first, then Russell put logic first, and then Husserl (in his later transcendental phase) put phenomenology first.

Consider epistemology. As we saw, phenomenology helps to define the phenomena on which knowledge claims rest, according to modern epistemology. On the other hand, phenomenology itself claims to achieve knowledge about the nature of consciousness, a distinctive kind of first-person knowledge, through a form of intuition.

Consider logic. As we saw, logical theory of meaning led Husserl into the theory of intentionality, the heart of phenomenology. On one account, phenomenology explicates the intentional or semantic force of ideal meanings, and propositional meanings are central to logical theory. But logical structure is expressed in language, either ordinary language or symbolic languages like those of predicate logic or mathematics or computer systems. It remains an important issue of debate where and whether language shapes specific forms of experience (thought, perception, emotion) and their content or meaning. So there is an important (if disputed) relation between phenomenology and logico-linguistic theory, especially philosophical logic and philosophy of language (as opposed to mathematical logic per se).

Consider ontology. Phenomenology studies (among other things) the nature of consciousness, which is a central issue in metaphysics or ontology, and one that leads into the traditional mind-body problem. Husserlian methodology would bracket the question of the existence of the surrounding world, thereby separating phenomenology from the ontology of the world. Yet Husserl’s phenomenology presupposes theory about species and individuals (universals and particulars), relations of part and whole, and ideal meanings—all parts of ontology.

Now consider ethics. Phenomenology might play a role in ethics by offering analyses of the structure of will, valuing, happiness, and care for others (in empathy and sympathy). Historically, though, ethics has been on the horizon of phenomenology. Husserl largely avoided ethics in his major works, though he featured the role of practical concerns in the structure of the life-world or of Geist (spirit, or culture, as in Zeitgeist), and he once delivered a course of lectures giving ethics (like logic) a basic place in philosophy, indicating the importance of the phenomenology of sympathy in grounding ethics. In Being and Time Heidegger claimed not to pursue ethics while discussing phenomena ranging from care, conscience, and guilt to “fallenness” and “authenticity” (all phenomena with theological echoes). In Being and Nothingness Sartre analyzed with subtlety the logical problem of “bad faith”, yet he developed an ontology of value as produced by willing in good faith (which sounds like a revised Kantian foundation for morality). Beauvoir sketched an existentialist ethics, and Sartre left unpublished notebooks on ethics. However, an explicitly phenomenological approach to ethics emerged in the works of Emannuel Levinas, a Lithuanian phenomenologist who heard Husserl and Heidegger in Freiburg before moving to Paris. In Totality and Infinity (1961), modifying themes drawn from Husserl and Heidegger, Levinas focused on the significance of the “face” of the other, explicitly developing grounds for ethics in this range of phenomenology, writing an impressionistic style of prose with allusions to religious experience.

Allied with ethics are political and social philosophy. Sartre and Merleau-Ponty were politically engaged in 1940s Paris, and their existential philosophies (phenomenologically based) suggest a political theory based in individual freedom. Sartre later sought an explicit blend of existentialism with Marxism. Still, political theory has remained on the borders of phenomenology. Social theory, however, has been closer to phenomenology as such. Husserl analyzed the phenomenological structure of the life-world and Geist generally, including our role in social activity. Heidegger stressed social practice, which he found more primordial than individual consciousness. Alfred Schutz developed a phenomenology of the social world. Sartre continued the phenomenological appraisal of the meaning of the other, the fundamental social formation. Moving outward from phenomenological issues, Michel Foucault studied the genesis and meaning of social institutions, from prisons to insane asylums. And Jacques Derrida has long practiced a kind of phenomenology of language, seeking social meaning in the “deconstruction” of wide-ranging texts. Aspects of French “poststructuralist” theory are sometimes interpreted as broadly phenomenological, but such issues are beyond the present purview.

Classical phenomenology, then, ties into certain areas of epistemology, logic, and ontology, and leads into parts of ethical, social, and political theory.

6. Phenomenology and Philosophy of Mind

It ought to be obvious that phenomenology has a lot to say in the area called philosophy of mind. Yet the traditions of phenomenology and analytic philosophy of mind have not been closely joined, despite overlapping areas of interest. So it is appropriate to close this survey of phenomenology by addressing philosophy of mind, one of the most vigorously debated areas in recent philosophy.

The tradition of analytic philosophy began, early in the 20th century, with analyses of language, notably in the works of Gottlob Frege, Bertrand Russell, and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Then in The Concept of Mind (1949) Gilbert Ryle developed a series of analyses of language about different mental states, including sensation, belief, and will. Though Ryle is commonly deemed a philosopher of ordinary language, Ryle himself said The Concept of Mind could be called phenomenology. In effect, Ryle analyzed our phenomenological understanding of mental states as reflected in ordinary language about the mind. From this linguistic phenomenology Ryle argued that Cartesian mind-body dualism involves a category mistake (the logic or grammar of mental verbs—“believe”, “see”, etc.—does not mean that we ascribe belief, sensation, etc., to “the ghost in the machine”). With Ryle’s rejection of mind-body dualism, the mind-body problem was re-awakened: what is the ontology of mind vis-à-vis body, and how are mind and body related?

René Descartes, in his epoch-making Meditations on First Philosophy (1641), had argued that minds and bodies are two distinct kinds of being or substance with two distinct kinds of attributes or modes: bodies are characterized by spatiotemporal physical properties, while minds are characterized by properties of thinking (including seeing, feeling, etc.). Centuries later, phenomenology would find, with Brentano and Husserl, that mental acts are characterized by consciousness and intentionality, while natural science would find that physical systems are characterized by mass and force, ultimately by gravitational, electromagnetic, and quantum fields. Where do we find consciousness and intentionality in the quantum-electromagnetic-gravitational field that, by hypothesis, orders everything in the natural world in which we humans and our minds exist? That is the mind-body problem today. In short, phenomenology by any other name lies at the heart of the contemporary mind-body problem.

After Ryle, philosophers sought a more explicit and generally naturalistic ontology of mind. In the 1950s materialism was argued anew, urging that mental states are identical with states of the central nervous system. The classical identity theory holds that each token mental state (in a particular person’s mind at a particular time) is identical with a token brain state (in that person’s brain at that time). A stronger materialism holds, instead, that each type of mental state is identical with a type of brain state. But materialism does not fit comfortably with phenomenology. For it is not obvious how conscious mental states as we experience them—sensations, thoughts, emotions—can simply be the complex neural states that somehow subserve or implement them. If mental states and neural states are simply identical, in token or in type, where in our scientific theory of mind does the phenomenology occur—is it not simply replaced by neuroscience? And yet experience is part of what is to be explained by neuroscience.

In the late 1960s and 1970s the computer model of mind set in, and functionalism became the dominant model of mind. On this model, mind is not what the brain consists in (electrochemical transactions in neurons in vast complexes). Instead, mind is what brains do: their function of mediating between information coming into the organism and behavior proceeding from the organism. Thus, a mental state is a functional state of the brain or of the human (or animal) organism. More specifically, on a favorite variation of functionalism, the mind is a computing system: mind is to brain as software is to hardware; thoughts are just programs running on the brain’s “wetware”. Since the 1970s the cognitive sciences—from experimental studies of cognition to neuroscience—have tended toward a mix of materialism and functionalism. Gradually, however, philosophers found that phenomenological aspects of the mind pose problems for the functionalist paradigm too.

In the early 1970s Thomas Nagel argued in “What Is It Like to Be a Bat?” (1974) that consciousness itself—especially the subjective character of what it is like to have a certain type of experience—escapes physical theory. Many philosophers pressed the case that sensory qualia—what it is like to feel pain, to see red, etc.—are not addressed or explained by a physical account of either brain structure or brain function. Consciousness has properties of its own. And yet, we know, it is closely tied to the brain. And, at some level of description, neural activities implement computation.

In the 1980s John Searle argued in Intentionality (1983) (and further in The Rediscovery of the Mind (1991)) that intentionality and consciousness are essential properties of mental states. For Searle, our brains produce mental states with properties of consciousness and intentionality, and this is all part of our biology, yet consciousness and intentionality require a “first-person” ontology. Searle also argued that computers simulate but do not have mental states characterized by intentionality. As Searle argued, a computer system has a syntax (processing symbols of certain shapes) but has no semantics (the symbols lack meaning: we interpret the symbols). In this way Searle rejected both materialism and functionalism, while insisting that mind is a biological property of organisms like us: our brains “secrete” consciousness.

The analysis of consciousness and intentionality is central to phenomenology as appraised above, and Searle’s theory of intentionality reads like a modernized version of Husserl’s. (Contemporary logical theory takes the form of stating truth conditions for propositions, and Searle characterizes a mental state’s intentionality by specifying its “satisfaction conditions”). However, there is an important difference in background theory. For Searle explicitly assumes the basic worldview of natural science, holding that consciousness is part of nature. But Husserl explicitly brackets that assumption, and later phenomenologists—including Heidegger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty—seem to seek a certain sanctuary for phenomenology beyond the natural sciences. And yet phenomenology itself should be largely neutral about further theories of how experience arises, notably from brain activity.

Since the late 1980s, and especially the late 1990s, a variety of writers working in philosophy of mind have focused on the fundamental character of consciousness, ultimately a phenomenological issue. Does consciousness always and essentially involve self-consciousness, or consciousness-of-consciousness, as Brentano, Husserl, and Sartre held (in varying detail)? If so, then every act of consciousness either includes or is adjoined by a consciousness-of-that-consciousness. Does that self-consciousness take the form of an internal self-monitoring? If so, is that monitoring of a higher order, where each act of consciousness is joined by a further mental act monitoring the base act? Or is such monitoring of the same order as the base act, a proper part of the act without which the act would not be conscious? A variety of models of this self-consciousness have been developed, some explicitly drawing on or adapting views in Brentano, Husserl, and Sartre. Two recent collections address these issues: David Woodruff Smith and Amie L. Thomasson (editors), Phenomenology and Philosophy of Mind (2005), and Uriah Kriegel and Kenneth Williford (editors), Self-Representational Approaches to Consciousness (2006).

The philosophy of mind may be factored into the following disciplines or ranges of theory relevant to mind:

  1. Phenomenology studies conscious experience as experienced, analyzing the structure—the types, intentional forms and meanings, dynamics, and (certain) enabling conditions—of perception, thought, imagination, emotion, and volition and action.
  2. Neuroscience studies the neural activities that serve as biological substrate to the various types of mental activity, including conscious experience. Neuroscience will be framed by evolutionary biology (explaining how neural phenomena evolved) and ultimately by basic physics (explaining how biological phenomena are grounded in physical phenomena). Here lie the intricacies of the natural sciences. Part of what the sciences are accountable for is the structure of experience, analyzed by phenomenology.
  3. Cultural analysis studies the social practices that help to shape or serve as cultural substrate of the various types of mental activity, including conscious experience, typically manifest in embodied action. Here we study the import of language and other social practices, including background attitudes or assumptions, sometimes involving particular political systems.
  4. Ontology of mind studies the ontological type of mental activity in general, ranging from perception (which involves causal input from environment to experience) to volitional action (which involves causal output from volition to bodily movement).

This division of labor in the theory of mind can be seen as an extension of Brentano’s original distinction between descriptive and genetic psychology. Phenomenology offers descriptive analyses of mental phenomena, while neuroscience (and wider biology and ultimately physics) offers models of explanation of what causes or gives rise to mental phenomena. Cultural theory offers analyses of social activities and their impact on experience, including ways language shapes our thought, emotion, and motivation. And ontology frames all these results within a basic scheme of the structure of the world, including our own minds.

The ontological distinction among the form, appearance, and substrate of an activity of consciousness is detailed in D. W. Smith, Mind World (2004), in the essay “Three Facets of Consciousness”.

Meanwhile, from an epistemological standpoint, all these ranges of theory about mind begin with how we observe and reason about and seek to explain phenomena we encounter in the world. And that is where phenomenology begins. Moreover, how we understand each piece of theory, including theory about mind, is central to the theory of intentionality, as it were, the semantics of thought and experience in general. And that is the heart of phenomenology.

7. Phenomenology in Contemporary Consciousness Theory

Phenomenological issues, by any other name, have played a prominent role in very recent philosophy of mind. Amplifying the theme of the previous section, we note two such issues: the form of inner awareness that ostensibly makes a mental activity conscious, and the phenomenal character of conscious cognitive mental activity in thought, and perception, and action.

Ever since Nagel’s 1974 article, “What Is It Like to be a Bat?”, the notion of what-it-is-like to experience a mental state or activity has posed a challenge to reductive materialism and functionalism in theory of mind. This subjective phenomenal character of consciousness is held to be constitutive or definitive of consciousness. What is the form of that phenomenal character we find in consciousness?

A prominent line of analysis holds that the phenomenal character of a mental activity consists in a certain form of awareness of that activity, an awareness that by definition renders it conscious. Since the 1980s a variety of models of that awareness have been developed. As noted above, there are models that define this awareness as a higher-order monitoring, either an inner perception of the activity (a form of inner sense per Kant) or inner consciousness (per Brentano), or an inner thought about the activity. A further model analyzes such awareness as an integral part of the experience, a form of self-representation within the experience. (Again, see Kriegel and Williford (eds.) (2006).)

A somewhat different model comes arguably closer to the form of self-consciousness sought by Brentano, Husserl, and Sartre. On the “modal” model, inner awareness of an experience takes the form of an integral reflexive awareness of “this very experience”. That form of awareness is held to be a constitutive element of the experience that renders it conscious. As Sartre put the claim, self-consciousness is constitutive of consciousness, but that self-consciousness is “pre-reflective”. This reflexive awareness is not, then, part of a separable higher-order monitoring, but rather built into consciousness per se. On the modal model, this awareness is part of the way the experience unfolds: subjectively, phenomenally, consciously. This model is elaborated in D. W. Smith (2004), Mind World, in the essay “Return to Consciousness” (and elsewhere).

Whatever may be the precise form of phenomenal character, we would ask how that character distributes over mental life. What is phenomenal in different types of mental activity? Here arise issues of cognitive phenomenology. Is phenomenality restricted to the “feel” of sensory experience? Or is phenomenality present also in cognitive experiences of thinking such-and-such, or of perception bearing conceptual as well as sensory content, or also in volitional or conative bodily action? These issues are explored in Bayne and Montague (eds.) (2011), Cognitive Phenomenology.

A restrictive view holds that only sensory experience has a proper phenomenal character, a what-it-is-like. Seeing a color, hearing a tone, smelling an odor, feeling a pain—these types of conscious experience have a phenomenal character, but no others do, on this view. A stringent empiricism might limit phenomenal experience to pure sensations, though Hume himself presumably recognized phenomenal “ideas” beyond pure sense “impressions”. A somewhat more expansive view would hold that perceptual experience has a distinctive phenomenal character even where sensation is informed by concepts. Seeing that yellow canary, hearing that clear Middle C on a Steinway piano, smelling the sharp odor of anise, feeling a pain of the jab of the doctor’s needle in receiving an injection—these types of conscious experience have a character of what-it-is-like, a character informed by conceptual content that is also “felt”, on this view. A Kantian account of conceptual-sensory experience, or “intuition”, would endorse a phenomenal character in these types of experience. Indeed, “phenomena”, in the Kantian idiom, are precisely things as they appear in consciousness, so of course their appearance has a phenomenal character.

Now, a much more expansive view would hold that every conscious experience has a distinctive phenomenal character. Thinking that 17 is a prime number, thinking that the red in the sunset is caused by the sun’s light waves being bent by the atmosphere, thinking that Kant was more right than Hume about the grounds of knowledge, thinking that economic principles are also political—even such highly cognitive activities have a character of what-it-is-like to so think, according to this expansive view.

Classical phenomenologists like Husserl and Merleau-Ponty surely assumed an expansive view of phenomenal consciousness. As noted above, the “phenomena” that are the focus of phenomenology were assumed to present a rich character of lived experience. Even Heidegger, while de-emphasizing consciousness (the Cartesian sin!), dwelt on “phenomena” as what appears or shows up to us (to “Dasein”) in our everyday activities such as hammering a nail. Like Merleau-Ponty, Gurwitsch (1964) explicitly studies the “phenomenal field”, embracing all that is presented in our experience. Arguably, for these thinkers, every type of conscious experience has its distinctive phenomenal character, its “phenomenology”—and the task of phenomenology (the discipline) is to analyze that character. Note that in recent debates the phenomenal character of an experience is often called its “phenomenology”—whereas, in the established idiom, the term “phenomenology” names the discipline that studies such “phenomenology”.

Since intentionality is a crucial property of consciousness, according to Brentano, Husserl, et al., the character of intentionality itself would count as phenomenal, as part of what-it-is-like to experience a given type of intentional experience. But it is not only intentional perception and thought that have their distinctive phenomenal characters. Embodied action also would have a distinctive phenomenal character, involving “lived” characters of kinesthetic sensation as well as conceptual volitional content, say, in the feel of kicking a soccer ball. The “lived body” is precisely the body as experienced in everyday embodied volitional action such as running or kicking a ball or even speaking. Husserl wrote at length about the “lived body” (Leib), in Ideas II, and Merleau-Ponty followed suit with rich analyses of embodied perception and action, in Phenomenology of Perception. In Bayne and Montague (eds.) (2011) see the article on conative phenomenology by Terence Horgan, and in Smith and Thomasson (eds.) (2005) see articles by Charles Siewert and Sean Kelly.

But now a problems remains. Intentionality essentially involves meaning, so the question arises how meaning appears in phenomenal character. Importantly, the content of a conscious experience typically carries a horizon of background meaning, meaning that is largely implicit rather than explicit in experience. But then a wide range of content carried by an experience would not have a consciously felt phenomenal character. So it may well be argued. Here is a line of phenomenological theory for another day.


Classical Texts

  • Brentano, F., 1995, Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, Trans. Antos C. Rancurello, D. B. Terrell, and Linda L. McAlister, London and New York: Routledge. From the German original of 1874.
    Brentano’s development of descriptive psychology, the forerunner of Husserlian phenomenology, including Brentano’s conception of mental phenomena as intentionally directed and his analysis of inner consciousness distinguished from inner observation.
  • Heidegger, M., 1962, Being and Time, Trans. by John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson. New York: Harper & Row. From the German original of 1927.
    Heidegger’s magnum opus, laying out his style of phenomenology and existential ontology, including his distinction between beings and their being, as well as his emphasis on practical activity.
  • Heidegger, M., 1982, The Basic Problems of Phenomenology. Trans. by Albert Hofstadter. Bloomington: Indiana University Press. From the German original of 1975. The text of a lecture course in 1927.
    Heidegger’s clearest presentation of his conception of phenomenology as fundamental ontology, addressing the history of the question of the meaning of being from Aristotle onward.
  • Husserl, E., 2001, Logical Investigations. Vols. One and Two, Trans. J. N. Findlay. Ed. with translation corrections and with a new Introduction by Dermot Moran. With a new Preface by Michael Dummett. London and New York: Routledge. A new and revised edition of the original English translation by J. N. Findlay. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1970. From the Second Edition of the German. First edition, 1900–01; second edition, 1913, 1920.
    Husserl’s magnum opus, laying out his system of philosophy including philosophy of logic, philosophy of language, ontology, phenomenology, and epistemology. Here are the foundations of Husserl’s phenomenology and his theory of intentionality.
  • Husserl, E., 2001, The Shorter Logical Investigations. London and New York: Routledge.
    An abridged edition of the preceding.
  • Husserl, E., 1963, Ideas: A General Introduction to Pure Phenomenology. Trans. W. R. Boyce Gibson. New York: Collier Books. From the German original of 1913, originally titled Ideas pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, First Book. Newly translated with the full title by Fred Kersten. Dordrecht and Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1983. Known as Ideas I.
    Husserl’s mature account of transcendental phenomenology, including his notion of intentional content as noema.
  • Husserl, E., 1989, Ideas pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, Second Book. Trans. Richard Rojcewicz and André Schuwer. Dordrecht and Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers. From the German original unpublished manuscript of 1912, revised 1915, 1928. Known as Ideas II.
    Detailed phenomenological analyses assumed in Ideas I, including analyses of bodily awareness (kinesthesis and motility) and social awareness (empathy).
  • Merleau-Ponty, M., 2012, Phenomenology of Perception, Trans. Donald A. Landes. London and New York: Routledge. Prior translation, 1996, Phenomenology of Perception, Trans. Colin Smith. London and New York: Routledge. From the French original of 1945.
    Merleau-Ponty’s conception of phenomenology, rich in impressionistic description of perception and other forms of experience, emphasizing the role of the experienced body in many forms of consciousness.
  • Sartre, J.-P., 1956, Being and Nothingness. Trans. Hazel Barnes. New York: Washington Square Press. From the French original of 1943.
    Sartre’s magnum opus, developing in detail his conception of phenomenology and his existential view of human freedom, including his analysis of consciousness-of-consciousness, the look of the Other, and much more.
  • Sartre, J.-P., 1964, Nausea. Trans. Lloyd Alexander. New York: New Directions Publishing. From the French original of 1938).
    A novel in the first person, featuring descriptions of how things are experienced, thereby illustrating Sartre’s conception of phenomenology (and existentialism) with no technical idioms and no explicit theoretical discussion.

Contemporary Studies

  • Bayne, T., and Montague, M., (eds.), 2011, Cognitive Phenomenology. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
    Essays debating the extend of phenomenal consciousness.
  • Block, N., Flanagan, O., and Güzeldere, G. (eds.), 1997, The Nature of Consciusness. Cambridge, Massachusetts: MIT Press.
    Extensive studies of aspects of consciousness, in analytic philosophy of mind, often addressing phenomenological issues, but with limited reference to phenomenology as such.
  • Chalmers, D. (ed.), 2002, Philosophy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
    Core readings in philosophy of mind, largely analytic philosophy of mind, sometimes addressing phenomenological issues, with some reference to classical phenomenology, including selections from Descartes, Ryle, Brentano, Nagel, and Searle (as discussed in the present article).
  • Dreyfus, H., with Hall, H. (eds.), 1982, Husserl, Intentionality and Cognitive Science. Cambridge, Massachusetts: MIT Press.
    Studies of issues in Husserlian phenomenology and theory of intentionality, with connections to early models of cognitive science, including Jerry Fodor’s discussion of methodological solipsism (compare Husserl’s method of bracketing or epoché), and including Dagfinn Føllesdal’s article, “Husserl’s Notion of Noema” (1969).
  • Fricke, C., and Føllesdal, D. (eds.), 2012, Intersubjectivity and Objectivity in Adam Smith and Edmund Husserl: A Collection of Essays. Frankfurt and Paris: Ontos Verlag.
    Phenomenological studies of intersubjectivity, empathy, and sympathy in the works of Smith and Husserl.
  • Kriegel, U., and Williford, K. (eds.), 2006, Self-Representational Approaches to Consciusness. Cambridge, Massachusetts: MIT Press.
    Essays addressing the structure of self-consciousness, or consciousness-of-consciousness, some drawing on phenomenology explicitly.
  • Mohanty, J. N., 1989, Transcendental Phenomenology: An Analytic Account. Oxford and Cambridge, Massachusetts: Basil Blackwell.
    A study of structures of consciousness and meaning in a contemporary rendition of transcendental phenomenology, connecting with issues in analytic philosophy and its history.
  • Mohanty, J. N., 2008, The Philosophy of Edmund Husserl: A Historical Development, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.
    A detailed study of the development of Husserl’s philosophy and his conception of transcendental phenomenology.
  • Mohanty, J. N.,  2011, Edmund Husserl’s Freiburg Years: 1916–1938. New Haven and London: Yale University Press.
    A close study of Husserl’s late philosophy and his conception of phenomenology involving the life-world.
  • Moran, D., 2000, Introduction to Phenomenology. London and New York: Routledge.
    An extensive introductory discussion of the principal works of the classical phenomenologists and several other broadly phenomenological thinkers.
  • Moran, D., 2005, Edmund Husserl: Founder of Phenomenology. Cambridge and Malden, Massachusetts: Polity Press.
    A study of Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology.
  • Parsons, Charles, 2012, From Kant to Husserl: Selected Essays, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    Studies of historical figures on philosophy of mathematics, including Kant, Frege, Brentano, and Husserl.
  • Petitot, J., Varela, F. J., Pachoud, B., and Roy, J.-M., (eds.), 1999, Naturalizing Phenomenology: Issues in Contemporary Phenmenology and Cognitive Science. Stanford, California: Stanford University Press (in collaboration with Cambridge University Press, Cambridge and New York).
    Studies of issues of phenomenology in connection with cognitive science and neuroscience, pursuing the integration of the disciplines, thus combining classical phenomenology with contemporary natural science.
  • Searle, J., 1983, Intentionality. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
    Searle’s analysis of intentionality, often similar in detail to Husserl’s theory of intentionality, but pursued in the tradition and style of analytic philosophy of mind and language, without overtly phenomenological methodology.
  • Smith, B., and Smith, D.W. (eds.), 1995, The Cambridge Companion to Husserl. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
    Detailed studies of Husserl’s work including his phenomenology, with an introduction to his overall philosophy.
  • Smith, D. W., 2013, Husserl, 2nd revised edition. London and New York: Routledge. (1st edition, 2007).
    A detailed study of Husserl’s philosophical system including logic, ontology, phenomenology, epistemology, and ethics, assuming no prior background.
  • Smith, D. W., and McIntyre, R., 1982, Husserl and Intentionality: a Study of Mind, Meaning, and Language. Dordrecht and Boston: D. Reidel Publishing Company (now Springer).
    A book-length development of analytic phenomenology, with an interpretation of Husserl’s phenomenology, his theory of intentionality, and his historical roots, and connections with issues in logical theory and analytic philosophy of language and mind, assuming no prior background.
  • Smith, D. W., and Thomasson, Amie L. (eds.), 2005, Phenomenology and Philosophy of Mind. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
    Essays integrating phenomenology and analytic philosophy of mind.
  • Sokolowski, R., 2000, Introduction to Phenomenology. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
    A contemporary introduction to the practice of transcendental phenomenology, without historical interpretation, emphasizing a transcendental attitude in phenomenology.
  • Tieszen, R., 2005, Phenomenology, Logic, and the Philosophy of Mathematics. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
    Essays relating Husserlian phenomenology with issues in logic and mathematics.
  • Tieszen, R., 2005, Phenomenology, Logic, and the Philosophy of Mathematics. Cambridge and New York: Camabridge University Press.
    Essays relating Husserlian phenomenology with issues in logic and mathematics.
  • Tieszen, R., 2011, After Gödel: Platonism and Rationalism in Mathematics and Logic. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
    A study of Gödel’s work in relation to, inter alia, Husserlian phenomenology in the foundations of logic and mathematics.
  • Zahavi, D. (ed.), 2012, The Oxford Handbook on Contemporary Phenomenology. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
    A collection of contemporary essays on phenomenological themes (not primarily on historical figures).

Other Internet Resources

  • Open content source of Husserl’s writings and commentary.

Copyright © 2013 by
David Woodruff Smith

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