Legal Positivism

First published Fri Jan 3, 2003; substantive revision Tue Dec 17, 2019

Legal positivism is the thesis that the existence and content of law depends on social facts and not on its merits. The English jurist John Austin (1790–1859) formulated it thus:

The existence of law is one thing; its merit and demerit another. Whether it be or be not is one enquiry; whether it be or be not conformable to an assumed standard, is a different enquiry. (1832 [1995: 157])

The positivist thesis does not say that law’s merits are unintelligible, unimportant, or peripheral to the philosophy of law. It says that they do not determine whether laws or legal systems exist. Whether a society has a legal system depends on the presence of certain structures of governance, not on the extent to which it satisfies ideals of justice, democracy, or the rule of law. What laws are in force in that system depends on what social standards its officials recognize as authoritative; for example, legislative enactments, judicial decisions, or social customs. The fact that a policy would be just, wise, efficient, or prudent is never sufficient reason for thinking that it is actually the law, and the fact that it is unjust, unwise, inefficient or imprudent is never sufficient reason for doubting it. According to positivism, law is a matter of what has been posited (ordered, decided, practiced, tolerated, etc.). Austin thought the thesis “simple and glaring”. While it is probably the dominant view among analytically inclined philosophers of law, it is also the subject of competing interpretations together with persistent criticisms and misunderstandings.

1. Development and Influence

Legal positivism has a long history and a broad influence. It has antecedents in ancient political philosophy and is discussed, and the term itself introduced, in mediaeval legal and political thought (see Finnis 1996). The modern doctrine, however, owes little to these forbears. Its most important roots lie in the political philosophies of Hobbes and Hume, and its first full elaboration is due to Jeremy Bentham (1748–1832) whose account Austin adopted, modified, and popularized. For much of the next century an amalgam of their views, according to which law is the command of a sovereign backed by force, dominated English philosophical reflection about law. By the mid-twentieth century, however, this account had lost its influence among working legal philosophers. Its emphasis on legislative institutions was replaced by a focus on law-applying institutions such as courts, and its insistence of the role of coercive force gave way to theories emphasizing the systematic and normative character of law. The most important architects of contemporary legal positivism are the Austrian jurist Hans Kelsen (1881–1973) and the two dominating figures in the analytic philosophy of law, H.L.A. Hart (1907–92) and Joseph Raz, among whom there are clear lines of influence, but also important contrasts. Legal positivism’s importance, however, is not confined to the philosophy of law. It can be seen throughout social theory, particularly in the works of Marx, Weber, and Durkheim, and also among many lawyers, including the American “legal realists” and most contemporary feminist scholars. Although they disagree on many other points, these writers all acknowledge that law is essentially a matter of social fact. Some of them are, it is true, uncomfortable with the label “legal positivism” and therefore hope to escape it. Their discomfort is sometimes the product of confusion. Lawyers often use “positivist” abusively, to condemn a formalistic doctrine according to which law is always clear and, however pointless or wrong, is to be rigorously applied by officials and obeyed by subjects. It is doubtful that anyone ever held this view, but it is in any case false and has nothing to do with legal positivism. Among the philosophically literate another, more intelligible, misunderstanding may interfere. Legal positivism is here sometimes associated with the homonymic but independent doctrines of logical positivism (the meaning of a sentence is its mode of verification) or sociological positivism (social phenomena can be studied only through the methods of natural science). While there are historical connections and commonalities of temper among these ideas, they are essentially different. The view that the existence and content of law depends ultimately on social facts does not rest on a particular semantic thesis, and it is compatible with a range of theories about how one investigates the social world, including non-naturalistic accounts. To say that the existence of law depends on facts and not on its merits is a thesis about the relation among laws, facts, and merits, and not otherwise a thesis about the individual relata. Hence, many traditional “natural law” moral doctrines—including the belief in a universal, objective morality grounded in human nature—do not contradict legal positivism. The only influential positivist moral theories are the views that moral norms are valid only if they have a source in divine commands or in social conventions. Such theists and relativists apply to morality the constraints that legal positivists think hold for law.

2. The Existence and Sources of Law

Every human society has some form of social order, some way of marking and encouraging approved behavior, deterring disapproved behavior, and resolving disputes about that behavior. What then is distinctive of societies with legal systems and, within those societies, of their law? Before exploring some positivist answers, it bears emphasizing that these are not the only questions worth asking about law. While an understanding of the nature of law requires an account of what makes law distinctive, it also requires an understanding of what it has in common with other forms of social control. Some Marxists are positivists about the nature of law while insisting that its distinguishing characteristics matter less than its role in replicating and facilitating other forms of domination. (Though other Marxists disagree: see Pashukanis 1924). They think that the specific nature of law casts little light on their primary concerns. But one can hardly know that in advance; it depends on what the nature of law is.

For Bentham and Austin, law is a phenomenon of societies with a sovereign: a determinate person or group who have supreme and absolute de facto power—they are obeyed by all or most others but do not themselves similarly obey anyone else. The laws in that society are a subset of the sovereign’s commands: general orders that apply to classes of actions and people and that are backed up by threat of force or “sanction”. This imperatival theory is positivist, for it identifies the existence of law with patterns of command and obedience that can be ascertained without considering whether the sovereign has a moral right to rule or whether their commands are meritorious. It has two other distinctive features. The theory is monistic: it represents all laws as having a single form, imposing obligations on their subjects, though not on the sovereign itself. The imperativalist acknowledges that ultimate legislative power may be self-limiting, or limited externally by what public opinion will tolerate, and also that legal systems contain provisions that are not imperatives (for example, permissions, definitions, and so on). But they regard these as part of the non-legal material that is necessary for every legal system. (Austin is a bit more liberal on this point). The theory is also reductivist, for it maintains that the normative language used in describing and stating the law—talk of authority, rights, obligations, and so on—can all be analyzed without remainder in factual terms, typically as concatenations of statements about power and obedience.

Imperatival theories are now without influence in legal philosophy (but see Ladenson 1980 and Morison 1982). What survives of their outlook is the idea that legal theory must ultimately be rooted in some account of the political system, an insight that came to be shared by all major positivists save Kelsen. Their particular conception of a society under a sovereign commander, however, is friendless (except among Foucauldians, who strangely take this relic as the ideal-type of what they call “juridical” power). It is clear that in complex societies there may be no one who has all the attributes of sovereignty, for ultimate authority may be divided among organs and may itself be limited by law. Moreover, sovereignty is a normative concept. A legislator is one who has authority to make laws, and not merely someone with great social power, and it is doubtful that “habits of obedience” is a candidate reduction for explaining authority. To distinguish genuine obedience from coincidental compliance we need something like the idea of subjects being oriented to, or guided by, the commands. Explicating this will carry us far from the power-based notions with which classical positivism hoped to work. The imperativalists’ account of the character of individual laws is also subject to decisive objections (Hart 1961 [2012: 26–78]; and Hacker 1973). Treating all laws as commands conceals important differences in their social functions, in the ways they operate in practical reasoning, and in the sort of justifications to which they are liable. For instance, laws conferring the power to marry command nothing; they do not obligate people to marry, or even to marry according to the prescribed formalities. Nor is reductivism any more plausible here: we speak of legal obligations when there is no probability of sanctions being applied and when there is no provision for sanctions (as in the duty of courts to apply the law). Moreover, we take the existence of legal obligations to be a reason for imposing sanctions, not a consequence or constituent of it.

Hans Kelsen retains the imperativalists’ monism but abandons their reductivism. On his view, law is characterized by a singular form and basic norm. The form of every law is that of a conditional order, directed at the courts, to apply sanctions if a certain behavior (the “delict”) is performed. On this view, law is an indirect system of guidance: it does not tell subjects what to do; it tells officials what to do to its subjects under certain conditions. Thus, what we ordinarily regard as the legal duty not to steal is for Kelsen merely a logical correlate of the primary norm which stipulates a sanction for stealing (1945 [1961: 61]). The objections to imperatival monism apply also to this more sophisticated version: the reduction misses important facts, such as the point of having a prohibition on theft; the law is not indifferent between, on the one hand, people not stealing and, on the other, stealing and suffering the sanctions. But in one respect the conditional sanction theory is in worse shape than is imperativalism, for it has no way to fix on the delict as the duty-defining condition of the sanction—that is but one of a large number of relevant antecedent conditions, including the legal capacity of the offender, the jurisdiction of the judge, the constitutionality of the offense, and so forth. Which among all these is the content of a legal duty?

Kelsen’s most important contribution lies in his attack on reductivism and his doctrine of the “basic norm”. He maintains that law is a normative domain and must understood as such. Might does not make right—not even legal right—so the philosophy of law must explain the fact that law imposes obligations on its subjects. Moreover, law is a normative system: “Law is not, as it is sometimes said, a rule. It is a set of rules having the kind of unity we understand by a system” (1945 [1961: 3]). For the imperativalists, the unity of a legal system consists in the fact that all its laws are commanded by one sovereign. For Kelsen, it consists in the fact that they are all links in one chain of authority. For example, a by-law is legally valid because it is created by a corporation lawfully exercising the powers conferred on it by the legislature, which confers those powers in a manner provided by the constitution, which was itself created in a way provided by an earlier constitution. But what about the very first constitution, historically speaking? Its authority, says Kelsen, is “presupposed”. The condition for interpreting any legal norm as binding is that the first constitution is validated by the following “basic norm:” “the original constitution is to be obeyed”. Now, the basic norm cannot be a legal norm—we cannot explain the bindingness of law by reference to more law without an infinite regress. Nor can it be a social fact, for Kelsen maintains that the reason for the validity of a norm must always be another norm—no ought from is. It follows, then, that a legal system must consist of norms all the way down. It bottoms in a hypothetical, transcendental norm that is the condition of the intelligibility of any (and all) other norms as binding. To “presuppose” this basic norm is not to endorse it as good or just—presupposition is a cognitive stance only—but it is, Kelsen thinks, the necessary precondition for a non-reductivist account of law as a normative system.

There are many difficulties with this, not least of which is the fact that if we are going to accept the basic norm as the solution it is not clear what we thought was the problem in the first place. One cannot say both that presupposing the basic norm is what validates all inferior norms and also that an inferior norm is part of the legal system only if it is connected by a chain of validity to the basic norm. We need a way into the circle. Moreover, it draws the boundaries of legal systems incorrectly. The Canadian Constitution of 1982 was lawfully created by an Act of the U.K. Parliament, and on that basis Canadian law and English law should be parts of a single legal system, rooted in one basic norm: “The (first) U.K. constitution is to be obeyed”. Yet English law is not binding in Canada, and a purported repeal of the Constitution Act by the U.K. would be without legal effect there.

If law cannot ultimately be grounded in force, or in a presupposed norm, on what does its authority rest? The most influential solution is perhaps H.L.A. Hart’s. His solution resembles Kelsen’s in its emphasis on the normative foundations of legal systems, but Hart rejects Kelsen’s transcendentalist, Kantian view of authority in favor of an empirical, Weberian one. For Hart, the authority of law is social. The ultimate criterion of validity in a legal system is neither a legal norm nor a presupposed norm, but a social rule that exists only because it is actually practiced, that is, used to guide conduct. Law ultimately rests on custom: customs about who shall have the authority to decide disputes, what they shall treat as binding reasons for decision, i.e., as sources of law, and how laws may be changed. Of these three “secondary rules”, as Hart calls them, the source-determining rule of recognition is most important, for it specifies the ultimate criteria of validity in the legal system. It exists only because it is practiced by officials, and it is not only that the recognition rule best explains their practice, it is the rule to which they actually appeal in arguments about what standards they are bound to apply. Hart’s account is therefore in one sense conventionalist (see Marmor 1998 and Coleman 2001): ultimate legal rules are social norms, although they are neither the product of express agreement nor conventions in the Schelling-Lewis sense (see Green 1999). Thus for Hart too the legal system is rule-based all the way down, but at its root is a social norm that has the kind of normative force that customs have. It is a regularity of behavior regarding which officials take “the internal point of view:” they use it as a standard for guiding and evaluating their own and others’ behavior, and this use is displayed in their conduct and speech, including the resort to various forms of social pressure to support the rule and the ready application of normative terms such as “duty” and “obligation” when invoking it.

Law, then, has its ultimate basis in the behaviors and attitudes of its officials. In the eyes of some this still seems to imply a mystifying reduction: how can we generate the oughts of the legal world from the is of official consensus? Concerns of this type part motivate Scott Shapiro’s understanding of law and his attempt to break with Hart’s theory: laws, he suggests, should be conceived of as “generalized plans, or planlike norms, issued by those who are authorized to plan for others” (2011: 155). Understanding law on the model of social planning, Shapiro suggests, frees us from misplaced concerns about its metaphysical basis. Just as you or I can adopt a plan for our day just by willing it, so a legal system’s officials can create or recognize plans for its subjects. To the extent there remains an issue, however, it is not clear that the notion of planning itself offers any deeper explanation. To begin with, planning, whether by an individual or a group, involves setting rules with the aim of achieving certain ends. So the ontology of plans folds into and becomes part of the more general ontology of rules on which Hart was rightly focused. Second, it is unclear whether the mechanics of law are accurately captured under the label of planning (is the law against theft, for example, to be thought of as a plan that people not deprive others of their property?—a somewhat implausible reading of the relevant injunction—or is the planning element exhausted by the decision to create the prohibition, in which case the law is not the plan). Nonetheless, Shapiro’s account helpfully reminds us that the theoretical complexity of law as a social kind does not render implausible an understanding of its foundation based in the everyday actions of its agents. In this he joins Hart.

It is an important feature of Hart’s account that the rule of recognition is an official custom, and not a standard necessarily shared by the broader community. If the imperativalists’ picture of the political system was pyramidal power, Hart’s is more like Weber’s rational bureaucracy. Law is normally a technical enterprise, characterized by a division of labor. Ordinary subjects’ contribution to the existence of law may therefore amount to no more than passive compliance, and in an extreme case perhaps less than this. Thus, Hart’s necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of a legal system are that

those rules of behavior which are valid according to the system’s ultimate criteria of validity must be generally obeyed, and…its rules of recognition specifying the criteria of legal validity and its rules of change and adjudication must be effectively accepted as common public standards of official behavior by its officials. (1961 [2012: 116])

And this division of labor is not a normatively neutral fact about law; it is politically charged, for it sets up the possibility of law becoming remote from the life of a society, a hazard to which Hart is acutely alert (1961 [2012: 117]; cf. Waldron 1999 and Green 2008).

Although Hart introduces the rule of recognition through a speculative anthropology of how it might emerge in response to deficiencies in a customary social order, he is not committed to the view that law is a cultural achievement. To the contrary, the idea that legal order is always a good thing, and that societies without it are deficient, is a familiar element of many anti-positivist views, beginning with Henry Maine’s criticism of Austin on the ground that his theory would not apply to certain Indian villages. The objection embraces the error it seeks to avoid. It imperialistically assumes that it is always a bad thing to lack law, and then makes a dazzling inference from ought to is: if it is good to have law, then each society must have it, and the concept of law must be adjusted to show that it does. If one thinks that law is a many splendored thing, one will be tempted by a very wide understanding of law, for it would seem improper to charge others with missing out. Positivism releases the harness. Law is a distinctive form of political order, not a moral achievement, and whether it is necessary or even useful depends entirely on its content and context. Societies without law may be perfectly adapted to their environments, missing nothing.

A positivist account of the existence and content of law, along any of the above lines, offers a theory of the validity of law in one of the two main senses of that term (see Harris 1979: 107–111). Kelsen says that validity is the specific mode of existence of a norm. In this sense a valid law is one that is systemically valid in the jurisdiction—it is part of the legal system, and identified as such by virtue of its dependence on the system’s social sources. The idea is distinct from that of validity as moral propriety, i.e., a sound justification for respecting the norm. For the legal positivist, this depends on the norm’s merits. One indication that these senses differ is that one may know that a society has a legal system, and know what its laws are, without having any idea whether they are morally justified. For example, one may know that the law of ancient Athens included the punishment of ostracism without knowing whether it was justified, because one does not know enough about its effects, about the social context, and so forth.

No legal positivist argues that the systemic validity of law establishes its moral validity, i.e., that it should be obeyed by subjects or applied by judges. Even Hobbes, to whom this view is sometimes ascribed, required that law actually be able to keep the peace, failing which we owe it nothing. Bentham and Austin, as utilitarians, hold that such questions always turn on the consequences, and both acknowledge that disobedience is therefore sometimes fully justified. Kelsen insists that “The science of law does not prescribe that one ought to obey the commands of the creator of the constitution” (1960 [1967: 204]). Hart believes that law may generate a prima facie duty to obey, grounded in but also limited by fairness—so there is no obligation to unfair or pointless laws (Hart 1955: 185–186). Raz goes further still, arguing that there isn’t even a prima facie duty to obey the law, not even in a just state (Raz 1979 [2009: 233–249]). The peculiar accusation that positivists believe the law is always to be obeyed is without foundation. Indeed, Hart’s own view is that an overweening deference to law consorts more easily with theories that imbue it with moral ideals, permitting

an enormous overvaluation of the importance of the bare fact that a rule may be said to be a valid rule of law, as if this, once declared, was conclusive of the final moral question: “Ought this law to be obeyed?” (Hart 1958: 75)

3. Moral Principles and the Boundaries of Law

The most influential criticisms of legal positivism all flow, in one way or another, from the suspicion that it fails to give morality its due. A theory that insists on the facticity of law seems to contribute little to our understanding that law has important functions in making human life go well, that the rule of law is a prized ideal, and that the language and practice of law is highly moralized. Accordingly, positivism’s critics maintain that the most important features of law are not to be found in its source-based character, but in law’s capacity to advance the common good, to secure human rights, or to govern with integrity.

It is beyond doubt that moral and political considerations bear on legal philosophy. As Finnis says, the reasons we have for establishing, maintaining or reforming law include moral reasons, and these reasons therefore shape our legal concepts (1980 [2011: 266–273] and 1996: 204). But which concepts? If one accepts, as Finnis does, that the existence and content of law can be identified without recourse to moral argument, and that “human law is artefact and artifice; and not a conclusion from moral premises” (1996: 205), it becomes hard to see how the natural law theory he develops rivals rather than accommodates the truth of legal positivism (see Gardner 2001, 225–227). This vitiates also Lon Fuller’s criticisms of Hart (Fuller 1958 and 1964). Fuller has two main points. First, he thinks that it isn’t enough for a legal system to rest on customary social rules, since law could not guide behavior without also being at least minimally clear, consistent, public, prospective and so on—that is, without exhibiting to some degree those virtues collectively called “the rule of law”. It suffices to note that this is consistent with law being source-based. Even if moral properties were identical with, or supervened upon, these rule-of-law properties, they do so in virtue of their rule-like character. Whatever virtues inhere in or follow from clear, consistent, prospective, and open practices can be found not only in law but in all other social practices with those features, including custom and positive morality. And such virtues, if they exist, are minor: there is little, if anything, to be said in favor of a clear, consistent, prospective, public and impartially administered system of racial segregation, for example. Fuller’s second worry is that if law is a matter of fact, then we are without an explanation of the duty to obey. He asks how “an amoral datum called law could have the peculiar quality of creating an obligation to obey it” (Fuller 1958: 656). One possibility he neglects is that it doesn’t. But even if Fuller is right in his unargued assumption, the “peculiar quality” whose existence he doubts is a familiar feature of many practices. Compare promises: whether a society has a practice of promising, and what someone has promised to do, are matters of social fact. Yet promising creates moral obligations of performance or compensation. An “amoral datum” may indeed figure, together with other premises, in a sound argument to moral conclusions.

While Finnis and Fuller’s views are thus compatible with the positivist thesis, the same cannot be said of Ronald Dworkin’s important works (Dworkin 1978, 1986 and 2011). Positivism’s most influential critic rejects the theory on every conceivable level. He denies that there can be any general theory of the existence and content of law; he denies that local theories of particular legal systems can identify law without recourse to its merits, and he rejects the whole institutional focus of positivism. A theory of law is for Dworkin a theory of how cases ought to be decided and it begins, not with an account of political organization, but with an abstract ideal regulating the conditions under which governments may use coercive force over their subjects. Coercion must not be deployed, he claims,

except as licensed or required by individual rights and responsibilities flowing from past political decisions about when collective force is justified. (Dworkin 1986: 93)

A society has a legal system only when, and to the extent that, it honors this ideal, and its law is the set of all considerations that the courts of such a society would be morally justified in applying, whether or not those considerations are determined by any source. To identify the law of a given society we must always engage in moral and political argument, for the law is whatever requirements are consistent with an interpretation of its legal practices that shows them to be best justified in light of this animating ideal. In addition to these philosophical considerations, Dworkin invokes two features of the phenomenology of judging, as he sees it. He finds deep controversy among lawyers and judges about how important cases should be decided, and he finds diversity in the considerations that they hold relevant to deciding them. The controversy suggests to him that law cannot rest on an official consensus, and the diversity suggests that there is no single social rule that validates all relevant reasons, moral and non-moral, for judicial decisions.

Dworkin’s rich and complex arguments attracted various lines of reply from positivists. One response denies the relevance of the phenomenological claims. Controversy is a matter of degree, and a consensus-defeating amount of it is not proved by the existence of adversarial argument in the high courts, or indeed in any courts. As important is the broad range of settled law that gives rise to few doubts and which guides social life outside the courtroom (see Leiter 2009). As for the diversity argument, so far from being a refutation of positivism, this is an entailment of it. Positivism identifies law, not with all valid reasons for decision, but only with the source-based subset of them. It is no part of the positivist claim that the rule of recognition tells us how to decide cases, or even identifies all relevant reasons for a decision. Positivists accept that moral, political or economic considerations are properly operative in legal decisions, just as linguistic or logical ones are. Modus ponens holds in court as much as outside, but not because it was enacted by the legislature or decided by the judges, and the fact that there is no social rule that validates both modus ponens and also the Municipalities Act is true but irrelevant. The authority of principles of logic (or morality) is not something to be explained by legal philosophy; the authority of acts of Parliament must be; and accounting for the difference is a central task of the philosophy of law.

Other positivists respond differently to Dworkin’s phenomenological points, accepting their relevance but modifying the theory to accommodate them. So-called “inclusive positivists” (e.g., Soper, Lyons, Coleman, Waluchow (to whom the term is due), Kramer and Himma) argue that the merit-based considerations may indeed be part of the law, if they are explicitly or implicitly made so by source-based considerations. For example, Canada’s constitution explicitly authorizes for breach of Charter rights, “such remedy as the court considers appropriate and just in the circumstances”. In determining which remedies might be legally valid, judges are thus expressly told to take into account their morality. And judges may develop a settled practice of doing this whether or not it is required by any enactment; it may become customary practice in certain types of cases. Reference to moral principles may be implicit in the web of judge-made law, for instance in the common law principle that no one should profit from his own wrongdoing. Such moral considerations, inclusivists claim, are part of the law because the sources make them so, and thus Dworkin is right that the existence and content of law might turn on its merits, and wrong only in his explanation of this fact. Legal validity depends on morality, not because of the interpretative consequences of some ideal about how the government may use force, but because that is one of the things that may be customarily recognized as an ultimate determinant of legal validity. It is the sources that make the merits relevant.

To understand and assess this response some clarifications are needed. First, it is not plausible to hold that the merits are relevant to a judicial decision only when the sources make them so. It would be odd to think that justice is a reason for decision only because some source directs an official to decide justly. It is of the nature of justice that it properly bears on certain controversies. In legal decisions, especially important ones, moral and political considerations are present of their own authority; they do not need sources to propel them into action. On the contrary, we expect to see a source—a statute, a decision, or a convention—when judges are constrained not to appeal directly to the merits (see Raz 2004a). Second, the fact that there is moral language in judicial decisions does not establish the presence of moral tests for law, for sources come in various guises. What sounds like moral reasoning in the courts is sometimes really source-based reasoning. For example, when the Supreme Court of Canada says that a publication is criminally “obscene” only if it is harmful, it is not applying J.S. Mill’s harm principle, for what that court means by “harmful” is that which is regarded by the community as degrading or intolerable. That is a source-based test, not a moral one. This is just one of many appeals to positive morality, i.e., to the moral customs actually practiced by a given society, and no positivist denies that positive morality may be a source of law. Moreover, it is important to remember that law is dynamic and that even a decision that does apply morality itself becomes a source of law, in the first instance for the parties and possibly for others as well. Over time, by the doctrine of precedent where it exists or through the gradual emergence of an interpretative convention where it does not, this gives a factual edge to normative terms. Thus, if a court decides that money damages are in some instances not a “just remedy” then this fact will join with others in fixing what “justice” means for these purposes. This process may ultimately detach legal concepts from their moral analogs (thus, legal “murder” may require no intention to kill, legal “fault” no moral blameworthiness, an “equitable” remedy may be manifestly unfair, etc.). Bearing in mind these complications, however, there undeniably remains a great deal of moral reasoning in adjudication. Courts are often called on to decide what would reasonable, fair, just, cruel, etc. by explicit or implicit requirement of statute or common law, or because this is the only proper or intelligible way to decide. When the law itself licenses such reasoning should we understand it, with the inclusive positivist, to incorporate moral standards, or, as per the views of their rival, the exclusive positivist, only to make reference to moral principles?

Exclusive positivists offer two main arguments for stopping at social sources. The first is due to Raz (1994: 201–37) and has to do with law’s role in practical reasoning (for criticism see Perry 1989, Waluchow 1994, Coleman 2001, Dworkin 2002, Kramer 2004 and Himma 2019). Although law does not necessarily have legitimate authority, Raz suggests it lays claim to it, and can intelligibly do so only if it is the kind of thing that could have legitimate authority. It may fail, therefore, in certain ways only, for example, by being unjust, pointless, or ineffective. But law cannot fail to be a candidate authority, for it is constituted in that role by our political practices. According to Raz, practical authorities mediate between subjects and the ultimate reasons for which they should act. Authorities’ directives should be based on such reasons, and they are justified only when compliance with the directives makes it more likely that people will comply with the underlying reasons that apply to them. But they can do that, he suggests, only if is possible to know what the directives require independent of appeal to those underlying reasons. If law were to incorporate the moral standards to which it refers it would no longer be able to play this mediating role; identifying the law would require identifying the reasons underlying it. Because the nature of law is partly determined by its role in giving practical guidance, Raz concludes, there is theoretical reason for stopping at source-based considerations.

The second argument challenges an underlying idea of inclusive positivism, what we might call the Midas Principle. “Just as everything King Midas touched turned into gold, everything to which law refers becomes law …” (Kelsen 1945 [1961: 161]). Kelsen thought that it followed from this principle that

It is…possible for the legal order, by obliging the law-creating organs to respect or apply certain moral norms or political principles or opinions of experts to transform these norms, principles, or opinions into legal norms, and thus into sources of law. (Kelsen 1945 [1961: 132])

(Though he regarded this transformation as effected by a sort of tacit legislation.) If sound, the Midas Principle holds in general and not only with respect to morality, as Kelsen makes clear. Suppose then that the Income Tax Act penalizes overdue accounts at 8% per annum. In a relevant case, an official can determine the content of a legal obligation only by calculating compound interest. Does this make mathematics part of the law? A contrary indication is that it is not subject to the rules of change in a legal system—neither courts nor legislators can repeal or amend the law of commutativity. The same holds of other social norms, including the norms of foreign legal systems. A conflict-of-laws rule may direct a Canadian judge to apply Mexican law in a Canadian case. The conflicts rule is obviously part of the Canadian legal system. But the rule of Mexican law is not, for although Canadian officials can decide whether or not to apply it, they can neither change it nor repeal it, and the best explanation for its existence and content makes no reference to Canadian society or its political system. In like manner, moral standards, logic, mathematics, principles of statistical inference, or English grammar, though all properly applied in cases, are not themselves the law, for legal organs have applicative but not creative power over them. The inclusivist thesis is actually groping towards an important, but different, truth. Law is an open normative system (Raz 1975 [1990: 152–154]): it adopts and enforces many other standards, including moral norms and the rules of social groups. There is no warrant for adopting the Midas Principle to explain how or why it does this.

As noted above, Dworkin’s arguments against positivism depend upon claims about the phenomenology of adjudication and about the constraints imposed on jurisprudence by legal disagreement. Mark Greenberg’s recent work takes as its starting point many of Dworkin’s claims, but his conclusions are in several ways more radical (see Greenberg 2004 and 2014). Greenberg’s central argument against positivism is methodological: no one, he suggests, would deny that the content of the law depends at least in part upon social facts. However, the question of which facts—the semantic content or intended effect of legislation, for example—cannot be answered by reference to further of the same: “law practices…cannot determine their own relevance” (2004: 185). Appeal must therefore be made to other kinds of considerations—for Greenberg, considerations about the moral import of our social practices. It is positivism’s error to suggest that law could be practice-based all the way down. That the content of law depends upon social sources, however, is a truth borne out by law in general, as opposed to being established within local legal practices. There is a categorical difference between the validity of the sources thesis—a truth about law as a kind of social practice—and the claim that in the UK, for example, statute renders it is illegal to drive above 70 miles an hour on the motorway. In this way the former explains the latter without circularity, and without the need for appeal to morality.

4. Law and Its Merits

It may clarify the philosophical stakes in legal positivism by comparing it to a number of other theses with which it is sometimes wrongly identified, and not only by its opponents (see also Hart 1958, Füßer 1996, and Schauer 1996).

4.1 The Fallibility Thesis

Law does not necessarily satisfy the conditions by which it is appropriately assessed (Lyons 1984: 63; Hart 1961 [2012: 185–186)]. Law should be just, but it may not be; it should promote the common good, but sometimes it doesn’t; it should protect moral rights, but it may fail miserably. This we may call the moral fallibility thesis. The thesis is correct, but it is not the exclusive property of positivism. Aquinas accepts it, Fuller accepts it, Finnis accepts it, and Dworkin accepts it. Only a crude misunderstanding of ideas like Aquinas’s claim that “an unjust law seems to be no law at all” might suggest the contrary. Law may have an essentially moral character and yet be morally deficient. Even if every law always does one kind of justice (formal justice; justice according to law), this does not entail that it does every kind of justice. Even if every law has a prima facie claim to be applied or obeyed, it does not follow that it has such a claim all things considered. The gap between these partial and conclusive judgments is all a natural law theory needs to accommodate the fallibility thesis. It is sometimes said that positivism gives a more secure grasp on the fallibility of law, for once we see that it is a social construction we will be less likely to accord it inappropriate deference and better prepared to engage in a clear-headed moral appraisal of the law. This claim appealed to several positivists, including Bentham and Hart. But while this might follow from the truth of positivism, it cannot provide an independent argument for it. If law has an essentially moral character then it is obfuscating, not clarifying, to describe it as a source-based structure of governance.

4.2 The Separability Thesis

At one point, Hart identifies legal positivism with

the simple contention that it is no sense a necessary truth that laws reproduce or satisfy certain demands of morality, though in fact they have often done so. (1961 [2012: 185–186])

Many other philosophers, encouraged also by the title of Hart’s famous essay, “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals”, (1958) treat the theory as the denial that there is a necessary connection between law and morality—they must be in some sense “separable” even if not in fact separate (Coleman 1982). The separability thesis is generally construed so as to tolerate any contingent connection between morality and law, provided only that it is conceivable that the connection might fail. Thus, the separability thesis is consistent with all of the following: (i) moral principles may be part of the law; (ii) law is usually, or even always in fact, valuable; (iii) the best explanation for the content of a society’s laws includes reference to the moral ideals current in that society; and (iv) a legal system cannot survive unless it is seen to be, and thus in some measure actually is, just. All four claims are counted by the separability thesis as contingent connections only; they do not hold of all possible legal systems—they probably don’t even hold of all historical legal systems. As merely contingent truths, it is said that they do not affect the concept of law itself. If we think of the positivist thesis this way, we might interpret the difference between exclusive and inclusive positivism in terms of the scope of the modal operator:

  • (EP) It is necessarily the case that there is no connection between law and morality.
  • (IP) It is not necessarily the case that there is a connection between law and morality.

In reality, however, legal positivism is not to be identified with either thesis: both are false. There are many necessary “connections”, trivial and non-trivial, between law and morality. As John Gardner notes, legal positivism takes a position on only one of them; it rejects any dependence of the existence of law on its merits (Gardner 2001). And with respect to this dependency relation, legal positivists are concerned with much more than the relationship between law and morality, for in the only sense in which they insist on a separation of law and morals they must insist also—and for the same reasons—on a separation of law and economics.

To exclude this dependency relation, however, is to leave intact many other interesting possibilities. For instance, it is possible that moral value derives from the existence of law (Raz 1975 [1990: 165–170]). If Hobbes is right, any order is better than chaos and in some circumstances order may be achievable only through positive law. Or perhaps in a Hegelian way every existing legal system expresses deliberate governance in a world otherwise dominated by chance; law is the spirit of the community come to self-consciousness. Notice that these claims are consistent with the fallibility thesis, for they do not deny that these supposedly good things might also bring evils, such as too much order or the will to power. Perhaps such derivative connections between law and morality are thought innocuous on the ground that they show more about human nature than they do about the nature of law. The same cannot be said of the following necessary connections between law and morality, each of which goes to the heart of our concept of law (on which see further Green 2008):

  • (1) Necessarily, law deals with moral matters.

Kelsen writes,

Just as natural and positive law govern the same subject-matter, and relate, therefore, to the same norm-object, namely the mutual relationships of men—so both also have in common the universal form of this governance, namely obligation. (Kelsen 1928 [1973: 34])

This is a matter of the content of all legal systems. Where there is law there is also morality, and they regulate the same matters by analogous techniques. Of course to say that law deals with morality’s subject matter is not to say that it does so well, and to say that all legal systems create obligations is not to endorse the duties so created. This notion is distinct from Hart’s “minimum content” thesis according to which there are basic rules governing violence, property, fidelity, and kinship that any legal system must encompass if it aims at the survival of social creatures like ourselves (Hart 1961 [2012: 193–200]). Hart regards this as a matter of “natural necessity” and in that measure is willing to qualify his endorsement of the separability thesis. But even a society that prefers national glory or the worship of gods to survival will charge its legal system with the same tasks its morality pursues. Unlike the rules of a health club, law has broad scope and reaches to the most important things in any society, whatever they may be. Indeed, our most urgent political worries about law and its claims flow from just this capacity to regulate our most vital interests, and law’s wide reach must figure in any argument about its legitimacy. (A distinct argument, developed most fully by Raz (1994) and Gardner (2012a), is that law not only occupies itself with moral matters but makes moral claims over us. For criticism see Kramer 1999: 83–9; Duarte d’Almeida and Edwards 2014.)

  • (2) Necessarily, law is justice-apt.

In view of the normative function of law in creating and enforcing obligations and rights, it always makes sense to ask whether law is just, and where it is found deficient to demand reform. Legal systems are therefore the kind of thing that is apt for appraisal as just or unjust. This is a significant feature of law. Not all human practices are justice-apt. It makes no sense to ask whether a certain fugue is just or to demand that it become so. The musical standards of fugal excellence are pre-eminently internal—a good fugue is a good example of its genre; it should be melodic, interesting, inventive etc.—and the further we get from these internal standards of excellence the more diverse evaluative judgments about it become. While some formalists flirt with similar ideas about law, this seems inconsistent with law’s place amongst human practices. Even if law has internal standards of merit—virtues uniquely its own that inhere in its law-like character—these cannot preclude or displace its assessment on independent criteria of justice. A fugue may be at its best when it has all the virtues of fugacity; but law is not best when it excels in legality; law must also be just. A society may therefore suffer not only from too little of the rule of law, but also from too much of it. This does not presuppose that justice is the only, or even the first, virtue of a legal system. It means that our concern for its justice as one of its virtues cannot be side lined by any claim of the sort that law’s purpose is to be law, to its most excellent degree. Law stands continuously exposed to demands for justification, and that too shapes its nature and role in our lives and culture.

  • (3) Necessarily, law is morally risky.

It is a curious fact that almost all theories that insist on the essentially moral character of law take law’s character to be essentially good. The gravamen of Fuller’s philosophy is that law is essentially a moral enterprise, made possible only by a robust adherence to its own inner morality. The thought that the law might have an inner immorality never occurred to him. But, as Hart recognized, where there is “a union of primary and secondary rules”—that is to say, wherever there is law—moral risks emerge as a matter of necessity. There are not only newly efficient forms of oppression, unavailable in communities with more diffuse forms of social organization, there are also new vices: the possible alienation of community and value, the loss of transparency, the rise of a new hierarchy, and the possibility that some who should resist injustice may be bought off by the goods that legal order brings. Although law has its virtues, it also necessarily risks certain vices, and this marks a connection between law and morality of a reverse kind.

These three theses establish connections between law and morality that are both necessary and highly significant. Each of them is consistent with the positivist thesis that the existence and content of law depends on social facts, not on the law’s merits. Each of them contributes to an understanding of the nature of law. The once-popular idea that legal positivism insists on the separability of law and morality is therefore significantly mistaken.

4.3 The Neutrality Thesis

The preceding theses together establish that law is not value-neutral. Although some lawyers regard this idea as a revelation (and others as provocation) it is in fact banal. The thought that law could be value neutral does not even rise to falsity—it is incoherent. Law is a normative system, promoting certain values and repressing others. Law is not neutral between victim and murderer or between owner and thief. When people complain of the law’s lack of neutrality, they are in fact voicing very different aspirations, such as the demand that it be fair, just, impartial, and so forth. A condition of law’s achieving any of these ideals is that it is not neutral in either its aims or its effects.

Positivism is however sometimes more credibly associated with the idea that legal philosophy is or should be value-neutral. Kelsen, for example, says, “the function of the science of law is not the evaluation of its subject, but its value-free description” (1960 [1967: 68]) and Hart at one point described his work as “descriptive sociology” (1961 [2012: v]). But a description of what? “Law” is an anthropocentric subject, dependent not merely on our sensory embodiment but also, as its necessary connections to morality show, on our moral sense and capacities. Legal kinds such as courts, decisions, and rules will not appear in a purely physical description of the universe and may not even appear in every social description. (This may limit the prospects for a “naturalized” jurisprudence; though for a defense of the contrary view, see Leiter 1997). Legal positivism, to be sure, is not an “evaluation of its subject”, i.e., an evaluation of the law. And to say that the existence of law depends on social facts does not commit one to thinking that it is a good thing that this is so (nor does it preclude it: see MacCormick 1985 and Campbell 1996). But it does not follow that legal philosophy therefore offers a “value-free description” of its subject. There is a sense, of course, in which every description is value-laden. It selects and systematizes only a subset of the infinite number of facts about its subject. To describe law as resting on customary social rules is to omit many other truths about it including, for example, truths about its connection to the demand for paper or silk. What forms the warrant for our prioritizing the former over the latter? Finnis (1980 [2011: 3–19]) thinks that the only possibility here has to do with the moral reasons we might have for wanting law (that we answer “what?” by answering “why?”) and that the failure of methodological positivism, the failure to achieve a value-free description of the subject, results in the failure of legal positivism. But the question of social significance is not exhausted by our moral register, and especially not only by its positive valence (on which see Dickson 2001). Others point to the notion of conceptual or metaphysical truth as setting the bounds of the question that positivism seeks to answer (for discussion see Raz 2004b). But however these difficult issues are to be resolved, we should not expect legal positivism itself to contribute much. A thesis about the nature of law is not at the same time a thesis about how to understand the nature of law.

It may seem, however, that legal positivism at least requires a stand on the so-called “fact-value” problem. There is no doubt that certain positivists, especially Kelsen, believe this to be so. In reality, positivism may cohabit with a range of views here—value statements may be entailed by factual statements; values may supervene on facts; values may be kinds of fact. Legal positivism requires only that it be in virtue of its facticity rather than its meritoriousness that something is law, and that we can describe that facticity without assessing its merits.

Evaluative argument is, of course, central to the philosophy of law more generally. No legal philosopher can be only a legal positivist. A complete understanding of law requires also an account of what kinds of things could possibly count as the merits of law (must law be efficient or elegant as well as just?); of what role law should play in adjudication (should valid law always be applied?); of what claim law has on our obedience (is there a duty to obey?); and also the more practical questions of what laws we should have and whether we should have law at all. Legal positivism does not aspire to answer these questions (although cf. Murphy 2014: 88–108 for the argument that the theory has important first-order implications for legal practice). Nonetheless, positivism’s claim that the existence and content of law depends only on social facts does give them shape.


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