Naturalism in Legal Philosophy

First published Mon Jul 15, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jun 23, 2021

The “naturalistic turn” that has swept so many areas of philosophy over the past five decades has also had an impact in legal philosophy. There are various forms of philosophical naturalism, all of which have influenced legal philosophy to different extents. Methodological naturalists (M-naturalists) view philosophy as continuous with empirical inquiry in the sciences. Some M-naturalists want to replace conceptual and justificatory theories with empirical and descriptive theories; they take their inspiration from more-or-less Quinean arguments against conceptual analysis and foundationalist programs. Other M-naturalists retain the normative and regulative ambitions of traditional philosophy, but emphasize that it is an empirical question what normative advice is actually useable and effective for creatures like us. Some M-naturalists are also substantive naturalists (S-naturalists). Ontological S-naturalism is the view that there exist only natural or physical things; semantic S-naturalism is the view that a suitable philosophical analysis of any concept must show it to be amenable to empirical inquiry.

Each of these varieties of naturalism has applications in legal philosophy. Within legal philosophy, replacement forms of M-naturalism hold that: (1) conceptual analysis of the concept of law should be replaced by reliance on the best social scientific explanations of legal phenomena, and (2) normative theories of adjudication should be replaced by empirical theories. These views are associated with American Legal Realism and Brian Leiter’s reinterpretation of Realism. Normative M-naturalists, by contrast, inspired and led by Alvin Goldman, seek to bring empirical results to bear on philosophical and foundational questions about adjudication, the legal rules of evidence and discovery, the adversarial process, and so forth. Finally, S-naturalism has featured most prominently in the writings of the Scandinavian Legal Realists (long predating the resurgence of naturalism in Anglophone jurisprudence), whose ontological S-naturalism led them to employ a familiar range of naturalism-motivated explanatory strategies, including naturalistic reduction of legal concepts and non-cognitivist accounts of important aspects of legal discourse. S-naturalism also can serve, and sometimes has served, as a motivation for Legal Positivism in the Anglo-American jurisprudential tradition. More recent forms of S-naturalism, associated with a revival of a kind of natural law theory defended by David Brink and Michael Moore (among others), apply the “new” or “causal” theory of reference to questions of legal interpretation, including the interpretation of moral concepts as they figure in legal rules.

1. Varieties of Naturalism: Methodological and Substantive

Different philosophical doctrines travel under the heading of “naturalism.” We can usefully distinguish two broad and important categories: methodological naturalism (or M-naturalism) and substantive naturalism (or S-naturalism) (Leiter 1998; cf. Railton 1990 and Goldman 1994). Naturalism in philosophy is most often a methodological view to the effect that philosophical theorizing should be continuous with empirical inquiry in the sciences. Such a view need not presuppose a solution to the so-called “demarcation problem”—i.e., the problem of what demarcates genuine science from pseudo-science—as long as there remain clear, paradigmatic cases of successful sciences. Some M-naturalists want “continuity with” only the hard or physical sciences; others seek “continuity with” any successful science, natural or social. The latter is probably the dominant strand in philosophy today.

For M-naturalists, “continuity with” the sciences includes, in the first instance, the Quinean repudiation of a “first philosophy”—that is, philosophical inquiry that proceeds entirely a priori and without the benefit of empirical evidence. (Most M-naturalists do not go as far as Quine, however, in repudiating any role for a priori conceptual analysis: see, e.g., Goldman 1986 for a more typical M-naturalist approach.) Beyond hostility to methods that are exclusively a priori, M-naturalists require continuity with the sciences in two more precise senses, which we may call “Results Continuity” and “Methods Continuity.”

Results Continuity requires that the substantive claims of philosophical theories be supported or justified by the results of the sciences. For example, epistemologists like Goldman look to the results of psychology and cognitive science to find out how the human cognitive apparatus really works; only with that information in hand can the epistemologist construct norms for how humans ought to form beliefs (Goldman 1978, 1986). Similarly, moral philosophers like Allan Gibbard and Peter Railton, despite profound substantive disagreements, both think that a satisfactory account of morality’s nature and function must be supported by the results of evolutionary biology, our best going theory for how we got to be the way we are (Gibbard 1990; Railton 1986). A philosophical account of morality that explains its nature and function in ways that would be impossible according to evolutionary theory would not, by naturalistic scruples, be an acceptable philosophical theory.

“Methods Continuity,” by contrast, demands only that philosophical theories emulate the methods of inquiry of successful sciences. “Methods” should be construed broadly here to encompass not only, say, the experimental method, but also the styles of explanation (e.g., identification of causes that determine, ceteris paribus, their effects) employed in the sciences. Such a view does not presuppose the methodological unity of the various sciences, only that successful sciences have some methodological uniqueness, even if this is not exactly the same across all the sciences. Historically, Methods Continuity has constituted the most important type of naturalism in philosophy; it is found in writers like Spinoza, Hume, and Nietzsche. (However, unlike the contemporary M-naturalists who draw on the actual results of established sciences, many historical M-naturalists drawn to Methods Continuity simply try to emulate a scientific way of understanding the world in developing their philosophical theories.)

M-naturalists, then, construct philosophical theories that are continuous with the sciences either in virtue of their dependence upon the actual results of scientific method in different domains or in virtue of their employment and emulation of distinctively scientific ways of looking at and explaining things. We may still distinguish between two different branches of M-naturalism, represented best by Quine, on the hand, and Goldman, on the other. The former we will call Replacement Naturalism, the latter Normative Naturalism. Goldman’s paradigm of Normative Naturalism has dominated research in philosophy (see Kitcher 1992), though it is Quine’s notion of Replacement Naturalism that proves useful for understanding the American Legal Realists as naturalists in legal philosophy (Leiter 1997). Since both Replacement and Normative Naturalists share the methodological commitment distinctive of naturalism—to make philosophical theorizing continuous with and dependent upon scientific theorizing—the difference must be located elsewhere: not in methodology, but in goal. According to Replacement Naturalists, the goal of theorizing is description or explanation; to that end, conceptual and justificatory theories are to be replaced by empirical and descriptive theories. According to Normative Naturalists, the goal is regulation of practice through the promulgation of norms or standards. Of course, traditional epistemology also shares the regulative goal of Normative Naturalism; what distinguishes the Normative Naturalist is simply the methods employed to realize this objective (cf. Goldman 1986, pp. 6–9).

Many naturalists go beyond methodological naturalism, however, and embrace a substantive doctrine. S-naturalism in philosophy is either the (ontological) view that the only things that exist are natural or physical things; or the (semantic) view that a suitable philosophical analysis of any concept must show it to be amenable to empirical inquiry. In the ontological sense, S-naturalism is often taken to entail physicalism, the doctrine that only those properties picked out by the laws of the physical sciences are real. In the semantic sense, S-naturalism is just the view that predicates must be analyzable in terms that admit of empirical inquiry: so, e.g., a semantic S-naturalist might claim that “morally good” can be analyzed in terms of characteristics like “maximizing human well-being” that admit of empirical inquiry by psychology and physiology (assuming that well-being is a complex psycho-physical state).

Many philosophers are drawn to some type of S-naturalism in virtue of their M-naturalism: being a philosophical naturalist in the methodological sense sometimes leads a philosopher to think that the best philosophical account of some concept or domain will be in terms that are substantively naturalistic. However, it is important to notice that a commitment to Methodological Naturalism does not necessarily entail any substantive conclusions: methodologically, it is an open question whether the best philosophical account of morality or mentality or law must be in substantively naturalistic terms.

The varieties of philosophical naturalism map on to a variety of naturalistic approaches in legal philosophy. The most radical version of M-naturalism, Replacement Naturalism, has been articulated and defended by Leiter (2001b) and arguably by the American Legal Realists (Llewellyn 1930; Moore and Callahan 1943; Leiter 1997). The less radical form of M-naturalism, Normative Naturalism, is exemplified in epistemology by Goldman (1978, 1986), but its implications for jurisprudence and law have been, to date, only partly developed (Allen & Leiter 2001; Goldman 1999; Leiter 1998; Talbott & Goldman 1998). S-naturalism features most prominently in the writings of the Scandinavian Legal Realists. S-naturalism has also played a role in motivating Legal Positivism in the Anglo-American legal-philosophical tradition. More recently, S-naturalism without normative skepticism has been defended by contemporary moral realists and natural law theorists like Brink (1988, 1989, 2001) and Moore (1985, 1992b).

2. Replacement Naturalism I: Against Conceptual Analysis

Replacement Naturalism holds that conceptual and justificatory theories—the traditional fare of philosophy—are to be replaced by empirical and descriptive theories. There are two kinds of argumentative routes to Replacement Naturalism, both traceable to Quine: the first arises from doubts about the analytic-synthetic distinction (Quine 1951); the second from doubts about foundationalism (Quine 1969). Here we consider the former.

Philosophers have long thought that some truths were necessary while others were contingent; in the twentieth century, under the influence of logical positivism, this was taken to be the distinction between those statements that were “true in virtue of meaning” (hence necessarily true) and those that were “true in virtue of fact” (hence only contingently true). The former “analytic” truths were the proper domain of philosophy; the latter “synthetic” truths the proper domain of empirical science. Quine argued that the distinction could not be sustained: all statements are, in principle, answerable to experience, and, conversely, all statements can be maintained in the face of experience as long as we adjust other parts of our picture of the world. So there is no hard distinction between claims that are “true in virtue of meaning” and “true in virtue of facts,” or between “necessary” and “contingent” truths; there is simply the socio-historical fact that, at any given point in the history of inquiry, there are some statements we are unlikely to give up in the face of recalcitrant empirical evidence and others that we are quite willing to give up in light of new empirical evidence.

Without a domain of analytic truths—truths that are a priori and hold in virtue of meaning—it becomes unclear what special domain of expertise for philosophical reflection remains. If all claims are, in principle, revisable in light of empirical evidence, why not let all questions fall to empirical science? Philosophy would be out of business, except perhaps as the abstract, reflective branch of empirical science. This Quinean attack has consequences for the traditional philosophical business of conceptual analysis, since on the dominant view from Plato through Carnap “every analysis of a concept is inextricably bound to a collection of purported analyticities” (Laurence & Margolis 1999, p. 18). The conclusion Replacement Naturalists draw from the preceding is that since any claim of conceptual analysis is vulnerable to the demands of a posteriori (i.e., empirical) theory construction, philosophy must proceed in tandem with empirical science, not as the arbiter of its claims, but as a reflective attempt at synoptic clarity about the state of empirical knowledge.

Many resist this conclusion. According to one proponent, a conceptual analysis proceeds “by appeal to what seems to us most obvious and central about [the concept in question]…as revealed by our intuitions about possible cases” (Jackson 1998, p. 31). “[T]he general coincidence in intuitive responses [to possible cases] reveals something about the folk theory of [the concept in question]” (Jackson, 1998, p. 32). But the question that plagues conceptual analysis, post-Quine, is what kind of knowledge such a procedure actually yields. Why should ordinary intuitions about the extension of a concept be deemed reliable or informative? Why think the “folk” are right?

The track record of a priori methods like appeal to intuitions and conceptual analysis is not a promising one (e.g., Harman 1994; Hintikka 1999). Kant, for example, took it to be a priori that space necessarily had the structure described by Euclidean geometry; subsequent physics showed his intuitions to be mistaken. The lesson naturalists draw from this track record of a priori philosophy is well-expressed by Cummins (1999, pp. 117–18):

We can give up on intuitions about the nature of space and time and ask instead what sort of beasts space and time must be if current physical theory is to be true and explanatory. We can give up on intuitions about representational content and ask instead what representation must be if current cognitive theory is to be true and explanatory.

For the Replacement Naturalist, in short, the only sound reason to prefer a proposed conceptual analysis is not because it seems intuitively obvious, but because it earns its place by figuring in successful a posteriori theories of the world. Philosophy qua conceptual analysis and intuition-pumping should be abandoned in favor of empirical science; philosophy is simply the more abstract and reflective part of empirical science and lays claim to no distinctive methods or body of knowledge.

Defenders of conceptual analysis, it is true, commonly proclaim the modesty of their ambitions. Indeed, Frank Jackson specifically chastises conceptual analysis in its “immodest role,” namely when “it gives intuitions…too big a place in determining what the world is like” (1998, pp. 43–44): “There is nothing sacrosanct about folk theory. It has served us well but not so well that it would be irrational to make changes to it in the light of reflection on exactly what it involves, and in the light of one or another empirical discovery about us and our world” (Jackson 1998, p. 44). The question is, having conceded this much, what remains? Conceptual analysis, as Jackson conceives it, becomes hard to distinguish from banal descriptive sociology of the Gallup-poll variety. (Jackson even says he advocates, when necessary, “doing serious opinion polls on people’s responses to various cases” [1998, p. 36].) Such a procedure might deliver some insight about what some people, at some time, in some place, think about “mind” or “law” or “justice,” but Replacement Naturalists wonder what philosophical import any of this data could have, since it is bounded not simply by time and place, but also by ignorance. Yet, as Ian Farrell (2006) has argued, such a procedure may serve an important theoretical purpose, even if its claims are vulnerable to revision.

How might Replacement Naturalism in legal philosophy, motivated by these Quinean doubts about conceptual analysis and intuitions, proceed? Leiter (2001b) suggests one possibility, which invokes the following example. Joseph Raz (1985) has offered an influential conceptual argument against Soft Legal Positivism’s claim that there is no constraint on the content of a rule of recognition beyond the fact that it is a social rule: its existence-conditions are given by the actual practice of officials in deciding disputes, but what criteria of legality officials appeal to (i.e., the content of the rule of recognition) is dependent upon whatever the conventional practice of officials in that society happens to be. Raz offers an analysis of the concept of authority to show that Soft Positivism is incompatible, even in principle, with the law’s having the authority it claims to have. According to Raz, it is a non-normative prerequisite for a claim to authority that it be possible to identify the authority’s directive without reference to the underlying “dependent” reasons for that directive. This is a prerequisite for authority because what distinguishes a (practical) authority, on Raz’s “service” conception, is that its directives preempt consideration of the underlying reasons for what we ought to do, and thereby make it more likely that we will do what we really ought to do. Authoritative reasons are claimed to be exclusionary reasons, excluding from consideration those dependent reasons (including, importantly, moral reasons) on which the authoritative directive rests. Soft Positivism, then, undermines the possibility of the rule of recognition claiming authority, since for Soft Positivism a rule of recognition can, in principle, employ dependent reasons as criteria of legal validity. Thus, it would be impossible to identify such a rule of recognition’s directives about legal validity without recourse to precisely the dependent reasons the rule was supposed to preempt.

One line of response to Raz has appealed to contrary intuitions about the concept of authority. Stephen Perry (1987), for example, argues that authoritative reasons need not be exclusionary in Raz’s sense; it suffices, Perry says, that they simply be “weightier” than other reasons. Some commentators’ intuitions line up with Raz’s (Leiter 2001b), others with Perry (Waluchow 1994). Now, of course, the Quinean worries about conceptual analysis hold even in cases where everyone’s intuitions about a concept coincide; but when they do not coincide, the inadequacies of the philosophical methods at hand seem especially acute. Some proponents of traditional methods of legal philosophy object that “the mere fact that there is disagreement about what the conceptual truths of law are…does not mean that conceptual analysis of law is fruitless. If that were the case, we should have to conclude the same about philosophy generally” (Coleman 2001, p. 211 n. 38). Unfortunately, this reductio response depends on a conclusion that the Replacement Naturalist is, in fact, prepared to embrace—and not because the Replacement Naturalist naively believes empirical methods “would…put an end to disputes about the nature of law or anything else” (Coleman 2001, p. 211 n.38). The worry, rather, is that intuitions about concepts enjoy no privileged epistemic status, while claims in empirical science do. Even if empirical science does not resolve these disputes, it at least delineates criteria with epistemic weight for adjudicating them. The crucial question, then, becomes whether our best empirical science requires drawing the conceptual lines one way rather than another.

The leading social-scientific accounts of judicial decision-making—both the informal ones (Pritchett 1949; Powe 2000) and the formal ones (Segal & Spaeth 1993)—have two striking features in this regard. First, they all aim to account for the relative causal contribution of “law” and non-law factors (e.g., political ideologies or “attitudes”) to judicial decisions. Second, they demarcate “law” from non-law factors in typical Hard Positivist terms, i.e., they generally treat as “law” only pedigreed norms, like legislative enactments and prior holdings of courts (as well as, sometimes, the interpretive methods applied to these kinds of legal sources: see the treatment of the “legal model” in Segal & Spaeth 1993, pp. 33–53). If these models were ultimately vindicated empirically—and not just for American courts—this would give the Replacement Naturalist reason to abandon any a priori, intuitive confidence we had about the concept of law that conflicted with Hard Positivism—just as the role of non-Euclidean geometry in parts of physics has led everyone to repudiate Kant’s a priori intuitive confidence about the Euclidean structure of space. If social science really cuts the causal joints of the legal world in Hard Positivist terms, the Replacement Naturalist argues, that is a compelling reason to work with that concept of law as against its competitors.

Proponents of conceptual analysis, by contrast, are skeptical that the explanatory premises of empirical social scientists give us any reason to prefer one concept of law to another. Notice, of course, that an analogous skepticism is available to the diehard Euclidean: after all, non-Euclidean geometries are famously non-intuitive and hard to grasp. But even those sympathetic to Kant’s view that space is necessarily Euclidean would have to admit that such a response would be unmotivated: if non-Euclidean geometry does explanatory work within successful physical theory, then the right conclusion to draw is that our intuitions about the structure of space need tutoring to keep pace with empirical knowledge. So, too, the analogous question for the natural lawyer or Soft Positivist is: why think your intuitions are epistemically privileged as opposed to simply untutored by the best empirical science?

The skeptic, however, might refine the challenge as follows: “It’s not,” she might say, “that I insist on sticking to my intuitions, empirical science be damned. Rather, I do not see why the empirical science at issue needs to take sides on a dispute about the concept of law.” Of course, it is clear that the empirical social science at issue draws the line between legal and non-legal norms based on pedigree criteria, but the question is whether it needs to: the natural lawyer could agree with the social scientists that, e.g., moral and political considerations determine judicial decisions, but contest the assumption that these considerations are not themselves legally binding.

The difficulty, of course, is that the candidate non-law explanatory factors at issue (e.g., an ideological commitment to the Republican Party platform) are not plausible candidates for being legal norms, on any existing theory of the concept of law. Moreover, there are good reasons why social science treats the explanatory factors at issue as non-legal. For example, the moral and political attitudes invoked to explain decisions do not appear explicitly in the text of judicial opinions or in courts’ explicit rationales for reaching particular outcomes; they are often hidden and hard to detect, which makes them quite unlike any of the paradigm instances of legal norms, such as statutory provisions or judicial precedents. Finally, the legal/non-legal demarcation in empirical social science usually reflects more general explanatory premises about the psycho-social factors that account for behavior, well beyond the realm of the legal. The motivation for demarcating the legal/non-legal in essentially Hard Positivist terms is, for most social scientists, to effect an explanatory unification of legal phenomena with other political and social behavior.

Yet the very talk of “legal phenomena” may invite a different kind of objection to the proposed naturalization of jurisprudential questions. For how is it, one might wonder, that the social scientist knows these are legal phenomena he is explaining, and not phenomena of some other kind? Does that not already presuppose an analysis of the concept of law? (Cf. Coleman 2001, pp. 213–214.) It is not obvious, though, why a shared language and dictionaries (or even an explicit definition of terms, as, for example, Newton deploys at the start of Principia Mathematica) won’t often suffice to get empirical science off the ground. It is not that empirical science needs conceptual analysis to tell this explanatory story, it’s rather that after the fact the philosopher may be able to offer some greater reflective clarity about the concepts invoked in the explanatory story. To the extent a conceptual analysis helps, it helps after we discover which way of cutting the causal joints of the social world works best, according to the naturalist.

All these rejoinders on behalf of naturalism, however, are predicated on the assumption that we have a robust social-scientific account of law. Yet it is now plain we do not. (See, e.g., Leiter 2007, pp. 192 ff.) The best social-scientific accounts of adjudication, for example, boast predictive success that is so feeble (better than coin-tosses, but not much!) that their explanatory models, with their implicit concepts of law, earn no epistemic credence. When it comes to the “concept of law” itself, we may have nothing more than intuitions, however epistemically feeble, on which to rely. And perhaps they are not as epistemically feeble as the naturalist originally thought? Law, after all, is not a natural kind, but a complicated kind of social artifact, and it seems far more plausible that social artifacts will depend on folk intuitions and how people use language: so perhaps traditional conceptual-analytic methodology, of the kind H.L.A. Hart utilized in The Concept of Law, is the right one after all for its subject-matter (cf. Langlinais & Leiter 2016)?

3. Replacement Naturalism II: American Legal Realism

The locus classicus of the second kind of Replacement Naturalism—the one deriving from an attack on foundationalism—is Quine’s “Epistemology Naturalized” (1969). The central enterprise of epistemology on Quine’s view is to understand the relation between our theories of the world and the evidence (sensory input) on which they are based. Quine’s target is one influential construal of this project: Cartesian foundationalism, particularly in the sophisticated form given to it in the twentieth century by Rudolf Carnap in Der Logische Aufbau der Welt (1928). The foundationalist wants an account of the theory-evidence relation that would vindicate the privileged epistemic status of at least some subset of our theories: our theories (in particular, our best theories of natural science) are to be “grounded” in indubitable evidence (i.e., immediate sense impressions). Quine deems foundationalism a failure: the semantic part of the program is rendered unrealizable by meaning holism (theoretical terms get their meanings from their place in the whole theoretical framework, not in virtue of some point-by-point contact with sensory input), while the epistemic part of the program is defeated by the Duhem–Quine thesis about the underdetermination of theory by evidence (there is always more than one theory consistent with the evidence, in part because a theoretical hypothesis can always be preserved in the face of recalcitrant evidence by abandoning the auxiliary hypotheses that informed the test of the hypothesis) (see Kim 1988, pp. 385–386).

What becomes, then, of epistemology? Hilary Kornblith has summed up Quine’s view as follows: “Once we see the sterility of the foundationalist program, we see that the only genuine questions there are to ask about the relation between theory and evidence and about the acquisition of belief are psychological questions” (Kornblith 1994, p. 4). Kornblith aptly dubs this view Quine’s “replacement thesis”: “the view that epistemological questions may be replaced by psychological questions” (Kornblith 1994, p. 3). Here is how Quine puts it:

The stimulation of his sensory receptors is all the evidence anybody has had to go on, ultimately, in arriving at his picture of the world. Why not just see how this construction really proceeds? Why not settle for psychology? Such a surrender of the epistemological burden to psychology is a move that was disallowed in earlier time as circular reasoning. If the epistemologist’s goal is validation of the grounds of empirical science, he defeats his purpose by using psychology or other empirical science in the validation. However, such scruples against circularity have little point once we have stopped dreaming of deducing science from observations. (1969, pp. 75–76)

Several pages later, Quine continues that on his proposal,

Epistemology, or something like it, simply falls into place as a chapter of psychology and hence of natural science. It studies a natural phenomenon, viz., a physical subject. This human subject is accorded a certain experientially controlled input—certain patterns of irradiation in assorted frequencies, for instance—and in the fullness of time the subject delivers as output a description of the three-dimensional external world and its history. The relation between the meager input and the torrential output is a relation that we are prompted to study for somewhat the same reasons that always prompted epistemology; namely, in order to see how evidence relates to theory, and in what ways one’s theory of nature transcends any available evidence. (1969, pp. 82–83)

Thus, according to Quine, the central concern of epistemology is the theory-evidence relationship; if the foundationalist story about this relationship is a failure, then that leaves only one story worth telling about this relationship: namely, the story told by “a purely descriptive, causal-nomological science of human cognition” (Kim 1988, p. 388). The science of human cognition replaces armchair epistemology: we naturalize epistemology by turning over its central question—the relationship between theory and evidence—to the relevant empirical science.

We can now generalize Quine’s point as follows (Leiter 1998). Let us say that a Replacement Naturalist in any branch of philosophy holds that:

For any pair of relata that might stand in a justificatory relation—e.g., evidence and theory, reasons and belief, causal history and semantic or intentional content, legal reasons and judicial decision—if no normative account of the relation is possible, then the only theoretically fruitful account is the descriptive/explanatory account given by the relevant science of that domain.

This goes beyond Quine in one important respect: for Quine infers Replacement Naturalism only from the failure of foundationalism—which is simply one possible normative account of the evidence-theory relationship, but not the only one. Quine’s arguments simply do not show that no other normative account of the evidence-theory relationship is possible.

Quine has been extensively criticized on precisely this score (e.g., Goldman 1986, pp. 2–3; Kim 1988). The key to a successful defense of Replacement Naturalism lies in an explanation of why normative theory without foundationalism is sterile. One worry is that without foundationalism, normative theories are banal. Consider: it is now a familiar result of cognitive psychology that human beings regularly make mistakes in logical reasoning (cf. Stich 1994). So a mere descriptive theory of belief-formation, of the sort Quine appears to recommend, would simply record these mistakes. But shouldn’t epistemology tell us that beliefs ought not to be formed illogically? One can hardly imagine why Quine would disagree: one ought not to form beliefs illogically. But the question is whether this piece of banal advice adds up to a fruitful research program. The descriptive project of Replacement Naturalism may record certain irrational cognitive processes in studying the evidence-theory relationship, but given the underdetermination of theory by evidence, even when we correct for logical mistakes, we still won’t have an account of which of our theoretical beliefs are warranted and which are not. The Quinean intuition is that we’ll learn more from the empirical inquiry than from systematizing our banal normative intuitions about irrationality. More generally, unless we have some foundational point outside our epistemic practices from which to assess the epistemic issues, the project of systematizing our mundane normative intuitions will simply collapse into the descriptive sociology of knowledge. If we can’t stand outside the epistemological boat, then we can do no more than report what it is we do. But it is precisely the viability of such an external standpoint that Quine denies in his embrace of the metaphor of Neurath’s boat. So from within the boat, there is nothing to do but description.

Quine’s argument for Replacement Naturalism, recall, moved in two steps. Step one was anti-foundationalism: no unique theory is justified on the basis of the evidential input. Step two was replacement: since no foundational story can be told about the relation between input (evidence) and output (theory), we should replace the normative program with a purely descriptive inquiry, e.g. the psychological study of what input causes what output. We can find analogues of both steps in the approach to the theory of adjudication offered by American Legal Realism.

Theory of adjudication is concerned not with the relationship between “evidence” and “scientific theory,” but rather with the justificatory relationship between “legal reasons” (the input, as it were) and judicial decision (the output): theory of adjudication tries to tell judges how they ought to justify their decisions, i.e., it seeks to “ground” judicial decision-making in reasons that require unique outcomes. The American Legal Realists are “anti-foundationalists” about judicial decisions in the sense that they deny that the legal reasons justify a unique decision: the legal reasons underdetermine the decision, at least in most cases actually litigated. More precisely, the Realists claim that the law is rationally indeterminate in the sense that the class of legal reasons—i.e., the class of legitimate reasons a judge may offer for a decision—does not provide a justification for a unique outcome. Just as sensory input does not justify a unique scientific theory, so legal reasons, according to the Realists, do not justify a unique decision.

The Realists also take the second step that Quine takes: replacement. According to the Realist indeterminacy thesis, legal reasons do not justify a unique decision, meaning that the foundationalist enterprise of theory of adjudication is impossible. Why not replace, then, the “sterile” foundational program of justifying some unique legal outcome on the basis of the applicable legal reasons with a descriptive/explanatory account of what input (i.e., what combination of facts and reasons) produces what output (i.e., what judicial decision)? As Underhill Moore puts it at the beginning of one of his articles: “This study lies within the province of jurisprudence. It also lies within the field of behavioristic psychology. It places the province within the field” (Moore & Callahan 1943, p. 1). Notice how closely this echoes Quine’s idea that, “Epistemology…simply falls into place as a chapter of psychology…” (1969, p. 82). Jurisprudence—or, more precisely, the theory of adjudication—is “naturalized” because it falls into place, for the Realist, as a chapter of psychology (or economics or sociology, etc.). Moreover, it does so for essentially Quinean reasons: because the foundational account of adjudication is a failure—a consequence of accepting the Realists’ famous claim that the law is indeterminate.

Of course, this argument for Replacement Naturalism only seems to work against “formalist” theories of adjudication that are committed to the rational determinacy of law. But, some object, “No contemporary analytic jurisprudent is a formalist” (Coleman 1998, p. 284), and some have even claimed that the “formalists” the Legal Realists opposed were not committed to the rational determinacy of law (Paulson 2001, p. 78). Both objections seem mistaken: Ronald Dworkin, for example, is committed to the rational determinacy of law in exactly the sense at issue for the Replacement argument. The targets of the Legal Realist critique were, equally, committed to the rational determinacy of law (Etchemendy 2021); indeed, it would be impossible to make sense of what the Realists were doing if that were not so. The Replacement Naturalist might take the view that there is no reason to call for “naturalizing” theory of adjudication in the range of cases where legal reasons are satisfactory predictors of legal outcomes (i.e., precisely those cases where the foundationalist program can be carried out). One may worry, again, about whether there is an interesting or fruitful normative story to be told (rather than a merely banal descriptive sociology), but it suffices for the analogy with Quine that there remains some substantial domain of cases where the foundationalist program cannot be carried out, so that the case for replacement remains intact.

The real difficulty, of course, pertains not to these historical points, but to whether or not the project of a normative theory of adjudication warrants replacement just because rational determinacy does not obtain. As in the Quinean case, the Replacement Naturalist must maintain that without rational determinacy, normative theories of adjudication are banal, mere exercises in descriptive sociology. Critics of Replacement Naturalism contest this conclusion, though more by way of affirmation than argument (Coleman 1998, p. 285 n. 44). However, if the objection under consideration were correct, then a normative theory that specifies what the anti-foundationalist concedes—namely, that there is more than one (though not simply any) judicial decision that can be justified on the basis of the class of legal reasons—must, in some measure, be a theory worth having. Arguably, such a theory might be adequate to deflect the challenge to the political legitimacy of adjudication based on the indeterminacy of law, but does it provide the normative guidance to judges we want from a theory? Does a theory that tells judges they would be justified (on the basis of the class of legal reasons) in deciding for the plaintiff on theory X or the defendant on theory Y (but not the plaintiff or defendant on theory Z!) really provide normative guidance for judges worth having? The Replacement Naturalist answers in the negative: better to have a descriptive account of inputs and outputs, one that would license prediction of judicial behavior, than an indeterminate normative theory. This response, of course, makes Replacement Naturalism vulnerable to conflicting intuitions about the fruitfulness or sterility of different kinds of theorizing.

There are other limits to the Quinean analogy (Leiter 2001a, pp. 284–285; Greenberg 2011 disputes other aspects of the analogy, while Leiter 2011 replies to some of Greenberg’s objections). First, the American Legal Realists end up presupposing a theory of the concept of legality in framing their arguments for law’s indeterminacy (Leiter 2001a, pp. 292–293); thus, while they may believe that the only fruitful account of adjudication is descriptive and empirical, not normative and conceptual, they themselves need a concept of law that is not—at least on the arguments considered so far—empirical or naturalized. As one critic of Replacement Naturalism notes: “the naturalist is committed as a conceptual matter to the existence of a test of legality…. The naturalist is thus in the same boat with every other analytic philosopher of law” (Coleman 2001, p. 214). The analogy with naturalized epistemology, in other words, must be localized to the theory of adjudication, and not the whole of jurisprudence. Of course, it remains possible for the Replacement Naturalist to argue for the requisite concept of legality on precisely the empirical grounds noted in the previous section (“Replacement Naturalism I: Against Conceptual Analysis”). But as it stands, the analogy to Quine’s attack on foundationalist epistemology warrants no radical abandonment of traditional conceptual analysis across the board.

A second difference from Quine is also important. The crux of the Legal Realist position (at least for the majority of Realists) is that non-legal reasons (e.g., judgments of fairness, or consideration of commercial norms) explain the decisions. They, of course, explain the decisions by justifying them, though not necessarily by justifying a unique outcome (i.e., the non-legal reasons might themselves rationalize other decisions as well). Now clearly the descriptive story about the non-legal reasons is not going to be part of a non-mentalistic naturalization of the theory of adjudication: a causal explanation of decisions in terms of reasons (even non-legal reasons) does require taking the normative force of the reasons qua reasons seriously. The behaviorism of Quine or Underhill Moore is not in the offing here, but surely this is to be preferred: behaviorism failed as a foundation for empirical social science, while social-scientific theories employing mentalistic categories have flourished. Moreover, if the non-legal reasons are themselves indeterminate—i.e., if they do not justify a unique outcome—then any causal explanation of the decision will have to go beyond reasons to identify the psycho-social facts (e.g., about personality, class, gender, socialization, etc.) that cause the decision. Such a “naturalization” of the theory of adjudication might be insufficiently austere in its ontology for Quinean scruples, but it is still a recognizable attempt to subsume what judges do within a (social) scientific framework.

4. Normative Naturalism

Like the traditional epistemologist, the Normative Naturalist embraces as his goal the promulgation of norms by which to regulate our epistemic practices—to govern how we should acquire and weigh evidence, and ultimately form beliefs. Unlike the non-naturalist, however, the Normative Naturalist does not think epistemic norms can be adequately formulated from the armchair: normative theorizing must be continuous with scientific theorizing. But if this is not just to collapse into Replacement Naturalism, then what does the M-naturalist credo amount to in the normative case? Consider Goldman’s proposal: “Epistemics assumes that cognitive operations should be assessed instrumentally: given a choice of cognitive procedures, those which would produce the best set of consequences should be selected” (1978, p. 520). The Normative Naturalist maintains that the reason the philosopher can’t do armchair epistemology is because it is an a posteriori, empirical matter what norms in fact serve our epistemic or cognitive goals (e.g., forming true beliefs). Goldman emphasizes a particularly important instance of this general point:

[A]dvice in matters intellectual, as in other matters, should take account of the agent’s capacities. There is no point in recommending procedures that cognizers cannot follow or recommending results that cognizers cannot attain. As in the ethical sphere, “ought” implies “can.” Traditional epistemology has often ignored this precept. Epistemological rules often seem to have been addressed to “ideal” cognizers, not human beings with limited information-processing resources. Epistemics [as a type of Normative Naturalism] wishes to take its regulative role seriously. It does not want to give merely idle advice, which humans are incapable of following. This means it must take account of the powers and limits of the human cognitive system, and this requires attention to descriptive psychology. (1978, p. 510)

So the Normative Naturalist thinks that normative epistemology must be continuous with natural and social science in (at least) two senses: (i) we need to know what epistemic norms in fact lead to our forming true beliefs; and (ii) as a special case of (i), we need to identify epistemic norms actually usable by creatures like us. This rules out certain (non-naturalistic) epistemic norms which require of cognizers belief-formation practices beyond their ken (Goldman 1978, pp. 512–513). The Normative Naturalist, in short, emphasizes the instrumental character of normative theorizing in epistemology, and then argues that the only way to assess instrumental claims is empirically—to see what means really brings about what ends. And that task can never be pursued a priori, from the armchair.

Of course, it bears noting that the Normative Naturalist does not dispense entirely with conceptual analysis—to the contrary. It is precisely, for example, Goldman’s proffered conceptual analyses of “knowledge” and “justification” that require him to turn to empirical psychology to fill in the actual content of epistemic norms. Unlike the Quinean program, naturalization enters for the Normativist only, as it were, in applied epistemology. What many philosophers might think of as “pure” epistemology—giving an account of knowledge—continues to be an a priori enterprise, even though it is an enterprise that invokes notions (like “reliability” and “causation”) that require a posteriori investigation to apply.

The Normative Naturalist in jurisprudence, too, views theoretical questions instrumentally. The philosophical foundation of evidence law has, to date, received the most attention from this perspective (Allen & Leiter 2001; Broughton & Leiter 2021). We want to ask, as Goldman puts it, “Which [social] practices have a comparatively favorable impact on knowledge as contrasted with error and ignorance?” (1999, p. 5). Normative naturalism is, in this respect, veritistic (to borrow Goldman’s term): it is concerned with the production of knowledge, meaning (in part) true belief (Goldman 1999, pp. 79–100). So the Normative Naturalist embraces as his goal the promulgation of norms by which to regulate our epistemic practices so that they yield knowledge. In the case of individual epistemology, this means the norms governing how individuals should acquire and weigh evidence as well as, ultimately, form beliefs; in the case of social epistemology, this means the norms governing the social mechanisms and practices that inculcate belief. The legal rules of evidence, in turn, are a prime case of the latter: for these rules structure the epistemic process by which trial jurors arrive at beliefs about disputed matters of fact. As such, the rules of evidence are a natural candidate for investigation by Normative Naturalists. We may ask of any particular rule: does it increase the likelihood that jurors will reach true beliefs about disputed matters of fact? (Of course, it does not make sense to ask that of every rule, since some rules of evidence—for example, Federal Rules of Evidence (FRE) 407–411—are not meant to facilitate the discovery of truth, but to carry out various policy objectives like reducing accidents and avoiding litigation.) That means, of course, asking an essentially empirical question: does a given rule of evidentiary inclusion or exclusion in fact increase the likelihood that fact finders, given what they are actually like, will achieve knowledge about disputed matters of fact (i.e., does it maximize veritistic value)? Of course, many rules that on their face invite one kind of veritistic analysis require a very different kind in practice. So, for example, FRE 404, on its face, excludes character evidence in most contexts, though, in fact, the exception in 404(b) largely swallows the rule. Thus, while it might seem that we should ask whether excluding character evidence maximizes veritistic value, the real question is whether admitting it does. The same may be said for the hearsay rule. Although on its face, the hearsay doctrine is a rule of exclusion, in reality it is a rule of admission: what the advocate must really know is how to get the proffered hearsay admitted under one of the multitude of exceptions to the nominal rule of exclusion (FRE 802). Thus, the pertinent veritistic question concerns the veritistic credentials of the grounds on which hearsay is admitted, rather than the veritistic reasons for excluding it in most cases. (Such questions, in fact, are already a staple of much evidence scholarship.)

In theory of adjudication, by contrast, the Normative Naturalist wants to identify norms for adjudication that will help judges realize adjudicative goals. Such norms must, once again, satisfy two naturalistic constraints: first, they must, as a matter of empirical fact, be effective means to goals (“the Instrumental Constraint”); second, they must be constrained by relevant empirical facts about the nature and limitations of judges (“the Ought-Implies-Can Constraint”) (Leiter 1998).

Dworkin’s theory of adjudication (Dworkin 1986) makes a popular target for the Normative Naturalist. Dworkin’s theory says, very roughly, that a judge should decide a case in such a way that it coheres with the principle that explains some significant portion of the prior institutional history and provides the best justification for that history as a matter of political morality. Can a Normative Naturalist be a Dworkinian?

(1) Instrumental Constraint: The naturalist assesses normative advice relative to its actual effectiveness for realizing relevant goals. What, then, is the relevant goal in adjudication? One candidate is surely this: we want to give judges normative advice that will lead them to reach fair or just outcomes. Thus, the naturalist’s question becomes: which piece of normative advice is most effective in really helping actual judges realize justice and fairness? It is, at least, an open question whether Dworkin’s methodology will be effective in leading judges to do fair things. The fact that his normative theory has had almost no impact whatsoever on American judicial practice over the last forty years is at least defeasible evidence that it does not appear to be an effective methodology (let alone one effective for realizing justice!) (Leiter 1998, p. 102). This latter point is related to the naturalist’s second, and more important, objection.

(2) Ought-Implies-Can-Constraint: One thing judges cannot do is what Dworkin’s Judge Hercules does. This is a familiar complaint about Dworkin’s theory, but naturalized jurisprudence gives it a principled foundation. The naturalistic jurisprudent eschews all normative guidance unusable by real judges; like his naturalized counterpart in epistemology, he does “not want to give merely idle advice, which humans [including judges] are incapable of following” (Goldman 1978, p. 510). Dworkin may give judges an “aspirational model” (to borrow Jules Coleman’s apt phrase), and the naturalistic jurisprudent need not dispute that; but Descartes gave us an aspirational model in epistemology as well, and that does not make his program any more adequate or relevant by the naturalist’s lights. (It would be attractive if we could take certain “clear and distinct” ideas, and build up all of knowledge from them.) The naturalist wants normative advice effective for creatures like us; demanding of judges Herculean philosophical ingenuity violates this constraint. Aspiration, the naturalist concludes, is not a fit aim of normative advice, which must, first and foremost, offer effective means to ends.

5. Substantive Naturalism

Substantive naturalism begins with the idea that there exist only natural things, things of the kind natural science describes. (Physicalism, a more severe form of S-naturalism, holds that there are only physical things.) This ontological S-naturalism may, though need not, go with semantic S-naturalism, according to which a suitable philosophical analysis of any concept must show it to be amenable to empirical inquiry.

S-naturalism has played a significant role in at least three legal-philosophical traditions: (1) the Scandinavian Legal Realists (like Alf Ross and Karl Olivecrona), whose austere ontological naturalism, conjoined with moral anti-realism, shaped their distinctive take on legal concepts; (2) Legal Positivists, for whom S-naturalism can be, and sometimes has been, a significant motivation, and (3) contemporary defenders of a kind of natural law theory (like David Brink, Michael Moore, and Nicos Stavropoulos), who invoke the Causal Theory of Reference associated with Kripke and Putnam to offer an interpretation of some legal predicates in substantively naturalistic terms.

5.1 Scandinavian Legal Realism

Scandinavian Legal Realism stands out from other major traditions in legal philosophy for expressly placing naturalism—and S-naturalism in particular—at center stage. Perhaps the most striking example of this comes in the preface to the Second Edition of Karl Olivecrona’s Law as Fact, where Olivecrona states that the aim of his book is “to fit the complex phenomena covered by the word law into the spatio-temporal world” (1971, p. vii). But S-naturalism is equally prominent in Alf Ross’ On Law and Justice (1959, p. 67; see also Spaak 2009, pp. 40–42), probably the most internationally famous contribution to the Scandinavian Realist tradition. Given the centrality of S-naturalism to Scandinavian Realism, it is unsurprising that a variety of familiar naturalism-motivated philosophical gambits feature prominently in the major Scandinavian Realist texts. These include efforts at naturalistic reduction of legal concepts, as well as non-cognitivist and error-theoretic accounts of important aspects of legal discourse. (Some particular examples are discussed below.)

The S-naturalism of the Scandinavian Realists is today viewed more as an intellectual-historical museum piece than as a live contender in jurisprudential debate. That Scandinavian Realism should have fallen out of favor is not altogether surprising, given the strong influence of logical positivism and the similar Uppsala school of philosophy on the philosophical outlook and approach of the major Scandinavian Realists (Bjarup 1999, p. 774; see also Sandin 1962, p. 496). Although many would still sympathize broadly with the Scandinavian Realists’ naturalism, anti-metaphysical inclinations, and moral anti-realism, their specific versions of these doctrines have not, as a general matter, aged well. Be that as it may, the poor long-term reception of the Scandinavians may be owed, in large part, to a rather more accidental cause: the influence of Hart (1959). In an influential review of Ross’ On Law and Justice—simply (and somewhat misleadingly) titled “Scandinavian Realism”—Hart famously attacked a central pillar of Ross’ legal philosophy, namely his austerely naturalistic analysis of the concept of legal validity. Ross (1962) responded in his own review of Hart’s The Concept of Law, arguing that Hart had misunderstood him and that their views, properly understood, were not so far apart.

In order to understand what it was that Ross proposed and that Hart found so objectionable, it is best to begin with the opening pages of On Law and Justice. There, Ross draws a distinction between two kinds of linguistic meaning: expressive and representative. According to Ross, all linguistic utterances, oral or written, have expressive meaning (i.e., express something); but only some have representative meaning, i.e., represent states of affairs in the world. Here Ross contrasts an utterance like “my father is dead,” which has expressive and representative meaning, with utterances like “ouch!” and “shut the door,” which have expressive meaning only. Ross calls utterances with representative meaning “assertions.” Utterances without representative meaning he calls either “exclamations” or “directives”—the former if they are not intended to exert influence on others (as in the case of a reflexive cry of “ouch!”), the latter if they are intended to exert influence (as in the case of “shut the door”) (1959, pp. 6–8).

Ross holds that legal rules, such as statutory provisions, are directives. He explains that such rules are not meant to represent states of affairs, but to influence behavior. Simply put, if a legal rule is laid down stating that certain behavior “shall be punished” or “gives rise to liability,” this is not done to describe what courts would do anyway, but to direct the behavior of courts (and, indirectly at least, the behavior of private individuals) (1959, pp. 8–9).

What, then, of the legal utterances “occurring in a textbook of law”? Are these assertions or directives? At a surface level, Ross tells us, the language in such books will often be similar or even identical to the language in an actual statute: a doctrinal writer might, for example, say that certain behavior “gives rise to liability” or “shall be punished.” But we should not be misled by this surface similarity, Ross says: “the propositions in a textbook, at any rate to a certain extent, intend to describe, not to prescribe” (1959, p. 9). To that extent, therefore, they must be assertions, not directives—specifically, Ross claims, assertions about what is valid law.

And what does it mean to say that something is valid law? In effect, Ross tells us, it is to predict the behavior and thinking of courts. Details aside, to say that “X is valid law” is in effect to say that (1) judges will act in accordance with X, and (2) in so acting, they will feel themselves bound to do so. Hence, claims about what is valid law are claims about purely natural-factual states of affairs: facts about the behavior and psychology of judges (1959, pp. 42, 73–74, 75).

The Hart–Ross dialogue revolved around the merits of this analysis; Hart, for his part, found it altogether inadequate. Most crucially and memorably, Hart argued that “even if in the mouth of the ordinary citizen or lawyer ‘this is a valid rule of English law’ is a prediction of what [English] judge[s] will do, say and/or feel, this cannot be its meaning in the mouth of a judge who is not engaged in predicting his own or others’ behaviour or feelings.” Instead, it is an “act of recognition” of “the rule in question as one satisfying certain accepted general criteria for admission as a rule of the system and so as a legal standard of behaviour” (1959, p. 165). At root, Hart argued, Ross’ analysis of the concept of legal validity fails because “the normal central use of ‘legally valid’ is in an internal normative statement of a special kind” (1959, p. 167).

Later, in his review of Hart’s The Concept of Law, Ross claimed that Hart had misunderstood him. In his analysis of “valid law,” Ross replied, he had been concerned specifically with “legal concepts as they function in the doctrinal study of law, what we on the Continent are accustomed to call the science of law,” and if this were adequately understood, it would be evident that much of the apparent disagreement between him and Hart was illusory (1962, p. 1190). In effect, Ross said, he had been analyzing legal statements of a kind Hart would have classified as “external.” Ross chalked up the confusion at least in part to the translation of the Danish phrase “gældende ret” as “valid law,” acknowledging that the results sounded “odd in English usage,” and suggesting in passing that “existing law” or “law in force” might have better captured what he had in mind. (For further discussion of the translation question, see Eng 2011.)

A number of subsequent authors who have revisited the Hart–Ross debate have expressed broad sympathy for Ross’ claims to have been misunderstood. (See Pattaro 2009, pp. 545–546; Eng 2011; Holtermann 2014, p. 166 n. 4.) Nonetheless, as a matter of intellectual history, Hart’s critique had its effect. There has, however, been a recent uptick in interest in Scandinavian Legal Realism, perhaps owing in part to a broader renewal of interest in naturalism in legal philosophy. This has not been limited to strictly historical or exegetical work, but has included efforts to mine the Scandinavian Realists’ writings for philosophical strategies or insights that might help advance contemporary legal philosophy, or to offer fruitful rational reconstructions of their ideas. (See, e.g., Holtermann 2014; Spaak 2014, Ch. 10.)

One topic of some contemporary interest to which the Scandinavian Realists may be relevant is the possibility of understanding legal language in expressivist and/or non-cognitivist terms. Largely owing to Kevin Toh’s work on the subject, there has been some recent interest in legal (or “meta-legal”) expressivism, that is, treatments of legal statements as expressions of distinctive (perhaps conative) mental states. (See Toh 2005; Toh 2011; Etchemendy 2016.) Contemporary legal expressivists might look to the Scandinavian Realists as intellectual forebears of a sort, given the prominence of non-cognitivist ideas in their theories of legal language.

As is widely recognized, the Scandinavian Realists were ethical non-cognitivists. (Bjarup 1999, p. 775; Ross 1959, p. 313; Spaak 2009, pp. 42–44, 52–55, 64.) In principle, this would not require adopting expressivist or non-cognitivist accounts of legal statements, but as it happens Ross and Olivecrona did understand substantial parts of legal discourse on this model. To be sure, Ross analyzed statements about “valid law” as assertions of naturalistic fact, and thus cognitive. But, as discussed earlier, Ross thought some legal utterances were non-cognitive directives. This most obviously included legal rules themselves, as in the provisions of a statute. But Ross also thought jurists’ doctrinal writings were typically a blend of cognitive assertions of valid law and non-cognitive directives, the latter being in effect advice calculated to influence the behavior of the judiciary (1959, pp. 46–49). In advancing this idea, Ross was not merely making the banal point that doctrinal writing is frequently laced with transparently normative claims about how courts should decide cases. His point was subtler than this; telegraphically stated, Ross’ observation was that doctrinal writers sometimes do (and sometimes intend to) influence judges by making statements that could, on their face, equally be interpreted as straightforward predictive/descriptive claims. It turns out, therefore, that Ross had a rather nuanced understanding of the mix of cognitive (or representational/descriptive) and non-cognitive (or directive/prescriptive) elements in legal discourse.

If anything, non-cognitivist ideas play an even more striking role in Olivecrona’s mature legal philosophy, notably as set out in the Second Edition of Law as Fact. Unsatisfied with efforts to reduce talk of legal rights to claims about naturalistic states of affairs, Olivecrona ultimately concludes that the word “right,” as commonly used, does not signify anything and lacks semantic reference (1971, pp. 183–184). In the first instance, he argues, statements about legal rights serve a directive function, though they can also indirectly serve to communicate information about actual (naturalistic) facts. Ultimately, Olivecrona extends this analysis to legal language in general, concluding: “Legal language is not a descriptive language. It is a directive, influential language serving as an instrument of social control” (1971, p. 253). Lest there be doubts about how far Olivecrona took this idea, he went on to observe that on his account, “Citizen, government, parliament, law, right, duty, marriage, elections, taxes, corporations, and princess all belong to th[e] category” of “words which…lack semantic reference” (1971, p. 255). Thus, Olivecrona found no place for many of the “things” legal language is ostensibly “about” in the world of facts that he countenanced as an S-naturalist. As so often happens with philosophers who embrace non-cognitivism about some domain of thought and talk, however, Olivecrona was equally insistent that legal language and ideas do find a place in reality. He accordingly devoted considerable attention to describing the function of legal language in society—concluding, ultimately, that “legal language plays a vital role” as “an instrument of social control,” “for keeping the peace, as well as for sending men to death on the battlefield” (1971, p. 254). Insofar as there is some contemporary interest in expressivist and/or non-cognitivist accounts of legal thought and talk, therefore, Scandinavian Realism may offer interesting intellectual-historical reference points (and possibly substantive inspiration) for the further development of such ideas.

5.2 Legal Positivism

At least in contemporary Anglo-American legal philosophy, “Legal Positivism” is generally used as a shorthand for a claim roughly along the following lines: “the existence and content of law depends on social facts and not on its merits” (Green 2009). What is the relationship between naturalism and Legal Positivism in the above-specified sense? The situation is somewhat complex because some but not all Legal Positivists are naturalists, and few have gone so far as the Scandinavian Realists in wearing their naturalism on their sleeves. In brief, however, naturalism can and sometimes has—but need not—play a role in motivating Legal Positivism.

How is it that naturalism can play a role in motivating Legal Positivism? As has often been remarked, the core Positivist claim about the relationship between law and social facts amounts in effect to a claim that law is reducible to social facts, which—given that “social facts” here is, tacitly if not expressly, limited to psychological and sociological facts—further amounts to the claim that law is reducible to naturalistic facts. It should be clear enough why this would be appealing to people with S-naturalist commitments, for it would, so to speak, mean that we can “place” law in the realm of naturalistic facts and entities. (By analogy, consider why S-naturalists would be drawn to the idea that the existence and contents of human minds depends solely on facts about human brains.) Unsurprisingly, therefore, the affinities between Legal Positivism and S-naturalism have not gone unnoticed. (See Kar 2006, p. 931; Leiter 2018, pp. 19–20.)

It is, however, somewhat harder to discern the actual extent to which S-naturalism has been a motivation for major philosophers in the Legal Positivist tradition. There is at least a good case to be made that Hart was sufficiently attracted to S-naturalism to consider it an advantage of Legal Positivism that it placed law in the world of earthly facts. (See Hart 1961, pp. 11–12, 83–84, 186; Raz 1998, pp. 4–5; Toh 2005, pp. 83–85.) Even so, Legal Positivism need not be, and is not always, motivated by S-naturalism, or for that matter any kind of naturalism, and not all Legal Positivists are naturalists in any interesting sense. For example, Raz does not appear to be a naturalist of any sort. (See Raz 1988, p. 6.) The broader point, of course, is that one need not be a naturalist to think that some particular phenomenon (e.g., law) depends solely on naturalistic facts.

Thus, it pays not to overstate, or to make overgeneralizations about, the relationship between naturalism and Legal Positivism. We can, however, confidently say that Legal Positivism sits well with a background commitment to S-naturalism. This point is of no small importance given the continuing influence of S-naturalism (or at least temperamental affinities to S-naturalism) in the general background framework of post-Enlightenment culture and thought. (See Leiter 2018, p. 19.)

5.3 S-Naturalism, Law, and the Causal Theory of Reference

Just as semantic doctrines more-or-less related to logical positivism were central to the S-naturalism of Scandinavian Realism, the more recent S-naturalism of writers like David Brink, Michael Moore, and Nicos Stavropoulos is indebted to the revolution in semantics initiated by Hilary Putnam and Saul Kripke known as the “new” or “causal” theory of reference. These latter doctrines are not—yet in any case—museum pieces, so the derived jurisprudential theses are very much live items of debate. Stavropoulos explains the core semantic ideas on which jurisprudential writers draw as follows:

Both Kripke and Putnam attack what they call the traditional theory of reference. That theory holds that an expression refers to whatever fits the description with which speakers associate the expression. The relevant description…captures necessary properties of the referent which are knowable a priori, as in the case of knowing that a bachelor is an unmarried man. This cannot be true, Kripke and Putnam argue, since expressions refer to the same object in the lips of speakers who can only associate the expression with vague or mistaken descriptions. Indeed, not only individual speakers but the community as a whole can be in error about the true properties of the relevant object. … The important suggestion being made by Kripke and Putnam is that reference is object-dependent. Which object ‘Aristotle’ or ‘water’ refers to is not determined by the associated description, but turns instead on a matter of fact, namely which object the name-using or term-using practice is directed at. (1996, p. 8)

Thus, if on the old view the “meaning” of an expression (the descriptions speakers associated with it) fixed the reference of the expression, on the new theory, the referent fixes the meaning. “Water” picks out whatever stuff we happened to baptize with the name “water” at the beginning of the “term-using practice.” As it happens, that stuff has a distinctive micro-constitution: it is H20. Thus, “water” refers to stuff that is H20, and that is what the term means: the stuff that is H20.

Writers like Brink, Moore, and Stavropoulos propose that when the meaning of expressions in legal rules—and, in particular, the meaning of the moral concepts (like “equality”) that figure in some legal rules—is understood in the same way, then it follows that all rules have determinate applications: either the facts do or do not fall within the extension of the meaning of the key terms in the rule. The meaning of the rule determines its application, but the meaning is fixed by the real referents of the terms in the legal rule. Of course, for this to be a version of S-naturalism, the claim must be that the real referents are themselves things cognizable within a naturalistic framework. So, e.g., it would have to be the case that the legal and moral features of situations picked out by our legal concepts (and the moral concepts embedded in them) must be identical with (or supervenient upon) natural facts: just as there are necessary, a posteriori statements of property identity about water, so too there are such statements about legal and moral facts. For example, perhaps the property of being “morally right” is just identical with the property of “maximizing human well-being,” where the latter may be understood in purely psychological and physiological terms. In that case, whether an action X is morally right is simply a scientific question about whether action X will in fact maximize the relevant kinds of psychological and physiological states in the world. (Most naturalistic moral realisms are based on versions of utilitarianism, precisely because it is easy to see what the naturalistic base of moral properties would be in a utilitarian schema. One peculiar feature of the moral realism of Moore (1992b) is that it is conjoined with a deontological moral theory, yet within a purportedly naturalistic moral realist framework.) The crucial claim, plainly, is that moral facts are to be identified with (or treated as supervenient upon) certain kinds of natural facts. Of course, many philosophers are skeptical that this claim can be made out.

Problems arise at several different levels with this more recent S-naturalism, though all are traceable to the reliance on the new theory of reference. To begin, there are familiar reasons to be skeptical about whether the new theory of reference is correct, reasons that won’t be rehearsed here (see, e.g., Evans 1973, Blackburn 1988). Even granting, however, the correctness of the new theory, it is not obvious how it helps in the case of law. After all, the new theory always seemed most plausible for a limited class of expressions: proper names and natural kind terms. The reason has to do with the implicit essentialism required for the new theory: unless referents have essential characteristics—just as “water” has a distinctive and essential molecular constitution—they cannot fix meanings. But what is the essence of “due process” or “equal protection?” And what is the “essential” nature of the many artifact terms that populate legal rules (terms like “contract” or “vehicle” or “security interest”)? Unsurprisingly, S-naturalists like Brink and Moore are also moral realists, and also try to give accounts of artifact terms as picking out not “natural kinds” but “functional kinds” (Moore 1992a, pp. 207–208).

Of course, even if the new theory of reference gives the correct account of the meaning of some terms (like natural kind terms), that still does not show that it gives us the right account of meaning for purposes of legal interpretation (cf. Munzer 1985). Suppose the legislature prohibits the killing of “fish” within 100 miles of the coast, intending quite clearly (as the legislative history reveals) to protect whales, but not realizing that “fish” is a natural kind term that does not include whales within its extension. The new theory of reference tells us that the statute protects sea bass but not whales, yet surely a court that interpreted the statute as also protecting whales would not be making a mistake. Indeed, one might think the reverse is true: for a court not to protect whales would be to contravene the will of the legislature, and thus, indirectly, the will of the people. What the example suggests is that the correct theory of legal interpretation is not a mere matter of philosophical semantics: issues about political legitimacy—about the conditions under which the exercise of coercive power by courts can be justified—must inform theories of legal interpretation, and such considerations may even trump considerations of semantics.


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